Plato’s Meno introduces aspects of Socratic ethics and Platonic epistemology in a fictional dialogue that is set among important political events and cultural concerns in the last years of Socrates’ life. It begins as an abrupt, prepackaged debater’s challenge from Meno about whether virtue can be taught, and quickly becomes an open and inconclusive search for the essence of this elusive “virtue,” or human goodness in general. This inquiry exhibits typical features of the Socratic method of elenchus, or refutation by cross-examination, and it employs typical criteria for the notoriously difficult goal of Socratic definitions. But then a distinctive objection to the possibility of learning anything at all by such inquiry prompts the introduction of characteristically Platonic themes of immortality, mathematics, and a “recollection” of knowledge not learned by experience in this life. A model geometry lesson with an uneducated slave is supposed to illustrate the importance of being aware of our own ignorance, the nature of proper education, the difference between knowledge and true belief, and the possibility of learning things without being taught. When the conversation returns to Meno’s initial question of whether virtue can be taught, Socrates introduces another manner of investigation, a method of “hypotheses,” by which he argues that virtue must be some kind of knowledge, and so it must be something that’s taught. But then Socrates also argues to the contrary that since virtue is never actually taught, it seems not to be knowledge after all.
This dialogue portrays aspects of Socratic ignorance and Socratic irony while it enacts his twofold mission of exposing common arrogant pretensions and pursuing a philosophical knowledge of virtue that no one ever seems to have. It is pervaded with typical Socratic and Platonic criticisms of how, in spite of people’s constant talk of virtue, they value things like wealth and power more than wisdom and justice. And it includes a tense confrontation with one of the men who will bring Socrates to trial on charges of corrupting young minds with dangerous teachings about morality and religion. The dialogue closes with the surprising suggestion that virtue as practiced in our world both depends on true belief rather than knowledge and is received as some kind of divine gift.
Table of Contents
- Overview of the Dialogue
- Major Themes of the Dialogue
- Relations of the Meno to Other Platonic Dialogues
- References and Further Reading
The Meno is a philosophical fiction, based on real people who took part in important historical events. Plato wrote it probably about 385 B.C.E., and placed it dramatically in 402 B.C.E. Socrates was then about sixty-seven years old, and had long been famous for his difficult questions about virtue and knowledge. In just a few years, he would be convicted and executed for the crime of corrupting the youth of Athens. This dialogue probably takes place in one of Athens’ gymnasia, where men and boys of leisure gathered not just for exercise, but also for education and socializing. Socrates often conducted his distinctive philosophical conversations in places like that, and ambitious young men like Meno, who studied public speaking and the hot intellectual topics of the times, wanted to hear what Socrates had to say. Some wanted to try refuting him in public.
The larger setting is the political and social crisis at the end of the long Peloponnesian War. After finally being defeated by Sparta, Athens has narrowly escaped total destruction, and is now ruled by a Spartan-backed oligarchy. The questions in the Meno about teaching virtue are directly related to longstanding tensions between oligarchic and democratic factions. For generations, Athens had been an intellectual, economic, and military leader, especially after her crucial role—together with Sparta—in repelling the Persian invasions of Greece in 490 B.C.E. and 480 B.C.E. Athens’ radically democratic form of government was distinctive but influential in typically oligarchic Greece, and influential largely because she presided over the Delian League of nearly 200 city-states, which became an Athenian empire. After those Persian invasions, many independent cities had asked Athens to replace Sparta in leading a united defense and reprisal against the Persian empire. But eventually most were just supplying mandated funds to Athens, basically for the continuation of Athens’ war against Sparta’s Peloponnesian League. Through many reversals of fortune, Athens both suffered greatly and flourished culturally, using some of that tribute for her own development and adornment. Much of the best Greek art still familiar to us today—the sculpture and architecture, the tragedy and comedy—comes from the Athens of that time. Artists and intellectuals flocked to Athens, including the new kind of traveling teachers, called “sophists,” who are so disparaged in the last part of the Meno. These teachers were independent entrepreneurs, competing with each other and providing an early form of higher education. Much of their influence came through their expensive courses in public speaking, which in Athens prepared young men of old aristocratic families for success in democratic politics. But various sophists also taught various other subjects, from mathematics to anthropology to literary criticism.
Shortly before this dialogue takes place, some leading Spartans and allies considered killing all the Athenian men and enslaving the women and children. But they decided instead to support a takeover by a brutal, narrow oligarchy, led by thirty members of aristocratic Athenian families who were unhappy with the democracy. Their executions, expropriations, and expulsions earned them the hatred of most Athenians; later “the Thirty” became known as “the Thirty Tyrants.” The extremists among them first purged their more obvious enemies, then turned to the moderates who resisted their cruelty and wanted a broader oligarchy or restricted democracy that included the thousands in the middle class. Thousands of Athenians were killed or fled the city, and many who stayed acquiesced in fear for their lives. But supporters of a return to democracy soon rallied outside the city, defeating the Thirty’s army in May 403 B.C.E. The conversation in the Meno takes place in late January or early February 402 B.C.E. (after Anytus’ return from exile in 403 B.C.E., before Meno’s departure for Persia by early 401 B.C.E., and shortly before annual rites of initiation to the religious Mysteries, which are mentioned at Meno 76e). Democratic and oligarchic factions might then still have been negotiating terms of reconciliation in order to prevent further civil war. The resulting agreement included a general amnesty for crimes committed up to that time, excluding only the Thirty and a few other officials. But the last of the extreme oligarchs would soon massacre the nearby town of Eleusis and take power there, and then attempt another takeover at Athens in 401 B.C.E., before they are finally put down for good.
As Meno and Socrates discuss the nature of virtue and how it might be acquired, the Athenian success story is not over. The democracy would continue for most of the next century, and even a semblance of the empire would be revived. But for now, the recently restored democracy is anxious about continuing class conflict, and fearful of renewed civil war. Some democrats were suspicious of Socrates, and may have believed that he had sided with the extreme oligarchs, because of his prior relationships with some of them. The general amnesty did not allow prosecuting such allegations. But after the war, Socrates continued his uniquely nondemocratic yet anti-elitist, unconventional yet anti-sophistic interrogations. Many Athenians thought that he was undermining traditional morality and piety, and thereby corrupting the young minds of a vulnerable community. Those were the formal charges that led to Socrates’ execution in 399 B.C.E.
About the historical Socrates, much of what we think we know is drawn from what Plato wrote about him. Socrates published nothing himself, but, probably soon after his death, the Socratic dialogue was born as a new genre of literature. He was portrayed with different emphases by different authors, including Xenophon, Aeschines, Antisthenes, Phaedo, Euclides, and others. But what interests most people about Socrates today comes from Plato’s philosophical portraits. Even these Platonic portraits vary somewhat across his many dialogues, but all are similar in one way or another to what we see in the Meno. Generally, Plato’s Socrates focuses his inquiries on moral subjects, and he will discuss them with anyone who is interested. He claims not to know the answers to his questions, and he interrogates others who do claim to know those answers. He seeks definitions of virtues like courage, moderation, justice, and piety, and often he suggests that each virtue, or virtue as a whole, is really some kind of knowledge.
As Plato depicts Socrates, it was not easy to understand his position in either the politics or the controversial new teachings of the time. Many of his contemporaries, like Meno and Anytus in this dialogue, probably could not distinguish his kinds of questions from other “arts of words” practiced by other intellectuals or “sophists.” But Plato often has Socrates criticizing sophists for claiming to teach more than they knew, and he emphasizes that, by contrast, Socrates never claimed to be a teacher, never accepted fees for his conversations, never sought wealth or political power, and always pursued subjects related to seeking the real nature of virtue.
To make matters more confusing, a few of the Thirty Tyrants or their extremist supporters, like Critias and Charmides, had earlier been associates of Socrates. But again, Socrates’ position in the conflict is not obvious. While he criticized democracy generally for putting power in the hands of an unwise and fickle majority, he never advocated rule by the wealthy either, and certainly not any of the Thirty’s cruel deeds. Plato emphasizes that Socrates respected common citizens more than the famous and powerful (Apology 21b-22e), and that he disobeyed direct orders from the Thirty, at risk to his own life (32cd). Socrates generally advocates humility and justice above all (for example, Apology 20cff, 29dff, Crito 49aff), and he specifically refutes and chastises Charmides and Critias in Plato’s Charmides.
Meno is apparently visiting the newly restored Athenian government to request aid for his family, one of the ruling aristocracies in Thessaly, in northern Greece, that was currently facing new power struggles there. Meno’s family had previously been such help to Athens against Sparta that his grandfather (also named Meno) was granted Athenian citizenship. We do not know what resulted from Meno’s mission to Athens, but we do know that he soon left Greece to serve as a commander of mercenary troops for Cyrus of Persia—in what turned out to be Cyrus’ attempt to overthrow his brother, King Artaxerxes II.
Meno was young for such a position, about twenty years old, but he was a favorite of the powerful Aristippus, a fellow aristocrat who had borrowed thousands of troops from Cyrus for those power struggles in Thessaly, and was now returning many of them. The contemporary historian Xenophon (who also wrote Socratic dialogues) survived Cyrus’ failed campaign, and he wrote an account whose description of Meno resonates with Plato’s portrait here: ambitious yet lazy for the hard work of doing things properly, and motivated by desire for wealth and power while easily forgetting friendship and justice. But Xenophon paints Meno as a thoroughly selfish and unscrupulous schemer, while Plato sketches him as a potentially dangerous, overly confident young man who has begun to tread the path of arrogance. His natural talents and his privileged but unphilosophical education are not guided by wisdom or even patience, and he prefers “good things” like money over genuine understanding and moral virtue. In this dialogue, Plato imagines Meno encountering Socrates shortly before that disastrous Persian adventure, when he has not yet proved himself to be the “scoundrel” and “tyrant” that Socrates suspects and Xenophon later confirms. According to Xenophon, when Cyrus was killed and his other commanders were quickly beheaded by the King’s men, Meno was separated and tortured at length before being killed, because of his special treachery (see Xenophon’s Anabasis II, 6).
Anytus is a prominent Athenian politician and Meno’s host in Athens. He too was wealthy, not in Meno’s old aristocratic way, but as heir to the successful tannery of a self-made businessman. Anytus is passionately opposed to those sophists who thrived in Athens’ democracy and claimed to teach virtue along with so many other things. He prefers the more traditional assumption that good gentlemen learn goodness not from professional teachers but by association with the previous generation of good gentlemen. (That was a traditional aristocratic notion, but it has a democratic shape at Meno 92e, Apology 24d ff., and Protagoras 325c ff.) Although Plato was not a fan of most sophists either, he portrays Anytus’ attitude as clearly prejudicial. And though Socrates is no professional teacher, Anytus considers him just as bad, or worse. Anytus is one of three men who will bring Socrates to trial in 399 B.C.E.
Anytus had himself been prosecuted in 409 B.C.E., for failure as a general in the war against Sparta, and allegedly he escaped punishment by bribing the jury. Later, he supported the moderate faction among the Thirty Tyrants, and was banished by the extremists. Then he was a general for the democratic forces in the fight to overthrow the Thirty in 403 B.C.E., and he quickly became a leading politician in the restored democracy. In the Meno, Socrates presses Anytus about why so many of Athens’ leading statesmen have failed to teach even their own sons to be good, and Anytus could probably see that these questions apply to himself. Xenophon’s Apology of Socrates, which is rather different from Plato’s, suggests that Anytus had a personal grudge against Socrates, since Socrates had criticized Anytus’ education of his own son, and predicted that he would turn out to be no good. But Anytus may well have sincerely believed that Socrates corrupted young men like Critias and Charmides by teaching them to question good traditions. At any rate, Socrates’ questions about education in the Meno upset Anytus enough to warn Socrates to desist, or risk getting hurt—thus foreshadowing Anytus’ role in Socrates’ trial. (Compare Meno 94e f. and 99e f. with Apology 23a-24a and 30cd.)
There are three main parts to this dialogue, which are three main stages in the argumentation that leads to the tentative conclusion about how virtue is acquired.
The dialogue opens with Meno’s challenge to Socrates about how “virtue” (aretê) is achieved. Is it something that is taught, or acquired through training, or possessed by nature? Socrates quickly turns the discussion into an investigation of something more basic, namely, what such virtue is. Since Socrates denies knowing the nature of virtue, while Meno confidently claims to know all about it, Socrates gets Meno to try defining it. Most of this third of the dialogue is then an extended series of arguments against Meno’s three attempts to define virtue. We see the famous “Socratic Method,” in which Socrates refutes someone’s claim to knowledge by revealing that one of their claims is contradicted by others that they also believe to be true. For example, Meno’s initial claim that there are irreducibly different virtues for different kinds of people (71e) is incompatible with his implicit belief (elicited by Socrates) that virtues cannot be different insofar as they are virtues. And Meno’s definition of virtue as the ability to rule over others (73d) is incompatible with his agreements that a successful definition of virtue must apply to all cases of virtue (so including those of children and slaves) and only to cases of virtue (so excluding cases of unjust rule). In each case, since Meno accepts these claims that contradict his proposed definitions, he is shown not to know what he thought he knew about virtue. As Socrates three times exposes the inadequacies of Meno’s attempted definitions, giving examples and guidelines for further practice, Meno’s enthusiasm gives way to reluctance and frustration. Eventually, Meno blames Socrates for his trouble, and insults Socrates by comparing him with the ugly, numbing stingray. Then he makes a momentous objection to conducting such an inquiry at all.
The second stage of the dialogue begins with that momentous, twofold objection: if someone does not already know what virtue is, how could he even look for it, and how could he even recognize it if he were to happen upon it? Socrates replies by reformulating that objection as a paradoxical dilemma, then arguing that the dilemma is based on a false dichotomy. The dilemma is that we cannot learn either what we know or what we do not know, because there is no need to learn what we already know, and we cannot recognize what we do not yet know. Socrates tries to expose the false dichotomy by identifying states of cognition between complete knowledge and pure ignorance. First, he introduces a notion that the human soul has learned in previous lives, and suggests that learning is therefore possible by remembering what has been known but forgotten. (Forgotten-but-capable-of-being-remembered is a state of cognition between complete knowledge and pure ignorance.) Then he tries to illustrate this “theory of recollection” with the example of a geometry lesson, in which Socrates refutes a slave’s incorrect answers much as he had refuted Meno, and then leads him to recognize that the correct answer is implied by his own prior true beliefs. (Implicit true belief is another state of cognition between complete knowledge and pure ignorance.) After the geometry lesson, Socrates briefly reinterprets the alleged “recollection” in a way that can be taken as the discovery of some kind of innate knowledge, or innate ideas or beliefs. Meno finds Socrates’ explanation somehow compelling, but puzzling. Socrates says he will not vouch for the details, but recommends it as encouraging us to work hard at learning what we do not now know. He asks Meno to join him again in a search for the definition of virtue.
But in the third stage of the dialogue, Meno nonetheless resists, and asks Socrates instead to answer his initial question: is virtue something that is taught, or is it acquired in some other way? Socrates criticizes Meno for still wanting to know how virtue is acquired without first understanding what it is. But he agrees, reluctantly, to examine whether virtue is something that is taught by way of “hypotheses” about what sorts of things are taught, and about what sorts of things are good. Here Socrates leads Meno to two opposed conclusions. First, he argues, on the hypothesis that virtue is necessarily good, that it must be some kind of knowledge, and therefore must be something that is taught. But then he argues, from the fact that no one does seem to teach virtue, that virtue is not after all something that is taught, and therefore must not be knowledge. This is where Anytus arrives and enters the discussion: he too objects to the sophists who claim to teach virtue for pay, and asserts that any good gentleman can teach young men to be good in the normal course of life. But then Anytus cannot explain Socrates’ long list of counterexamples: famous Athenians who were widely considered virtuous, but who did not teach their virtue even to their own sons. When Anytus withdraws from the conversation in anger, Socrates reminds Meno that sometimes people’s actions are guided not by knowledge but by mere true belief, which has not been “tied down by working out the reason.” He provisionally concludes that when people act virtuously, it is not by knowledge but by true belief, which they receive not by teaching but by some kind of divine gift. But then Socrates warns again that they will not really learn how virtue is acquired until they first figure out what virtue itself is.
In this whole inconclusive conversation, the most important Socratic proposal is that “virtue” (aretê in Greek) must be some kind of knowledge. But a crucial fact about the dialogue is that this central subject matter, while obviously very important, remains elusive from beginning to end. When Meno asks how aretê is acquired, Socrates denies knowing what aretê really is. Meno thinks he knows what aretê is, but he is soon surprised to find that he cannot define it. As they work at the definition, alleged examples of aretê range from political power to good taste and from justice to getting lots of money. At first, Meno wants to deny that all aretai share some common nature, but he quickly becomes ambivalent about that. Eventually, Socrates seems to persuade him that the essence of aretê must be some kind of knowledge, but then this provisional conclusion gives way under the observation that what they are looking for is apparently never actually taught. In closing, Socrates reminds Meno that their confusion about whether aretê is taught is a result of their confusion about the nature of aretê itself.
So what sort of thing is this aretê that they are trying to understand? Much of ancient Greek literature shows that aretê was a central ideal and basic motivator throughout the culture. The stylized heroes of Homer’s legendary Trojan war and the real soldiers of their own contemporary campaigns, the athletes at the Olympic games and the orators in political debates—all of these, whether they fought for survival or retribution or the common good, were also seeking honor from their peers for aretê. Both the importance and the vagueness of the term is expressed in Socrates’ question to Anytus:
Meno has been telling me for some time, Anytus, that he desires the kind of wisdom and aretê by which people manage their households and cities well, and take care of their parents, and know how to receive and send off fellow-citizes and foreign guests as a good man should. To whom should we send him for this aretê? (91a)
The standard English translations of aretê are “excellence” and “virtue.” “Excellence” reminds us that the ancient concept applies to all of the above and even to some admirable qualities in nonhuman things, like the speed of a good horse, the sharpness of a good knife, and the fertility of good farmland. But “virtue” too is sometimes still used that way, when we speak of the virtues of the plan or the brand that we prefer. And “excellence” is rather weak and abstract for the focus of these Socratic dialogues, which is something people spent a lot of time thinking and worrying about. Intellectuals debated how it is acquired; politicians knew they had to speak persuasively about it; and Socrates himself considered it the most important thing in life. In our dialogue, Meno keeps thinking of aretê in terms of ruling others and acquiring honor or wealth, while Socrates keeps reminding him that aretê must also include things like justice and moderation (73a, d, 78d), industriousness (81d, 86b). and self-control: “rule yourself,” he says, “so that you may be free” (86d). In this connection, it is often said that Greek ethical thinking evolved from a focus on competitive virtues like courage and strength to a greater appreciation of cooperative virtues like justice and fairness. But this could be at most a shift of emphasis, since even Homer’s epics of war and adventure celebrate pity and humility, justice and self-control. So it may help to think of our dialogue as asking how we can acquire “virtue” in the very general sense of human goodness or human greatness. Like Meno, most of us think we already know what “being a good person” or “being a great person” is like, but we would be stumped if we had to define it. The whole range of examples used in this dialogue would be relevant. And Socrates’ basic suggestion, that “being good and great” requires some important kind of knowledge, would seem both attractive and puzzling.
A further reason for the inconclusiveness of the Meno is the inherent difficulty of providing the kind of definition that Socrates seeks. He was notorious for always seeking and always failing to identify the essences of things like justice, piety, courage, and moderation. A successful definition in Socrates’ sense does not just state how a given word is used, or identify examples, or stipulate a special meaning for a given context. A Socratic definition is supposed to reveal the essence of a unitary concept or a type of real thing. Such a definition would specify not just any qualities that are common to that kind of thing, but the qualities that make them be the kind of thing they are. Other characters in Plato’s dialogues usually have difficulty understanding what Socrates is asking for; in fact, the historical Socrates may have been the first person to be rigorous about such definitions. The task is more difficult than it first seems, even for things like shape and color (see 75b-76e); it is even harder to accomplish for something like virtue. The first third of our dialogue takes the time to show that Meno’s list of examples will not do, because it does not reveal what is common to them all and makes them be virtue while other things are not (72a ff.); and that this kind of explanation must apply to all relevant cases (73d) and only to relevant cases (78d-e); and that something cannot be so explained in terms of itself or related terms that are still matters of dispute (79a-e). At the beginning of the dialogue, Meno did not know even how to begin looking for the one essence of all virtue that would enable us to understand things like how it is achieved. Socrates shows him these guidelines, and tries to get him to practice. But while Socrates clearly knows more than Meno about how to investigate the essence of virtue, he has not been able to discover exactly what it is.
Socrates is drawn to the idea that the essence of all virtue is some kind of knowledge. In the last third of the dialogue, when Meno will not try again to define virtue, Socrates introduces and explores his own suspicion in terms of the following “hypothesis”: if virtue is taught then it is knowledge, and if it is knowledge then it is taught, but not otherwise. This line is pursued with the further “firm hypothesis” that virtue must always be a good thing. Socrates argues that only knowledge is necessarily good, and the goodness or badness of everything else depends on whether it is directed by knowledge. The conclusion of this hypothetical investigation would be that virtue is taught because it is some kind of knowledge—and the argument to that effect requires the rejection of Meno’s constant preference for “good things” like wealth and power (78c-d, 87e-89a). But what kind of knowledge? Or what kind of wisdom? In this discussion, Socrates uses a variety of Greek knowledge-terms, combining epistêmê, phronêsis, and nous as if they were interchangeable. The cumulative meaning ranges from knowledge and intelligence to understanding and wisdom. Clearly, what Socrates is looking for would be not just theoretical knowledge but some kind of practical wisdom, a knowledge that can properly direct our behavior and our use of material things. But this dialogue gets no further than arguing that virtue is some sort of wisdom, “in whole or in part” (89a). And then Socrates introduces a reason for reconsidering even that: it seems that such wisdom is never taught.
A surprising interpretation of knowledge occurs in the middle third of the Meno, when Socrates suggests that real learning is a special kind of remembering. Meno’s frustration in trying to define virtue had led him to object:
But in what way will you look for it, Socrates, this thing that you don’t know at all what it is? What sort of thing, among the things you don’t know, will you propose to look for? Or even if you should meet right up against it, how will you know that this is the thing you didn’t know? (80d)
Is Meno here honestly identifying a practical difficulty with this particular kind of inquiry, where the participants now seem not to know even what they are looking for? Or is he just throwing up an abstract, defensive obstacle, so that he does not have to keep trying? Socrates interprets Meno’s objection in the obstructionist way, and reformulates it as a paradoxical theoretical dilemma:
Do you see what a contentious debater’s argument you’re bringing up—that it seems impossible for a person to seek either what he knows or what he doesn’t know? He couldn’t seek what he knows, because he knows it, and there’s no need for him to seek it. Nor could he seek what he doesn’t know, because he doesn’t know what to look for. (80e)
This reformulation of Meno’s objection has come to be known as “Meno's Paradox.” It is Plato’s first occasion for introducing his notorious “theory of recollection,” which is an early example of what would later be called a theory of innate ideas.
The notion that learning is recollection is supposed to show that learning is possible in spite of Meno’s objection: we can learn by inquiry, because we can begin in a state of neither complete knowledge nor pure ignorance. To understand what Plato intends with his sketchy theory, we should compare the initial statement of the idea (81a-e), the alleged illustration of it (82a-85b), and the restatement of it after the illustration (85b-86b). According to the initial statement, all souls have already learned everything in many former lives, and learning in this life is therefore a matter of remembering what was once known but is now forgotten. But this is apparently an attention-grabber, dubiously citing unnamed priests and poets, who are just the kind of people Socrates later criticizes for having intermittent true beliefs rather than stable knowledge about their subjects (99c-d). Meno is in fact intrigued, and when he asks for a demonstration, Socrates illustrates by cleverly leading an uneducated slave to the correct answer to a geometrical problem—and doing so by “only asking questions” and eliciting the correct answer from the slave himself. Here, Socrates clearly asks “leading questions,” and eventually even shows the slave the answer in the form of a question (84e). But more important is the fact that he legitimately helps the slave to work out the reasoning, and thereby see the way in which the unexpected answer was implied by other true beliefs that he already had. So the geometry lesson successfully demonstrates some of the beauty of Socratic education, and the power of deductive reasoning in learning. That is enough to refute Meno’s Paradox, which inferred the impossibility of learning from a false dichotomy between complete knowledge and pure ignorance.
But the geometry lesson with the slave clearly does not demonstrate the reminding of something that was learned in a previous life. So it is important to notice that Socrates partly restates the “theory of recollection” after the geometry lesson. This time he concludes not that the slave has remembered some geometrical knowledge from what his mind had learned from experiences in previous lives, but instead that the slave has discovered the relevant true beliefs in his mind, which is somehow “always in a state of having learned” (86a). In the context, that “always” does seem to include many lifetimes, though it could in principle refer just to however long the mind has existed, perhaps since some point of development in the womb. In any case, the phrase “always in a state of having learned” is unusual and striking. If a mind could always be in a state of having learned something, then there would be no point at which it learned that thing. This paradoxical phrasing turns the initial statement of the theory of recollection, which stretched a common-sense notion of learning from experience over a number of successive lifetimes, into the beginnings of a theory of innate ideas, because the geometrical beliefs or concepts somehow belong to the mind at all times. Near this point in the dialogue, Socrates also states that after employing such ideas to elicit the relevant true beliefs, more work is still required for converting them to knowledge (85c-d). Later in the conversation, Socrates even seems to identify “recollection” with this latter part of the process (98a).
Some philosophers and experimental psychologists today agree that basic mathematical concepts, and the beliefs implicit in them (along with many others), are innate—not as an eternal possession of an immortal soul, but as a universal and specialized human capacity determined in part by biological evolution. So in a sense, Socrates’ conclusion that something of “the truth about reality” is “always in our minds” (86b) is even roughly compatible with modern science. The Meno does not end up specifying just what kind of innate resources enable genuine learning about geometry or virtue: Socrates infers from the geometry lesson both that the slave had innate knowledge (85d), and that he had innate beliefs that can be converted to knowledge (85c, 86a), but the dialogue ends with an agreement that “men have neither of these by nature, neither knowledge nor true belief” (98c-d). In fact, while Plato seems quite serious about the idea that genuine learning requires discovering knowledge for ourselves on the basis of our innate resources, he has Socrates disclaim confidence about any details of the theory in this dialogue (86b-c).
According to Socrates, the practical purpose of the theory of recollection is to make Meno eager to learn without a teacher (81e-82a, 86b-c). It seems that Meno is used to thinking of learning as just hearing and remembering what others say, and he objects to continuing the inquiry into the nature of virtue with Socrates precisely because neither of them already knows what it is (80d). The geometry lesson shows that we can learn things we do not yet know (at least what we do not yet consciously and explicitly know) if they are entailed by other things that we know or correctly believe. And Socrates emphatically alleges that when the slave becomes aware of his own ignorance, he properly desires to overcome it by learning; this too is supposed to be an object lesson for Meno (84a-d). But Meno does not learn this lesson. Instead of desiring to inquire into the real nature of virtue, he asks instead to hear Socrates’ answer to his initial question about how virtue is acquired. He asks again whether virtue is something that is taught, and once again he wants to be taught about this just by being told (86c-d; compare 70a, 75b, 76a-b, 76d).
This time Socrates apparently relents, but he warns that the rest of their discussion will be compromised by a flawed approach. At least he gets Meno to follow him in a self-consciously “hypothetical” approach—a kind of method that he claims to borrow from mathematicians, who use it when they cannot prove more securely what they want to prove. He illustrates with a geometrical hypothesis that is notoriously obscure, but the corresponding hypothesis about virtue seems to be this: if virtue is something that is taught, then it is a kind of knowledge, and if it is a kind of knowledge, then it is something that is taught (87b-c). Next, Socrates offers an independent argument (based on a different hypothesis) that virtue must in fact be some kind of knowledge, because virtue is necessarily good and beneficial, and only knowledge could be necessarily good and beneficial. Together with the hypothesis that knowledge and only knowledge is taught, Socrates would have proved that virtue is something that is taught.
But there is something wrong with the hypothesis that all and only knowledge is taught. Surely much of what is taught is just opinion, and surely some knowledge is learned on one’s own, without a teacher. In fact, one main point of the theory of recollection and the geometry lesson was that real learning requires active inquiry and discovery from one’s own resources, which include some form of innate knowledge. Even if Socrates did “teach” the geometry lesson in a Socratic way, by leading the slave to the answer with the right questions, nonetheless he showed that while he could in some sense just show the slave the answer, he could not successfully give him knowledge or understanding. That requires working out the explanation for oneself (82d, 83d, 84b-c, 85c-d; compare 98a). This whole lesson was conducted in order to encourage Meno to try learning what virtue is, when he does not have a teacher to tell him what it is (81e-82a, 86c).
So why would Socrates use the faulty hypothesis that knowledge and only knowledge is taught, when it contradicts his notion of recollection and his model geometry lesson? Perhaps because, in effect, it is really Meno’s own hypothesis, as his opening questions and his behavior throughout the dialogue persistently imply. Meno’s opening set of questions substitutes “learned” for “taught” as if they were the same thing (Is virtue taught? Or is it trained? Or is it neither learned nor trained…). And then he just wants to hear Socrates’ answers, and keeps resisting the hard work of definition that Socrates keeps encouraging. When Meno resists yet again after the theory of recollection and the geometry lesson (86c), Socrates cleverly investigates this hypothesis, implicit in Meno’s behavior, to redirect Meno’s attention from his question about how virtue is acquired (Is it taught?) back to the unanswered question of what virtue is (Is it knowledge?). So Socrates could be quite serious in his lengthy argument that virtue must be some kind of knowledge (87c-89a), while reluctantly making use of the unsupported hypothesis that knowledge must be taught because, in effect, Meno insists upon it. Meno refuses to pursue knowledge of virtue the hard way, and he thinks that what he hears about virtue the easy way is knowledge.
After persuading Meno to take seriously his own favorite notion—that virtue is achieved through some kind of knowledge, rather than through wealth and political power—Socrates endeavors to convince Meno that learning just by hearing from others does not provide real knowledge or real virtue. Meno’s host Anytus now arrives at just the right moment, since Anytus is passionately opposed to the sophists who claim to teach wisdom and virtue with their traveling lectures and verbal displays. Anytus believes that virtue can be learned instead by spending time with any good gentleman of Athens, but Socrates shows that this view is superficial, too. He gathers well-known examples of allegedly virtuous men who did not teach their virtue even to their own children, which indicates that virtue is not something that is taught. Anytus departs in annoyance at Socrates’ seemingly dismissive treatment of Athens’ political heroes, so Socrates continues the issue with Meno. He reminds Meno that even professional teachers and good men themselves disagree about whether virtue can be taught. The closing pages argue that if their earlier hypothesis was true, and “people are taught nothing but knowledge,” then since virtue is not taught, virtue would not be knowledge. Socrates suggests that perhaps it could be correct belief instead. Correct belief can direct our behavior well, too, though not nearly as reliably as knowledge.
In this final portion of the dialogue, Socrates twice again asks Meno whether “if there are no teachers, there are no learners.” And Meno keeps affirming it, though no longer with full confidence: “I think … So it seems … if we have examined this correctly” (96c-d). Meno’s challenge to Socrates in the opening lines of the dialogue had used the terms “learned” and “taught” interchangeably. In the meantime, Socrates’ notion of learning as “recollection” indicates that knowledge requires much more than verbal instruction. As Socrates says to Anytus:
For some time we have been examining ... whether virtue is something that’s taught. To that end we are asking whether good men past or present know how to bestow on another this virtue which makes them good, or whether it just isn’t something a man can give or receive from another. (93a-b)
Meno’s assumption that knowledge must be taught, and taught by mere verbal instruction, prevents a fuller investigation in this dialogue of Socrates’ hope that virtue is a kind of knowledge.
And what about Socrates: does he teach virtue in the Meno? He offers a theory that “there is no teaching but recollection” (82a). But what about his practice? Isn’t Socrates trying to teach Meno, by leading him to a correct definition of virtue, as he led Meno’s slave to the correct answer in the geometry lesson?
Rather, Socrates’ practice in the geometry lesson actually goes pretty well with his theory that there is no teaching, because his leading questions there require that the slave think through the deduction of the answer from what he already knew. And Socrates finishes by emphasizing that real knowledge of the answer requires working out the explanation for oneself. So even if a “teacher” can show the answer, he cannot give the understanding. The understanding requires active inquiry and discovery for oneself, based on innate mental resources and a genuine desire to learn. Whatever else might prove true or false about the notion that learning is a kind of recollection, these practical implications are what Socrates insists upon.
On behalf of the rest of the theory, I wouldn’t much insist. But we’ll be better men, braver and less lazy, if we believe that we must search for the things we don’t know, rather than if we believe that it’s not possible to find out what we don’t know, and that we must not search for it—this I would fight for very much, so long as I’m able, both in theory and in practice. (86b-c)
The practical side of learning as recollection applies no less in Socrates’ interactions with Meno. Socrates tries leading Meno to desire real knowledge of what virtue is rather than just collecting others’ opinions about how it is acquired, and tries to get him to practice active inquiry and discovery of the truth for himself, starting from his own basic and sincere beliefs about virtue. Meno’s moral education would call for all of that even if Socrates could tell him what the essence of virtue is, which he claims he cannot do.
Active Socratic inquiry requires humble hard work on the part of all learners: practice in the sense of the personal effort and training that properly develops natural ability. Socrates’ efforts to guide Meno throughout the dialogue indicate that achieving the wisdom that is virtue would require both the right kind of natural abilities and the right kind of training or practice—so that teaching can help if it is not mere verbal instruction but discussions that help a learner to discover the knowledge for himself. That could be the whole dialogue’s answer to Meno’s opening challenge, which specifies three options:
Tell me if you can, Socrates: Is virtue something that’s taught? Or is it not taught, but trained? Or is it neither trained nor learned, but people get it by nature, or in some other way? (70a)
Some have argued that Plato mentions training in the opening lines only because it was one of the traditional options debated in his day. It seems to be tacitly dropped from the rest of the dialogue, and when Meno later revisits his opening challenge, he omits the option about training (86c-d). But if Meno forgets or deliberately avoids it, Socrates does not. When Meno starts to recognize his difficulties, Socrates encourages him to practice with definitions about shape (75a) and gives him a series of paradigms or examples to practice with (73e-77a); later, he criticizes Meno for refusing to do so (79a). At a number of points, Socrates draws attention to the kind of training and habits Meno has already received (70b, 76d, 82a). The geometry lesson, which is supposed to exhibit successful persistent inquiry in the face of previous failures, concludes with advice about the need to work through problems “many times in many ways” (85c) and with a repeated warning about intellectual laziness (86b). While the theory that learning is recollection suggests that an essential basis for wisdom and virtue is innate, Socrates also reminds Meno that any such basis in nature would still require development through experience (89b). When Anytus enters the discussion, his father is praised as a man who, unlike Anytus himself, did not receive his prosperity as a gift from his father, but earned it “by his own skill and hard work” (90a). And the combination of quotations from Theognis near the end of the dialogue suggest that virtue is learned not through verbal teaching alone, but through some kind of character-apprenticeship under the guidance of others who are already accomplished in virtue (95d ff.)
Socrates’ persistence in encouraging Meno to practice active inquiry points in the same direction as the sketchy theory of recollection: while the kind of wisdom that could be real virtue would require understanding the nature of virtue itself, it would not be achieved by being told the definition. And it would not be a theoretical understanding divorced from the practice of virtue. In fact, our dialogue as a whole shows that Meno will not acquire the wisdom that is virtue until after he already practices some measure of virtue: at least the kind of humility, courage, and industriousness that are necessary for genuine learning.
We cannot be precise or certain about much in Plato’s writing career. The Meno seems to be philosophically transitional between rough groupings of dialogues that are often associated in allegedly chronological terms, though these groupings have been qualified and questioned in various ways. It is commonly thought that in the Meno we see Plato transitioning from (a) a presumably earlier group of especially “Socratic” dialogues, which defend Socrates’ ways of refuting unwarranted claims to knowledge and promoting intellectual humility, and so are largely inconclusive concerning virtue and knowledge, to (b) a presumably “middle” group of more constructively theoretical dialogues, which involve Plato’s famous metaphysics and epistemology of transcendent “Forms,” such Justice itself, Equality itself, and Beauty or Goodness itself. (However, that second group of dialogues remains rather tentative and exploratory in its theories, and there is also (c) a presumably “late” group of dialogues that seems critical of the middle-period metaphysics, adopting somewhat different logical and linguistic methods in treating similar philosophical issues.) So the Meno begins with a typically unsuccessful Socratic search for a definition, providing some lessons about good definitions and exposing someone’s arrogance in thinking that he knows much more than he really knows. All of that resembles what we see in early dialogues like the Euthyphro, Laches, Charmides, and Lysis. But the style and substance of the Meno changes somewhat with the formulation of Meno’s Paradox about the possibility of learning anything with such inquiries, which prompts Socrates to introduce the notions that the human soul is immortal, that genuine learning requires some form of innate knowledge, and that progress can be made with a kind of hypothetical method that is related to mathematical sciences. This cluster of Platonic concerns is variously developed in the Phaedo, Symposium, Republic, and Phaedrus, but in those dialogues, these concerns are combined with arguments concerning imperceptible, immaterial Forms, which are never mentioned in the Meno. Accordingly, many scholars believe that the Meno was written between those groups of dialogues, and probably about 385 B.C.E. That would be about seventeen years after the dramatic date of the dialogue, about fourteen years after the trial and execution of Socrates, and about the time that Plato founded his own school at the gymnasium called the Academy.
More specifically, significant relations of the Meno to other Platonic dialogues include the following.
The Meno is related by its dramatic setting to the famous series of dialogues that center on the historical indictment, trial, imprisonment, and death of Socrates (Euthyphro, Apology, Crito, and Phaedo). Anytus in the Meno will be one of the three men who prosecute Socrates, which is specifically foreshadowed in the Meno at 94e.
The failed attempt to define virtue as a whole in the Meno is much like the failed attempts in other dialogues to define particular virtues: piety in the Euthyphro, courage in the Laches, moderation in the Charmides, and justice in the first book of the Republic. (And two other dialogues attempt and fail to define terms that are related to virtue: friendship in the Lysis and beautiful/good/fine (to kalon) in the Hippias Major.) Those dialogues emphasize some of the same criteria for successful definitions as the Meno, including that it must apply to all and only relevant cases, and that it must identify the nature or essence of what is being defined. The Meno adds another criterion: that something may not be defined in terms of itself, or in related terms that are still subject to dispute.
One of Socrates’ arguments late in the Meno, that virtue probably cannot be taught because men who are widely considered virtuous have not taught it even to their own sons, is also used near the beginning of Plato’s Protagoras. But there it is countered by a long explanation from the sophist Protagoras of how virtue is in fact taught to everyone by everyone, not with definitions or by mere verbal instruction, but in a life-long training of human nature through imitation, storytelling, and rewards and punishments of many kinds. Socrates does not object to this theory of moral education (instead he objects to other parts of Protagoras’ account), and elements of it are included in the system of education outlined by Socrates in Plato’s Republic. But while Plato’s treatment of Protagoras’ theory of education in the Protagoras is fairly sympathetic, the Meno’s general disparagement of sophistic teaching is explored at length in Socrates’ debates with individual sophists in Plato’s Euthydemus, Gorgias, Hippias Minor, and Hippias Major.
The Meno’s geometry lesson with the slave, where success in learning some geometry is supposed to encourage serious inquiry about virtue, is one indication of Plato’s interest in relations between mathematical and moral education. In the Gorgias (named after a sophist or orator who is mentioned early in the Meno as one of Meno’s teachers), Socrates debates an ambitious young orator-politician who is drawn to a crass hedonism, and claims that his soul lacks good order because he neglects geometry, and so does not appreciate the ratios or proportions exhibited in the good order of nature. Book VII of the Republic describes a system of higher education designed for ideal rulers, which uses a graduated series of mathematical studies to prepare such rulers for philosophical dialectic and for eventually understanding the Form of Goodness itself. In this connection, Socrates’ introduction of a “hypothetical” method of inquiry, adopted from mathematics, is developed somewhat in the Phaedo and in Republic Book VI.
The notion of learning as recollection is revisited most conspicuously in Plato’s Phaedo (72e-76e) and Phaedrus (246a ff.), both of which associate it closely with theories of human immortality and eternal, transcendent Forms. The passage about recollection in the Phaedo even begins by alluding to the one in the Meno, but then it discusses recollection not of specific beliefs or propositions (like the theorem about doubling the square in the Meno), but of basic general concepts like Equality and Beauty, which Socrates argues cannot be learned from our experiences in this life. In the Phaedrus, recollection of such Forms is not argued for but asserted, in a rather suggestive and playful manner, as part of a myth-based story about the human soul’s journeys with gods, which is meant to convey the power of love in philosophical learning. Plato also explores other models of innate knowledge elsewhere, such as an innate mental pregnancy in the Symposium (206c-212b; compare Phaedrus 251a ff.) and an innate intellectual vision in the Republic (507a-509c, 518b ff.).
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