James Frederick Ferrier (1808—1864)

James Frederick Ferrier was a mid-nineteenth-century Scottish metaphysician who developed the first post-Hegelian system of idealism in Britain. Unlike the British Idealists in the latter half of the nineteenth century, he was neither a Kantian nor a Hegelian. Instead, he largely develops his idealist metaphysics via his defense of Berkeley and through his rejection of Thomas Reid’s philosophy of common sense. In this way, he is a transitional figure between the philosophy of Enlightenment Scotland and the development of British Idealism in the latter half of the nineteenth century. Ferrier was also the first philosopher in English to refer to the philosophy of knowledge as Epistemology.

The most fully realized version of his metaphysics appears in his Institutes of Metaphysic. For Ferrier, epistemology is primary and must be the starting point for philosophy. His metaphysics depends on the axiom that the minimum unit of cognition involves a synthesis of subject-with-object, which is the absolute in cognition. From here he develops an idealist ontology, which concludes that which really exists is the absolute: some self in union with some object. The central features of his philosophy include the importance of self-consciousness, a rejection of noumena or things-in-themselves, and his theory of ignorance.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Thought and Writings
    1. Self-consciousness
    2. Reappraisal of Berkeley
    3. Critique of Reid
    4. Idealist Metaphysics
  3. Reception and Influence
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life and Works

Ferrier was born in Edinburgh, Scotland, in 1808. His father, John Ferrier, was a lawyer known as a Writer to the Signet, and his mother was Margaret Wilson. His family was well connected; his uncle, John Wilson (also known as “Christopher North”), was an author and the Professor of Moral Philosophy at Edinburgh University, and his aunt was the novelist Susan Ferrier. Notable figures such as Sir Walter Scott, James Hogg, William Wordsworth, and Thomas De Quincey were acquainted with Ferrier and his family. He began his education in Ruthwell, Dumfriesshire, where he lived with the family of a Rev. Dr. Duncan. He then went to Edinburgh High School, followed by a period at another school in Greenwich. At the age of seventeen, he attended Edinburgh University for two academic sessions from 1825 to 1827. And, then in 1828 he moved to Oxford to study at Magdalen College for his B.A., which he received in 1831. His student life was unexceptional, and he did not show a particular aptitude for philosophy until later in his life.

He returned to Edinburgh after graduation and began a short-lived career in law. It was at this time that he developed his interest in philosophy. In the early 1830s he became friends with the philosopher Sir William Hamilton, and they remained in close contact until Hamilton’s death in 1856. Indicative of his growing interest in German thought, Ferrier traveled to Germany in 1834 where he spent several months in Heidelberg; his awareness of the German Idealists is apparent from the fact that he returned to Scotland with a photograph and a medallion of Hegel. In 1837 he married his cousin Margaret Wilson who was the daughter of his famous uncle “Christopher North.” By all accounts, they had a happy marriage and went on to have five children.

In the late 1830s, Ferrier started to publish articles in philosophy, and this led to his subsequent academic career. In 1842 he gained his first academic chair, becoming the Professor of Civil History at Edinburgh. In 1844-1845 he acted as Hamilton’s substitute in the Chair of Logic and Metaphysics at Edinburgh during the older philosopher’s illness. Then, in 1845, Ferrier moved his family to St. Andrews where he became the Professor of Moral Philosophy and Political Economy. He unsuccessfully attempted to get two Edinburgh Chairs: Moral Philosophy in 1852 and Logic and Metaphysics in 1856. He was unsuccessful in the first case due to sectarian politics and in the latter instance because his metaphysics were considered to be too far from the Scottish philosophy of his predecessors. For this reason, he remained at St Andrews for the remainder of his career. He died in St Andrews in 1863, and he is buried in St Cuthbert’s Churchyard, which is in the city center of Edinburgh.

Ferrier published several articles on literature and philosophy during his lifetime, and many of these were published in Blackwood’s Magazine. Among his articles, there are a few that are particularly indicative of his philosophical interests and eloquent writing style. These are his seven-part series “An Introduction to a Philosophy of Consciousness” (1838-1839), “Berkeley and Idealism” (1842), and “Reid and the Philosophy of Common Sense” (1847). A selection of his collected works appears in three volumes (originally published by Blackwood and Sons in 1875 and republished by Thoemmes Press in 2001). The first volume contains his most significant work, the Institutes of Metaphysic, which was originally published in 1854; here, Ferrier presents a complete system of metaphysics. The contemporary reaction to this was mixed, and Ferrier believed that certain critics, in an attempt to stifle his self-designated “new Scottish philosophy” in favor of the more traditional, or “old Scottish philosophy,” of his predecessors, deliberately misinterpreted his Institutes. Therefore, he subsequently wrote a scathing defense of the Institutes called Scottish Philosophy: The Old and the New (1856) in which he reiterates his arguments in favor of idealism and attacks his critics. A selection from Scottish Philosophy appears as “Appendix” to “Institutes of Metaphysic” in the first volume of his complete works. The second volume contains his lectures on Greek Philosophy, which he worked on in the later years of his life and was published posthumously. The final volume consists of a selection of his articles.

2. Thought and Writings

a. Self-consciousness

A topic that Ferrier concentrates on throughout his philosophical works is self-consciousness, which he generally refers to as “consciousness.” It is: “that notion of self, and that self-reference, which in man generally, though by no means invariably, accompanies his sensations, passions, emotions, play of reason, or states of mind whatsoever” (Ferrier 2001: vol. 3. 40). His focus on self-consciousness is central to his rejection of the Enlightenment goal to develop a “science of human nature.” Further, it forms the basis of his idealism.

He places upmost importance on self-consciousness because he believes that it is the peculiar and defining characteristic of humanity. He contends that things such as sensation and the capacity for reason are not only shared with other animals but they are given by nature; the human being who is subject to them is akin to “a spoke in an unresting wheel. Nothing connected with him is really his. His actions are not his own” (Ferrier 2001: vol. 3. 36). By contrast, consciousness is the act of will through which a thing becomes a person. One is not born conscious, it must be asserted: “The notion of self … is absolutely genetic or creative. Thinking oneself ‘I’ makes oneself ‘I,’ and it is only by thinking himself ‘I’ that a man can make himself ‘I’; or, in other words, change an unconscious thing into that which is now a conscious self” (Ferrier 2001: vol. 3. 109). Prior to consciousness there is no self or personality; without it the human being is a creature of nature that lives for others. Yet, post-consciousness a person’s acts are her own. It follows that consciousness is the precondition for everything that involves a self. In this way, consciousness is required for freedom, responsibility, morality, religion, and conscience.

Moreover, Ferrier explains in “An Introduction to a Philosophy of Consciousness” that a person’s knowledge of the external world depends on an act of negation in which she distinguishes between the self and the not-self. Thus, one becomes aware of the not-self in conjunction with the self. He describes this principle of idealism as “the fundamental act of humanity” (Ferrier 2001: vol. 3. 177). The concomitance of self and other forms the basis of his metaphysics, and it is a topic that he returns to throughout his published works.

In “An Introduction to a Philosophy of Consciousness” he sets out his concerns with contemporary philosophy and calls for a change of focus. His primary target is the Enlightenment goal to develop a “science of human nature.” In his view, this project is impossible because humanity is essentially different from anything else in the world that can be studied. For instance, in astronomy there is a distinction between the subject and the object; the scientist (the subject) is removed from the celestial objects (the objects) that she studies. Yet, in a “science of human nature” the philosopher is at once both the subject and the object. Now, given that self-consciousness is the defining feature of humanity and thereby central to any account of humanity, a problem arises. If the mind is an object of research, the object is deprived of its characteristic feature, namely self-consciousness, which remains with the subject of the research, leaving nothing but “a wretched association machine” (Ferrier 2001: vol. 3. 195). But, if the mind is considered with self-consciousness, then it cannot be properly considered an object of research because the objectivity is lost in so far as the subject and the object are identical. This leads Ferrier to suggest a change of focus for philosophy; instead of the empirical endeavor of a “science of human nature,” he prefers a more metaphysical approach, which is the development of a “philosophy of consciousness.”

In suggesting a “philosophy of consciousness,” Ferrier conceives philosophy as an extension of what people already do. Philosophy and self-consciousness are different only in degree and not in kind. Philosophy is a systematic and elevated self-consciousness, whereas self-consciousness is unsystematic and informal philosophy. He describes it as follows: “Consciousness is philosophy nascent; philosophy is consciousness in full bloom and blow … thus all conscious men are to a certain extent philosophers, although they may not know it” (Ferrier 2001: vol. 3. 197).

b. Reappraisal of Berkeley

Later in the nineteenth century, the British Idealists such as T. H. Green, F. H. Bradley, and Edward Caird were influenced by Kant and the German Idealists. Ferrier was aware of the German philosophers, but his own idealism does not appear to be directly influenced by them. Nonetheless, he was the first Scottish philosopher to seriously consider them. Thomas de Quincey said that: “he was introduced, as if suddenly stepping into an inheritance, to a German Philosophy refracted through an alien Scottish medium” (The Testimonials of J.F. Ferrier 1852, p.22). His friend and mentor, Hamilton, attempted to synthesize the commonsense philosophy deriving from Reid with the transcendental realism of Kant. Ferrier separates himself from Kant (and by extension also from Hamilton) by rejecting the existence of noumena or thing-in-themselves in the absence of percipient beings. He considers the German Idealists in a more favorable light, and he wrote biographical entries on both Schelling and Hegel for the Imperial Dictionary of Philosophy (see Ferrier 2001: vol. 3. 545-568). He also makes the occasional reference to Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel in his published works; in general, he views them positively, while depicting Hegel as an opaque genius. For instance, he says:@

whatever truth there may be in Hegel, it is certain that his meaning cannot be wrung from him by any amount of mere reading, any more than the whisky which is in bread … can be extracted by squeezing a loaf into a tumbler. He requires to be distilled, as all philosophers do, more or less—but Hegel to an extent which is unparalleled. A much less intellectual effort would be required to find out the truth for oneself than to understand his exposition of it. (Ferrier 2001: vol. 1. 96)

Yet, the most important idealist influence for Ferrier was the Irish philosopher Berkeley: “we are disposed to regard [Berkeley] as the greatest metaphysician of his own county (we do not mean Ireland; but England, Scotland, and Ireland) at the very least” (Ferrier 2001: vol. 3. 458). Indeed, Ferrier, along with his contemporary Alexander Campbell Fraser, can be credited with reviving Berkeley’s philosophy in the nineteenth century. Ferrier refers to Berkeley on numerous occasions throughout his published works, and in “Berkeley and Idealism” he provides an argument for idealism that is developed out of his reaction to Berkeley. First, he defends Berkeley from the accusation that he denies the existence of the external world. Second, he expands on an idealist conception of non-existence, which is something that he believes that Berkeley has overlooked.

Berkeley shared Locke’s belief that ideas are the immediate objects of the mind. However, he rejected Locke’s view that ideas represent real things, and that real things are the indirect objects of the mind. Berkeley argued that ideas are the real things and that there is nothing beyond them. Thus, for Berkeley, the mind directly knows reality. His conclusion that ideas are real things led many to conclude that Berkeley denied the existence of material objects (for instance, see Leibniz, Samuel Johnson, and Reid). Yet, Ferrier strongly rejects the widespread belief that Berkeley denies the existence of matter. He argues that Berkeley readily accepts the existence of matter in the ordinary understanding of such; the external world consists of solid extended bodies that are perceived by the senses. However, he allows that Berkeley denies the existence of the world in itself, a world beyond perceivers. Ferrier emphasizes that what Berkeley wants to show is that reality is as it appears to perceivers; it is the immediate object of perceptions. He denies the existence of intermediate entities between the perceiver and reality and instead argues that that which is perceived is that which exists. In connection with this, Ferrier supports another aspect of Berkeley’s epistemology, specifically, his contention that primary and secondary qualities are akin in so far as each depends on perceivers and provide information about reality. Neither primary nor secondary qualities denote anything more objective about reality; reality is that which is perceived and both primary and secondary qualities are perceived.

Berkeley considered his own philosophy to be in line with common sense and Ferrier agrees. According to Ferrier, it is Berkeley rather than Reid who is “the champion of common sense” (Ferrier 2001: vol. 3. 301). Berkeley’s idealism places the mind in direct contact with reality; there are no intermediate entities. And, this, Ferrier suggests, is in line with the experience of ordinary people who do not distinguish between the perceptions of objects and the objects themselves. It is the notion of thing-in-themselves, or of a world that exists independently of perceivers that is at odds with common sense. Berkeley’s idealism, by contrast, is in accordance with common sense.

On the one hand, Ferrier describes Berkeley as “the champion of common sense.” On the other hand, he says that the significance of Berkeley’s philosophy is that he provides the basis for absolute idealism. He says:

[Berkeley] was the first to stamp the indelible impress of his powerful understanding on those principles of our nature, which, since his time, have brightened into imperishable truths in the light of genuine speculation. His genius was the first to swell the current of that mighty stream of tendency towards which all modern meditation flows, the great gulf-stream of Absolute Idealism. (Ferrier 2001: vol. 3. 293)

For Ferrier, common sense and absolute idealism are complementary. According to Ferrier, when “genuine idealism” is “instructed by the unadulterated dictates of common sense” it is indistinguishable from “genuine unperverted realism” (Ferrier 2001: vol. 3. 309).

His admiration for Berkeley is clear and he says: “Among all philosophers, ancient or modern, we are acquainted with none who presents fewer vulnerable points than Bishop Berkeley” (Ferrier 2001: vol. 3. 291). Nevertheless, he acknowledges that there is a weakness in Berkeley’s philosophy, namely, his failure to address non-existence. Something that is levied against idealism is the suggestion that it contains the implication that things flit in and out of existence; for example, the tree exists only in so far as it is perceived, and when it is not perceived, it cannot exist. Ferrier recognizes that Berkeley’s account seems to suggest that the world exists only in so far as it is perceived. He believes that this makes him vulnerable to accusations of subjective idealism. To overcome this, Ferrier broadens Berkeley’s account to include non-existence.

There are two parts to his discussion of non-existence. First, he reiterates the Berkeleian argument that mind-independent objects cannot exist because it is impossible to conceive of them. He says that if a philosopher speaks of the world-as-it-is-in-itself (for instance, the world existing prior to and following the existence of percipient beings), they are obliged to posit an ideal percipient. For example, in order to think of the River Nile existing in a world where there are no percipient beings, one must think about it in terms of its perceivable qualities: size, color, boundaries and so forth. But, in thinking of such things, one is still thinking of the act of perception and not the thing-in-itself. Here, Ferrier returns to “the fundamental act of humanity.” He emphasizes that that which is perceived is inseparable from the act of perception; it is impossible to consider what is seen in isolation from the act of seeing, what is heard in isolation from the act of hearing, and so on.

Second, Ferrier asserts that this argument must be extended to included non-existence as well. Not only is the existence of the world inconceivable without a real or ideal perceiver, but also non-existence similarly requires such a perceiver. In order to conceive nothing, that is silence, colorlessness, tastelessness, and so forth, the philosopher must refer to her perceptual framework. He develops Berkeley’s view that existence is percipi by insisting that non-existence is also percipi. Using Kantian language, he argues that “no phenomena, not even … the phenomenon of the absence of phenomena, are thus independent or irrespective” (Ferrier 2001: vol. 3. 315). Ferrier contends that it is not only matter that depends upon perceivers but also the non-existence of matter. He says:

[U]niversal colourlessness, universal silence, universal impalpability, universal tastelessness, and so forth, are just as much phenomena requiring, in thought, the presence of an ideal percipient endowed with sight and hearing and taste and touch, as their more positive opposites were phenomena requiring such a percipient. (Ferrier 2001: vol. 3. 311)

In this way, non-existence is just as much a known concept as existence. In order to conceive of either the existence or the non-existence of the world, a percipient being, whether real or ideal, is required. By supplementing Berkeley’s theory in this manner, he believes it becomes invulnerable to accusations of subjective idealism; one cannot say that the world will cease to exist in the absence of percipient beings because percipient beings are required to conceive of the world ceasing to exist.

c. Critique of Reid

Although he died more than a decade before Ferrier was born, Thomas Reid’s influence on Scottish philosophy remained strong during Ferrier’s youth and career. Hamilton is famous for his annotated edition of Reid’s works, and while Ferrier professes admiration for Hamilton’s scholarship, he wholeheartedly rejects the focus of his intellect. In Ferrier’s view, Reid produced a form of realism that not only failed to overcome the representative theory of perception but also resulted in its own form of representationism. Additionally, for Ferrier, Reid’s commonsense philosophy is inadequate and anti-philosophical. Instead, he calls for a new Scottish philosophy that is more systematic and rational; that is, an idealist metaphysics.

Reid was a Berkeleyan in his youth, but Hume’s skepticism led him to reassess his philosophical assumptions, which, in turn, led him to reject the theory of ideas. A version of the theory of ideas can be found in a range of philosophers from Descartes to Hume. In general, this theory posits that ideas are the immediate objects of one’s mind. This epistemological belief allows for a variety of metaphysical positions, including: Locke’s realism, Berkeley’s idealism, and Hume’s skepticism. Reid recognized that Hume’s astute reasoning was the logical development of the theory of ideas. At the same time, he could not accept Hume’s conclusions that we must be skeptical about things such as the continued existence of objects or the continuation of one’s personal identity. Thus, Reid examined the foundations of this theory: the existence of ideas. He realized that he had no experience of ideas and concluded that they are philosophical constructs, which are at odds with common sense. According to Reid, all persons share a priori commonsense principles upon which all reasoning depends. For instance, the belief in the existence of the external world, the principle of causality, and the belief that one is the same person she was yesterday and will be tomorrow, all count among Reid’s principles of common sense. The aspect of Reid’s theory that is most important for Ferrier is his philosophy of perception. Reid holds that we perceive objects directly and not via intermediate entities such as ideas. In his view, all persons have a commonsense belief in the existence of the external world that is irresistible and prior to reasoning. In this way, Reid was said to remove representationism from the theory of perception; the objects of knowledge are the things themselves rather than representative intermediaries such as ideas. Ferrier, however, argues that Reid failed to disprove representationism and that Reid’s theory of perception retains a form of representationism.

A discussion of the perception of matter is central to Ferrier’s philosophical writings, and it is this issue that he believes demonstrates the central difference between Berkeley and the commonsense school. One of his main talking points is representationism. On this topic, he dismissively says that “Berkeley thus accomplished the very task which, fifty or sixty years afterwards, Reid laboured at in vain” (Ferrier 2001: vol. 1. 490). Ferrier believes that Reid and others have misunderstood Berkeley by mistaking him for a representationist. Yet, Ferrier believes that idealism—both his own and Berkeley’s—is the only type of philosophy that can overcome representationism. He criticizes Reid’s theory of perception throughout his published works, and his argument against him is best expressed in his article “Reid and the Philosophy of Common Sense.” Here, he refutes Reid’s realist account of perception and develops his own idealist theory.

Ferrier divides philosophical accounts of perception into two schools: the metaphysical school and the psychological school. His idealist metaphysics is an example of the former and Reid’s commonsense philosophy is an example of the latter. Both schools accept that the perception of matter occurs, yet, they disagree about what this entails. Ferrier considers “the perception of matter” to be a whole, indivisible unit:

In the estimation of metaphysic, the perception of matter is the absolutely elementary in cognition, the ne plus ultra of thought. Reason cannot get beyond, or behind it. It has no pedigree. It admits of no analysis. It is not a relation constituted by the coalescence of an objective and a subjective element. It is not a state or a modification of the human mind. It is not an effect which can be distinguished from its cause. It is not brought about by the presence of antecedent realities. It is positively the FIRST, with no forerunner. The perception-of-matter is one mental word, of which the verbal words are mere syllables. (Ferrier 2001: vol. 3. 410, 411)

On the other hand, there is the psychological school’s approach to the perception of matter, which considers the relation between two component parts: the subjective perception and the objective matter. And, in Ferrier’s view, this approach leads to representationism.

Representationists make a distinction between an immediate and a remote object of the mind. For instance, Locke argues that we know things in the world via our ideas; things are the indirect objects of our minds, whereas ideas are the immediate object of our minds. What Ferrier believes is that Reid and other “psychologists” similarly set up a remote and an immediate object of the mind in their accounts of perception. He argues that the psychological school holds that there is the material world which exists regardless of whether it is perceived or not and that there are percipient beings who know the material world via their perceptions of it. It follows that in this account of the perception of matter there is both an objective aspect (the external world) and a subjective aspect (the subject’s perception of that world). He observes that this creates both an immediate and a remote object of knowledge; the subject knows her perception of the world immediately, whereas she knows the world remotely and only via her perception of it. He says:@

When a philosopher divides, or imagines that he divides, the perception of matter into two things, perception and matter; holding the former to be a state of his own mind, and the latter to be no such state; he does, in that analysis, and without saying one other word, avow himself to be a thoroughgoing representationist. For his analysis declares that, in perception, the mind has an immediate or proximate, and a mediate or remote object. Its perception of matter is the proximate object, the object of its consciousness; matter itself, the material existence, is the remote object—the object of its belief. (Ferrier 2001: vol. 3. 415)

Therefore, Ferrier suggests that in avoiding representationism, Reid and others are paradoxically guilty of the very thing that they are attempting to dispel. In order to truly avoid representationism Ferrier insists on an idealist account of perception. Again he returns to “the fundamental act of humanity.” In his view, the “perception of matter” is a composite that cannot be broken down into its constituent parts; subjects and objects are always presented at once and can never be separated.

While Ferrier’s critique of Reid’s analysis if the perception of matter is astute, at other times, he makes derogatory remarks about his predecessor in an ad hominem manner. For instance, he says that when Reid is considered alongside philosophers such as Berkeley or Hume, he is akin to a “whale in a field of clover” (Ferrier 2001: vol. 1. 495). Remarks such as these have more to do with the dominance of commonsense philosophy during his lifetime and the ways in which it hampered his own career than with a thoughtful analysis of Reid’s ideas. Yet, despite his dismissal of Reid and the philosophy of common sense, Ferrier, nevertheless, wants to retain the language of “common sense.” Indeed, he believes that his own idealism is an example of an enlightened system of common sense.

d. Idealist Metaphysics

One of Ferrier’s criticisms with the philosophy of common sense is that he believes it formalizes the inadequacies of ordinary thinking.

Common sense … is the problem of philosophy, and is plainly not to be solved by being set aside, but just as little is it to be solved by being taken for granted, or in other words, by being allowed to remain in the primary forms in which it is presented to our notice. (Ferrier 2001: vol. 3. 64)

By contrast, he thinks that philosophy should fulfill a corrective purpose; he says: “philosophy exists only to correct the inadvertencies of man’s ordinary thinking” (Ferrier 2001: vol. 1. 32). A rational consideration of the laws of thought is required to separate unrefined opinions from the “genuine principles of common sense.” This is exactly what he tries to achieve in his major work the Institutes of Metaphysic; here, he attempts to systematically reveal the laws of thought via reason.

The Institutes is arranged into three main books, which follow on from one another: the Epistemology, the Agnoiology or theory of ignorance, and finally the Ontology. Together, they comprise his idealist metaphysics. Unusually, for a philosophical work, the Institutes is written in a deductive style. Ferrier’s metaphysics are deduced from an axiomatic, self-evident principle. In the introduction to his Institutes he asserts that: “From this single proposition the whole system is deduced in a series of demonstrations, each of which professes to be as strict as any demonstration in Euclid, while the whole of them taken together constitute one great demonstration” (Ferrier 2001: vol. 1. 30). His “Epistemology” consists of twenty-two propositions, the “Agnoiology” has eight propositions, and he concludes with the eleven propositions that form his “Ontology.” Each proposition involves a demonstration and a subsequent discussion in which he posits a counter-proposition that he disproves.

While Ferrier’s own philosophy is largely unknown to contemporary epistemologists, it is noteworthy that he was the first philosopher in English to call the philosophy of knowledge “epistemology.” His own epistemology is central to his philosophy as is evident from the fact that it forms the largest part of his metaphysics. It is also the common focus that appears in all of his published works. In his 1841 article “The Crisis of Modern Speculation,” he says: “Before we can be entitled to speak of what is, we must ascertain what we can think” (Ferrier 2001: vol. 3. 272). And, this is a principle that he follows in the Institutes by grounding his metaphysics in his epistemology. For Ferrier, it is important to secure of the laws of thought before making any positive statements about reality. Thus, “Proposition I” or “the primary law or condition of all knowledge” is the axiom from which the rest of Ferrier’s system follows. It asserts that: “Along with whatever any intelligence knows, it must, as the ground or condition of knowledge, have some cognisance of itself” (Ferrier 2001: vol. 1. 79).

The first proposition asserts that self-consciousness is the necessary concomitant of all knowledge; in knowing anything (for example, “that Tuesday follows Monday,” or “that one is reading Ferrier’s metaphysics”), at the same time, a person knows herself. In this way, Ferrier’s Institutes are the natural development of his work on consciousness; self-consciousness, as the peculiar feature of humanity, shapes his entire metaphysics. From this starting point, the main deductive conclusion that follows is that the minimum unit of cognition requires some self in union with some object. This forms Ferrier’s conception of the absolute; for Ferrier, a synthesis of subject-with-object is the absolute in knowledge.

If that which can be known must be a synthesis of subject-with-object, then, this is a union, which cannot be broken down into its constituent parts. As such, there can be no mere objects or matter per se. He says:

Everything which I, or any intelligence, can apprehend, is steeped primordially in me … Whether the object be what we call a thing or what we call a thought, it is equally impossible for any effort of thinking to grasp it as an intelligible thing or as an intelligible thought, when placed out of all connection with the ego. This is a necessary truth of all reason—an inviolable law of all knowledge. (Ferrier 2001: vol. 1. 120)

Hence, in perception, there can be no objects as they are, independent of knowers (typically known as things-in-themselves or noumena). For Ferrier, things-in-themselves are not objects of knowledge; they are unthinkable and as such they are the contradictory and unknowable by any mind, including by a supreme knower. In rejecting things-in-themselves, he has in mind Reid but also Hamilton and Kant as well as any philosophers who hold that there is a noumenal world. In his idealist epistemology, the notion of a thing-in-itself contradicts the laws of thought; one cannot conceive of a thing-in-itself because the synthesis of subject-with-object is the minimum unit of cognition, which cannot be broken down. Similarly, subjects-in-themselves are unknowable by all minds, including that of a supreme knower. In this way, the ego or self in itself is unknowable. While the self is the constant concomitant of all knowledge, there must also be an object that it is conjoined with. Ferrier calls the self the universal in all knowledge and the object is the particular in all knowledge.

Once he has established what can be known, he wants to reveal what cannot be known. Thus, in his Agnoiology he considers what, if anything, is a possible object of ignorance. This is one of the most unique and interesting features of Ferrier’s philosophy because the philosophy of ignorance has been given limited attention in the history of philosophy. His definition of ignorance is: not knowing that which could be known. In his view, ignorance involves a deficit or a privation of knowledge; it is a failure by the knower, to know something that could be known. In some cases, this might be a result of one’s limited constitution; for instance, a finite knower has more limited abilities for cognition than a supreme knower and there are some things that a finite knower could never know but are nevertheless the object of knowledge for some knower. In other cases, this might be a failure of will or effort; for instance, one might not know the time of day at a given moment, although that is something that could be rectified. By contrast, there are things that could never be known by any knower, including a supreme knower. This is what Ferrier designates the contradictory. For instance, no one, including a supreme knower, could know that 2 + 2 = 5 because this violates the laws of reason. For Ferrier, not knowing the contradictory is not ignorance but rather evidence of the strength of reason. Thus, “Proposition III” of his “Agnoiology” or “the law of all ignorance” asserts that: “We can only be ignorant of what can possibly be known; in other words, there can be an ignorance only of that of which there can be a knowledge” (Ferrier 2001: vol. 1. 412).

Given that in his “Epistemology” he has already concluded that the object of knowledge must be a synthesis of subject-with-object, the central conclusion of the “Agnoiology” is that that which we are ignorant of is a synthesis of subject-with-object, or in other words, the absolute in cognition. That which is the object of knowledge is some synthesis of subject-with-object. That which is the object of ignorance is some synthesis of subject-with-object. Thus, the possible objects of knowledge and ignorance are one and the same: the absolute in cognition. It follows that matter per se and the ego per se are neither the objects of knowledge nor ignorance. He returns to his contention that his idealism is in line with common sense when he says:

Novel, and somewhat startling, as this doctrine may seem, it will be found, on reflection, to be the only one that is consistent with the dictates of an enlightened common sense … If we are ignorant at all (and who will question our ignorance?) we must be ignorant of something; and this something is not nothing, nor is it the contradictory. (Ferrier 2001: vol. 1. 434)

Once Ferrier has established that the absolute must be the object of knowledge and ignorance, he moves to the question of being and considers what is. His “Ontology” directly follows from his “Epistemology” and the “Agnoiology.” In the opening proposition of this section he sets out the possibilities for that which is, which he refers to as “Absolute Existence.” It must be that which is (1) an object of knowledge, (2) that which is an object of ignorance, or (3) that which is neither an object of knowledge nor an object of ignorance. That which we can neither know nor be ignorant of is the contradictory and as such cannot be that which absolutely exists; Ferrier argues that this is a conclusion that even skeptics must allow for. He says:

No form of scepticism has ever questioned the fact that something absolutely exists, or has ever maintained that this something was the nonsensical. The sceptic, even when he carries his opinions to an extreme, merely doubts or denies our competency to find out and declare what absolutely exists. (Ferrier 2001: vol. 1. 466)

Therefore, that which exists must be the object of knowledge or ignorance, or, in other words, it is the absolute: a synthesis of subject-with-object.

The influence of Berkeley again becomes apparent in the development of his idealist ontology because he concludes the Institutes with the proposition that there is only one necessary absolute existence, namely, a supreme mind in synthesis with the universe. He says: “All absolute existences are contingent except one; in other words, there is One, but only one, Absolute Existence which is strictly necessary; and that existence is a supreme and infinite, and everlasting Mind in synthesis with all things” (Ferrier 2001: vol. 1. 522).  Grounding Ferrier’s metaphysics is the notion that God is both the supreme knower and the only necessary knower. Every other knower is finite and contingent; therefore, the existence of reality cannot depend on them. Ferrier argues that reason dictates that there must be a supreme mind to prevent the universe from being contradictory. This is because objects per se are contradictory. Therefore, the universe, which constitutes the objective part of knowledge, must be in conjunction with some subject in order to provide it with existence.

3. Reception and Influence

Ferrier was arguably the best Scottish philosopher of his generation. However, his contemporaries did not uniformly welcome his idealist metaphysics, believing the Institutes to be too far removed from the philosophy of his predecessors. Commonsense philosophy was dominant in the Scottish universities in the decades following Reid’s death. Subsequent generations of philosophers from Dugald Stewart to Hamilton defended some version of commonsense philosophy, which led nineteenth-century writers such as Ferrier, Andrew Seth Pringle-Pattison, and James McCosh to speak of a tradition of “Scottish philosophy.” In the history of Scottish philosophy, the role of the universities was of considerable importance, and acquiring a key university Chair often signified the status of the philosopher at the time. Many important philosophers held such academic chairs; for instance, both Adam Smith and Thomas Reid held the Chair of Moral Philosophy at Glasgow, Dugald Stewart was the Chair of Moral Philosophy at Edinburgh, and Sir William Hamilton was the Chair of Logic and Metaphysics at Edinburgh. A notable exception to this list is David Hume who unsuccessfully tried to acquire Chairs of philosophy at both Edinburgh and Glasgow. In many respects, Ferrier was the obvious candidate to succeed Hamilton in the esteemed Chair of Logic and Metaphysics at Edinburgh. Although Hamilton was best known for his editions of Reid’s works, he tried to combine Reid with Kant, while placing a greater emphasis on metaphysics than there had been before. Ferrier developed this tendency towards metaphysics even further with his idealism and his rejection of Reid’s commonsense philosophy. Additionally, Ferrier had taught in place of Hamilton during his mentor’s illness during the forties, and he was highly esteemed by Hamilton and others for his philosophical acuity. Nevertheless, Ferrier was unsuccessful in his attempt to acquire the Chair of Logic and Metaphysics in 1856, losing out to the lesser-known Alexander Campbell Fraser.

He reacted angrily to his defeat and it led him to produce his polemical work Scottish Philosophy: The Old and the New, which is a defense of his philosophical system as well as a scathing attack on his opponents. Ferrier’s animosity is not directed at Fraser; instead, he targets those who campaigned against him as well as Edinburgh’s Town Council who were responsible for appointing Hamilton’s successor. Here, he employs extraordinary rhetoric to argue that there is a distinction between old and new Scottish philosophy. In his analysis, his idealist metaphysics represents a “new Scottish philosophy,” whereas adherence to Reid and Hamilton is equivalent to perpetuating the “old Scottish philosophy.” In the campaign against Ferrier, his idealism was portrayed as being insufficiently Scottish. He replies that his philosophy is quintessentially Scottish even though it differs from Reid and Hamilton in certain respects. He says: “Philosophy is not traditional. As a mere inheritance it carries no benefit to either man or boy. The more it is a received dogmatic, the less it is a quickening process” (Ferrier 1856: 9). To discredit Ferrier his philosophy was compared to both Hegel and Spinoza with associations of pantheism and atheism mixed with nationalism and xenophobia. Ferrier denies the accusation that his philosophy is Hegelian and points out that claims to the contrary are simply propaganda. Moreover, he responds to suggestions that his philosophy is similar to Spinoza’s by wholeheartedly demonstrating his antipathy toward those who campaigned against him: “all the outcry which has been raised against Spinoza has its origin in nothing but ignorance, hypocrisy, and cant” (Ferrier 1856: 14). Ferrier was educated in the Scottish tradition, and the work he created was in direct reaction to it. The difference between Ferrier’s Institutes of Metaphysic and Reid’s philosophy of common sense is substantial. However, the difference between Ferrier’s thought and Hamilton’s is less dramatic.

Ironically, some decades later, the association with Hegel did not carry a negative connation. Alexander Campbell Fraser went on to teach several of the British Idealists of the latter part of the nineteenth century, and Edward Caird, an avowed Hegelian, was the Professor of Moral Philosophy in Glasgow for several years. The idealist R. B. Haldane summed up this change in attitude when he said: “The Time-Spirit is fond of revenges” (Haldane 1899: 9). In retrospect, Ferrier’s idealism appeared a few decades too early to be received by a receptive audience.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Ferrier, James Frederick, Philosophical Works of James Frederick Ferrier, 3 vols: i. Institutes of Metaphysic, ii. Lectures on Greek Philosophy, iii. Philosophical Remains, Bristol: Thoemmes Press, 2001.
  • Ferrier, James Frederick, Scottish Philosophy: The Old and the New, Edinburgh: Sutherland and Knox, 1856.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Boucher, David, “Introduction” in The Scottish Idealists: Selected Philosophical Writings, Exeter: Imprint Academic, 2004.
  • Broadie, Alexander, A History of Scottish Philosophy, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 2009.
  • Cairns, Revd. J, An Examination of Professor Ferrier’s “Theory of Knowing and Being,” Edinburgh: Thomas Constable and Co, 1856.
  • Davie, George, Ferrier and the Blackout of the Scottish Enlightenment. Edinburgh: Edinburgh Review, 2003.
  • Davie, George, The Democratic Intellect: Scotland and Her Universities in the Nineteenth Century. Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 1961.
  • Davie, George, The Scotch Metaphysics A Century of Enlightenment in Scotland. London: Routledge, 2001.
  • Ferreira, Phillip, “James Frederick Ferrier” in A. C. Grayling, Naomi Goulder, and Andrew Pyle (eds.), Continuum Encyclopedia of British Philosophy, London: Thoemmes Continuum, 2006, ii. 1085-1087.
  • Fraser, Alexander Campbell, “Ferrier’s Theory of Knowing and Being” in Essays in Philosophy. Edinburgh: W.P. Kennedy, 1856.
  • Graham, Graham (ed.), Scottish Philosophy in the Nineteenth and Twentieth Centuries, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2015.
  • Graham, Graham, “The Nineteenth-Century Aftermath” in Broadie, Alexander ed. The Cambridge Companion to the Scottish Enlightenment, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
  • Haldane, E. S., James Frederick Ferrier. Edinburgh and London: Oliphant Anderson & Ferrier, 1899.
  • Haldane, John, “Introduction” in Ferrier, James Frederick, Philosophical Works of James Frederick Ferrier, Bristol: Thoemmes Press, i. Institutes of Metaphysic, 2001.
  • Jaffro, Laurent, “Reid said the business, but Berkeley did it.” Ferrier interprète de l'immatérialisme in Revue philosophique de la France et de l'étranger 135: 1, pp.135-149, 2010.
  • Keefe, Jenny, “James Ferrier and the Theory of Ignorance” in The Monist, Volume 90, No.2, pp.297-309, 2007.
  • Keefe, Jenny, “The Return to Berkeley” in British Journal for the History of Philosophy, Volume 15, Issue 1, pp.101-113, 2007.
  • Lushington, E. L., “Introductory Notice” in Ferrier, James Frederick, Philosophical Works of James Frederick Ferrier, Bristol: Thoemmes Press, ii. Lectures on Greek Philosophy, 2001.
  • Mander, W. J., British Idealism: A History, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2011.
  • Mander, W. J. and Panagakou, S., British Idealism and the Concept of the Self, London: Palgrave Macmillan, 2016.
  • Mander, W. J. (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of British Philosophy in the Nineteenth Century, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2014.
  • Mayo, Bernard, “The Moral and the Physical Order: A Reappraisal of James Frederick Ferrier,” Inaugural Lecture, University of St Andrews, 1969.
  • McCosh, James, The Scottish Philosophy, New York: Robert Carter and Brothers, 1875.
  • McDermid, Douglas, “Ferrier and the Myth of Scottish Common Sense Realism” in Journal of Scottish Philosophy, Volume 11, Issue 1, pp.87-107, 2013.
  • McDermid, Douglas, The Rise and Fall of Scottish Common Sense Realism, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2018.
  • Muirhead, J. H., The Platonic Tradition in Anglo-Saxon Philosophy, London: George Allen & Unwin, 1931.
  • Segerstedt, Torgny T., The Problem of Knowledge in Scottish Philosophy (Reid-Stewart-Hamilton-Ferrier). Lund: Gleerup, 1931.
  • Seth, Andrew, Scottish Philosophy: A Comparison of the Scottish and German Answers to Hume, Edinburgh and London: William Blackwood and Sons, 1885.
  • Sorley, W. R., A History of English Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1920.
  • Thomson, Arthur, Ferrier of St Andrews: An Academic Tragedy, Edinburgh: Scottish Academic Press, 1985.
  • The Testimonials of J.F. Ferrier, Candidate for the Chair of Moral Philosophy in the University of Edinburgh, Second Series, 1852.


Author Information

Jenny Keefe
Email: keefe@uwp.edu
University of Wisconsin–Parkside
U. S. A.