Duality in Logic and Language

Duality phenomena occur in nearly all mathematically formalized disciplines, such as algebra, geometry, logic and natural language semantics. However, many of these disciplines use the term ‘duality’ in vastly different senses, and while some of these senses are intimately connected to each other, others seem to be entirely unrelated. Consequently, if the term ‘duality’ is used in two different senses in one and the same work, the authors often explicitly warn about the potential confusion.

This article focuses exclusively on duality phenomena involving the
interaction between an ‘external’ and an ‘internal’ negation of some kind, which arise primarily in logic and linguistics. A well-known example from logic is the duality between conjunction and disjunction in classical propositional logic: φ ∧ ψ is logically equivalent to ¬(¬φ ∨ ¬ψ). Hence, ¬(φ ∧ ψ) is logically equivalent to ¬φ ∨ ¬ψ. A well-known example from linguistics concerns the duality between the aspectual particles already and still in natural language: already outside means the same as not still inside, and hence, not already outside means the same as still inside (where inside is taken to be synonymous to not outside). Examples such as these show that dualities based on external/internal negation show up for a wide variety of logical and linguistic operators.

Duality phenomena of this kind are highly important. First of all, since they occur in formal as well as natural languages, they provide an interesting perspective on the interface between logic and linguistics. Furthermore, because of their ubiquity across natural languages, it has been suggested that duality is a semantic universal, which can be of great heuristic value. Finally, duality principles play a central role in Freudenthal’s famous proposal for a language for cosmic communication.

Many authors employ the notion of duality as a means to describe the specific details of a particular formal or natural language, without going into any systematic theorizing about this notion itself. Next to such auxiliary uses, however, there also exist more abstract, theoretical accounts that focus on the notion of duality itself. For example, these theoretical perspectives address the group-theoretical aspects of duality, or its interplay with the so-called Aristotelian relations. This article, on the one hand, looks at a wide variety of dualities in formal and natural languages, and, on the other hand, discusses some of the more theoretical perspectives on duality.

The article is organized as follows. Sections 1 and 2 provide an extensive overview of the most important concrete examples of duality in logic and natural language, respectively. Section 3 then describes a detailed framework (based on the notion of a Boolean algebra) that allows us to systematically analyze these dualities. Section 4 presents a group-theoretical approach to duality phenomena, and Section 5 draws an extensive comparison between duality relations and another type of logical relations, namely those characterizing the Aristotelian square of oppositions.

As to the technical prerequisites for this article, Sections 1 and 2 should be accessible to everyone with a basic understanding of philosophical logic. But in Sections 3, 4 and 5, the use of some other mathematical tools and techniques is unavoidable; these sections require a basic understanding of discrete mathematics (in particular, Boolean algebra and elementary group theory).

For the main body of this article, go to Duality in Logic and Language.

Author Information

Lorenz Demey
Email: lorenz.demey@kuleuven.be
Catholic University of Leuven


Hans Smessaert
Email: hans.smessaert@kuleuven.be
Catholic University of Leuven