The Ethics of Economic Sanctions
Economic sanctions involve the politically motivated withdrawal of customary trade or financial relations from a state, organisation or individual. They may be imposed by the United Nations, regional governmental organisations such as the European Union, or by states acting alone.
Although economic sanctions have long been a feature of international relations, the end of the Cold War in the late 20th century saw significant proliferation of their use. The sanctions made concerted international action possible where previously any action by the West was countered by the U.S.S.R. and vice-versa. This meant that for the first time the United Nations Security Council could impose economic sanctions that, in theory at least, all member states were required to take part in. With this came the possibility to inflict serious damage. Most notable during this period were the comprehensive sanctions imposed on Haiti, the former Yugoslav republics and Iraq. The harms caused to Haiti and the former Yugoslav republics were severe, but the harms suffered by Iraq were the worst ever caused by the use of economic sanctions outside of a war situation. UNICEF, for example, estimated that the economic sanctions imposed on Iraq led to the deaths of 500,000 children aged under five from malnutrition and disease.
Following the devastation caused by economic sanctions in Iraq, a wide variety of organisations began to seriously investigate the possibility of alternative forms of economic sanctions, sanctions not targeted against ‘ordinary people’ but rather targeted against those considered to be morally responsible for the objectionable policies of the target state. The results—‘targeted’ economic sanctions—became the UN’s economic sanctions tool of choice throughout the 2000s. Targeted economic sanctions include measures such as freezing the assets of top government officials or those suspected of financing terrorism, arms embargoes, nuclear sanctions and so on. The harms inflicted by targeted sanctions are, for the most part, much less extensive than those inflicted by previous episodes of economic sanctions which targeted entire populations. Nevertheless, they are not harmless and may still be morally problematic. For example, the arms embargo imposed during the break up of the former Yugoslavia was widely criticised as it did not permit the Bosnian Muslims to acquire the weapons they needed to defend themselves from the genocidal attacks of certain Bosnian-Serb forces.
Despite the obvious and serious moral problems associated with economic sanctions, the ethics of economic sanctions is a topic that has been curiously neglected by philosophers and political theorists. Only a handful of philosophical journal articles and book chapters have ever been published on the subject. This article describes the work that has been carried out.
Table of Contents
- The Nature of Economic Sanctions
- The Ethics of Economic Sanctions
- References and Further Reading
Economic sanctions are the deliberate withdrawal of customary trade or financial relations (Hufbauer et al., 2007), ordered by a state, supra-national or international governmental organisation (the ‘sender’) from any state, sub-state group, organisation or individual (the ‘target’) in response to the political behaviour of that target.
The specific elements of this definition merit some discussion. First, economic sanctions may comprise the withdrawal of customary trade or financial relations in whole or in part. Trade may be restricted in its entirety by refusing all imports and exports. If all imports and exports are refused then the sanctions are known as ‘comprehensive’ sanctions. (Though note that even in the case of comprehensive sanctions humanitarian exemptions are usually made, for example, for food and medicine). In other cases, only some imports or exports are refused—usually commodities like oil and timber—or weapons in the case of arms embargoes. Financial restrictions include measures such as asset freezes, the denial of credit, the denial of banking services, the withdrawal of aid and so on. Again, withdrawal of financial relations may be comprehensive or not.
Second, economic sanctions may be ordered (or ‘imposed’) by a variety of actors. Sanctions can be ‘multilateral’, ordered by the United Nations or regional organisations such as the European Union, or they can be ‘unilateral’, ordered by one state acting alone. The actor ordering economic sanctions is typically known as the ‘sender’ of the sanctions.
In practical terms, contemporary economic sanctions are imposed by following a legal process. For example, economic sanctions mandated by the United Nations Security Council are required to be adopted by all member states under chapter VII of the United Nations Charter. States then pass legislation prohibiting their citizens from entering into trading and/or financial relationships with the target and setting penalties for sanctions-breaking. So although we often talk of sanctions being ‘imposed’ on the target, it should be clear that economic sanctions are actually legal measures imposed by a sender on its own members. It is a sender’s own citizens who are prohibited from trading.
Further, note that this definition excludes measures undertaken by non-state actors, for example, consumer boycotts or boycotts undertaken by companies or religious organisations. Such measures are undeniably worthy of ethical enquiry; however, the ethical concerns they present are sufficiently distinctive to make it sensible to treat them as a separate issue.
Third, states are not the only targets of economic sanctions. Economic sanctions can be, and often are, imposed on sub-state groups. Well known examples from the recent past are the sanctions imposed on Serb-controlled areas of the former Yugoslavia in the 1990s or the ban on trade in conflict diamonds that targeted sub-state rebel groups in parts of Africa. Economic sanctions can also be imposed on companies, organisations and individuals. For example, the UK regularly freezes the UK-held assets of companies, charities or individuals suspected of funding terrorist activities. For this reason it is perfectly possible for a state to sanction its own citizens. Those on the receiving end of economic sanctions are typically known as the ‘target’.
In recent years there has been a shift away from targeting entire states, and towards targeting economic sanctions more narrowly at specific sub-state groups and individuals—those considered responsible for the political behaviour the sanctions are responding to. The reasons for this are two-fold. First, it is expected that such sanctions are more likely to achieve their objectives. Second, it makes it less likely that the harms of sanctions will fall on innocent people. Economic sanctions that are narrowly targeted in this way are known as ‘targeted’ or ‘smart’ sanctions. There is no common term for sanctions imposed on an entire state. This entry suggests ‘collective’.
Fourth, under this definition, economic sanctions are imposed in response to the political behaviour of the target—as distinguished from its economic behaviour. Such a stipulation is common in the economic sanctions literature. For example, Robert Pape distinguishes economic sanctions from what he calls ‘trade wars’:
When the United States threatens China with economic punishment if it does not respect human rights, that is an economic sanction; when punishment is threatened over copyright infringement, that is a trade war (Pape, 1999, 94).
However, not everyone accepts this distinction. David Baldwin, for instance, denies that economic sanctions must be a response to political behaviour. For Baldwin economic sanctions can be a response to any type of behaviour—there is no reason to restrict the definition of economic sanctions to those measures which aim to respond to political behaviour. Thus, contra Pape, Baldwin argues that if the U.S imposes restrictions on trade with China over copyright issues then this is an economic sanction. Further, he argues that in any case there is no clear-cut distinction between the ‘political’ and the ‘economic’ and so there would be no clear-cut basis for making the distinction even if it were warranted (Baldwin, 1985).
In response to Baldwin, it is worth pointing out that in common usage the term ‘economic sanctions’ is actually reserved for a distinctive class of cases that we can roughly describe as being a response to political rather than economic behaviour. Baldwin is right that there is no clear-cut distinction between the political and the economic, but to categorise responses to both as economic sanctions is to ignore the fact that people do actually manage to make the distinction in practice.
Finally, the definition presented here makes no reference to the objective sought by economic sanctions or the mechanism by which they are expected to work. This is an advantage since both the question of the proper objectives of sanctions and the question of how they work, are controversial.
Economic sanctions theorists tend to conceptualise economic sanctions in one of two ways: as tools of foreign policy or as tools of international law enforcement. As tools of foreign policy, their objective is to achieve foreign policy goals. As tools of international law enforcement, their objective is to enforce international law or international moral norms.
Economic sanctions are most commonly conceptualised as being tools for achieving foreign policy goals. They are considered part of the foreign policy ‘toolkit’ (a range of measures that includes diplomacy, propaganda, covert action, the use of military force, and so forth) that politicians have at their disposal when attempting to influence the behaviour of other states. The foreign policy conception comes in both simple and more sophisticated versions.
In the simple version, the objective of economic sanctions is to change or prevent a target’s ‘objectionable’ policy or behaviour where a policy or behaviour is understood to be ‘objectionable’ if it conflicts with the foreign policy goals of the sender.
However, a frequent criticism of economic sanctions is that—if these are their goals—then economic sanctions don’t work. That is, they usually fail to change or prevent a target’s objectionable policy or behaviour (Nossal, 1989). This concern has led some to ask the question: if economic sanctions don’t work, why do we keep using them? The attempt to answer this question has led some theorists to develop more sophisticated conceptions of economic sanctions.
It has been argued, for instance, that although changing a target’s ‘objectionable’ policy or behaviour is sometimes the objective of economic sanctions, politicians often employ economic sanctions in much more nuanced and subtle ways (Baldwin, 1985, Cortright & Lopez, 2000).
First, Baldwin argues that economic sanctions are often employed with the more limited objective of influencing a target’s ‘beliefs, attitudes, opinions, expectations, emotions and/or propensities to act’ (Baldwin, 1985, 20). No immediate policy or behaviour change is expected—even if, in the long—term, some change is hoped for. In such cases Baldwin argues that economic sanctions are being used symbolically to ‘send a message’. They can signal specific intentions or general foreign policy orientations or they can be used to show support or disapproval for the policies of other states. If the economic sanctions are imposed at some cost to the sending state then this demonstrates the sender’s commitment to its position and strengthens the message being sent. Importantly, even if the objective of an episode of economic sanctions is to ‘send a message’, it is unlikely to feature as the officially stated objective. The message is stronger if the sanctions are framed as demanding a change in the target’s objectionable policy or behaviour—even if it is clear that the economic sanctions alone cannot hope to change this behaviour.
Second, Baldwin argues that economic sanctions may have multiple objectives of which some will be more important to the sender than others. Behaviour change might be a sender’s secondary or even tertiary objective whilst ‘sending a message’ might be the primary objective. Even if the most important objective for the sender is to ‘send a message’, the economic sanctions must be framed as demanding behaviour change if this secondary or tertiary objective is to be met.
Third, economic sanctions may have multiple targets. For example, if economic sanctions are employed as a general deterrent, then there will be many targets of the influence attempt extending well beyond the original recipient of the economic sanctions (Baldwin, 1985).
David Cortright and George A. Lopez have also worked on developing more sophisticated understandings of economic sanctions. Economic sanctions, they argue, can be imposed for purposes that include deterrence, demonstrating resolve, upholding international norms and sending messages of disapproval as well as influencing behaviour change (Cortright & Lopez, 2000).
Finally, Kim Richard Nossal argues that senders might also have retributive punishment as their objective. In other words the intent is to inflict economic harm on a target they regard to have wronged them solely for its own sake and not to achieve any change in behaviour or policy. For Nossal, to be clear, saying a sender has been ‘wronged’ is not to say it has been morally wronged. It is only to say that the target’s actions have displeased the sender. Thus, on Nossal’s account, senders can ‘punish’ agents who—objectively—have done nothing morally wrong—just as a mafia boss might ‘punish’ underlings who have been passing information to the police. Again, it is important to realise that even if the purpose of the economic sanctions is retributive punishment, it is unlikely to be stated as such by the sender for fear of appearing irrational or vindictive (Nossal, 1989).
For all these reasons it would be a mistake to assume from the fact that economic sanctions often fail to achieve their stated objectives that economic sanctions do not work; stated objectives are not always true objectives. The true objectives might be to punish or to send a message. Even when the stated objectives are true objectives they may not be the primary objectives.
Given the above discussion, it appears that changing or preventing objectionable policies or behaviour, ‘sending a message’, and punishment are all possible objectives of economic sanctions.
Alternatively, economic sanctions are sometimes conceptualised as being a tool for enforcing international law or international norms of behaviour. On this conception, the ultimate objective of economic sanctions is understood to be international law enforcement.
For Margaret Doxey, enforcement of the law through the use of economic sanctions might take several forms.
First, enforcement might involve the ending of ongoing violations of international law/norms—the domestic analogy is that of stopping a crime in progress. Doxey’s own example is that of economic sanctions imposed to reverse the illegal invasion of the Falklands Islands by Argentina (Doxey, 1987, 91).
Second, enforcement might require preventing violations of international law from occurring in the first place. The domestic equivalent is that of preventing a known criminal conspiracy from being realised. As Doxey notes, under chapter VII of the UN Charter, given adequate support from its members, the Security Council can designate any situation a threat to peace and then order preventive action to ensure that the threat is not realised (Doxey, 1987, 91).
Third, enforcement might require that economic sanctions are imposed punitively subsequent to violations of international law to deter either the recipient state or others from repeating the violations. Here economic sanctions are ‘a kind of fine for international misbehaviour’ (Doxey, 1987, 92).
The main difference between the law enforcement and the foreign policy conceptions of economic sanctions is that the former claims that the objectives of economic sanctions are purely to enforce international law/international norms of behaviour, whereas the latter claims that the objectives of economic sanctions are determined by a sender’s foreign policy. Of course the two conceptions are not mutually exclusive. A given sanctions episode may align with a sender’s foreign policy goals and work to enforce international law.
This difference between the two conceptions can partially be explained with reference to the focus of the respective theorists’ studies: those employing a foreign policy conception tend to focus on cases where states are the senders of economic sanctions, whereas those employing a law enforcement conception tend to focus on cases where the UN is the sender. Undoubtedly the foreign policy conception fits states better than the UN and the law enforcement conception fits the UN better than states. However, it would be wrong to say that the foreign policy conception applies to states and the law enforcement conception to the UN. States can also act to enforce international law. Likewise, the UN is not immune to the national interests of its more powerful member states.
To summarise then, these are the possible objectives of economic sanctions:
- To change or prevent objectionable or unlawful policies or behaviour
- To send a message with regards to objectionable or unlawful policies or behaviour
- To punish objectionable or unlawful behaviour on deterrent or retributive grounds
Whatever the objectives of economic sanctions, we also need to address the question of how economic sanctions work. Five mechanisms are discussed here: economic pressure, non-economic pressure, direct denial of resources, message sending and punitive mechanisms.
Theorists of economic sanctions began addressing the question of how economic sanctions worked in the 1970s and 80s and took as their model collective sanctions imposed on states—as this was the predominant mode of sanctioning at the time. They theorised that economic sanctions achieved behaviour/policy change via the imposition of economic pressure. Robert Pape sums this view up well when he states that economic sanctions ‘seek to lower the aggregate economic welfare of a target state by reducing international trade in order to coerce the target government to change its political behaviour’ (Pape, 1997, 94). In elaborating on this mechanism Pape argues that:
Targets of economic sanctions understand they would be better off economically if they conceded to the coercer’s demands, and make their decision based on whether they consider their political objectives to be worth the economic costs. (Pape, 1997, 94)
A similar view to Pape is shared by Hufbauer. They use the following framework to analyse the utility of economic sanctions:
Stripped to the bare bones, the formula for a successful sanctions effort is simple: The costs of defiance borne by the target must be greater than its perceived cost of compliance. That is, the political and economic costs to the target from sanctions must be greater than the political and security costs of complying with the sender’s demands. (Hufbuaer, 2007, 50)
Indeed, the view that economic sanctions work via the imposition of economic pressure is the most widely accepted in the literature. Johann Galtung even calls it ‘the general theory of economic sanctions’ and he elucidates as follows. Focussing on collective economic sanctions, Galtung argues that the objective of economic sanctions is to cause an amount of economic harm sufficient to bring about the ‘political disintegration’ of the state which, in turn, will result in the state being forced to comply with the sender’s demands. For Galtung ‘political disintegration’ is a split in the leadership of a state or a split between the leadership and the people that occurs as people within the state disagree about what to do with regards to the sanctions and the resulting economic crisis. This may involve popular protest and the government being forced to change the objectionable or unlawful policy for fear of losing power. Under what Galtung calls the ‘naïve theory’ of economic sanctions (which he rejects), the more severe the economic pressure, the faster and more significant the political disintegration and the sooner the state will comply. This theory is naïve, Galtung argues, because it does not take into account the fact that sanctions might—at least initially—result in political integration, as the people of the state pull together in the face of adversity. This is especially likely to occur if the target government can muster up the spirit of nationalism. Indeed, ‘rally-round-the-flag’ effects are often cited as a reason for the failure of economic sanctions. Under Galtung’s ‘revised theory’ of economic sanctions, economic pressure results initially in political integration but will eventually lead to political disintegration as economic pressure increases but, he warns, the levels of economic harm required for this might in some cases be exceptionally severe (Galtung, 1967).
With regards to targeted sanctions, it seems possible that they could also sometimes operate via an economic pressure mechanism. For example, asset freezes on top government officials might pressure them into changing the objectionable or unlawful policy/behaviour if the amounts involved were significant enough.
Baldwin, however, argues that although economic pressure is one possibility for how economic sanctions might work, it is not the only one. In particular, he argues that economic sanctions do not have to cause economic harm to work. He argues that even if the economic sanctions make barely a dent in a target state’s economy, its government may be moved to act out of a concern to avoid international embarrassment or a reputation as a pariah state. This is particularly likely to occur when targets believe themselves to be members in good standing of international society. Suffering international condemnation might be unacceptable to them. In other cases Baldwin argues that targets might worry that the economic sanctions are a prelude to war. Since a just war must be a last resort, those about to resort to war often impose sanctions first—either in a genuine attempt to reach a non-military resolution or, more cynically, to demonstrate to domestic and international audiences that non-military methods have been attempted and failed—thus making war the last resort. A target might comply with the economic sanctions not because they damage the economy but out of concern to avoid war (Baldwin, 1985). The pressure employed here does not derive from the economic effects of the sanctions. Both collective and targeted economic sanctions may utilise a non-economic pressure mechanism.
Economic sanctions employing either the economic or non-economic pressure mechanisms work only indirectly: pressure is applied to targets to force them to change their objectionable/unlawful policies themselves. Thus such sanctions are sometimes referred to as ‘indirect’ sanctions (Gordon, 1999).
However, economic sanctions can also operate directly by denying a target the resources necessary for pursuit of their objectionable/unlawful policy. For example, if the objectionable/unlawful policy of that target state is its militarisation, then economic sanctions might be designed to damage a target state’s economy so thoroughly that it does not have the resources available to build up or maintain its military capacity, or they might involve arms embargoes or nuclear sanctions. Similarly, asset freezes of either state funds or the funds of government officials may operate with a direct mechanism. Freezing Libya’s state funds and the funds of Colonel Gadaffi was intended to make it impossible for him to pay mercenaries during the Arab Spring. Plus the freezing of assets suspected of belonging to terrorist groups is intended to make financing terrorist operations more difficult. Such ‘direct sanctions’ do not apply pressure to the target to change their objectionable/unlawful policy themselves but instead work directly by denying the target the resources it needs to pursue the objectionable/unlawful policy.
Of course, not all economic sanctions aim to change or prevent an objectionable/unlawful policy. Some aim only to ‘send a message’. If the objective of the economic sanctions is simply to ‘send a message’ then the imposition of sanctions in itself should be sufficient to achieve this—causing economic harm should not be necessary. Having said this, there are undoubtedly ways of making the message stronger and causing some economic harm to the target might do this. Of course, as both Baldwin and Doxey note, this is not the only way to strengthen the message. If the sanctions are costly to the sender—because, for instance, they involve putting a stop to valuable exports, this willingness of the sender to bear costs shows how seriously it takes the situation.
Punishment necessarily involves the infliction of some harm, suffering or otherwise unpleasant consequences on the target, and this is the case whether the objective of the punishment is to deter or whether the punishment is purely retributive in nature. Thus economic sanctions imposed as punishment must either inflict some economic harm or, if a target state (or organisation/individual) is particularly sensitive about its standing in the international community, symbolic sanctions expressing international condemnation might suffice as punishment.
The table below summarises the possible objectives of economic sanctions, together with each objective’s related mechanism(s).
At least four moral frameworks have been used to consider the ethics of economic sanctions: just war theory, theories of law enforcement, utilitarianism, and ‘clean hands’.
Of the few writers who have considered the ethics of economic sanctions, the majority point to the analogies between economic sanctions and war and use just war theory as a framework within which to assess their moral permissibility. Some extend the framework only to collective, comprehensive economic sanctions (Gordon, 1999) while others extend it to all types of economic sanctions (Pierce, 1996, Winkler, 1999, Amstutz, 2013).
Just war theory is split into two parts: jus ad bellum, which sets out the principles that must be followed for the resort to war to be just and jus in bello, which sets out the principles that must be followed during war. (Some just war theorists add a third part, jus post bellum, which sets out the principles that must be followed post-war, but since no writers on economic sanctions consider jus post bellum, it has been left out of the following analysis). Those writers who employ just war theory as a moral framework believe that these principles of just war theory can—with minor adjustments—be appropriate as a moral framework for economic sanctions as follows.
There are six principles of jus ad bellum. For the resort to war to be just, all six conditions must be met.
Just Cause: There must be a just cause for war. In mainstream just war theory, just cause is limited to:
- the defence of a state from an actual or imminent military attack; and
- humanitarian intervention in cases where a state is committing extremely serious human rights violations against its own citizens.
Theorists applying this principle to economic sanctions widely agree that there is just cause to impose economic sanctions if their aim is:
- to defend a state from the target’s actual or imminent military attack; or
- to stop extremely serious human rights violations being carried out by the target against its own citizens.
Some theorists go further and allow greater latitude for the case of economic sanctions, arguing that there is just cause for economic sanctions in situations of serious injustice that nevertheless fall short of just cause for war (Amstutz, 2013).
However, under the just war framework, there is no just cause for economic sanctions with punitive objectives. Likewise, there is no just cause for economic sanctions imposed preventively, to head off future (but non-imminent) attacks. The theorists in question do not consider economic sanctions designed to ‘send a message’, but since such sanctions do not aim to defend a state from military attack or to stop serious human rights violations but aim merely to change attitudes, beliefs, and so forth, it would seem that there would be no just cause for them on this approach. Therefore, economic sanctions designed to punish or to prevent objectionable/unlawful policies or behaviour would be ruled out as would all sanctions designed to ‘send a message’.
Proportionality: The harm that will foreseeably be caused by the war must not be disproportionate to the good that it is hoped will be achieved. The good consequences to be counted are limited to those specified in the just cause, i.e. putting a stop to any attack or human rights abuses. Any incidental good consequences, such as the kick-starting of an economy, should not be included in the proportionality calculation. However, the harmful consequences of war are not limited to certain types and should all be counted. Further, the calculation must include the harms suffered by all parties to the war and those suffered by neutral states.
For economic sanctions, this principle is met if the good achieved by the sanctions is expected to outweigh the harms of those sanctions. The good to be counted is the ending of the attack, human rights abuses or other injustice. The harms to be counted include not just those suffered by target citizens but also those suffered by sender citizens. It is worth remembering that citizens of sender states can suffer—either directly if their business relies on trade with the target—or indirectly if the economy of the sending state is particularly reliant on trade with the target.
There is nothing essential to the nature of economic sanctions that would prevent the proportionality condition being met.
Right Intention: The decision to go to war must be made with the right intention—the intention to achieve the just cause. The just cause must not be a pretext for some unjust end that is secretly intended. Therefore, economic sanctions must be imposed with the intention of defending a state from attack or stopping/reducing human rights violations. There is nothing essential to the nature of economic sanctions that prevents this condition from being fulfilled. However, Winkler warns that, as a matter of fact, there is a propensity for economic sanctions to be imposed without clear purpose and this means that the requirement of right intention might not be met in many actual cases (Winkler, 1999).
Legitimate Authority: The decision to go to war must be made by a legitimate authority. That is, one which has the moral right to act on behalf of its people and take them into a war. In international law there is a presumption that the governments of all states are legitimate authorities. According to mainstream just war theory, private individuals may not wage war. According to A. J. Coates, war is a legal instrument, and the power to enforce the law is vested in the government on behalf the political community. Thus, private war is an instance of taking the law into your own hands and is a kind of vigilante justice (Coates, 1997).
There is nothing essential to the nature of economic sanctions that would prevent this condition being met. However, if we take the war/economic sanctions analogy seriously, the legitimate authority condition implies that private boycotts of a target state’s products by individuals, companies or other organisations are wrongful—a kind of vigilante justice. This is a conclusion that many would be unwilling to accept.
Last Resort: War must be the last resort. Given the horrendous harms it creates, war must be necessary in order to be just. If other, less harmful, alternatives are available such as economic sanctions or diplomatic measures, then war is not necessary and therefore not just. Under just war theory it is not the case that all the alternative measures must actually be attempted first: if it is obvious they would not work then there is no requirement to make such attempts.
Clearly, if war must be the last resort, it cannot be a requirement that economic sanctions are also a last resort. The equivalent requirement given is that economic sanctions must be the last resort short of war (Winkler, 1999, 145) or that less harmful or less coercive means must be attempted before economic sanctions may be imposed (Amstutz, 2013, 217 ). Again there is nothing essential to the nature of economic sanctions that would prevent them being the least harmful or coercive means available. However, it is worth noting that the harmful effects of economic sanctions have been underestimated in the past and it is not inconceivable that the harms of economic sanctions could exceed those of war in a given case.
Reasonable Chance of Success: There must be a reasonable chance of success. This is to prevent hopeless wars where people die pointlessly.
This condition is particularly pertinent for economic sanctions. Historically, economic sanctions have been accused of ‘never working’ (Nossal, 1989). If this were true then economic sanctions would never be morally permissible under just war theory. However, it is not true. The most comprehensive study of the effectiveness of economic sanctions to date concluded that economic sanctions succeeded (achieved their stated objectives) in one third of cases (Hufbauer et al., 2007). This figure is disputed and is not in any case particularly high. However, it seems fair to say it is not impossible for economic sanctions to work. Therefore this condition could be met in specific cases.
Having addressed the principles of jus ad bellum, it is clear that some economic sanctions may meet the conditions. However, it is still necessary to consider jus in bello. As with jus ad bellum, all the conditions of jus in bello must be met for an individual military action to be morally permissible. However, there is only one principle that is particularly relevant to economic sanctions and that is the principle of discrimination.
Discrimination: The principle of discrimination requires attackers to distinguish between two classes of people in war: combatants and non-combatants, and stipulates their different treatment. According to the principle of discrimination, it is morally permissible to attack combatants at any time. Non-combatants, on the other hand, have immunity from attack, and it is never morally permissible to attack them directly. However, it is sometimes morally permissible to harm non-combatants as an unintentional side effect of an attack against combatants or military property under the doctrine of double effect. The doctrine of double effect acknowledges that one action (for example, bombing a weapons factory) can have two effects: the intended effect (destroying a weapons factory) and a foreseen but unintended side effect (killing non-combatants who live nearby). According to the traditional doctrine of double effect, it is morally permissible to bring about a harmful side effect if it is a foreseen but genuinely unintended consequence of pursuing some good end that is intended—so long as the harm of the side effect is not disproportionate to the intended good end. Michael Walzer, however, significantly revises the traditional doctrine of double effect and it is worth considering his revision here because most of those writing on economic sanctions use Walzer’s version. Walzer adds a further condition to the doctrine. It is not good enough, Walzer argues, that the harm to non-combatants be unintended and not disproportionate, we should expect soldiers to take positive steps to minimise harm to non-combatants, even if this imposes costs to themselves. As he puts it ‘[d]ouble effect is defensible…only when the two [effects] are the product of a double intention: first, that the ‘good’ be achieved; second that the foreseeable evil be reduced as far as possible’ (Walzer, 2006, 155). It is only in this case when the side-effect harms to non-combatants are morally permissible.
In the case of economic sanctions though, who are the equivalent of ‘combatant’ and ‘non-combatant’? Pierce argues that the individuals falling into the class of ‘combatants’ are those who are actually part of the causal chain of events that led to the objectionable or unlawful policy: those who planned and organised it, and those who are carrying it out (Pierce, 1996, 102). Similarly, for Winkler, combatants are those who plan and carry out the objectionable or unlawful policy (Winkler, 1999, 149). For Amtutz, combatants are ‘the government and the elites that support it’ (Amstutz, 2013, 217). Gordon is not clear on who counts as a ‘combatant,’ but she is clear about who she thinks does not: ‘those who are least able to defend themselves, who present the least military threat, who have the least input into policy and military decisions, and who are the most vulnerable’ (Gordon, 1996, 125). On any of these definitions, it is clear that in cases where a target state is pursuing an objectionable/unlawful policy, there will be both ‘combatants’ and ‘non-combatants’ amongst its citizens.
It is generally agreed by writers employing the just war framework that collective sanctions violate the principle of discrimination. Where the collective sanctions involve an indirect economic pressure mechanism, economic harms are intentionally inflicted on the population in the hopes they will protest and force their government to change their objectionable policies. Given that some of the population will count as ‘non-combatants’, this involves the intentional infliction of harm on non-combatants and straightforwardly violates the principle of discrimination.
Where the collective sanctions involve a direct denial of resources mechanism, for example, an attempt to destroy an economy to end a state’s militarisation, the harm to non-combatants is not intended but it is foreseeable and it is still problematic. In the memorable words of Joy Gordon, such sanctions are like a ‘siege writ large’. The sanctions prevent the import of goods into a country just as a surrounding enemy army would a castle or city. Thus sanctions are vulnerable to the same moral criticisms as a siege. Sieges do not discriminate between combatants and non-combatants. In fact in a siege it is usually the non-combatants who suffer the most since increasingly scarce resources will be allocated as a matter of priority to the army or leadership. As Gordon states, in both sieges and in the case of comprehensive collective sanctions ‘the harm is done to those who are least able to defend themselves, who present the least military threat, who have the least input into policy or military decisions, and who are the most vulnerable’ (Gordon, 1999, 125). Sieges do not discriminate between combatants and non-combatants and they do not demonstrate an intention to minimise harms to non-combatants. Therefore, even if the harms are not intended, they cannot be justified under Walzer’s revised doctrine of double effect.
In summary, all writers employing the just war principles as a framework justify its use by drawing an analogy between economic sanctions and war. The just war framework then leads them to conclude that collective sanctions are always impermissible because they violate the just war principle of discrimination. Pierce, Winkler and Amstutz further extend the use of just war principles to targeted economic sanctions and conclude that targeted economic sanctions that do not harm ‘non-combatants’ may be morally permissible because it is at least theoretically possible that they can meet all the just war principles. This would appear to be a neat solution to the issue of the ethics of economic sanctions. However, there are objections to this approach.
Christiansen & Powers argue that there are significant differences between the case of war and the case of collective, comprehensive economic sanctions and therefore that the just war principles provide an inadequate framework for the moral analysis of such economic sanctions. In particular they argue that the principle of discrimination does not apply to the case of economic sanctions.
For them, the most important differences between war and economic sanctions are that (1) economic sanctions are imposed as an alternative to war, not as a form of war (sieges during a war being a form of war), and (2) economic sanctions—if carefully designed and monitored—cause less harm than war. They argue that the just war principles—in particular the principle of discrimination—exist to prevent military conflicts heading down the road to ‘total war’, a hellish situation where anything goes. They are an attempt to keep war within some kind of limited civilised control. However, they argue, the intent behind economic sanctions is to avoid war altogether, to stop us even starting upon the road to total war. This being so, there is no reason why the principles governing war—including the principle of discrimination—should also govern economic sanctions (Christiansen & Powers, 1996, 101-109).
Of course that still leaves open the question of what principles should govern economic sanctions, particularly when it concerns questions of inflicting harm on ‘non-combatants’ or, as they put it ‘innocent’ people. Christiansen & Powers argue that in certain cases it is permissible to harm innocent people by means of economic sanctions—even intentionally—so long as their basic rights are not violated. As they state:
“Another model for thinking about sanctions may be found in the distinction between basic rights and lesser rights and enjoyments. This may prove more useful than the just war principle of [discrimination] as a paradigm for economic sanctions. As long as the survival of the population is not put at risk and its health is not severely impaired, aspects of daily life might temporarily be degraded for the sake of restoring the [more basic] rights of others” (Christiansen & Powers, 1996, 107).
Christiansen and Powers go on to argue that there are two further differences between war and economic sanctions that also lend support to abolishing the principle of discrimination. They argue (1) that a population might consent to suffer economic sanctions in which case harming them would not violate their rights, and (2) that a population can in fact bear moral responsibility for the actions of its government, for example, by supporting or not opposing them, and so not qualify as ‘non-combatant’ or innocent. They argue that neither of these considerations are available in the case of war.
It is first worth pointing out that they are surely wrong about these considerations not being available in the case of war. A population suffering severe human rights violations such as ethnic cleansing or genocide might consent to military intervention to help protect them. Likewise, if we can hold a population morally responsible for the actions of their government because they supported them or did not oppose them, then we can do this whether economic sanctions or war are being considered. Nevertheless, their arguments that consent or moral responsibility on the part of the innocent population renders harm to that population morally permissible can be considered on their own merits. Let us consider each in turn.
If an individual genuinely consents to suffer harm then her rights are not violated since she has waived her right to not be harmed in this way. To give an example, it is often argued that the Black population of South Africa consented to the anti-Apartheid sanctions and that this justified the harms they suffered. The consent argument, of course, only applies where the innocent population does in fact consent. This is something that is very difficult to establish. Further, even if it can be shown that the majority of a population consent to the sanctions, it is unlikely that every last person will do so. Hence the consent justification is unlikely to justify all targeting of innocent people.
Christiansen & Powers further argue that we can consider a population morally responsible for its government’s policies if they support them or fail to oppose them—at least where the state in question is a democracy and opposition does not meet with serious penalties. In such cases, they argue, the population is not innocent and so it is morally permissible to target them directly with economic sanctions. They give the example of the White population of South Africa, arguing that the White population shared responsibility for the Apartheid policies of their government and therefore it was morally permissible to target them directly with economic sanctions. However, even if it is accepted that supporting or failing to oppose objectionable/unlawful policies renders one morally responsible and non-innocent, it is very unlikely that every last person in a state is actually supporting—or not opposing—the policies. There is almost always some opposition, however small. Further, one would not normally attribute moral responsibility for such actions to children. They remain innocent. Hence, even if we were to accept the idea that supporting—or even just failing to oppose—one’s government was sufficient for the attribution of moral responsibility—a state would still have some innocent members amongst its population.
Christiansen & Powers conclude by offering their own moral framework which, while clearly influenced by just war theory, has significant differences. The most significant difference is the absence of the principle of discrimination and two replacement principles as follows:
A Commitment to and Prospects for a Political Solution: Sanctions should be pursued as an alternative to war, not as another form of war. They must be part of an abiding commitment to and a feasible strategy for finding a political solution to the problem that justified the imposition of sanctions in the first place.
Humanitarian Proviso: Civilians should be immune from grave and irreversible harm from sanctions, though lesser harms may be imposed on the civilian population. Provision must be made to ensure that fundamental human rights, such as the right to food, medicine, and shelter, are not violated. (Christiansen & Powers, 1996, 114)
It has been argued that the revisions made to the just war principles—considered above—do not go far enough. The just war principles are derived from a set of complex and detailed arguments all planted firmly within the context of war. These arguments contain premises that, whilst they may hold true in the case of war, do not always hold true in the case of economic sanctions. Therefore, a much more thoroughgoing revision of just war principles is required if they are to be applied to the case of economic sanctions (Ellis, 2013).
Further, while there are differences between war and collective comprehensive economic sanctions, there are even greater differences between war and targeted economic sanctions. These also call into question the use of a just war framework (Ellis, 2013). For example, why should an arms embargo—which aims to prevent or mitigate a war—be considered under the same principles governing the resort to war or the fighting of it? There is no obvious reason why it should.
As we have seen, one way of conceptualising of the economic sanctions is as a tool of international law enforcement: a means to prevent, terminate or punish violations of international law or international moral norms. Therefore, it would seem natural to analyse the ethics of economic sanctions using a framework based on the ethics of law enforcement. Theorists who have done this (Damrosch 1994, Lang 2008) argue that the use of economic sanctions as a tool of law enforcement faces significant moral challenges as follows.
Legitimate Authority: Many argue that only a legitimate authority has the right to enforce the law. An authority is considered legitimate if she (or it) is morally justified in exercising that authority. Opinion is divided on what exactly makes an authority legitimate but two oft-cited necessary conditions are (1) the consent of those subject to the authority (either tacit or explicit), (2) impartiality on the part of the authority; that is, the authority should have no reason to favour the interests of one party over the interests of any other (Rodin, 2002, 176-177).
In the domestic case, it is widely accepted that states (at least democratic states) have the legitimate authority to enforce domestic law against citizens. Therefore agents of the state (police, judges, prison officers) have the legitimate authority to prevent, terminate and punish crime in a way that ordinary citizens do not. If ordinary citizens attempt to prevent, terminate and punish criminals themselves—without any state involvement—this is closer to vigilantism or revenge than law enforcement.
However, in the international case the picture is more complex. Although (at least democratic) states are regarded as having legitimate authority over their own citizens, they are not regarded as having legitimate authority over the citizens of foreign states or over foreign states themselves. First, they lack the consent of foreign citizens or states. Second, they lack impartiality since, in any international dispute, they are likely to prefer their own national interest over the interest of foreign states or citizens. This position on the legitimate authority of states is consistent with the fundamental principle of international law that all sovereign states are equal in the international system.
Different considerations apply when it comes to the United Nations. Is the United Nations a legitimate authority? The UN certainly does claim the authority to interpret international law and to enforce it—at least in the area of peace and security. According to the UN Charter, the Security Council has the authority to require that all UN member states impose economic sanctions on those states or individuals it deems a threat to peace and security. However, many would argue that this authority is illusory since the UN lacks the power to enforce its own judgments on matters of international law. This is because the UN relies on support of member states to achieve law enforcement, and this is not always forthcoming. Further, the permanent members of the Security Council can veto any action the UN proposes. Other critics would argue that whatever de facto authority the UN has, that authority is not legitimate; some question whether the UN really has the consent of member states, others question whether or not the UN, dominated as it is by the five permanent members of the Security Council, is really impartial.
This leads many to conclude that (1) there is no entity in the international system with the legitimate authority to enforce the law, and (2) therefore there is no possibility of morally justified law enforcement at the international level.
Principled Basis: In order to be morally justified on the basis of law enforcement, the sanctions must be a response to violations of genuine international law or international moral norms (Damrosch, 1994). This is not as straightforward as it sounds. International law is a very different matter to domestic law; there is considerable dispute about the moral norms that hold sway internationally and whether or not they even count as real laws. While economic sanctions imposed as a response to the rule against aggression or genocide would pass this test easily, other moral norms are more questionable; to borrow an example from Damrosch, is democratic governance an international moral norm?
Consistency: Law enforcement should be consistent—it is a fundamental principle of justice that like cases are treated alike. It is unfair if one state or individual is prevented from carrying out an activity or punished for it, when another is not (other things being equal). Yet, all our evidence to date shows that economic sanctions are not imposed consistently—they are not regularly and reliably imposed on those who violate international law or international moral norms. With regards to the UN, the national interests of the UN Security Council members are more a guide to the likelihood of sanctions being employed than the fact of a violation (Damrosch, 1994). The situation for states is no different. This should not be surprising, consistency in law enforcement is a product of impartiality and neither the UN nor states are impartial.
Harm to Innocents: Economic sanctions that are used to prevent, terminate or punish breaches of international law sometimes intentionally (or at least foreseeably) harm innocent people—those who bear no moral responsibility for the illegality in question. This is morally problematic because, as a matter of justice, we usually think that the harms of law enforcement and punishment should be directed only at wrongdoers (Lang, 2008; Damrosch, 1994).
Here though it is worth making a distinction between punishment after the fact and law enforcement directed at preventing or terminating violations of law.
In the case of punishment after the fact, it is straightforwardly accepted by most that it is wrong to punish the innocent. This means that collective sanctions—those aimed at the entire population of a state—are straightforwardly morally wrong if judged as punishment. They are a type of collective punishment that punishes the innocent along with the guilty. Targeted sanctions, of course, may be targeted directly at the guilty (or at least those believed to be guilty) and so can avoid this problem.
Lang would extend the prohibition on harming the innocent to all types of law enforcement. However, Damrosch argues that the case of preventing and terminating violations of law is different. She argues that if the law being enforced is important enough (for example, if the sanctions are aimed at preventing genocide) then innocents may be intentionally or foreseeably harmed to achieve this. To be sure, law enforcement measures should be chosen carefully to minimise the suffering of innocent bystanders, but it should not be ruled out altogether (Damrosch, 1994, 67).
Joy Gordon has used utilitarianism to assess the moral status of comprehensive economic sanctions (Gordon, 1999). According to utilitarianism, an act is right if and only if it maximises utility (i.e. the balance of pleasure over pain or, more generally, of benefit over harm).
According to Gordon, comprehensive economic sanctions are justified on utilitarian grounds in cases where ‘the economic hardship of the civilian population of the target country entails less human harm overall, and less harm to the sanctioned population, than the military aggression or human rights violations the sanctions seek to prevent’ (Gordon, 1999, 133). Let us consider this idea in a bit more detail.
Imagine a sender is indeed considering imposing economic sanctions on a state that is engaged in military aggression or human rights violations. According to utilitarianism, the sender would be permitted (indeed, required) to impose economic sanctions if the sanctions were expected to result in less harm overall than any other means of ending the aggression/human rights violations (travel bans, military intervention and so forth) or, indeed, “doing nothing” and letting the aggression/violations continue unchecked. Note that in making this utilitarian calculation, harms to sender citizens, target citizens and all other individuals affected are to be counted and weighed equally.
In order to determine whether economic sanctions are expected to result in the least harm in this case, we need to address two questions: (1) how harmful do we expect the economic sanctions to be? and (2) what is the probability they will succeed in ending the human rights abuses?
(1) It is fair to say that, in general, economic sanctions are less harmful and destructive in their effects than military attack but more harmful and destructive than diplomatic measures (such as travel bans or withdrawing staff from embassies). However, there will be exceptions. For example, a targeted military strike might result in a lot less harm than collective, comprehensive sanctions. It should not always be assumed that economic sanctions are less harmful than military action. Senders should also take care to consider the full range of economic sanctions available to them: targeted sanctions may cause much less harm than collective sanctions but be equally effective.
(2) We also need to consider whether the economic sanctions will be successful at ending the human rights abuses. It is important to take this into account. If economic sanctions do not work, then the target citizens continue to suffer the human rights abuses whilst also suffering the economic sanctions. It would have been better to not have imposed the sanctions at all. From a utilitarian point of view, it is wrong to impose economic sanctions if it is expected that they will fail or that they are very likely to fail. Since economic sanctions often have quite a low probability of success then, at least in the case of more harmful comprehensive sanctions, they will often be ruled out on utilitarian grounds. Of course, this would need to be considered on a case by case basis. Gordon finds the ineffectiveness of economic sanctions particularly troubling, and claims it is unlikely any particular episode of comprehensive sanctions would be justified on utilitarian grounds (Gordon, 1999, 137).
Finally, senders also need to remember that economic sanctions—especially those using an economic pressure mechanism—often take years to work. Military intervention might be a faster way of ending the human rights abuses and consequently be the action that results in the least harm overall. In such a case, utilitarianism would demand military intervention, not economic sanctions.
Conventionally, economic sanctions are conceptualised as being measures designed to change the objectionable/unlawful behaviour of targets (or perhaps to punish it). However, Noam Zohar, drawing on Jewish theological tradition, argues in favour of an alternative way of thinking about economic sanctions—that of economic sanctions as a method of ‘preserving clean hands’.
Under a ‘clean hands’ sanctioning policy, the objective of the economic sanctions is not to change a target’s behaviour or to punish it but rather to avoid complicity in that behaviour. Zohar argues, for example, that if one state sells weapons—or allows weapons to be sold by its citizens—to a second state where it knows or suspects those weapons will be used to commit human rights violations, then it facilitates those violations and is thus morally responsibility for them as an accomplice. Hence states have a duty to impose arms embargoes (a type of economic sanction) on targets that they suspect would use those arms to commit human rights violations. Furthermore, clean hands sanctions are not restricted to arms embargoes; Zohar argues that embargoes would be required on all goods which would facilitate wrongdoing. For example, he argues that there is a requirement to prevent oil exports to a state whose military is engaged in ethnic cleansing as oil would be necessary to fuel tanks, planes and so on. (Zohar, 1993). Zohar’s analysis is restricted to cases where a state is violating the human rights of its own citizens. However, it can easily be extended to cover cases where states are engaged in other types of wrongdoing, for example, pursuing aggressive war.
Zohar’s idea is interesting because to date the moral analysis of economic sanctions has almost exclusively assumed that economic sanctions are a prima facie wrong and that their use requires moral justification. However, under a clean hands conception of economic sanctions the imposition of sanctions is, by contrast, a moral duty—a duty derived from the duty not to be complicit in human rights violations. Employing the clean hands conception of economic sanctions thus shifts the burden of moral justification from those who would impose sanctions to those who would not. The clean hands conception therefore appears to be a valuable tool for those who would impose economic sanctions in response to international wrongdoing. However, attractive as it may be, there are some difficulties with Zohar’s view (some of which he acknowledges himself).
The first relates to Zohar’s conception of complicity in wrongdoing. For Zohar, mere suspicion that the goods in question will be used for activities that violate human rights is sufficient to deem the exporting state complicit in the violations. This view of complicity is controversial. Many would argue that an accomplice to a crime must intend—or at least know—that the goods they are supplying will be used to commit a crime. To designate a person an accomplice on the grounds of mere suspicion, they argue, would appear to make one responsible for the crimes of other people, people over whom one has no control. If it cannot be said that the exporting state is complicit in cases of suspicion, then it cannot be said that it has a duty to sanction in these cases (at least not on the grounds that sanctioning would avoid complicity in wrongdoing). This view of complicity would restrict Zohar’s clean hands argument to cases where the exporting state intends or knows the goods supplied will be used in human rights violations.
Second, there is the question of which goods can be said to facilitate human rights violations. It seems obvious that weapons directly facilitate all kinds of human rights violations. But what about other goods? What about food for example? Without food, no military (or any other organisation) can operate. Does this mean that in cases where a state is engaged in human rights violations, there is a duty to sanction food exports? The clean hands argument would seem to suggest there is. For many, however, this conclusion would be too extreme.
Another serious problem relates to the question of dual-use goods. These are goods which have both military and civilian uses. To borrow Zohar’s example, oil may be used to fuel a campaign of ethnic cleansing but it may also be used to heat homes in winter. In cases of multi-lateral sanctions, such as those imposed by the UN, a ban on oil exports could cause civilians to freeze to death (as—in theory at least—no state would sell them oil). Should the UN sanction oil to avoid complicity in ethnic cleansing or should it continue to allow the export of oil to avoid civilians freezing to death? Zohar tentatively suggests that in such cases there may be a duty to engage in a limited military action designed to ensure oil exports are used purely by civilians. This would allow the exporting states to avoid complicity in the ethnic cleansing without causing civilians to freeze to death. He suggests this role could be taken on by the United Nations.
The problem with this suggestion is twofold. First, the limited military action suggested may simply not be possible. The importing state may simply take the oil by force from the UN. Second, even if limited military action were possible, a positive argument would still be required for this course of action. The fact that it resolves the dilemma is not by itself a positive argument in favour given that other methods may also resolve the dilemma, for example, full scale military intervention, and so forth.
Economic sanctions raise serious moral questions that have largely been ignored by philosophers and political theorists. The existing literature on the ethics of economic sanctions, whilst important and illuminating, barely scratches the surface of the subject. Further research in this area is required. There is scope to consider the four frameworks outlined above in more detail and to critique their application and/or the conclusions reached under each of them. There is also scope to develop entirely new frameworks for the moral assessment of economic sanctions.
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