Feminist Ethics and Narrative Ethics
A narrative approach to ethics focuses on how stories that are told, written, or otherwise expressed by individuals and groups help to define and structure our moral universe. Specifically, narrative ethicists take the practices of storytelling, listening, and bearing empathetic, careful witness to these stories to be central to understanding and evaluating not just the unique circumstances of particular lives, but the wider moral contexts within which we all exist. In telling stories, they suggest, we both create and reveal who we think we are as moral agents and as persons; in granting these stories uptake—that is, in giving them epistemic credibility—we help to mold and sustain the moral identities of others, as well as our own. Thus, theorists engaged in narratively-based moral scholarship take stories to be foundational for how we view the world and our place in it, arguing that they are the means through which we can make ourselves morally intelligible to ourselves and to others. At their best, narrative methodologies offer non-ideal, epistemically rich approaches—that are not grounded in strict, juridical principles—to a number of philosophical discourses, including those central to questions of morality, identity, and social justice. At their most worrisome, they appear to be merely loosely-related notions about the constitutive roles of stories in moral theory and practice that do not easily lend themselves to rigorous moral justifications, epistemic explanations, or the guiding of action, raising concerns about the theoretical and practical soundness of the whole endeavor.
Table of Contents
- Feminist Ethics
- Narrative Theories and Methodologies
- Feminist Ethics and Narrative
- Some Criticisms of Narrative Approaches to Ethics
- References and Further Reading
Even as a relatively new set of moral discourses and practices, narrative ethics has made its presence known. Among the areas within philosophy in which the influence of narrative has been particularly influential are biomedical ethics and feminist ethics. While this entry will only minimally touch on the former, the focus on the latter requires some qualification: While the themes, concerns, and ideas that connect feminist ethics and narrative theory are philosophically significant, this is not to suggest that all (or even most) of feminist ethics employs narrative methodologies, or that all (or most) feminist ethicists are narrativists. In fact, in addressing the oppression of women and other disadvantaged individuals and groups, a number are focused on alternative, non-narrative methodologies (for example, multicultural feminists tend to focus on interconnected systems of oppression, which may or may not be grounded in oppressive narratives) while others (for example, certain liberal feminists who tend to focus on justice-related remedies) reject the personal turn altogether. Thus, the connection between narrative ethics and feminist ethics as explored here ought not be viewed as global or as necessary, but as one that exists whenever the focus on the particular, on stories, and on phenomenologies within feminist ethics intersects with the conception of narratives as normatively constituting our moral universe. Viewed in this light, their relationship is philosophically important in the sense of sharing an anti-totalizing, anti-hierarchical views of the practices of morality, as well as in the sense of emphasizing the necessity of greater inclusivity in moral discourses. Indeed, to view feminist ethics through the lens of narrative, or to conceive of narrative ethics as an approach to feminist value theory is not to exhaust the claims, significance, or methodologies of either one—it is simply to examine overlapping aspects of both, and how they have, and continue, to shape each other. This entry, then, will focus will be on the complicated relationship between feminist ethics and narrative ethics. And while narrative ethics does not always neatly intersect with some of the concerns of feminist theorists, the relationship between feminist ethics and narrative ethics is nevertheless a rather dynamic one, combining the social, political, epistemic, and other insights of feminist theory with the fluid methodologies of narrative. Moreover, although a number of feminist theorists have benefitted from, and contributed to, the various insights provided by narrative approaches to ethics, no single method or theory can definitively be called “narrative feminist ethics.”
Thus, this entry will not endeavor to reduce the relationship between feminist ethics and narrative ethics to a single approach, but instead, will address the ongoing discourses between narrative approaches to ethics and feminist ethics, focusing on four specific issues: (1). What are some of the central concerns of feminist ethicists? (2) What are narrative methodologies, and how do they pertain to ethics, and specifically, to feminist ethics? (3) How have the theorists engaged in feminist ethics turned to narrative, and which aspects of narrative seem to be most useful to their projects? (4) What are some general criticisms of narrative as an approach to ethics, broadly construed?
Although the main purpose of this entry is not an exploration of the many nuances of the approaches to feminist ethics or the work of feminist ethicists, it is important to note how feminist ethics differs from the more “traditional” ethical theories, and importantly, how this difference makes feminist ethics responsive to narrative approaches and methodologies. To a large extent, feminist ethical theory can be understood as both a response to, and a movement against, a historical tradition of more abstract, universalist, ethical theories such as utilitarianism, deontology, and in certain respects, contractarianism and virtue theory, which tend to view the moral agent either as an autonomous, rational actor, deliberating out of a calculus of utility or duty, or else as an often disembodied and decontextualized ideal decision-maker, unburdened by the non-ideal constraints of luck (moral and otherwise), circumstance, or capability (Nagel 1979; Brennan 1999; Nussbaum 2000). Specifically, feminist ethicists contend that this top-down, juridical, principlist theorizing has largely neglected the centrality of physical, social, and psychological situatedness, power differentials, and, importantly, the voices of women whose lived experiences have simply not been part of any ongoing moral debates (Young 2005; Jaggar 1992; Walker 1997; Lindemann Nelson 2001; Held 1990; Tessman 2005). As Alison Jaggar argues, traditional ethics emphasize male-centered issues of the public and the abstract while dismissing the private and the situated. As a result, women, and “women’s issues” that have to do with care, interdependent relationships, community, partiality, and the emotions, are de-centered, and relegated to the margins of serious intellectual (and specifically philosophical) inquiry (Tong and Williams 2014; Jaggar 1992). While there is a significant number of subgroups of feminists—traditionally, including care ethicists, Marxist feminist, liberal feminists, radical feminists, and ecofeminists, and lately, divided into a greater variety of feminisms, including analytic feminism, continental feminism, radical lesbian separatist feminism, pragmatist feminism, psychoanalytic feminism, and all the intersections among them—the intent of feminist theory has been, and remains, the elimination of group and individual oppressions, and especially the silencing oppression of women, both in philosophical discourse and in the wider world (Tuana 2011). As Brennan argued, “feminist ethical theories [are] those ethical theories which share two central aims: (a) to achieve a theoretical understanding of women’s oppression with the purpose of providing a route to ending women’s oppression and (b) to develop an account of morality which is based on women’s moral experience(s)” (Brennan 860, 1999, citing Jaggar 1991).
While this entry does not address the many varieties or the latest developments within feminist ethics, it is important to note its general, and persistent, commitment to for the rejection of, among other things, the sort of universalizable, uniform, acontextual “view from nowhere” that characterized much of ethical theory. As noted earlier, feminist ethics has generally pointed to the lack of serious philosophical attention to the aspects of human life where women (and other minorities) tend to predominate, thus leading to a deficit of inclusion of these actors who were subsequently made invisible to anthropocentric theory. In taking seriously, and including, the contexts, relationships, and commitments of women’s (and many marginal others’) experiences in its theorizing, feminist ethics does not deprive these individuals and groups of their moral agency. In this way, feminist ethics opens up the spaces of reasons within moral theory to marginalized others by, on the one hand, affirming the necessity of socially inclusive moral work, and on the other, by challenging the socially (and otherwise) excluding practices, boundaries, and limitations of its current discourses. Finally, although not strictly a part of this discussion, it is important to note that liberal feminism, and liberal feminists, like Susan Moller Okin, represent an important exception to the more particularist, subjective approaches to women’s freedom noted earlier, focusing instead on the need for women’s personal and political autonomy, promoted by the liberal state, that enable their flourishing as persons, and fighting for democratic self-determination denied to women by social and political patriarchies (Okin 1989).
What is mostly dismissed or neglected by traditional moral theorists is any engagement with non-ideal actors in non-ideal environments. Often, the default “autonomous moral agent” within moral philosophy is an otherwise unencumbered, abstract decision-maker, understood to be a man, coming to a decision that is not otherwise burdened by the messy contextuality of an actual lived life (Tong and Williams 2014; Jaggar 1992; Brennan 1999). The result was not only a simplification of what it might mean to be a situated agent in non-ideal circumstances, but also the wholesale absence of agents who were not male, not unencumbered, and certainly not abstract. In other words, those left out of the moral calculus—indeed, out of the philosophical moral imaginaries—were women, people of color, LGBTQ communities, economically underprivileged individuals, and many others. Because many of these non-standard agents are engaged with the world in ways not considered by those relying on abstract agent models in their ethical analyses, and because they are instead participants in the interdependent moral practices that define them in terms of their relationships with others, they are viewed by a great majority of traditional moral theorists as somehow beyond the scope of philosophical discourse (Held 1990; Tong 2009). Apart from neglecting the fact of men’s own situatedness and embeddedness in the particular circumstances of their lives, the exclusion of entire categories of individuals not only deprived these populations of a voice in philosophical debate, but also removed their experiences from the scope of possible normative discourse altogether. More specifically, the voices, and thus the moral experiences, of women and minorities were effectively silenced as reliable narrators of not only the moral significance of their experiences, but also of what moral theory and practice ought to take into account as its proper subject matter.
In addition to impoverishing and narrowing the idea of what moral theory is more generally, this kind of silencing has had uniquely burdensome costs for the silenced: As the feminist political theorist Iris Marion Young noted, those whose voices and whose presence have been historically missing from public discourses are severely challenged in receiving any kind of uptake of their view even once they attempt to engage (Young 1997; McAfee 2014). In the process of democratic deliberation, for example, those who are not habituated into participating in the overly formal, abstract, and juridical moral and sociopolitical discourses would be continuously marginalized, and, in the end, dismissed. What Young argued ought to be an alternative way of engaging those on the periphery is a kind of a “communicative democracy,” allowing for a number of different communicative styles (including narrative, rhetoric, and storytelling), perspectives, and voices (McAfee 2014).
Thus, understood very broadly, feminist ethics is a response to this epistemic, moral, and sociopolitical silencing born of exclusion, and to the oppression that it underwrites. As Samantha Brennan notes, “[f]eminist ethics seeks to overcome the limits of narrow, male-centered ethics by constructing moral theories which can make sense of the experiences of women as moral agents…feminist ethics has become associated with an ethics of lived, concrete experiences which takes most seriously women’s experiences of morality” (Brennan 1999, 861). Indeed, feminist ethicists, like Margaret Urban Walker, have argued against the impartial universality of “juridical,” or top-down, ethical methodologies that reduce moral reason to rigid, acontextual deductions, and favor more situated, “expressive-collaborative” approaches to morality that expand, rather than restrict, both the spaces of moral reasons as well as the variety of moral agents (Walker 1997).
What feminist philosophers accomplish, therefore, is the broadening and deepening of what it means to be engaged in moral philosophy by introducing the epistemically and morally rich stories of what it is like to be a non-ideal agent in a non-ideal world. It is this turn toward including, confronting, and challenging the oppressions of women (and other oppressed and often silenced populations), that serves as the beginning of the intersection between narrative and feminist ethics. And because like much of feminist moral theory, narrative approaches to ethics emphasize the contextuality, situatedness, and the shared nature of public and private life as central to moral reasoning, some leading feminist philosophers have offered a number of varying approaches to philosophical ethics that can all nevertheless be called “narrative” in significant ways.
Generally speaking, there is not a single theory of narrative ethics, nor is there a single correct way to engage in narrative analysis. However, there are a number of views and practices that have a family resemblance, and can be construed as a part of a larger, more amorphous field of narrative ethics. One such view about how narrative is to be understood as a part of moral theory is offered by Kathryn Montgomery Hunter. Hunter argues that “[i]n using the word ‘narrative’ somewhat interchangeably with ‘story’ I mean to designate a more or less coherent written, spoken, or (by extension) enacted account of occurrences, whether historical or fictional” (Hunter 1996, 306).
There are many ways to define, and engage in, a narrative approach to ethics. By a “narrative approach,” I mean a focus on the significance of context, situatedness, and, importantly, the communication of the stories people tell about themselves and others in trying to make themselves, others, and, more broadly, their world, mutually intelligible. Narrative ethicists often criticize what they consider to be a preoccupation with impartiality distance, and universalizability at the expense of personal relationships among more traditional juridical moral theories (Walker 1997; Lindemann Nelson 2001; Rimmon-Kenan 2002). What is missing, they suggest, is not merely the exclusion of so many from juridical moral discourses, but, importantly, the warrant for why moral actors would desire, and be motivated by, something like a good will (or a utilitarian-based outcome, or a rights-based justification) as a part of a meaningful life. Indeed, they argue, given the requirements of juridical moral thought, we are left wondering what there is to admire about such a life, why such a life is worth having, and why disinterested detachment from everything and everything one cares about – that is, detachment from all that makes the moral life not just worthwhile but possible – is the sole path to robust moral agency. Although duties and laws might very well be a part of moral work, the “ought” of morality cannot be grounded primarily in bare, unyielding principles.
In response, narrative approaches to moral theory and practice have been put forth by a number of philosophers (especially those engaged in normative ethics and applied ethics, such as medical ethics), literary scholars, and psychologists, including Alasdair MacIntyre, Charles Taylor, Paul Ricoeur, Paul John Eakin, Hilde Lindemann Nelson, Margaret Urban Walker, Martha Nussbaum, Kathryn Montgomery Hunter, and Jerome Bruner, among others. Indeed, the philosopher Marya Schechtman has argued that narratives are not only essential to understanding what we do, but, indeed, to who we are by suggesting that only those who “weave stories of their lives” are, strictly speaking, persons. This is so, she suggests, because one’s narrative is precisely what constitutes—or, as she argues, characterizes—one’s personal identity (Schechtman 1996). Generally, narrative theorists take the personal story, or the first-person narrative, to not only be descriptively informative, but also normatively vital to connecting a particular life with the rest of a moral community (or communities), making the story, and the storyteller, both intelligible and open to normative analysis. In other words, theorists who use a narrative approach to ethics take the process of telling and hearing the stories of our lives to be doing something morally significant. For example, feminist philosopher Hilde Lindemann offers the following summary of some possible roles of stories in moral reasoning:
Narrativists have claimed, among other things, that stories of one kind or another are required: (1) to teach us our duties, (2) to guide morally good action, (3) to motivate morally good action, (4) to justify action on moral grounds, (5) to cultivate our moral sensibilities, (6) to enhance our moral perception, (7) to make actions of persons morally intelligible, and (8) to reinvent ourselves as better persons (Nelson 2001, 36).
Thus, narratives can differ teleologically. They can also be judged to be good and bad, desirable and undesirable, truthful and false. Indeed, instead of providing the sort of insight into ourselves that might be constructive and action-guiding, they can encourage dishonesty, cowardice, or can serve to indulge our fantasies in generally unhealthy, or even destructive, ways. Narratives can be “master narratives” that tell us where and how we are socially situated with respect to our duties, claims, and expectations. One can also resist harmful master narratives through a counterstory, whose purpose it is to “root out the master narratives in the tissue of stories that constitute an oppressive identity and replace them with stories that depict the person as morally worthy” (Lindemann 2001, 150). Moreover, one can resist a master narrative through a humorous re-casting of that narrative – a king with no clothes (power), Victor/Victoria (sexuality), and so on – that serves to expose the “master narrative” as unreliable, or at least of doubtful validity. And, of course, the master narratives themselves can differ: while they can oppress, they can also inform, (re)align, and guide. Counterstories, too, can be destructive as well as reparative. What matters is acquiring the ability (and desire) to listen or read closely enough, with sufficient attention and discernment, to tell the difference (Lindemann 2001). Morality, in short, is not solely within the purview of a judge who possesses the necessary moral epistemology and pronounces on a given act as “warranted” or “unwarranted,” but is something that we do together: it is a socially embodied medium of understanding and adjustment in which people engage in practices of allotting, assuming, or deflecting responsibilities of various kinds (Walker 1997). These practices create a vocabulary and resources for moral deliberation that give us recognized and socially shared ways of deciding what is good or right to do.
Since narrative approaches to ethics are not a singular, monolithic whole, the understandings and practices of what it might mean to engage in moral analysis narratively does indeed vary. Narratives can be read, heard or viewed through the mediums of film, literature, or through the oral traditions of storytelling, thus expanding one’s emotional, social, and intellectual vocabulary and perception. In this way, we become not merely better informed about being otherwise, but better equipped in addressing morally complex and difficult situations in the real world (Lindemann 2001; Nussbaum 1990). These narrative techniques can be can be reified by substituting a “master” model of moral reasoning (say, the Enlightenment model of detached objectivity and rationality) with the kind of normativity that is action-guiding to a particular narrative community that wishes to find justification for, and thus make moral sense of, its way of life (Lindemann 2001; MacIntyre 1984). They can also serve as methods of clarification of confusing or contradictory moral reasoning when compared to each other. In trying to work through some particularly difficult moral dilemmas, narratives can help us to see where seemingly divergent viewpoints can possibly move closer together, when they cannot, and why, without resorting to ill-fated attempts to (re)order principles and (re)interpret laws. In short, a narrative approach to doing ethics takes its cues from the stories themselves, as they are told, heard, and (mis)understood, and although there are a number of approaches and methodologies, they tend to center around questions of who the teller is, what the teller might mean, who the intended (and unintended) audience might be, what is the effect of the story, and (perhaps less frequently) what constitutes a good story – and what might be meant, in this case, by “good.” Writing from a narrativist medical ethics perspective, Joan McCarthy suggests that some of the central tenets of narrative approaches to moral issues can be understood as the following:
- Every moral situation is unique and unrepeatable and its meaning cannot be fully captured by appealing to law like universal principles.
- …[A]ny decision or course of action is justified in terms of its fit with the individual life story or stories…
- The objective of the task of justification in 2 is not necessarily to unify moral beliefs and commitments, but is to open up dialogue, challenge received views and norms, and explore tensions between individual and shared meanings. (McCarthy 2003)
Thus, a narrativist account of moral problems, dilemmas, and general questions of moral judgment, takes seriously the multitudes of individual lives, and thus the multitudes of voices and interpretations of moral situations. What matters, then, is not so much a reduction of moral positions to a commonly-held single perspective, but an opening up of a space for reasons and dialogues with equally morally worthy others, thereby expanding the possibility of a shared, rather than a unitary and monolithic, moral universe.
One way to charitably interpret this narrative turn in ethics is to take seriously the proposition that stories simply provide the sort of flexibility of understanding and variability of perspective that deep and “thick” moral work requires. It makes possible a way to engage in moral negotiations by reminding the participants to take into account how they got to the present point, what the present circumstances are, as well what they ought to do in the future. At their best, narrative approaches to ethics welcome voices that, as Young noted, are differently situated, possessing quite radically divergent views of where they fit within the moral and sociopolitical discourses and debates. They remind us that different participants carry the burdens of different histories, epistemologies, and moralities. In the end, the narrative collaborative methodologies see stories as not merely ways to decide among competing principles, but as self-contained, and context-rich, reasons to revise moral understandings, to negotiate solutions, and to continue seeking the ever-elusive common ground (Walker 1997).
Given the narrative emphasis on multivocality, shared discourse, and the moral significance of individual voices, it is perhaps not entirely surprising that feminist philosophers have both employed and expanded the idea of narrative within feminist philosophy. For example, Margaret Urban Walker, in “Moral Particularity,” has argued that one of the characteristics that make an agent a distinctly moral one is her desire to define herself as the protagonist of a coherent narrative (Walker 2003). The “moral persona” that emerges out of such narrative coherence, she claims elsewhere, is defined by her commitments to individuals, institutions, and values. It is this desire to self-define as a protagonist of a largely coherent narrative that makes one as a moral agent (Walker 1989, 177). Walker later expanded her views to include the narrative notions of collaboration and negotiation into moral work. Perhaps as a way of challenging what she calls the “theoretical-juridical model” of ethics as exemplified by the more traditional top-down theories, her “expressive-collaborative” approach to morality turns on its head both the priorities and its presuppositions of what it means to be engaged in moral practice. As a priority, the expressive-collaborative approach tends to view the importance of moral work not as necessarily the juridical determination of “right” and wrong” based on a set of deduced unyielding norms or laws, but more as a way to negotiate and narrate our way in the complex and imperfect social, physical, and psychological realities of being human: The “expressive-collaborative model” encourages us to view “an investigation of morality as a socially embodied medium of mutual understanding and negotiation between people over their responsibility for things open to human care and response” (Walker 1997, 173). The distinction between this approach and the non-narrative juridical one is that while the latter emphasizes the uniformity of what is required, forbidden, or permitted in a given situation for all similarly-placed agents, the expressive-collaborative model prioritizes moral competence as strong moral self-definition, or, as Walker has argued, “the ability of morally developed persons to install and observe precedents for themselves which are both distinctive of them and binding upon them morally” (Walker 2003). In other words, her argument explicitly makes the point that the work of morality has to do with accountability and responsibility – and thus moral reliability, requiring a certain integrity in one’s relationships, sense of identity, and values. To be accountable is, to some extent, to be viewed as accountable by others, and this means that our actions have to tell a coherent story at least to the extent that they are reasonably predictable by those who are affected by them in the sorts of situations that matter morally. In the end, moral accountability is a narrative practice of making ourselves both internally and externally coherent, and in so becoming, weave ourselves into the fabric of a moral universe (Walker 1989).
Other feminist scholars have also turned to narrative as a way to engage with some of the central concerns within feminist ethical theory. In considering how personal identities structure our various moral discourses and concepts, Hilde Lindemann claims that these identities are “complex narrative constructions consisting of a fluid interaction of the many stories and fragments of stories surrounding the things that seem most important, from one’s own point of view and the point of view of others, about a person over time” (Nelson 2001, 20). She argues that not only are identities, and thus one’s moral standing in society, narratively constituted, she notes, but they can be narratively damaged by oppression and oppressive practices. Indeed, the moral damage of oppressive “master narratives”—destructive especially to those who are already socially subordinated and disempowered—must be counteracted with powerful counter-narratives that just might repair these broken identities, securing individual (and sometimes group) moral agency. The two kinds of moral damage that can impact the cohesion of one’s identity—one, depriving one of important social goods, and the other, of self-respect—can be repaired by, and through, counterstories, which narratively resist, challenge, and overcome the damaging master narratives that are so inflicted by the powerful on the vulnerable (Lindemann 2011). For example, women whose moral agency is compromised because they choose childlessness against a more general pronatalist narrative can offer stories of womanhood as personhood without essentializing the women-as-mother. As noted earlier, these counternarratives can take many forms, but their purpose remains consistent: to both expand normative spaces to include those previously excluded, and to admit, and in fact encourage, the use of narrative as a legitimate practice of engagement within the broader moral and sociopolitical discourses.
Of course, Walker and Lindemann are not the only feminist theorists to turn to narrative. Because feminist theorists are generally concerned with addressing various kinds of oppressions—and especially the oppression of women—they have often construed personal stories as fruitful ways of theorizing morally dilemmatic situations. These accounts serve a number of goals, including clarifying the harms of oppression, explaining the personal costs of cruel, myopic, or marginalizing moral reasoning, re-orienting the purely juridical and theoretical toward the non-ideal, and, among other things, motivating the development of moral thinking in ways that are inclusive of contextualities, situatedness, and burdened lives. Vivid, empathy-producing examples that tend to engage the moral imagination are often used by feminist scholars to focus on specific problems in order to show—and not to simply argue—that issues of sexism, oppression, gross power differentials, exclusion, and domination must be recognized and addressed both theoretically and practically. For example, Sandra Bartky, as a part of her analysis of objectification, offers a story of harassment, catcalls and whistles, noting that her previously unremarkable walk was now a source of identity-threatening humiliation and brutal, othering objectification (Bartky 1990; 1979). Moreover, Susan Brison, as a part of her examination of violence, identity, and the moral work of bearing witness, shares the very personal trauma of her brutal rape and assault. As Anita Superson notes, “Brison argues that the experience of rape should be of interest to philosophers because it raises many philosophical issues, including the metaphysical issue of the disintegration of the self, the epistemological issue of the victim's skepticism about everyone and everything, as well as the obvious legal, moral, and political issues relating to what it is like to be a victim of rape, why rape occurs and is so prevalent in our society, what its meaning is, and so on” (Superson 2009). Moreover, Susan Estrich employed her own story not just of rape, but of a right for her credibility as a reliable narrator of her experiences as a crime victim to police who did not take her claim to be a serious one (Superson 2009). Through this reliance on a personal narrative of trauma and victimization, she addresses not only the broader challenge of confronting the presuppositions and prejudice inherent in American rape law, but also makes a case, through her personal narrative, for alternative, less abstract and rigid constructions of the notions of force and consent.
Turning to a different aspect of narrative—namely, fiction—the philosopher Martha Nussbaum argues that the narrativity of literature provides a deep and necessary source of moral knowledge that not only more sharply attunes people to the various sources of morality, but also to themselves as sensing moral beings who enter into relationships of mutual responsibilities and obligations with each other (Nussbaum 1990). Finally, Seyla Benhabib has noted that narratives are not only the central constituting elements of a self, but that “[w]e are born into webs of interlocution or into webs of narrative-from the familial and gender narratives to the linguistic one to the macronarrative of one’s collective identity. We become who we are by learning to be a conversation partner in these narratives. Although we do not choose the webs in whose nets we are initially caught or select those with whom we wish to converse, our agency consists in our capacity to weave out of those narratives and fragments of narratives a life story that makes sense for us, as unique individual selves” (Benhabib 1999, 344).
Thus, the process of challenging, re-defining, and finally re-making moral theory and practice that is so central to the project of feminist ethics can, with the help of narrative methodologies, go far toward addressing women's oppressions, as well as the oppressions of numerous excluded others. By telling their stories—by grounding moral theorizing in personal narratives rather than in purely idealized contexts and agents—feminists scholars are not only able to motivate a deeper understanding of ethical dilemmas, but also advocate for practical changes in the structures of marginalizing social practices by creating a more inclusive space of reasons within which to negotiate our moral understandings.
Even though embraced by a not insignificant number of feminist ethicists, narrative approaches to ethics, whether feminist or otherwise, are not without their critics. While these criticisms are diverse and multifaceted, many of them converge on the worries about narrative’s lack of moral grounding, epistemic justification, and normative guidance. Some concerns stem from a reliance on context, perspective, and circumstances of specific stories, which, for some, drift too close to relativism. Others worry about the dependence on testimony and storytelling as a basis of moral theory. A number of theorists also wonder about the theoretical and practical value of a narrative, contextualized approach for moral theory, broadly construed. Finally, some claim that a narrative approach to understanding one’s place in the moral universe is not only misguided, but unnecessary and not reflective of what matters to us morally as human beings.
First, in addressing worries about relativism, the turn of feminist ethics toward narrative and experiential pluralism might re-make moral theory merely into an account of “historically specific moral practices and traditions” (Jaggar 1991, 93). Alison Jaggar further notes that while feminist ethics is “incompatible with any form of moral relativism that condones the subordination of women or the devaluation of their moral experience...[i]t is neutral, however, between the plural and local understanding of ethics, on the one hand, and then ideal of a universal morality, on the other” (Brennan 1999, 862, citing Jaggar 1991, 94). Thus it would seem that worry about the slide of feminist narrative-based theory into moral relativism is at least prima facie warranted: Ought feminist theorists relying on narratives focus on the local and the contextualized, rather than on the abstract and universalizing, if so doing offers an expansion of new “political agendas” (Shrage 1994) while at the same time leading practitioner to accept practices and narratives that might contribute to other kinds of oppressions (Brennan 1999)? Perhaps if identity-and-moral-community-defining stories are to have any kind of moral grounding that are both useful and reasonably defensible, then Susan Sherwin’s suggestion that it is the revisable and process-dependent “community standards” that might offer something beyond a fully relativistic and situational ethics is one way out of the worries about relativism (Brennan 1999; Sherwin 1992).
Second, Diana Tietjens Meyers, concerned about the reliability of testimony, suggests that narrative theory, instead of simply looking to storytelling as its sources of normativity, must prove its credibility as an account of morality by insisting on a particular skill set of the storyteller. She argues: “To ensure respect for the diversity of morally decent lives, narrativity theory must explicate the credibility of self-narratives in terms of this repertoire of skills. Self-narratives are not all equally valid, revealing, and conducive to flourishing, but there is no property internal to self-narratives nor any interpersonal test that can rank them. The best gauge of a self-narrative’s credibility, then, is the narrator’s overall degree of mastery of the self-discovery, self-definition, and self-direction skill repertoire and the extent to which the narrator made use of this competency in constructing a particular self-narrative” (Meyers 2004,303). Meyers claims that if narratives are simply taken at face value, we might be left with “all sorts of fictions—fairy tales, negative utopias, science fiction, romances, and horror stories—as well as autobiographical narratives” (Meyers 2004, 303). Simply because a story is good or interesting, Meyers notes, it does not guarantee that it will be anything but an exercise in wishful fiction or a flight of fancy. In order to properly address this possibility, one must acquire particular skills—introspection, volition, nurturing, communication, listening, and memory, among others—that allow one to recall relevant experiences, to imagine feasible options, and so on (Meyers 2004). Indeed, Meyers insists that “[t]o curb overactive imaginations, to overcome isolating silence, and to secure the credibility of self-narratives, the competency that keeps people attuned to themselves and alive to life’s possibilities must underwrite the processes of self-narrating” (Meyers 2004,303). Without this kind of rigorous self-discipline, a narrative approach to morality seems at best less than fully credible, and at worst, a methodologically compromised enterprise that confuses the interesting and the exciting with the epistemically important and the morally compelling.
Third, another kind of critique of narrative is offered by the philosopher and bioethicist Tom Tomlinson, focused on the worry about whether a narrative approach to ethics brings something distinct to moral theory that other, more traditional, approaches do not (Tomlinson 1997). Tomlinson argues that even though narrative might be methodologically important to the development of ethical reasoning, it does not offer “a mode of ethical justification that is independent from or superior to appeals to moral principles” (Tomlinson 1997, 132). On his view, narrative does not serve the sort of “central epistemic function in the discovery, justification, or application of ethical knowledge” that its supporters take it to be serving (Tomlinson 1997, 124). Instead, he argues that a focus on stories does not go far enough – or, indeed, any distance at all – toward enriching our moral epistemology. If narrative sets itself against the overstructured and sterile methodology of juridical thinking, then, Tomlinson claims, we ought to expect to find something morally valuable that is unavailable to us through principles alone. However, this does not seem to be the case: First, if one takes the kind of narrative approach that Martha Nussbaum has proposed—whereby engaging with certain kinds of literature allows for the development of a more nuanced, and empathetic, view of moral discourse (Nussbaum 1990)—and reads a novel in order to broaden one’s moral imagination, one is missing the actual encounter with a living person, and is thus epistemically and morally limited by the four corners of the text. Whatever moral “truth” is made available by the story, it seems limited situationally to the characters within that story, and does very little to speak to those who do not also share the world in which a particular moral lesson unfolds. And even if one were to set aside literary narrative and enter into a conversation with other people, the sort of particular knowledge one might derive through these interactions would not yield any moral knowledge that is generalizeable—that translates from one story, or from one storyteller, to another. At best, Tomlinson suggest, “novels and stories become…vivid illustrations of knowledge verified through other means” (Tomlinson 1997,125).
On Tomlinson’s account then, narrative does not appear to have much to contribute toward assisting the ethical discourse about aligning, or at least making less attenuated, the relationship between moral principles and lived experiences. Indeed, Tomlinson sees no clear way to distinguish how a uniquely narrative approach helps with addressing ethical dilemmas from other methodologies. For example, in a case where one is torn between disclosing or withholding potentially devastating news, a narrative theorist might require a consideration of how much truth to tell, how to tell it, how one will hear what is said, who is doing the speaking, and so on. However, Tomlinson suggests that aside from the vagueness of the narrative criteria itself, what it might mean to “interpret” this information is unclear: “Any social system of reasoned reflection involves a ‘communal dialogue’ of ‘give and take,’ including those deliberatively rooted in principles…The failure to provide any more precise account of the nature and role of ‘interpretation’ is a symptom of the tendency to wave it and ‘narrative’ as banners that fly over everything bright and beautiful being ignored by those crude and insensitive principles” (Tomlinson 1997, 127).
Moreover, Tomlinson rejects what he views as the tendency among proponents of narrative ethics to conflate the descriptive claim that one’s life is best understood as a narrative with the normative claim that one’s choices – and especially one’s moral choices – ought to be judged according to their coherence with a given life narrative. First, we do not, he claims, live a life that can be forced into coherence by a storyline – or by anything else: “we don’t live out a narrative, we create one by living a life” (Tomlinson 1997, 130). Second, even if we were to take seriously the narrative we create by “living a life,” “the [moral] question of how best to live out ‘that’ unity is not answered by the notion of narrative unity. It’s answered by appeal to extranarrative ideals that elevate some kinds of narrative over others” (Tomlinson 1997, 130). And since these ideals can be whatever one desires them to be, the resulting coherence loses any meaningful normative force. Unless one subscribes to one “extranarrative” ideal – or, indeed, to one principle – over another, the standard of narrative coherence seems to neither add anything to principlist analysis, nor offer an epistemically independent criteria of ethical reasoning, explanation, or justification.
While Tomlinson’s arguments focus on the claim that narratives do not offer any ethically or epistemically satisfying criteria that we could use in making moral choices, another kind of criticism, offered by John Arras, centers on the moral incompleteness of narrative as moral theory. Although he takes a somewhat more conciliatory, although still critical, view, his dissatisfaction with narrative as a method for doing ethics is grounded in his suspicion of narrative as a means of grounding moral justification—of finding the relationship “between the telling of a story and the establishment of a warrant for believing in the moral adequacy or excellence of a particular action, policy or character.” Having examined what he takes to be three different approaches to narrative—“as an essential element of any and all ethical analyses,” as an ahistorical rejection of the Enlightenment project, and as a postmodern attempt to substitute narrative “for the entire enterprise of moral justification”—he concludes that, while narrative seems to be an important part of ethical analysis, its ability to completely replace principles and ethical theory seems doubtful at best if what one seeks is moral justification for actions (Arras 1997, 79-85). Arras’s view, therefore, is that narrative seems to be merely supplementary to principles, and, in the end, is no threat to their moral primacy.
Finally, Galen Strawson, in “Against Narrativity,” argues that a narrative approach (to morality, to identity, and so on) is not only presumptively false from a folk-psychological, or common-sense perspective, but is also descriptively vague and normatively unmoored. He claims that not only does he not see himself or his life in narrative terms, but that he resents the idea of such a practice altogether. In response to the urging of (feminist and other) narrative theorists to engage in moral work through narrative, Strawson wonders, “Why on earth, in the midst of the beauty of being, it should be thought to be important to do this” (Strawson 2004, 436). Indeed, he noted there are deeply non-Narrative people and there are good ways to live that are deeply non-Narrative” (Eakin 2006, 180-187). Moral claims about oneself, about others, or about the world more broadly, Strawson insists, do not require the reliance on stories, or on how these stories relate to one’s present and future agency and shared moral understandings.
It can be said with some certainty that narrative approaches to ethics are not without considerable controversies and passionate critiques. It also seems clear that there are significant and challenging insights offered by narrative ethicists—a number of which have been theorized, defended, and expanded upon by feminist ethicists. Indeed, it seems that feminist ethics and narrative approaches to normativity do indeed share a number of concerns, goals, and motivations that offer powerful counterstories to the largely principlist, abstract, and universalizing practices of traditional moral theory. But shared worries and a desire for a more multivocal and collaborative moral discourse do not presuppose, nor require, the same methodologies, and there are some clear and powerful points of disagreement both within feminist philosophy about the role of narrative in ethical theory, as well as among narrativists themselves about what kinds of narratives ought to count as properly normative and adequately action-guiding. Because there is not a single approach to feminist ethics, and certainly no single way of engaging in narrative analysis, it is quite difficult to make any tidy generalizations, either about the theories themselves, or about their complicated relationship. Yet perhaps this is exactly the point: theorizing that tends to move away from such generalization in its own methodologies unsurprisingly escapes any attempts at totalizing definitions, in the process changing and restructuring the spaces and scope of moral discourse.
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