Are all persons of equal moral worth? Is variation in income and wealth just? Does it matter that the allocation of income and wealth is shaped by undeserved luck? No one deserves the family into which they are born, their innate abilities, or their starting place in society, yet these have a dramatic impact on life outcomes.
Keeping in mind the extreme inequality in many countries, is there some obligation to pursue greater equality of income and wealth? Is inequality inherently unjust? Is equality a baseline from which we judge other distributions of goods? Do inequalities have to be justified by people somehow deserving what they have, or by inequality somehow improving society?
As a view within political philosophy, egalitarianism has to do both with how people are treated and with distributive justice. Civil rights movements reject certain types of social and political discrimination and demand that people be treated equally. Distributive justice is another form of egalitarianism that addresses life outcomes and the allocation of valuable things such as income, wealth, and other goods.
The proper metric of equality is a contentious issue. Is egalitarianism about subjective feelings of well-being, about wealth and income, about a broader conception of resources, or some other alternative? This leads us to the question of whether an equal distribution of the preferred metric deals with the starting gate of each person’s life (giving everyone a fair and equal opportunity to compete and succeed) or with equality of life outcomes. Egalitarianism also raises a question of scope. If there is an obligation to pursue distributive equality, does it apply only within particular states or globally?
See also Moral Egalitarianism.
Table of Contents
- What is Egalitarianism?
- Equality of What?
- Equality of Opportunity
- Domestic or Global?
- References and Further Reading
Consider three different claims about equality:
- All persons have equal moral and legal standing.
- In some contexts, it is unjust for people to be treated unequally on the basis of irrelevant traits.
- When persons’ opportunities or life outcomes are unequal in some important respect, we have a reason to lessen that inequality. (This reason is not necessarily decisive.)
All of these claims express a commitment to equality. They are each progressively more egalitarian. Understanding the difference between these claims, their normative implications, and the various ways the content of the third claim can be further specified, are crucial to understanding the disparate collection of philosophical views that compose egalitarianism.
Claim (1) entails claim (2), and therefore captures part of contemporary egalitarianism. If all persons are equal, then there are political constraints on how they can be treated unequally. Disenfranchisement and differential rights violate the equality affirmed in (1). (3) is even stronger than (2), because it is not only committed to treating people equally, but ensuring that people have equal amounts of some important good. There is controversy whether (1) entails, is merely compatible with, or is incompatible with (3).
The descriptive thesis found in claim (1) affirms the equality of all persons. This must not be the plainly false assertion that for any given trait, all persons are equal. We differ in our abilities, resources, opportunities, preferences, and temperaments. The claim must be about something more specific. All persons have equal moral worth or equal standing. The United States Declaration of Independence famously states that “all men are created equal.” Jeremy Bentham’s dictum “each to count for one, none to count for more than one,” is another expression of the descriptive thesis. While the conditions in which people live, their wealth and income, their abilities, their satisfaction, and their life prospects may radically differ, they are all morally equal. In moral and political deliberation, each person deserves equal concern. All should have equal moral and legal standing.
If all persons are equal in this way, then some forms of unequal treatment must be unjust. The descriptive thesis, applied within a particular state, at least entails equal rights and equal standing. Therefore (1) constrains how a just political society can be structured because it entails some degree of support for claim (2). The degree is debatable in terms of which contexts require equal treatment, what types of institutions must treat people equally, and so on. At least in terms of basic political rights, discrimination on the basis of gender, ethnicity, and caste is prohibited. Many would also extend these to commerce and the wider public sphere: businesses should not be able to refuse service on the basis of race, gender, or sexual orientation. The descriptive thesis must entail some commitment to equal treatment, but the scope of that commitment is disputed.
Claim (3) (let us call it the egalitarian thesis) is closely related to the descriptive thesis. (1) is taken by some as ground for affirming (3). Denying (1) is grounds for rejecting the imperative in (3). Yet the two theses are distinct. A commitment to (1) does not obviously entail a commitment to (3), because (3) is more robust and has wider scope. (1) may entail (3), but establishing this requires a substantive argument. The descriptive thesis’ extension into the social standing, well-being, wealth, income, and life outcomes of citizens is controversial. Unlike (3), (1) is not on its face opposed to radical inequalities in income, wealth, capabilities, welfare, life prospects, or social standing. If those inequalities arise within legitimate political institutions that respect the equal standing of all persons, they may be just.
The egalitarian thesis addresses more than the moral worth of persons. It expresses an obligation to pursue distributive equality. Deviations from equality are prima facie unjust. But along which dimension ought we pursue greater equality? Candidate metrics include resources, income, wealth, welfare, or capabilities to perform certain functions. The obligation to pursue equality along some such dimension makes (3) fully egalitarian in the contemporary sense of the term. (1) does not necessarily prohibit dramatic inequalities, whether they are deserved or undeserved, due to hard work or luck, recent or hereditary. Absent further argument, the content of (1) is only concerned with such inequalities conditionally, when they violate the equal moral status of persons. Of course if social exclusion, caste discrimination, and unequal rights are prohibited in light of the fact that (1) entails some level of commitment to (2), this will influence the distribution those metrics. This is not the same as a direct obligation to pursue distributive equality of one of those metrics.
(1) is descriptive in content but has normative implications. Egalitarianism is essentially prescriptive and normative. (3) directly states what ought to be done with regard to the inequalities among persons. It is an imperative to reduce distributive inequality along some dimension. The normative commitments that follow from (1) set minimal standards: states must not violate the equal standing of persons. The normative commitments of (3) are stronger and more aspirational: we continually pursue equality by reducing inequality. This is a pursuit of substantive distributive justice—equality of some sort of condition or opportunities. It is not mere formal equality of rights, or of economic notions such as considering everyone equal as long as their income is determined by their marginal product.
Egalitarians are thus committed to distributive justice in a way that (1) need not be. (1) may entail a certain conception of distributive justice having to do with equality of opportunity and individual rights, especially property rights. For example, John Locke argued that all persons are equal and have the same rights. The equal standing and equal rights of all persons, even in the pre-civilized state of nature, is a crucial component of his theory of just government. This is a commitment to equality, but it is not egalitarian in the contemporary sense. It does deal with distributive justice, but only in terms of respecting property rights and the right to free exchange of property. A commitment to equality is not yet a commitment to substantive distributive justice (a commitment to have a fair and equitable distribution of goods), and is compatible with merely formal or historical distributive justice (defining a just distribution as one that respects standing property rights and the right of people to trade without theft or coercion).
What is an egalitarian commitment to substantive distributive justice? In the most literal sense, it requires equalizing the distribution of some quantifiable thing among persons, such as income or wealth. An egalitarian may see distributive justice as an end in itself. This would mean it is constitutive of a just society. It can also mean that we choose a metric of equality that is intrinsically good, such as welfare or well-being. Those things are desirable in themselves, not because they are instrumental in acquiring other goods. Alternatively, egalitarianism can be seen as merely instrumental. For example, distributive justice can be seen as a means to achieving some other social end, such as creating social relationships among citizens that are equal and non-oppressive, and allowing them to flourish and function as citizens. An example of an instrumental metric of equality is resources, because resources can be used to generate welfare.
Strictly speaking, all non-equalizing views of substantive distributive justice are alternatives to egalitarianism. This would exclude Rawls’ difference principle, which allows for inequalities when they are required to raise the absolute condition of the worst off. It would also exclude views that prioritize aid to the worst off or argue in favor of redistribution to guarantee a sufficient minimum for all. The contemporary usage of the term is not restricted to equalizing views. While there are contemporary debates between egalitarianism narrowly defined and non-equalizing views such as Rawls’, the most illuminating contemporary definition of the term is that it is a commitment to substantive distributive justice as opposed to merely formal or historical distributive justice.
Egalitarianism therefore comprises divergent views about equality that go beyond the merely descriptive thesis and affirm at least one of the following theses: first, some important type of thing should be distributed equally among persons; second, distributive inequality (along some relevant dimension) is prima facie unjust and should be reduced.
Both principles further specify the normativity contained in (3), yet still give little concrete guidance. Consider a different normative principle with similar form: the current level of infant mortality is unjust and should be reduced. While this thesis does not tell us how to achieve our end, it clearly specifies the end. We know what counts as success because we know what infant mortality is and how to measure it. These two distributive principles, while clearly egalitarian, do not articulate any specific end. They give no guidance on what quantifiable thing matters to distributive justice. What form must a just distribution take? Is it about wealth? Income? Well-being? Preference satisfaction? Something else?
The remainder of this article focuses on the following topics:
- What is the proper egalitarian metric? Well-being? Resources? Income? Capabilities?
- Once we settle on a metric, are we then concerned with ex ante or outcome equality? In other words, is egalitarianism concerned with a fair allocation of holdings among persons at the starting gate of each life, so that the ensuing competition is fair, or is it concerned with equal life outcomes? Do choice and responsibility matter to this question? What if a given inequality is due to informed and avoidable choices made by the relevant persons? Can such inequalities be just? Should our shares be determined by our choices and actions? If so, then what is genuine equality—a pattern of distribution in which each person is maximally responsible for their holdings, with the role of luck minimized?
- Anti-egalitarianism. Many deny the fundamental equality of persons. Some think men are superior to women, certain races are superior to others, and certain castes should dominate others. If so, there is no general moral imperative to lessen inequality among persons. Anti-egalitarianism of this sort rejects both (1) and (2). This article will not address such views. The more philosophically compelling anti-egalitarianism stems not from a rejection of (1) but rather from one of the following readings of it:(3) does not follow from (1).Pursuit of (3) is counterproductive or has bad consequences. This includes political objections about incentives and productivity, an objection that if equality is desirable then it is desirable to lower the condition of those who have more even when this does not objectively aid those who have less, and objections that egalitarianism is motivated by envy.Engaging in redistribution to pursue the aim of (3) is incompatible with (1). For example, pursuing (3) violates rights that follow from (1).
- The relationship between egalitarianism and global justice. Does egalitarianism apply to the global community of humanity, or only within particular states? If it does not apply globally, is this a justified deference to the moral value of specific political attachments, a temporary compromise on the way to a more defensible form of egalitarianism, or is it simply unjustifiable favoritism?
Egalitarianism requires a commitment to equalizing our holdings or at least reducing distributive inequality. Neither of these aims can solely be about equal standing or equal moral worth, if equal moral worth can be respected in a society that exhibits inequality among one of the specified dimensions. Respect for (1) puts some constraints on either inequality or the acceptable material minimum (say, by respect for equal rights entailing the minimum holdings to make those rights effective). That has to do with distributive justice, but in an attenuated sense that falls short of egalitarianism. Similarly, a society with radical inequality may make a rational calculus that some minimal redistribution is required for social stability, but this is prudential and conditional, not genuinely egalitarian.
What, other than equal standing or moral worth, is egalitarianism about? We examine five of the most influential candidates: welfare, resources, capabilities, democratic/social equality, and primary goods.
Welfare is well-being or one’s quality of life. There are two main variants of welfare. The first is hedonic: welfare is pleasure or happiness. Your welfare increases as you experience more pleasures and fewer pains. The second is desire or preference satisfaction. Your welfare increases the more your desires, goals, and preferences are satisfied.
According to hedonic welfare egalitarianism, this feeling is what fundamentally matters in life. Welfare is the purpose of our actions. This view is common in ethics generally and is not restricted to political egalitarianism. Jeremy Bentham argued that humans seek pleasure and avoid pain, and that this is both a descriptive truth about human psychology and a normative truth about what we morally ought to do. Welfare is an intrinsic good. Other goods are useful in an instrumental sense. They can be used to obtain welfare.
If the use of material resources generates welfare, then equalizing welfare will attain substantive outcome equality even among people who exhibit different levels of efficiency in welfare generation. An able-bodied person may require fewer resources than a disabled person to achieve a given level of well-being. Suppose a disabled person needs a wheelchair. If she holds an equal amount of resources as a non-disabled person, then the able bodied person is better off than the disabled person. The disabled person must exchange resources for a wheelchair. So either she is not mobile or she is mobile but has fewer remaining resources than the able-bodied, and in either case she is worse off. Welfare equality accounts for variation in talents and abilities and opportunities. Equality of welfare attempts to neutralize the impact of these variations on the distribution of welfare.
From a welfare egalitarian perspective, a just distribution of material resources is merely instrumental to achieving what really matters. We cannot redistribute welfare directly; we can only redistribute the resources that persons can use to generate welfare. Since equality of welfare accounts for variations in how efficiently a person can convert resources into welfare, it is markedly different from equality of resources. An egalitarian welfare distribution will not distribute resources equally.
A problem facing this approach is that preferences adapt to one’s living conditions. Therefore, if preferences help determine one’s level of welfare, unjust inequalities in living conditions might not be rectified by welfare egalitarianism. Nussbaum gives examples of women deprived of resources and opportunities adapting their preferences. This leads to them reporting similar satisfaction levels to women who are objectively less deprived. The adaptive preferences worry is that when there are unjust inequalities, those at the bottom will adapt their preferences to this injustice. A preference can adapt such that you no longer desire that which you are denied. Someone for whom college is an impossible goal may adapt their preferences so that they do not desire to attend college. “Sour grapes” is an even stronger negative preference or aversion to the thing denied. Empirical studies support the thesis that preferences adapt to environmental factors and expectations. Thus someone with fewer opportunities than another may eventually report equivalent welfare levels to those with more opportunities, merely because their preferences, expectations, and standards have lowered. Welfare egalitarianism might therefore convert inequality to equality via subjugated persons internalizing and accepting their inferior status, thereby increasing their satisfaction and reported welfare. (For more on preferences see Harsanyi 1982; and Nussbaum 1999 Ch.5, 2001a.)
However, adaptive preferences are also a benefit for welfare egalitarianism. If persons did not adapt their preferences and ends in response to what they can reasonably expect to attain, aggregate life outcomes would be worse. If goals and preferences were completely non-adaptive, our collective welfare levels would suffer. Adapting one’s ends and preferences is part of forming a rational plan of life. Consider someone who pursues a goal of being a professional athlete at the expense of other professional and personal options. If that person lacks the relevant physical ability, this goal is harmful to their welfare.
Another question facing welfare egalitarianism is whether we should adopt an objective or subjective conception of welfare. Thus far, the description of welfare has been subjective. But what if someone derives high levels of welfare from objects or activities that have low or negative social worth? What if the person experiences higher level of welfare in pursuit of an idiosyncratic end rather than securing the objective necessities for survival? What if there are higher and lower forms of welfare?
Scanlon (1975) gives an example of someone who prefers to have resources to build a temple rather than to provide for his own health and physical well-being. If he would experience greater subjective welfare under the former scenario, is that the ideal outcome? Or should we take an objective view, specify welfare in terms of the most objectively urgent needs, and guarantee that those are met? Suppose a person will have a below average level of subjective welfare if they have their basic necessities but not the temple, and a very high level of subjective welfare if they have the temple but not the basic necessities. What would welfare egalitarianism have us do? This is a dispute over whether any objective welfare standards are sovereign over individual preferences.
Two other problems for welfare egalitarianism deal with psychological variations among persons. Consider variation in disposition. The cheerful and the gloomy will vary in welfare levels as their share of resources holds constant. Do the gloomy deserve compensation? If resources are the raw material for generating welfare, this would lead to subsidizing the gloomy merely for being gloomy. The opposing view is that the gloomy should adapt rather than be subsidized, and if they do not adapt this is a personal matter, not an unjust inequality.
Expensive and inexpensive tastes are further problems for equality of welfare. Someone might have tastes and preferences that require a large number of resources, or particularly scarce resources, to satisfy. Those with expensive tastes require more resources to achieve a given level of welfare than those with less expensive tastes. While both disabilities and expensive tastes are inefficiencies in the conversion of resources to welfare, it seems a mistake to lump them together. Tastes can change over time. They are subject to their bearer’s agency in ways disabilities are not. People can cultivate, modify, and abandon their tastes and preferences. Also, being deprived of the goods made possible by, say, being ambulatory is not clearly equivalent to the deprivation suffered by someone with an unsatisfied preference for exotic food and wine. There seems to be a difference between using society’s resource to subsidize those with disabilities and subsidizing those with expensive tastes. Proponents of resource egalitarianism find welfare egalitarianism inadequately sensitive to this difference.
Some of the objections to welfare egalitarianism just outlined can be answered by moving to equality of opportunity for welfare. Equality of opportunity for welfare accounts for the luck egalitarian principle that what is bad, is for someone to be worse off than others through no fault of their own. Equality of opportunity for welfare does not commit itself to subsidizing the imprudent or those who cultivate expensive tastes. For an example of equality of opportunity for welfare, see Arneson (1989, 1990). For an equality of opportunity view with a wider metric that includes aspects of both welfare and resources, see Cohen (1989). Equality of opportunity is addressed in greater detail in Section 3.
Resources are things one can possess or use. Think of the various things you can use to generate welfare: wealth, income, land, food, consumer goods. Wider conceptions of resources include one’s own talents and abilities. Resources can also be social: social capital, respect, and opportunities.
Welfare is an intrinsic good, resources are instrumental goods. Resources are good because they can be used to generate welfare, or to guarantee that people are fully capable of functioning and thriving, or able to pursue some specific conception of the good life. Why focus on an instrumental good rather than the intrinsic good? Recall that different persons may require different amounts of resources to achieve equivalent levels of welfare. For example, we can understand disability as inefficiency in welfare generation. Equality of welfare counteracts disabilities, variations in talent and ability, and so on. From the welfare egalitarian perspective, focusing on resources misses the point.
On the other hand, equality of resources gives an attractive answer to other forms of resource-to-welfare inefficiencies that are not obviously matters of justice. What if my tastes are simply more expensive than yours? If you can achieve a specific welfare level with low-grade hamburger, but I need wagyu beef to reach the same level, then equality of welfare, at least in principle, requires subsidizing my share of resources above yours. You get fewer resources than I do only because your tastes are less expensive. Is this just? Many find it to be implausible in principle and inapplicable in practice. Consider the problems of implementing a scheme of distributive justice that would subsidize expensive tastes. This would generate resentment and reduce the commitment to distributive justice in society. There is also a problem of knowledge and trust—how do I know you have expensive tastes? Everyone has an incentive to report having expensive tastes when they are subsidized.
The bad sort of adaptive preferences amplifies this problem. Suppose your tastes are less expensive than mine because you were raised in a less privileged environment with fewer resources and opportunities. This institutionalizes prior inequalities and subsidizes further those who were already better off. If that seems unjust, then it is attractive to shift focus from the intrinsic good to the instrumental good. If we equalize resources, we can give everyone a fair opportunity to generate welfare and leave variations in tastes as a private concern.
One welfare-egalitarian response to these problems is to distinguish between tastes that are under the control of the person and those for which the person is not responsible. If my taste is out of my control, then its impact on my welfare levels is a matter of justice. If I intentionally cultivated the taste, or refuse to expend effort attempting to revise it, then it is a private concern. But this distinction raises perplexing empirical questions. How could we ascertain whether or not a taste is under one’s control? This is a counterfactual claim about what would happen if the person tried to change it, or a historical question about what happened when in fact they tried to change it.
Equality of resources provides a compelling answer to these problems. If we all have an equivalent bundle of resources, and have control over how we expend them, then whatever tastes an individual has is a private concern. It is not a matter of justice. But the advantage gained in terms of expensive tastes generates a cost: we may no longer have a sufficiently egalitarian response to unjust inefficiencies such as disabilities. Even if expensive tastes and gloominess should not be concerns of distributive justice, inefficiencies involving disability should be. If you and I have the same bundle of resources, but you need a wheelchair to be mobile and I do not, then you are disadvantaged. Our positions are not equal. If equal shares of resources define distributive justice, the disabled are at a disadvantage.
Dworkin (1981b, 2002) takes this as one reason to treat some features of the self as resources. This allows resource egalitarianism to differentiate expensive tastes and disabilities. Dworkin sees both as inefficiencies in welfare generation, but only disability is also a resource deprivation. Someone who can walk has more bodily resources than someone who cannot. This wide conception of resource egalitarianism sees disability as a resource deprivation and therefore a matter of distributive justice. Equal shares of resources now account for disabilities. In the example from the previous paragraph, you will receive the same bundle as me plus a wheelchair. Our total bundles are comparable, because mine includes an ambulatory body while yours includes a non-ambulatory body plus a wheelchair. This approach also applies to innate talents. Someone with abilities or talents that are in high demand already has more resources than someone without such innate talents.
Dworkin’s strategy immediately raises the question of how to determine the value of specific traits and abilities. If we want to implement such a scheme of redistributive justice, how would we specify the value of all these resources? It is a trivial matter to specify equality of wealth or income, but not to quantify the resource variation among persons with various abilities, disabilities, and talents. Dworkin attempts to solve such problems by abstracting away from particular cases and looking at decisions that rational people would make in a hypothetical insurance market. Rational agents, unaware of their own actual talents, abilities, and disabilities, purchase coverage against having disabilities or a lack of valued skills. For example, one considers what sort of policy would be attractive to insure against blindness, lack of in-demand talents, and so on. Then the actual redistributive scheme in society should redistribute resources to actual persons in accord with the insurance coverage that it would have been rational to purchase. Think of it along the lines of medical insurance or unemployment insurance. The hypothetical insurance market provides a rough guide for determining the value of specific resources, giving a baseline of compensation for those who lack such resources.
Resource egalitarianism aims to secure for everyone an equal set of resources and an equal opportunity to convert those resources into welfare. How well people do this, and resulting inequalities stemming from their choices, are not core concerns of this conception of distributive justice.
Capabilities are potential functionings, such as walking to work, reading a book, travelling, or being safe and secure in one’s home. If you have the capability to do a specific thing then you have both the abilities and resources required to do it, whether or not you actually choose to do it. A person has the capability to participate in a town hall discussion when they have the physical ability to move into that space (their body, or lack of assistive devices, or the infrastructure does not prevent this motion), the safety to do so without being assaulted, the ability to become informed about the issues (literacy, access to information), and so on. Whatever material and social conditions are required for a specific functioning are possessed by whoever has the relevant capability.
Capabilities-based approaches to distributive justice are sufficientarian rather than equalizing. What is unjust is not the number of capabilities possessed by those on the top compared to others, but the objective inadequacy of the capabilities of those on the bottom. While not equalizing, this is egalitarian. It is concerned with substantive distributive justice. These theories are meant to provide a minimal component of justice that can be combined with further normative principles. When coupled with egalitarian principles, the view is no longer sufficientarian. In terms of its minimal core, though, just as with resource egalitarianism, its commitment to distributive justice is instrumental: a more egalitarian distribution of resources can bring more persons up to the threshold capability level.
The capabilities-based approach’s distinction between capability and function accounts for responsibility and autonomy. What the theory attempts to secure is a sufficient level of capabilities for all. Whether an individual functions is up to his or her own choice. The capabilities approach is therefore not subject to the adaptive preferences objection. No matter how much one adapts their tastes, preferences, and expectations downward, it is unjust whenever they lack the essential capabilities. They may, through free choice or conditioning, choose not to function in certain ways—but they must have the relevant capabilities. In this case, the agent is not making a judgment that something is not worth doing when they currently cannot do it, they are making a judgment that they do not want to do something that they are capable of doing. They have the abilities and resources required to do so. Thus, adaptive preferences can still lead to inequalities in functioning, but this does not impact distributive justice. A sufficient level of capabilities for all requires a certain pattern of the distribution of resources. That pattern is not impacted by the choice of some persons not to function in certain ways.
This approach raises an obvious and crucial question: which capabilities matter to distributive justice? Not every capability should matter, such as the capability to pollute the environment. It also seems that capabilities must be specified in a coarse rather than fine-grained way. The theory would be intractable if every discrete form of functioning were correlated with a discrete capability. For the theory to be illuminating and useful the list must be manageable.
Some capabilities theorists, such as Sen, avoid enumerating an official list. Nussbaum argues that the following list enables one to live a full life with dignity. She does not treat it as timeless or the final word:
- Life—capable of living a normal lifespan.
- Bodily Health—health, nutrition, shelter.
- Bodily Integrity—movement, security against violence, choice in reproduction, sexual satisfaction.
- Senses, imagination, thought—the exercise of these capacities in a fully human sense, facilitated by education and protected by rights (of expression, religion, and so forth).
- Emotions—emotional development allowing one to form attachments.
- Practical reason—development, critical reflection upon, and pursuit of a conception of a good human life.
- Affiliation—social interaction, the social bases of self-respect.
- Other species—living with and showing concern for the natural world.
- Control over one’s environment—political activity, political guarantees of security and noninterference, property holdings, full participation in the economic and civic spheres.
Nussbaum’s capabilities list gives a general picture of human flourishing. It reaches every domain of human life. (For more on the capabilities approach, see "Sen's Capability Approach.")
Democratic or social equality is a narrower-scope form of the capabilities approach. Elizabeth Anderson (1999, 2010) developed the most prominent version. Her theory stems from a critique of the individualistic nature of both resource and welfare egalitarianism. Those theories of distributive justice address equality among the holdings of different individuals. Anderson objects to the focus on individual holdings of resources or welfare levels. The point of egalitarianism is social, dealing with relations among persons, not atomistic, dealing with individual allocations of some metric. Anderson rejects the individual compensation model entirely. We cannot do away with unjust inequality by allocating more resources or welfare to those at the bottom. Anderson focuses on the capabilities of citizens and the social relationships between them. Unjust inequalities are caused by oppression, which is social.
Let us again consider disability. Anderson argues that disability is as much a social as a biological fact. The impact on one’s life of having a particular disability varies according to the way social space and infrastructure are constituted and on the social practices of fellow citizens. For example, someone in a wheelchair has less of a handicap when social spaces are physically accessible to them. Equality and inequality are essentially social—the impact of many disabilities depends on social attitudes and political policies. What accommodations do the majority enact through democratic policy? Do non-disabled treat the disabled as equal and fully capable? The proper response to disability cannot be individual compensation. The resources and redistribution that should be used to counteract such handicaps must deal with social practices and infrastructure. Individualistic models could account for why a disabled person requires extra medical resources, but does not reach the level of infrastructure and social practice. Wheelchair accessible social spaces are not part of any individual’s holdings of resources. They are not her property. Yet they are fundamental to understanding disability and inequality.
Unjust inequalities are not mere individual deprivations of welfare or resources compared to others, but socially imposed oppression and exploitation. The paradigm of unjust distribution is not one in which some have much more than others, but in which some oppress and exploit others. Inequality is constituted by certain sorts of social relations. The ideal distribution is not one in which everyone is equalized in terms of resources or welfare, but in which everyone can fully function as a citizen. This is a narrow-scope capabilities approach in two ways: first, the capabilities list is not all-encompassing; second, this is all within a particular political state. Indeed, Anderson’s conception is specifically democratic equality.
This approach is committed to substantive distributive justice as instrumental in guaranteeing that all citizens have a sufficient set of capabilities. Whether a citizen possesses a given capability is jointly determined by the individual, their resources, their environment (natural and built), and the social practices and attitudes of their fellow citizens. Hence the focus is more on institutional changes to make the infrastructure navigable with disabilities, and changes to social norms and behavior, rather than seeing disabilities as an inefficiency for which the individual has a claim to a greater resource share.
The list of capabilities is narrowed to those required to function as a citizen, but nonetheless must be rather coarse and general. The capabilities list must include what is needed to fully function as a citizen and to avoid oppressive social relationships. However, fully functioning as a citizen includes more than political life. It also includes the ability to function in the civil and economic spheres. The point of egalitarianism is not to impose a pattern of distribution but to eradicate oppression, which is socially imposed.
Not only is this theory narrower than the theories of Sen and Nussbaum, it is more constrained than any other option we have considered. Welfare, resources, preferences, primary goods, Nussbaum’s capabilities—each of these reaches into every domain of human life. This conception of equality only touches our lives as citizens. Now, to be sure, since capabilities must be specified in a rather coarse-grained way, the relevant capabilities to citizenship can be put to use in other domains of life. Nonetheless, the scope is relatively narrow.
One objection facing this approach is that it may be possible to guarantee that everyone can fully function as citizens and avoid oppression while at the same time having radical inequality of resources or welfare. If so, perhaps this view is unacceptably narrow because guaranteeing the threshold capability level is compatible with unjust inequalities in life outcomes. Another worry is that this view might be less able to address global justice than other alternatives. That is a disadvantage if one thinks that a unified theory should cover both domestic and global justice.
We now turn to an influential variation on resource egalitarianism. It is not strictly equalizing, and it employs a wide and diverse conception of resources. John Rawls argued that primary goods are what citizens have reason to care about, regardless of whatever else they care about. Primary goods include health, physical and mental abilities, income, wealth, rights, liberties, opportunities, and the social bases of self-respect. No matter what particular conception of the good a citizen may have, what their life plans, goals, and deepest commitments are, she has reason to want more rather than fewer primary goods. Primary goods are what must be expended or employed in pursuit of your conception of the good. (This could mean recreation, education, artistic output, religious missionary work, and so on.) Non-material goods such as liberties and opportunities are what make one’s freedom effective. The social bases of self-respect make for a rewarding life.
All of these primary goods are valuable to you regardless of your religion, values, and life goals. No matter what comprehensive conception of the good you affirm, it is rational to want more rather than fewer primary goods. However, given our differing conceptions of the good, we will not all agree on the best way to use the additional goods created by our social cooperation. Principles of justice are required to fairly allocate resources. For Rawls, the right is prior to the good. Just principles for allocating primary goods trumps pursuit of our individual, various conceptions of the good. This is one thing meant by the title of his book Justice as Fairness.
Rawls’ theory is egalitarian but not necessarily equalizing. It focuses on substantive distributive justice but does not always aim for an equal distribution of all primary goods. Basic rights and liberties must be distributed equally. Fair equality of opportunity requires that opportunities are distributed equally across persons of equal talent and motivation. However, considering all the various primary goods including wealth and income, equality is merely the baseline from which other distributions are judged. Other distributions can be preferable to equality. Inequalities can be justified instrumentally when they are necessary to raise the absolute condition of the worst off. This is accomplished when inequality is a necessary causal mechanism for increasing total productivity. Greater incentives may be required to motivate the talented to be more productive. The worst off would prefer to live in a society in which they get a larger slice of a larger economic pie than to live in a purely equal society in which they get a smaller slice of a smaller pie. Rawls’ strategy is to answer the problem of distributive justice via a social contract. We consider an idealized choice scenario in which free and equal persons come to an agreement about the nature of the society they wish to enter. If our society matches principles that those persons would have chosen, our society is just. A society meeting this standard is as close as we can get to a voluntary agreement to be bound by a particular state.
Rawls argued that the distribution of benefits and burdens in society should not be fundamentally determined by that which is arbitrary from the moral point of view. This rejection of the morally arbitrary explains Rawls’ choice of the veil of ignorance as part of the preferred choice scenario for picking principles of justice. Rawls argued that we should choose principles of justice by imagining persons behind a veil of ignorance that prevents them from basing their choice on what is morally arbitrary. It is not possible to choose principles tailored to serve one’s own peculiar self-interest. The choice of principles is still made out of self-interest, but it is the interest of an abstract model of the person, not of a specific person who is aware of their particular, contingent situation in the actual world. The veil occludes knowledge of much that is due to chance, but also much that is due to choice, including the choosers’ various conceptions of the good. This scenario attempts to value choice by creating the conditions under which people can all pursue their own conceptions of the good. They reason about how to secure primary goods, which can be expended in pursuit of any conception of the good. The original position creates a model of the Kantian notion of the self, and the veil of ignorance forces the choosers to make decisions that are categorical. They lack the knowledge required to make hypothetical choices based in their own particular conception of the good and their peculiar desires.
Rawls argues that under these conditions, rational actors would choose a maximin strategy. Each individual’s goal is to make the worst possible outcome for themselves as good as it can be. They would not take an avoidable gamble on entering into a society with persons suffering at the bottom of the socioeconomic ladder because they would not want to risk living their entire lives under such conditions. Nor would they object to inequality when it raises the absolute level of the worst off, since they are more concerned with the objective quality of their own lives than with envy of those with more primary goods. Rational, self-interested persons situated in a fair procedure for making decisions about their society will affirm the difference principle. According to the difference principle, if incentives that generate inequality are required to increase productivity, then the resulting inequality can be just. If such incentives are required to motivate higher productivity, then they should be allowed as long as they can be harnessed to assist the worst off. By using inequality to motivate productivity, the economic pie grows, and redistribution can improve the lives of the worst off. Note, however, that the difference principle cannot justify violations of the descriptive thesis affirming the equal worth of all persons. A liberty principle takes priority over the difference principle. We may not create a system of unequal rights and liberties even if doing so would allow us to raise the absolute condition of the worst off.
Gerald Cohen objects to the demand for greater incentives that the difference principle allows. The people who require greater incentives to work productively are blameworthy. Why, knowing that if they work to their full ability this will benefit the worst off, do they not do so without demanding a greater share of primary goods? Cohen argues that this demand for incentives is exploitative. If the talented changed their outlook, we would have greater equality and improvement of the lives of the worst off. Rawls’ theory deals with principles governing political institutions and the basic structure of society, not with private actions and motivations. Cohen thinks egalitarianism should be internalized. In Rawls’ theory, persons in the original position are conceived of as self-interested, and a fair procedure for choosing principles of justice ensures a commitment to distributive justice. But that is a product of the fairness of the choice scenario and the self-interest of the participants. Cohen thinks that egalitarianism as a moral and political imperative should motivate individual choices and actions, not only shape the basic structure of society and its institutions. Still, as a matter of public policy, Cohen deems Rawls’ view a radical improvement on contemporary society. His objection is that the difference principle is subordinate to unjust motivations and attitudes. Justice requires that we have egalitarian motivations, and therefore the talented should never demand the incentives allowed by the difference principle. Egalitarianism is a normative ideal, and talented persons ought to work productively and support redistributive policies to pursue equality without demanding a greater share of primary goods. Rawls thinks that in actual societies people will have a variety of motivations. The problem for Cohen is that the original position models persons as self-interested rather than egalitarian. He concludes that the difference principle is not just.
We now turn to a view that combines egalitarianism, Rawls’ rejection of the influence of morally arbitrary factors, and an emphasis on the values of choice and responsibility. Rawls’ social contract view holds that the morally arbitrary should not fundamentally determine the distribution of primary goods or people’s life prospects. So one’s family, one’s innate talents, and one’s starting place in society should not shape one’s life prospects or distributive share unless this benefits the worst off. These factors are undeserved and should not alone determine the distribution of benefits and burdens in society. Luck egalitarianism distills this thought into a complete theory of distributive justice. The ideal distribution is sensitive to people’s choices and informed gambles, but not to brute luck in the distribution of talents and opportunities. For the luck egalitarians, our capacities for free deliberation, choice, and action are pre-institutional. Therefore, they should inform and determine the principles of distributive justice, and the institutional expectations for entitlement and deservingness. (Hurley argues that this is a crucial feature of luck egalitarianism.) These features of the self are not ignored in Rawls’ view, but they do not fundamentally shape the institutions.
Luck egalitarianism is a responsibility-sensitive conception of equality and a system for distributing goods and aid under conditions of scarcity. It prioritizes aid to those who suffer through no fault of their own. It is a non-equalizing commitment to substantive distributive justice. Equality provides a baseline, though in a quite different way from Rawls. The role of equality here is what we can call ex ante equality. At the starting gate of life, we should be equal in some sense. Depending on the favored metric, we should begin with an equal amount of resources or opportunity for welfare. The luck egalitarian ideal is that we start on an equal footing, and then the outcomes of our life choices and freely taken gambles should determine our future holdings. Inequality therefore can be just. It is not just because it brings about some further social good, as the difference principle allowed for inequalities that improve the objective condition of the worst off. Rather, inequalities are justified by being brought about in the right way, by having the right sort of causal origin.
Indeed, luck egalitarianism is an alternative way to develop the emphasis on choice, responsibility, and individual sovereignty that leads some to reject egalitarianism entirely. Cohen argues that the view co-opts these values from the anti-egalitarians. Luck egalitarianism is not opposed to inequality per se; it is opposed to inequalities that have the wrong sort of origins. Inequalities based in brute luck, that is, the type of morally arbitrary factors cited by Rawls (innate talents, parentage, starting place in society) generate unjust inequalities. But option luck, that is, luck in the outcomes of freely taken risks or gambles, lead to just inequalities. As with the capabilities approach, luck egalitarianism may be combined with other principles of justice. (See Cohen on community.)
One objection to luck egalitarianism is based in skepticism about free will and moral responsibility. The theory hinges on the moral importance of choice and responsibility. If there is no robust conception of free will and moral responsibility, why think that inequalities caused by our choices are just?
Another worry about the theory is abandonment. Does luck egalitarianism offer no aid to those who suffer because of choices with poor outcomes? If inequalities are just whenever they are caused by choice, then is there no minimum level of well-being guaranteed for all? One sort of response to this worry is combining luck egalitarianism with other political values. Cohen argues that a commitment to community prohibits inequalities that would be allowed in a purely luck egalitarian system. Kymlicka argues that luck egalitarianism can be combined with social egalitarian views that likewise prohibit some inequalities that might be allowed by luck egalitarianism.
Anderson develops a social egalitarian view and is a strong critic of luck egalitarianism. Her conception of democratic equality is not only a development of the capabilities theory but also an explicit rejection of luck egalitarianism. She thinks that the luck egalitarian focus on brute luck means the theory completely misses the social nature of inequality. She objects that luck egalitarianism ends up trying to correct the “cosmic injustice” of brute luck in an attempt to ensure that people get what they deserve, and that this blinds them to the social oppression and exploitation that constitutes inequality. Unjust inequality has to do with social relationships.
Another question facing those who support luck egalitarianism is how to define equal starting places. This leads us into the larger issue of what constitutes equality of opportunity.
What if there are dramatic inequalities in the opportunities for choice, education, and careers? This is a problem for luck egalitarians, because they need to specify a starting gate conception of equality. It is also a pressing issue for the other conceptions of equality.
Dworkin argues that inequalities can be historically justified when persons made their choices from an equivalent set of options. This commits luck egalitarianism to robust equality of opportunity. However, his standard is difficult to interpret, since citizens can never have a strictly equivalent set of options, unless that set is so restricted that the society is dystopian. There must be some standard to define when their options are fungible or equivalent enough. However, this is a massive problem for egalitarian theory, and it seems luck egalitarianism’s values of choice and responsibility alone cannot solve it. Answering that problem requires some other standard of value. When do persons have equal opportunities?
Equality of opportunity is a natural extension of the descriptive thesis that affirmed the equality of all persons. The descriptive thesis is incompatible with forms of oppression that rule out classes of people from competing for certain positions within society. A denial of the descriptive thesis entails a denial of a commitment to equality opportunity. But what exactly does equality of opportunity require? It can be understood as ranging from merely formal equality of opportunity to substantive equality of opportunity. The more one approaches the latter, the more one becomes committed to substantive distributive justice.
Formal equality of opportunity requires that desirable positions and resources in society be allocated by open and meritocratic competition. Firms, government agencies, and universities are appropriate candidates for such equality of opportunity. This requires little or no substantive distributive justice. It does require that all citizens can participate in the competition, and that the winners are chosen on the basis of purely meritocratic concerns. Meritocracy requires that the traits that determine who wins the competition actually predict success in the position. Formal equality of opportunity prohibits allocating positions on the basis of gender, ethnicity, and so on. This deals only with opportunities, not outcomes. It does not address systemic inequalities in who wins the meritocratic competitions.
Substantive equality of opportunity addresses both the procedures for allocating positions and the preparation of the candidates that determine their chances of success. It deals with both fair procedures and the actual outcomes of those procedures. For example, if positions are open on the basis of purely meritocratic competition, but the advantages conferred by wealthy parentage are so overwhelming that only the children of the wealthy win the desirable positions, this is merely formal equality of opportunity. Those who support substantive equality of opportunity argue that the merely formal is morally inadequate.
Consider Bernard Williams’ example of a hypothetical warrior society. In the past, this was a caste society in which warriors had high prestige and the majority of wealth. The society transitions to a system of formal equality of opportunity. Under the old order, only the sons of wealthy families were eligible to be chosen as warriors. All others were consigned to poverty and subjugation. Now, warrior positions are allocated under a system that exhibits formal equality of opportunity. Under the new order, there is a meritocratic allocation of the desirable warrior positions. These desirable positions are distributed according to the results of an open, meritocratic, and fair tryout. Rich and poor alike may enter the competition. There is no bias in judging the winners and losers. Stipulate that women may now obtain these positions. Success in the examination is predictive of success as a warrior, so the system is meritocratic.
However, this is all compatible with only the offspring of warriors having adequate nutrition and training to succeed in the competition. Although careers are open to talents, the poor have no chance to cultivate the relevant talents. Even those with the luck to be born with innate ability have their prospects defined by their parentage. Those who were not born to a warrior family cannot succeed. Therefore, the old social hierarchy will persist, even though a strict caste system has been replaced by open, meritocratic procedures that satisfy formal equality of opportunity.
A formal equality of opportunity defender might point out that the long-term outlook for this social hierarchy is made much more tenuous by the implementation of formal equality of opportunity. Other changes to the society could impact the levels of inequality. The dominant positions in society are subject to change over time in a way that they were not under the original caste system.
Still, from the egalitarian perspective, this meritocratic society is unjust. That destabilizing forces can change things under formal equality of opportunity does not redeem the status quo. The current situation is unjust, and destabilizing change would not entail that the next distribution will be just, only that the individuals occupying the dominant and subordinate positions will change. The transition might be to one in which different non-meritocratic attributes correlate with having any chance for success; say, from warrior families to merchant families, or that the offspring of a small set of occupations will be the only ones with a genuine opportunity to succeed.
A perfectionist, someone who thinks that society should maximize the pursuit of some particular conception of the good, could argue that formal equality of opportunity is adequate because the concentration of wealth, which in turn prepares people to flourish as warriors, creates the best set of warriors overall. One can object to this on perfectionist terms (that generating the best warriors is not the proper overriding good, or that this system does not generate the best set of warriors) or on Rawlsian terms of liberal justice (no one conception of the good should be made sovereign in a free society, and no one would agree to this arrangement in the original position).
Suppose the example is shifted slightly. Rather than only the sons of wealthy high caste families having any opportunity to succeed, there is a small amount of social mobility. Some not born into a privileged position win the meritocratic competition. There is not substantive equality of opportunity, but there is both formal equality of opportunity and actual mobility. A supporter of substantive equality of opportunity will still object that it is the strength of the correlation between family background, the resources provided by that background, and obtaining a warrior position is itself adequate evidence of the inadequacy of formal equality of opportunity. These concerns push one to rely on another metric, such as resources, to attain a substantive, material form of equality of opportunity.
Of course, examples need not be so rigid as Williams’ caste society. A collection of informal social attitudes and practices may also violate equality of opportunity. If women are not seen as capable of being good pilots, then hiring and promotion procedures will lack genuine formal equality of opportunity, even if this is neither inscribed in company policy, in law, or in a caste system. These impediments to equality of opportunity are endemic in contemporary society. There are more strategies for answering these problems than can possibly be described in this brief article, so we will mention only two that expand upon views already covered. Rawls (2009) developed a conception of fair equality of opportunity that undermines the role of class, race, gender, or caste to determine life prospects. Fair equality of opportunity requires that persons of equivalent talent who expend equivalent effort have equivalent outcomes. Roemer (2009) provides a sophisticated luck egalitarian account of equality of opportunity that separates people into different types. The competitions that allocate desirable resources and positions should be designed so that effort is rewarded. The details of this scheme are beyond the scope of this article, but these two views are good starting places for readers who want to research the issue in greater depth.
An obvious form of anti-egalitarianism rejects the descriptive thesis. If persons are not equal, then there is no moral imperative to pursue substantive distributive justice. Sexism, racism, caste discrimination, and so on are obviously not views that lead into egalitarianism. These objections are beyond the scope of this article.
A common political objection to egalitarianism is that it is based in envy. None of the theories canvassed in this article are explicitly based in envy, so this objection has more to do with the alleged psychological motivations for becoming an egalitarian rather than criticism of egalitarian arguments themselves. Of course, Rawls’ theory explicitly rejects envy. Persons in the original position want to secure the greatest number of primary goods for themselves. Their choice is not impacted by envy of those who may end up with an even greater share of primary goods.
A second political objection is that egalitarianism undermines productivity. If the state redistributes income or other resources, then there is less incentive to be productive. Egalitarians can deny this on empirical grounds, object that total productivity is not the most important criterion, or attempt to harness the way that incentives motivate productivity (as with Rawls’ difference principle).
A practical objection is that a commitment to distributive equality would lead us to “level down” the allocations of those who have more for no real benefit. Suppose all the members of a population have x units of your preferred metric of distributive justice, except for one person who has 2x. Now consider whether it is desirable to transition from that distribution to one in which everyone holds x units. This makes one person worse off and no person better off. The distribution is now equal, but is it preferable? Is it more just? A strict egalitarian can respond that if equality is intrinsically valuable then the distribution is improved in that respect. They are not strictly committed to concluding that this makes the new distribution preferable overall. That only follows if equality is the overriding or sole value. If equality must be balanced against other values, then egalitarians have an answer to the leveling down objection. A strict egalitarian who thinks equality is instrumental already accepts other values, so they can argue that in these cases equality is not instrumental in bringing about the desired consequences.
The leveling down objection is a threat to views that pursue strict equality. Non-equalizing conceptions of substantive distributive justice avoid the problem. What most theories aim to do is improve the condition of the worst off and thereby lessen inequality, not pursue strict equality unconditionally. Views that prioritize aid to the worst off or support a sufficient minimum floor are not obviously subject to this objection. Even if one thinks it is morally obligatory to redistribute resources to improve the condition of those who are worse off than others, it does not follow that it is obligatory to destroy resources when that is the only way to achieve distributive equality.
Perhaps the most philosophically interesting objections to egalitarianism are themselves based in the descriptive thesis that all persons are in fact equal. One objection is that egalitarian distributive justice is insufficiently sensitive to both deservingness and human agency. A second is that there is no just way to implement a redistributive scheme that aims towards equality, because doing so violates freedoms and rights that follow from our equality.
Welfare egalitarianism, resource egalitarianism, the capabilities approach, and Rawls’ difference principle are patterned conceptions of distributive justice as opposed to historical conceptions. Strict egalitarianism defines a pattern of equal shares, the various capabilities approaches define patterns involving a sufficient minimum below which persons cannot fall, and the difference principle states that the level of permissible deviation from the baseline of equality is defined by what is necessary to raise the absolute condition of the worst off.
Nozick (1974) argues against all patterned conceptions of distributive justice. He claims that according to patterned conceptions of justice, if a given pattern is just, it makes no difference which persons occupy which places in the distribution. Justice is defined in terms of structural features of the pattern, not the identity of those occupying specific places in the pattern. Yet that seems counterintuitive. Those at the top might deserve their place on the basis of working hard. Inequalities might be generated by the voluntary transfer of goods that took place in a distribution that was already just. Nozick concludes that, rather than favoring a patterned conception of distributive justice, we ought to understand distributive justice in terms of historical entitlements and voluntary transactions. He agrees with Rawls that the distribution of natural talents is not a basis for deservingness, but denies that this means the distribution of those talents (and the varying wealth and income derivable from them) is arbitrary from the moral point of view. It is not arbitrary because natural talents are implicated in the normative relationship of self-ownership. Persons own themselves. That includes their native abilities. This means that, by extension, they hold strong entitlements to the property they can obtain by exercising those (undeserved) talents.
Since Nozick was primarily responding to Rawls’ Theory of Justice, it is worth looking at this objection and the extent it threatens patterned conceptions in general and Rawls’ conception in particular. Rawls’ view can be defended against Nozick’s objection that according to patterned conceptions of distributive justice, it should not matter which individual occupies which place in the pattern. Consider the role given to institutional expectations and institutional desert. Rawls’ theory allows for people to deserve property so long as the state’s institutions have created the reasonable expectation of such property rights. In other words, entitlement to property is generated by the basic structure of the state. Institutional expectations ground such entitlements. Therefore, his view is compatible with a conception of private property that is not indifferent to which persons occupy which positions in the distribution. Of course, Nozick, following Locke, thinks individuals can have preinstitutional entitlements, so his view of property rights is much stronger.
Still, in Rawls’ patterned view of distributive justice, it must matter which particular individuals occupy which places in the patterned distribution, because the point of the difference principle is that scarce talents are harnessed for the benefit of all. There is a causal relationship between which persons occupy which positions and the pattern of the total distribution. The size of the economic pie is defined by which people occupy which places. Switching places would change total productivity and harm the absolute condition of the worst off. Rawls argues that a given society’s distribution of goods is just if it matches the difference principle. The specific pattern depends on myriad factors, and those factors cannot be held constant while you switch the persons occupying the different positions in the pattern. For example, if in a given state greater incentives are required to motivate some of the highly talented to be more productive, you cannot switch their place in the pattern without changing the productivity level. In such cases, Nozick’s discussion of switching persons within the pattern would necessarily modify the pattern itself. The hypothetical place switching across identical patterns cannot be implemented. So what Nozick means by “patterned” does not capture everything that matters in substantive distributive justice. This response also applies to luck egalitarian accounts of distributive justice. Luck egalitarianism is committed to having shares allocated in accordance with the individual’s choices and option luck. (For a much stronger desert-based alternative, see Kagan 2012.)
Nozick’s second objection has to do with individual liberty to make voluntary transactions. Suppose an actual distribution meets your definition of a just pattern, whatever that may be. So long as persons can make voluntary transactions (purchases, gifts, trades, bequests), the original pattern will be lost. This all happens without exploitation or coercion. The only way to regain the pattern is to for the state to interfere with these voluntary transactions and coercively redistribute the resources. But that is objectionable for two reasons. First, since the deviation from the initial pattern was entirely voluntary, nobody has a valid objection to the second pattern. It wrongs no one, since every transaction that changed the pattern was consensual. Second, coercive redistribution to retain the original pattern must violate property rights. In the initial distribution, which we stipulate was just, each had a right to their holdings. Through voluntary transfers, the new pattern was generated. But if the transactions were voluntary, the new owners of these resources are as entitled to them as the original owners were. The original pattern was just and therefore it is neither required nor permissible for the state to redistribute anything. Egalitarian redistribution enforced by the state must violate property rights. No program can pursue substantive distributive justice through redistribution, because such redistribution is unjust.
This anti-egalitarianism is crucial for Nozick’s understanding of the descriptive thesis: individual rights, including the right to own and transfer property, constitute our equality. Those rights preclude systems of imposing, retaining, or regaining a specific distributive pattern. His understanding of equality is incompatible with egalitarianism. Nozick concludes that we should understand distributive justice in formal and historical terms, not in terms of patterning. He then argues for a set of historical principles governing the original acquisition and subsequent transfer of property. Nozick affirms that persons are equal, but this means that each person has equally strong property rights. The descriptive thesis on this view entails a denial of egalitarianism. Egalitarianism can only be pursued by violating the property rights that follow from our equality.
There is also a sufficiency objection to strictly equalizing views. Frankfurt objects that
The mistaken belief that economic equality is important in itself leads people to detach the problem of formulating their economic ambitions from the problem of understanding what is most fundamentally significant to them. It influences them to take too seriously, as though it were a matter of great moral concern, a question that is inherently rather insignificant and not directly to the point, namely, how their economic status compares with the economic status of others. In this way the doctrine of equality contributes to the moral disorientation and shallowness of our time. (Frankfurt 1987)
A person focused on strict egalitarianism evaluates their own life and holdings based on something impersonal and independent of the particular features of their own lives and their own personal needs. Egalitarianism is harmful.
However, the egalitarian impulse is really based in something that is of moral importance—the principle that all persons should have a sufficient level of well-being. On Frankfurt’s view, people become egalitarians on the basis of compelling reasons, but those reasons have to do solely with sufficiency, not equality.
It seems clear that egalitarianism and the doctrine of sufficiency are logically independent: considerations that support the one cannot be presumed to provide support also for the other. Yet proponents of egalitarianism frequently suppose that they have offered grounds for their position when in fact what they have offered is pertinent as support only for the doctrine of sufficiency. Thus they often, in attempting to gain acceptance for egalitarianism, call attention to disparities between the conditions of life characteristic of the rich and those characteristic of the poor. (Frankfurt 1987)
The case for egalitarianism is usually only a case against poverty.
The fundamental error of egalitarianism lies in supposing that it is morally important whether one person has less than another regardless of how much either of them has. […] The economic comparison implies nothing concerning whether either of the people compared has any morally important unsatisfied needs at all nor concerning whether either is content with what he has. (Frankfurt 1987)
Defenders of equality must show that substantive distributive justice is not captured by concerns over sufficiency alone. We will use Scanlon as a representative example. (See also Parfit and O’Neill for discussions of equality as opposed to sufficiency.) Scanlon offers five sorts of reasons to be concerned with equality and not merely sufficiency. 1. Some inequalities create humiliating differences in status. One could object that sufficiency is whatever level required to avoid humiliation and shame. However, the level is sensitive to differences between the better off and worse off rather than being determined by objective or unchanging standards. This means that, contra Frankfurt, we are intrinsically concerned with differences between people, not just that everyone meets some sufficient benchmark. 2. Inequalities can give those who have more an unjust amount of power over others. 3. Social institutions are only fair if there is equality of starting places in society. Inequality can undermine procedural fairness. We can see this in economic competition, inequality of opportunity, and political influence. 4. Inequalities can be objectionable when they involve failure to treat equally those who have a claim to equal benefit. Just because everyone has a sufficient level of some service or resource provided by the state does not mean that unequal allocation is just. 5. Inequality can violate the claims of citizens to benefit from the fruits of social cooperation. This is how Scanlon reads Rawls as egalitarian. The participants in the original position are equal participants. The presumption is that they have an equal claim to the benefits of social cooperation. This is why equality is the benchmark from which inequalities are judged, and only those that benefit everyone are permissible. The primary goods are produced by social cooperation and, contra Nozick, the baseline or benchmark is that every equal citizen has an equal claim to those benefits. (For more on the debate between equality, sufficiency, and giving priority to the worst off, see the references for Nagel, Parfit, and Scanlon. For elucidating commentary on Scanlon, see Wolff 2013.)
Many egalitarians hold a stronger domestic than global view. Redistributive priority is given to fellow citizens over persons in other nations. This, on its face, seems inconsistent or unwarranted. If one is committed to equality, what difference could national borders make? Is it just for a state to prioritize domestic distributive justice over global distributive justice? As a pure matter of luck egalitarianism, the state into which one is born is a paradigm example of brute luck. Having one’s life prospects be determined by nation of origin seems as morally arbitrary as having one’s life prospects determined by parentage. The arbitrariness of nationality combined with the universality of the descriptive thesis (all persons are equal) creates tension with domestic prioritization. On the other hand, if redistributive justice deals with the allocation of goods produced by the cooperation of citizens, then perhaps there is a justification for prioritizing domestic over international redistribution. The amount of redistribution required to address global inequality may depend on the nature of the goods to be allocated as well as the degree of entanglement among the world’s various states.
Consider an efficiency argument against global egalitarianism. One may be an egalitarian yet argue for domestic priority based on increased costs of sending aid to distant locations, difficulty with managing the efficient distribution on the other end, or epistemic advantages of dealing with local rather than remote issues. Peter Singer argues against the efficiency rationale. Changes in modern transportation, financial systems, and information technology have lessened most of the inefficiencies in aiding far away persons. Singer’s argument is not about egalitarianism per se, but about preventing what all reasonable people can agree are objectively bad states of affairs: famine, starvation, epidemics, and so forth. So on the one hand, it is not egalitarian in the sense of an equal distribution of some metric, but rather egalitarian in the sense of doing away with suffering at the bottom rungs of the global society.
Singer’s view is a useful example of moral obligations being global. If moral obligations can be global, then perhaps so too can egalitarianism. Proximity is arbitrary in his analysis: someone suffering nearby is no more morally relevant than someone suffering far away. Given the magnitude of global suffering, there is an egalitarian element to his utilitarian calculus. So long as these objectively bad states of affairs are occurring, first world people are obligated to work to prevent them. This will flatten global inequality. His view can be taken in two ways: the strict reading requires sacrifice to the point of marginal utility with the globe’s worst off, or a weaker (though still radical) reading that requires significant sacrifice. However, Singer constrains both readings with a utilitarian productivity argument: the first world may need some excess consumer culture (that in the short term contradicts our obligations to the worst off) to keep the economy at a level where it can make the maximum contribution to the plight of the globe’s worst off.
Singer therefore takes the descriptive thesis to require radical, obligatory sacrifice on the part of citizens in first world countries. Given the amount of objectively bad states of affairs in the world, those who are comparatively well off are obligated to reallocate resources to the worst off.
Onora O’Neill gives another example of global moral obligation. She argues for a right not to be killed unjustly. Global resource inequalities amount to de facto killings. They are unjust, since they can be avoided at reasonable cost. There is no obligation to equalize anything globally, but there is an obligation to avoid violating the global poor’s right to not be killed unjustly. She gives an argument by analogy that highlights the tension between property entitlements and distributive justice. In a lifeboat scenario, one who has excess water and food but withholds it from others, who will die without it, violates their right not to be killed unjustly. Property entitlements vary in strength in different contexts. She then argues that the planet is no different from a lifeboat, so that those dying from poverty and famine have their right not to be killed unjustly violated. This argument hinges on the contextual variability of property rights and the relative strength of the right not to be killed over property rights. The right not to be killed trumps property rights, so the redistribution required to avoid these killings is obligatory. Unlike Singer, this does not generalize to an obligation to prevent all objectively bad happenings globally. First world citizens are only obligated to do what is required to secure everyone’s right not to be killed unjustly. Yet this is radical, too—her conception of agency means that those complicit in first world economies are killing the globe’s worst off. Redistribution is the means to avoid these killings.
Given these types of arguments for global moral obligations, what can be said in favor of domestic priority in egalitarian redistribution? If distributive equality is a matter of justice, should redistribution be global? As in the discussion of anti-egalitarianism, one obvious objection is to deny that the descriptive thesis holds globally. Denying the equality of all the globe’s people is not philosophically interesting. A stronger argument is that the demands of egalitarian justice are tied up with institutions and practices that are not global. If matters of distributive justice have to do with coercive redistribution, then perhaps only persons living within the same state fall under egalitarian requirements. If so, global distributive justice would only apply if there were genuinely powerful and coercive global institutions. Egalitarian obligations only arise within a coercive political structure. That the state holds coercive power over the citizens means that they should each be treated equally and, perhaps, that the state should engage in redistribution to pursue equality of holdings. Various forms of this view appeal to different features of the state. A similar argument is that redistributive justice has to do with allocating the resources made possible through social cooperation. If so, then the bonds of citizenship matter to distributive justice, and we should treat domestic and international inequality differently.
Another domestic-priority view is that egalitarian norms arise among people who share political bonds and obligations, and those attachments are local rather than global. These sorts of objections are not unconditionally opposed to global egalitarianism; they rather object that egalitarianism is tied to certain relationships and institutions that currently are not global. Some egalitarians counter that the amount of global engagement, cooperation, and institutional entanglement does generate global egalitarian obligations. (For example, see Pogge 1989.)
Richard Miller gives a consequentialist argument for domestic prioritization. Too much redistribution directed outside of a particular state can have a destabilizing impact. Even if that state is well off compared to others, as long as it has inequality in its own economy, then those on the internal bottom rungs may become alienated if resources are taken out of their economic system and sent to another country whose most deprived citizens are even more worse off. The worst-off citizens within the relatively wealthier state are participating in a scheme of social cooperation that benefits the well off, their state engages in egalitarian redistribution, but the redistributive scheme prioritizes the needs of the worst off in other countries. It seems as though this scheme provides benefits to all but the domestic worst off. This can undermine their commitment both to productive labor and the respect for the rule of law. This in turn harms the state, makes it less stable and productive, and therefore makes it less able to generate external aid.
Miller also attempts to transcend the patriotism-cosmopolitanism dispute by universalizing patriotic priority. For the vast majority of people, certain universal human goods are only satisfied in local political communities. (The exceptions are a miniscule small number of global elites.) Our need for social interaction and political community is satisfied locally, as we do not share rich attachments with persons across the globe. This changes the inherently arbitrary nature of the state into which one was born into something morally relevant. This is not a rejection of all global redistribution, but an attempt to break from the view that patriotic priority and helping the globe’s worst off are polar opposites. Combined with the previous consequentialist argument, this means that in order to secure these universal human goods, we need individual states, and within each state we need patriotic priority in redistributive justice. Each person needs these goods categorically, they can only be provided locally, and they are threatened when the redistributive scheme within a given state does not exhibit patriotic priority. This is all compatible with the descriptive thesis applying globally. On this view the descriptive thesis only requires that we are not insensitive to the suffering of others. We do have global obligations to assist others, but this does not mean all the demands of distributive justice are all global.
A commitment to global equality requires radical, perhaps unrealistic sacrifice. That can be taken as reason to reject global egalitarianism: persons cannot reasonably be expected to bring about global equality. However, normative principles specify what we ought to do, not what we are comfortable doing. What we ought to do might require a complete change to our way of life.
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