Lao Sze-kwang (Lao Siguang) (1927—2012)

photo courtesy of The Chinese University of Hong Kong

The works of Lao Sze-kwang (Lao Siguang) cover a wide range of philosophies, including Confucianism, Buddhism, Daoism, Kantianism, Hegelianism, and, most importantly, the philosophy of culture. Like many other Chinese philosophers of the 20th century, Lao was personally affected by the Chinese Revolution of 1949 and made his career outside of mainland China, having first fled to Taiwan and then Hong Kong after the victory of Mao Zedong’s Communist forces in China’s civil war. Along with other modern Chinese philosophers, Lao was deeply interested in the problem of China’s modernization and actively participated in politics. These two aspects of his intellectual biography, in turn, help to define his work as a philosopher, which focused on contextualizing Chinese philosophy in relation to Western thought as well as emphasizing the practical, as opposed to purely theoretical, dimension of Chinese philosophy.

In his multi-volume New Edition of the History of Chinese Philosophy (1984-1986), he tried to reconstruct traditional Chinese philosophy with the help of modern Western philosophy but in ways that both resembled and differed from the work of so-called “New Confucians” such as Mou Zongsan and Tang Junyi. This work highly influenced the study of Chinese philosophy in Hong Kong and Taiwan and helped shape several generations of Chinese scholars’ understanding of traditional Chinese thought. Unlike Feng Youlan or Hu Shi, each of whom authored competing histories of Chinese philosophy, Lao attempted to define Chinese philosophy not in terms of what it is (an essentialist approach) but in terms of what it does (a functionalist approach). For Lao, Chinese philosophy functions primarily in an “orientative” manner, shaping and guiding Chinese people’s values at a deep level rather than merely advocating particular propositions or theories. In this way, Lao thought, Chinese philosophy was distinct from other social philosophies, particularly those of the West.

Having summarized the legacies of both traditional Chinese and modern Western thought, Lao later developed a philosophy of culture that preoccupied him from the 1990s until his death in 2012. In his Lectures on Philosophy of Culture (2003), Lao declared that his philosophy was driven by a cultural crisis of consciousness, as he realized that he grew up in a frustrating age in which traditional Chinese culture was declining in influence while modern culture was yet to be established as a new cultural order. Lao criticized both traditionalist and anti-traditionalist approaches to the modernization of Chinese culture and tried to develop his own approach.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. On Chinese Philosophy
    1. New Edition of the History of Chinese Philosophy
    2. The Fundamental Question Method
    3. Chinese Philosophy as an Orientative Philosophy
  3. On Philosophy of Culture
    1. Cultural Spirit as Self-Consciousness of Value
      1. Categories of the Self
      2. Moral Subjectivity in Confucianism and the Rejection of Metaphysical Interpretation
      3. “Eastern Spirit” vs. “Western Spirit”
    2. Modernization of Chinese Culture
      1. The Problem of Objectivity
      2. The Problem of Traditionalism
      3. The Problem of Anti-Traditionalism
  4. Criticisms and Influence
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Lao Sze-kwang was born in Xi’an, capital of Shaanxi province, in 1927 to a highly educated military officer’s family. His grandfather scored high on the Qing dynasty’s (1644-1912) imperial civil service examination and was appointed Governor General of Liangguang (modern Guangxi and Guangdong provinces). In 1860, he negotiated Britain’s lease of the Kowloon peninsula and the New Territories following China’s defeat in the Second Opium War (1856-1860). Throughout his childhood, Lao received a traditional Chinese education at home and even composed his first classical poem at the age of seven.

In 1946, Lao entered the Department of Philosophy at Peking University but fled to Taiwan in 1949 when the Communist Party overtook mainland China. He graduated from the Department of Philosophy at Taiwan University in 1951. As a liberal, however, Lao had difficulty tolerating the Kuomintang (KMT) military dictatorship in Taiwan headed by Chiang Kai-shek. To protect him from political persecution in Taiwan, Lao’s father—a general who served under Chiang—asked him to flee to Hong Kong in 1955. In 1964, Lao joined Chung Chi College at the Chinese University of Hong Kong as a lecturer of philosophy. Lao’s colleagues in Hong Kong included Mou Zongsan and Tang Junyi. As opposed to his pro-KMT colleagues, who condemned only the Communist regime in mainland China, Lao condemned both the KMT’s and the Chinese Communist Party’s dictatorships and refused to join Mou’s and Tang’s “New Confucian” campaign. Lao was later promoted to Senior Lecturer, Reader, and finally Head of the Philosophy Department at the Chinese University of Hong Kong. Although Lao officially retired in 1985, he continued to serve as Honorary Senior Research Fellow at the Institute of Chinese Studies and as Senior College Tutor at Shaw College.

In 1989, Lao returned to Taiwan, where the process of democratization had begun. In 1994, Lao became Chair Professor at the Department of Philosophy of Huafan University. The government of the Republic of China (Taiwan) awarded Lao the National Cultural Award in 2001 and the Republic of China Academia Sinica Fellowship in 2002. In 2012, Lao died in Taiwan.

2. On Chinese Philosophy

a. New Edition of the History of Chinese Philosophy

From 1984 to 1986, Lao published his most influential work, New Edition of the History of Chinese Philosophy. It consists of four volumes of a systematic reconstruction of Chinese philosophy, from the pre-Qin period (the period before the establishment of the Qin dynasty in 221 B.C.E.) to the Qing dynasty (1644-1912). Lao regarded it as the first complete work on the history of Chinese philosophy because, according to him, all previous writings about the history of Chinese philosophy focused on its history rather than on the reconstruction of its philosophical problems. While Lao acknowledged Huang Zongxi (1610-1695)’s Record of the Ming Scholars as work that satisfied his criteria for an authentic history of Chinese philosophy, it merely addressed the development of Confucian thought during the Ming dynasty (1368-1644). Similarly, Lao did not consider Hu Shi (1891-1962)’s History of Chinese Philosophy as an authentic study of the history of Chinese philosophy because, in his view, it focused too much on archaeological investigation rather than philosophical discussion. For Lao, a valid work on the history of Chinese philosophy should reconstruct the theories of past philosophers by investigating their philosophical questions and answers. Lao argued that although Feng Youlan (1895-1990)’s History of Chinese Philosophy explored the philosophical problems of past Chinese philosophers, it failed to grasp the nature of Chinese philosophy as the pursuit of virtue (that is, the complete actualization of humanity’s innate moral goodness) due to the overwhelming influence of Western metaphysical concepts and Marxist ideology on Feng’s thought. Thus, Lao refused to acknowledge Feng’s book as a work on Chinese philosophy. Instead, Lao argued that his own book was the first true account of the history of Chinese philosophy because of its accurate reconstruction of the philosophical questions and answers of past Chinese philosophers.

b. The Fundamental Question Method

In New Edition of the History of Chinese Philosophy, Lao suggested a new methodology for the study of Chinese philosophy called the Fundamental Question Method. Lao argued that every school of philosophy chooses a single ultimate question to answer. Such a question is known as “the fundamental question,” for which the procedure is as follows:

  1. Investigation of a philosophical text and its historical background
  2. Reconstruction of the text’s arguments
  3. Deduction of the original intention behind the arguments
  4. Identification of the fundamental question
  5. Reconstruction of the logical relations between the questions and answers on the basis of the fundamental question

In order to answer such questions, philosophers provide several answers or solutions, which may lead to new sub-questions. The question-answering process is the development of a philosophical school. A fundamental question leads to several levels of sub-questions with their corresponding answers. All of these questions and answers construct a complete theory. The problem is that some philosophers may not explicitly declare their own fundamental question. Therefore, a “theoretical reduction” is needed. One may deduce the philosopher’s original intention from the arguments found in his writings.

It is important to note that the Fundamental Question Method does not resist the introduction of Western philosophical concepts to the study of Chinese philosophy. Instead, Lao emphasized that his Fundamental Question Method employed a “Western logical analysis” due to the relative absence of logic and epistemology in the Chinese tradition. To articulate the fundamental questions of Chinese philosophies, one must inevitably employ Western disciplines such as hermeneutics and logic. Lao used a microscope analogy to justify his support of the use of logical analysis in the study of the history of Chinese philosophy. Although the microscope was invented by the Europeans in the modern era, it can still be used as an instrument to study ancient bacteria in Africa, which existed long before their discovery under the microscope. Likewise, logical analysis is a “microscope for thoughts.” Principles discovered through logical analysis have existed since before its introduction. Spatiotemporal differences do not weaken the universal validity of principles discovered through logical analysis, for logic is a universal science. The following section demonstrates Lao’s application of the Fundamental Question Method to Confucius’ philosophy as articulated in New Edition of the History of Chinese Philosophy.

Lao identified the Analects as the only reliable source for studying Confucius’ philosophy, as it was allegedly composed by Confucius’ students. According to the Records of the Grand Historian, written by Sima Qian (145-86 B.C.E.), Confucius was employed as an official ritual expert by the ancient state of Lu (modern Shandong province). For Confucius, the ceremonies and literature of the Western Zhou dynasty (1046-771 B.C.E.) provided the basis for all proper and efficacious ritual (li), but by his time, these had been forgotten, diluted, or abused as a result of China’s increasingly fractious political and military environment. As Lao pointed out, the Confucian view of li goes beyond mere ceremony to encompass internal attitudes within ritual actors and participants, especially a sense of reverence for tradition and an aesthetic sensitivity to beauty as a mode of order. As a way of restoring harmonious order to a disorderly and divided society, li was vital to Confucius’ understanding of the purpose of both collective culture and personal self-cultivation. Therefore, Lao considered the concept of li as the starting point of Confucius’ philosophy.

However, Lao did not think that li itself was the central concept of Confucius’ philosophy. According to him, Confucius’ concept of li points at a deeper principle: social order. The distinction between li as the guarantor of social order and mere ritual was already being discussed before Confucius developed his philosophy. In the Zuozhuan (Zuo Commentary on the Spring and Autumn Annuals), an ancient Chinese chronicle, when the Duke of the state of Jin praised the Duke of Lu for being good at keeping li in archery performance, his minister, Ru Shuqui, disagreed and distinguished li from deportment, or the following of rituals: “[li] is that by which [a ruler] maintains his State, carries out his governmental orders, and does not lose his people.” Lao coined the term quanfen (division of power and responsibility) to describe what Neo-Confucian philosophers called lifen (division by ritual, that is, reason and duty)—a sense of social order achieved by the division of society into class-specific titles and duties. It is this sense of social order on which Confucius’ philosophy was based, according to Lao, and toward which li as a kind of social performance and inner experience was to be aimed.

What is the legitimacy of li? According to Lao, Confucius reduced li to yi (righteousness) and ren (humaneness or benevolence). Confucius said that “[t]he gentleman takes rightness as his substance, puts it into practice by means of ritual [li], gives it expression through modesty, and perfects it by being trustworthy. Now that is a gentleman” (Analects 15:18). Righteousness stands for the normative principles used to distinguish between right and wrong. Ren is the basis of righteousness, as Confucius said a person practising ren is free from wickedness (Analects 4:4). Ren is the highest moral goodness. Therefore, li is ultimately reduced to ren. Confucius clearly argued that ren constitutes the restraint of the self for the return to li (Analects 12:1). Li is the way of practising ren. But, what is ren? In Lao’s Essential of Chinese Culture (1998), he argued that ren is the foundation of righteousness, devotion to public well-being (gongxin), and purification of intention. Ren implies the denial of self-interest, for righteousness contrasts with narrow self-interest (Analects 4:16). Once a person has denied his self-interest, he will pursue public well-being and righteousness.

To sum up, Lao argued that Confucius’ fundamental question was, “How can we preserve the social order?” As such, it leads to the question, “What is the legitimacy of li?” By reducing the concept of li to yi (righteousness) and ren (humaneness or benevolence), Lao approached Confucius’ answer systematically: the legitimacy of li comes from ren. Once a person practices li, he actualizes ren as devotion to public well-being.

c. Chinese Philosophy as an Orientative Philosophy

In his 1989 article “On Understanding Chinese Philosophy: An Inquiry and a Proposal,” Lao defined Chinese philosophy as an Orientative Philosophy and tried to convince the Western scholar to consider Chinese thoughts as a philosophical tradition. He introduced a simplified version of the Fundamental Question Method for the reconstruction of Chinese philosophies, which he called the “purpose theory.”

Firstly, Lao argued that philosophy is reflective thinking about certain functions of philosophy. Reflective thinking occurs when a person reflects on his own activities. Epistemology and hermeneutics reflect on the nature of human knowledge and understanding, while ethics reflects on the nature of human moral action. Metaphysics reflects on the underlying unity of the empirical world. The subject matter of reflective thinking in different periods and places can be radically different. When reflective thinking addresses a certain type of subject matter, it provides particular philosophical solutions to a particular philosophical problem. Therefore, to understand a particular philosophy, one must understand the problems with which it deals. If the problems of a particular philosophy have no relevance whatsoever to real life, said Lao, it should be rejected.

Secondly, Chinese philosophy is an orientative reflective thinking that intends to transform the self or the world. According to Lao’s definition, an orientative philosopher should suggest that there is a final purpose in life and that people should try to actualize such purpose in their daily living. Different schools of Chinese philosophy provide different normative guidelines or regulations for daily life. Lao named such guidelines “purpose-theories,” which contain three steps: (1) selecting a purpose, (2) justifying the purpose, and (3) offering practical maxims for people actualizing such a purpose.

Lao used the work of the Daoist philosopher Zhuangzi and the Confucian philosopher Mencius (Mengzi) as examples. Zhuangzi’s purpose was to achieve xiaoyao, which means “absolutely unburdened and unbound freedom” of the mind or the self. Lao identified xiaoyao as “transcendent freedom” because it exerts no influence on the objective world. In order to justify his purpose, one must understand Zhuangzi’s view of the world. According to Zhuangzi, the world is changing. He used the term hua to indicate the concept of change. The physical self is illusory, as “every empirical existence is in a relation of transformation with other existences. The elements that constitute my body did constitute, and will constitute, other things in the same time/space structure, or empirical world.” The “body is no more than a congregation of physical elements… which will disintegrate when the elements move to form other physical things” (Lao 1989, 280). The principle governing all changes in the world is known as zaohua (meaning “making changes”). In other words, the real self cannot be anything physical that changes restlessly. Instead of defining the non-physical self as the “real self,” Zhuangzi simply did not consider the real self as an object. The real self is beyond all beings and gets rid of self-limiting inclinations. The real self should not fall into the realm of beings, or else it would be limited by changes. Zhuangzi even denied the existence of anything valuable in the physical world. He rejected cultural values as limiting one’s freedom, for knowledge and values exist only within a system in which the criterion of truth is relative. There is no universal criterion of truth that transcends all theories and systems, according to Zhuangzi. The endless debates among philosophies, like the debate between Confucianism and Mohism, can never manifest the truth. Only the transcendent freedom of the self is valuable, according to Zhuangzi. One must become enlightened to enjoy transcendent freedom. Lao, however, argued that Zhuangzi did not provide a practical maxim that could teach people how to become enlightened.

In contrast to Zhuangzi’s purpose of the transformation of self, Lao saw Mencius’ purpose as the transformation of the world by creating a cultural order actualized by li (ritual propriety), yi (righteousness), and ren (humaneness or benevolence). In order to justify his purpose, Mencius established a doctrine of mind and essence (xin xing lun). He argued that the real root of all moral and cultural values is within human nature. As long as one can maintain the mastery of the mind over the body, one can act morally. According to him, there are “four beginnings (sishanduan),” which are also known as the four basic qualities of the mind: “The sprout of humaneness or benevolence [ren],” “the sprout of righteousness [yi],” “the sprout of ritual propriety [li],” and “the sprout of wisdom [zhi]” (Mencius 2A6). Xing, which can be translated as human nature or essence, is universal to every human being. The four beginnings are four innate moral capacities. Thus, the legitimacy of moral and cultural values and orders is determined by such universal virtues. A righteous government is one in which the rulers love the people through the virtue of ren. The legitimacy of authority lies on the will of the people. For practical maxims, Mencius emphasised not only self-transformation but also social transformation. Social transformation can only be achieved by a virtuous leader who fully actualizes his innate moral capacities. Self-transformation, however, can simply be achieved by the enlightenment. As long as a person is conscious of his innate moral capacities and actualizes them, he achieves self-transformation. Using Zhuangzi and Mencius as examples, Lao argued that Chinese philosophies, as orientative philosophies, aim to answer the question of “where to go” instead of “what it is” (Lao 1989, 290). Both Zhuangzi and Mencius tried to provide some directions for how one ought to live.

Overall, Lao’s purpose theory is merely a simplified version of the Fundamental Question Method. With the Fundamental Question Method, one must identify the fundamental questions, sub-questions, and answers so as to reconstruct the system of a particular Chinese school of philosophy. With the purpose theory, however, one only needs to identify a Chinese philosopher’s purpose with justification. One does not need to investigate how a fundamental question leads to several secondary questions and answers.

3. On Philosophy of Culture

While Lao is famous for his contribution to the study of the history of Chinese philosophy, his major research interest lies in Chinese cultural issues—namely, the philosophy of culture. Despite Lao’s deep interest in Chinese thought, his philosophy of culture draws heavily from German idealism, especially Hegel’s doctrine of “externalization,” which postulates that just as human beings come to perceive the world as alien and even hostile because it is “other,” not human—because the observed world is different from the human self that observes—so too can human beings reconcile themselves to the world by realizing that the world really is not “other” in relation to themselves.

In Lectures on Philosophy of Culture, Lao distinguished philosophy of culture from cultural critique or cultural studies. Having adopted Habermas’ trichotomy (distinction between philosophy, critique, and science) from the essay “Between Philosophy and Science—Marxism as Critique,” Lao argued that philosophy is merely theoretical, science is merely epistemically judgmental (according to experience), and critique is both theoretical and judgmental (Lao 2002, 42).

In order to understand Lao’s take on philosophy of culture, one must understand his definition of the term “philosophy of culture.” According to him, philosophy of culture is both descriptive and normative. As a descriptive philosophy, it aims to describe the nature or essence of a particular culture, while as a normative philosophy, it aims to evaluate the orientations or trends of cultural development. The term “culture” has two meanings: phenomenon and spirit. Human activities that express meanings and values are cultural phenomena, while the systems of those inner meanings and values are cultural spirits. Anthropology and social sciences only study cultural phenomena. Only philosophy investigates the underlying values and meanings behind that phenomena. Cultural spirit, which is “value consciousness,” determines the modes of cultural phenomena. When human beings are conscious of the existence of values and meanings and try to manifest them in human activities—including ideas, attitudes, systems, and customs—they are actualizing their cultural spirits. A cultural spirit is determined by free will (Lao 1998, 6-7). Therefore, culture is defined as a spirit or as “the actualization of value consciousness,” namely, the process of manifesting values in human activities. Because the subject matter of philosophy of culture is the cultural spirit, it is appropriate to look at Lao’s narratives of Chinese cultural spirit to understand his particular philosophy of culture.

a. Cultural Spirit as Self-Consciousness of Value

i. Categories of the Self

Subjectivity is an essential concept in Lao’s philosophy. Lao categorized the self into the moral self, the cognitive self, and the aesthetic self in terms of the “field of subjective activities,” namely, the mind activity of the self, manifesting itself in the external world against the limitations of the body. He calls this the “trichotomy of the self.” In terms of the numbers of the self, Lao provided another distinction: the “single subject” and the “multiple subjects.” Such distinction is known as the “dichotomy of the subject” (Lao 2000, 219).

In order to understand the concepts of cognitive self, moral self, and aesthetic self, one must understand the nature of the “subjective mind activity.” According to Lao, mind activity tries to manifest itself in the external world and to achieve self-actualization. To achieve self-actualization, one must overcome the physical limitation imposed by the body and the external world. In other words, self-actualization is a struggle for freedom against limitation. The body or the physical self of a person is not his real self, for the body is determined by external factors instead of one’s free will. The body is mechanical and determined by conditions; when the hand feels the heat of the fire, it immediately moves away from the fire.

The cognitive self is manifested as cognitive judgment. Cognitive judgment aims to analyze or reflect on experience so as to produce certain knowledge. Cognitive judgment is objective and universally valid. The facts that 1 + 1 = 2 and that H2O is water are both universally and objectively true. The cognitive self is the subject undertaking such cognitive judgment. Such self-freedom is not complete freedom, for that cognitive judgment is nonetheless limited by external conditions, which are experiences. The self has no dominion over the experience it receives. Free will does not affect the validity of the judgment.

The moral self is manifested as ethical judgment. Ethical judgments are value judgments. Value judgments are unconditional. When one says that killing is morally wrong, one means that killing is always wrong. Therefore, ethical judgments are also universal. However, the objects of value judgments must be free human beings. When person A considers his own action C1 as being morally right or wrong, he assumes that C1 is an intentional action done by himself according to his free will. In other words, person A assumes that he has dominion over his own action C1 and is responsible for his own actions. The self, manifested in value judgment, therefore, is always dominant over some actions (Lao 1998, 143).

The aesthetic self-manifests itself in aesthetic or emotional judgment. Unlike the moral self or the cognitive self, the aesthetic self brings no universal judgment. Aesthetic judgment, like sexual desires or appetite, is merely about preferences. When person B makes an aesthetic judgment that he wants an object or a state of affair x, he assumes that his desire for x is intentional, but his desire for x is never universal. Someone from Hong Kong may want to drink Hong Kong-style milk tea for breakfast this morning but British-style Earl Grey tea tomorrow morning. A person may fall in love with different people at different times and places. More importantly, “B wants x” is only valid for person B alone. In other words, the validity of an aesthetic judgment is subjective. Person B “clings to” object x where such satisfaction depends on external conditions, for the satisfaction of desire is not determined by one’s own free will. Therefore, the dominion and the freedom of an aesthetic self is very limited.

ii. Moral Subjectivity in Confucianism and the Rejection of Metaphysical Interpretation

Confucianism, according to Lao, emphasizes only the moral self. Like his contemporaries, Lao acknowledged that subjectivity—being a moral subject itself—is essential to Confucianism. Mencius’ doctrine of mind and essence affirmed that everyone shares the innate moral goodness to act morally in the form of “four beginnings.” One does not need to learn how to be a moral person. One need only to acknowledge the fact that human nature is good, and one needs to actualize his own moral capacity by following certain teachings. According to Lao, Mencius was the first person to argue that the origin of moral values and virtues, namely, the self-consciousness of one’s innate moral capacity, is internal instead of external. However, the Han dynasty Confucians were ignorant of Mencius’ xin xing lun and instead defined heaven as the external source of moral values with the help of yin yang cosmology. Lao criticized the Han Confucians for being too “metaphysical” (Lao 1984, vol. 2, 10). Nonetheless, the later Confucian thinkers known as “Neo-Confucians” gradually moved from cosmology to the xin xing lun. The only exception is the Lu-Wang school, which argued that the mind itself is the innate moral principle (xin ji li, “the mind is the reason”) is closer to Mencius’ philosophy than the Cheng-Zhu school, which argued that the heavenly command is the supreme moral principle (xing ji li, “the essence is the reason”) (Lao 1984, vol. 3a, 489).

Because Confucians argued that the origin of moral value is internal to every human being, they emphasized the priority of the moral self or of subjectivity. The moral self transcends from the bodily limitation and postulates moral principles according to its own innate moral capacity. The moral self-manifests freedom through moral actualization or virtue completion. The social and cultural orders are not sources of moral values. Rather, they are the instruments that help every individual to actualize his own moral capacity. Confucian emphasis on the moral self leads to a Confucian doctrine of culture: that all cultural phenomena should manifest the internal moral values in every individual. Such a statement is essential to Lao’s analysis of the nature of traditional Chinese culture, which is strongly shaped by Confucian ethics.

iii. “Eastern Spirit” vs. “Western Spirit”

Lao contrasted the “Eastern spirit” with the “Western spirit” by claiming that the Eastern spirit is virtue-oriented while the Western spirit is wisdom-oriented. In Collection of Essays on Cultural Problems (2000), Lao argued that the wisdom-oriented spirit originating from ancient Greek philosophy is the orthodox cultural spirit in the West, unlike the faith-oriented Hebrew spirit (Lao 2000, 30). A wisdom-oriented spirit is a spirit that pursues objective knowledge. The Eastern spirit, however, is a virtue-oriented spirit, which pursues moral order. Easterners aim to establish a proper way of living. Both the Chinese cultural spirit and the Indian cultural spirit are virtue-oriented Eastern spirits. The Chinese cultural spirit, however, emphasises moral actualization and virtue completion, while the Indian cultural spirit emphasises renunciation. The Chinese cultural spirit is dominated by the Confucian spirit (Lao 2001, 218), which aims to construct a “reasonable” or “proper” social order according to human nature (Lao 2000, 48).

According to Lao, the ancient Chinese—unlike Westerners—emphasized social order more than knowledge about the external world. The “reasonableness” of social order is not about objective evidence. Instead, it is about its coherence with innate human nature. As discussed above, Confucius reduced li as social order into yi (righteousness) and ren (humaneness or benevolence). The legitimacy or the moral value of social order does not depend on an external God, monarch, or objective form. Instead, it depends on ren alone, which is internal to the moral self. Li is the actualization of the virtue of ren. The rituals and order between parents and children manifest the filial and family love, while those between monarchs and ministers manifest teamwork, solicitude, and loyalty. As a result, the moral self becomes the only source of all moral and cultural values. The legitimacy of moral and cultural values is not demonstrated by experiences or reasoning.

Under the Chinese cultural spirit, the aesthetic self and the ethical self are submissive to the moral self. Because, for Lao, the ultimate concern in Chinese culture is virtue completion or actualization, knowledge and arts are merely instruments for moral practices. For example, poems and verses should manifest proper moral values. Architecture is merely used for the sake of improving people’s well-being, as in the construction of China’s Great Canal and Great Wall. Arts and sciences are not used for their own sakes. They are all used for the sake of moral actualization.

Having distinguished the Chinese cultural spirit from other cultural spirits, Lao argued that the Chinese emphasis on social order led to a different perspective on interpersonal relationships. Moral actualization requires the actualization of the innate human nature of the moral self instead of other selves. Only a single self participates in moral actualization. Moreover, the Chinese cultural spirit only emphasises the role of the moral self. Lao did not consider the cognitive self and the aesthetic self as independent from the moral self, as all cognitive and aesthetic activities are merely instruments of moral actualization. Therefore, there is only one self in the Chinese cultural spirit, namely, the moral self.

b. Modernization of Chinese Culture

i. The Problem of Objectivity

Based on his philosophy of culture, Lao established his political philosophy and provided criticism of traditional Chinese culture. As discussed above, for Lao, the Chinese cultural spirit is dominated by the Confucian spirit, which only emphasises the actualization of the moral self as a single self, instead of multiple and equal selves. In Lao’s Liberty, Democracy and Cultural Creation (2001), he explained why democracy and modern natural science are absent from traditional Chinese culture.

There are two kinds of interpersonal relations according to Lao, namely, coordinative relations (bing li guan xi) and hierarchical relations (ceng ji guan xi). A coordinative relation is an equal relation among individuals, while a hierarchical relation is unequal (Lao 2001, 224). In order to deal with certain “public affairs,” individual members of the society gather under a particular relation. If the members gather in a coordinative relation, acknowledging each member as an equal individual, they may develop a democracy. However, if they gather in a hierarchical relation, they may have a monarchy or an aristocracy.

The dominance of the moral self leads to a hierarchical relation, for the moral self suppresses the cognitive and aesthetic selves. The authority of the moral self cannot be challenged by the cognitive or aesthetic selves. The cognitive self cannot question the legitimacy of virtue and rituals, as their legitimacy does not rely on reason or empirical evidence. The moral self is a single individual who does not seek anything outward, for it has already attained all innate virtues. The Confucian emphasis on the moral self leads to a hierarchical relation, which is the social and cultural order according to the principle of li.

The absence of coordinative relations in the Chinese cultural spirit implies the absence of democracy and modern natural science. Lao argued that the virtue-oriented Chinese cultural spirit does not acknowledge inter-subjectivity, as the moral self is a single self suppressing all other selves. Without a coordinative relation, equality is impossible. Scientific knowledge is objective knowledge, which is verifiable or falsifiable by empirical evidence. In other words, the authority of scientific knowledge does not depend on any individual but on the objective evidence to which everyone has equal access. Scientific knowledge assumes the concept of equality and coordinative relations. If a scientist S1 verifies that theory T is true with experiment E, other scientists like S2, S3, S4 … and Sn should be able to verify theory T with the same experiment E. There are multiple subjects who are cognitive selves having equal access to the same method and the same knowledge, regardless of their social status.

Social status and roles, however, are important in the Confucian concept of virtue completion or moral actualization. Confucius argued that a monarch should behave like a monarch, a minister should behave like a minister, a father should behave like a father, and a son should behave like a son. The hierarchical order determines the particular ways of virtue completion for different people. A son has no access to his father’s moral practices and vice versa. A minister acting as a virtuous monarch is vicious for having seized the power from the monarch. One cannot actualize his innate virtue if he refuses to act according to his social role.

Hierarchical relations emphasise authority. Education and entertainment are distributed to different people according to their social statuses. A peasant should not play royal music in his home as it is not proper. A student should not condemn his teacher’s teaching openly as it is impolite. The overemphasis on authority prevents the development of modern natural science, which constantly falsifies previous theories. Hierarchical relations also prevent the development of democracy due to the denial of equality.

In short, Lao criticized the Chinese cultural spirit for its overemphasis on the moral self, which suppresses the cognitive and aesthetic selves and denies the existence of a coordinate interpersonal relation. Lao assumed that the Chinese cultural spirit is dominated by the Confucian spirit, which aims to actualize the internal and innate virtues of ren. Although he did not provide a concrete solution to cure the “sickness of Chinese culture,” he argued that if Chinese culture is to be modernized, it should acknowledge the existence of multiple subjects and a coordinate relation and develop an independent cognitive self. Lao claimed that most contemporary Chinese scholars failed to diagnose the problem of Chinese culture. This led to two extreme perspectives on the modernization of Chinese culture: traditionalism and anti-traditionalism. Lao condemned both perspectives as one-sided misinterpretations of the Chinese cultural spirit, as explained below.

ii. The Problem of Traditionalism

Traditionalists are people who argue for the full restoration and preservation of traditional Chinese culture against Western cultural invasion. Traditionalists do not argue against Chinese modernization. Rather, traditionalists argue that there are precious values within traditional Chinese culture that must be preserved. Traditionalists do not reject Western thoughts. Instead, they argue that the introduction of Western thought must be based on the preservation of essential traditional Chinese values. Such a perspective is known as zhongti xiyong (“Chinese [thought for] fundamentals and Western [thought for] practical application”) (Lao 2003, 104). For example, the early 20th century Chinese reformer Liang Qichao (1873-1929) argued that Western constitutional monarchies are consistent with traditional Confucian ethics, while Mou Zongsan tried to reinterpret Confucianism with the help of Kantian ethics.

According to Lao, traditionalists generally follow a Hegelian model of culture, according to which “[internal] values determine the activities which are manifested as [external] systems” (Lao 2003, 104-105). In the Manifesto on the Reappraisal of Chinese Culture (1958), “new Confucian” philosophers—including the aforementioned Mou Zongsan and Tang Junyi—reconstructed traditional Chinese culture by articulating how Confucian values determine the Chinese cultural phenomenon. Tang even argued that conservative attitudes can be progressive. Progression must be based on value consciousness: how to manifest values in contemporary situations (Tang, 1974, 24). The overseas Chinese refugee must be confident with traditional Chinese culture and “re-root oneself spiritually” in order to preserve traditional Chinese values (Tang 1974, 49). However, Lao questioned Tang and his fellow “new Confucians” by asking why Confucian and traditional Chinese values are worthy of preservation and manifestation in the contemporary world. Lao argued that if traditional Chinese culture needs to be restored or preserved, as new Confucians argued, then traditional Chinese culture had already declined. So why did traditional Chinese culture decline? And why is traditional Chinese culture worthy of being preserved? Someone taking Tang’s position might reply by arguing in favour of the unique features of Chinese Confucian values, for example the xin xing lun, and blaming the Western invasion for the decline of traditional Chinese culture. As discussed before, however, Lao argued that Confucian overemphasis on moral self and the suppression of cognitive and aesthetic selves led to that cultural decline. Natural science and democracy failed to develop within traditional Chinese culture until the Western invasion arrived. For Lao, this amounted to a devastating critique of the traditionalist arguments advanced by Tang and his colleagues. Still, this did not mean that Lao embraced the anti-traditionalist view, either.

iii. The Problem of Anti-Traditionalism

As opposed to traditionalists, anti-traditionalists are people who reject the value of traditional Chinese culture entirely in order to achieve Chinese modernization. Hostility towards traditional Chinese culture was the mainline ideology in early 20th century China. After the First Opium War (1839-1842), the Qing dynasty suffered from invasions and interventions by the West. Chinese people were aware of the weakness of traditional Chinese culture and tried to modernize China through Westernization. After the overthrow of the Qing dynasty and founding of the Republic of China in 1912, the imperial system collapsed, which challenged the hierarchical order of traditional Chinese culture. The May Fourth New Culture Movement in 1919 blamed traditional Chinese culture for being a barrier to Chinese modernization. This movement assumed that modernization counteracts traditional Chinese culture.

To evaluate anti-traditionalists’ criticism of traditional Chinese culture, Lao reconstructed the anti-traditionalist argument as follows:

  1. Traditional Chinese culture is a barrier to Chinese modernization.
  2. Confucianism is an influential origin of traditional Chinese culture.
  3. To achieve modernization, one must oppose traditional Chinese culture and therefore reject Confucianism (Lao 2003, 59).

Furthermore, to demonstrate that traditional Chinese culture is a barrier to Chinese modernization, one must demonstrate the truth of two statements: that traditional Chinese culture is influential enough to prevent Chinese modernization and that all factors preventing Chinese modernization stem from traditional Chinese culture. Lao argued that both statements can hardly be substantiated. Traditional Chinese culture was very weak in modern Chinese society after the Opium Wars. The republic replaced the imperial monarchy in the 1912 revolution, and modern written Chinese replaced classical written Chinese in the 1919 May Fourth New Cultural Movement. Both the Chinese Communist Party and the KMT, while bitterly opposed to one another, engaged in critiques of traditional Chinese culture (Lao 2003, 59-60).

Lao argued that, while there are counterexamples that reject the first statement, it is difficult to justify the second statement. There are numerous factors preventing Chinese modernization that may come not from traditional Chinese culture, but from humans’ simple animal nature, namely, instincts like selfishness, fear, and so on. People’s fear of change may prevent social reform, and rulers’ ambitions of power may prevent democratic reform. Traditional Chinese culture may have nothing to do with these factors. Therefore, it is unfair to blame traditional Chinese culture for preventing Chinese modernization. Besides, while the Confucian spirit dominates the traditional Chinese cultural spirit, Confucianism is not the only influential origin of Chinese values. Daoism and Buddhism are more influential at the popular level of society than Confucianism. Even if traditional Chinese culture were the major barrier to Chinese modernization, it is unfair to argue that Confucianism is also a barrier, as the traditional Chinese culture is not identical with Confucianism (Lao 2003, 62).

Lao criticized anti-traditionalists for their failure to acknowledge modernization as imitation or learning, rather than destroying one’s own traditional cultural heritage. A native speaker of Cantonese cannot learn English as his second language until he can speak his native language. When he learns English as a second language, he does not give up Cantonese as his native language. Learning is the process of obtaining new abilities based on existing capacity. Without existing capacity, it is difficult to learn any new skill (Lao 2003, 73).

4. Criticisms and Influence

Lao’s writings make it clear that he tended to overemphasize the importance of Confucianism in characterizing Chinese culture at the expense of other traditions, especially Buddhism and Daoism. In Essentials of Chinese Culture, Lao expressed his bias against the Daoist religion. He argued that the Daoist religion has little impact on political systems and moral teachings, as the Daoist religion “is not believed by the scholars” (Lao 1998, 180).

Moreover, Lao assumed that Chinese scholars or philosophers—most of whom were social elites—determined the nature of the Chinese cultural spirit. Given that since the 11th century or so, most Chinese elites have embraced Confucianism, for Lao it seemed obvious that Confucianism defines the Chinese cultural spirit. However, as continental philosophers such as N. F. S. Grundtvig have pointed out, it is questionable whether a cultural spirit is defined by scholars alone. Lao seemed to assume that the working class and folk religion play only small roles in cultural development. However, if a cultural spirit bears the true meaning and values behind all cultural phenomena, one should observe how those cultural phenomena are manifested in reality and how community members interpret a particular cultural phenomenon.

Additionally, Lao’s definition of culture as a “cultural spirit” is problematic. If culture is defined as a cultural spirit, which is value consciousness, it means that all members share and manifest the same values in their cultural behavior, for as long as they are conformists. However, the fact is that it is possible for members of the same culture to interpret the same cultural phenomenon with different values. An uneducated peasant may have no knowledge about the deep meanings behind the rituals of ancestor worship or a traditional Chinese marriage ceremony. He may merely follow the customs and habits without reflection. Alternatively, he may interpret ancestor worship in a very different way from the standard Confucian interpretation endorsed by Confucian scholars. While Confucian scholars interpret the ritual of ancestor worship as a way to show respect and commemorate ancestors, a peasant may practice ancestor worship as a way to ask ancestors to bless his family. Different subgroups, economic classes, or families within the same community may have vastly different interpretations of the same cultural phenomenon. Differences in value consciousness imply different cultural spirits. Thus, the definition of culture as cultural spirit or value consciousness is problematic, as it is very difficult to verify what values are essential to a particular culture.

Agreeing with the idea that the Confucian spirit dominates the Chinese cultural spirit and that the latter emphasises virtue completion or moral actualization, it is nonetheless unclear why the dominion of the moral self in the Chinese cultural spirit implies a hierarchical relation among individuals. The moral self’s suppression of the aesthetic and cognitive selves does not signify the single self’s suppression of the other selves. A real individual self is a union of the aesthetic self, the cognitive self, and the moral self. The relation between the aesthetic, cognitive, and moral selves should be distinguished from the relation between individual selves. The former can be a suppression within a single individual self, but the latter is a suppression among different individual selves, namely, an individual who oppresses other individuals. Undoubtedly, Lao confused the real individual self with the moral self. More importantly, as Confucianism acknowledges that everyone has the innate moral capacity to achieve virtue completion, it should be able to acknowledge the equality of human beings. Why, then, did classical Confucianism not acknowledge such equality but instead develop a hierarchical relation among people?

Furthermore, when it comes to the role of Confucian values in traditional Chinese culture, Lao seems to contradict himself. On one hand, Lao himself realized that Confucian values have a limited influence on traditional Chinese culture when he distinguished the opposition against traditional Chinese culture from the opposition against Confucianism in his discussion of anti-traditionalism. On the other hand, Lao maintained that the Confucian cultural spirit dominates traditional Chinese culture, assuming that Chinese scholars determined the structure of traditional Chinese culture while Daoism and Buddhism were less influential.

Finally, despite its having been influenced by Western thought, Lao’s philosophy of culture contained a certain bias against Western culture, which weakened his discussions on transcultural dialogue between Chinese culture and Western cultures. Lao displayed no interest whatsoever in Christian contributions to such transcultural dialogue, nor did he acknowledge Christianity’s influence on the modernization of Chinese culture. Considering the fact that Lao spent many years teaching at Chung Chi College, a Protestant Christian institution in which discussions of dialogue between Christianity and Confucianism were frequent and enthusiastic, it is surprising that he has so little to say about Christianity. He devoted only a few pages of The Essentials of Chinese Culture to summarizing the history of Christianity in China. Without offering any evidence, Lao argued that Christianity “has yet to infiltrate the cultural life of the Chinese nation” and that Chinese people have little passion for the Christian faith (Lao 1998, 191).

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Kang de zhi shi lun yao yi [Essential of Kant’s Theory of Knowledge]. Hong Kong: Union Press, 1974.
  • Li shi zhi cheng fa [The Punishment of History]. Hong Kong: University Life Ltd., 1971.
  • Zhongguo zhi lu xiang [China’s Way Out]. Hong Kong: Wisdom Publishing, 1981.
  • Xin bian zhong guo zhe xue shi [New Edition of the History of Chinese Philosophy]. Taipei: San Min Book Co. Ltd, 1984-1986.
  • “On Understanding Chinese Philosophy: An Inquiry and a Proposal,” in Understanding the Chinese Mind: The Philosophical Roots, ed. Robert E. Allinson (Hong Kong: Oxford University Press, 1989), 265-293.
  • Zhongguo wenhua yao yi xin bian [Essentials of Chinese Culture]. Hong Kong: The Chinese University Press, 1998.
  • Wen hua wen ti lun ji xin bian [Collection of Essays on Cultural Problems]. Hong Kong: The Chinese University Press, 2000.
  • Wen hua zhe xue yan jiang lu [Lectures on Philosophy of Culture]. Hong Kong: The Chinese University Press, 2003.
  • Xu jing yu xi wang: lun dang dai zhe xue yu wen hua [Illusion and Hope: On Contemporary Philosophy and Culture]. Hong Kong: The Chinese University Press, 2003.
  • Dang dai xi fang si xiang de kun ju [The Dilemma of the Contemporary Western Thoughts]. Taipei: Commercial Press Taiwan, 2014.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Mou Zongsan, Xu Fuguan, Zhang Junmai, Tang Junyi, and Xie Youwei. “Manifesto on Behalf of Chinese Culture Respectfully Announced to the People of the World: Our Joint Understanding of Sinological Study and Chinese Culture with Respect to the Future Prospects of World Culture,” trans. Eirik Lang Harris. Hackett Publishing, 2018.
  • Shen, Vincent. “Obituary of Lao Sze Kwang.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 40/1 (2013): 215-217.
  • Tam, Andrew Ka Pok. A Discourse on Hong Kong Culture. Hong Kong: Passion Times, 2016.
  • Tang Junyi. Shuo zhong hua min zu zhi hua guo piao ling [On the Falling Flower and the Withering Fruit of the Chinese Nation]. Taipei: San Min Book Co. Ltd, 1974.


Author Information

Andrew Ka Pok Tam
University of Glasgow
United Kingdom