Sigmund Freud: Religion
This article explores attempts by Sigmund Freud (1850-1939) to provide a naturalistic account of religion enhanced by insights and theoretical constructs derived from the discipline of psychoanalysis which he had pioneered. Freud was an Austrian neurologist and psychologist who is widely regarded as the father of psychoanalysis, which is both a psychological theory and therapeutic system. As a theory, psychoanalysis conceptualizes the mind as a system composed of three constituent elements: id, ego, and superego. It focuses on the interaction between those elements, and includes such key concepts as infantile sexuality, repression, latency and transference. Psychoanalytic therapy is an application of this conceptual schema, in which the interaction of the mind’s conscious and unconscious elements in individual cases is explored using the techniques of dream interpretation, free association and the analysis of resistance to identify repressed conflicts and bring them into the conscious mind.
Freud’s thought on religion is, perhaps fittingly, rather complex and ambivalent: while there can be little doubt as to its roundly skeptical, and at times hostile, character, it is nonetheless clear that he had a firm grounding in Jewish religious thought and that the religious impulse held a life-long fascination for him. This article charts the evolution of his views on religion from Totem and Taboo (1913), through The Future of an Illusion (1927) and Civilization and its Discontents (1930) to Moses and Monotheism (1939), focusing in particular on the parallels drawn by him between religious belief and neurosis, and on his account of the role which the father complex plays in the genesis of religious belief. The article concludes with a review of some of the main critical responses which the Freudian account has elicited.
Table of Contents
- Psychoanalysis and Religion
- Freud’s Jewish Heritage
- Philosophical Connections
- The Orientation of Freud’s Approach to Religion
- Totemism and the Father Complex
- Religion and Civilization
- The Moses Narrative: The Origins of Judaic Monotheism
- Critical Responses
- References and Further Reading
At the heart of Freud’s psychoanalysis is his theory of infantile sexuality, which represents individual psychological human development as a progression through a number of stages in which the libidinal drives are directed towards particular pleasure-release loci, from the oral to the anal to the phallic and, after a latency period, in maturity to the genital. He thus saw the psychosexual development of every individual as consisting essentially of a movement through a series of conflicts which are resolved by the internalization, through the operation of the superego, of control mechanisms derived originally from an authoritative, usually parental, source. In infancy, such a progression entails a process whereby parental control involves the introduction to the child of behavioral prohibitions and limitations and necessitates the repression, displacement or sublimation of the libidinal drives.
Central to this account is the idea that neuroses, which may include the formation of psychosomatic symptoms in the individual, arise essentially either out of external trauma or through a failure to effect a resolution of the internal conflict between libidinal urges and the key psychological control mechanisms. Symptomatically, these often present as compulsive and debilitating patterns of behavior—as in hysteria, repetitive ceremonial movements or an obsession with personal hygiene—which make a normal healthy life impossible, requiring psychotherapeutic intervention in the form of such techniques as dream analysis and free association. Of particular importance, he held, is the resolution of the Oedipus complex, which arises at the phallic stage, in which the male child forms a sexual attachment with the mother and comes to view the father as a hated and feared sexual rival. That resolution, which Freud saw as essential to the formation of sexuality, entails the repression of the drive away from the mother as libidinal object and the male child’s identification with the father. The cluster of associations relating to the multifaceted relationship between son and father Freud termed “the father complex” (1957, 144) and, as we shall see, viewed it as central to a correct understanding both of the developmental psychology of human beings and to many of the central and most important social phenomena in human life, including religious belief and practice.
In his account of religion Freud deployed what Paul Ricoeur (1913—2005) terms a hermeneutic “of suspicion” (Ricoeur 1970, 32), a reductive and demystifying style of interpretation that repudiated what he saw as a masquerade of conventional meanings operating at the level of common discourse in favor of deeper, less conventional truths relating to human psychology. He sought to demonstrate by this means the true origins and significance of religion in human life, in effect utilizing the techniques of psychotherapy to achieve that goal. Freud’s general position on religion stands firmly in the naturalistic tradition of projectionism stretching from Xenophanes (c.570—c.475 B.C.E.) and Lucretius (c.99—c.55 B.C.E.) through Thomas Hobbes (1588—1679) and David Hume (1711—76) to Ludwig Feuerbach (1804—1872) in holding that the concept of God is essentially the product of an unconscious anthropomorphic construct, which Freud saw as a function of the underlying father complex operating in social groups. “The psycho-analysis of individual human beings,” he thus stated boldly in Totem and Taboo, “teaches us with quite special insistence that the god of each of them is formed in the likeness of his father, that his personal relation to God depends on his relation to his father in the flesh and oscillates and changes along with that relation, and that at bottom God is nothing other than an exalted father” (Freud 2001, 171).
The following sections examine the considerations which led him to this view, to the manner in which it found articulation in his writings on religion and to the main criticisms which it has encountered.
Freud was born to Jewish parents in the town of Freiberg, then in the Austro-Hungarian Empire. His father Jacob was a businessman descended from a long line of rabbinical scholars; a textile merchant, he went bankrupt when Sigmund was four years of age and the family were forced to move to Vienna, where they lived in genteel poverty for many years, dependent in part upon the generosity of relatives. The young Sigmund found it difficult to come to terms with the new urban surroundings and family’s reduced financial circumstances. Experience of the latter left him with a life-long fear of poverty, his overweening ambition to establish psychoanalysis as a new science and successful treatment for hysteria was as a result partially motivated by the desire to achieve financial security for his family.
In the preface to the Hebrew edition of Totem and Taboo, published in 1930, Freud described himself as being “in his essential nature a Jew and who has no desire to alter that nature,” but one who is “completely estranged from the religion of his fathers—as well as from every other religion” (Freud 2001 Preface, xiii). This phrasing marks Freud’s recognition that, notwithstanding his skepticism regarding religion, his character had largely been formed by a Judaic cultural heritage passed on to him by his father Jacob, with whom he had a rather fraught relationship. Freud’s ancestors were affiliates of Hasidic Judaism going back many generations, and included several rabbis and distinguished scholars among their number (Berke 2015, xii). While Jacob was liberal and progressive in his outlook, he retained a deep reverence for the Talmud and the Torah and had overseen Sigmund’s childhood study of the Philippson family Bible, which generated in the young Sigmund a life-long fascination with the story of Moses and his connection with Egypt. He also ensured that the boy had a traditional Jewish schooling in which he was steeped in Biblical studies in the original Hebrew. In that connection the young Freud developed a deep admiration for, and friendship with, one of his religion teachers, Rabbi Samuel Hammerschlag, who was a strong proponent of humanistic Reform Judaism. Such was his admiration for his teacher that Freud ultimately named his fifth and sixth children, Sophie and Anna, after Hammerschlag’s niece and daughter; commentators now generally agree that the patient referred to as ‘Irma’ in Freud’s pivotal The Interpretation of Dreams was in fact Anna Hammerschlag. It was Rabbi Hammerschlag’s deep humanism, more than any other feature of his character, which Freud found inspiring, inculcating in him a lasting commitment to the universality of Enlightenment values. It is notable that, in seeking to pay Hammerschlag the highest compliment possible in the obituary which he wrote for him in 1904, Freud compared him to the Hebrew prophets, but also highlighted the extent to which that aspect of his character was integrated with humanistic ideals: “A part from the same fire which animated the great Jewish seers and prophets burned in him … but the passionate side of his nature was happily tempered by the ideal of humanism of our classical German period, which governed him and his method of education” (Freud 1976 IX, 256).
Notwithstanding the positive impact of such religious influences, from adolescence onwards Freud apparently found the observances and strictures required by orthodox Jewish belief increasingly burdensome and he became overtly hostile to the religion of his forefathers and to religion in general (Goodnick 1992, 352); it is likely that this was the principal cause of the estrangement between Sigmund and his father Jacob. That the estrangement ran deep and was a source of distress to Jacob became evident on the occasion of his son’s 35th birthday, when, in a gesture conforming with an established Jewish custom, he presented Sigmund with the family Bible which he had studied so closely as a child, newly rebound in leather. This was accompanied by a richly lyrical dedication in Hebrew, written in the style of melitzah, a literary tradition of Biblical allusion (Alter 1988, 23), referencing the relationship between them and their shared Jewish heritage. In part, the verse ran:
Son who is dear to me, Shelomoh. In the seventh in the days of the years of your life the Spirit of the Lord began to move you and spoke within you: Go, read in my Book that I have written and there will burst open for you the wellsprings of understanding, knowledge, and wisdom… For the day on which your years were filled to five and thirty I have put upon it a cover of new skin and have called it: “Spring up, O well, sing ye unto it!” And I have presented it to you as a memorial and as a reminder of love from your father, who loves you with everlasting love. (trans. and cited by Yerushalmi 1993, 71)
This attempt at effecting a rapprochement, which gently sought to remind Freud of his father’s love for him and of their shared religious and cultural heritage—implying, as one commentator puts it, “that their Bible embodies both the Jewish tradition and this love” (Gresser 1994, 31)—appeared initially not to have been successful. Freud never mentioned his father’s birthday dedication in his writings, though it was found after his death perfectly preserved in the Philippson Bible with which he had been presented, and his reductive critique of institutional religion became instead ever more sustained and pointed. Yet, at the deepest level, an ambivalence remained; as Freud acknowledged in his Autobiographical Study, “My deep engrossment in the Bible story (almost as soon as I had learnt the art of reading) had, as I recognised much later, an enduring effect upon the direction of my interest” (Freud 1959, XX 8).
The death of Jacob on 23rd October 1896 was one of the most important events in Sigmund Freud’s life and precipitated a lengthy period of reflective contemplation on their relationship. As he confessed later that year in a letter to his friend Wilhelm Fliess, “… the old man’s death has affected me deeply. I valued him highly, understood him very well, and with his peculiar mixture of deep wisdom and fantastic light-heartedness he had a significant effect on my life… in my inner self the whole past has been awakened by this event. I now feel quite uprooted” (Freud 1986, 202). The importance of the event cannot be overestimated; Jacob’s death triggered a period of sustained self-analysis in which Freud had what he considered an epiphany: the hostility which he had often felt towards his father, which had at one point made him suspect that Jacob had been guilty of sexually abusing him, was due to the fact that as a child he saw Jacob as a rival for his mother’s love. Thus was born the ideas of the Oedipus complex to which we have referred above, which, universalized by Freud, became one of the cornerstones of psychoanalytic theory. In his 1908 preface to the second edition of The Interpretation of Dreams, the work which made his reputation globally and brought him the financial security which he had craved, Freud made clear the extent to which his articulation of the new science owed to his analytical resolution of the crisis generated by Jacob’s death: “It was a portion of my own self-analysis, my reaction to my father’s death—that is to say, to the most important event, the most poignant loss of a man’s life” (Freud 2010, xxvi). Still awaiting resolution at that point, however, was the conflict generated in Freud’s life by the demand to find a means of affirming the richness and particularity of his Jewish cultural heritage, as his father had urged in his dedication, without acceding to the Biblical and theological orthodoxies associated with it. A number of scholars (Rice, 1990; Gresser, 1994) have suggested that this problem is one of the keys to an understanding of his final work, Moses and Monotheism.
Two of the major formative influences upon Freud were those of the philosophers/psychologists Franz Brentano (1838—1917) and Theodor Lipps (1851—1914). Brentano was author of the seminal Psychology From an Empirical Standpoint (1973, orig. 1874); Freud took two philosophy courses under his direction when he first enrolled at the University of Vienna, as part of which he encountered Feuerbach’s writings on religion. Freud was captivated by the scope and clarity of Brentano’s lectures and found the latter’s emphasis on the need for empirical methods in psychology and for philosophy to be informed by logical rigour and scientific findings highly congenial. Less congenial to him, perhaps, were Brentano’s rational theism and his dismissal of the notion of unconscious mental states; these were two key issues on which Freud was subsequently to diverge sharply from him.
Freud—like other gifted students of Brentano such as Edmund Husserl (1859—1938) and Alexius Meinong (1853—1920)—was enthralled by him as a teacher and scholar, describing him in correspondence as “a darned clever fellow, a genius” (in Boehlich (ed.) 1992, 95). Such was the impact of Brentano’s influence that, at one stage, Freud resolved to take his doctorate in philosophy and zoology, a proposal towards which Brentano was favourably disposed but which faculty regulations at the University prevented from being realised.
In seeking to modernise psychology, Brentano had returned to the Aristotelian definition of the subject, understanding it as “the science which studies the properties and laws of the soul, which we discover within ourselves directly by means of inner perception, and which we infer, by analogy, to exist in others” (Brentano 1973, 5). In that connection, he revitalised the famous principle of intentionality from scholasticism as the defining criterion of mental phenomena and processes: unlike the physical counterparts from which they must be distinguished, mental or psychical phenomena, he argued, are necessarily directed towards intentional objects. Further, since such phenomena are accessible to us directly by means of “inner perception,” their existence and nature comes, he argued, guaranteed with an epistemic certainty and transparency that is markedly lacking in relation to our perception of physical phenomena, where, for example, we sometimes misapprehend such subjective characteristics as colour and taste as objective properties of things.
Given this distinction between the physical and the mental, Brentano considered that one of the key problems for an empirical psychology was that of constructing an adequate picture of the internal dynamics of the mind from an analysis of the complex interplay between diverse mental phenomena, on the one hand, and the interactions between the mind and the external world, on the other. This conception was to have a profound influence upon the development of Freudian psychoanalysis, into which it was to become prominently incorporated. However, Brentano set his face implacably against admitting the notion of unconscious mental states and processes into a fully scientific psychology. In this he was in part motivated by his conviction that all mental states are known directly in introspection or “inner perception” and are thus, by definition, conscious; mental acts, he considered, are pellucid in the sense that they take themselves as secondary objects and so are consciously apprehended as they occur. Further, the positing of the existence of unconscious mental states also seemed to him to introduce uncertainty and vagueness into the field of psychology and to carry with it an implication of the impossibility of the very rigorous, empirically-based science of mind which he sought to establish.
While Freud adopted Brentano’s characterisation of the intentional nature of mental phenomena throughout his work, he did not, of course, accept that all such phenomena are conscious, and indeed extended the very notion of intentionality, in the guise of symbolic meaning, to the level of the unconscious. For the primary focus of Freud’s interest was medical and his therapeutic practice was, from the outset, predicated upon the assumption of a level of scientific understanding of aberrant behaviour and abnormal mental states. And it seemed evident to him from an early stage that the restriction of psychology to the level of conscious processes and events had made, and would continue to make, such a goal unattainable, and that it was precisely because traditional psychology had operated with that restriction that it found such occurrences problematic and inexplicable. Thus, while both Brentano and Freud were motivated by the desire to create a fully scientific science of mind, they reached diametrically opposed positions on the question of the inclusion of the unconscious in its terms of reference. In contrast with Brentano’s belief that the very notion of the unconscious lacks intellectual validity, Freud was convinced that a scientific approach to the area of the mental requires the concept of the unconscious as a critical presupposition.
Freud found strong support for this conviction in Theodor Lipps, a thinker who was as committed as Brentano to the ideal of an empirically grounded psychology governed by an experimental methodology, but who, unlike Brentano, considered that this necessitated, at a fundamental level, reference to the unconscious. Lipps’ account of the nature of the unconscious was of particular importance to the development of Freud’s thought for two reasons: In the first instance, when Freud encountered Lipps’ view that consciousness is an “organ” which mediates the inner reality of unconscious mental processes, he found in it a theory which was almost identical to one at which he had independently arrived. Secondly, in his account of humor—which also anticipated much of Freud’s later work on that subject—Lipps had extended the notion of aesthetic empathy (Einfühlung; “in-feeling” or “feeling-into”) from Robert Vischer (1847—1933) into the psychological realm to designate the process that allows us to comprehend and respond to the mental lives of others by putting ourselves in their place, which involved the key notion that meaningful interaction between humans necessitates the projection of mental states and occurrences from the self to others.
Freud adopted and integrated Lipps’ account of projection centrally in his psychoanalytic theory, regarding it as a precondition for establishing the relationship between patient and analyst which alone makes the interpretation of unconscious processes possible. But perhaps of even greater consequence in connection with the analysis of religion is the fact that concomitant to the idea of psychological projection is the notion that the human need to ascribe psychological states to others can and does readily lead to situations in which such ascriptions are extended beyond their legitimate boundaries in the human realm. As David Hume had observed, “There is an universal tendency among mankind to conceive all beings like themselves, and to transfer to every object those qualities with which they are familiarly acquainted, and of which they are intimately conscious” (Hume 1956, Section 111). It is in that way that personifications or anthropomorphisms arise: human beings, particularly at the early stage of their development, have an innate tendency to go beyond the legitimate boundaries of application of the psychological concept-range and thus to misapply human-being concepts. A child relates to its environment at large most readily through such a process: in the narratives provided by storybooks, school text-books and film and televisual animation, the child's interest, attention, and above all, its understanding, are engaged through the attribution of anthropomorphic qualities to non-human objects and organisms: bees worry, trees are sad, ants are curious, and so on.
In his Essence of Christianity (1841; English trans. 1881), Ludwig Feuerbach had offered a sustained critique of religion predicated upon the notion that the very idea of God is such an anthropomorphic construct, with no reality beyond the human mind, and that specific characteristics attributed to God in religion (Love, Benevolence, Power, Knowledge, and so forth) embody an idealized conception of human nature and of the values esteemed by human beings. This projectionist view, which he first encountered under Brentano’s—no doubt, critical—tutelage, was one which Freud came to accept implicitly and indeed to extend, holding that the insights offered by psychoanalysis into the workings of the human mind can explain just why and how religious anthropomorphisms arise. Freud accordingly integrated his account of religion into the broader project of psychoanalysis, suggesting that “a large portion of the mythological conception of the world which reaches far into the most modern religions is nothing but psychology projected into the outer world… We venture to explain in this way the myths of paradise and the fall of man, of God, of good and evil, of immortality and the like—that is, to transform metaphysics into meta-psychology” (Freud 1914, 309. Italics in original).
In articulating this project, Freud drew deeply upon a wide variety of anthropological sources, particularly the work of such contemporary luminaries as John Ferguson McLennan (1827—1881), Edward Burnett Tylor (1832—1917), John Lubbock (1834—1913), Andrew Lang (1844—1912), James George Frazer (1854—1941) and Robert Ranulph Marett (1866—1943) on the connection between social structures and primitive religions. Freud’s claim to originality in this context resides in his attempt to situate projectionism within the framework of psychoanalysis, ultimately interpreting the social origins and cultural significance of the religious impulse in terms paralleling his account of the father-son relationship in individual psychology.
The evolutionist paradigm, which projected a universal linear cultural development from the primitive to the civilized, with the differences found in human societies reflecting stages in that development, gradually came to function as a background assumption in Freud’s thought from an early stage. Tylor, whose Primitive Culture (1871) and Anthropology (1881) are generally regarded as foundational to the then emergent science of cultural anthropology, held that, in terms of human interaction with the world at large, civilization progresses through three developmental “stages,” from magic through religion to science, with contemporary Western culture representative of the final stage. This view was rearticulated by Frazer in his famous Golden Bough and referenced approvingly by Freud (2001, 90), though he emphasized that elements of the first two stages continue to operate in contemporary life. Accordingly, Freud gradually adopted the position of one who seeks to explicate the significance of religion in the context of a cultural milieu in which, having supplanted attempts to control the world through sympathetic magic, it has itself been superseded by science. Furthermore, Freud found in Tylor’s and Frazer’s evolutionist account of cultural progress an implication which had been affirmed explicitly by Feuerbach: “Religion is the childlike condition of humanity” (Feuerbach 1881, 13); it belongs to a social developmental stage paralleling that of the individual, through which each civilization must pass en route to the maturity of scientific understanding. It was perhaps this latter, more than any other factor, which was to suggest to Freud that the psychoanalytical techniques which he pioneered in his account of individual psychology could be applied socially, to explain the nature of the religious impulse in human life generally.
Some of Freud’s earliest comments on religion give immediate evidence of the psychologically reductionist direction which his thought was to take, which represented the dynamic underpinning religion as deriving from the powerfully ambivalent relationship between the child and his apparently omnipotent father. For example, in his 1907 paper “Obsessive Actions and Religious Practices” he drew attention to similarities between neurotic behavior and religious rituals, suggesting that the formation of a religion has, as its “pathological counterpart,” obsessional neurosis, such that it might be appropriate to describe neurosis “as an individual religiosity and religion as a universal obsessional neurosis” (Freud 1976 S.E. IX, 125-6), a view which he was to retain for the remainder of his life.
Freud’s first sustained treatment of religion in these terms occurs in his 1913 Totem and Taboo, in the context of his account, heavily influenced in particular by the work of James George Frazer, Andrew Lang and J.J. Atkinson, of the relationship between totemism and the incest prohibition in primitive social groupings. The prominence and strength of the incest taboo was of considerable interest to him as a psychologist, not least because he saw it as one of the keys to an understanding of human culture and as deeply linked to the concepts of infantile sexuality, Oedipal desire, repression and sublimation which play such a key role in psychoanalytic theory. In tribal groups the incest taboo was usually associated with the totem animal with which the group identified and after which it was named. This identification led to a ban on the killing or the consumption of the flesh of the totem animal and on other restrictions on the range of permissible behaviors and, in particular, it led to the practice of exogamy, the prohibition of sexual relations between members of the totem group.
Such prohibitions, Freud believed, are extremely important as they constitute the origins of human morality, and he offered a reconstruction of the genesis of totem religions in human culture in terms which are at once forensically psychoanalytical and rather egregiously speculative. The primal social state of our pre-human ancestors, he argued, closely following J.J. Atkinson’s account in his Primal Law, was that of a patriarchal “horde” in which a single male jealously maintained sexual hegemony over all of the females in the group, prohibiting his sons and other male rivals from engaging in sexual congress with them. In this account, the psycho-sexual dynamic operating within the group led to the violent rebellion of the sons, their murder of the father and their consumption of his flesh (Atkinson 1903, chapters I-III; Freud 2001, 164). However, the sons’ subsequent recognition that no one of them had the power to take the place of the father led them to create a sacred totem with which to identify him and to reinstate the practice of the exogamy which the parricide was designed to abolish: the creation of the totem yielded a totem clan within which sexual congress between members was forbidden. The identification of the totem animal with the father arose out of a displacement of the deep sense of guilt generated by the murder, while simultaneously being an attempt at reconciliation and a retrospective renunciation of the crime by creating a taboo around the killing of the totem. “They revoked their deed by forbidding the killing of the totem, the substitute for their father; and they renounced its fruits by resigning their claim to the women who had now been set free” (Freud 2001, 166). This identification, Freud asserted, confirmed the link between neurosis and religion suggested by him in 1907: given that the totem animal represents the father, then the two main taboo prohibitions of totemism, the ban on killing the totem animal and the incest prohibition, “coincide in their content with … the two primal wishes of children [to kill the father and have sexual intercourse with the mother], the insufficient repression or re-awakening of which forms the nucleus of perhaps all psychoneuroses” (Freud 2001, 153).
The parricidal deed, Freud asserted, is the single “great event with which culture began and which, since it occurred, has not let mankind a moment’s rest” (Freud 2001, 168), the acquired memory traces of which underpins the whole of human culture, including, and in particular, both totem and developed religions. Such a view, of course, presupposes the validity of the essentially Lamarckian idea that traits acquired by individuals, including psychological traits such a memory, can be inherited and thus passed through the generations. This was a controversial notion to which Freud, who never fully accepted the Darwinian account of evolution through natural selection, steadfastly adhered throughout his life, in the face of scientific criticism. He also took it as being consistent with Ernst Haeckel’s (1834—1919) view that ontogeny recapitulates phylogeny, that is, that the stages of individual human development repeat that of the evolution of humanity—which he took as scientific justification of his belief that psychoanalytical techniques could be applied with equal validity to the social as to the individual.
The counterpart to the primary taboo against killing or eating the totem animal, Freud pointed out, is the annual totem feast, in which that very prohibition is solemnly and ritualistically violated by the tribal community, and he followed the Orientalist William Robertson Smith (1846—1894) in linking such totem feasts with the rituals of sacrifice in developed religions. Such feasts involved the entire community and were, Freud argued, a mechanism for the affirmation of tribal identity through the sharing of the totem’s body, which was simultaneously an affirmation of kinship with the father. Freud saw no contradiction in such a ritual, holding that the ambivalence contained in the father-complex pervades both totemic and developed religions: “Totemic religion not only comprises expressions of remorse and attempts at atonement, it also serves as a remembrance of the triumph over the father” (Freud 2001, 169). The father is thus represented twice in primitive sacrifice, as god and as totem animal, the totem being the first form taken by the father substitute and the god a later one in which the father reassumes his human identity. The dynamic which operates in totem religions, Freud argued, is sustained by and underpins the evolution of religion into its modern forms, where the need for communal sacrifice to expiate an original sin should also be understood in terms of parricide guilt.
In time Freud came to consider that the account which he had given in Totem and Taboo did not fully address the issue of the origins of developed religion, the human needs which religion is designed to meet and, consequently, the psychological motivations underpinning religious belief. He turned to these questions in his The Future of an Illusion (1927; reprinted 1961) and Civilization and its Discontents (1930; reprinted 1962). In the two works he represented the structures of civilization, which permit men to live in mutually beneficial communal relationships, as emerging only as a consequence of the imposition of restrictive processes on individual human instinct. In order for civilization to emerge, limiting regulations must be created to frustrate the satisfaction of destructive libidinal drives, examples of which are those directed towards incest, cannibalism and murder. Even the religious injunction to love one’s neighbor as oneself, Freud argued, springs from the need to protect civilization from disintegration. Given that history demonstrates that man is “a savage beast to whom consideration towards his own kind is something alien” (Freud 1962, 59), the fashioning of a value system based upon the requirement to develop loving relationships with one’s fellow man is a social and cultural necessity, without which we would be reduced to living in a state of nature. For Freud, the principal task of civilization is thus to defend us against nature, for without it we would be entirely exposed to natural forces which have almost unlimited power to destroy us.
Extending his account of repression from individual to group psychology, Freud contended that, with the refinement of culture, the external coercive measures inhibiting the instincts become largely internalized. Humans become social and moral beings through the functioning of the superego in effecting a renunciation of the more antisocial drives: “external coercion gradually becomes internalized; for a special mental agency, man's super-ego, takes it over and includes it among its commandments… Those in whom it has taken place are turned from being opponents of civilization into being its vehicles” (Freud 1961, 11). However, the effect of such renunciations is to create a state of cultural privation “resembling repression” (Freud 1961, 43), which in order to foster social harmony must in turn be dissipated by sublimation, the creation of substitute satisfactions for the drives.
Professional work, Freud argued, is one area in which such substitutions take place, while the aesthetic appreciation of art is another significant one; for art, though it is inaccessible to all but a privileged few, serves to reconcile human beings to the individual sacrifices that have been made for the sake of civilization. However, the effects of art, even on those who appreciate it, are transient, with experience demonstrating that they are insufficiently strong to reconcile us to misery and loss. For that effect, in particular for the achievement of consolation for the suffering and tribulations of life, religious ideas become invoked; these ideas, he held, consequentially become of the greatest importance to a culture in terms of the range of substitute satisfactions which they provide.
The role which religion has played in human culture was thus described by Freud in his 1932 lecture “On the Question of a Weltanschauung” as nothing less than grandiose; because it purports to offer information about the origins of the universe and assures human beings of divine protection and of the achievement of ultimate personal happiness, religion “is an immense power, which has the strongest emotions of human beings at its service” (Freud 1990, 199). Since religious ideas thus address the most fundamental problems of existence, they are regarded as the most precious assets civilization has to offer, and the religious worldview, which Freud acknowledged as possessing incomparable consistency and coherence, makes the claim that it alone can answer the question of the meaning of life.
For Freud, then, the cultural and social importance of religion resides both in reconciling men to the limitations which membership of the community places upon them and in mitigating their sense of powerlessness in the face of a recalcitrant and ever-threatening nature. In this respect again, Freud held, group psychology is an extension of individual psychology, with the powerful father figure in patriarchal monotheistic religions providing the required protection against the threat of destruction: “Now that God was a single person, man's relations to him could recover the intimacy and intensity of the child's relation to his father” (Freud 1961, 19). It is in this sense, he argued, that the father-son relationship so crucial to psychoanalysis demands the projection of a deity configured as an all-powerful, benevolent father figure.
Genetically, Freud argued, religious ideas thus owe their origin neither to reason nor experience but to an atavistic need to overcome the fear of an ever-threatening nature: “[they] are not precipitates of experience or end results of thinking: they are illusions, fulfilments of the oldest, strongest and most urgent wishes of mankind. The secret of their strength lies in the strength of those wishes” (Freud 1961, 30). In declaring such ideas illusory Freud did not initially seek to suggest or imply that they are thereby necessarily false; an illusory belief he defined simply as one which is motivated in part by wish-fulfillment, which in itself implied nothing about its relation to reality. He gives the example of a middle-class girl who believes that a prince will marry her; such a belief is clearly inspired by a wish-fantasy and is unlikely to prove justified, but such marriages do occasionally happen. Religious beliefs, he suggested in The Future of an Illusion, are illusions in that sense; unlike delusions, they are not, or are not necessarily, “in contradiction with reality” (Freud 1961, 31). However, by the time he wrote Civilization and its Discontents he was prepared to take his religious skepticism a stage further, explicitly declaring religious beliefs to be delusional, not only on an individual but on a mass scale: “A special importance attaches to the case in which [the] attempt to procure a certainty of happiness and a protection against suffering through a delusional remolding of reality is made by a considerable number of people in common. The religions of mankind must be classed among the mass-delusions of this kind” (Freud 1962, 28).
Given that religion has, as Freud acknowledged, made very significant contributions to the development of civilization, and that religious beliefs are not strictly refutable, the question arises as to why he came to consider that religious beliefs are delusional and that a turning away from religion is both desirable and inevitable in advanced social groupings. The answer given in Civilization and its Discontents is that, in the final analysis, religion has failed to deliver on its promise of human happiness and fulfillment; it seeks to impose a belief structure on humans which has no rational evidential base but requires unquestioning acceptance in the face of countervailing empirical evidence: “Its technique consists in depressing the value of life and distorting the picture of the real world in a delusional manner—which presupposes an intimidation of the intelligence” (Freud 1962, 31). He took this as confirming his belief that religion is akin to a universal obsessional neurosis generated by an unresolved father complex and is situated on an evolutionary trajectory which can only lead to its general abandonment in favor of science. “If this view is right,” he concluded, “it is to be supposed that a turning-away from religion is bound to occur with the fatal inevitability of a process of growth, and that we find ourselves at this very juncture in the middle of that phase of development” (Freud 1961, 43). That Freud saw the movement from religious to scientific modes of understanding as a positive cultural development cannot be doubted; indeed, it is one which he saw himself facilitating in a process analogous to the therapeutic resolution of individual neuroses: “Men cannot remain children for ever; they must in the end go out into 'hostile life'. We may call this education to reality. Need I confess to you that the sole purpose of my book is to point out the necessity for this forward step?” (Freud 1961, 49).
In Civilization Freud mentions that he had sent a copy of The Future of an Illusion to an admired friend, subsequently identified as the French novelist and social critic Romain Rolland. In his response, Rolland indicted broad agreement with Freud’s critique of organised religion, but suggested that Freud had failed in his attempt to identify the true experiential source of religious sentiments: a mystical, numinous feeling of oneness with the universe, “a sensation of ‘eternity’, a feeling as of something limitless, unbounded—as it were, ‘oceanic’” (In Freud 1962, 11). The occurrence of this feeling, Rolland argued, is a subjective fact about the human mind rather than an article of faith; it is common to millions of people and is undoubtedly “the source of the religious energy which is seized upon by the various Churches and religious systems” (In Freud 1962, 11). Thus, he suggested, it would be entirely appropriate to count oneself as religious “on the ground of this oceanic feeling alone, even if one rejects every belief and every illusion” (In Freud 1962, 11). In that sense, he concluded, there is an important sense in which Freud’s account of the origins of religion missed its mark to a significant degree.
Freud was clearly troubled by Rolland’s challenge, confessing that it caused him no small difficulty. On the one hand his respect for Rolland’s intellectual honesty made him take seriously the possibility that his analysis of religion might be deficient in failing to take cognizance of mystical feelings of the kind described. On the other hand, he was confronted with the obvious problem that feelings are notoriously difficult to deal with in a scientific manner. Additionally—and perhaps more importantly—Freud admitted to being unable to discover the oceanic feeling in himself, though he was not disposed on that ground to deny the occurrence of it in others. Given that such a feeling exists, even on the scale suggested by Rolland, the only question to be faced, Freud declared, is “whether it ought to be regarded as the fons et origo of the whole need for religion” (Freud 1962, 12).
Dismissing the possibility of accounting for the oceanic feeling in terms of an underlying physiology, Freud’s response was to focus on its “ideational content,” that is, the conscious ideas most readily associated with its feeling-tone. In that connection, he offered an account of the oceanic feeling as being a revival of an infantile experience associated with the narcissistic union between mother and child, in which the awareness of an ego or self as differentiated from the mother and world at large has yet to emerge in the child. In that sense, he contended, it would be implausible to take it as the foundational source of religion, since only a feeling which is an expression of a strong need could function as a motivational drive. The oceanic feeling, he conceded, may have become connected with religion later on, but he insisted that it is the experience of infantile helplessness and the longing for the father occasioned by it which is the original source from which religion derives (Freud 1962, 19).
However, while this analysis of the relation between religion and mystical experience is acknowledged as important and influential, few commentators have deemed it entirely adequate, the self-confessed absence of any direct experience of the oceanic feeling in Freud’s own case seeming to many to have led to an underestimation on his part of the significance of such feelings in the genesis of religion.
A very significant body of literature has since grown up around the idea that religion might have emerged genetically, and derive its dynamic energy, as Rolland suggested, from mystical feelings of oneness with the universe in which fear and anxiety are transcended and time and space are eclipsed. The work of thinkers as diverse as Paul Tillich (1886—1965), Ludwig Wittgenstein (1889—1951) and Paul Ricoeur (1913—2005) in this connection has proven influential and has established an ongoing dialogue between psychology and philosophy/theology (compare Parsons, 1998, 501). Additionally, Freud’s dismissal of the possibility of a physiological approach to mystical experience has been questioned. Recent scientific investigation of the neurophysiological correlates of mystical or spiritual experiences, utilizing magnetic resonance imaging (MRI) and related technologies, while extremely controversial, appears to demonstrate that some deep meditative practices trigger alterations in brain metabolism, occasioning the kind of numinous feelings specified by Rolland (compare d’Aquili, & Newberg 1999, ch. 6; Saarinen 2015, 19).
In 1939, while exiled in Britain and suffering from the throat cancer which was to lead to his death, Freud published his final and most controversial work, Moses and Monotheism. Written over a period of many years and sub-divided into discrete segments, two of which were published independently in the periodical Imago in 1937, the book has an inelegant structure. The many repetitions that it contains, coupled with the initial strangeness of the arguments advanced, persuaded some that it was the product of a man whose intellectual powers had fallen into serious decline. The analysis of Judaism offered in the text also evoked a vitriolic response from some quarters and even led to allegations of Jewish self-hatred on Freud’s part. However, in more recent times the book has become recognized as one of the most important in the Freudian canon, offering an innovative contribution to the understanding of the nature of religious truth and of the role played by tradition in religious thought.
The focal point of the work is the figure of Moses and his connection with Egypt, which had exerted a fascination on Freud since his childhood study of the Philippson bible, as evidenced also in his publication of the essay “The Moses of Michelangelo” in 1914. Accordingly, at this late juncture in his life and with the threat of fascist antisemitism looming over Europe, he turned his attention once more to the religion of his forefathers, constructing an alternative narrative to the orthodox Biblical one on the origins of Judaism and the emergence from it of Christianity. Developing a thesis partly suggested by work of the protestant theologian Ernst Sellin (1867—1946) in 1922, Freud argued that the historical Moses was not born Jewish but was rather an aristocratic Egyptian who functioned as a senior official or priest to the Pharaoh Amenhotep IV. The latter had introduced revolutionary changes to almost all aspects of Egyptian culture in the 14th century B.C.E., changing his name to Akhenaten, centralizing governmental administration and moving the capital from Thebes to the new city of Akhetaten. More significantly, he had also introduced a strict new universal monotheistic religion to Egypt, the religion of the god Aton or Aten, in the process outlawing as idolatrous the veneration of the traditional Egyptian polytheistic deities, including the then dominant religion of Amun-Ra, removing all references to the possibility of an afterlife and prohibiting the creation of graven images. He had also proscribed all forms of magic and sorcery, closed all the temples and suppressed established religious practice, thereby undermining the social status and political power of the Amun priests. In Freud’s words, “This king undertook to force upon his subjects a new religion, one contrary to their ancient traditions and to all their familiar habits. It was a strict monotheism, the first attempt of its kind in the history of the world as far as we know and religious intolerance, which was foreign to antiquity before this and for long after, was inevitably born with the belief in one God” (Freud 1939, 34-5). This religion was represented as a universal rather than a local one, reflective of the fact that imperial conquest had extended the Pharaoh’s rule beyond the borders of Egypt into Nubia, Syria and parts of Mesopotamia, which brought with it the novel idea of exclusivity: that the God Aton was not merely the supreme god, but the only god.
These radical innovations were not well received either by the disempowered Amun priestly caste or by the Egyptian general populace; predictably, they produced a fanatical desire for retribution and the return of the traditional religious practices on the part of the priests and the discontented people, “a reaction which was able to find a free outlet after the king's death” (Freud 1939, 39). Thus, when the Pharaoh died in 1358 B.C.E. the religion of Aton was ruthlessly suppressed in Egypt and Akhenaten became known to his successors as the “heretic king” whose memory they sought to expunge from the historical record. In his narrative, Freud depicts a despairing Moses, a devotee of the Aton religion, seeing “his hopes and prospects destroyed” (Freud 1939, 46), responding to these events by placing himself at the head of an enslaved Semitic tribe which had long been in bondage in Egypt and leading them to freedom across the Sinai. In the process he converted them to an even more spiritualized, rigorous and demanding form of monotheism, which involved the Egyptian custom of circumcision, a symbolic act of submission to the Divine Will.
In the Freudian narrative the onerous demands of the new religion ultimately led his followers to rebel and to kill Moses, an effective repetition of the original father murder outlined in Totem and Taboo, after which they turned to the cult of the volcano god Yahweh. But the memory of the Egyptian Moses remained a powerful latent force until, several generations later, a second Moses, the son-in-law of the Midianite priest Jethro, shaped the development of Judaism by integrating the monotheism of his predecessor with the worship of Yahweh. By this means the guilt deriving from the murder of the original Moses survived in the collective unconscious of the Jewish people and led to the hope of a messiah who would redeem them for their forefathers’ murderous act.
While Freud evidently retained his view of religion as the analogue of an obsessional neurosis, this account now contained the recognition that, as such, its effects are not necessarily pathological, but, on the contrary, can also be socially and culturally beneficial in a marked way. Thus he points out in his narrative that, through the example and guidance of the great prophets, there arose an ethical tradition within Judaism, ultimately traceable back to Moses the Egyptian, which proscribed iconic representation and ceremonial performance, demanding in their place belief and “a life of truth and justice” (Freud 1939, 82), a tradition with which Freud evidently had deep affinity. In his view, the Judaic ethic was one which demanded restrictions on the gratification of certain instincts as being incompatible with its spiritualised view of human nature and dignity, in a manner paralleling that in which the totem laws had imposed the rule of exogamy within the totem clan. Such restrictions, he argued, enabled Jewish culture to flourish and to take on its unique character. The prophets “did not tire of maintaining that God demands nothing else from his people but a just and virtuous life: that is to say, abstention from the gratification of all impulses that according to our present-day moral standards are to be condemned as vicious” (Freud 1939, 187). In this account, the murder of Moses was thus the initial event which provoked a sense of guilt that in turn shaped the ethical content of Judaic monotheism. This guilt, Freud argued, marked what he termed “the return of the repressed” (Freud 1939, 197), the emergence of compulsive patterns of behavior in the life of a social group generated by a dynamic originating in a traumatic event lying in the distant past but mediated and transmitted to the present in covert form by a tradition inspired, and partly shaped, by unconscious memory-traces. “All phenomena of symptom-formation can be fairly described as ‘the return of the repressed’,” he argued; “The distinctive character of them, however, lies in the extensive distortion the returning elements have undergone, compared with their original form” (Freud 1939, 201). This is something, he held, which constitutes an “archaic heritage” that does not need to be reacquired by each generation, but merely to be reawakened, and he charted the development of that heritage by means of an enumeration of the stages by means of which the repressed returns, from the primeval father through to the totem, to the hero, then to the polytheistic gods and finally to the monotheistic concept of a single Highest Being.
On this account, the obsessional sense of guilt governing and shaping the ascetic, highly spiritualized ethic implicit in Judaism has been passed on through the generations, such that it has become the very essence of the Jewish character: “The origin … of this ethics in feelings of guilt, due to the repressed hostility to God, cannot be gainsaid. It bears the characteristic of being never concluded and never able to be concluded with which we are familiar in the reaction-formations of the obsessional neurosis” (Freud 1939, 212). To recognize, through this form of (psycho)analysis, the genesis of the ethical system in the guilt arising from a nefarious historical deed is, he suggested, to free oneself from its obsessive features while simultaneously accepting its entirely human origins. But such a recognition does not entail an abandonment of the core value system, as there is a sense, as Freud acknowledged to be true in his own case, in which that ethical heritage cannot be repudiated once it is acquired.
This narrative account of the rootedness of the Jewish monotheistic tradition in the life and murder of the man Moses captures what Freud believed to be its most essential feature, something “majestic,” an eternal truth, “historic” rather than “material,” that “in primaeval times there was one person who must needs appear gigantic and who, raised to the status of a deity, returned to the memory of men” (1939, 204). For this reason, a number of commentators, in particular, Gresser and Friedman, argue persuasively that the Moses text should be seen as a response to the question posed by many of Freud’s critics after the publication of the Hebrew edition of Totem and Taboo as to the sense in which he remained, as he claimed, “in his essential nature a Jew,” given his psychologically reductive analysis of religion and his perceived hostility to religious orthodoxy. The answer, they suggest, could be offered by him in Moses and Monotheism only in terms of what he saw as essential to Judaism itself, a rigorous, spiritually intellectualized life ethic, centering on the virtues of truth and justice, derived from the man Moses, its human creator, through the work and influence of the prophets (compare Whitebook 2017, 68-9).
In early Christianity, Freud argued, the guilt of Moses’ murder became reconfigured in the Pauline tradition as the notion of an original sin for which atonement must be sought through a sacrificial death, the effect of which was to abolish the feeling of guilt and supplant Judaism with Christianity: “Paul, by developing the Jewish religion further, became its destroyer. His success was certainly mainly due to the fact that through the idea of salvation he laid the ghost of the feeling of guilt” (Freud 1939, 141). Once again, this historical transition was interpreted by Freud in clear Oedipal terms: “Originally a Father religion, Christianity became a Son religion. The fate of having to displace the Father it could not escape” (Freud 1939, 215). However, he held that the advent of Christianity was in some respects a step back from monotheism and a reversion to a covert form of polytheism, with the panoply of saints standing as a surrogate for the lesser gods of pagan antiquity. He accordingly saw the process whereby Christianity supplanted Judaism as comparable to the historical expunging of the monotheistic religion of Aton in ancient Egypt after the death of the Pharaoh Akhenaten: “The triumph of Christianity was a renewed victory of the Amon priests over the God of Ikhnaton” (Freud 1939, 142).
What is arguably of most importance in the Moses narrative is that it constitutes a final effort by Freud to reconcile himself with his own Jewish heritage; as one critic suggests, “Freud uses Moses to re-affirm his loyalty to a people whose religion he does not share but whose claim on him he steadfastly refuses to disavow” (Friedman, 1998, 148). The Jewish people, Freud pointed out, have a self-confidence which springs from the idea of being chosen by God from amongst the peoples of the world, an idea which derives strength from the related notion of participation in the reality of a supreme Deity. But the tenet of the Judaic religion which historically has had perhaps the most significant effect of all, he contended, has been the prohibition, derived from the religion of Aton, of graven images as idolatrous. That forces the believer into worship of a dematerialized God, an abstraction apprehensible only to the intellect, a movement described by Freud as “a triumph of spirituality over the senses” (Freud 1939, 178). This shift from the sensible to the conceptual was, he believed, “unquestionably one of the most important stages on the way to becoming human” (Freud 1939, 180), and it gave a preeminence to abstractions in Jewish intellectual life that made possible some of its key contributions to Western mathematics, science and literature, including, of course, the discipline of psychoanalysis. In that sense, he ultimately recognized that the very science of mind which he had pioneered and with which he sought to expose the Oedipal nature of religion was itself a cultural product of the Judaic religious impulse.
Freud’s utilization of the conceptual apparatus of psychoanalysis in his treatment of religion yields a naturalistic account rooted in psychoanalytic theory which, while being arguably one of the more self-consistent to be found in the modern age, is also one of the most controversial. In its main features it strongly anticipated, and almost certainly influenced, contemporary critiques of religion associated with the “New Atheism” movement of the late 20th and early 21st centuries, such as those of Daniel Dennett, Richard Dawkins, Sam Harris and Christopher Hitchens (1949—2011). The impact of Freud’s psychoanalytical projectionism can also be traced in the development of contemporary radical theology, particularly in the work of Don Cupitt and Lloyd Geering. The responses to it, in turn, occupy a very wide spectrum, from enthusiastic affirmation to condemnatory repudiation. A representative sample of these would include the following.
The idea of the “primal horde” was derived by Atkinson and Freud from what was no more than a cautious suggestion by Darwin in his Descent of Man that, amongst several possibilities regarding the social organization of “primeval” humans, one was that it might have consisted of small patriarchal groups led by a single dominant male, “each with as many wives as he could support and obtain, whom he would have jealously guarded against all other men” (Darwin 1981, II 362). This suggestion, which became one of the linchpins of Freud’s account of totem religion, has not received scientific corroboration, and it remains questionable whether the idea has any basis in reality (compare Smith, R.J. 2016). Further, the progressivist evolutionary paradigm championed by Freud, with its projection of a universal linear cultural development from the primitive to the civilized, is largely rejected by contemporary ethnologists and social anthropologists, in particular those influenced by the work of Franz Boas (1858—1942). The assimilation of prehistoric humans with contemporary “primitive” humans on which it is based, and the narrative constructed out of that assimilation, is generally regarded as Eurocentric in its presuppositions and as deriving from the mindset of 19th century imperialism (Kenny, R. 2015). Thus, in his influential review of Freud’s Totem and Taboo in 1919, the eminent American anthropologist Alfred L. Kroeber, who was a disciple of Boas, subjected Freud’s account of totemism to an extended and trenchant critique, suggesting that the method employed in it amounted to “multiplying into one another, as it were, fractional certainties … without recognition that the multiplicity of factors must successively decrease the probability of their product” (Kroeber 1920, 51). Kroeber attributed this almost entirely to the reliance by Freud on the speculative approach taken by such nineteenth century ethnologists as Tylor and Frazer; their anthropological work, he stated bluntly, “is not so much ethnology as an attempt to psychologize with ethnological data” (Kroeber 1920, 55). In a less trenchantly-worded retrospective review written 20 years later, Kroeber—who had in the interim spent some time as a practicing lay psychoanalyst—sought to make conceptual space for a reconciliation of Freud’s theory with scientific ethnology by making a distinction between “historical” and “psychological” thinking, suggesting that Freud’s account should be understood as involving the latter rather than the former (Kroeber 1939, 447). However, notwithstanding that, Kroeber’s strongly negative assessment in his original review of Freud’s incursion into the field of scientific anthropology is now generally accepted within the discipline. Accordingly, Freud’s account of totemism, considered as a direct contribution to an understanding of the development of human culture, would now be viewed with considerable suspicion by professional anthropologists.
For these reasons, Freud’s projectionist theory of religion as evolving from a primal parricide has been called into serious question as a scientific or historical hypothesis, and with it, the status of psychoanalysis itself. Karl Popper (1902—1994) and Ludwig Wittgenstein have both argued against Freud’s repeated claim for the scientific status of psychoanalysis and—by implication—the account of religion which he developed from it. Popper did so on the grounds that the terms in which psychoanalytic theory is couched make it unfalsifiable in principle and thus unscientific. The theories of Freud and Adler, he argued, describe some facts, but “in the manner of myths. They contain most interesting psychological suggestions, but not in a testable form” (Popper 1963, 37), unlike, for example, the propositions of the natural sciences which almost certainly served as a model for Freud. Wittgenstein, who considered Freud to be one of the few contemporary thinkers with “something to say” (Wittgenstein 1966, 41), albeit one whose whole way of thinking “wants combatting” (ibid., 50), was intrigued by Freud’s focus on mythology in his narratives, and saw that much of the persuasive force of his work derived from the claim that it has constructed a scientific explanation of ancient myths. However, he considered that what Freud had effected was of a different order: “What he has done is propound a new myth” (Wittgenstein 1966, 51).
In a similar vein, Paul Ricoeur, in conceding that the primal parricide depicted by Freud is constructed out of ethnological scraps “on the pattern of the fantasy deciphered by analysis” (Ricoeur 1970, 208), proposed that it, and indeed the entire edifice of Freud’s psychoanalytic theory, should itself be read as being essentially mythical rather than scientific. He thus argued that “one does psychoanalysis a service, not by defending its scientific myth as science, but by interpreting it as myth” (Ricoeur 1970, 20). This latter stratagem, with some variations, has subsequently been adopted by a number of other commentators who seek a mechanism to validate the Freudian cultural narrative in the face of its undeniable ethnological shortcomings (compare, for example, Paul, 1996). It is worth noting that Ricoeur’s conception of the mythic is complex, and occurs within the context of his construction of a religious hermeneutics that engages and intersects with the Freudian psychoanalytic one while seeking to go beyond it, a hermeneutics that regards myths not as fables, “but rather as the symbolic exploration of our relationship to beings and to Being” (Ricoeur 1970, 551). On such a view, the deficiencies presented by the Freudian narrative are read as being hermeneutic rather than scientific, open to further articulation and refinement through a more nuanced and balanced interpretation of the symbolic structure of religious discourse.
However, the hermeneutic construal of the Freudian enterprise is itself open to the charge that it fails utterly to acknowledge the over-arching importance attributed by Freud to his claim that psychoanalysis is to be properly regarded as a rigorous science of the mind and has been vigorously critiqued on those and related grounds by Adolf Grünbaum (1923—2018). For Grünbaum, the hermeneutic approach to Freud constitutes a serious distortion of its subject matter and is reflective of an objectionable scientophobia; rather immoderately, he accused it of having “all of the earmarks of an investigative cul-de-sac, a blind alley rather than a citadel for psychoanalytic apologetics” (Grünbaum 1984, 93). By contrast, he insisted on seeing psychoanalysis precisely as a testable theory, but one which is based upon clinical reports from therapeutic practice rather than rigorous experimentally-derived evidence. He pointed out that Freud, whom he considered “a sophisticated scientific methodologist” (ibid., 128), was fully aware of and highly sensitive to the question of the logic of the confirmation and disconfirmation of psychoanalytic interpretations, but contended that his utilization of the notion of consilience in that connection could not meet the demands of full scientific probity. Grünbaum accordingly came to view psychoanalysis as being based upon an inadequate conception of scientific confirmation; the clinical data ostensibly adduced in its favor from therapeutic sessions—which Ernest Jones had described as “the real basis” of psychoanalysis (Jones 1959, 1:3) —are, he argued, the products of a shared influence and are irremediably contaminated by suggestion on the part of the analyst. They cannot therefore properly be regarded as providing confirmatory evidence for the theory, while contemporary psychoanalysis has not met the objection that successful therapy operates as a placebo.
As we have seen, Freud’s transposition of the father complex from individual infantile development to the social order relied heavily on Haeckel’s thesis that ontogeny recapitulates phylogeny. The latter is now largely rejected by contemporary science, in particular the manner in which Freudians have adopted it to model the social evolution of human beings analogically with the psychological development of children. Further, it seems evident that Freud’s transposition is deeply problematic and leaves psychoanalysis unable to explain the wide variety of culturally determined personality structures which are demonstrated by contemporary empirical research. Freud’s commitment to Lamarckian evolutionary principles has, of course, also received significant critical comment from the scientific community (Slavet 2009, Ch. 2; Yerushalmi 1993, Ch. 2), though it must be noted that his account of acquired memory traces as being partly constitutive of Jewish identity in Moses and Monotheism owes as much to August Weissmann’s germ-plasma theory of inheritance as it does to Lamarckism (Slavet 2009, 28).
The entire enterprise of accounting for the origins of religion as an evolutionary trajectory from polytheism to monotheism has been challenged by the work of the ethnologist Father Wilhelm Schmidt (1868—1954), whose multi-volume Der Ursprung der Gottesidee (The Origin of the Idea of God; 1912—1955) is a wide-ranging study of primitive religion. In it Schmidt argued that the “original” tribal religion was almost invariably a form of primitive monotheism, focused on belief in a single benevolent creator god, with polytheistic religions featuring at a later stage of cultural development. Schmidt, who was influenced by Boas and his followers, was accordingly critical of evolutionist accounts of religious development, contending that they frequently lack solid grounding in the historical and anthropological evidence, and was dismissive on those grounds of the totemic theory propagated by Freud. It must be added that Freud was aware of Schmidt’s work and was less than impressed by its quality or its scientific impartiality. He saw Schmidt, whom he held partially responsible for the abolition of the journal Rivista italiana di Psicoanalisi in Italy, as an implacable enemy of psychoanalysis, who was motivated by a desire to undermine Freud’s account of the genesis of religion. Freud feared for a possible suppression of psychoanalysis in Vienna in the mid-1930s by the ruling Catholic authorities, with whom Schmidt had considerable influence. That fear, combined with hope—which proved unfortunately ill-grounded—that those authorities might function as a bulwark against the threat of Nazism, persuaded Freud to defer publication of the full text of Moses and Monotheism until after he had taken up residence in England (see Freud 1939, Prefatory Notes to Part 111), a fact which itself had a considerably negative effect on the literary coherence of the work. The substantive issue between Freud and Schmidt on the temporal primacy of polytheism or monotheism remains unresolved and is almost certainly irresolvable; as the theologian Hans Küng puts it, the scientific search for the primordial religion should be called off, as “neither the theory of degeneration from a lofty monotheistic beginning nor the evolutionary theory of a lower animistic or preanimistic beginning can be historically substantiated” (Küng 1990, 70).
It is instructive to compare Freud’s attempts to deal with the social dimension of religion with that of his near contemporary, the sociologist Émile Durkheim (1858—1917), whose study The Elementary Forms of Religious Life (1995; orig. 1912) has been highly influential, though it should not in any way be seen as a response to Freud. In The Elementary Forms Durkheim set himself the task of analyzing religion empirically as a social phenomenon, holding that such a treatment alone can reveal its true nature. For Durkheim, the social dimension of human life is primary; human individuality itself is largely determined by, and is a function of, social interaction and organization. This was a point missed by Freud, who, we have seen, sought to deal with the social dimension of religion by an extension of psychoanalytical principles from individual to group psychology. What Durkheim termed “social facts” play an important role in his analysis; they are the collective forces external to individuals which compel or influence them to act in particular ways. Such facts exist at the level of society as a whole and arise from social relationships and human associations, and include law, morality, contractual relationships and, perhaps most importantly, religion.
Durkheim defined religion as “a unified system of beliefs and practices relative to sacred things, that is to say, things set apart and forbidden—beliefs and practices which unite in one single moral community called a Church, all those who adhere to them” (Durkheim 1995, 44). He saw the connection between religious beliefs and practices as a necessary one; for him, religious experience is rooted more in the actions associated with rites than it is in reflective thought. Traditional accounts of religion have tended to treat religious beliefs as essentially hypothetical or quasi-scientific in nature—an approach clearly evident in Freud—which almost inevitably raises skeptical doubts about their validity, whereas Durkheim saw that what is important to the believer is the normative dimension of faith. The true function of religion is to deliver salvation by showing us how to live; as such, it originates in and receives legitimation from, moments of “general effervescence” (Durkheim 1995, 213), in which members of a group gather together to perform religious rituals. This often leads the participants into a state of psychological excitement resembling delirium, in which they come to feel transported into a higher level of existence where they make direct contact with the sacred object. Participation in such rituals has the effect of affirming and strengthening the collective identity of the group and must be renewed periodically in order to consolidate that identity.
Durkheim took pains to ensure that his use of terms like “delirium” in such contexts should not be misunderstood: the “delirium” associated with religious rituals is, he stressed, “well-founded” (Durkheim 1995, 228) in that it is produced by the operation of social factors that are both irreducibly real and crucially important. Given that it is a foundational postulate of sociology that no human institution rests upon an error or a lie, he declared it unscientific to suggest that systems of ideas of such complexity as religions could be delusory or be the product of illusion, as Freud was to do. In that clear functionalist sense, he concluded, all religions are true; “Fundamentally then, there are no religions that are false. All are true after their own fashion: All fulfil given conditions of human existence, though in different ways” (Durkheim 1995, 2).
This vindication of religion in general, however, has as its counterpart a commitment on Durkheim’s part to an account of the nature of sacred objects or gods which was no less egregiously projectionist than Freud’s. If it is impossible for religious belief, considered as a set of representations relating to the sacred, to be erroneous in its own social right, error can and does emerge, he argued, in the interpretation of what those representations mean, even within the framework of a particular culture. At that level, Durkheim conceded, false beliefs are the norm, because all collective representations are delusional and religion is merely a case in point in that regard: “The whole social world seems populated with forces that in reality exist only in our minds” (Durkheim 1995, 228), non-religious examples of which are the meanings attributed by people to flags, to blood and to humans themselves as a class of being. This point regarding the socially-imposed nature of the meanings associated with collective representations can perhaps be most clearly illustrated by reference to now-defunct cultures and religions. For example, while we readily recognize that the Moai, the deeply impressive monolithic statues of Easter Island, unquestionably had a particular political, aesthetic and religious significance for the Rapa Nui people who created them, the meaning of that symbolism largely escapes us—archeological and anthropological reconstruction aside—as we view them from a perspective external to that culture.
Durkheim contended that in a religious context, the sacred object, which is indeed greater than the individual, is nothing more or less than the power of society itself which, in order to be represented symbolically at all, has be objectified through a process of projection. Gods or sacred objects then, are “a figurative expression of … society” (Durkheim 1995, 227); they are society refined, idealized and apotheosized. As such, they represent a power beyond all individual humans, but are ultimately existentially interdependent with them: “while it is true that man is a dependent of his gods, this dependence is mutual. The gods also need man; without offerings and sacrifices, they would die” (Durkheim 1995, 36).
Durkheim’s treatment of religion, then, utilizes a methodology which offers a sharp contrast with Freud’s highly-individualistic, psychological approach to the subject, a contrast which highlights some of the sociological shortcomings of the latter. Unlike Freud, Durkheim also sought to provide an account of religion which achieves full scientific probity while simultaneously doing justice to the richness of the actual lived experiences of believers. Notwithstanding that, however, it seems clear that in the final analysis his anti-skeptical stratagem works satisfactorily only on its own, scientific terms; a believer could scarcely derive comfort from a view which legitimates his belief-system qua sociological fact while implying that the personal God of worship which is its intentional object is, in reality, nothing other than society personified.
This raises the whole question of the intellectual plausibility of the projection theory of religion. The question is a complex one, a fact which Freud scarcely acknowledges in his works. As we have seen, the theory, which has a number of related but distinct forms, arose in modernity as a response to the anthropomorphic nature of the attributes which the conceptualization of a personal God in many of the great world religions seems to necessitate. Freud, like Feuerbach, took this as entailing strict anthropotheistic consequences: Feuerbach’s argument reduced God to the essence of man, and Freud sought to go beyond him in offering a psychoanalytical explanation, in terms of the father complex, of why it is human beings have a need to hypostasize their own subjective nature. Belief in God, and the complex patterns of behavior and of rituals associated with that belief, he argued, arise essentially out of the deep psychological need for a Cosmic father.
However, it has been pointed out that such a view underestimates the logical gulf that exists between wishes and beliefs; the former may on occasion be a necessary condition for the latter, but are rarely a sufficient one: an athlete may wish to triumph in an event with every fibre of his being, but that will not necessarily generate a belief that he can do so, much less the delusion that he has done so. Thus, even if it is true that there is a universal wish for a Cosmic father, it is implausible to suggest that such a wish is a sufficient condition for religious belief and the complex practices and value systems associated with it (Kai-man Kwan 2006). Further, as Alvin Plantinga (1932—) argues, in the absence of compelling empirical evidence to support the view that such a universal wish exists, Freud was left with no option but to contend that such wishes are equally universally repressed into the unconscious, a move which opens his theory to the accusation of being empirically untestable (Plantinga 2000, 163).
It is to be noted too that concerns about anthropomorphisms in religious language are in no way restricted to religious skeptics: apophatic or negative theology, for example, grew out of recognition of the logical difficulties implicit in attempts to express the nature of the divine in language. As a result, theologians such as Maximus the Confessor (580—662), Johannes Scotus Eriugena (815—877) and—in Judaism—Maimonides (1138—1204) repudiated the positive attribution of characteristics to God in favour of “referencing” God exclusively in terms of what He is not, through the via negativa. It is also important to note that some proponents of the projection theory, such as Spinoza and possibly Xenophanes, saw the projection theory as invalidating only those forms of religious belief which are anthropotheistic in nature. Thus projectionism, so far from being hostile to all forms of religious belief and practice, is in fact consistent with themes relating to the avoidance of idolatry long central to the Abrahamic religions in particular, as evidenced in the proscription on naming God in Judaism and in aniconism, the prohibition of figurative representations of the Divine in the early Orthodox Church, in Calvinism and also in Islam (Thornton, 2015: 139-140).
It is thus perfectly consistent to accept projectionism as an account of religious concept formation without thereby repudiating religious belief. Indeed, the logical compatibility of projectionism with religious belief has led some contemporary religious thinkers to go so far as to embrace projectionism as a condition of a reflective religious commitment. The view that religious representations are products of the human imagination, it has been argued, can be accepted implicitly by believers, as the “mark of the Christian in the twilight of modernity is … trust in the faithfulness of the God who alone guarantees the conformity of our images to reality and who has given himself to us in forms that may only be grasped by imagination” (Green, 2000, 15). This argument is closely paralleled by a suggestion from Plantinga that wish-fulfillment as a mechanism could have arisen out of a divinely created human constitution. For while it may not, in general, be the function of wish-fulfillment to produce true belief, that in itself does not rule out the possibility, Plantinga contends—at least for those who believe in God—that humans have been so constituted by the creator to have a deeply-felt need and wish to believe in him. On this view, the very existence of the wish for a transcendent Father may be taken as evidence for the truth rather than the falsity of the beliefs which it inspires: “Perhaps God has designed us to know that he is present and loves us by way of creating us with a strong desire for him, a desire that leads to the belief that in fact he is there” (Plantinga 2000, 165).
Whatever level of plausibility may be assigned to these views, it is in any case clear that the projection theory is also reflective of the difficulties which certain forms of religious discourse generate: the characterization of God as possessing attributes such as Love and Wisdom, however qualified such attributions may be, seems invariably to invite the kind of challenge that is found in Feuerbach, Freud and even in Durkheim. In that sense, the projection theory highlights deep theological and philosophical issues relating to the nature and meaning of religious language. One of the more promising approaches to this issue is that suggested by the work of of Wittgenstein, who, in his Philosophical Investigations (1974), propounded his language-game theory of meaning, which argued that the meaning of any term is determined by its actual use in a living language-system. In that connection, he brought out the complex interplay of linguistic and non-linguistic activities and practices in human life, in a manner analogous to Durkheim’s functionalism. An application of this to religious discourse implies that the latter cannot be understood in isolation from the broad web of cultural practices, beliefs and concerns in which it is imbedded and from which it derives its meaning. This suggests that concerns that skeptical conclusions necessarily follow from our use of human-being predicates in speaking about the Divine are misguided; such concerns gain credence only when accompanied by the deeply pervasive, but uncritical, philosophical assumption—clearly evident in Freud—that the attributions of anthropomorphic predicates to God are to be understood exclusively as factual descriptions of a particular kind, an assumption which is at the very least gratuitous.
This point is made cryptically by Wittgenstein in an indirect allusion to the projection theory: “‘God’s Eye Sees Everything’—I want to say of this that it uses a picture.... [in saying this] I meant: what conclusions are you going to draw? etc. Are eyebrows going to be talked of, in connection with the Eye of God?” (Wittgenstein, 1966, 71). In other words, while in factual discourse references to human eyes have an internal relationship to references to human eyebrows, such that the occurrence of one may and frequently does give rise to the other, no such correlation is possible or necessary in religious discourse about God’s Eye (or Mercy, Anger, Love, and so forth). Thus while “God’s Eye Sees Everything” conjures up the image of a stern, judgmental all-seeing parental figure which, at one level, is amenable to the Freudian father-complex analysis, at another, arguably deeper, level it is clear that the web of relations that holds between the anthropomorphic terms used cannot meaningfully be compared with that which holds in factual discourse about earthly fathers; even the most literal-minded do not seek to speak of God’s eyebrows. The occurrence of anthropomorphisms in religious discourse, then, does not in itself necessitate the acceptance of anthropotheistic conclusions.
Moses and Monotheism is the most controversial of Freud’s works, seeking as it does to both utilize psychoanalytic theory to reinterpret key historical events and to embed psychoanalysis within a historiographical narrative. Not alone did it contest the orthodox Biblical narrative of the role of Moses in the history of Judaism, it did so at a time when the Jews of Europe were threatened with complete annihilation. It is unsurprising, then, that it should have become the subject of very strong criticism, on the grounds both of methodology and content; indeed, because its central account of the Egyptian origins of Judaic monotheism has seemed so egregiously at odds with both tradition and the historical evidence, much of the critical interest has focused on the question of Freud’s motives in propagating it. The Freudian narrative is, of course, problematic in the extreme when considered as a putative exegesis of the Exodus story; as one commentator puts it, “There is hardly any need to state that Moses and Monotheism does not operate at the level of an exegesis of the Old Testament and in no way satisfies the most elementary requirement of a hermeneutics adapted to a text” (Ricoeur 1970, 545). Though Moses is almost certainly an Egyptian name, the evidence that Moses was an Egyptian is not conclusive and it has also been suggested that his life was not in fact contemporaneous with that of Amenhotep IV (Banks 1973, 411). Freud’s willingness, towards the very end of his life, to construct such an apparently speculative narrative on the very origins of Judaism has long puzzled scholars, but it is possible to distinguish three broad exegetical approaches relating to the Moses text in the secondary literature:
- For much of his life Freud presented an image of himself to the world as an urbane, cosmopolitan intellectual, committed to the ideals of secular humanism and modern science, and at times that seemed to necessitate downplaying his Jewish background and education. Some scholars, such as Jones (1957) and, more recently Gay (1987), have accordingly represented the Moses text primarily as a critique of Judaism, a comprehensive application of the reductive analysis of religion offered in Freud’s earlier works to the religion of his forefathers. In a similar vein, Jan Assmann (1998) sees Freud as continuing the more general task, initiated by Baruch Spinoza (1632—1677), of combating monotheism and undoing the negative values, such as intolerance, religious hatred and the configuration of alternative religions as idolatrous, generated by the absolute conception of truth which monotheistic religions seem to require.
- The second approach, associated in particular with Yerushalmi (1993), Bernstein (1998) and Slavet (2009; 2010) repudiates what it sees as a confusion of meaning with motivation in the secondary literature regarding Freud’s text, stressing that what is of importance is what Freud sought to convey, not what motivated him to do so. While acknowledging the resonances within the text of personal factors operating in Freud’s life at the time of publication, such as his relationship with the memory of his father, the resurgence of antisemitism and the personal and professional threat presented by Nazism from which he so narrowly escaped, this approach rejects any autobiographical interpretation of the text, focusing instead on Freud’s account of the nature of the Jewish religion and the factors which constitute and determine Jewish identity. Thus Bernstein sees in Freud’s Moses text a powerful new account of religion in general and of Judaism in particular, centering on the idea that a religious tradition derives its dynamic from a complex interplay of conscious and unconscious forces. Slavet attributes to Freud a racial theory of memory and sees Moses and Monotheism as “the culmination of a lifetime spent investigating the relationships between memory and its rivals: heredity, history, and fiction” (Slavet 2009, 7) in the context of the question of “Jewishness.” On this view, Freud sought to show that the advancement of intellectualized spirituality (Geistigkeit) has been the most important part of the legacy of Judaic monotheism, but that this owed as much to the working out of collective trauma, the return of the repressed, as it did to the conscious influence of the patriarchs and prophets.
- Finally, there is the semi-autobiographical approach, largely taken in this article, which sees the text as primarily concerned with the long-standing problem for Freud of resolving his personal father complex. That, in psychoanalytical terms, amounted to the implementation of an instance of “deferred obedience” by defining in a positive way his relationship with the religion into which he was born, albeit with an emphasis on the human origins of the Judaic ethic (Rice 1990; Gresser 1994; Friedman 1998).
In a thinker as complex as Freud, these approaches can neither be taken as exhaustive nor as entirely mutually exclusive, as significant textual evidence can be invoked for all three. What seems evident, at any rate, is that Freud was seeking, at that critical point in Jewish history, to affirm his cultural and intellectual indebtedness to the ethical basis of the religion of his forefathers while simultaneously seeking to demonstrate that the validity of that ethic is not contingent upon the Biblical and theological accretions traditionally associated with it. On such a reading, the question of the accuracy of the historical detail in the Freudian narrative becomes as peripheral as it is—on a non-literal interpretation—to that of the Biblical one. The import of the book, as Friedman puts it, may reside ultimately in a purpose which can certainly be discerned in it: to preserve Judaism and articulate Freud’s own Jewish identity at a stage in a historical process in which his people come to progress from worship of a transcendent God “to the rational and self-conscious appreciation of themselves as a people of great accomplishment descended from a great but human leader” (Friedman 1998, 139).
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Mary Immaculate College, University of Limerick