Chinese Philosophy: Overview of History
There was no effort to write a comprehensive history of the Chinese Philosophy until the modern period of Western influence on Chinese culture. This is not to say that Chinese thinkers did not engage selectively with philosophers of earlier or contemporary eras.
What has come down to us as the final chapter of the Zhuangzi (ch. 33, Tian Xia “Under Heaven”) offers a sort of history of the development of Chinese philosophy. Of the writers of texts that survive to this day, it was Sima Tan (165?-110 B.C.E.) who made the first real attempt to classify Chinese thinkers into six major schools: Yin-Yang, Confucianism (Rujia), Mohism (Mojia), the School of Names (Mingjia), Legalism (Fajia), and Daoism (Daojia). As the history of Chinese philosophy evolved, more categories were added to these six, as well as various permutations and blends of them (for example, Profound Learning/Xuanxue and Neo-Confucianism/Lijia).
Hu Shi’s An Outline of the History of Chinese Philosophy (1919) is the first work by a Chinese scholar to undertake the project of writing a comprehensive history of the transformations of Chinese philosophical thought, although it is presented by the author as only an outline. Feng Youlan (Fung Yu-lan, 1895-1990) wrote the most widely known and used work on the history of Chinese philosophy in the 20th century. His two-volume History of Chinese Philosophy (volume 1, 1931 and volume 2, 1934) is a landmark work having a range and depth far exceeding that of Hu Shi’s Outline. Lao Siguang's History of Chinese Philosophy in 1982 makes it quite clear that his intention was to write a work that made use of Western critical standards in all respects. One of the most thorough and well-informed studies of the history of Chinese philosophy in a single volume is The History of Chinese Philosophy, edited by Bo Mou.
It is a common characterization of the history of Chinese philosophy to say that its overall trajectory may be captured in the concept of “the three teachings” (sanjiao): Confucianism, Daoism, and Buddhism. If we acknowledge the numerous permutations, revisions, re-conceptualizations, and syntheses of them, and if we speak of the three teachings as analogous to streams of influence flowing together into the broad river of Chinese philosophy, then this is still a fruitful way of conceiving of the major historical forces at work in the tradition, from at least the 3rd century C.E. down at least to the modern period. Beginning in the late 18th century, Western philosophical influences began to flow into the stream of Chinese philosophy, as well.
Table of Contents
- Classical Chinese Philosophy in the Pre-Qin Period (before 221 B.C.E.)
- The “Great Commentary (Da Zhuan)” to the Classic of Changes (Yijing)
- Confucius (551-479 B.C.E.) of the Analects
- Mozi (c. 470-391 B.C.E.) and Mohism
- The School of Names, Mingjia 名家 (Disputers, Dialecticians, Bianshi)
- The Daodejing
- The Zhuangzi
- Mencius (c. 372-289 B.C.E.)
- Xun Kuang or Xunzi (c. 325?-235? B.C.E.)
- Philosophy from the Qin (221 B.C.E.) to the Tang (618 C.E.)
- Syncretic Philosophies in the Qin and Han Periods
- The Rise of Critical Philosophy in China: Wang Chong (25-100 C.E.)
- Profound Learning (Xuanxue)
- Early Buddhism in China
- The Song Period (960-1279 C.E.) and Neo-Confucianism
- The Chinese and Western Encounter in Philosophy
- Whither China? Philosophical Views
- References and Further Reading
In terms of a repository of philosophical reflection on the nature of reality and the human place in it, the story of Chinese philosophy may be said to begin with the Classic of Changes (Yijing). This work is composed of two parts: 1) a quite ancient manual of divination known simply as the Changes (Yi), or, more correctly, as the Zhouyi because it is a handbook of practices and procedures are traceable to the period of the Western Zhou dynasty (c. 1046-771 B.C.E.) and 2) a set of seven commentaries (zhuan) attached to the Yi and traditionally ascribed to Confucius, although there is no firm evidence that he wrote them, or even that he used them. Three of the commentaries are composed of two sections each, so taken as a whole, the commentary set is known as “The Ten Wings (Shiyi).” One of the commentaries to the Yi is known by the various titles of “The Great Commentary (Da Zhuan)” or “Appended Statements (Xici).” For a study of philosophy, “The Great Commentary” is arguably the most important single offering an understanding of the earliest written understanding of Chinese ontology currently available to us.
Edward Shaughnessy (1997) has done a recent translation of The Classic of Changes based on the Mawangdui archaeological finds. He offers reasons for thinking the work was edited most likely during the long period from 320-168 B.C.E. While it is true that some material in the “Great Commentary” may have its origin as late as the Han dynasty, there is clear evidence in concepts and reasoning of a much earlier period in the text, as well. The “Great Commentary” provides a clear exposition of the early Chinese worldview that all things are in a constant process of change. Readers will notice that “Yi” is sometimes used for the Zhouyi/Yijing as a divination guide and sometimes simply for “the process of reality” itself.
The earliest association of Chinese philosophy with a specific figure whose work is not only still extant, but widely used, is that of Confucius (personal name Kong Qiu, also known as “Master Kong” or Kongzi, 551-479 B.C.E.). Confucius was born, lived, and taught during the classical period of China. His philosophical teachings were gathered and transmitted largely, but not exclusively, in a work known as the Analects (also known as Lunyu, meaning “Selected Sayings”). This book is composed of short texts and brief conversations in which Confucius is often, but not always, the main teacher. The received version of the Analects is divided into 20 books that are further categorized with the convention of listing the book first, then the analect (that is, 3.1 is Book Three, analect one). Recent textual critical studies of the received text of the Analects have identified various strata in the collection, according to which some analects are more likely to be traceable to the historical Confucius, others to his disciples, others to master teachers associated with him or a generation removed, and still others that may be several generations removed from Confucius himself.
Ronnie Littlejohn’s understanding of this structure divides the text into the following categories: basic teachings on philosophical concepts probably traceable to Confucius (for example, Book 4); comments on disciples and personages by Confucius (for example, Book 5); collection of teachings to specific students by topic (for example, Book 12); and later materials codified for transmission by students and later masters (for example, Books 19 and 20) (Littlejohn 2011). There are many fine complete English translations of the Analects, some of which are available online.
Confucius stood within the tradition of scholars called Ru (儒). In the Han dynasty (206 B.C.E.-220 C.E.), two centuries after Confucius’s life, Liu Xin (46? B.C.E.-23 C.E.) says the Ru first appeared as an identifiable professional group in the early Zhou dynasty (c. 1046-256 B.C.E.). They were noted for their allegiance to the sage kings of ancient China who followed what they called “the Way (Dao) of Heaven” and its social, religious, and moral proprieties (li 禮). Liu Xin tells us the Ru were devoted to the “Six Classics (Liujing)” and took Confucius as their master teacher.
The “Confucianism” of teachers and literati who studied, modified, and applied Confucius’s ideas began robustly during the Han dynasty and continues in some forms down to the 21st century. Confucianism struggled throughout Chinese history with other intellectual streams, including Daoism and Buddhism. In the 12th century, Zhu Xi (1130-1200 C.E.) assembled a set of works known simply as the “Four Books,” which he took to represent the core of Confucian teachings: the “Great Learning (Daxue),” the “Way of Balance (Zhongyong),” the Analects, and the Mencius. This collection became the curriculum for China’s civil service examination system down to the year 1911, as well as for similar national exams in Japan, Korea, and Vietnam. During the period 1966-1976, Confucius and Confucianism were attacked as feudalistic and oppressive. Not until the mid-1980s did a recovery of Confucian philosophy begin with the so-called New Confucians.
Unlike the “Great Commentary,” Confucius’s teachings in the Analects are not concerned with ontology or cosmology but rather with human self-development and social ethics. Because of the prominence of Confucian thought both in China and in the early encounter of Western philosophy with Chinese philosophy, it was often said that Chinese thought is only socio-political or ethico-moral in its interests. This is, of course, not true at all. However, it is a not an inaccurate representation of Confucius’s thought.
Based on the development of Confucianism in history, the following concepts from the Analects can be identified with confidence as central to Confucius’s thought and contribution to Chinese philosophy: ren 仁 (humaneness, benevolence); junzi 君子 (exemplary person, gentleman); yi 義 (righteousness, appropriate behavior for the situation), xiao 孝 (filiality), and li 禮 (ritual propriety).
Although it is little known and not influential today, the “Mohist School” was one of the most influential movements in pre-Qin China. The thinkers in this tradition were students and later followers of Mo Di (also known as “Master Mo” or Mozi, c. 470–391 B.C.E.). According to the Records of the Historian (Shiji) by Sima Qian, Mozi was an official of the state of Song, and he lived just after Confucius. Our primary source for his thought is a collection of materials edited into a large anthology simply called the Mozi, although this text also contains materials much later in origin than the historical Mo Di, thus representing more fully Mohism as a school or movement. The Mozi contains essays, short dialogues, anecdotes, and compact philosophical discussions. One part of the text sets out the “Ten Core Doctrines” of Mohism in a triad of essays, each exploring the same principal ideas and often containing repeated language and examples. The essay layers are designated as shang 上, zhong 中, and xia 下 (that is, upper, middle, and lower). Just why there are three versions of each core doctrine is not certain, but the prevailing theory is that the triads are probably versions of oral and/or written traditions representing three different lineages of Mohism coming down from the historical Mozi. It is clear, though, that between the triads there are some divergences in philosophical positions between the versions. Some of these are of little consequence, but others are more significant. There is no attempt to harmonize all of these into a monolithic version.
An English translation of the entire Mozi is Ian Johnston’s The Mozi: A Complete Translation (2010). The Mozi contains philosophical reflections on a wide range of questions and problems. Mozi is revealed as a master of argument, making him the foremost representative of the “debaters (bianshi)” of the classical period. He sets forward the earliest form of consequentialism in political and moral thought, opposes military aggression, advocates state welfare for the people, holds to an absolute merit-based principle for most levels of political leadership, and consistently advocates for the folk religious beliefs of his day. The Mozi takes sophisticated positions on logic, epistemology, causality, and language. Arguably, the central moral idea of Mozi is jian ai 兼爱, which may be rendered as “universal love” or “impartial concern.”
Included among the dialecticians (debaters, bianshi) associated with what we may call the School of Names, Hui Shi (350-260 B.C.E.) and Gongsun Long (320-250 B.C.E.) are easily the most prominent. Other thinkers often mentioned are Deng Xi and Yin Wen. Unfortunately, with the exception of the partial anthology Gongsunlong Zi, the works of these thinkers have all been lost.
In both the Zhuangzi’s chapter 33 and in Sima Tan’s remarks on “the six schools,” the School of Names and its dialecticians are somewhat ridiculed for making minute examinations of trifling points or intricate distinctions in the use of terms. For example, they are associated with making philosophical points about the distinctions between shapes and colors, unity and plurality, similarity and difference.
However, the philosophers practicing this methodology were interested in demonstrating that our understanding of the world is a radical form of perspectivism or relativism. They sought to move persons out of dogmatic positions, which tended to elevate particular points of view to absolute truths. In Zhuangzi 33, twenty-one theses associated with these thinkers, are included and they are most often taken by interpreters as examples full of counterintuitive and even absurd implications in ways familiar to the characterizations of Zeno in Western thought. Ten theses of Hui Shi, also reported in Zhuangzi 33, are examples of these methods.
The long-standing tradition in China is that an individual philosophical master named Laozi was the author of a philosophical work known as the Daodejing, which means the “Classic of Dao (the Way) and its De (virtuous power).” This understanding of authorship is almost universally rejected by scholars now in favor of the view that the text is a collection of materials from “ancient masters” collected in different versions beginning in about 300 B.C.E. and continuing until the standard edition made by Wang Bi sometime between 226 and 249 C.E. Nonetheless, the impact of the Daodejing has been monumental as the classical representative of the tradition of Daoism, often characterized as the yin (passive) spirit in Chinese philosophy, where Confucianism is regarded as the yang (active). The remarks in the Daodejing counsel naturalness, simplicity, and spontaneous action without effort according to the movement of Dao, while Confucianism advocates active cultivation of one’s nature by learning, vigorous effort and political involvement, and conformity with established proprieties reconceived in their application by each new generation.
The Daodejing is one of the most translated texts of China into other world languages and, as with the Analects, there are many English versions of the complete text. Among these, some that stand out include P. J. Ivanhoe, The Daodejing of Laozi, D. C. Lau, Tao Te Ching, and Michael LaFargue, The Tao of the Tao-te-ching. Textual, literary, and redaction-critical approaches have shown that the received text is a collection of teachings used across lineages of Daoist teachers and not the work of a single author, although in its received form a final editor did collate its current arrangement. The component aphorisms and remarks of the Daodejing are strung together somewhat like beads on a string by an editor or editors.
The Zhuangzi is one of the formative texts of classical Chinese Daoism traditionally ascribed to the philosopher Zhuang Zhou (c. 365?-290? B.C.E.). The received text was edited by a scholar official named Guo Xiang (d. 312 C.E.) and contains 33 chapters. Most of these, like those in the Daodejing, contain many component logia. However, unlike the case of the Daodejing, we know that there was a much larger and older Zhuangzi. This “lost Zhuangzi” consisted of 52 chapters, and it is mentioned on a list in Imperial bibliographies dating from about 110 C.E. Within the Zhuangzi are cycles of materials related to Laozi and other characters, real and imaginary. Contemporary scholars, such as Liu Xiaogan (1994), Harold Roth (1991), and Ronnie Littlejohn (2010), have all suggested models for understanding the structure of the text of the Zhuangzi. The following represents the textual division by Littlejohn:
Inner Chapters (chs. 1-7) contain a number of logia that may be attributed to Zhuang Zhou and very likely represent the oldest material in the book.
Daode Chapters (chs. 8-10e) represent a clear break in the text and form a coherent essay, often using the first person and employing illustrations of its points internal to the essay. The essay is not interrupted by any disconnected logia. As such, it is likely that the essay was written by a single individual who made use of texts and themes, some of which are also found in the Daodejing.
Yellow Emperor-Laozi Chapters (also known as Huang-Lao Daoism) (largely chs. 11-16, 18, 19, and 22) are traceable to a lineage of Daoist teachers that developed during and after the heyday of the Jixia Academy (318?-284? B.C.E.) and had distinctively different emphases than those found in the other layers of the Zhuangzi and in the Daodejing. The earliest look that we get at the characteristics of this important tradition in Daoist history is in the Zhuangzi itself. The Masters of Huainan (Huainanzi, 139 B.C.E.) represents a continuation and maturing of these ideas.
Zhuangzi Disciples Chapters (largely Chapters 17-28) contain logia associated with the earliest disciples and second-generation transmitters of Zhuang Zhou’s teachings and that have close connections with ideas in the Inner Chapters (Littlejohn 2010).
If our ancient sources are correct in their chronologies, Mencius (that is, Meng Ke, Mengzi, or “Master Meng,” c. 372?-289? B.C.E.) was a contemporary of Zhuang Zhou, the Daoist master. The text coming down to us as the Mengzi contains virtually all of his significant teachings. Within the Confucian stream of Chinese philosophy, Mencius’s influence was so significant that he became recognized as the most authoritative interpreter of Confucius’s teachings and was known as “Mengzi the Second Sage.” He was a defender of Confucianism during the period of the Hundred Schools of Thought during the so-called Spring and Autumn (771-476 B.C.E.) and Warring States (475-221 B.C.E.) periods of Chinese history. Mencius was likely one of the major teachers at what has been called the Jixia Academy (318?-284? B.C.E.). The Mengzi that contains his philosophical remarks later became one of the “Four Books (Sishu)” that formed the core of the Confucian examination and education system for centuries.
The Mengzi appears to have been collected by Mencius’s disciples, some of whom are referred to in the text as “masters” themselves, indicating a later period of composition for those passages. The received text was edited by Zhao Qi (d. 201 C.E.) into seven books, each in two parts, and each part with a number of passages. When scholars cite the Mengzi, the form is always in this manner: book, section, passage (that is, 3B9). This citation form enables the reader to locate the passage in any of the complete translations of the text. Among the best full-text translations of the Mengzi are D. C. Lau, Mencius; Bryan Van Norden, Mengzi with Selections from Traditional Commentaries; and Irene Bloom, Mencius (completed and edited by Philip J. Ivanhoe).
What little is known of the life of Xun Kuang (also known as Master Xun or Xunzi, c. 325?-235? B.C.E.) is culled from evidence in his own writings and from the brief biography written by the historian Sima Qian some hundred years or so after Xunzi’s death. If we are right about Xunzi’s year of birth, he would have been around 20 years old when Mencius died. Sima Qian reports that Xunzi studied at the Jixia Academy, and it is quite possible that he was well acquainted with Mencius’ ideas directly or through first-generation disciples. He and his disciples seem to have been highly regarded by the rising Qin rulers. In fact, two of his students, Han Fei and Li Si, were instrumental in developing the theory of law and justice used during the Qin dynasty (221-206 B.C.E.) and known simply as Legalism. The primary source for Xun Kuang’s thought is known simply as the Xunzi. This book consists of 32 chapters that are essentially well-crafted, self-contained essays. Interestingly, though, the Xunzi was not a part of any of the later lists of Confucian classics in the canon, very much unlike the Mengzi that became part of the Four Books and occupied a central place in Confucian learning.
For years, the standard English translation of Xunzi was that by John Knoblock (1988, 1990, 1994), but in 2014 a new complete version appeared by Eric Hutton.
During the Qin and Han periods, it was not uncommon to gather communities of scholars together and also collect numerous texts, all from different philosophical traditions. A result of this process was the creation of works that attempted to unify and synthesize previous learning, representing an effort to create a harmonized body of truth. Two of these syncretic works are the Hanfeizi and the Masters of Huainan (Huainanzi).
Master Han Fei (Hanfeizi, c. 280-233 B.C.E.) was a student of Xunzi, probably at the Jixia Academy. His essays, gathered into the work Hanfeizi, were most likely written for the kings of the Han state, King Huan Hui (r. 272-239 B.C.E.) and King An (r. 238-230 B.C.E.). Han Fei is regarded as a principal representative of the “Legalist School (fa jia).” The “Legalist School” refers loosely to Chinese philosophers of the classical period whose common conviction was that law rather than morality was the most reliable ordering mechanism for society. A number of philosophers associated with this school were active in government and as imperial consultants. Han Fei himself was an advisor in the Han state just prior to its annexation by the Qin during the consolidation of China’s first empire in 221 B.C.E. Wenkui Liao’s translation, The Complete Works of Han Fei Tzu with Collected Commentaries, is available electronically at The Institute for Advanced Technology in the Humanities University of Virginia, ed. Anne Kinney.
According to his biography in the Book of the Early Han, Liu An (179-122 B.C.E.), the king of Huainan (in modern Anhui province) and uncle of Han Emperor Wu, gathered a large number of philosophers, scholars, and practitioners of esoteric techniques to Huainan roughly in the period 160-140 B.C.E. to debate and synthesize all learning. The collected volume now known as Masters of Huainan (Huainanzi) was a product of this interchange of ideas. It was presented to emperor Wu in 139 B.C.E. as a suggested program of rulership, although it was rejected, leading perhaps to the death of Liu An himself.
The Masters of Huainan is a synthetic document meant to harmonize the thought of the so-called “Hundred Schools (zhuzi baijia)” as a sort of universal encyclopedia of knowledge, although most scholars hold that its primary influence is associated with what is known as Yellow-Emperor Daoism (Huang-Lao Daoism). In its received form, it is a work of 21 essays ranging in subject matter from cosmology and astronomy to inner qi (vital energy) cultivation, bio-spiritual transformation, and political rulership.
The first complete English translation of the text is The Huainanzi: A Guide to the Theory and Practice of Government in Early Han China, by John Major, Sarah Queen, Andrew Set Meyer, and Harold Roth (2010).
Dong Zhongshu (c. 198-104 B.C.E.) was more successful than Liu An in crafting a philosophical vision attractive to the Han rulers. Dong was one of the central figures involved in the resurgence of Confucianism and the Confucian classics in the Han Dynasty. His version of Confucianism drew within it the cosmologies of the five phases (wuxing) and the yin-yang school prominent during the Han period. The Luxuriant Dew of the Spring and Autumn Annals (Chun Qiu Fan Lu) is a work in 17 parts, containing 123 chapter titles, of which 79 chapters survive. Although traditionally ascribed solely to Dong Zhongshu, it shows the signs of multiple editorial hands and cannot be attributed in its entirety to him.
Selections from Dong have been translated by Mark Csikszentmihalyi and are included in Readings in Later Chinese Philosophy: Han to the Twentieth Century.
Wang Chong (25-100 C.E.) studied in the imperial school in Luoyang, Henan province. After his training, he returned to his home near modern Shangyu, Zhejiang province in the position as Officer of Merit. His writings on subjects ranging from morality, to government, to science and technology were compiled into the work Critical Essays (Lunheng). Actually, each of the essays is meant to stand alone as a separate philosophical analysis, and there is no attempt to harmonize any seeming contradictions or inconsistencies apparent between the essays that come into view when the collection is read as a whole. Wang is generally acknowledged as a philosopher who is critical of many traditional beliefs of his day. He does not believe Heaven interferes with natural happenings, neither does it reward and punish persons for their actions, as Mozi thought it did. Destiny, chance, and luck are more important operators for describing what happens to us in his philosophy. Wang thinks human activity is actually of little consequence in the grand sweep of reality, and he largely disconnects happiness and unhappiness from the notions of legal reward and punishment, or even from any direct connection to our moral actions. He especially rejects reports of what we would call supernatural occurrences and interventions in human life and nature.
The movement known as Profound (or Mysterious) Learning (Xuanxue) has been labeled “Neo-Daoism.” This generalized term once was used to refer to the period of development of Chinese philosophy from the decades immediately preceding the fall of the Han dynasty to approximately the early 300s C.E. However, the term is misleading and no longer in favor due to the fact that the movement it seeks to describe claimed no particular Daoist sectarian identity but instead encapsulates a complex set of fresh insights and intense debates about new directions in Chinese thought.
Major figures generally associated with Profound Learning include He Yan (c. 207-249 C.E.), Wang Bi (226-249 C.E.), and Guo Xiang (d. 312 C.E.). Generally speaking, all three of these philosophers were working with the syncretic philosophies of the late Han as their background, but they were seeking to make new interpretations of original classical sources such as the Yijing, the Daodejing, and the Zhuangzi, or what were known as “the Three Profound Treatises (sanxuan).” Wang Bi and Guo Xiang edited and commented on what may now be called the standard texts of the Daodejing and the Zhuangzi. He Yan commented on the Analects. All of the philosophers in this tradition were seeking to demonstrate a unity of the Chinese classical texts into one tradition. However, this is not to say that the three thinkers mentioned here shared the same interpretations of Chinese concepts, nor that they even ranked the classical texts and thinkers in the same priority, although all valorized Confucius.
Buddhism first reached China from India roughly 2,000 years ago during the Han dynasty. It is generally agreed now that Buddhism entered along several different trade routes in the 1st century C.E., both in northern and southern regions of China, but the northern route known simply as the Silk Road is still regarded as the line along which Buddhist monks, believers, and traders had the most prominent manner of entry. The Buddhists entering along this route established famous monastic and study sites at places such as Dunhuang, Chang’an (Xi’an), and Luoyang, leaving behind marvels of art and architecture, as well as fascinating texts. As early as the 2nd century C.E., a few Buddhist monks, such as Lokaksema (Zhi Loujiachen, 147-? C.E.), a monk from Gandhara, began translating Buddhist sutras and commentaries from Sanskrit into Chinese. The most famous of such monks was Xuanzang (602-664 C.E.), whose travels to India to acquire texts and create a translation school at Chang’an are both made famous in historical records, as well as the classic Chinese novel Journey to the West (Xiyou ji).
The Dhammapada (Fa Jujing) was translated into Chinese about 224 C.E., and the tradition is that it represents a 423-verse sermon attributed to the historical Buddha, that is, Siddhartha. This work is often neglected in a study of Buddhism’s early impact on Chinese philosophy. While it is arguably the most popular work in the Pali Canon, how it came to China and just how widely it was used are still matters of debate. Nevertheless, it represents well the earliest texts introducing the new way of thinking known as Buddhism into the Chinese philosophical tradition. The selection that follows is taken from John Richards’s 1993 translation available electronically at http://www.geocities.ws/sharibushariputra/SharibuShariputra/BuddhaDharma-Dhammapada_1.htm. The verse number is provided at the end of each teaching.
The Tiantai School of Buddhism (Tiantai zong) was entirely of Chinese origin. Tiantai grew and flourished as a Buddhist school under its fourth patriarch, Zhiyi (538-597 C.E.), who asserted that the Lotus Sutra (that is, The Sutra of the Lotus Blossom of the Subtle Dharma, Miaofa Lianhua Jing) contained the supreme teaching of Buddhism. The school derives its name from the Tiantai Mountain that served as its most important monastic community and the one at which Zhiyi studied.
Two of Zhiyi’s most important philosophical teachings are “the Ten Ways of Existing in Reality” and “The Threefold Truth.”
The most distinctive ontological claim of Tiantai is that there is only one reality, which is both the phenomenal existence of our everyday experience and nirvana itself. There is no transcendent dimension or place that exists apart from the reality we are experiencing here and now. In fact, Tiantai writings describe 10 ways one may exist in reality:
- Hell Beings
- Hungry Ghosts
- Beasts (that is, beings of animal nature)
- Asuras (demons)
- Human Beings
- Gods or celestial creatures
- Voice-hearers (Skravakas)
- Self-enlightened Ones (Pratyekabuddhas)
- Living Buddhas
In Tiantai ontology, the reality that the Hell Beings inhabit is the same reality in which the Buddhas live. There is no supernatural boundary between these ways of existing or transcendent place to which some go (for example, Heaven), while others dwell elsewhere (Hell). Living and working next to us may be one who is a Hell Being or a Bodhisattva or even a Buddha. Indeed, we ourselves may be demons or Bodhisattvas, depending on whether we follow the Buddhist way.
Zhiyi’s Teaching of the Threefold Truth (san di) may be summarized in the following way. 1) We can make true statements about the world of existing things. These truths are about things that exist and their interactions in a network of interdependent causes. These are the truths of history, science, and so forth. The truth of a statement here is verified by testing it over against the world of our experience. 2) It is also true to say that all things are empty (kong di) and have no permanence. There is no permanent essence to anything in our world of experience, including ourselves. Everything in reality is devoid of any permanent essence. 3) The third character of truth is that the mundane or phenomenal world is real and at the same time it is impermanent and ultimately empty.
The Great Calming and Contemplation (Mohe zhiguan), a massive treatise of edited lectures by Zhiyi on meditation, offers the teaching that we may dwell in one or more of the Buddhist 10 realms at any given time. The more one moves in calm and contemplation toward Buddha consciousness, however, the more the other realms of consciousness recede and eventually dissipate. The contents of the work are organized into 10 chapters, which systematically trace the perfect path of calming and contemplation to the final actualization of Buddhahood itself. The translation by Daniel Stevenson (1996) is available electronically at http://chancenter.org/cmc/1996/08/26/selections-from-chi-is-great-calming-and-contemplation/.
Xuanzang (602-664 C.E.), born Chen Hui, was a Chinese Buddhist monk, scholar, traveler, and translator in the early Tang dynasty. Born in Chenhe village, near present-day Luoyang in what is now Henan province in 602, his family was well educated. Although he received an orthodox Confucian education, he lived for five years at Jingtu monastery (Jingtu si) in Luoyan. He spent more than 10 years traveling and studying in India. When he returned, he brought back 657 Buddhist texts and devoted the remainder of his life to a translation school he established in Chang’an (Xi’an). His travels in India are recorded in detail in the classic Chinese text Great Tang Records on the Western Regions (Da Tang Xiyuji), which in turn provided the inspiration for the fictitious religious novel Journey to the West (Xiyou ji) written by Wu Cheng'en during the Ming dynasty, around nine centuries after Xuanzang's death. Xuanzang’s creation in China of the “Consciousness-only” School of Buddhism (Weishi zong) was greatly influenced by the writings of the Indian Yogacara master, Vasubandhu (Chinese name, Shi Qin). Xuanzang wrote an extensive commentary in 10 volumes on Vasubandhu’s text Thirty Stanzas of Consciousness-Only entitled, A Treatise on the Establishment of Consciousness-Only (Cheng Wei-shi Lun), and used it to set out his own views of this tradition of Buddhist teaching. The only complete English translation of Xuanzang’s Treatise is by Tat Wei (1973), but Chan’s Sourcebook (1973: ch. 23) contains excerpts from it.
The central ontological tenet of Consciousness-only Buddhism is that nothing exists but consciousness. Of course, this is in direct conflict with early Chinese ontology since qi is an energy that may produce consciousness but is not itself a form of consciousness. According to Consciousness-only philosophy, we have a flow of experienced ideas that we also call perceptions. However, these ideas or perceptions are not caused by concrete or material things external to us and that continue to exist whether we are conscious of them or not. In philosophical language, the ontology of Consciousness-only is simply called Idealism.
Chan Buddhism developed in China between the 6th and 8th centuries C.E. It is regarded as a uniquely Chinese form of Buddhism that later was transplanted into Japan, where it became prominent as Zen. The Chinese word chan is used to translate the Sanskrit dhyana, which means “meditation.” Although regarded as Chinese in origin and tenor, the founding legend of Chan is that the Buddha transmitted a private esoteric teaching, never written on any sutra, but passed only from one teacher to another. The twenty-eighth patriarch in this lineage of transmission is known as Bodhidharma (470-543 C.E.), and he is said to have brought the teaching to China.
In the history of Chan, there is a Northern and Southern School. The Northern followed Shenxiu (c. 605–706 C.E.) as its patriarch, and the Southern followed Dajian Huineng (638–713 C.E.). According to the Platform Sutra of the Sixth Patriarch, regarded as the canonical expression of Chan philosophy, the split between these schools arose over who should succeed Hongren (601–74 C.E.) who was the fifth patriarch of Chan. The sutra tells the story of Huineng’s ascendancy to that role.
Chan’s theory of knowledge is concerned with one’s own mind, elevating in importance that which is known by the mind through immediate, direct acquaintance. When Chan philosophers claim that we know the world through our own minds, they do not identify mind with the thoughts presently in front of us. They mean one’s original mind, before the mind was clouded over by experiences or human distinctions made in language. It is in our original minds that we have awareness of absolutely certain truth. D. T. Suzuki says this knowledge “is not derivative but primitive; not inferential, not rationalistic, not mediational, but direct, immediate; not analytical but synthetic; not cognitive, but symbolical; not intending but merely expressive; not abstract, but concrete; not processional, not purposive, but ultimate, final and irreducible; not eternally receding, but infinitely inclusive; etc.” (1956: 34).
The village lecture system of Song dynasty China made use of morality books (shanshu) to create, shape, and transmit a unified moral culture throughout the empire. Arguably, the most important of these was Tract of the Most Exalted on Action and Response (Taishang ganying pian). The Tract likely reached its final form between the 10th and 12th centuries C.E., and it is still widely available today. Although primarily a work of Daoist spiritual piety and relatively brief in length, having only 1,277 characters, it shows numerous Buddhist and Confucian influences and moral injunctions as well, thereby representing in itself the “Three Teachings (sanjiao)” of China. The work attributes its own authorship to Taishang, by which is meant Laozi. The term ganying employed in the title of the work is a way of speaking about sowing and reaping or receiving the results of one’s action, a concept used often in the Masters of Huainan and frequently associated with the Buddhist notion of karma when it entered China. The work builds on earlier Chinese moral tracts of similar scope and teaching such as The Code of Nuqing for Controlling Ghosts (probably composed sometime between 143 and 224 C.E.) and Ge Hong’s (283-343 C.E.) merit system in The Master Who Embraces Simplicity (c. 316 C.E.).
Like these earlier works, the Tract represents an extremely quantitative view of morality, relying on the counting of good and evil deeds as way of predicting coming blessings or punishments, including the shortening or lengthening of life. In the introductory remarks of the Tract, Taishang says that moral transgressions reduce a person’s lifespan and poverty comes upon the immoral person. The immoral person meets with calamity and misery, and all men hate him. In this work, Taishang reports a bureaucracy of numinal beings who are record keepers in charge of recording the good and evil deeds of every individual. According to the text, those who wish to attain to a celestial spiritual life should perform a net result of 1,300 good deeds, and those who wish to attain an indefinite earthly life should perform 300. One’s moral deeds are kept, as it were, on a ledger and counted by the celestial powers. Evil deeds do not disappear from one’s ledger, indicating their lasting effect, but they may be counter-balanced by good works.
T. Suzuki’sand Paul Carus’ translation is entitledTreatise on Response & Retribution.
Zhou Dunyi’s (1017-1073 C.E.) Diagram of the Supreme Ultimate Explained (Taiji tushuo) is a work of importance to the articulation of the common understanding of the structure of reality that we find in the Neo-Confucian thinkers, including Cheng Hao (1032-1085 C.E.), Cheng Yi (1033-1107 C.E.), and Zhu Xi (1130-1200 C.E.). All of the most important concepts of the Chinese worldview as it was being understood and remade during the 11th to 13th centuries C.E. are present in Zhou Dunyi’s essay: qi, yin and yang, the five phases (wuxing), principle (li 理), and the trigrams and hexagrams of the Yijing. A translation may be found in Bryan W. Van Norden’s and Justin Tiwald’s Readings in Later Chinese Philosophy: Han to the Twentieth Century.
The Cheng brothers made a powerful impact on the development of Neo-Confucian thought. Cheng Hao was one of the principal figures of the Neo-Confucian movement, and his work connected ontology and morality in a skillful way. His brother Cheng Yi reinterpreted a number of key figures and ideas in Chinese classical philosophy, giving them a distinctive Neo-Confucian flavor. The translations of their work by Philip J. Ivanhoe in Readings in Later Chinese Philosophy: Han to the Twentieth Century are based upon the Chinese texts found in Collected Works of the Two Chengs (Er Cheng ji).
Zhu Xi was born in Youqi in Fujian province, China in 1130 C.E. His early interests were in Daoism and Buddhism, but he became the student of Li Tong (1093-1163 C.E.). Li worked within the philosophical tradition of Cheng Hao and Cheng Yi. Zhu Xi compiled an anthology of these thinkers known as Reflections on Things at Hand that became essentially the primer for Neo-Confucianism for generations. If we were to compare him to Western philosophers of the same far-reaching influence, we would take note of Aristotle’s influence in the classical period, Thomas Aquinas in the Medieval period, and Immanuel Kant in the Enlightenment period. He ranks along with Confucius and Mencius as one of the three preeminent thinkers of China. As such, his philosophy represents the most thoroughgoing example of Neo-Confucianism.
One of Zhu Xi’s greatest accomplishments was collecting and compiling the Four Books (sishu), which were made the foundation of the all-important imperial examinations. His systematization of Confucianism into a coherent program of education became the foundation for educational systems in China, Korea, and Japan. Zhu Xi’s oral teachings to students are preserved in Conversations of Master Zhu, Arranged Topically or Categorized Conversations (1270). The translation of excerpts from this text by Bryan W. Van Norden in Readings in Later Chinese Philosophy: Han to the Twentieth Century is based on Zhuzi yulei, vol. 1 (1986 reprint edition) as well as Fung Yulan (Feng Youlan)’s A History of Chinese Philosophy: The Period of Classical Learning, vol. 2.
Wang Yangming, a Ming dynasty general and official, practiced Daoist “sitting in forgetfulness (zuowang),” grasped the realization of the unity of knowledge and action that Daoist thinkers know as wu-wei, and taught that the highest form of knowledge was what he called “pure knowledge (liangzhi),” resembling in many ways the epistemology of Chan (Zen) Buddhism. The principal sources for Wang’s ideas are his works, A Record for Practice (1518 C.E., Chuan Xilu) and “Inquiry on the Great Learning” (1527 C.E., Daxue Wen). Excerpts from these texts have been translated by Philip J. Ivanhoe in Readings from the Lu-Wang School of Neo-Confucianism.
Wang actually had a rather stormy career due in large measure to his opposition to the philosophy of Zhu Xi. He departed from Zhu in both his ontology and epistemology. In fact, during the Ming dynasty (1368-1644 C.E.), Wang Yangming became the most deliberative of Zhu Xi’s critics, even if he continued to use much of the philosophical vocabulary of Zhu Xi and other Neo-Confucians.
Dai Zhen was born in Longfu City (Tunxi city) in Anhui Province into the family of a poor cloth merchant. He devoted himself to the study of the basic works of Chinese philosophy. His two most prominent philosophical works are entitled On the Good (Yuanshan) and An Evidential Commentary on the Meaning of Terms in the Mengzi (Mengzi Ziyi Shu). Dai Zhen’s Evidential Commentary is organized into several parts, each devoted to a particular philosophical term or phrase. His approach is to begin the analysis of each important concept with a philological analysis. Sometimes he shows how the term or phrase was used in selected passages in the history of Chinese philosophy. One of his principal goals is to correct misunderstandings, most particularly those he associates with the Neo-Confucians with respect to their views on reality’s Principle(s) (li) and our human desires. Dai makes the point that, unlike Buddhism’s rejection of all desire as the root of suffering, some desires may actually be positive. Selections from this text, translated by Justin Tiwald, may be found in Readings in Later Chinese Philosophy: Han Dynasty to the 20th Century.
Kang Youwei was a committed Chinese nationalist in the last years of the Qing dynasty (1644-1912 C.E.). He developed a philosophical construction of a utopian state entitled Book of Great Unity (Da Tong Shu), which should be considered along with other such political visions developed in world philosophy as Plato’s Republic. The work was not published in its entirety until 1935, eight years after Kang’s death. Laurence G. Thompson’s translation of Book of Great Unity is entitled The One-World Philosophy of K’ang Yu-wei.
Zhang Dongsun was well educated in the philosophy and method of the Western philosopher Immanuel Kant. He even interpreted Confucianism along Kantian lines. As an intellectual, he was quite active in government during the early years of the People’s Republic of China but was sent to a re-education camp during the Cultural Revolution (1966-1976 C.E.). He is best known for articulating a “pluralistic epistemology” that emphasizes the importance of sociology, culture, and language in the shaping of worldviews and philosophical approaches. His essay, “A Chinese Philosopher's Theory of Knowledge,” appears in Our Language and Our World: Selections from Etc.: A Review of General Semantics.
Although influenced by Buddhism in his youth, Hu Shi studied in Shanghai in three schools known for their curriculum called “the New Education,” which was a reference both to a Western style of learning and its content. He later completed his Ph.D. in Philosophy under the direction of John Dewey at Columbia University in the U. S. A. After completing his doctorate in 1917 C.E., he returned to China to become professor of Chinese and Western philosophy at Beijing University. He was instrumental in the development of the New Culture Movement (1912-1920 C.E.) that was dedicated to the modernization of Chinese learning and social progress. He was also a key figure in introducing Pragmatism and scientific research methodologies to China. A succinct representation of the shift to Western science in China during the 20th century is Hu’s “New Credo.”
Mao Zedong was born in a village in Hunan province into a well-to-do farming family. He was influenced by Sun Yat-sen’s calls for a Republic of China and read widely from Western texts, including Darwin, Mill, and Rousseau. When the May Fourth Movement (May 4, 1919) erupted in Beijing as a response to imperialism, Mao started a magazine in Changsha and called for a union of the popular masses, the liberation of women, and a new Chinese nationalism. When the Communist Party was founded in Shanghai in 1921, Mao started a branch in Changsha. From 1923 to 1925, he worked as a member of the Party Committee alongside the KMT (Kuomintang/Nationalists) and even ran the KMT activities in Hunan. After 1927, Mao became commander of the Red Army or People’s Liberation Army. He later became the first Chairman of the Central Committee of the Chinese Communist Party of the People’s Republic of China and the “Father of the Nation.”
The complete collected works of Mao from 1917-1945 are available in English at the U. S. Government’s Joint Publications Research Service, where all articles signed by Chairman Mao individually or jointly, as well as those unsigned but verified as his, are available http://marxists.org/reference/archive/mao/works/collected-works-pdf/index.htm. For works after 1945, Selected Works of Mao Zedong (1968) is also a good source for his work: http://www.marxists.org/reference/archive/mao/selected-works/index.htm.
While some question Mao’s credentials as a philosopher, actually he did educate himself extensively with regard to Chinese history and philosophy. Of course, Mao’s concerns are directed into a relatively narrow range of philosophical inquiry: specifically, social, political, and economic thought.
Kang Xiaoguang has taken up the challenge to offer a political philosophy for China’s post-Mao years in several works. A good overview of his views in English is David Ownby’s “Kang Xiaoguang: Social Science, Civil Society, and Confucian Religion.” Kang’s principal philosophical claim is that the Chinese Community Party must be Confucianized. He thinks that what remains of Marxism in Chinese socio-political ideology of the Party should be replaced with a reconstituted and adapted version of the philosophies of Confucius and Mencius. In his program, while the educational system will be kept within the party schools, their syllabi should be changed, listing the Four Books and Five Classics as required courses of study. He calls for a return to the examination system for all promotions within the bureaucracy and argues that Confucian philosophical teachings should be a major component of each examination. Moreover, he also maintains that not merely the political system of China, but also the society must be Confucianized. Kang holds that only by introducing Confucianism into the national education system can China regain its value system, as well as possess again a faith and soul for its culture. In his view, this can be achieved only if Confucianism becomes the state’s civil value system.
The New Confucian Movement is a complex and overlapping group of scholars from mainland China to the U. S. A. One thinker who is contributing to this movement is Tu Wei-ming (Du Weiming, 1940-). Having taught and written for many years in the U. S. A., Tu became the founding Dean of the Institute for Advanced Humanistic Studies at Beijing University in 2010. A five-volume anthology of his works was published in Chinese in 2001. One representative example of his work is the essay entitled “Beyond the Enlightenment Mentality: A Confucian Perspective on Ethics, Migration, and Global Stewardship.”
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U. S. A.