Metaepistemology is, roughly, the branch of epistemology that asks questions about first-order epistemological questions. It inquires into fundamental aspects of epistemic theorizing like metaphysics, epistemology, semantics, agency, psychology, responsibility, reasons for belief, and beyond. So, if as traditionally conceived, epistemology is the theory of knowledge, metaepistemology is the theory of the theory of knowledge. It is an emerging and quickly developing branch of epistemology, partly because of the success of the more advanced ‘twin’ metanormative subject of metaethics. The success of metaethics and the structural similarities between metaethics and metaepistemology have inspired parallel conceptual forays in metaepistemology with far reaching implications for both subjects.
The current article offers a concise survey of basic themes and problems in metaepistemology. The survey, of course, aims neither at being exhaustive nor at presenting these basic themes and problems in their full sophistication and complexity. Rather, given the very broad span of themes and problems that fall under the label of metaepistemology, the aim is to introduce basic themes and problems and overview some of the cutting edge research that is currently undertaken in metaepistemology debates.
In what follows, “(meta)”epistemology contains brackets to indicate the epistemology of epistemology. This is to be distinguished from non-bracketed “metaepistemology,” which is meant to refer to the whole domain of metaepistemological theorizing (metaphysics, epistemology, semantics, agency and so forth).
Table of Contents
- Situating Metaepistemology within Epistemology and Metanormativity
- Reasons for Belief and Epistemic Psychology
- Agency and Responsibility
- New Directions in Metaepistemology
- References and Further Reading
Following the example of ethics (for example, Fisher 2011; see also Fumerton 1995), we can distinguish three basic branches of epistemology: normative epistemology, applied epistemology, and metaepistemology. Normative epistemology mostly deals with first-order theorizing about how we should form justified beliefs, gain understanding, truth and knowledge, offer accounts of the basic sources of knowledge (like memory, perception, testimony) and so forth, but it does not pursue higher-order questions about these matters or pressing applied epistemic matters. To the extent that it does, it embroils itself, respectively, in metaepistemology and applied epistemology. Applied epistemology draws from normative epistemological theorizing in order to respond to pressing epistemic matters of practical value, like climate change skepticism, jury decision-making, gender or race issues in epistemology, and so forth.
The following is an example to illustrate how the trichotomy of the epistemic domain is meant to divide epistemological labor. As is well-known, epistemologists are intrigued by the perennial question “What is knowledge?” and, accordingly, try to come up with plausible reductive analyses. This much is first-order normative epistemological theorizing at its best. If we conceptually dig deeper, however, move a level down and ask whether there is any “real” (or robust) knowledge or whether the project of reductive analysis of knowledge is any plausible, then we ask second-order, metaepistemological questions. That is, we ask questions about first-order epistemological questions, like the question “what is knowledge?”. Moreover, if we ask epistemic questions of pressing practical value, like whether gender, race, and ethnic origin factors affect ordinary knowledge attributions, then we are pressing applied questions (for example, Fricker 2010) and have swiftly moved into the field of applied epistemology.
Opinions diverge about the exact interrelation of the three branches of epistemology and the exact interrelation of metaepistemology and its twin metanormative subject of metaethics. In regard to the former issue, there are two broad, possible positions about the relation among the three branches. The first position is one we may call the autonomy thesis. According to the autonomy thesis, also sometimes propounded in ethical theory (compare Enoch 2013 for discussion), metaepistemology is an independent branch of epistemological inquiry that does not depend on the results of the other two branches of epistemology. Inversely, both applied and normative epistemology do not depend on the results of metaepistemology either. The autonomy thesis bears some prima facie plausibility because it seems intuitive that one may be, let us say, a coherentist, foundationalist, or reliabilist about normative epistemology but an expressivist, error theorist, or relativist about metaepistemology.
The other position on the matter is what we may call the interdependency thesis. It suggests that there are important theoretical interdependencies between the three branches (pace some prima facie appearances of autonomy). If, for example, we could reductively analyze epistemic justification in informative necessary and sufficient conditions, it seems that we would have a theory to invoke in normative justificatory matters and apply to pressing questions of epistemic justification like, say, climate change skepticism. However, the fact that such analyses do not seem readily available indicates that nothing is very obvious in metaepistemological matters.
In regard to the latter issue, namely, how to situate metaepistemology not merely within epistemology but within the broadly metanormative domain, there are again two broad, divergent positions. First, many metanormativists hold “the parity thesis” (or, sometimes called, “the unity thesis”) according to which the epistemic and the moral/practical are intertwined normative subjects, theoretically on a par and should therefore share the same metanormative fate, whatever that may be (realist, antirealist, Kantian constructivist, or even other) (compare Kim 1988; Cuneo 2007). Other metanormativists deny this and argue that there are important discontinuities between metaepistemology and metaethics and, hence, that we should instead hold “the disparity thesis” (compare Lenman 2008; Heathwood 2009).
For example, Cuneo (2007) has argued that the moral and the epistemic domain share core structural similarities (reasons, supervenience, motivation, and so forth) and that this bolsters the parity thesis. In response to Cuneo’s (2007) arguments for the parity thesis, it has been suggested by Lenman (2008) and Heathwood (2009) that while moral facts and truths may be irreducible, epistemic facts and truths may be reducible to facts and truths about evidence and probability (where these are ultimately to be understood in descriptive terms) and, therefore, there is a fundamental disparity between the two metanormative subjects. Again, Cuneo and Kyriacou (2017) have come up with a rejoinder to the Heathwood/Lenman case for the moral/epistemic disparity and argued that the parity seems to go through in the end. Of course, the dialectic is currently developing and the jury is still out.
So far, we have said a few basic things about the possible positions in situating metaepistemology within epistemology proper and within metanormativity. We now turn to the basic question of what it is that makes epistemology a distinctively normative subject and how from epistemic normativity we arrive at perplexing metaepistemological questions. The next section unpacks the various aspects of the metaepistemological domain that will be presented as we proceed.
One of the most remarkable characteristics of human primates is their evolved, often linguistically mediated, capacity for cognizing and, moreover, the intrinsic normativity of this cognizing; intrinsic normativity of cognizing because our wide array of cognitive endeavors seem to be inherently “fraught with ought” and evaluable in terms of (in)correctness. Intuitively, to the extent that we are rational and responsible agents, there are propositions we ought to believe and propositions we ought not to believe, and there are cognitive practices, methods, processes, habits, and so forth that are epistemically correct to employ and others that are epistemically incorrect to employ. That is, (in)correct from the epistemic point of view.
Indeed, generations of epistemologists from the early moderns like Descartes (1641), Locke (1690) and Hume (1739), to Clifford (1877), Chisholm (1966), Alston (1988), Fumerton (1995), Feldman (2002) and beyond have attested the normativity of cognizing and have talked about corresponding epistemic duties, oughts, obligations, requirements, and so forth—terms that for current purposes are used interchangeably—that rational agents have.
For example, intuitively, we ought to believe on the basis of the relevant evidence or the relevant reliable cognitive process and ought not to believe what is merely bequeathed by tradition, dictated by fiat of authority or simply feels good. It is also epistemically correct to collect evidence meticulously and open-mindedly, and it is epistemically incorrect to cook up your lab research to the conclusions that a generous research sponsor would favor (for example, say, that extensive consumption of red meat incurs no side-effects on health and the environment).
It is precisely this intrinsic normativity of our cognitive endeavors (practices, methods, processes, habits, beliefs, theories) that gives rise to metaepistemological questions because as rational, responsible agents we seem bound by epistemic duties and obligations that are rationally non-optional and inescapable. To the extent that we are rational agents, we seem constrained by epistemic oughts and duties regardless of whether we like it or not, or whether we submit to these or not. The fact is reflected in ordinary locutions like “p is the right thing to believe,” “You should trust what Paul says because he is an expert on the matter,” or ‘They should have known this much; there is no excuse,” and so forth. Call this fundamental appearance of ordinary epistemic discourse the deontic appearance.
Of course, the deontic appearance is the prima facie appearance of ordinary epistemic discourse and appearances, even deeply entrenched appearances, as we know very well may be deceptive. Secunda facie, we may have no epistemic duties or obligations and epistemic normativity may not be explainable in deontological terms. But at least prima facie we often talk and think in terms of propositions that one should or should not believe and in terms of practices, processes, methods, habits etc. that one should and should not employ. This much of epistemic appearance seems unequivocal and whether we should debunk the deontic appearance or not is a further question down the road.
It should also be underscored that the deontic appearance of ordinary epistemic discourse seems to have a distinctively categorical flavor; that is, the phenomenology of our everyday talk and thought about duties, obligations, oughts, seems to imply the existence of categorical duties and obligations such as duties that are in some sense unconditional, that is independent of our psychology (desires, dispositions, beliefs,) and constrain what we ought to believe insofar as we are rational. For example, if a speaker utters, “You should believe that p” in an ordinary conversational context her statement would, typically, conversationally implicate that it is an (epistemic) fact of sorts that “You should believe that p.” A fortiori, the conversational implication is that anyone epistemically rational would be obliged to believe that p because it constitutes a categorical epistemic obligation (derivative of a corresponding epistemic fact).
In line with the deontic appearance, the broadly internalist view that takes it that we are bound by reflectively accessible epistemic duties is called epistemic deontologism (compare Clifford 1877; Alston 1988; Feldman 2002). It asserts that we have reflectively accessible, epistemic duties and that they should regulate rational doxastic behavior, namely, endorsing, maintaining, and revising a belief. Epistemic deontologism can be construed in a number of ways depending on how we understand epistemic goals of inquiry. Accordingly, we can have different proposals about how to construe epistemic duties.
However, the standard way to understand epistemic deontologism has been in terms of epistemic justification (for discussion see Feldman 2002). Roughly, an epistemic duty for S to believe p exists iff S has sufficient justification for p. Sufficient justification may in turn be understood in various ways, perhaps, along broadly evidentialist lines, that is, in terms of a relatively high ratio of evidential probability (for example, Heathwood 2009) or even along reliabilist lines, that is, in terms of a high ratio of truth output by a process (or ability) in an externalist framework (for example, Goldman 1979).
This, of course, is not the only way epistemic deontologism may be construed because it can also be construed in terms of alternative epistemic goals/values like truth, knowledge, and even understanding or wisdom (compare for the latter two goals Kyriacou 2016). That would mean that, roughly, an epistemic duty for S to believe p exists iff p is true or an instance of knowledge or even promotes understanding or wisdom. However, the best construal of epistemic deontologism is a question we need not further dwell on here. The important thing for current explicating purposes is that no matter how epistemic duties are to be construed, the deontic appearance stirs a whole host of perplexing and far-reaching metaepistemological questions, like the following:
Metaphysical: Are there epistemic properties/goals, norms, and facts in virtue of which categorical epistemic oughts, duties, and obligations for rational agents follow? If yes, what is their exact nature? If no, where does this leave us in terms of the intrinsic normativity of our cognitive practices? May the nonexistence of epistemic properties/goals, norms, and facts cripple the normative dimension of our epistemic lives? How is the constraint of epistemic supervenience to be understood and explained?
Semantic: What is the meaning of epistemic statements? Is it descriptive, expressivist, or even other? Are epistemic statements truth-apt? If yes, can truth-aptness be rescued in an expressivist metasemantic framework? Can deflationism do the trick? If there are robust epistemic facts, how do they ground truth, if at all? If there are no robust epistemic facts, then what does ground epistemic truth, if at all? Is the meaning of epistemic statements invariant or context-sensitive? Do practical interests, stakes, and so forth have a semantic contribution to the meaning of epistemic statements?
(Meta)epistemological: If there are categorical epistemic oughts and duties, how do we get to know them, if at all? Do we merely construct such duties and obligations or do we somehow discover them? If we discover them, how can this happen with minimal reliability, given that such properties and duties do not seem at first instance natural? How is this cognitive reliability to be accounted for, given our evolutionary history and the fact that the evolutionary process has been a blind, nonintentional process largely pushing towards adaptation, survival and reproduction by means of natural selection? Are intuitions credible evidence, especially in view of the evolutionary-cultural origins of cognition? Is talk of epistemic duties and oughts misconceived in light of epistemic externalism? Does epistemic externalism comport with the intrinsic normativity of cognitive endeavors?
Reasons for Belief and Epistemic Psychology: Are there categorical reasons for belief or are all reasons for belief hypothetical and dependent on our contingent, subjective desires and dispositions? Is epistemic rationality merely instrumental or categorical? Is epistemic judgment motivating? If yes, motivating in what way?
Agency and Responsibility: Can we directly choose what to believe and, if not, what about the fundamental and deontic notion of epistemic responsibility? Is there such a thing as character or is it merely fictional? If there is, can it play an integral part in our epistemic lives? If there is not, where does this leave our epistemic lives?
The following sections concisely introduce and discuss at some depth at least many of these metaepistemological questions.
A core component of epistemic metaphysics concerns ontology. Epistemic ontology explores questions about the existence and nature of epistemic properties like epistemic justification, warrant, rationality, entitlement, understanding, truth, wisdom, knowledge, epistemic duties, and norms like, “You ought to trust your senses, unless you have reason to doubt their overall reliability” and particular epistemic facts like, “The theory of evolution is well-justified, given the abundant empirical evidence.”
Here, focus is restricted on the epistemic properties of justification and knowledge and respective justificatory and knowledge duties/norms/facts for at least three basic reasons: first, because of the more prominent position they have traditionally held in the history of epistemology; second, because of their relatively more advanced research state of art; and third, because considerations of simplicity and economy inevitably constrain the thematic boundaries of the article.
Justification and knowledge are treated in turns and not jointly in spite of the fact that some positions about the two properties are strictly analogous, for two reasons: first, because this analogy can easily come apart, for example, in principle someone could be an antirealist about knowledge but not about justification; second, because the debates of justification and knowledge often develop independently of one another, and it would perhaps oversimplify the state of the debates if we agglomerate the two.
Now, beginning with epistemic justification, a traditional distinction that helps map the theoretical landscape of justification debates is that between epistemic realism and antirealism (though to see how hard it can be to distinguish the two see Dreier, 2004). On the one hand, realists take epistemic justification to be a real, mind-independent property that its existence does not depend in any way on human cognizing. Thus, if a belief is justified, then this should be the object of discovery and not of invention (or construction). Accordingly, we should be able to understand that a justified belief instantiates the property of justification and that it is in virtue of this property that is justified.
On the other hand, epistemic antirealists deny that epistemic justification is anything like a real and mind-independent property. Epistemic justification is considered a property (if at all) that is constructed out of the workings of evolved human cognizing and nothing over and above this. This is not to imply the rather naïve view that justification is made up “out of thin air” by the antirealist. Justification is still constrained by certain epistemic norms, facts or framework, although these are mind-dependent and are of mere local validity. For the antirealist, if a belief is justified, then it is justified in virtue of certain epistemic norms, facts, or framework, but this should not be overstated. Epistemic norms, facts, or framework are invented by cognizers and therefore epistemic justification is also invented. It is not the case that if a belief is justified, then we can somehow understand that is justified because it instantiates a real property of justification.
As in metaethics, realists can be distinguished between reductionists and antireductionists. Reductionists can further be distinguished between analytic and synthetic reductionists. Analytic reductionists believe in the capacity of traditional a priori conceptual analysis to deliver illuminating, descriptive analyses of philosophically interesting concepts. Accordingly, they would take epistemic justification to be, in principle, reductively analyzable to a more basic property like coherence, reliability, foundations, virtues, responsibility, evidence, probability, and so forth (compare Bonjour 1985, 1998; Goldman 1979; Zagzebski 1996; Conee and Feldman 2004; Vahid 2005; Sosa 2007; Heathwood 2009;).
Synthetic reductionists are not so sanguine about traditional a priori conceptual analysis, and its purported capacity to deliver illuminating, descriptive analyses of philosophically interesting concepts. Accordingly, they would deny that epistemic justification is, in principle, reductively analyzable to a more basic and informative property, but they would still cling on realism about epistemic justification because they would take it to be a natural kind property, somehow discoverable only by the a posteriori means of empirical science and not by the a priori conceptual analysis of traditional philosophical methodology (compare Jenkins 2007). As, for instance, we can discover by empirical means that “water is H20 molecules” or that “gold is the element with atomic number 79,” we can presumably discover the natural kind property that constitutes the essence of epistemic justification, or so the thought goes.
So far, we have seen analytic and synthetic reductionism. Both typically adhere to methodological naturalism, roughly, the view that naturalistic scruples constrain the right kind of philosophical methodology (compare Pollock and Cruz 1999). In other words, philosophical methodology should be empirically informed and cohere with our best naturalistic picture about ontology, epistemology, and so forth. Be that as it may, analytic and synthetic reductionists disagree about the exact content of methodological naturalism. Analytic reductionists are still optimistic about the method of a priori conceptual analysis while synthetic reductionists counter that conceptual analysis is rendered obsolete by the progress of the a posteriori methods of empirical science and that philosophy should be sensitive to this progress.
However, there are also antireductionist realists that are usually reluctant to embrace methodological naturalism, at least not any form of chauvinistic methodological naturalism that would exclude the possibility of antireductionism from the outset. Anti-reductionists usually disagree with their fellow reductionist realists about the capacity of methodological naturalism to deliver illuminating philosophical results and, in particular, results about justification—and, in principle, other normative properties (compare Moore 1903; Boghossian 2007; Cuneo 2007). They take epistemic justification to be a property that is real and mind-independent but not reducible to any more basic, natural property. That is, a property that can be the object of study of natural sciences and empirical psychology, neuroscience, anthropology, sociology, and so forth.
Behind their suspicion of methodological naturalism may hover the intuition that normative properties do not seem natural. This suspicious attitude also helps explain their pessimism about the employment of methodological naturalism in metanormativity puzzles, for if normative properties do not seem in any profound way to be natural, then, perhaps, we should not insist on the employment of the restrictive philosophical methodology of methodological naturalism. The thought is that if normative properties are, indeed, non-natural in any profound sense then by insisting on a naturalistic methodology we will not be making any progress. We will only engage in a subtle begging of the question, or so the thought goes.
On the opposite theoretical side stand epistemic antirealists about justification. Antirealists deny that the property of epistemic justification is anything over and above what human cognizers construct and thereby invent. This is not to deny that there are, in some sense, justified beliefs in virtue of certain epistemic norms and facts or agents that justifiably believe that p or even corresponding epistemic oughts and duties. It is only to reject the distinctively realist idea that epistemic justification is a robust property somehow “out there” and our beliefs are justified to the extent that they instantiate that “out there” property. Rather, justification is something that emerges out of our evolved cognitive attitudes that are mental states and out of our culturally evolved epistemic practices and interactions that are social activities. The same goes for corresponding epistemic oughts and duties. They may exist, in some sense, but definitely not in the Archimedean “out there” sense that realists like to envisage.
Like realists, epistemic antirealists are a heterogeneous lot. Some may be subjectivists, others expressivists, error theorists, or relativists. Let us very briefly preview the rudiments of these families of theories. Subjectivists typically hold that judgments of justification report the agent’s noncognitive attitudes, valuations, pro-attitudes. For subjectivism, justification assertions like “p is justified, given my evidence” or attributions like “S justifiably believes that p” report the speaker’s attitudes of approval, endorsement, recommendation, trust, and so forth, for the belief that p or for S’s believing that p. Worthy of notice is that the speaker’s attitudes are reported and not expressed. The speaker is supposed, so to speak, to step back from his own attitudes, introspect and simply report these attitudes but not directly express them. So, if I say, “S justifiably believes that p,” according to a simple subjectivist theory I may be reporting my approval for the belief that p, but not directly expressing that approval.
The fine-grained distinction between reporting/expressing the speaker’s attitudes might seem like an insignificant detail but it is a distinctive feature of the theory that helps distinguish it from expressivist theories (compare Schroeder 2008a). Besides, subjectivism is usually understood to be a cognitivist theory while expressivism is usually understood to be a noncognitivist theory. To stipulate, a cognitivist theory is a theory that takes normative judgment to express descriptive mental states like beliefs while a noncognitivist theory is a theory that takes normative judgment (or at least some species of it) to express nondescriptive mental states like desires, proattitudes and sentiments. Obviously, although both subjectivism and expressivism may be labeled as broadly sentimentalist theories because they involve noncognitive attitudes, subjectivism is a cognitivist theory while expressivism is a noncognitivist theory.
Subjectivism is usually considered an implausible theory (see Schroeder 2008a) and, in fact, although it has some metaethical proponents (compare Wiggins 1987), to the best of my knowledge there are no obvious subjectivists in metaepistemology. But things are very different with regard to expressivism that has had quite a few proponents recently. Expressivists take justification judgments to express (and not report) the speaker’s noncognitive attitudes like approval, endorsement, recommendation, assurance, reliance, plans, trust, desires and intentions. Justification assertions like “p is justified” or attributions like “S justifiably believes that p” express the speaker’s attitudes of approval, endorsement, recommendation, trust, and so forth for p or for S’s believing that p (compare Kyriacou 2012). They express (or “voice”) directly the speaker’s states of mind.
The third antirealist theory of epistemic justification is that of error theory (or, sometimes, fictionalism). Unlike subjectivism and expressivism, error theory does not invoke, one way or another, noncognitive attitudes. Error theorists take their justification judgments to purport to describe respective justification facts but deny that such facts really exist (compare Olson 2011a, 2011b). Given the absence of such facts (typically considered to be truthmakers), we end up with an error theory, namely, a theory that suggests that justification judgments are uniformly false; at least all first-order justification judgments are false (compare Olson 2011a, 2011b).
The fourth antirealist theory of justification is that of relativism. Relativism denies the existence of “real” justificatory epistemic norms and facts and stipulates that justificatory norms and facts are only relative to some indexical factor of mere local validity—usually the agent, or his society, culture, and so forth (compare MacFarlane 2005). Often, relativists are cultural relativists that think that there are no mind-independent norms and facts and that the only norms and facts that really exist are some culturally constructed and embedded norms and facts (compare Stich 1990; for a recent defense of cultural moral relativism see Velleman 2013; and for criticism see Kyriacou 2015). These culturally constructed norms and facts allow for justified beliefs but the justification is of only local validity.
There are many subdivisions under the banner of each of these families of theories that we cannot really dwell on here. There are, for example, many different expressivist theories, and it is really doubtful whether any two of these theories are identical. For instance, Allan Gibbard, one of the most prominent and influential expressivists and one of the first to extend expressivism from metaethics to metaepistemology, has held at least two expressivist theories, the early norm-expressivism (1990) and the later plan-expressivism (2003). There are other versions of expressivism in the literature too—habits-expressivism (compare Kyriacou 2012) and hybrid versions of expressivism such as Ridge’s (2007) ecumenical expressivism (for some discussion of epistemic expressivism see Chrisman 2012).
We have now introduced the rudiments of the major realist and antirealist theories of justification, but there are also other theoretical options that are somewhat harder to classify as realist or antirealist that deserve at least a short mention. For example, as in metaethics (for example, Korsgaard 1996), a Kantian constructivist might claim that norms and facts of justification are constructed out of a priori constitutive norms of rationality (for example, the universalizability or autonomy formulas) and obviate the distinction between realism/antirealism. She could claim that her theory cannot be properly classified as realist or antirealist but only as deontological. Categorical epistemic duties follow from the application of these constitutive norms of rationality but these duties are, ontologically speaking, neither realist nor antirealist.
Be that as it may, so far we have discussed the question of the ontology of justification and the various sorts of approaches to it, but there are also two important metaphysical challenges for a plausible metaepistemological theory that deserve some attention: the evolutionary challenge and the supervenience challenge.
The evolutionary challenge is more of a challenge to normative realism and realist understandings of justification/knowledge (moral and epistemic). As Sharon Street (2006, 2009) has argued, our evolutionary history prima facie conflicts with normative realism because it is very implausible to think that we evolved and our moral and epistemic attitudes were somehow mysteriously and finely attuned to track corresponding moral and epistemic facts. Such a realist “tracking account” seems implausible on a number of counts (ontological parsimony, clarity, mysterious causal connections, and so forth), especially if we think of a competing metaphysically lighter, mere Darwinian account that explains our normative attitudes and their content as largely shaped by the main mechanism of evolutionary change, namely, natural selection. There is no need to postulate moral and epistemic facts, Street argued, in order to have the best Darwinian explanation of how we came to have the normative attitudes we tend to have.
Thus, the evolutionary challenge for realists is to explain, in the best theoretical way, how our normative attitudes have largely been shaped by natural selection in consonance with robust normative facts. The problem for the realist now is that it seems that Ockham’s razor should apply and redundant robust normative facts (and realism) should drop off the picture of that theoretical explanation because a mere Darwinian, antirealist account can do all the explaining we need.
Street’s evolutionary challenge has stirred some fascinating discussion and some interesting realist rejoinders that we unfortunately have to skip here—for example, Setiya (2012), Enoch (2013), FitzPatrick (2014), Vavova (2014). Nevertheless, it is widely acknowledged to be an important challenge for metanormative realism. If realism is to be plausible, it has to explain in a plausible way how it can comport with our evolutionary history.
The supervenience challenge asks us to explain how epistemic properties (if any) relate to the natural world. This challenge is usually interpreted in terms of the widely accepted metaphysical constraint of the epistemic supervenience thesis (compare Kim 1988; Conee and Feldman 2004; Vahid 2005; Cuneo 2007). It is a metaphysical constraint because it suggests that any theory needs to explain how epistemic properties like justification supervene on more basic, natural properties in such a way that if two situations are naturalistically identical (and thereby indistinguishable) and the first realizes, say, epistemic justification then the second situation must also realize epistemic justification.
Metaphysically speaking, it cannot be the case that two naturalistically identical situations (at least in the epistemically relevant aspects) realize inconsistent epistemic properties. There must be some naturalistic difference at the base level that grounds some difference at the normative-supervening level, otherwise there is no good reason why the supervenient-normative properties should be inconsistent. To illustrate, suppose that there are two naturalistically indistinguishable cases where a dead body has been found. It would be unreasonable to think that the one case justifies the belief in a homicide while the second justifies the belief in a suicide—unless of course there is at least some relevant naturalistic difference in the two cases.
The epistemic supervenience thesis is a rather technical way to formalize the strong mundane intuition that ‘no double standards’ should be allowed in normative matters (epistemic, practical/moral, aesthetic, or other). Some theories can deal with the constraint rather easily while others seem to have difficulties with it. For example, reductionist realists have an easy explanation of the constraint. Intuitively, if two naturalistic situations are identical (at least in the epistemically relevant respects) and the first situation realizes justification as, say, coherence, then there should be no surprise that the other situation realizes coherence and thereby justificatory status.
On the other hand, antireductionists cannot offer the same account of supervenience with the reductionist because, crucially, they deny that epistemic justification is a reducible property. To see this, conceive for a moment of epistemic justification as a non-natural property, an irreducible property that regardless of what natural facts it is not entailed that a certain belief p is justified for S. Conceive now of two naturalistically identical situations and that one of the two situations does realize justification. It seems that it remains at least an open question whether the second situation also realizes epistemic justification exactly because the property is not reducible to a more basic property. No doubt, this is not to deny that antireductionists can somehow explain epistemic supervenience. It is only to note a distinctive challenge they face.
Expressivists usually attempt to explain epistemic supervenience as a merely conceptual and not as a metaphysical constraint (for discussion compare Hare 1952; Blackburn 1993; and Ridge 2014). For antirealists such as expressivists, epistemic supervenience is only an a priori norm of rationality that constrains the appropriate application of the concept of epistemic justification. If we have two naturalistically identical situations (at least in the epistemically relevant respects), and we judge that the one justifies a target belief p, then on pain of irrationality, we should also judge that the next situation justifies the belief that p.
One worry for antirealist explications of supervenience is that they reduce the constraint from a metaphysical principle to a conceptual and this seems to change the subject; likewise, expressivists might object that to insist that the constraint should be addressed in its metaphysical guise it is to beg the question in favor of realism. At any rate, supervenience is a tricky but valuable philosophical concept, and there are questions about how to best interpret it (local or global, for instance) and how to best account for its intuitive character, but the discussion will end here. Enough has been said to showcase why epistemic supervenience seems to be a challenge for realists and antirealists and a desideratum for a plausible metaepistemic theory of justification.
Let us now turn to the ontology of knowledge. The metaepistemology of knowledge seems even less well-defined than the metaepistemology of epistemic justification. This is reflected in the fact that knowledge theorists do not usually speak in the metaphysically-loaded terms of realism/antirealism about knowledge. They often set up their discussion in terms of challenges and problems for a theory of knowledge like radical skepticism, the Gettier problem, the lottery problem, the dogmatism paradox, linguistic evidence, and so forth. To keep the distinctively metaepistemological tone of the article, let us follow Michael Williams (2001) and speak of realism/antirealism about knowledge. According to Williams (2001), and this is the understanding of knowledge realism/antirealism that we endorse in the ensuing discussion, realists think of knowledge as something real, invariant, and mind-independent. Antirealists simply deny that there is such knowledge.
So, for realists, whether “S knows that p” is a question to be decided by the corresponding, independent knowledge facts, whatever these may be (evidential, reliabilist, virtue-theoretic, and so forth). Knowledge status is not a construct or invention of human cognition of sorts. In contrast, antirealists deny that there is such a thing as robust knowledge and corresponding robust knowledge norms and facts. There is knowledge, of course, but not in the metaphysically-inflated sense that realists tend to envisage. Knowledge is true belief in accordance with certain knowledge norms and facts that are not mind-independent and not of universal validity. How to comment on antirealist knowledge norms and facts depends on the contours of the particular theory one favors (relativist, expressivist, error theory and so forth). At any rate, there is nothing over and above this sort of knowledge.
Realists divide again into reductionists and antireductionists, and reductionists further divide into analytic and synthetic reductionists. On the one hand, analytic reductionists think that the analytical project about knowledge is still viable in spite of the failures and pessimism that traditional conceptual analysis may occasionally inspire. The Gettier problem has, for example, inspired pessimism about the prospects for an analysis of knowledge to many epistemologists (compare Kirkham 1984; Fogelin 1994; Williamson 2000; Floridi 2004), but some others remain unmoved and argue for sophisticated analyses of knowledge, like Pritchard’s (2012) anti-luck virtue-theoretic account. On the other hand, synthetic reductionists again tend to treat knowledge as a natural kind property that in principle should be discoverable by means of empirical inquiry. In this spirit Kornblith (2002) and Neta (2008) have argued that knowledge is just another natural kind.
In their turn, antireductionists deny that knowledge is reducible, analytically or synthetically. They tend to think that knowledge is irreducible to anything more basic and should be taken to be a primitive and sui generis concept, “the unexplained explainer” that is the most fundamental building block for an epistemological theory. Other epistemic concepts/phenomena like evidence, justification, probability, assertion, and skepticism should be explained in the light of knowledge and not the other way round. The most notable proponent of this “knowledge first” approach to epistemological theorizing is, of course, Williamson (2000).
Worthy of note is that Williamson (2000) puts forth his antireductionist theory not as a metaphysically-loaded theory, so it would be a mistake to hasten to infer that he is a non-naturalist about knowledge just because he is an antireductionist about knowledge. He is more interested in showing that the analytical reductionist project about knowledge is a “degenerate research programme.” In consequence, the safe thing to say is that although he is an avowed antireductionist, he shows no particular interest in the metaphysics of knowledge as such.
Antirealists about knowledge include expressivists and relativists as well as what we could call skeptics-as-error theorists. Expressivists like Gibbard (2003) and Chrisman (2007) claim that there are no “real” knowledge facts in virtue of which knowledge truths obtain. Building on Gibbard’s (1990) norm-expressivism about rationality, Chrisman (2007) suggests that knowledge is a normative concept we use to evaluate epistemic positions, and, accordingly, express approval for the norms in virtue of which true belief is formed. There are also relativists about knowledge who suggest that there are no independent or absolute knowledge facts but only constructed knowledge facts of mere local validity, like Stich (1990) and Macfarlane (2005).
Skeptics about knowledge are typically also antirealists and one natural way to integrate their position in metaepistemological classification would be as error theorists (compare Unger 1971; Fogelin 1994; Kyriacou 2017). Skeptics deny that there are any real knowledge facts (at least empirical knowledge facts) and therefore imply that at least most of knowledge discourse is implicitly in a state of constant error (for discussion compare Hawthorne 2004). Knowledge assertions and attributions are almost uniformly false. Of course, we speak of knowing such-and-such but we do not know in reality because there is no such thing as knowledge. As a result, ordinary speakers are afflicted by semantic blindness about the concept of knowledge. They unwittingly speak as if they know, but philosophical reflection can eventually indicate that there is not much of real knowledge.
Thus far we have introduced realists and antirealist approaches to knowledge. Interestingly, however, some epistemologists argue that there is “real” knowledge but not of the demanding invariant sort that traditional realism (as stipulated above) presupposes. There is proper, “real” knowledge that fully merits the name but is context-sensitive. That is, it is knowledge where the demandingness of the standards of justification (in virtue of which we arrive at true belief) varies with context because of factors like the intentions, needs, stakes, goals, and so forth of the attributor. In essence, the standards of knowledge may shift from context to context.
Contextualists, though, suggest that at least some important portion of our knowledge talk comes out true because the standards of knowledge need not be so high that we couldn’t ever satisfy them. Of note is that contextualism is a semantic view and not a metaphysical view and as such it could be easily wed to an antirealist theory. For example, some cultural relativists might be understood as a kind of contextualists about knowledge. The concept of knowledge picks out incommensurable culturally constructed knowledge facts from cultural context to cultural context (for critical discussion of such views see Boghossian 2007). At any rate, discussion of contextualism about knowledge takes us into the field of semantics, which is discussed in section four.
A final note on how the supervenience constraint applies to knowledge. As the epistemic supervenience thesis applies to epistemic justification, it seems to apply to knowledge as well. That is, if two epistemic situations are naturalistically indistinguishable (at least in the epistemically relevant respects) and the first situation realizes knowledge, then in the absence of at least some relevant difference between the two situations, it would be irrational to deny that knowledge is realized in the second situation. No double standards are allowed in epistemology. Again, the supervenience constraint on knowledge has stirred some fascinating discussion but space restrictions oblige us to leave the topic here (for critical discussion of the mentalist supervenience thesis of Conee and Feldman 2004, see Greco 2010).
We have now talked a bit about the metaphysics of epistemic justification and knowledge. As it has probably become obvious from the discussion, metaphysics is inextricably linked with semantics (and there is also a good methodological question of explanatory priority) and, therefore, it makes for a natural follow up section.
Epistemic semantics typically deals with the meaning of epistemic declarative statements and often focuses on the more traditional concepts of justification and knowledge. Let us first present a certain famous semantic challenge for the meaning of normative predicates that has been lately applied to the subset of epistemic predicates as well (Jenkins 2007; Heathwood 2009; Greco 2015; Cuneo and Kyriacou 2017). This is Moore’s (1903) famous open question argument that he applied to “goodness” that ushered Moore to the conclusion that goodness is an indefinable predicate that picks out a simple and sui generis non-natural property. It can be formulated in this style of question: “Is (super)natural property N (for example, pleasure, desire, divine will, and so forth) goodness?” Or, in terms of more colloquial discursive contexts, “I can see that this is N (pleasurable, desirable, socially accepted, and so forth), but can’t see why this is good.”
Moore thought that competent speakers of English (and of goodness) will find this style of questions widely open and that this intuition of semantic openness is evidence that goodness is irreducible. He thought so because he assumed that property identities can be discovered solely by a priori conceptual analysis and that they should be directly transparent to competent speakers of the target language. As applied to epistemic predicates like justification, the open question argument would go like this: “Is (super)natural property N epistemic justification?”; or “I can see that this belief (or system of beliefs) is coherent, intuitive, socially approved, reliably produced and so forth but is this really justified? I don’t see that!”; or “I see that this belief is coherent, self-presenting, and so forth, but so what? It does not make it justified.”
The open question argument has been transposed and applied to epistemic justification and epistemic rationality with the same antireductionist verdict as in the case of goodness (and other moral predicates). Interestingly, there are also echoes of the Moorean semantic openness idea in Williamson’s (2000) famous antireductionist argument about knowledge. Williamson (2000:31) says, for example, that ‘‘even if some sufficiently complex analysis never succumbed to counterexamples, that would not entail the identity of the analyzing concept with the concept knows. Indeed, the equation of the concepts might well lead to more puzzlement rather than less.” The Moorean, semantic intuition that lies behind Williamson’s words is that it just seems that any purported reduction of knowledge, even if it avoids counterexamples, will remain semantically open and this indicates that the predicate is irreducible to a more basic property. It is a conceptual primitive that is not derivative to anything conceptually more basic.
As it quickly became obvious, however, the open question argument is dialectically vulnerable because it relies on unwarranted assumptions about meaning and analysis. First, intuitions of semantic openness are inconclusive evidence for property non-identity. We might have not discovered the correct analysis yet and, besides, intuitions are often a bad counselor (compare Frankena 1939).
Second, not all property identities should be immediately transparent to a competent speaker (compare Smith 1994). Some may of course be almost trivial like “vixen is a female fox,” but some others may require reflection and practice even for the relatively simple “circle is the figure with a circumference that is equidistant from the center.” Arguably, it might take some reflection (and drawing) for a competent speaker to grasp the property identity. Third, some property identities may not be discoverable by a priori conceptual analysis no matter how hard or ingeniously we try (compare Brink 1989; Kornblith 2002; Jenkins 2007; and Neta 2008). Some seem discoverable by the a posteriori means of empirical science like the natural kinds of water, gold, silver, salt, and so forth.
But in spite of its dialectical weaknesses, the open question argument has exerted significant influence to metaethics (compare Darwall and others 1992) and now seems to extend this influence to metaepistemology. Many think that there is something strongly intuitive to this argument that is hard to shake off. Perhaps what the argument captures is the strong—in Enoch’s (2013) words- “just-too-different intuition,” namely, the intuition that normative properties are just too different to be reduced to anything more basic, like natural properties. Others, no doubt, think that the argument can be blunted and we can still argue for reductionist accounts of goodness, justification, rationality, knowledge, and so forth. To be sure, all parties to the discussion seem to consider it a serious semantic challenge that should be addressed, one way or another.
Those who accept the antireductionist result of the open question argument may interpret it (and actually have) in ways amenable to their overall views, realist or antirealist. Synthetic reductionists have seen it as evidence that an a priori conceptual reduction of epistemic properties is not possible but this constitutes no reason for thinking that an a posteriori reduction could not apply. So they proposed that perhaps epistemic properties are irreducible by conceptual analysis and, hence, this is why we have “open feel” semantic intuitions in Moore-style open question arguments.
This optimism, though, seems to be premature as there are good reasons to question whether sophisticated synthetic reductionism is all that promising. In the case of moral properties, Timmons and Horgan (1991) have devised a sophisticated Moore-style open question argument, the so-called “moral twin earth argument,” with the intent to thwart the optimism of synthetic reductionists. Inspired by Putnam’s (1975) seminal “twin earth argument” for semantic externalism, Timmons and Horgan have devised a thought experiment that allows us to test our semantic intuitions for the prospects of such a synthetic reductionism.
Timmons and Horgan contrasted their moral version of the twin earth argument with Putnam’s natural kinds version. They argued that, while in Putnam’s original thought experiment our intuitions suggest that the meaning of natural kind terms is not merely fixed internally (by other “meanings in the head,” so to speak) but externally by the natural world, in the moral version of the story our intuitions differ significantly. We tend to think that differences in the extension of, say, “right’” merely reflect differences in internal normative theory, not external natural facts about rightness. This, obviously, contrasts with Putnam’s natural kinds version because these intuitive differences in extension in the twin earths experiments seem to reflect differences in what external natural facts we tend to think there are. We tend to think that there are no moral natural facts or kinds.
The exact details need not detain us here but what is important is that as in the case of Moore’s classic open question argument,, in the moral twin earth argument, our semantic intuitions seem to suggest that such a synthetic reduction is not in the offing. Even if there were a synthetic reduction of normative properties, we would tend to find such a reduction semantically open. To illustrate this, suppose for the sake of argument that somehow epistemic justification is reduced to some externalist property X (reliabilist, subjunctive tracking property, and so forth). Would this close the question “Is justification the externalist property X?”; it seems that the question would still strike us as widely open.
Some others have seen the open question argument as evidence for an antireductionist but realist theory while others, more sympathetic to both antireductionism and methodological naturalism, have seen it as evidence for antireductionist antirealist theories like error theory or expressivism (compare Ayer 1936). They suggested that we have entrenched “open feel” semantic intuitions because no reduction (analytic or synthetic) of normative properties (moral or epistemic) is forthcoming. Since there are no such properties, the quest for reduction is therefore quixotic.
In particular, expressivism is a very interesting approach to moral and epistemic discourse because it breaks completely with the traditional and mainstream truth-conditional metasemantic framework. Unlike error theorists, relativists, and so forth, expressivists question and reject both factualism and cognitivism. While antirealists by definition reject factualism—namely, the idea that propositions are rendered true by corresponding robust facts regardless of the kind of discourse (descriptive or normative)—with the sole exception of audacious expressivists, they respect cognitivism. That is, they respect the thesis that normative propositions express descriptive mental states like beliefs that purport to pick out corresponding normative properties and facts.
The result of the joint rejection of factualism and cognitivism is a novel metasemantic framework that does not understand meaning on the basis of truth and reference (and truth-conditions) but on the basis of the notion of expression of states of mind (though, for a recent non-content-centric exposition of expressivism see Charlow 2014). Truth is not built in the rudiments of the semantic theory at first instance. Sophisticated, non-classical expressivists (compare Blackburn 1993, 1998) like to appeal to a deflationary account of normative truth, but even then truth is not a primitive component of their metasemantic theory, but only a derivative of the mental states expressed.
This allows expressivists to reap some important explanatory fruit but at the same time also incurs important theoretical costs: expressivists can explain the operation of the open question argument; they are in accord with a naturalistic picture of ontology and epistemology consonant with our evolutionary history (compare Gibbard 1990, 2003); they can explain epistemic motivation (compare Kappel and Moeller (2014); they can explain normative disagreement as a mere conflict in noncognitive attitudes (compare Stevenson 1963); they are in line with linguistic evidence for the expression of noncognitive attitudes in normative discourse; and even more.
However, the theoretical price they are called to pay seems also pretty high. For a start, at first sight truth and objectivity fall out of the picture and the appeal to deflationism about truth seems only to transpose the problem a step back (compare Cuneo 2007). Normative disagreement also becomes a psychological matter of conflicting noncognitive attitudes and not a logical matter of truth/falsity. Consonance with empirical linguistics may also quickly become a problem rather than an attraction because sometimes we may express normative thoughts without expressing noncognitive states like approval as the theory suggests that we should; at least this much of empirical linguistics cannot and should not be denied a priori by expressivism (for similar points compare Huemer (2008) and Yalcin 2012).
There are even more problems for expressivism, but a very serious problem that deserves at least a brief note is widely considered to be “the Frege-Geach problem” (compare Schroeder 2008a, 2008b; Charlow 2014). Drawing from Frege’s (1918/1997) discussion of negation, Geach (1960, 1965) first broached the problem for the early expressivist theory of emotivism, and ever since the problem has been at the forefront of expressivism debates. The problem consists in the fact that while expressivism works reasonably well in the context of asserted atomic normative sentences, in non-asserted logically complex contexts, the noncognitive content of the sentence seems absent.
This seems to have serious repercussions because in the case of deductive inference contexts it implies a fallacy of equivocation in regard to the normative predicate. This is so because the meaning of the predicate seems different from premise to premise and as sameness of meaning is a prerequisite for truth-preservation and validity, an obviously valid argument is left invalid. This means that expressivism does not account for a key semantic fact, namely, logical validity (for a round discussion of the problem see Schroeder 2008b).
The Frege-Geach problem has provoked heated discussions about the plausibility of expressivism, and expressivists keep trying to address the challenge. Some have tried to build a so-called “logic of attitudes” while others have tried to build structure into the involved noncognitive attitudes that would help explain the syntactical features of logic and address the problem (compare Blackburn 1993, 1998; Gibbard 1990, 2003; and Schroeder 2008a). More recently, some have developed novel non-content-centric understandings of expressivism (compare Charlow 2014). Whether expressivism can be developed into a plausible, full-blown metasemantic framework is currently an ongoing research project for many philosophers (some pessimists, some optimists).
Perhaps unsurprisingly, expressivists have an additional problem with truth. For an expressivist, nondescriptive theory of meaning the notion of truth need not come up in the explication of the meaning of sentences. What matters are the states of mind expressed and not truth-conditions, but truth is so valuable a notion that we cannot just give up so lightly. For instance, we want to hold onto such truths like that “the theory of general relativity is well-justified, given the evidence’ or that ‘murder is wrong.” But of course, expressivists are baffled about such truth-talk. Early emotivists like Ayer (1936) were happy to concede that moral statements are not truth-apt at all, but misgivings about giving up truth never subsided.
More sanguine and sophisticated non-classical expressivists observed that expressivism is a metasemantic framework that need not directly involve truth-conditions but that need not imply that we cannot wed such a framework with a derivative notion of truth. Perhaps it is incoherent to assume that expressivism can be wed to certain traditional theories of truth like a correspondence theory, given the antirealism of expressivism, but we could still appeal to metaphysically light theories of truth like deflationism/minimalism. This is what Blackburn (1993, 1998) has proposed for example. Blackburn suggested that we could be expressivists and antirealists but appeal to a deflationary theory of quasi-truth and quasi-facts in order to rescue normative quasi-truth. He has dubbed this project quasi-realism for obvious reasons: you can be an antirealist but mimic all the realist appearances, like the truth appearance (though, for the so-called “problem of creeping minimalism” about how to distinguish realism from quasi-realism see Dreier 2004).
Deflationism about truth understands truth-talk in a merely disquotational, ontologically deflated way. No commitment to a truth-property is involved and typically truth-talk is understood as a linguistic device that serves certain conversational and social functions. For instance, to say that “p is true” is semantically equivalent to saying that “p” (and vice versa). The predicate “…is true” (and cognates) may recommend that p, show approval of p, confidence about p, and so forth. and facilitate other conversational and social functions but does not thereby commit to a robust truth property. Similarly, saying that “It is true that p is justified” merely shows approval, recommendation, and so forth. that p is justified but without any ontological commitment to a truth property (see Dowden & Swartz’s Truth for more discussion of deflationism).
Of course, deflationism as a theory of truth faces a number of important independent objections that carry over to the expressivist project. Here are a couple of objections. First, it is very unclear what grounds normative truth in the absence of normative facts (compare Cuneo 2007). Truth seems to presuppose a grounding relation that confers truthmaking but it is not clear what grounding and truthmaking can antirealist expressivism offer (for discussion of grounding see Schaffer 2013). So the question remains: If a normative sentence is true, it is true in virtue of what? Second, we often ascribe truth in second-order sentences like that “It is true for expressivism that realism is false and antirealism true” and there is a question about how the expressivist can explain such truth-talk if there is no corresponding robust truth about the matter.
To conclude our discussion of expressivism and return to mainstream truth-conditional semantics, there are various truth-conditional theories of justification/knowledge with different takes on semantics. There is of course traditional invariantism and contextualism about justification and knowledge. Traditional invariantism takes justification/knowledge to be absolute/univocal concepts that their meaning remains invariant from context to context (compare Unger 1971; Fogelin 1994; and Kyriacou 2017). Invariantism can then be glossed either in more moderate terms or more demanding terms. Moderate invariantism about knowledge can, for instance, be explicated in terms of a safety principle, that is, a principle that roughly suggests that true belief involved in knowledge could not have easily been false. Such safety-based, Neo-moorean approaches can be found in Sosa (1999), Williamson (2000), and Pritchard (2007, 2012).
More demanding invariantism about knowledge can be explicated in terms of a sensitivity principle, that is, a principle that roughly suggests that true belief involved in knowledge is sensitive to falsity and if the belief were false it wouldn’t be believed. Interestingly, one strand of demanding invariantism may lead to skeptical invariantism because it seems to indicate that all logical (relevant or irrelevant) possibilities of error should be taken into consideration and ruled out. Given that almost always we cannot rule out all logical possibilities of error, we inevitably embrace skepticism about knowledge. Of course, sensitivity theorists need not be, and some have not been, skeptics. Nozick (1981), for example, famously accepted a sensitivity condition on knowledge but rejected the intuitive condition of closure under known entailment and escaped the embrace of skepticism; at least this much he thought (for critical discussion compare Fogelin (1994) and Hawthorne 2004).
Some other philosophers simply repudiate the semantic invariance assumption in favor of semantic contextualism. Attributor contextualism takes justification/knowledge to be context-sensitive concepts, that is, concepts that their meaning varies due to contextual factors (stakes, interests, needs, goals, and so forth of the attributor). Such contextual factors induce a conversational shift of epistemic standards between high and low standards depending on the discursive context. Philosophers like Annis (1978), DeRose (1995), Lewis (1996), Cohen (1998), Williams (2001), and Wedgwood (2008) have proposed contextualist accounts of justification/knowledge that analyze meaning as context-sensitive.
More recently novel understandings of invariantism and contextualism have been proposed. These novel understandings are at least partly motivated by empirical linguistic evidence of how we occasionally use the concepts of justification/knowledge. Subject-sensitive invariantism proposes that the meaning of justification/knowledge is sensitive to the invariant subject’s practical interests, stakes, goals, and so forth. (and not the attributor’s) and makes much of the importance of knowledge for assertion and practical reasoning (compare Hawthorne 2004). Contrastivism takes into consideration the contrastive and comparative element in justification/knowledge discourse. For example, if I say ‘”S knows that p” this might conversationally imply that “S knows that p rather than q” (compare Schaffer 2004).
Questions of epistemic meaning go far beyond what we presented, but we have to pause here. In the next section we turn to (meta)epistemology, namely, the epistemology of epistemology and, in particular, the (meta)epistemology of epistemic justification and knowledge.
Let us pause for a moment to take stock. We have explained how metaepistemological questions and puzzles arise out of the deontic appearance of our cognizing and its concomitant intrinsic normativity. Accordingly, we explained that human cognizing seems to implicate categorical epistemic duties and obligations; that is, there are propositions we ought to (dis)believe and practices that are (in)correct to employ from the epistemic point of view. Finally, we explained that justification and/or knowledge and corresponding epistemic oughts may be understood realistically or anti-realistically, or even otherwise (for example, in Kantian constructivist style) and delved a bit into the semantic aspect of things.
The obvious (meta)epistemological question now is how we get to know, or at least have justified belief, of such epistemic oughts and obligations (realist, antirealist, or other). That is, how we get to know, or at least have justified belief, about what we ought to believe or what doxastic practices, habits, and methods we should employ. To pursue this metaepistemic question we need first to stipulate a fundamental and very contentious distinction, namely, the distinction between epistemic internalism/externalism. The distinction is so fundamental—that we have not managed to entirely avoid it so far—because the epistemological theory we end up with depends on how we construe it and take sides about it. Given that so much hinges on the distinction, it should come as no surprise that the distinction is so contentious that is even debatable how best to construe it (and there are a number of ways of doing so) (see Poston’s Internalism and Externalism in Epistemology for discussion).
One standard way is to construe it in terms of cognitive accessibility, namely, the reality or not of cognitive accessibility to facts/evidence/reasons that support the target belief p. According to the accessibility reading, epistemic internalism suggests that S justifiably believes that p iff S has cognitive access to epistemic reasons in support of p (compare Chisholm 1966). Epistemic externalism simply consists in the denial of epistemic internalism. S can justifiably believe that p even if S has no cognitive access to epistemic reasons in support of p. If, for example, the belief is produced by a reliable belief-forming process, then S can justifiably believe that p (even without access to supporting reasons). There may of course be cases of justified believing that enjoy cognitive access to reasons in support of p, but for externalists this is not a prerequisite for justification (compare Goldman 1979).
A second reading of the distinction is laid out in terms of mental states rather than accessibility (compare Conee and Feldman 2004). According to the mentalist reading, epistemic internalism suggests that S justifiably believes that p iff S has mental states that count as evidence in support of p. Epistemic externalism again denies this. S can justifiably believe that p even if S has no mental states that count as evidence in support of p (compare Greco 2010). The mere satisfaction of some external conditions (reliability, counterfactual tracking, and so forth) suffices for justification or knowledge.
Of note is that mentalism implies no accessibility to reasons for justification. All that is required for justification are evidential mental states, but the agent need not have access or conscious awareness of such mental states or reasons. In this sense, mentalist internalism concedes to access externalism that cognitive access is not required for justification but still upholds that justification supervenes on and is fixed by mental states. At any rate, for the purposes of this article we could stick to the more standard accessibility reading of the distinction of epistemic internalism/externalism.
With this partial clarification of the epistemic internalism/externalism distinction in hand, we can now revert to the question of how we know, or at least have justified belief, about epistemic duties and obligations. Recall that ordinary epistemic discourse may give some prima facie support to epistemic deontologism and that the traditional (and more natural) interpretation of this has been in internalist contours. We have epistemic duties and obligations, like the general and a priori “You ought to abide by the relevant evidence and pursue the truth” or the particular and a posteriori “You should believe what Mary says because of her relevant expertise,” and these are reflectively accessible. Careful reflection can, in principle, indicate the epistemic duties and obligations an agent may have.
Of importance for the epistemology of epistemic oughts and duties is also the ontological distinction between epistemic realism and antirealism. Realists would claim that there are real, mind-independent epistemic duties and obligations that vindicate the deontic appearance and would offer different epistemological stories of how we get to know them, or at least have justified belief about them (foundationalist, coherentist, foundherentist, reliabilist, virtue-theoretic, and so forth).
To use a toy theory as an example, a foundationalist analytic reductionist would suggest that categorical epistemic duties are either non-inferentially justified or inferentially justified. Non-inferentially justified beliefs are beliefs that are justified but not in virtue of being based on other beliefs. There are various ways how beliefs could be justified without recourse to other beliefs: by means of non-doxastic states (for example, Fumerton 1995; Bonjour 2003); or self-presenting doxastic states (compare Chisholm 1966; McDowell 1994); or by means of belief-independent belief-forming processes (compare Goldman 1979); or in the case of a priori basic beliefs, in virtue of conceptual content (compare Bonjour 1998). To take the latter case, for instance, it could be suggested that “the duty to proportionate belief to the relevant evidence” seems a priori prima facie justified in virtue of conceptual content for anyone rational with proper understanding of the meaning of the proposition.
Instead, inferentially justified beliefs are beliefs that are justified in virtue of other beliefs/reasons. If beliefs/reasons for p are sufficiently strong then we have an obligation to believe that p. If for example I say that “The thing to believe is what Mr Poirot has concluded,” this should be further supported by epistemic reasons, that is, reasons that involve relevant evidence, like, say, Poirot’s character traits of integrity, attentiveness and investigating dexterity. Such a traditional foundationalist model of epistemic duties and obligations would be broadly internalist and intuitionist. On the one hand, internalist because we need access to epistemic reasons for justification and, on the other hand, intuitionist because intuitions should play a distinctive role in identifying at least non-inferentially justified duties to believe.
Unfortunately both features of such a theory are very controversial. To begin with, first, externalists would deny that internalism is a plausible constraint on epistemic justification. For one thing, they would suggest that it over-intellectualizes our everyday cognitive practices and processes and thereby distorts them beyond repair. Our cognitive practices and processes need not be conceived as so reflective and intellectual (compare Goldman 1979; Plantinga 1993; Sosa 2003, 2007; and Greco 2010). Second, what seems to really matter in our cognitive endeavors is cognitive success (of sorts) out of cognitive ability, be it of the goal of truth, knowledge or even other. So accessibility to facts/reasons does not really matter for justificatory matters. What matters is reliability through cognitive ability for truth and knowledge.
The intuitionist component does not fare any better. First, intuitions are often quite unreliable, and this psychological fact is unsurprising if we consider the evolutionary and cultural origins of our intuitions (compare Haidt 2012, and Kahneman 2011). So there is a clear question why trust our intuitions, especially when we have conflicting intuitions with other epistemic peers we esteem and trust as cognizers (for a similar point compare Setiya 2012). Second, it is not clear what sort of epistemic facts about duties we intuit when we invoke our intuitions. Surely such facts do not seem natural in the sense that they do not seem part of the natural world and the corresponding object of study of empirical sciences. Equally, non-natural (epistemic, moral or other) facts sound mysterious, or queer if we are to recall Mackie (1971), not to mention how we can reliably (and causally) track such facts if they exist (compare Street 2006, 2009; Olson 2011b).
Third, suppose our intuitions are at least somewhat reliable and sometimes, somehow, do track corresponding epistemic facts about duties. This much we can suppose with some justification because if our intuitions are completely and universally unreliable then it would seem that we have no rational ground for the starting point of an inquiry. So, it seems that too much of skepticism about intuitions might be self-defeating of any epistemic endeavor and lead to global skepticism, something that almost all epistemologists find unpalatable (pace Unger (1971), compare Plantinga 1993; De Cruz and others 2011; Vavova 2014). In addition, if we also assume so-called factualism, namely, the ontological idea that it is robust facts (of sorts) that stand as truthmakers for propositions, then there must be epistemic facts that render propositions about epistemic duties true.
Of course, internalist deontologism is far from being the only game in town. Externalists typically reject both epistemic deontologism and its internalist underpinnings as implausible. Externalists contend that the idea of internally construed epistemic duties and obligations is rendered obsolete by the advent of the more sophisticated scheme of externalism and, therefore, we should not take the deontic appearance of ordinary epistemic discourse at face value; at least not in the traditional internalist mode of its interpretation (for example, Greco 2010).
Instead, externalists focus on the reliability of cognitive processes (perception, memory, induction, deduction, introspection, and so forth), where reliability is typically understood in terms of a relatively high ratio of truth output. The basic insight is that if a cognitive process systematically and reliably delivers truth, then the belief-output of such a reliable process can be considered justified. No Cartesian-style reflective access to duties and supporting reasons is required for justification (and potentially knowledge). We can have justification and knowledge without further reflective justification or epistemic duties. It is not accidental that often externalist theories like reliabilism are understood as a form of epistemic consequentialism (see Dunn’s Epistemic Consequentialism). That is, of a theory that identifies epistemic value with the maximization and promotion of the goal of truth and the minimization and avoidance of error.
There are a variety of externalist positions in the marketplace of epistemology: Goldman’s (1979, 1986) process reliabilism; Plantinga’s (1993) proper functionalism; Bergmann’s (2008) Reidian externalism; Sosa’s (1991, 2007) and Greco’s (2010) virtue-theoretic externalisms and more. It is interesting to note that some externalist positions make important concessions to internalism and in essence come up with hybrid theories of justification and knowledge that aspire to a reconciliation of sorts between the two camps.
A good example of this is Sosa (1991, 2007). Sosa distinguishes between animal knowledge and reflective knowledge. Animal knowledge is simply “apt” knowledge that is produced by reliable, virtuous faculties, but human knowledge is the distinctively reflective sort of knowledge where reasons in support of the belief are accessed. Reasons are supposed to spring out of a coherence testing of the belief. That is, for human-reflective knowledge, production by the relevant virtuous faculty is not sufficient. Reasons in support of the belief should be accessed and these should come via a coherence test.
Hybrid accounts like Sosa’s seem better poised to fend off the often heard charge against externalism that it seems to leave epistemic normativity out of the picture because it overlooks the question of what one ought to believe (compare Fumerton 1995; Brandom 2000). More precisely, the charge is that it permits only for mechanical, reliable belief-forming processes that mostly deliver true beliefs and therefore ignores the further requirement for reflection about epistemic oughts. Sosa (1991, 2007) can alleviate this worry because he allows for a reflective element that can monitor the operation of the processes and ponder even about which process one ought to employ and rely on. This seems to be an advantage of Sosa’s (1991, 2007) theory over other mere externalist theories.
We have now seen some of the basic issues surrounding the epistemology of epistemology. Let us now turn to reasons for belief and epistemic psychology.
Mainstream externalists dislike the whole idea of talking about (at least reflectively accessible) epistemic duties and reasons. For one thing, they tend to think that it is overly intellectualistic and, therefore, distorts ordinary cognitive practice. We neither usually appeal nor need to appeal to reasons for belief and even when we do we cannot really choose what to believe. Belief is involuntary and usually comes swiftly and effortlessly, plausibly for evolutionary psychological reasons. So, externalists are often also skeptical about the dialectical import of the deontic appearance and sometimes even of its concomitant normativity. The concepts of deontology, internalism and sometimes normativity do not ring very well to their ears.
Admittedly, there is some insight in externalist misgivings about reasons-talk and the deontic appearance, but it is also hard to expel talk of reasons and duties from epistemological theorizing. Think for example of Locke’s (1690/1975: 687) pithy aphorism that “those who believe without reason are in love with their own fancies.”. As we have seen, this conflict of externalist and deontological/internalist intuitions seems to leave us in a bind because it is not clear which intuition we should discard (or even how we should attempt to reconcile them). Hence, the resolution of the conflict of internalist/externalist intuitions constitutes one of the most serious challenges for any epistemological theory.
Be that as it may, in this section we set aside externalist misgivings about reasons and introduce basic issues surrounding reasons for belief and epistemic psychology. Besides, even externalists give some reasons in support of externalism. First, let us distinguish epistemic from non-epistemic reasons like moral, pragmatic, prudential, aesthetic, political, and even more. One way to delineate epistemic reasons from other kinds of reasons is to emphasize that they stand as reasons for belief from the epistemic point of view. That is, from the point of view of commitment to some epistemic goals/values, whatever these may be: justification, truth, knowledge, understanding, wisdom (or even some other). Suffice it to say that, very roughly, epistemic goals are goals that promote our goal for cognitive contact with reality.
Non-epistemic kinds of reasons are not oriented towards distinctively epistemic goals. Reasons that are oriented towards practical utility are often—somewhat loosely—called pragmatic, and they are akin to a consequentialist/instrumental understanding of practical reasons. So, if for instance you are a cynic enough to believe in divine existence simply because it is consoling or because you find Pascal’s wager cogent, then you have pragmatic reasons for such belief but not epistemic reasons. Even if you should believe in God because that is what your relevant evidence rationally prescribes, but believe because it is consoling or because you find Pascal’s wager cogent then you believe for the wrong kind of reasons.
Epistemic reasons are also closely connected to moral reasons. Indeed, it is sometimes said that epistemic reasons have a moral flavor because they are reasons that should regulate behavior and such reasons cannot fail to be in some sense moral/practical (compare Clifford 1877; Cuneo 2007). Even if this is right, which is a moot thesis, epistemic reasons would make for a very distinctive species of moral reasons, perhaps so distinctive that they merit a distinctive appellation too: epistemic instead of moral/practical. They are reasons that have to do with the proper regulation of doxastic behavior and not just any kind of practical behavior. Typical doxastic behavior seems different from typical practical behavior at least in terms of conscious and direct control of the behavior.
Much more needs to be said about the classification of reasons, but I have said enough for an intuitive grasp of what might make epistemic reasons different from other kind of reasons. Let me close this topic with two concluding observations. First, epistemic reasons may be sensitive to moral/practical reasons (and other reasons as well). To see this, think of the case of a cosmologist that by trade has a duty to inquire about the origins of the universe but also has to attend to time-consuming filial duties towards her ageing parents. Surely, it is hard to combine both conflicting duties because the time dedicated to filial duties is taken out of work and reflection of epistemic duties. So, there must be a tradeoff between epistemic and moral/epistemic reasons.
Moral/practical reasons may even affect epistemic reasons in a more dramatic way. You may have good epistemic reasons to believe that your business partner and childhood friend is cheating on you but you might have moral reasons to trust him. So, it seems that epistemic and moral reasons may pull to opposite directions and the interesting question is what sort of reasons may have the upper hand in such situations. In such cases, we have a moral-epistemic obligation dilemma.
Second, a short note to the so-called “wrong kind of reasons problem” is due (compare Rabinowicz and Ronnow-Rasmussen 2004; Olson 2004; Schroeder 2010; Heuer 2010; Kyriacou 2013). It is a problem that concerns all propositional attitudes (not just belief) and it popped to the surface as a problem for so-called buckpassing accounts of value. Buckpassing accounts of value contend that something is valuable iff it has a property that elicits proattitudes like approval, admiration, desire and so forth (compare Scanlon 1998). The problem now is that something may have a property that elicits proattitudes for the wrong kind of reasons. It is not enough that something is valuable. This is beside the point.
The point is that what we judge as valuable should be so judged for the right kind of reasons. If, for example, I admire a truly remarkable painting just because this will please the painter, I have the right attitude concerning its aesthetic value for the wrong reasons. In the epistemic case, if you endorse a truly justified belief as justified because it is consoling for you, and not because it is evidentially grounded, reliably produced, or what have you as the correct justificatory story, then you have the right kind of doxastic attitude but for the wrong kind of reason. The wrong kind of reasons problem poses a challenge for any metanormative theory and it is also a challenge for a theory of epistemic justification. We need a theory of epistemic justification that would get round the problem and have agents believe justifiably for the right kind of reasons.
A further important distinction about epistemic reasons is the distinction between hypothetical/instrumental and categorical reasons (or rationality). One position supports that epistemic rationality is merely instrumental. We have certain (or opt for some) epistemic goals like truth and knowledge and then we try to satisfy them in the best possible way (to the extent that we are rational). According to instrumental epistemic rationality, there are no reasons for belief going over and above these conditional\hypothetical epistemic goals. For example, if we have the hypothetical goal of truth about p, then epistemic rationality is merely instrumental in the sense that it should find the best means to satisfy the goal. In other words, epistemic rationality is instrumental, and, as such, it should be understood in terms of hypothetical requirements like ‘If you aim for the truth of p, then do such-and-such, say, employ reliable belief-forming processes’ (compare Kornblith 2002).
Their opponents disagree and reject instrumental epistemic rationality in favor of categorical rationality. They contend that we may have reasons for belief, even if we are lacking some conditional epistemic goal (compare Kelly 2003). For example, I may have no desire to find the truth about who killed my boss but I may still have a binding (external/categorical) reason to believe that it was John because there is abundant and accessible evidence at my disposal that confirms this. In a sense, whether I care about the truth of the matter or not, I have sufficient epistemic reason to believe that John is the murderer. Epistemic rationality constrains what I should believe unconditionally, that is, independently of my desires, interests, or adopted goals. In this sense, epistemic rationality should be understood in terms of non-optional, categorical requirements like “Given the evidence, you ought to believe that such-and-such (here, that John is the murderer).”
A related question about reasons for belief that may be inspired by a parallel discussion in metaethics concerns the nature of reasons for belief. As in metaethics there has been considerable discussion about the nature of reasons for action and corresponding internal/external reasons for action, the same fruitful discussion could be opened in metaepistemology about reasons for belief. Internal reasons are reasons that depend on the agent’s subjective motivational set (desires, intentions, dispositions, plans, goals) while external reasons are reasons that are independent of the agent’s subjective motivational set (see Williams 1990; also Turri 2009).
For example, I may have a reason to believe or inquire about p only if I have a desire or care about the truth about p. According to this internal reading of having a reason, my having a reason exclusively depends on my caring and desiring to know about p. Were I not to care, I wouldn’t have a reason to believe or inquire into p at all, which is to restate the instrumental conception of epistemic rationality, but there is also an externalist reading of the notion of having a reason. For example, I might say “Sophie has a reason to believe that John is from New York” and imply that she has a reason to believe this insofar as she is rational, independently of whether she cares or not about the truth of the matter. Even if she couldn’t care less, it remains an epistemic fact that she has a reason to believe that John is from New York, which is to restate the categorical conception of epistemic rationality. There are epistemic facts about what (categorical) reasons for belief we have (compare Boghossian 2007; Cuneo 2007).
A different issue that has recently drawn attention, and also parallels an analogous discussion in metaethics, concerns the relation between epistemic judgment and motivation (compare Kappel and Moeller 2014; Grajner 2015). That is, the so-called judgment internalism/externalism controversy. Like moral judgments, it seems that epistemic judgments like “p is justified” or “S’s belief that p is true” or “I know that p” seem to implicate certain kinds of motivations. They seem to have an internal, conceptual connection with certain motivations. Judgment internalists hold onto the intuition of internal connection of judgment and motivation while judgment externalists, though they accept the systematic character of the connection, deny the internalist intuition and suggest that the connection may be severed in certain circumstances. Hence, the connection may only be external and defeasible in certain circumstances.
For example, for judgment internalists sincerely saying that “p is justified” implicates that I have at least some reason or doxastic motivation to believe that p, rely on p, recommend to others that p, approve of the norms, habits, processes , in virtue of which p was formed; or saying that “S’s belief that p is true” implicates some reason to also believe that p, approve the norms in virtue of which p was formed, give some credit to S and so forth; or asserting that “I know that p” implicates, all other things equal, termination of inquiry. The inquiry about p is at least for time being settled (compare Kappel and Moeller 2014).
In contrast externalists would question the conceptual connection and its modal strength (compare Kvanvig 2003; Grajner 2015). They might highlight the conceivability of Spock-like agents who make sincere normative judgments but remain entirely cold and unmotivated by that judgment. In the moral case, such personas are called amoralists, and the typical characters externalists have in mind are psychopaths, sociopaths, social delinquents, and so forth that seem capable of sincere moral judgment without any corresponding motivation for action. (Perhaps we can call the epistemic counterparts of amoralists, “acognitivists.”)
Like in the parallel case of moral motivation in metaethics, expressivists seem able to easily explain the systematic—if not strictly necessary—connection between epistemic judgment and motivation for belief, reliance, termination of inquiry, and so forth. This is the case because, as a noncognitivist theory about the nature of the mental state expressed in epistemic judgment, the expressivist can appeal to the motivating nature of noncognitive states to explain this systematic connection of motivation. Desires, intentions, and even epistemic sentiments may be called for explanatory psychological work.
For example, if I say that “p is justified” the expressivist will suggest that I express some sort of approval for p or the norms that license it or the doxastic habits in virtue of which was reliably formed (for example, Kyriacou 2012). The bottom line of such a noncognitivist account is that the relevant desire or intention for belief might be expressible in such judgments of justification. Similar stories would be drawn for other sorts of epistemic judgments. Thus, epistemic motivation is easily explained as a psychological phenomenon in an expressivist framework.
Cognitivists about epistemic judgment, though, cannot directly appeal to the same style of psychological explanation as the expressivist because they suggest that epistemic judgments express beliefs and beliefs do not seem to be intrinsically motivating states. They are representational states and as such they do not seem to be engaging the will at all. Saying that “Paris is a city” or that “It’s a hot day today” may be representational, but it is also “motivationally inert.” As is often said, beliefs and desires have an opposite direction of fit with the world (compare Anscombe 1957; Smith 1994). Beliefs are representational states in the sense that they aspire to represent aspects of the world and get at the respective truth. They are mind-to-world directed states. Desires are nonrepresentational states in the sense that they urge for changing the world in order to be satisfied (compare Smith 1994). They are world-to-mind directed states.
This leaves cognitivists with an obvious puzzle about epistemic motivation. They could insist that epistemic beliefs can motivate but this seems entirely ad hoc because beliefs seem representational and motivationally inert states. Alternatively, they could suggest that beliefs may induce corresponding desires, but this will have to explain how this systematic inducing works given that beliefs and desires are so-called Humean “distinct existences” (compare Korsgaard 1986; Smith 1994). That is, there is no necessary (logical or psychological) connection between belief and desire as the two states can pull apart. There can be belief without any corresponding desire and vice versa.
They could even appeal to a sophisticated hybrid (or so-called “ecumenical”) picture about normative judgment and suggest that they express both cognitive and noncognitive states (compare Copp 2001; Ridge 2007; Grajner 2015). At any event, cognitivists have some extra explaining to do that noncognitivists do not. This seems to give the noncognitivists the edge in regard to understanding the psychological relation between normative judgment and motivation, and it is considered as one of the best arguments in favor of noncognitivism. Nevertheless, one should not question the resourcefulness of the cognitivist tradition and its ability to account for moral and epistemic motivation (for ecumenical cognitivism see Grajner 2015).
With this much about reasons for belief and epistemic psychology, in the next section we briefly visit the notions of agency and responsibility.
Epistemic deontology has seemed especially implausible to many externalists because it does not comport with a plausible picture of epistemic agency. That is, epistemic deontologism assumes that as rational and responsible agents we have epistemic duties about what to believe and to the extent that we do not conform our doxastic behavior to these duties we are responsible and culpable. The problem now is that a plausible account of epistemic agency does not allow for the responsibility that deontologism requires and, since this is a prerequisite for deontologism, deontologism seems implausible.
This is arguably the case because typically doxastic behavior seems beyond the reach of our direct and conscious control. To illustrate this, let someone try to believe something that considers an obvious falsehood, or at least something she considers implausible, like “1+1=3” or that “Paris is not the French capital.” Let us even offer a powerful motive for the fruition of this cognitive exercise, say, 10,000 pounds for sincerely acquiring the belief. But alas, it seems psychologically impossible because direct belief-fixation is not up to us in any profound manner. Unlike ordinary decisions about what to do (for example, dance or standing up) we can’t directly decide what to believe.
In light of the fact that an intuitive understanding of responsibility is explicated in terms of minimal control of action, and control in terms of relative freedom to choose from open alternatives (for example, Pink 2004) one may consider epistemic deontologism a lost cause. That is, a lost cause because it relies on the existence of epistemic responsibility but, on the other hand, does not allow for sufficient control and freedom of choice that is a necessary prerequisite for such responsibility—this is “the doxastic involuntarism problem” for (internalist) epistemic deontologism (for the classic statement compare Alston 1988).
As one might expect, there have been a number of responses on behalf of deontologism. Some have blankly denied the involuntarism intuition and insisted that we can at least sometimes directly decide what to believe (for example, Ginet 2001). Others have denied that responsibility is exhausted by the absence of direct control (for example, Feldman 2001). We might have no direct control over the working of our heart but we might still be to some extent responsible for its proper working because we can take steps to indirectly enhance its functioning. After all, we can have a healthy lifestyle that includes a pro-heart diet, exercising, regular medical exams, and so forth
Similarly, we can take steps to indirectly enhance our cognitive functioning. We could for example cultivate reliance on methods, habits, and processes that are reliable belief-producers—that is, produce a high ratio of true beliefs. If I am myopic for example, I could cultivate habitual reliance for visual perception on my glasses because I know they make for reliable perception, or I could rely on certain sources of information that are generally reliable like a trustworthy newspaper columnist or a trustworthy friend. I could also cultivate epistemic virtues, namely, character traits that are generally truth-conducive like conscientiousness, inquisitiveness, open-mindedness, perseverance, respect, courage, tolerance, fairness, love of truth and humility.
In this vein Chrisman (2008), for example, has argued that doxastic involuntarism and epistemic deontology can be reconciled. He appeals to Wilfrid Sellars’ distinction between “rules of criticism” and “rules of action” and explains how doxastic oughts might be subject to rules of criticism that require no direct voluntary control but, nevertheless, do not compromise the categoricity of doxastic oughts (and responsibility). The doxastic involuntarism problem remains a live question for epistemic deontologism and agency (for more discussion see Vitz’s Doxastic Voluntarism).
A second topic of some recent debate that relates to (epistemic) agency is the so-called “situationist challenge about character.” Roughly, situationism about character is the thesis that character is a figment of folk psychology (and virtue theory) and does not really exist. Although it was first applied to moral character and thereby virtue ethics and then transposed to responsibilist virtue-theoretic epistemology (compare Alfano 2012) that appeals to character, it is arguably not of merely local responsibilist virtue-theoretic concern. This is the case because if, as Baehr (2012) has cogently argued, even theories that as stipulated have nothing to do with character, and virtuous/vicious traits (like evidentialism and reliabilism) are inevitably involving virtuous and vicious traits, then the debunking of character as a mere figment will have serious repercussions for these theories as well.
Harman (1999) is a classic statement of so-called situationism about moral character traits, namely, the idea that what drives our behavior is the current of the social situation and not fixed character traits, as virtue theories and folk psychology tend to think. In fact, according to Harman (1999), there is no positive empirical evidence in favor of character traits, and there is much negative empirical evidence against them and, therefore, in so thinking we commit the so-called “fundamental attribution error.” We excessively focus on the agent and downplay the importance of the social situation that the agent is found in.
The situationist challenge questions the psychological reality of the theoretical cornerstone of responsibilist virtue theories, namely, character. Drawing from various empirical psychological studies, like Milgram’s (1974) famous obedience experiments, it is suggested that the folk psychological and virtue-theoretical concept of character is a mere fiction. These studies are taken to show that in reality the notion of character does not exist because in these experiments the agents’ actions are not guided by their character, relevant virtues, or traits but by the situational context they are found in.
True enough, we speak about character and character traits (virtuous and vicious) but empirical, psychological studies confirm that in a given situation our supposed character traits may fail to manifest themselves in our conduct, at least for a statistically significant portion of us. This indicates that there is no reliable source of dispositions for action according to character traits as it is widely assumed. If there were, most of us couldn’t just so easily behave out of character. This corollary would suffice to shake the building foundations of folk psychology (that relies extensively on the notion of character) and responsibilist virtue theory as well as other theories that surreptitiously involve the notion of character (for some discussion of situationism, see Timpe’s Moral Character; for responses to moral situationism see Miller 2003; Kamterkar 2004; and Snow 2010).
More recently Alfano (2011) transposed the situationist challenge from virtue ethics to responsibilist virtue epistemology. He appeals to abundant empirical work from cognitive and social psychology to rest his case. He indicates that intellectual virtues like curiosity, flexibility, creativity, and courage are susceptible to the vagaries of non-intellectual factors of their situation like mood elevators, mood depressors, ambient sounds, ambient smells, and even the weather.
This suggests, according to Alfano (2011), a puzzle that can be framed as an inconsistent triad: (non-skepticism) Most people know quite a bit; (responsibilism) Knowledge is true belief acquired and retained through the exercise of intellectual virtue; and (epistemic situationism) Most people do not possess the epistemic virtues countenanced by responsibilism. Alfano suggests that a plausible way to resolve the puzzle is to give up responsibilism and with it the whole enterprise of responsibilist virtue epistemology. The safe prediction is that situationism about moral and intellectual character poses a sharp challenge to folk psychology, virtue theory (and beyond) and is here to stay as a topic for discussion.
With this much about agency and responsibility, let us now wrap up the overall discussion.
We have covered a lot of ground in large strides and introduced various key aspects of metaepistemological theorizing, ranging from semantics to metaphysics and agency. There is, of course, much more going on in metaepistemological debates (both in terms of depth and breadth), especially as new and fascinating directions of inquiry are constantly emerging. New semantic theories have been suggested like hybrid semantic theories of epistemic concepts and inferentialist theories. More light is being shed on neglected epistemic properties and their value like understanding, entitlement, and wisdom and new and interesting parallels with metaethics are constantly emerging, like reasons and motivation. Finally, exciting experimental work on intuitions is emerging and formal work is being carried out that links metaepistemological themes with probability calculus and decision theory (for example, Pettigrew 2011, 2013). This indicates that metaepistemology is an emerging and promising field of epistemological inquiry that is anticipated to blossom in the years to come.
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