Phenomenal states are mental states in which there is something that it is like for their subjects to be in; they are states with a phenomenology. What it is like to be in a mental state is that state´s phenomenal character. There is general agreement among philosophers of mind that the category of mental states includes at least some sensory states. For example, there is something that it is like to taste chocolate, to smell coffee, to feel the wind in one´s hair, to see the blue sky and to feel a pain in one´s toe. Is there also something that it is like to consciously think, to consciously judge and to consciously believe something? Are such cognitive states, when conscious, phenomenal states? Is there a clear distinction between sensory states and cognitive states? Or, can our knowledge, thoughts and beliefs influence our sensory experiences? Is there a cognitive phenomenology?
It is challenging to give a clear characterization of the cognitive phenomenology debate, since different contributors conceive of the debate in different ways. Central for the debate is the question of whether conscious thoughts possess a non-sensory phenomenology. Intuitively, there is something that it is like to consciously think, consciously judge and consciously believe something. However, the debate about cognitive phenomenology is not, strictly speaking, about whether there is something that it is like to consciously think. Rather, the debate concerns the nature of cognitive phenomenology. Is the phenomenology of cognitive states reducible to purely sensory phenomenology? Or, is there an irreducible cognitive phenomenology? A sceptic about cognitive phenomenology claims that conscious cognitive states are non-phenomenal. But, conscious cognitive states may seem to be phenomenal because they are accompanied by sensory states. For instance, when one thinks that ´Paris is a beautiful city`, one´s thought may be expressed in inner-speech and an image of Paris may accompany it. These accompanying sensory states are phenomenal states, and not the thought itself. Contrary to this, the proponent of cognitive phenomenology claims that a conscious cognitive state can have a phenomenology that is irreducible to purely sensory phenomenology.
Other debates have also been placed under the ´cognitive phenomenology’ label. There is an ongoing debate within the philosophy of perception about how cognition influences our sensory experiences. Philosophers tend to agree that, for example, an expert ornithologist´s perceptual experience of a type of bird can differ from that of a novice, even if the viewing conditions for both expert and novice are the same. The expert´s knowledge of birds can influence her experience. However, what philosophers disagree about is how the expert´s knowledge influences her experience, and how her knowledge contributes to what her experience is like.
Table of Contents
- The Nature of Cognitive Phenomenology
- Arguments for Cognitive Phenomenology
- Implications of the Cognitive Phenomenology Debate
- References and Further Reading
When this article talks about a state being conscious, being conscious should be understood as being phenomenally conscious. A phenomenal state is a mental state that is phenomenally conscious in that there is something that it is like for the subject of that state to be in that state. Phenomenal states are states with phenomenology. What it is like to be in a phenomenal state is that state´s phenomenal character. An example of a phenomenal state is a visual experience of the blueness of the sea. Another example is an auditory experience of the sound of waves. There is something that it is like to have these experiences. There is also something that it is like to simultaneously visually experiencing the blueness of the sea and auditorily experiencing the sound of the waves (Bayne & Chalmers 2003). Our everyday conscious experiences are often complex in that they involve simultaneously thinking, feeling and experiencing within different sensory modalities. Such a complex experience is referred to as an overall phenomenal state.
Examples of sensory mental states are perceptual states, proprioception, bodily feelings and pains. Examples of cognitive states are thoughts, judgments and beliefs. According to some views, emotions and categorical perceptual experiences (such as experiencing something as being a type of bird) should also be categorized as cognitive states, or as partly cognitive and partly sensory states (see Chudnoff 2015a, Montague 2017).
Traditionally, it was common to distinguish between two kinds of mental states, namely sensory states and propositional attitudes. Paradigmatic examples of propositional attitudes are cognitive states such as beliefs, desires, thoughts and judgements. Propositional attitudes are intentional states since they are about or represent objects, properties or states of affair. They are states with propositional contents that can be linguistically expressed by using a ´that-clause`. The content of my belief ´that it will rain tomorrow` is ´that it will rain tomorrow`. When I believe ´that it will rain tomorrow` I am having a certain attitude towards that content, namely the attitude of belief. I could have had a different attitude towards the same content, I could for instance desire ´that it will rain tomorrow`.
According to the traditional view, sensory mental states, unlike cognitive states, have qualia. On this view, qualia are seen as phenomenal properties that can be separated from intentional or representational properties. For example, my visual experience of a red rose in front of me is intentional in that it is about or represents ´that there is a red rose in front of me`, but it is also something that it is like for me to experience the red rose. The redness that I experience is a property of my experience, a quale. While conscious sensory states are regarded as phenomenal states with qualia, conscious cognitive states are said to lack qualia. They are seen as non-phenomenal states.
Lately, this traditional view has been challenged. Firstly, proponents of intentionalism argue that when I experience a red rose I experience the redness as a property of the rose itself, and not as a property of my experience of the rose. My experience of the red rose has a phenomenal character, but this phenomenal character is embedded in the intentional content of my experience. Secondly, proponents of cognitive phenomenology challenge the assumption that cognitive states are non-phenomenal states when conscious.
In their seminal paper from 2002 ‘The Intentionality of Phenomenology and the Phenomenology of Intentionality’, Horgan and Tienson argue against the traditional view and argue in favour of intentionalism and cognitive phenomenology. They also argue for a view about the relation between the intentional and the phenomenal that has recently gained popularity, Phenomenal intentionalism.
According to intentionalism, all mental states are intentional, including phenomenal states. A mental state is commonly regarded as intentional if it is about or directed towards some objects or states of affairs, and if it has a content.
Phenomenal intentionality is a kind of intentionality that is said to be grounded in phenomenal consciousness (Kriegel 2011, Mendelovici 2018). According to proponents of Phenomenal intentionalism, there is a Phenomenal intentionality and all other forms of intentionality are derived from Phenomenal intentionality. While other proponents of intentionalism hold that intentionality is primary to phenomenology (see for example, Tye 1995 and Dretske 1995), proponents of Phenomenal intentionalism claim that phenomenology or Phenomenal intentionality is primary to all other forms of intentionality (Horgan & Tienson 2002, Kriegel 2011, Mendelovici 2018).
While most proponents of Phenomenal intentionalism also claim that there is a cognitive phenomenology, the two views should not be intermingled. Phenomenal intentionalism is a view about what it is that grounds the relation between phenomenal consciousness and intentionality, while cognitive phenomenology is a view about the scope of phenomenal consciousness. A proponent of cognitive phenomenology needs not accept Phenomenal intentionalism, and it is not necessary for a proponent of Phenomenal intentionalism to hold that there is a cognitive phenomenology. However, since proponents of Phenomenal intentionalism claim that all intentionality is derived from Phenomenal intentionality, it is easier to explain the intentionality of cognitive states if one holds that conscious cognitive states are phenomenal states. If one denies that there is a cognitive phenomenology and accepts Phenomenal intentionalism, one needs to tell a story about how the intentionality of cognitive states is derived from the Phenomenal intentionality of sensory states. While if one holds that there is a cognitive phenomenology one can simply claim that the intentionality of non-conscious cognitive states (such as dispositional beliefs) is derived from the Phenomenal intentionality of conscious cognitive states.
The debate about whether or not there is a cognitive phenomenology can seem bewildering since there are different claims about what cognitive phenomenology is, and these claims may vary in both strength and generality.
According to Elijah Chudnoff (2015a), a proponent of cognitive phenomenology should minimally accept the irreducibility thesis.
Irreducibility: ‘Some cognitive states put one in phenomenal states for which no wholly sensory states suffices’ (Chudnoff 2015a: 15).
It follows from Irreducibility that some cognitive states are such that because one is in them one is in a phenomenal state for which no wholly sensory states suffice. That is, there is a phenomenal character that is over and above the phenomenal character that accrues for sensory states. Putting one in a phenomenal state should be understood as a non-causal explanatory relation that can alternatively be picked out by ´in virtue of` or ´constitutively dependent on` (see Chudnoff 2015b).
In order to get a better grip on the Irreducibility thesis we can contrast it with an alternative view on the relation between cognitive states and phenomenal states. It is uncontroversial to claim that cognitive states can make an impact on our sensory states. For instance, judging that the sum of the angles of a triangle is 180 degrees can lead one to visualize the triangle or to express sentences such as ´the sum of the angles of a triangle is 180 degrees` in inner speech. In this case, one is in a phenomenal state since one is in a certain cognitive state, but the phenomenal state one is in is not different from the phenomenal state various wholly sensory states can put one in (Chudnoff 2015a). What Irreducibility claims is that some cognitive states can put one in phenomenal states that are different from those phenomenal states that wholly sensory states can put one in. Chudnoff uses an example from mathematics to illustrate how Irreducibility differs from the view that cognitive states merely cause one to be in a certain phenomenal state. At first you read that ´If a < 1, then 2 – 2a > 0`, and you wonder whether this is true (Chudnoff 2015a: 15). Then you realise how a´s being less than 1 makes 2a smaller than 2 and so 2 – 2a greater than 0. When you realise the truth of this mathematical proposition you might say to yourself in inner speech ´If a < 1, then 2 – 2a > 0` and you might visualize the variable ´a` and the numeral ´1`. You might also feel satisfied because you got it right. These states that you are put in are all sensory phenomenal states. However, if you believe Irreducibility and if you think that this case of realising the truth of this mathematical proposition involves cognitive phenomenology, then you also believe that these sensory states taken together cannot account for the overall phenomenal state you are in. You think that there is some phenomenal state that is left over which only the cognitive states of ´realising` or ´intuiting` can put you in.
Following Chudoff, Irreducibility is the thesis that a proponent of cognitive phenomenology must minimally accept. There are other theses figuring within the cognitive phenomenology debate that go beyond Irreducibility and make stronger and more specific claims about the nature of cognitive phenomenology.
According to Irreducibility, some sensory states put one in phenomenal states for which no wholly sensory states suffice to put one in. However, it does not follow from Irreducibility that only cognitive states put one in these phenomenal states. Neither does it follow from Irreducibility that the phenomenal character of the phenomenal states that cognitive states put one in is cognitively grounded. That is, that their phenomenal character is different in kind from sensory phenomenal character (Levine 2011).
Many proponents of cognitive phenomenology hold that there is a proprietary cognitive phenomenology (See Horgan & Tienson 2002, Horgan 2011, Kriegel 2011, Kriegel 2015a, Kriegel 2015b, Pitt 2004, Pitt 2011, Siewert 1998, Siewert 2011). The kind of phenomenology that philosophers are talking about when they are talking about cognitive phenomenology must differ in kind form the kind of phenomenology one is familiar with through one´s sensory experiences. As David Pitt puts it:
I believe that the phenomenology of occurrent conscious thought is proprietary: It´s a sui generis sort of phenomenology, as unlike, say, auditory or visual phenomenology as they are unlike each other—a cognitive phenomenology. (Pitt 2011: 141)
There is something that it is like to be in a conscious cognitive state and/or to consciously entertain a cognitive content, and this phenomenology is distinct from the phenomenology one experiences when one is consciously perceiving something or feeling something. Cognitive phenomenology is, on this view, proprietary and sui generis.
Proprietary: Conscious cognitive states have proprietary or sui generis phenomenal character.
Someone who accepts Proprietary also accepts Irreducibility, but one may accept Irreducibility and deny Proprietary. For example, one could claim that knowing a lot about sparrows may influence the way one visually experiences sparrows so that one can be put in phenomenal states for which no wholly sensory states suffice. One´s knowledge does not merely cause one to attend to sparrows in a particular way. Rather, one´s knowledge puts one in a phenomenal state that one could not have been put in by wholly sensory states. In such a case, cognitive states can make a constitutive contribution to one´s perceptual experience by, for example, structuring the experience, without thereby producing a phenomenal state that is non-sensory in kind (see Levine 2011, Nes 2011). However, most philosophers hold that cognitive states can cause one to be in certain sensory states by influencing attention. Carruthers and Veillet (2011) argue that it is not clear that the sparrow expert´s experience involves irreducible cognitive phenomenology, since it is possible that her knowledge simply causes her to attend to sparrows in a different way compared with a novice. She will notice certain properties of the sparrows that the novice fails to notice, but the phenomenal state she is in is a state that wholly sensory states suffice to put her in. How should we decide between these views?
If cognitive phenomenology is proprietary, it should in principle also be possible to pick it out via introspection. Holding that cognitive phenomenology is proprietary allows one to appeal to introspection in cases where there is a dispute about whether cognitive phenomenology is involved or not. This may serve as a motivation for holding that cognitive phenomenology is proprietary, and not merely irreducible.
We can further distinguish between three different ways of characterizing the nature of a phenomenal state: 1) A phenomenal state is purely sensory in case wholly sensory states suffice to put one in that state; 2) A phenomenal state can be partly cognitive (and partly sensory) if no wholly sensory states suffice to put one in that state and no wholly cognitive states suffice to put one in that state; 3) A phenomenal state is purely cognitive in case cognitive states suffice to put one in that state (Chudnoff 2015b). A cognitive phenomenal state is an impure cognitive phenomenal state if 2 holds but not 3. A cognitive phenomenal state is a pure cognitive phenomenal state if 3 holds. In other words, a cognitive phenomenal state is a pure cognitive phenomenal state if it is independent of sensory states.
A proponent of cognitive phenomenology needs not accept that there is pure cognitive phenomenology. It is compatible with Irreducibility that there is merely impure cognitive phenomenology. Many of the cases that are commonly appealed to in arguments for cognitive phenomenology seem to involve impure cognitive phenomenology. For instance, the overall phenomenal state one is in when one suddenly grasps a mathematical proposition arguably depends on both sensory experiences and intuiting. Proposed candidates for pure cognitive phenomenology are imageless thoughts and beliefs.
It is compatible with Irreducibility to deny that there is pure cognitive phenomenology. However, if one holds Proprietary one seems committed to accept that pure cognitive phenomenology is, at least, possible. Following Proprietary, cognitive phenomenology is different in kind from other kinds of phenomenology, and it should in principle be possible to pick out this kind of phenomenology via introspection. When one is in a phenomenal state that involves different sensory modalities—such as the state one is in when watching a TV-show—one seems able, at least roughly, to pick out and separate visual phenomenology from auditory phenomenology. This is because visual phenomenology is quite unlike auditory phenomenology. Similarly, when one is consciously thinking that p, one should be able to separate the phenomenology of thinking from the auditory phenomenology involved when expressing the content in inner-speech. On this view, cognitive phenomenology is a sui generis kind of phenomenology, as unlike auditory and visual phenomenology as they are unlike each other (Pitt 2004, Pitt 2011).
Cognitive states such as thoughts, beliefs, judgements and inferences are propositional attitudes. One may think that conscious cognitive states have attitudinal cognitive phenomenology PA:
PA: There is something that it is like to have a conscious cognitive attitude towards a content, and no wholly sensory states suffice to put one in a state with this phenomenal character.
PA is compatible with Irreducibility and Proprietary.
The claim that there is a cognitive phenomenology can also be a claim about the cognitive content that one is consciously entertaining when one is in a cognitive state. One may think that conscious cognitive states have content cognitive phenomenology CA:
CA: There is something that it is like to consciously entertain a cognitive content, and no wholly sensory states suffice to put one in a state with this phenomenal character.
A proponent of cognitive phenomenology can accept that there is an attitudinal cognitive phenomenology and deny that there is a content cognitive phenomenology. One can also hold that there is a content cognitive phenomenology, but not an attitudinal cognitive phenomenology. Or, one can accept that there is both an attitudinal cognitive phenomenology and a content cognitive phenomenology.
Cognitive phenomenology claims can be general claims such as the claim that conscious cognitive attitudes have attitudinal cognitive phenomenology, where this attitudinal cognitive phenomenology is common for all cognitive attitudes. Alternatively, cognitive phenomenology claims can be claims about there being a particular cognitive phenomenology involved when one is consciously believing, and this attitudinal cognitive phenomenology is different from the attitudinal cognitive phenomenology involved when one is having other conscious cognitive attitudes. One may also think of attitudinal cognitive phenomenology as even more fine-grained: for example, that there are different attitudinal cognitive phenomenologies involved in having different kinds of conscious beliefs.
The claim that there is a content phenomenology can be more or less general. The most general claim is that there is a content cognitive phenomenology that is common for all cognitive contents. A more particular view claims that the cognitive content phenomenology involved in consciously entertaining the content that p, say, differs from the cognitive content phenomenology involved in consciously entertaining that q. An even more particular view holds that the content cognitive phenomenology involved in consciously entertaining the content that p is different from the content phenomenology involved in consciously entertaining any other cognitive contents. Further, one could hold that the phenomenology involved in consciously entertaining the cognitive content that p may differ from person to person. For example, the content phenomenology involved when John consciously entertains the cognitive content that p, differs from the content phenomenology involved when Jane consciously entertains the cognitive content that p.
Particular claims about either attitudinal cognitive phenomenology and content cognitive phenomenology are often motivated by the view that phenomenology is individuative. That is, in virtue of having the phenomenal character it has, my belief is a belief as opposed to a judgment, a thought or an intuition. And, in virtue of having the phenomenal character it has, the content that I am entertaining, the content that p, is the very content that p as opposed to the content that q. By claiming that phenomenology is individuative one can elegantly explain how one can determine the content of one´s own phenomenal state. One knows which phenomenal state one is in, and its content, because it has the phenomenal character that it has. For instance, when I am having a visual experience of a red rose I come to know—via introspection—that I am having a visual experience of a red rose. Similarly, I come to know that I am consciously believing that p due to the phenomenal character belief that p has (Pitt, 2004, Horgan 2011, Kriegel 2011, Kriegel 2013).
We can distinguish between different types of arguments for cognitive phenomenology. These arguments are generally arguments for Irreducibility, but some of them also defend stronger claims about the nature of cognitive phenomenology. This section presents the types of arguments that are most commonly used and common responses to them.
Arguments from examples appeal to cases or circumstances where one seems to be in phenomenal states that involve cognitive phenomenology. For instance, there is something that it is like for me to suddenly remember that I have an appointment with a student in 5 minutes. The state that I am in when I suddenly remember something is a cognitive state. There can be sensory states involved as well; a visual image of my student may pop-up, or I may feel annoyed because I almost forgot about the appointment. The cognitive state I am in when I suddenly remember my appointment puts me in a phenomenal state, and no wholly sensory states suffice to put me in that state.
Another argument from example appeals to tip-of-the-tongue experiences, the kind of experiences one has when searching for a word that one knows but fails to retrieve (Goldman 1993). There is something that it Is like to have such experiences, and cognitive states play a role in putting one in that state, and no wholly sensory states suffice to put one in that state.
A sceptic about cognitive phenomenology may agree with the proponent of cognitive phenomenology in that the states that these arguments appeal to are phenomenal states, while denying that they are cognitive phenomenal states. According to the sceptic there is always some sensory states involved when one suddenly remembers something. When I remember that I have an appointment with my student in 5 minutes, I may visualize my student and feel annoyed by myself for almost forgetting about the appointment. The sensory states that I am in can, according to the sceptic, fully account for the phenomenal character of the state that I am in.
One can make a similar response to the tip-of-the-tongue example. When having a tip-of-the-tongue experience I am making an effort to retrieve a word, and it is the sensory feeling of making an effort that accounts for the phenomenal character of the experience.
A proponent of cognitive phenomenology can insist that if one carefully introspects one´s phenomenal states, it becomes apparent to one that these states involve cognitive phenomenology. However, such appeals to introspection are problematic because a sceptic may simply claim that she is carefully introspecting the phenomenal state she is in when she suddenly remembers something, but she finds only sensory phenomenology. Nevertheless, it seems wrong to completely dismiss appeals to introspection, as some such appeals appear more convincing than others. Charles Siewert (1999) argues that the sensory states involved in cases where one suddenly remembers something occur after the state of suddenly remembering. The state that one is in when suddenly remembering something needs not involve any sensory phenomenology at all. Following Siewert, the state of suddenly remembering is a pure cognitive phenomenal state (Siewert 1999).
One of the most commonly used type of argument for cognitive phenomenology is contrast arguments. Contrast arguments for cognitive phenomenology appeal to two contrasting phenomenal states, s1 and s2, where there appears to be a difference in the phenomenal character of s1 and s2, and where this difference is best explained as a difference in cognitive phenomenology. Contrast arguments can be used when arguing for attitudinal cognitive phenomenology, content cognitive phenomenology, pure and impure cognitive phenomenology. The expert/novice argument that is introduced earlier in this article can be seen as a contrast argument.
When contrast arguments are used as argument for attitudinal cognitive phenomenology one typically appeals to cases where there is a slight change in one´s attitude towards a content. An example is the change of attitude one experiences when one suddenly grasps a mathematical proof. There is something that it is like to grasp a mathematical proof, and the state one is in when one suddenly grasps it differs from the state one was in before grasping it.
When contrast arguments are used as arguments for content phenomenology one typically appeals to a pair of situations where one is attending to the meaning of an ambiguous utterance in natural language, and where there appears to be a phenomenal difference in the states one is in depending on which proposition one takes the utterance to express (Horgan & Tienson 2002).
Contrast arguments can be more or less convincing, depending on how easy it is to give an alternative explanation of the contrast, and on whether the claim that there is a contrast is convincing.
´The foreign language argument’, due to Galen Strawson (1994), is maybe the most famous contrast argument for cognitive phenomenology: Jack is a native English speaker who does not understand French, while Jacques is a native French speaker. Both Jack and Jacques hear the same instance of the utterance ´La vie est belle`. There is something that it is like for both Jack and Jacques to hear the utterance, though what it is like for Jacques differs from what it is like for Jack. So, Jack and Jacques are put in different phenomenal states. The difference in the phenomenal character of their states can be explained by the fact that Jacques, unlike Jack, understands what is being said. Jacques, unlike Jack, has an attitude of understanding towards the content, and he is able to consciously entertain the content that is being expressed. In the case of Jacques, unlike Jack, cognitive states of understanding and entertaining a content put him in a phenomenal state, and this explains why the phenomenal state he is in differs from the phenomenal state Jack is in. In order to make the foreign language argument into an argument for cognitive phenomenology one needs to add that the phenomenal difference between Jack`s and Jacques` states is a difference in cognitive phenomenology.
However, in this case, at least some of the differences between the two phenomenal states involve differences in sensory phenomenology. From phonetic studies, we know that a sentence expressed in a language sounds different for a person who understands that language, compared to what it sounds like for a person who does not understand the language (Pinker 1995). This difference is at least partly auditory. The person who understands the language attends differently to the phonemes and prosody of the utterance compared with the person who does not understand the language. A sceptic about cognitive phenomenology may therefore agree that there is a phenomenal difference between the states that Jack and Jacques are in, but claim that the difference is a difference in purely sensory phenomenology (Lormand 1996). The proponent of cognitive phenomenology may insist that though the phenomenal states of Jack and Jacques also differ in sensory phenomenology, the differences in sensory phenomenology do not sufficiently explain the whole phenomenal difference.
A different type of contrast argument that appeals to ambiguous utterances in a familiar language has been proposed by, among others, Kriegel 2011, Horgan 2011, Horgan & Tienson 2002 and Siewert 1999. For example: it is something that it is like to hear the ambiguous utterance ´I am going to the bank` where one understands this utterance as being about the financial institution, as opposed to what it is like to hear the same instance of the utterance and understand it as being about the river bank. One is in different phenomenal states depending on which proposition one consciously entertains. Arguably, given that one accepts that there is a phenomenal difference between these states, this difference is best explained as a difference in cognitive phenomenology.
In this case, the argument is appealing to the same instance of utterance in a language that one does understand. A sceptic who agrees that there is phenomenal difference between the two states may possibly claim that the different understandings cause one to be in different sensory states, and that the phenomenal difference is due to this. However, it is less easy, compared with the foreign language argument, to see what candidates for such states would be. Surely, hearing the utterance and understanding it as ´I am going to the financial institution` may cause some emotional responses in someone who has financial problems, but it needs not have such an effect. Apparently, one needs not respond emotionally to either of the two understandings of the utterance. Also, one may, but one needs not visualize the financial institution or the river bank when hearing the utterance. Arguably, one´s sensory states can remain the same, regardless of which of the two understandings one consciously entertains, and still there is a phenomenal difference. Therefore, if there is a phenomenal difference in this contrast case, the most plausible candidate for explaining the difference is that there is a difference in cognitive phenomenology. One is put in different phenomenal states, and no wholly sensory states suffice to put one in these phenomenal states. Contrast arguments involving ambiguous utterances of this type have the virtue that if there is a phenomenal contrast in these cases, this contrast is difficult to explain away as a contrast in sensory phenomenology. One way of responding to such contrast arguments is to deny that there is a phenomenal contrast. That is, one is not in different phenomenal states in such cases.
The self-knowledge argument that was originally presented by David Pitt (2004) is a very complex argument, and this article presents only a rough version of it.
The argument from self-knowledge differs from the types of arguments introduced above in that it explicitly supports a strong cognitive phenomenology claim: the claim that there is a proprietary, distinctive and individuative cognitive phenomenology. According to the argument, we can have immediate knowledge of the content of our own conscious thoughts, and the only way we can explain how such knowledge is possible is by assuming that there is a proprietary, distinctive and individuative cognitive phenomenology of thought. From this it follows that one is able to consciously do three distinct things: a) to distinguish one´s occurrent conscious thoughts from one´s other occurrent conscious mental states (cognitive phenomenology is proprietary); b) to distinguish one´s occurrent conscious thoughts from each other (cognitive phenomenology is distinctive); c) to identify each of one´s occurrent conscious thoughts as the thought it is (cognitive phenomenology is individuative).
According to the self-knowledge argument (Pitt 2004):
P1: It is possible immediately to identify one´s occurrent conscious thoughts: one can know by acquaintance (via introspection) which thought a particular occurrent thought is: but
P2: It would not be possible immediately to identify one´s conscious thought unless each type of conscious thought had a proprietary, distinctive, individuative phenomenology, so
C: Each type of conscious thought—each state of consciously thinking that p, for all thinkable contents p—has a proprietary, distinctive, individuative phenomenology.
The argument is valid. Before questioning the premises, we should say something about what it is that motivates them.
Intuitively, one does know the content of one´s conscious thoughts, and one has a privileged introspective access to one´s own thoughts that other people lack. I know when I am thinking ´that pizza is good`, and I know that the mental state I am in is a thought and not a perceptual state. So, I am able to identify my thought as a thought, and I am able to identify the content of my thought and distinguish it from other thoughts.
However, according to the premises of the argument, it is possible to ´immediately` identify one´s occurrent conscious thoughts (P1). This premise relies on a particular view on introspection of phenomenal states—the acquaintance theory—that is controversial. On this view, introspection makes one directly or immediately aware of one´s phenomenal states and their contents. No inferences are made and no causal processes are involved. If one holds a different view on introspection one can simply deny P1 and the argument for self-knowledge. In his article, Pitt strongly defends the acquaintance theory of introspection. For further reading consult Pitt 2004 and Pitt 2011.
Contrast arguments and arguments from examples are generally neutral when it comes to whether they are arguments for pure or impure cognitive phenomenology.
However, Kriegel´s cognitive zombie argument is an argument for pure cognitive phenomenology (see Kriegel 2015b and Chudnoff 2015b). A philosophical zombie is a being that acts and talks like a phenomenally conscious being, but who completely lacks phenomenal states. In other words, there is nothing that it is like to be a zombie (see Chalmers 1996).
Imagine a partial zombie, Zoe, who is an expert mathematician. Zoe is also a sensory zombie, in that there is nothing that it is like for her to have sensory experiences. Still, there is something that it is like for her to gain new mathematical insights. Since Zoe is a sensory zombie the phenomenal states she is in when gaining new mathematical insights are purely cognitive phenomenal states.
A sceptic may respond to this thought experiment by claiming that since Zoe is a sensory zombie, there is nothing that it is like for her to gain these insights. One may insist that cognitive states do not suffice to put one in the phenomenal states that one is normally put in when one grasps something or gains a new insight. The sceptic can either claim that the phenomenology involved in being in such phenomenal states is purely sensory, or she could hold that it is impurely cognitive phenomenal.
In order to strengthen the appeal of this thought experiment, one can turn it into a contrast-argument. Imagine that Zoe turns into a full zombie. As a full zombie, there is nothing that it is like for her to gain mathematical insights. Intuitively, there is a phenomenal contrast between the states of sensory zombie Zoe, and the states of full zombie Zoe. While there is something that it is like for the sensory zombie Zoe to gain mathematical insights, there is nothing that it is like for the full zombie Zoe to do so. If we share the intuition that there is such a contrast between the two zombies, we should also accept that pure cognitive phenomenology is possible.
Interestingly, the cognitive zombie argument appears as more challenging for proponents of impure cognitive phenomenology who deny that there is pure cognitive phenomenology, than for a sceptic who denies that there is cognitive phenomenology. Sensory states within different sensory modalities can put one in certain phenomenal states. We can imagine a zombie who lacks sensory phenomenology in all sensory modalities apart from audition. Intuitively, since she has auditory phenomenal states there is something that it is like for her to watch a movie though her experience is clearly not as rich as that of an ordinary person. Similarly, even if it is normally the case that the phenomenal state one is in when grasping a mathematical proof is a phenomenal state that both sensory and cognitive states puts one in, still there is something that it is like for Zoe the sensory zombie to grasp mathematical proofs. Though Zoe´s phenomenal states may not be as rich as that of a normal person. (For further reading, consult Kriegel 2015b and Chudnoff 2015b.)
Philosophers of mind generally agree that conscious sensory states have phenomenal characters. We come to know what it is like to be in a certain conscious sensory state simply by being in that state. But, when it comes to irreducible cognitive phenomenology, philosophers strongly disagree about whether it exists or not. Why do they disagree?
Maybe the reason why philosophers disagree so strongly is that people simply differ? That is, some people have cognitive phenomenal states, while others do not (see Schwitzgebel 2008)? If this is the case, it can explain why highly competent philosophers on both sides of the debate come to different conclusions when introspecting their own conscious states. However, most philosophers seem to dismiss this possibility. What are the reasons for thinking that people differ so greatly in their phenomenal states? Why are there no similar controversies when it comes to disputes about sensory phenomenology?
What are the implications of the cognitive phenomenology debate? Why should we care about cognitive phenomenology?
One issue that arises from the cognitive phenomenology debate concerns the trustworthiness of introspection. If there is a cognitive phenomenology, then the opponents have overlooked a range of phenomenal states that they enjoy. On the other hand, if there is no cognitive phenomenology, the proponents have been positing a range of phenomenal states that they do not enjoy (Bayne & Montague 2011). Such considerations may lead us to question the reliability of introspection (Schwitzgebel 2008).
The cognitive phenomenology debate also has implications for the general debate about consciousness, since there are certain theories of consciousness that are at odds with the existence of cognitive phenomenology. For example, accounts that identify phenomenal states with intentional states with non-conceptual contents (see Tye 1995). Such views are not compatible with thoughts having a distinctive phenomenal character, since the content of a thought is conceptual.
Further, the cognitive phenomenology debate has implications for our view on the relationship between phenomenology and intentionality. Proponents of phenomenal intentionalism take phenomenology to be the source of intentionality (Kriegel 2013, Mendelvici 2018). Most proponents of phenomenal intentionalism hold that there is a cognitive phenomenology. If phenomenology is the source of intentionality, cognitive phenomenology is the source of the intentionality of cognitive states. If there is no cognitive phenomenology, the proponents of phenomenal intentionalism need to tell a different story of how phenomenology can be the source of the intentionality of cognitive states.
The cognitive phenomenology debate also has implications for the debate about whether consciousness can be naturalized. If only sensory states are phenomenal states, naturalizing cognition is part of what Chalmers (1996) labels ´the easy problem of consciousness`, while naturalizing conscious sensory states is part of ´the hard problem of consciousness`. The easy problems of consciousness are those that can be solved (in the future) by using the standard methods of cognitive science. Whereas the hard problem is that of explaining phenomenal consciousness (see “The Hard Problem of Consciousness”). If there is a cognitive phenomenology, the hard problem of consciousness becomes more expansive as it will include both sensory and cognitive phenomenal states. Arguably, therefore, if there is a cognitive phenomenology, naturalizing consciousness becomes harder. However, the hard problem remains ´hard` whether we accept that there is a cognitive phenomenology or not. If arguments convince us that there is a cognitive phenomenology, we should accept these independently of the fact that it has the consequence of expanding the hard problem.
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Mette Kristine Hansen
University of Bergen