Thomas S. Kuhn (1922—1996)
Thomas Samuel Kuhn, although trained as a physicist at Harvard University, became an historian and philosopher of science through the support of Harvard’s president, James Conant. In 1962, Kuhn’s renowned The Structure of Scientific Revolutions (Structure) helped to inaugurate a revolution—the 1960s historiographic revolution—by providing a new image of science. For Kuhn, scientific revolutions involved paradigm shifts that punctuated periods of stasis or normal science. Towards the end of his career, however, Kuhn underwent a paradigm shift of his own—from a historical philosophy of science to an evolutionary one.
In this article, Kuhn’s philosophy of science is reconstructed chronologically. To that end, the following questions are entertained: What was Kuhn’s early life and career? What was the road towards Structure? What is Structure? Why did Kuhn revise Structure? What was the road Kuhn took after Structure? At the heart of the answers to these questions is the person of Kuhn himself, especially the intellectual and social context in which he practiced his trade. This chronological reconstruction of Kuhn’s philosophy begins with his work in the 1950s on physical theory in the Lowell lectures and on the Copernican revolution and ends with his work in the 1990s on an evolutionary philosophy of science. Rather than present Kuhn’s philosophy as a finished product, this approach endeavors to capture it in the process of its formation so as to represent it accurately and faithfully.
Table of Contents
- Early Life and Career
- The Road to Structure
- The Structure of Scientific Revolutions
- The Road after Structure
- References and Further Reading
Kuhn was born in Cincinnati, Ohio, on 18 July 1922. He was the first of two children born to Samuel L. and Minette (neè Stroock) Kuhn, with a brother Roger born several years later. His father was a native Cincinnatian and his mother a native New Yorker. Kuhn’s father, Sam, was a hydraulic engineer, trained at Harvard University and at Massachusetts Institute of Technology (MIT) prior to World War I. He entered the war, and served in the Army Corps of Engineers. After leaving the armed services, Sam returned to Cincinnati for several years before moving to New York to help his recently widowed mother Setty (neè Swartz) Kuhn. Kuhn’s mother, Minette, was a liberally educated person who came from an affluent family.
Kuhn’s early education reflected the family’s liberal progressiveness. In 1927, Kuhn began schooling at the progressive Lincoln School in Manhattan. His early education taught him to think independently, but by his own admission, there was little content to the thinking. He remembered that by the second grade, for instance, he was unable to read proficiently, much to the consternation of his parents.
Beginning in the sixth grade, Kuhn’s family moved to Croton-on-Hudson, a small town about fifty miles from Manhattan, and the adolescent Kuhn attended the progressive Hessian Hills School. According to Kuhn the school was staffed by left-oriented radical teachers, who taught the students pacifism. When he left the school after the ninth grade, Kuhn felt he was a bright and independent thinker. After spending an uninspired year at the preparatory school Solebury in Pennsylvania, Kuhn spent his last two years of high school at the Yale-preparatory Taft School in Watertown, Connecticut. He graduated third in his class of 105 students and was inducted into the National Honor Society. He also received the prestigious Rensselaer Alumni Association Medal.
Kuhn matriculated to Harvard College in the fall of 1940, following his father’s and uncles’ footsteps. At Harvard, he acquired a better sense of himself socially by participating in various organizations. During his first year, Kuhn took a yearlong philosophy course. In the first semester, he studied Plato and Aristotle; while in the second semester, he studied Descartes, Spinoza, Hume, and Kant. He intended to take additional philosophy courses but could not find time. He attended, however, several of George Sarton’s lectures on the history of science, but he found them boring.
At Harvard, Kuhn agonized over majoring in either physics or mathematics. After seeking his father’s counsel, he chose physics because of career opportunities. Interestingly, the attraction of physics or mathematics was their problem-solving traditions. In the fall of his sophomore year, the Japanese attacked Pearl Harbor and Kuhn expedited his undergraduate education by going to summer school. The physics department focused on teaching predominantly electronics, and Kuhn followed suit.
Kuhn underwent another radical transformation, also during his sophomore year. Although he was trained a pacifist the atrocities perpetrated in Europe during World War II, especially by Hitler, horrified him. Kuhn experienced a crisis, since he was unable to defend pacifism reasonably. The outcome was that he became an interventionist, which was the position of many at Harvard—especially its president, Conant. The episode left a lasting impact upon him. In a Harvard Crimson editorial, Kuhn supported Conant’s effort to militarize the universities in the United States. The editorial came to the attention of the administration, and eventually Conant and Kuhn met.
In the spring of 1943, Kuhn graduated summa cum laude from Harvard College with an S.B. After graduation, he worked for the Radio Research Laboratory located in Harvard’s biology building. He conducted research on radar counter technology, under John van Vleck’s supervision. The job procured for Kuhn a deferment from the draft. After a year, he requested a transfer to England and then to the continent, where he worked in association with the U.S. Office of Scientific Research and Development. The trip was Kuhn’s first abroad and he felt invigorated by the experience. However, Kuhn realized that he did not like radar work, which led him to reconsider whether he wanted to continue as a physicist. But, these doubts did not dampen his enthusiasm for or belief in science. During this time, Kuhn had the opportunity to read what he wanted; he read in the philosophy of science, including authors such as Bertrand Russell, P.W. Bridgman, Rudolf Carnap, and Philipp Frank.
After V.E. day in 1945, Kuhn returned to Harvard. As the war abated with the dropping of atomic bombs on Japan, Kuhn activated an earlier acceptance into graduate school and began studies in the physics department. Although Kuhn persuaded the department to permit him to take philosophy courses during his first year, he again chose the pragmatic course and focused on physics. In 1946, Kuhn passed the general examinations and received a master’s degree in physics. He then began dissertation research on theoretical solid-state physics, under the direction of van Vleck. In 1949, Harvard awarded Kuhn a doctorate in physics.
Although Kuhn had high regard for science, especially physics, he was unfulfilled as a physicist and continually harbored doubts during graduate school about a career in physics. He had chosen both a dissertation topic and an advisor to expedite obtaining a degree. But, he was to find direction for his career through Conant’s invitation in 1947 to help prepare a historical case-based course on science for upper-level undergraduates. Kuhn accepted the invitation to be one of two assistants for Conant’s course. He undertook a project investigating the origins of seventeenth-century mechanics, a project that would transform his image of science.
That transformation came, as Kuhn recounted later, on a summer day in 1947 as he struggled to understand Aristotle’s idea of motion in Physics. The problem was that Kuhn tried to make sense of Aristotle’s idea of motion using Newtonian assumptions and categories of motion. Once he realized that he had to read Aristotle’s Physics using assumptions and categories contemporary to when the Greek philosopher wrote it, suddenly Aristotle’s idea of motion made sense.
After this experience, Kuhn realized that he wanted to be a philosopher of science by doing history of science. His interest was not strictly history of science but philosophy, for he felt that philosophy was the way to truth and truth was what he was after. To achieve that goal, Kuhn asked Conant to sponsor him as a junior fellow in the Harvard Society of Fellows. Harvard initiated the society to provide promising young scholars freedom from teaching for three years to develop a scholarly program. Kuhn’s colleagues stimulated him professionally, especially a senior fellow by the name of Willard Quine. At the time, Quine was publishing his critique on the distinction between the analytic and the synthetic, which Kuhn found reassuring for his own thinking.
Kuhn began as a fellow in the fall of 1948, which provided him the opportunity to retool as a historian of science. Kuhn took advantage of the opportunity and read widely over the next year and a half in the humanities and sciences. Just prior to his appointment as a fellow, Kuhn was also undergoing psychoanalysis. This experience allowed him to see other people’s perspectives and contributed to his approach for conducting historical research.
In 1950, the trustee of the Lowell Institute, Ralph Lowell, invited Kuhn to deliver the 1951 Lowell lectures. In these lectures, Kuhn outlined a conception of science in contrast to the traditional philosophy of science’s conception in which facts are slowly accumulated and stockpiled in textbooks. Kuhn began by assuring his audience that he, as a once practicing scientist, believed that science produces useful and cumulative knowledge of the world, but that traditional analysis of science distorts the process by which scientific knowledge develops. He went on to inform the audience that the history of science could be instructive for identifying the process by which creative science advances, rather than focusing on the finished product promulgated in textbooks. Because textbooks only state the immutable scientific laws and marshal forth the experimental evidence to support those laws, they cover over the creative process that leads to the laws in the first place.
Kuhn then presented an alternative historical approach to scientific methodology. He claimed that the traditional position in which Galileo rejected Aristotle’s physics because of Galileo’s experiments is a fallacy. Rather, Galileo rejected Aristotelianism as an entire system. In other words, Galileo’s evidence was necessary but not sufficient; rather, the Aristotelian system was under evaluation, which also included its logic. Next, Kuhn proposed an alternative image of science based on the new approach to the history of science. He introduced the notion of conceptual frameworks, and drew from psychology to defend the advancement of science though scientists’ predispositions. These predispositions allow scientists to negotiate a professional world and to learn from their experiences. Moreover, they are important in organizing the scientist’s professional world and scientists do not dispense with them easily. Change in them represents a foundational alteration in a professional world.
Kuhn argued that although logic is important for deriving meaning and for managing and manipulating knowledge, scientific language—as natural—outstrips such formalization. He upended the tables on an important tool for the traditional analysis of science. By revealing the limitations of logical analysis, he showed that logic is necessary but insufficient for justifying scientific knowledge. Logic, then, cannot guarantee the traditional image of science as the progressive accumulation of scientific facts. Kuhn next examined logical analysis in terms of language and meaning. His position was that language is a way of dissecting the professional world in which scientists operate. But, there is always ambiguity or overlap in the meaning of terms as that world is dissected. Certainly, scientists attempt to increase the precision of their terms but not to the point that they can eliminate ambiguity. Kuhn concluded by distinguishing between creative and textbook science.
In the same year of the Lowell lectures, Harvard appointed Kuhn as an instructor and the following year as an assistant professor. Kuhn’s primary teaching duty was in the general education curriculum, where he taught Natural Sciences 4 along with Leonard Nash. He also taught courses in the history of science. And, it was during this time that Kuhn developed a course on the history of cosmology. Kuhn utilized course preparation for scholarly writing projects. For example, he handed out draft chapters of The Copernican Revolution to his classes.
A part of Kuhn’s motivation for developing a new image of science was the misconceptions of science held by the public. He blamed its misconceptions on introductory courses that stressed the textbook image of science as a fixed body of facts. After discussing this state of affairs with friends and Conant, Kuhn provided students with a more accurate image of science. The key to that image, claimed Kuhn, was science’s history, which displays the creative and dynamic nature of science.
In The Copernican Revolution, Kuhn claimed he had identified an important feature of the revolution, which previous scholars had missed: its plurality. What Kuhn meant by plurality was that scientists have philosophical and even religious commitments, which are important for the justification of scientific knowledge. This stance was anathema to traditional philosophers of science, who believed that such commitments played little—if any—role in the justification of scientific knowledge and relegated them to the discovery process.
Kuhn began reconstruction of the Copernican revolution by establishing the genuine scientific character of ancient cosmological conceptual schemes, especially the two-sphere cosmology composed of an inner sphere for the earth and an outer sphere for the heavens. For Kuhn, conceptual schemes exhibit three important features. They are comprehensive in terms of scientific predictions, there is no final proof for them, and they are derived from other schemes. Finally, to be successful conceptual schemes must perform logical and psychological functions. The logical function is expressed in explanatory terms, while the psychological function in existential terms. Although the logical function of the two-sphere cosmology continued to be problematic, its psychological function afforded adherents a comprehensive worldview that included even religious elements.
The major logical problem with the two-sphere cosmology was the movement and positions of the planets. The conceptual scheme Ptolemy developed in the second century guided research for the next millennium. But, problems surfaced with the scheme and predecessors could only correct it so far with ad hoc modifications. Kuhn asked at this point in the narrative why the Ptolemaic system, given its imperfection, was not overthrown sooner. The answer, for Kuhn, depended on a distinction between the logical and psychological dimensions of scientific revolutions. According to Kuhn, there are logically different conceptual schemes that can organize and account for observations. The difference among these schemes is their predictive power. Consequently, if an observation is made that is not compatible with a prediction the scheme must be replaced. But, before change can occur, there is also the psychological dimension to a revolution.
Copernicus had to overcome not only the logical dimension of the Ptolemaic system but also its psychological dimension. Aristotle had established this latter dimension by wedding the two-sphere cosmology to a philosophical system. Through the Aristotelian notion of motion among the earthly and heavenly spheres, the inner sphere was connected and depended on the outer sphere. The ability to presage future events linked astronomy to astrology. Such an alliance, according to Kuhn, provided a formidable obstacle to change of any kind.
But change began to take place, albeit slowly. From Aristotle to Ptolemy, a sharp distinction arose between the psychological dimensions of cosmology and the mathematical precision of astronomy. By Ptolemy’s time, astronomy was less concerned with the psychological dimensions of data interpretation and more with the accuracy of theoretical prediction. To some extent, this aided Copernicus, since whether the earth moved could be determined by theoretical analysis of the empirical data. But still, the earth as center of the universe gave existential consolation to people. The strands of the Copernican revolution, then, included not only astronomical concerns but also theological, economic, and social ones. Besides the Scholastic tradition, with its impetus theory of motion, other factors also paved the way for the Copernican revolution, including the Protestant revolution, navigation for oceanic voyages, calendar reform, and Renaissance humanism and Neoplatonism.
Copernicus, according to Kuhn, was the immediate inheritor of Aristotelian-Ptolemaic cosmological tradition and, except for the position of the earth, was closer to that tradition than to modern astronomy. For Kuhn, De Revolutionibus precipitated a revolution and was not the revolution itself. Although the problem Copernicus addressed was the same as for his predecessors, that is, planetary motion, his solution was to revise the mathematical model for that motion by making the earth a planet that moves around the sun. Essentially, Copernicus maintained the Aristotelian-Ptolemaic universe but exchanged the sun for the earth, as the universe’s center. Although Copernicus had eliminated major epicycles, he still used minor ones and the accuracy of planetary position was no better than Ptolemy’s. Kuhn concluded that Copernicus did not really solve the problem of planetary motion.
Initially, according to Kuhn, there were only a few supporters of Copernicus’ cosmology. Although the majority of astronomers accepted the mathematical harmonies of De Revolutionibus after its publication in 1543, they rejected or ignored its cosmology. Tycho Brahe, for example, although relying on Copernican harmonies to explain astronomical data, proposed a system in which the earth was still the universe’s center. Essentially, it was a compromise between ancient cosmology and Copernican mathematical astronomy. However, Brahe recorded accurate and precise astronomical observations, which helped to compel others towards Copernicanism—particularly Johannes Kepler, who used its mathematical precision to solve the planetary motion problem. The final player Kuhn considered in the revolution was Galileo, who, Kuhn claimed, provided through telescopic observations not proof of but rather propaganda for Copernicanism.
Although astronomers achieved consensus during the seventeenth century, Copernicanism still faced serious resistance from Christianity. The Copernican revolution was completed with the Newtonian universe, which not only had an impact on astronomy but also on other sciences and even non-sciences. For instance, Newton’s universe changed the nature of God to that of a clockmaker. For Kuhn, Newtonian’s impact on disciplines other than astronomy was an example of its fruitfulness. Scientific progress, concluded Kuhn, is not the linear process, as championed by traditional philosophers of science, in which scientific facts are stockpiled in a warehouse. Rather, it is the repeated destruction and replacement of scientific theories.
The professional reviews of The Copernican Revolution signaled Kuhn’s acceptance into the philosophical and historical communities. His reconstruction of the revolution was considered for the most part scientifically accurate and methodologically appropriate. Reviewers considered integration of the science and the social an advance over other histories that ignored these dimensions of the historical narrative. Although philosophers appreciated the historical dimension of Kuhn’s study, they found its analysis imprecise according to their standards. Overall, both the historical and philosophical communities expressed no major objections to the image of science that animated Kuhn’s narrative.
Kuhn’s reconstruction of the Copernican revolution portrayed a radically different image of science than that of traditional philosophers of science. Justification of scientific knowledge was not simply a logical or objective affair but also included non-logical or subjective factors. According to Kuhn, scientific progress is not a clear-sighted linear process aimed directly at the truth. Rather, there are contingencies that can divert and forestall the progress of science. Moreover, Copernicus’ revolution changed the way astronomers and non-astronomers viewed the world. This change in perceiving the world was the result of new sets of challenges, new techniques, and a new hermeneutics for interpreting data.
Besides differing from traditional philosophers of science, Kuhn’s image of science put him at odds with Whig historians of science. These historians underrated ancient cosmologies by degrading them to myth or religious belief. Such a move was often a rhetorical ploy on the part of the victors to enhance the status of the current scientific theory. Only by showing how Aristotelian-Ptolemaic geocentric astronomy was authentic science could Kuhn argue for the radical transformation (revolution) that Copernican heliocentric astronomy invoked. Kuhn also asserted that Copernicus’ theory was not accepted simply for its predictive ability, since it was not as accurate as the original conceptual scheme, but because of non-empirical factors, such as the simplicity of Copernican’s system in which certain ad hoc modifications for accounting for the orbits of various planets were eliminated.
In 1956, Harvard denied Kuhn tenure because the tenure committee felt his book on the Copernican revolution was too popular in its approach and analysis. A friend of Kuhn knew Steven Pepper, who was chair of the philosophy department at the University of California at Berkeley. Kuhn’s friend told Pepper that Kuhn was looking for an academic position. Pepper’s department was searching for someone to establish a program in the history and philosophy of science. Berkeley eventually offered Kuhn a position in the philosophy department and later asked if he also wanted an appointment in the history department. Kuhn accepted both positions and joined the Berkeley faculty as an assistant professor.
Kuhn found Stanley Cavell in the philosophy department, a soulmate to replace Nash. Kuhn had meet Cavell earlier while they were both fellows at Harvard. Cavell was an ethicist and aesthetician, whom Kuhn found intellectually stimulating. He introduced Kuhn to Wittgenstein’s notion of language games. Besides Cavell, Kuhn developed a professional relationship with Paul Feyerabend, who was also working on the notion of incommensurability.
In 1958, Berkeley promoted Kuhn to associate professor and granted him tenure. Moreover, having completed several historical projects, he was ready to return to the philosophical issues that first attracted him to the history of science. Beginning in the fall of 1958, he spent a year as a fellow at the Center for Advanced Study in the Behavioral Sciences at Stanford, California. What struck Kuhn about the relationships among behavioral and social scientists was their inability to agree on the fundamental problems and practices of their discipline. Although natural scientists do not necessarily have the right answers to their questions, there is an agreement over fundamentals. This difference between natural and social scientists eventually led Kuhn to formulate the paradigm concept.
Although The Copernican Revolution represented a significant advance in Kuhn’s articulation of a revolutionary theory of science, several issues still needed attention. What was missing from Kuhn’s reconstruction of the Copernican revolution was an understanding of how scientists function on a daily basis, when an impending revolution is not looming. That understanding emerged gradually during the last mile on the road to Structure in terms of three papers written from the mid-fifties to the early sixties.
In the first paper, ‘The function of measurement in modern physical science’, Kuhn challenged the belief that if scientists cannot measure a phenomenon then their knowledge of it is inadequate or not scientific. Part of the reason for Kuhn’s concern over measurement in science was its textbook tradition, which he believed perpetuates a myth about measurement that is misleading. Kuhn compared the textbook presentation of measurement to a machine in which scientists feed laws and theories along with initial conditions into the machine’s hopper at the top, turn a handle on the side representing logical and mathematical operations, and then collect numerical predictions exiting the machine’s chute in the front. Scientists finally compare experimental observations to theoretical predictions. The function of these measurements serves as a test of the theory, which is the confirmation function of measurement.
Kuhn claimed that the above function is not why measurements are reported in textbooks; rather, measurements are reported to give the reader an idea of what the professional community believes is reasonable agreement between theoretical predictions and experimental observations. Reasonable agreement, however, depends upon approximate, not exact, agreement between theory and data and differs from one science to the next. Moreover, external criteria do not exist for determining reasonableness. For Kuhn, the actual function of normal measurement in science is found in its journal articles. That function is neither invention of novel theories nor the confirmation of older ones. Discovery and exploratory measurements in science instead are rare. The reason is that changes in theories, which require discovery or confirmation, occur during revolutions, which are also quite rare. Once a revolution occurs, moreover, the new theory only exhibits potential for ordering and explaining natural phenomena. The function of normal measurement is to tighten reasonable agreement between novel theoretical predictions and experimental observations.
The textbook tradition is also misleading in terms of normal measurement’s effects. It claims that theories must conform to quantitative facts. Such facts are not the given but the expected and the scientist’s task is to obtain them. This obligation to obtain the expected quantitative fact is often the incentive for developing novel technology. Moreover, a well-developed theoretical system is required for meaningful measurement in science. Besides the function of normal or expected measurement, Kuhn also examined the function of extraordinary measurement—which pertain to unexpected results. It is this latter type of measurement that exhibits the discovery and confirmatory functions. When normal scientific practice results consistently in unexpected anomalies, this leads to crisis, and extraordinary measurement often aids to resolve it. Crisis then leads to the invention of new theories. Again, extraordinary measurement plays a critical role in this process. Theory invention in response to quantitative anomalies leads to decisive measurements for judging a novel theory’s adequacy, whereas qualitative anomalies generally lead to ad hoc modifications of theories. Extraordinary measurement allows scientists to choose among competing theories.
Kuhn was moving closer towards a notion of normal science through an analysis of normal measurement, in contrast to extraordinary measurement, in science. His conception of science continued to distance him from traditional philosophers of science. But, the notion of normal measurement was not as robust as he needed. Importantly, Kuhn was changing the agenda for philosophy of science from justification of scientific theories as finished products in textbooks to dynamic process by which theories are tested and assimilated into the professional literature. A robust notion of normal science was the revolutionary concept he needed, to overturn the traditional image of science as an accumulated body of facts.
With the introduction of normal and extraordinary measurement, the step towards the notions of normal and extraordinary science in Kuhn’s revolutionary image of science was imminent. Kuhn worked out those notions in The Essential Tension. He began by addressing the notion that creative thinking in science assumes a particular assumption of science in which science advances through unbridled imagination and divergent thinking—which involves identifying multiple avenues by which to solve a problem and determining which one works best. Kuhn acknowledged that such thinking is responsible for some scientific progress, but he proposed that convergent thinking—which limits itself to well-defined, often logical, steps for solving a problem—is also an important means of progress. While revolutions, which depend on divergent thinking, are an obvious means for scientific progress, Kuhn insisted that few scientists consciously design revolutionary experiments. Rather, most scientists engage in normal research, which represents convergent thinking. But, occasionally scientists may break with the tradition of normal science and replace it with a new tradition. Science, as a profession, is both traditional and iconoclastic, and the tension between them often creates a space in which to practice it.
Next, Kuhn utilized the term paradigm, while discussing the pedagogical advantages of convergent thinking—especially as displayed in science textbooks. Whereas textbooks in other disciplines include the methodological and conceptual conflicts prevalent within the discipline, science textbooks do not. Rather, science education is the transmission of a tradition that guides the activities of practitioners. In science education, students are taught not to evaluate the tradition but to accept it.
Progress within normal research projects represents attempts to bring theory and observation into closer agreement and to extend a theory’s scope to new phenomena. Given the convergent and tradition-bound nature of science education and of scientific practice, how can normal research be a means for the generation of revolutionary knowledge and technology? According to Kuhn, a mature science provides the background that allows practitioners to identify non-trivial problems or anomalies with a paradigm. In other words, without mature science there can be no revolution.
Kuhn continued to develop the notion of normal research and its convergent thinking in ‘The function of dogma in scientific research’. He began with the traditional image of science as an objective and critical enterprise. Although this is the ideal, the reality is that often scientists already know what to expect from their investigations of natural phenomena. If the expected is not forthcoming, then scientists must struggle to find conformity between what they expect and what they observe, which textbooks encode as dogmas. Dogmas are critical for the practice of normal science and for advancement in it because they define the puzzles for the profession and stipulate the criteria for their solution.
Kuhn next expanded the range of paradigms to embrace scientific practice in general, rather than simply as a model for research. Specifically, paradigms include not only a community’s previous scientific achievements but also its theoretical concepts, the experimental techniques and protocols, and even the natural entities. In short, they are the community’s body of beliefs or foundations. Paradigms are also open-ended in terms of solving problems. Moreover, they are exclusive in their nature, in that there is only one paradigm per mature science. Finally, they are not permanent fixtures of the scientific landscape, for eventually paradigms are replaceable. Importantly, for Kuhn, when a paradigm replaces another the two paradigms are radically different.
Having done paradigmatic spadework, Kuhn then discussed the notion of normal scientific research. The process of matching paradigm and nature includes extending and applying the paradigm to expected but also unexpected parts of nature. This does not necessarily mean discovering the unknown as it does explaining the known. Although the dogma paper is only a fragment of the solution to problems associated with the traditional image of science, the complete solution was soon to appear in Structure.
In July 1961, Kuhn completed a draft of Structure; and in 1962, it was published as the final monograph in the second volume of Neurath’s International Encyclopedia of Unified Science. Charles Morris was instrumental in its publication and Carnap served as its editor. Structure was not a single publishing event in 1962; rather, it covered the years from 1962 to 1970. After its publication, Kuhn was engrossed for the rest of the sixties addressing criticisms directed to the ideas contained in it, especially the paradigm concept. During this time, he continued to develop and refine his new image of science. The endpoint was a second edition of Structure that appeared in 1970. The text of the revised edition, however, remained essentially unaltered and only a ‘Postscript—1969’ was added in which Kuhn addressed his critics.
What Kuhn proposed in Structure was a new image of science. That image differed radically from the traditional one. The difference hinged on a shift from a logical analysis and an explanation of scientific knowledge as finished product to a historical narration and description of scientific practices by which a community of practitioners produces scientific knowledge. In short, it was a shift from the subject (the product) to the verb (to produce).
According to the traditional image, science is a repository of accumulated facts, discovered by individuals at specific periods in history. One of the central tasks of traditional historians, given this image of science, was to answer questions about who discovered what and when. Even though the task seemed straightforward, many historians found it difficult and doubted whether these were the right kinds of questions to ask concerning science’s historical record. The historiographic revolution in the study of science changed the sorts of questions historians asked by revising the underlying assumptions concerning the approach to reading the historical record. Rather than reading history backwards and imposing current ideas and values on the past, texts are read within their historical context thereby maintaining their integrity. The historiographic revolution also had implications for how to analyze and understand science philosophically. The goal of Structure, declared Kuhn, was to cash out those implications.
The structure of scientific development, according to Kuhn, may be illustrated schematically, as follows: pre-paradigm science → normal science → extraordinary science → new normal science. The step from pre-paradigm science to normal science involves consensus of the community around a single paradigm, where no prior consensus existed. This is the step required for transitioning from immature to mature science. The step from normal science to extraordinary science includes the community’s recognition that the reigning paradigm is unable to account for accumulating anomalies. A crisis ensues, and community practitioners engage in extraordinary science to resolve its anomalies. A scientific revolution occurs with crisis resolution. Once a community selects a new paradigm, it discards the old one and another period of new normal science follows. The revolution or paradigm shift is now complete, and the cycle from normal science to new normal science through revolution is free to occur again.
For Kuhn, the origin of a scientific discipline begins with the identification of a natural phenomenon, which members of the discipline investigate experimentally and attempt to explain theoretically. But, each member of that nascent discipline is at cross-purposes with other members; for each member often represents a school working from different foundations. Scientists, operating under these conditions, share few, if any, theoretical concepts, experimental techniques, or phenomenal entities. Rather, each school is in competition for monetary and social resources and for the allegiance of the professional guild. An outcome of this lack of consensus is that all facts seem equally relevant to the problem(s) at hand and fact gathering itself is often a random activity. There is then a proliferation of facts and hence little progress in solving the problem(s) under these conditions. Kuhn called this state pre-paradigm or immature science, which is non-directed and flexible, providing a community of practitioners little guidance.
To achieve the status of a science, a discipline must reach consensus with respect to a single paradigm. This is realized when, during the competition involved in pre-paradigm science, one school makes a stunning achievement that catches the professional community’s attention. The candidate paradigm elicits the community’s confidence that the problems are solvable with precision and in detail. The community’s confidence in a paradigm to guide research is the basis for the conversion of its members, who now commit to it. After paradigm consensus, Kuhn claimed that scientists are in the position to commence with the practice of normal science. The prerequisite of normal science then includes a commitment to a shared paradigm that defines the rules and standards by which to practice science. Whereas pre-paradigm science is non-directed and flexible, normal or paradigm science is highly directed and rigid. Because of its directedness and rigidity, normal scientists are able to make the progress they do.
The paradigm concept loomed large in Kuhn’s new image of science. He defined the concept in terms of the community’s concrete achievements, such as Newtonian mechanics, which the professional can commonly recognize but cannot fully describe or explain. A paradigm is certainly not just a set of rules or algorithms by which scientists blindly practice their trade. In fact, there is no easy way to abstract a paradigm’s essence or to define its features exhaustively. Moreover, a paradigm defines a family resemblance, à la Wittgenstein, of problems and procedures for solving problems that are part of a single research tradition.
Although scientists rely, at times, on rules to guide research, these rules do not precede paradigms. Importantly, Kuhn was not claiming that rules are unnecessary for guiding research but rather that they are not always sufficient, either pedagogically or professionally. Kuhn compared the paradigm concept to Polanyi’s notion of tacit knowledge, in which knowledge production depends on the investigator’s acquisition of skills that do not reduce to methodological rules and protocols.
As noted above, Newtonian mechanics represents an example of a Kuhnian paradigm. The three laws of motion comprising it provided the scientific community with the resources to investigate natural phenomena in terms of both precision and predictability. In terms of precision, Newtonian mechanics allowed physicists to measure and explain accurately—with clockwork exactitude—the motion not only of celestial but also terrestrial bodies. With respect to prediction, physicists used the Newtonian paradigm to determine the potential movement of heavenly and earthly bodies. Thus, Newtonian mechanics qua paradigm equipped physicists with the ability to explain and manipulate natural phenomena. In sum, it became a way of viewing the world.
According to Kuhn, a paradigm allows scientists to ignore concerns over a discipline’s fundamentals and to concentrate on solving its puzzles—as the Newtonian paradigm permitted physicists to do for several centuries. It not only guides scientists in terms of identifying soluble puzzles, but it also prevents scientists from tackling insoluble ones. Kuhn compared paradigms to maps that guide and direct the community’s investigations. Only when a paradigm guides the community’s activities is scientific advancement as cumulative progress possible.
The activity of practitioners engaged in normal science is paradigm articulation and extension to new areas. Indeed, the Newtonian paradigm was adapted even for medicine. When a new paradigm is established, it solves only a few critical problems that faced the community. But, it does offer the promise for solving many more problems. Much of normal science involves mopping up, in which the community forces nature into a conceptually rigid framework—the paradigm. Rather than being dull and routine, however, such activity, according to Kuhn, is exciting and rewarding and requires practitioners who are creative and resourceful.
Normal scientists are not out to make new discoveries or to invent new theories, outside the paradigm’s aegis. Rather, they are involved in using the paradigm to understand nature precisely and in detail. From the experimental end of this task, normal scientists go to great pains to increase the precision and reliability of their measurements and facts. They are also involved in closing the gap between observations and theoretical predictions, and they attempt to clarify ambiguities left over from the paradigm’s initial adoption. They also strive to extend the scope of the paradigm by including phenomena not heretofore investigated. Much of this activity requires exploratory investigation, in which normal scientists make novel discoveries but anticipated vis-à-vis the paradigm. To solve these experimental puzzles often requires considerable technological ingenuity and innovation on the part of the scientific community. As Kuhn notes, Atwood’s machine—developed almost a century after Newton, is a good illustration of this.
Besides experimental puzzles, there are also the theoretical puzzles of normal science, which obviously mirror the types of experimental puzzles. Normal scientists conduct theoretical analyses to enhance the match between theoretical predictions and experimental observations, especially in terms of increasing the paradigm’s precision and scope. Again, just as experimental ingenuity is required so is theoretical ingenuity to explain natural phenomena successfully.
Normal science, according to Kuhn, is puzzle-solving activity, and its practitioners are puzzle solvers and not paradigm testers. The paradigm’s power over a community of practitioners is that it can transform seemingly insoluble problems into soluble ones through the practitioner’s ingenuity and skill. Besides the assured solution, Kuhn’s paradigm concept also involved rules of the puzzle-solving game not in a narrow sense of algorithms but in a broad sense of viewpoints or preconceptions. Besides these rules of the game, as it were, there are also metaphysical commitments, which inform the community as to the types of natural entities, and methodological commitments, which inform the community as to kinds of laws and explanations. Although rules are often necessary for normal scientific research, they are not always required. Normal science can proceed in the absence of such rules.
Although scientists engaged in normal science do not intentionally attempt to make unexpected discoveries, such discoveries do occur. Paradigms are imperfect and rifts in the match between paradigm and nature are inevitable. For Kuhn, discoveries not only occur in terms of new facts but there is also invention in terms of novel theories. Both discoveries of new facts and invention of novel theories begin with anomalies, which are violations of paradigm expectations during the practice of normal science. Anomalies can lead to unexpected discoveries. For Kuhn, unexpected discoveries involve complex processes that include the intertwining of both new facts and novel theories. Facts and theories go hand-in-hand, for such discoveries cannot be made by simple inspection. Because discoveries depend upon the intertwining of observations and theories, the discovery process takes time for the conceptual integration of the novel with the known. Moreover, that process is complicated by the fact that novelties are often resisted due to prior expectations. Because of allegiance to a paradigm, scientists are loathed to abandon it simply because of an anomaly or even several anomalies. In other words, anomalies are generally not counter-instances that falsify a paradigm.
Just as anomalies are critical for discovery of new facts or phenomena, so they are essential for the invention of novel theories. Although facts and theories are intertwined, the emergence of novel theories is the outcome of a crisis. The crisis is the result of the paradigm’s breakdown or inability to provide solutions to its anomalies. The community then begins to harbor questions about the ability of the paradigm to guide research, which has a profound impact upon it. The chief characteristic of a crisis is the proliferation of theories. As members of a community in crisis attempt to resolve its anomalies, they offer more and varied theories. Interestingly, anomalies that are responsible for the crisis may not necessarily be new since they may have been present all along. This helps to explain why anomalies lead to a period of crisis in the first place. The paradigm promised resolution of them but was unable to fulfill its promise. The overall effect is a return to a situation very similar to pre-paradigm science.
Closure of a crisis occurs in one of three possible ways, according to Kuhn. First, on occasion that the paradigm is sufficiently robust to resolve anomalies and to restore normal science practice. Second, even the most radical methods are unable to revolve the anomalies. Under these circumstances, the community tables them until future investigation and analysis. Third, the crisis is resolved with the replacement of the old paradigm by a new one but only after a period of extraordinary science.
Kuhn stressed that the initial response of a community in crisis is not to abandon its paradigm. Rather, its members make every effort to salvage it through ad hoc modifications until the anomalies can be resolved, either theoretically or experimentally. The reason for this strong allegiance, claimed Kuhn, is that a community must first have an alternative candidate to take the original paradigm’s place. For science, at least normal science, is possible only with a paradigm, and to reject it without a substitute is to reject science itself, which reflects poorly on the community and not on the paradigm. Moreover, a community does not reject a paradigm simply because of a fissure in the paradigm-nature fit. Kuhn’s aim was to reject a naïve Popperian falsificationism in which single counter-instances are sufficient to reject a theory. In fact, he reversed the tables and contended that counter-instances are essential for the practice of vibrant normal science. Although the goal of normal science is not necessarily to generate counter-instances, normal science practice does provide the occasion for their possible occurrence. Normal science, then, serves as an opportunity for scientific revolutions. If there are no counter-instances, reasoned Kuhn, scientific development comes to a halt.
The transition from normal science through crisis to extraordinary science involves two key events. First, the paradigm’s boundaries become blurred when faced with recalcitrant anomalies; and, second, its rules are relaxed leading to proliferation of theories and ultimately to the emergence of a new paradigm. Often relaxing the rules allows practitioners to see exactly where the problem is and how to solve it. This state has tremendous impact upon a community’s practitioners, similar to that during pre-paradigm science. Extraordinary scientists, according to Kuhn, behave erratically—because scientists are trained under a paradigm to be puzzle-solvers, not paradigm-testers. In other words, they are not trained to do extraordinary science and must learn as they go. For Kuhn, this type of behavior is more open to psychological than logical analysis. Moreover, during periods of extraordinary science practitioners may even examine the discipline’s philosophical foundations. To that end, they analyze their assumptions in order to loosen the old paradigm’s grip on the community and to suggest alternative approaches to the generation of a new paradigm.
Although the process of extraordinary science is convoluted and complex, a replacement paradigm may emerge suddenly. Often the source of its inspiration is rooted in the practice of extraordinary science itself, in terms of the interconnections among various anomalies. Finally, whereas normal science is a cumulative process, adding one paradigm achievement to the next, extraordinary science is not; rather, it is like—using Herbert Butterfield’s analogy—grabbing hold of a stick’s other end. That other end of the stick is a scientific revolution.
The transition from extraordinary science to a new normal science represents a scientific revolution. According to Kuhn, a scientific revolution is non-cumulative in which a newer paradigm replaces an older one—either partially or completely. It can come in two sizes: a major revolution such as the shift from geocentric universe to heliocentric universe or a minor revolution such as the discovery of X-rays or oxygen. But whether big or small, all revolutions have the same structure: generation of a crisis through irresolvable anomalies and establishment of a new paradigm that resolves the crisis-producing anomalies.
Because of the extreme positions taken by participants in a revolution, opposing camps often become galvanized in their positions, and communication between them breaks down and discourse fails. The ultimate source for the establishment of a new paradigm during a crisis is community consensus, that is, when enough community members are convinced by persuasion and not simply by empirical evidence or logical analysis. Moreover, to accept the new paradigm, community practitioners must be assured that there is no chance for the old paradigm to solve its anomalies.
Persuasion loomed large in Kuhn’s scientific revolutions because the new paradigm solves the anomalies the old paradigm could not. Thus, the two paradigms are radically different from each other, often with little overlap between them. For Kuhn, a community can only accept the new paradigm if it considers the old one wrong. The radical difference between old and new paradigms, such that the old cannot be derived from the new, is the basis of the incommensurability thesis. In essence, there is no common measure or standard for the two paradigms. This is evident, claimed Kuhn, when looking at the meaning of theoretical terms. Although the terms from an older paradigm can be compared to those of a newer one, the older terms must be transformed with respect to the newer ones. But, there is a serious problem with restating the old paradigm in transformed terms. The older, transformed paradigm may have some utility, for example pedagogically, but a community cannot use it to guide its research. Like a fossil, it reminds the community of its history but it can no longer direct its future.
The establishment of a new paradigm resolves a scientific revolution and issues forth a new period of normal science. With its establishment, Kuhn’s new image of a mature science comes full circle. Only after a period on intense competition among rival paradigms, does the community choose a new paradigm and scientists once again become puzzle-solvers rather than paradigm-testers. The resolution of a scientific revolution is not a straightforward process that depends only upon reason or evidence. Part of the problem is that proponents of competing paradigms cannot agree on the relevant evidence or proof or even on the relevant anomalies that require resolution, since their paradigms are incommensurable.
Another factor that leads to difficulties in resolving scientific revolutions is that communication among members in crisis is only partial. This results from the new paradigm borrowing from the old paradigm theoretical terms and concepts, and laboratory protocols. Although they share borrowed vocabulary and technology, the new paradigm gives new meaning and uses to them. The net result is that members of competing paradigms talk past one another. Moreover, the change in paradigms is not a gradual process in which different parts of the paradigm are changed piecemeal; rather, the change must be as a whole and suddenly. Convincing scientists to make such a wholesale transformation takes time.
How then does one segment of the community convince or persuade another to switch paradigms? For members who worked for decades under the old paradigm, they may never accept the new paradigm. Rather, it is often the younger members who accept the new paradigm through something like a religious conversion. According to Kuhn, faith is the basis for conversion, especially faith in the potential of the new paradigm to solve future puzzles. By invoking the terms conversion and faith, Kuhn was not implying that arguments and reason are unimportant in a paradigm shift. Indeed, the most common reason for accepting a new paradigm is that it solves the anomalies the old paradigm could not. However, Kuhn point was that argument and reason alone are insufficient. Aesthetic or subjective factors also play an important role in a paradigm shift, since the new paradigm solves only a few, but critical, anomalies. These factors weigh heavily in the shift initially by reassuring community members that the new paradigm represents the discipline’s future.
From the resolution of revolutions, Kuhn made several important philosophical points concerning the principles of verification and falsification. As Kuhn acknowledged, philosophers no longer search for absolute verification, since no theory can be tested exhaustively; rather, they calculate the probability of a theory’s verification. According to probabilistic verification, every imaginable theory must be compared with one another vis-à-vis the available data. The problem in terms of Kuhn’s new image of science is that a theory is tested with respect to a given paradigm, and such a restriction precludes access to every imaginable theory. Moreover, Kuhn rejected falsifying instances because no paradigm resolves every problem facing a community. Under these conditions, no paradigm would ever be accepted. For Kuhn, the process of verification and falsification must include imprecision associated with theory-fact fit.
An interesting feature of scientific revolutions, according to Kuhn, is their invisibility. What he meant by this is that in the process of writing textbooks, popular scientific essays, and even philosophy of science, the path to the current paradigm is sanitized to make it appear as if it was in some sense born mature. Disguising a paradigm’s history is an outcome of a belief about scientific knowledge, which considers it as invariable and its accumulation as linear. This disguising serves the winner of the crisis by establishing its authority, especially as a pedagogical aid for indoctrinating students into a community of practitioners. Another important effect of a revolution, related to a paradigm shift, is a shift in the community’s image of science. The change in science’s image should be no surprise, since the prevailing paradigm defines science. Change that paradigm and science itself changes, at least how to practice it. In other words, the shift in science’s image is a result of a change in the community’s standards for what constitutes its puzzles and its puzzles’ solutions. Finally, revolutions transform scientists from practitioners of normal science, who are puzzle-solvers, to practitioners of extraordinary science, who are paradigm-testers. Besides transforming science, revolutions also transform the world that scientists inhabit and investigate.
One of the major impacts of a scientific revolution is a change of the world in which scientists practice their trade. Kuhn’s world-changes thesis, as it has become known, is certainly one of his most radical and controversial ideas, besides the associated incommensurability thesis. The issue is how far ontologically does the change go, or is it simply an epistemological ploy to reinforce the comprehensive effects of scientific revolutions. In other words, does the world really change or simply the worldview, that is, one’s perspective on or perception of the world? For Kuhn, the answer relied not on a logical or even a philosophical but rather a psychological analysis of the change.
Kuhn analyzed the changes in worldview by analogizing it to a gestalt switch, for example, duck-rabbit. Although the gestalt analogy is suggestive, it is limited to only perceptual changes and says little about the role of previous experience in such transformations. Previous experience is important because it influences what a scientist sees when making an observation. Moreover, with a gestalt switch, the person can stand above or outside of it acknowledging with certainty that one sees now a duck or now a rabbit. Such an independent perspective, which eventually is an authoritarian stance, is not available to the community of practitioners; there is no answer sheet, as it were. Because the community’s access to the world is limited by what it can observe, any change in what is observed has important consequences for the nature of what is observed, that is, the change has ontological significance.
Thus, for Kuhn, the change revolution brings about is more than simply seeing or observing a different world; it also involves working in a different world. The perceptual transformation is more than reinterpretation of data. For, data are not stable but they too change during a paradigm shift. Data interpretation is a function of normal science, while data transformation is a function of extraordinary science. That transformation is often a result of intuitions. Moreover, besides a change in data, revolutions change the relationships among data. Although traditional western philosophy has searched for three centuries for stable theory-neutral data or observations to justify theories, that search has been in vain. Sensory experience occurs through a paradigm of some sort, argued Kuhn, even articulations of that experience. Hence, no one can step outside a paradigm to make an observation; it is simply impossible given the limits of human physiology.
Kuhn then took on the nature of scientific progress. For normal science, progress is cumulative in that the solutions to puzzles form a repository of information and knowledge about the world. This progress is the result of the direction a paradigm provides a community of practitioners. Importantly, the progress achieved through normal science, in terms of the information and knowledge, is used to educate the next generation of scientists and to manipulate the world for human welfare. Scientific revolutions change all that. For Kuhn, revolutionary progress is not cumulative but non-cumulative.
What, then, does a community of practitioners gain by going through a revolution or paradigm shift? Has it made any kind of progress in its rejection of a previous paradigm and the fruit that paradigm yielded? Of course, the victors of the revolution are going to claim that progress was made after the revolution. To do otherwise would be to admit that they were wrong. Rather advocates of the new normal science are going to do everything they can to ensure that their winning paradigm is seen as pushing forward a better understanding of the world. The progress achieved through a revolution is two-fold, according to Kuhn. The first is the successful solution of anomalies that a previous paradigm could not solve. The second is the promise to solve additional problems or puzzles that arise from these anomalies.
But has the community gotten closer to the truth, that is, the notion of verisimilitude, by going through a revolution? According to Kuhn the answer is no. For Kuhn, progress in science is not directed activity towards some goal like truth. Rather, scientific progress is evolutionary. Just as natural selection operates during biological evolution in the emergence of a new species, so community selection during a scientific revolution functions similarly in the emergence of a new theory. And, just as species are adapted to their environments, so theories are adapted to the world. Kuhn had no answer to the question why this should be other than the world and the community that investigates it exhibit unique features. What these features are, Kuhn did not know, but he concluded that the new image of science he had proposed would resolve, like a new paradigm after a scientific revolution, these problems. He invited the next generation of philosophers of science to join him in a new philosophy of science incommensurate with its predecessor.
The reaction to Kuhn’s Structure was at first congenial, especially by historians of science, but within a few years it turned critical, particularly by philosophers. Critics charged him with irrationalism and epistemic relativism. Although he felt the reviews of Structure were good, his chief concerns were the tags of irrationalism and relativism—at least a pernicious kind of relativism. Kuhn believed the charges were inaccurate, however, simply because he maintained that science does not progress toward a predetermined goal. But, like evolutionary change, one theory replaces another with a better fit between theory and nature vis-à-vis competitors. Moreover, he believed that use of the Darwinian evolution was the correct framework for discussing science’s progress. But, he felt no one took it seriously.
On 13 July 1965, Kuhn participated in an International Colloquium in the Philosophy of Science, held at Bedford College in London. The colloquium was organized jointly by the British Society for the Philosophy of Science and by the London School of Economics and Political Science. Kuhn delivered the initial paper comparing his and Karl Popper’s conceptions of the growth of scientific knowledge. John Watkins then delivered a paper criticizing Kuhn’s notion of normal science, with Popper chairing the session. Popper also presented a paper criticizing Kuhn, as did several other members of the philosophy of science community, including Stephen Toulmin, L. Pearce Williams, and Margaret Masterman, who identified twenty-one senses of Kuhn’s use of paradigm in Structure. Masterman concluded her paper inviting others to join in clarifying Kuhn’s paradigm concept.
Kuhn himself took up Masterman’s challenge and clarified the paradigm concept in the second edition of Structure, particularly in its ‘Postscript—1969’. To that end, he divided paradigm into disciplinary matrix and exemplars. The former represents the milieu of the professional practice, consisting of symbolic generalizations, models, and values, while the latter represents solutions to concrete problems that a community accepts as paradigmatic. In other words, exemplars serve as templates for solving problems or puzzles facing the scientific community and thereby for advancing the community’s scientific knowledge. For Kuhn, scientific knowledge is not localized simply within theories and rules; rather, it is localized within exemplars. The basis for an exemplar to function in puzzle solving is the scientist’s ability to see the similarity between a previously solved puzzle and a currently unsolved one.
In the early sixties, van Vleck invited Kuhn to direct a project collecting materials on the history of quantum mechanics. In August 1960, Hunter Dupree, Charles Kittel, Kuhn, John Wheeler, and Harry Wolff, met in Berkeley to discuss the project’s organization. Wheeler next met with Richard Shryock and a joint committee of the American Physical Society and the American Philosophical Society on the History of Theoretical Physics in the Twentieth Century was formed to sponsor and develop the project. The project lasted for three years, with the first and last years of the project conducted in Berkeley and the middle year in Europe. The National Science Foundation funded the project.
The project led to a publication, by John Heilbron and Kuhn, on the origins of the Bohr atom. They provided a revisionist narrative of Bohr’s path to the quantized atom, beginning with his 1911 doctoral dissertation and concluding with his 1913 three-part paper on atomic structure. The intrigue of this historical study was that within a six-week period in mid-1912 Bohr went from little interest in models of the atom to producing a quantized model of J.J. Rutherford’s atom and applying that model to several perplexing problems. The authors explored Bohr’s sudden interest in atomic models. They proposed that his interest stemmed from specific problems, which guided Bohr in terms of both his reading and research toward the potential of the atomic structure for solving them. The solutions to those problems resulted from what Heilbron and Kuhn called a 1913 February transformation in Bohr’s research. What initiated the transformation, claimed the authors, was that Bohr had read a few months earlier J.W. Nicholson’s papers on the application of Max Planck’s constant to generate an atomic model. Although Nicholson’s model was incorrect, it led Bohr in the right direction. Then in February 1913, Bohr, in a conversation with H.R. Hansen, obtained the last piece of the puzzle. After the transformation, Bohr completed the atomic model project within the year.
Besides completing a draft of Structure in 1961, Kuhn was made full professor at Berkeley, but only in the history department. Members of philosophy department voted to deny him promotion in their department, a denial that angered and hurt Kuhn tremendously. Princeton University made Kuhn an offer to join its faculty, while he was in Europe. The university had recently inaugurated a history and philosophy of science program. The program’s chair was Charles Gillispie and its staff included John Murdoch, Hilary Putnam, and Carl Hempel. Upon returning to the United States in 1963, Kuhn visited Princeton. He decided to accept the offer and joined its faculty in 1964. He became the program’s director in 1967 and the following year Princeton appointed him the Moses Taylor Pyne Professor of History. As the sixties ended, Structure was becoming increasingly popular, especially among student radicals who believed it liberated them from the tyranny of tradition.
In 1979, Kuhn moved to M.I.T.’s Department of Linguistics and Philosophy. In 1983, he was appointed the Laurance S. Rockefeller Professor of Philosophy. At M.I.T., he took a linguistic turn in his thinking, reflecting his new environment, which had a major impact on his subsequent work, especially on the incommensurability thesis.
Structure’s success not only established the historiographic revolution in the study of science in either historically or philosophically or what came to be called the discipline of history and philosophy of science, but also supported the rise of science studies in general and specifically the sociology and anthropology of science, particularly the sociology of scientific knowledge. Kuhn rejected both these trajectories often attributed to Structure, for what he called historical philosophy of science. He conducted—as he categorized his work in the Essential Tension—either historical studies on science or their historiographic implications, or either metahistorical studies or their philosophical implications. In other words, his scholarly work was either historical or philosophical.
Kuhn’s final major historical study was on Planck’s black-body radiation theory and the origins of quantum discontinuity. The transition from classical physics—in which particles pass through intermediate energy stages—to quantum physics—in which energy change is discontinuous—is traditionally attributed to Planck’s 1900 and 1901 quantum papers. According to Kuhn, this traditional account was inaccurate and the transition was initiated by Albert Einstein’s and Paul Ehrenfest’s independent 1906 quantum papers. Kuhn’s realization of this inaccuracy was similar to the enlightenment he experienced when struggling to make sense of Aristotle’s notion of mechanical motion. His initial epiphany occurred while reading Planck’s 1895 paper on black-body radiation. Through that experience, he realized that Planck’s 1900 and 1901 quantum papers were not the initiation of a new theory of quantum discontinuity, but rather they represented Planck’s effort to derive the black-body distribution law based on classical statistical mechanics. Kuhn concluded the study with an analysis of Planck’s second black-body theory, first published in 1911, in which Planck used the notion of discontinuity to derive the second theory. Rather than the traditional position, which claimed the second theory represents a regression on Planck’s part to classical physics, Kuhn argued that it represents the first time Planck incorporated into his theoretical work a theory in which he was not completely confident.
In the black-body radiation and quantum discontinuity historical study, Kuhn did not use paradigm, normal science, anomaly, crisis, or incommensurability, which he championed in Structure. Critics, especially within the history and philosophy of science discipline, were disappointed. Kuhn bemoaned the book’s reception, even by its supporters. However, he later explored the historiographic and philosophical issues raised in Black-Body Theory with respect to Structure. The historiographic issues that the former book addressed were the same raised in the 1962 monograph. Specifically, he claimed that current historiography should attempt to understand previous scientific texts in terms of their contemporary context and not in terms of modern science. Kuhn’s concern was more than historical accuracy; rather, he was interested in recapturing the thought processes that lead to a change in theory. Although Structure was Kuhn’s articulation of this process for scientific change, the terminology in the monograph did not represent a straightjacket for narrating history. For Kuhn, the terminology and vocabulary, like paradigm and normal science, used in Structure were not products, such as metaphysical categories, to which a historical narrative must conform; rather, they had a different metaphysical function—as presuppositions towards an historical narrative as process. In other words, Structure’s terminology and vocabulary were tools by which to reconstruct a scientific historical narrative and not a template for articulating it.
The purpose of history of science, according to Kuhn, was not just getting the facts straight but providing philosophers of science with an accurate image of science to practice their trade. Kuhn fervently believed that the new historiography of science would prevent philosophers from engaging in the excesses and distortions prevalent within traditional philosophy of science. He envisioned history of science informing philosophy of science as historical philosophy of science rather than history and philosophy of science, since the relationship was asymmetrical.
Prior to 1950, history of science was a discipline practiced mostly by eminent scientists, who generally wrote heroic biographies or sweeping overviews of a discipline often for pedagogical purposes. Within the past generation, historians of science, such as Alexander Koyré, Anneliese Maier, and E.J. Dijsterhuis, developed an approach to the history of science that was simply more than chronicling science’s theoretical and technical achievements. An important factor in that development was the recognition of institutional and sociological factors in the practice of science. A consequence of this historiographic revolution was the distinction between internal and external histories of science. Internal history of science is concerned with the development of the theories and methods employed by scientists. In other words, it studies the history of events, people, and ideas internal to scientific advancement. The historian as internalist attempts to climb inside the mind of scientists as they push forward the boundaries of their discipline. External history of science concentrates on the social and cultural factors that impinge on the practice of science.
For Kuhn, the distinction between internal and external histories of science mapped onto his pattern of scientific development. External or cultural and social factors are important during a scientific discipline’s initial establishment; however, once established, those factors no longer have a major impact on a community’s practice or its generation of scientific knowledge. They can have a minor impact on a mature science’s practice, such as the timing of technological innovation. Importantly for Kuhn, internal and external approaches to the history of science are not necessarily mutually exclusive but complementary.
As mentioned already, Kuhn considered himself a practitioner of both the history of science and the philosophy of science and not the history and philosophy of science, for a very practical reason. Crassly put, the goal for history is the particular while for philosophy the universal. Kuhn compared the differences between the two disciplines to a duck-rabbit Gestalt switch. In other words, the two disciplines are so fundamentally different in terms of their goals, that the resulting images of science are incommensurable. Moreover, to see the other discipline’s image requires a conversion. For Kuhn, then, the history of science and the philosophy of science cannot be practiced at the same time but only alternatively, and then with difficulty.
How then can the history of science be of use to philosophers of science? The answer for Kuhn was by providing an accurate image of science. Rejecting the covering law model for historical explanation because it reduces historians to mere social scientists, Kuhn advocated an image based on ordering of historical facts into a narrative analogous to the one he proposed for puzzle solving under the aegis of a paradigm in the physical sciences. Historians of science, as they narrate change in science, provide an image of science that reflects the process by which scientific information develops, rather than the image provided by traditional philosophers of science in which scientific knowledge is simply a product of logical verification or falsification. Kuhn insisted that the history of science and the philosophy of science remain distinct disciplines, so that historians of science can provide an image of science to correct the distortion produced by traditional philosophers of science.
According to Kuhn, the social history of science also distorts the image of science. For social historians, scientists construct rather than discover scientific knowledge. Although Kuhn was sympathetic to this type of history, he believed it created a gap between older constructions and the ones replacing them, which he challenged historians of science to fill. Besides social historians of science, Kuhn also accused sociologists of science for distorting the image of science. Although Kuhn acknowledged that factors such as interests, power, authority, among others, are important in the production of scientific knowledge, the predominant use of them by sociologists eclipses other factors such as nature itself. The key to rectifying the distortion introduced by sociologists is to shift from a rationality of belief, that is, the reasons scientists hold specific beliefs, to a rationality of change in beliefs, that is, the reasons scientists change their beliefs. For Kuhn, a historical philosophy of science was the means for correcting these distortions of the scientific image.
Kuhn’s historical philosophy of science focused on the metahistorical issues derived from historical research, particularly scientific development and the related issues of theory choice and incommensurability. Importantly for Kuhn, both theory choice and incommensurability are intimately linked to one another. The former cannot be reduced to an algorithm of objective rules but requires subjective values because of the latter.
Kuhn explored scientific development using three different approaches. The first was in terms of problem versus puzzle solving. According to Kuhn, problems have no ready solution; and, problem solving is often generally pragmatic and is the hallmark of an underdeveloped or immature science. Puzzles, on the other hand, occupy the attention of scientists involved in a developed or mature science. Although they have guaranteed solutions, the methods for solving puzzles are not assured. Scientists, who solve them, demonstrate their ingenuity and are rewarded by the community.
With this distinction in mind, Kuhn envisioned scientific development as the transition of a scientific discipline from an underdeveloped problem-solving state to a developed puzzle-solving one. The question then arises as to how this occurs. The answer that many took from Structure was, adopt a paradigm. However, Kuhn found this answer to be incorrect in that paradigms are not unique only to the sciences. But does articulating the question in terms of puzzle-solving help? Kuhn’s answer was pragmatic, that is, keep trying different solutions until one works. In other words, philosophers of science had no exemplars by which to solve their problems.
Kuhn’s second approach to scientific development was in terms of the growth of knowledge. He proposed an alternative view to the traditional one that scientific knowledge grows by a piecemeal accumulation of facts. To shed light on the alternative view, Kuhn offered a different reconstruction of science. The central ideas of a science cohere with one another, forming a set of the central ideas or core of a particular science. Besides the core, a periphery exists, which represents an area where scientists can investigate problems associated with a research tradition without changing core ideas.
Kuhn then drew parallels between the current reconstruction of science and the earlier one in Structure. Obviously, the transition in cores from one research tradition to another is a scientific revolution. Moreover, the core represents a paradigm that defines a particular research tradition. Finally, the periphery is identified with normal science. The core then provides the means by which to practice science, and to change the core requires significant retooling that practitioners naturally resist.
Is this change in the core a growth of knowledge? To answer the question, Kuhn examined the standard account of knowledge as justified true belief. What he found problematic with the account is the amount or nature of the evidence needed to justify a belief. And this, of course, raises the issue of truth for which he had no ready solution. Ultimately, Kuhn equivocated on the question of the growth of knowledge.
Kuhn’s final approach to scientific development was through the analysis of three scientific revolutions: the shift from Aristotelian to Newtonian physics, Volta’s discovery of the electric cell, and Planck’s black-body radiation research and quantum discontinuity. From these examples, Kuhn derived three characteristics of scientific revolutions. The first was holistic in that scientific revolutions are all-or-none events. The second was the way referents change after revolutions, especially in terms of taxonomic categories. According to Kuhn, revolutions redistribute objects among these categories. The final characteristic of scientific revolutions was a change in a discipline’s analogy, metaphor, or model, which represents the connection between taxonomic categories and the world’s structure.
According to traditional philosophers of science, the objective features of a good scientific theory include accuracy, consistency, scope, simplicity, and fecundity. However, these features, when used individually as criteria for theory choice, argued Kuhn, are imprecise and often conflict with one another. Although necessary for theory choice, they are insufficient and must include the characteristics of the scientists making the choices. These characteristics involve personal experiences or biography and personality or psychological traits. In other words, not only does theory choice rely on a theory’s objective features but also on individual scientists’ subjective characteristics.
Why have traditional philosophers of science ignored or neglected subjective factors in theory choice? Part of the answer is that they confined the subjective to the context of discovery, while restricting the objective to the context of justification. Kuhn insisted that this distinction does not fit with observations of scientific practice. It is artificial, reflecting science pedagogy. But, actual scientific practice reveals that textbook presentations of theory choice are stylized, to convince students who rely on the authority of their instructors. What else can students do? Textbook science discloses only the product of science, not its process. For Kuhn, since subjective factors are present at the discovery phase of science, they should also be present at the justification phase.
According to Kuhn, objective criteria function as values, which do not dictate theory choice but rather influence it. Values help to explain scientists’ behavior, which for the traditional philosopher of science may at times appear irrational. Most importantly, values account for disagreement over theories and help to distribute risk during debates over theories. Kuhn’s position had important consequences for the philosophy of science. He maintained that critics misinterpreted his position on theory choice as subjective. For them, the term denoted a matter of taste that is not rationally discussable. But, his use of the term did involve the discussable with respect to standards. Moreover, Kuhn denied that facts are theory independent and that there is strictly a rational choice to be made. Rather, he contended scientists do not choose a theory based on objective criteria alone but are converted based on subjective values.
Finally, Kuhn discussed theory choice with respect to the incommensurability thesis. The question he entertained was what type of communication is possible among community members holding competing theories. The answer, according to Kuhn, is that communication is partial. The answer raised a second, and more important, question for Kuhn and his critics. Is good reason vis-à-vis empirical evidence available to justify theory choice, given such partial communication? The answer would be straightforward if communication was complete, but it is not. For Kuhn, this situation meant that ultimately reasonable evaluation of the empirical evidence is not compelling for theory choice and, of course, raised the charge of irrationality, which he denied.
Kuhn identified two common misconceptions of his version of the incommensurability thesis. The first was that since two incommensurable theories cannot be stated in a common language, then they be cannot compared to one another in order to choose between them. The second was that since an older theory cannot be translated into modern expression, it cannot be articulated meaningfully.
Kuhn addressed the first misconception by distinguishing between incommensurability as no common measure and as no common language. He defined the incommensurability thesis in terms of the latter rather than the former. Most theoretical terms are homophonic and can have the same meaning in two competing theories. However, only a handful of terms are incommensurable or untranslatable. Kuhn considered this a modest version of the incommensurability thesis, calling it local incommensurability, and claimed that it was his originally intention. Although there may be no common language to compare terms that change their meaning during a scientific revolution, there is a partially common language composed of the invariant terms that do permit some semblance of comparison. Thus, Kuhn argued, the first criticism fails; because, and this was his main point, an incommensurate residue remains even with a partially common language.
As for the second misconception, Kuhn claimed that critics conflate the difference between translation and interpretation. The conflation is understandable since translation often involves interpretation. Translation for Kuhn is the process by which words or phrases of one language substitute for another. Interpretation, however, involves attempts to make sense of a statement or to make it intelligible. Incommensurability, then, does not mean that a theoretical term cannot be interpreted, that is, cannot be made intelligible; rather, it means that the term cannot be translated, that is, there is no equivalent for the term in the competing theoretical language. In other words, in order for the theoretical term to have meaning the scientist must go native in its use.
Kuhn introduced the notion of the lexicon and its attendant taxonomy to capture both a term’s reference and intention or sense. In the lexicon, there are referring terms that are interrelated to other referring terms, that is, the holistic principle. The lexicon’s structure of interrelated terms resembles the world’s structure in terms of its taxonomic categories. A particular scientific community uses its lexicon to describe and explain the world in terms of this taxonomy. And, members of a community or of different communities must share the same lexicon if they are to communicate fully with one another. Moreover, claimed Kuhn, if full translation is to be achieved the two languages must share a similar structure with respect to their respective lexicons. Incommensurability, then, reflects lexicons that have different taxonomic structures by which the world is carved up and articulated.
Kuhn also addressed a problem that involves communication among communities who hold incommensurable theories, or who occupy positions across a historical divide. Kuhn noted that although lexicons can change dramatically, this does not deter members from reconstructing their past in the current lexicon’s vocabulary. Such reconstruction obviously plays an important function in the community. But the issue is that, given the incommensurable nature of theories, assessments of true and false or right and wrong are unwarranted, for which critics charged Kuhn with a relativist position—a position he was less inclined to deny.
The charge stemmed from the fact that Kuhn advocated no privileged position from which to evaluate a theory. Rather, evaluations must be made within the context of a particular lexicon. And thus, evaluations are relative to the relevant lexicon. But, Kuhn found the charge of relativism trivial. He acknowledged that his position on the relativity of truth and objectivity, with respect to the community’s lexicon, left him no option but to take literally world changes associated with lexical changes. But, is this an idealist position? Kuhn admitted that it appears to be, but he claimed that it is an idealism like none other. On the one hand, the world is composed of the community’s lexicon, but one the other hand, preconceived ideas cannot mold it.
From the mid-1980s to early-1990s, Kuhn transitioned from historical philosophy of science and the paradigm concept to an evolutionary philosophy of science and the lexicon notion. To that end, he identified an alternative role for the incommensurability thesis with respect to segregating or isolating lexicons and their associated worlds from one another. Incommensurability now functioned for Kuhn as a mechanism to isolate a community’s lexicon from another’s and as a means to underpin a notion of scientific progress as the proliferation of scientific specialties. In other words, as the taxonomical structure of the two lexicons become isolated and thereby incommensurable with one another, according to Kuhn, a new specialty and its lexicon split off from the old or parent specialty and its lexicon. This process accounts for a notion of scientific progress as an increase in the number of scientific specialties after a revolution.
Scientific progress, then, is akin to biological speciation, argued Kuhn, with incommensurability serving as the isolation mechanism. The result is a tree-like structure with increased specialization at the tips of the branches. Finally, Kuhn’s evolutionary philosophy of science is non-teleological in the sense that science progresses not towards an ultimate truth about the world but simply away from a lexicon that cannot be used to solve its anomalies to one that can. However, he still articulated incommensurability in terms of no common language, with its attendant problems involving the notion of meaning, and did not transform it fully with respect to an evolutionary philosophy of science.
Kuhn was working out an evolutionary philosophy of science in a proposed book, Words and Worlds: An Evolutionary View of Scientific Development. He divided it into three parts, with three chapters in each. In the first part, Kuhn framed the problem associated with the incommensurability thesis and addressed the difficulties accessing past scientific achievements. In the first chapter, he presented an evolutionary view of scientific development. Without an Archimedean platform to guide theory assessment, Kuhn proposed a comparative method for assessing theoretical changes. The method forbids assessment of theories in isolation and methodological solecism. In the next chapter, he discussed the problems associated with examining past historical studies in science. Based on several historical cases, he claimed that anomalies in older scientific texts could be understood only through an interpretative process involving an ethnographic or a hermeneutical reading. He had now laid the groundwork for examining the incommensurability thesis. In the third chapter, Kuhn discussed the changes of word-meanings as changes in a taxonomy embedded in a lexicon—an apparatus of a language’s referring terms. The result of these changes was an untranslatable gap between two incommensurable theories. Finally, the lexical terms referring to objects change as the number of scientific specialties proliferate.
In the book’s second part, Kuhn continued to explore the nature of a community’s lexicon, which he explicated in terms of taxonomic categories. These categories are grouped as contrast sets and no overlap of categories exists within the same contrast set, which Kuhn called the no-overlap principle. The principle prohibits the reference of terms to objects unless related to one another as species to genus. Moreover, the properties of the categories are reflected in the properties of their names. A term’s meaning then is a function of its taxonomic category. And, this restriction is the origin of untranslatability. In the first chapter of this part, Kuhn discussed the nature of substances in terms of sortal predicates. This move allowed Kuhn to introduce plasticity into the lexicon’s usage. Moreover, the differentiating set is not strictly conventional but relies on the world to which the different sets connect. In the next chapter, Kuhn extended the lexicon notion to artifacts, abstractions, and theoretical entities.
In the final chapter of the second part, Kuhn specified the means by which community members acquire a lexicon. First, they must already possess a vocabulary about physical entities and forces. Next, definitions play little, if any, role in learning new terms; rather, those terms are acquired through ostensive examples, especially through problem solving and laboratory demonstrations. Third, a single example is inadequate to learn the meaning of a term; rather, multiple examples are required. Next, acquisition of a new term within a statement also requires acquisition of other new terms within that statement. And lastly, students can acquire the terms of a lexicon through different pedagogical routes.
In the book’s concluding part, Kuhn discussed what occurs during a change in the lexicon and the implications for scientific development. In chapter seven, he examined the means by which lexicons change and the repercussions such change has for communication among communities with different lexicons. Moreover, he explored the role of arguments in lexical change. In the subsequent chapter, Kuhn identified the type of progress achieved with changes in lexicons. He maintained that progress is not the type that aims at a specific goal but rather is instrumental. In the final chapter, he broached the issues of relativism and realism not in traditional terms of truth and objectivity but rather with respect to the capability of making a statement. Statements from incommensurable theories that cannot be translated are ultimately ineffable. They can be neither true nor false but their capability of being stated is relative to the community’s history.
In sum, the book’s aim was certainly to address the philosophical issues left over from Structure, but more importantly, it was to resolve the problems generated by a historical philosophy of science. Although others were also responsible for its creation, Kuhn assumed responsibility for resolving the problems; and the sine qua non for resolving them was the incommensurability thesis. For Kuhn, the thesis was required more than ever to defend rationality from the post-modern development of the strong program.
In May 1990, a conference—or as Hempel called it, a Kuhnfest—was held in Kuhn’s honor at MIT, sponsored by the Sloan Foundation and organized by Paul Horwich and Judith Thomson. The conference speakers included Jed Buchwald, Nancy Cartwright, John Earman, Michael Friedman, Ian Hacking, John Heilbron, Ernan McMullin, N.M Swerdlow, and Norton Wise. The papers reflected Kuhn’s impact on the history and the philosophy of science. Hempel made a special appearance on the last day, followed by Kuhn’s remarks on the conference papers. As he approached the podium after Hempel’s remarks, before a standing-room-only audience, Kuhn was visibly moved by the outpouring of professional appreciation for his contributions, to a discipline that he cherished and from its members whom he truly respected.
Kuhn retired from teaching in 1991 and became an emeritus professor at MIT. During Kuhn’s career, he received numerous awards and accolades. He was the recipient of honorary degrees from around a dozen academic institutions, such as University of Chicago, Columbia University, University of Padua, and University of Notre Dame. He was elected a member of the National Academy of Science—the most prestigious society for U.S. scientists—and was an honorary life member of the New York Academy of Science and a corresponding fellow of the British Academy. He was president of the History of Science Society from 1968 to 1970 and the society awarded him its highest honor, the Sarton Medal, in 1982. Kuhn was also the recipient in 1977 of the Howard T. Behrman Award for distinguished achievement in the humanities and in 1983 of the celebrated John Desmond Bernal award. Kuhn died on 17 June 1996 in Cambridge, Massachusetts, after suffering for two years from cancer of the throat and bronchial tubes.
- a Kuhn’s work
- Kuhn Papers, MIT MC 240, Institute Archives and Special Collections, MIT Libraries, Cambridge, MA.
- Kuhn, T. S. (1957) The Copernican Revolution: Planetary Astronomy in the Development of Western Thought. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
- Kuhn, T. S. (1962) The Structure of Scientific Revolutions. Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press.
- Kuhn, T. S. (1963) ‘The function of dogma in scientific research’, in A.C. Crombie, ed. Scientific Change: Historical Studies in the Intellectual, Social and Technical Conditions for Scientific Discovery and Technical Invention, From Antiquity to the Present. New York: Basic Books, pp. 347-69.
- Kuhn, T. S., Heilbron, J. L., Forman, P. and Allen, L. (1967) Sources for History of Quantum Physics: An Inventory and Report. Philadelphia, PA: American Philosophical Society.
- Heilbron, J. L., and Kuhn, T. S. (1969) ‘The genesis of the Bohr atom’. Historical Studies in the Physical Sciences, 1, 211-90.
- Kuhn, T. S. (1970) The Structure of Scientific Revolutions (2nd edition). Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press.
- Kuhn, T. S. (1977) The Essential Tension: Selected Studies in Science Tradition and Change. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
- Kuhn, T. S. (1987) Black-Body Theory and the Quantum Discontinuity, 1894-1912 (revised edition). Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
- Kuhn, T. S. (1990) ‘Dubbing and redubbing: the vulnerability of rigid designation’, in C.W. Savage, ed. Scientific Theories. Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press, pp. 298-318.
- Kuhn, T. S. (2000) The Road since Structure: Philosophical Essays, 1970-1993, with an Autobiographical Interview. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
- Contains a comprehensive interview with Kuhn covering his life and work.
- Andersen, H. (2001) On Kuhn. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth Publishing.
- A general introduction to Kuhn and his philosophy.
- Andersen, H., Barker, P. and Chen, X. (2006) The Cognitive Structure of Scientific Revolutions. New York: Cambridge University Press.
- Barnes, B. (1982) T.S. Kuhn and Social Science. London: Macmillan Press.
- Discusses the impact of Kuhn’s philosophy for the sociology of science.
- Bernardoni, J. (2009) Knowing Nature without Mirrors: Thomas Kuhn’s Antirepresentationalist Objectivity. Saarbrücken, DE: VDM Verlag Dr. Müller.
- Bird, A. (2000) Thomas Kuhn. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
- A critical introduction to Kuhn’s philosophy of science.
- Bird, A. (2012) ‘The Structure of Scientific Revolutions and its significance: an essay review of the fiftieth anniversary edition’. British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 63, 859-83.
- Buchwald, J. Z. and Smith, G. E. (1997) ‘Thomas S. Kuhn, 1922-1996’. Philosophy of Science, 64, 361-76.
- D’Agostino, F. (2010) Naturalizing Epistemology: Thomas Kuhn and the Essential Tension. New York: Palgrave Macmillan.
- Davidson, K. (2006) The Death of Truth: Thomas S. Kuhn and the Evolution of Ideas. New York: Oxford University Press.
- Favretti, R. R., Sandri, G. and Scazzieri, R., eds. (1999) Incommensurability and Translation: Kuhnian Perspectives on Scientific Communication and Theory Change. Northampton, MA: Edward Elgar.
- Fuller, S. (2000) Thomas Kuhn: A Philosophical History of Our Times. Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press.
- A revisionist account of Kuhn as a foot soldier in Conant’s agenda to educate the public about science.
- Fuller, S. (2004) Kuhn vs. Popper: The Struggle for the Soul of Science. New York: Columbia University Press.
- Gattei, S. (2008) Thomas Kuhn’s ‘Linguistic Turn’ and the Legacy of Logical Empiricism: Incommensurability, Rationality and the Search for Truth. Burlington, VT: Ashgate.
- Gutting, G., ed. (1980) Paradigms and Revolutions: Appraisals and Applications of Thomas Kuhn’s Philosophy of Science. Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press.
- A collection of articles addressing Kuhn’s philosophy of science.
- Heilbron, J. L. (1998) ‘Thomas Samuel Kuhn’. Isis, 89, 505-15.
- Horgan, J. (1991) ‘Reluctant revolutionary’. Scientific American, 264, 40-9.
- Is based on an interview with Kuhn about his philosophy.
- Hufbauer, K. (2012) ‘From student of physics to historian of science: TS Kuhn’s education and early career, 1940–1958’. Physics in Perspective, 14, 421-70.
- A detailed reconstruction of Kuhn’s education and early career at Harvard.
- Horwich, P., ed. (1993) World Changes: Thomas Kuhn and the Nature of Science. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
- The published papers from the 1990 Kuhnfest.
- Hoyningen-Huene, P. (1993) Reconstructing Scientific Revolutions: Thomas S. Kuhn’s Philosophy of Science. Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press.
- Hoyningen-Huene, P. and Sankey, H., eds. (2001) Incommensurability and Related Matters. Boston, MA: Kluwer.
- Hung, E. H. -C. (2006) Beyond Kuhn: Scientific Explanation, Theory Structure, Incommensurability, and Physical Necessity. Burlington, VT: Ashgate.
- Kindi, V. and Arabatzis T., eds. (2012) Kuhn’s The Structure of Scientific Revolutions Revisited. New York: Routledge.
- A collection of essays examining the impact of Structure on contemporary philosophy of science.
- Kuukkanen, J. M. (2008) Meaning Changes: A Study of Thomas Kuhn’s Philosophy. Saarbrücken, DE: VDM Verlag Dr. Müller.
- Lakatos, I. and Musgrave, A., eds. (1970) Criticism and the Growth of Knowledge. Cambridge, U.K.: Cambridge University Press.
- The published papers from the 1965 London colloquium.
- Marcum, J.A. (2015) Thomas Kuhn’s Revolutions: A Historical and an Evolutionary Philosophy of Science? London: Bloomsbury.
- Nickles, T., ed. (2003) Thomas Kuhn. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press.
- Onkware, K. (2010) Thomas Kuhn and Scientific Progression: Investigation on Kuhn’s Account of How Science Progresses. Staarbrücken: Lambert Academic Publishing.
- Preston, J. M. (2008) Kuhn’s The Structure of Scientific Revolutions: A Reader’s Guide. London: Continuum.
- Ruse, M. (1999) The Darwinian Revolution: Science Red in Tooth and Claw (2nd edition). Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press
- Sankey, H. (1994) The Incommensurability Thesis. London: Ashgate.
- Sardar, Z. (2000) Thomas Kuhn and the Science Wars. New York: Totem Books.
- Sharrock, W., and Read, R. (2002) Kuhn: Philosopher of Scientific Revolution. Cambridge, UK: Polity.
- Sigurdsson, S. (1990) ‘The nature of scientific knowledge: an interview with Thomas Kuhn’. Harvard Science Review, Winter issue, 18-25.
- Suppe, F., ed. (1977) The Structure of Scientific Theories (2nd edition). Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press.
- Swerdlow, N.M. (2013) ‘Thomas S. Kuhn, 1922-1996’. Biographical Memoir, National Academy of Sciences USA. http://www.nasonline.org/publications/biographical-memoirs/memoir-pdfs/kuhn-thomas.pdf.
- Torres, J. M., ed. (2010) On Kuhn’s Philosophy and Its Legacy. Faculdade de Ciêcias da Universidade de Lisboa.
- von Dietze, E. (2001) Paradigms Explained: Rethinking Thomas Kuhn’s Philosophy of Science. Westport, CT: Praeger.
- Wade, N. (1977) ‘Thomas S. Kuhn: revolutionary theorist of science’. Science, 197, 143-5.
- Wang, X. (2007) Incommensurability and Cross-Language Communication. Burlington, VT: Ashgate.
- Wray, K. B. (2011) Kuhn’s Evolutionary Social Epistemology. New York: Cambridge University Press.
James A. Marcum
U. S. A.