Friedrich Nietzsche: Philosophy of History
Nietzsche was well-steeped in his contemporary methods and debates in the philosophy of history, which carried over into his philosophy in essential ways. Once a prodigy in classical philology, Nietzsche’s philosophy is everywhere concerned with traditions, historical shifts in custom and meaning, and, to adapt his key expression, "how things become what they are". Beyond these, Nietzsche was closely concerned with the manner these traditions are recorded, emphasized or covered over, as accords the subjective dynamic of those who would claim to know and re-present the past. His earliest philosophical books are marked by an attempt to incorporate Schopenhauer’s notion of timeless ideas into Jakob Burckhardt’s language of historiographical typology. His middle and mature works offer important critiques of both sides of the 19th Century ‘history wars’. Against the Hegelians, Nietzsche rejects efforts to systemize history within rational frameworks as well as teleological schemes generally. Against the ‘Berlin School’ of scientific historiography, he rejects the possibility of subject-free objectivity, realist description, and deductive explanations as to why things happened as they did. In his later thinking, Nietzsche devises his own genealogical mode of writing about the past in response to evolutionary accounts of the development of morals.
This article will trace the context and evolution of Nietzsche’s philosophy of history throughout his career. Attention will be paid, too, to its reception by thinkers in the twentieth and twenty-first centuries.
Table of Contents
- Bonn and Leipzig
- Physiognomy and Teleology
- Réealism and Genealogy
- References and Further Reading
Nietzsche enrolled at Schulpforta in 1858 at the age of fourteen. The four hundred year-old school was long the standard of humane education in Germany. During Nietzsche’s time there, the character of the school mirrored that of its most venerable literary scholar and historian Friedrich August Koberstein. Embracing those same two disciplines himself, Nietzsche’s first extensive historiographical project covered the saga of the fourth century Ostrogoth King Ermanarich (KGW I/2, 274-284). Even then Nietzsche tried his hand at various historiographic expressions. In 1861, he wrote a symphonic poem entitled Serbia (BAW 2, 32-37). The following year, he presented to his friends Wilhelm Pinder and Gustav Krug three additional “Hungarian Sketches” in imitation of Liszt, whose daughter Cosima was to become Cosima van Bulow and then Cosima Wagner. In the fall of that year, Nietzsche outlined the composition of a dramatic production entitled ‘Ermanarich’ (BAW 2, 144-54), and as late as the summer of 1865, he was considering the performance of an Ermanarich, Oper in drei Akten (BAW 3, 123-4).
Nietzsche’s problem, foremost, is one of conflicting historical sources. Ermanarich, king of Oium in the early 300’s, had been confused over time with various old tribal kings of gothic Germany, like Hermenrich and Emelrich, and the old Danish tribal leader Jarmarich of whom Saxo Grammaticus spoke (BAW 2, 306). His name is Eormenric in the English epic Beowulf and Jörmunrekkr in old Norse songs. His story had been manipulated most egregiously by the chroniclers of the Anglo-Saxons who sought to associate the notoriously cruel and rapacious traits of Attila the Hun with all of their Eastern foes. Whoever Ermanarich actually was, and whatever the factual details of his life and death were, is likely unrecoverable given the discontinuity of the extant historical evidence. But Nietzsche did not rest at the level of philological skepticism. In this, as in his earliest published articles on Theognis and Diogenes Laertius, he constructed a speculative character portrait intended to fill in the missing pieces of the historical story. Such a two-phase meta-historical standpoint—a skeptical realism about the historical sources combined with a psychological constructivism—was indeed cultivated by the instructors at Schulpforta. As Nietzsche’s close friend Karl von Gersdorff would later recall, “[Kobertsein] was pleased in the highest and full of praise for the erudition, the perspicacity, the deductive character and stylistic elegance of his student” (Janz 1993, I 96).
From his work at Schulpforta one can at least begin to outline Nietzsche’s historiographical education in contradistinction to other reigning views. In contrast to Enlightenment historiographers like Voltaire or Gibbon, the young Nietzsche never valorizes his historical figures to make them stand as moral exemplars for our own edification in humanistic ideals. None of the personalities he constructs are enlightened models of rational clarity; each evoke much darker and more earthly psychological compulsions. Nietzsche’s early philological scholarship is in this way more reminiscent of romantic historiography, a likely mark of Koberstein’s influence. Along with Carlyle, Michelet, Schiller, Goethe, and Macaulay, the young Nietzsche conceived the constructive task of the historian as that of a dramaturge who imbues his characters with personality in order to re-enliven formerly lifeless aspects of the past. In the 1850’s and 60’s, the meta-historical theory simultaneously most popular among philosophers and most tendentious among historians was doubtless that put forward by the Hegelian-Marxists. It is apparent that Nietzsche’s Ermanarich project—or for that matter any of his published philology—does not bear even the slightest resemblance to a teleological account, whether idealist or materialist. Ermanarich is not some moment in the march of history, nor some typological phenomenon characteristic of an epoch. Indeed, the conservative religious and constitutionalist leanings of Schulpforta would hardly have been conducive to the Hegelian-Marxist way of thinking.
Friedrich August Wolf is typically considered the father of German philology. Wolf provided the study of antiquity, more than a generation before Ranke did for historiography generally, its first systematic set of methods and its first aspiration to achieve the same sort of demonstrable progress and rigor as the natural sciences. Wolf’s two most important descendants, Gottfried Hermann and August Boeckh, founded two groups of scholars with antipodal methodologies: the Sprachphilologen and the Sachphilologen respectively. For the former, the scientific status of philology entailed both certainty and objectivity, which in turn meant avoiding as much as possible the intrusion of subjective interpretations of evidence. To do that, the Sprachphilologen narrowed their net of acceptable evidence to that which allegedly needed no interpretation, to that form of evidence whose meaning would allegedly be manifest to whoever could observe it: the written word. The Sachphilologen, on the contrary, considered science as a means of circumscribing the whole of experience. That whole, with respect to antiquity, could be elucidated in part through written accounts, to be sure, but only in part. What counted equally as evidence were the artifacts of antiquity: the plastic arts, the architecture, the coinage, even the clothing, athletics, tools, and playthings. None of these phenomena speaks for itself in the way the written word does. Each requires the understanding of the historian to reconstruct what their meaning might have been—each historical phenomenon, in other words, is meaningful only within a scheme of hermeneutical interpretation. Something of the objectivity and exactitude is lost therein; but the sacrifice is repaid by attaining a more comprehensive sense of antiquity through the totality of its artifacts.
The overwhelming portion of training Nietzsche received in the methods of professional historiography was philological. But in place of a single unitary lesson, Nietzsche found himself immersed directly in a debate about the meaning of the field itself during his education at both Bonn and Leipzig. His teacher Friedrich Ritschl was the student of Hermann and of Hermann’s student Karl Christian Reisig. Otto Jahn, like Nietzsche a Schulpforta graduate, went on to study with Hermann in Leipzig and Lachmann in Berlin. But Jahn was also a student of Boeckh at Berlin, and was considered alongside his friend Theodor Mommsen one of the defenders of Sachphilologie.
Ritschl’s pedagogy mimicked Wolf’s in its holistic approach to shaping not just scholars but men. Yet in his scholarship, he was clearly an adherent of the rigor and discipline of Hermann’s Sprachphilologie. Jahn was equally scientific in terms of rigor. But in keeping with Sachphilologie, he ventured beyond the written word and investigated the wholeness of culture, especially by applying philological methodology to the objects of archeology. In the school year of 1864-5, the same year that Nietzsche entered Bonn, Ritschl and Jahn engaged in a petty yet field-altering squabble that came to be known as the Bonnerstreit. Although Nietzsche took Jahn’s side in the matter—as he wrote to Gersdorff, “Here in Bonn the biggest flap, the worst cattiness about the Jahn-Ritschlstreit still dominates. I consider Jahn unconditionally right” (an Gersdorff 25.5.1865, KSB 2, 56)—he nevertheless had no palpable interest in Jahn’s archeological, artistic, or numismatical studies. His philological articles in those years on Theognis and Diogenes Laertius show a methodological allegiance to Ritschl’s Sprachphilologie, and retain the basic strategy of his earlier effort on Ermanarich in that they rely both on a skeptical realism about the authenticity of the texts and the construction of a Charakterbild in order to supply the psychological motivations for the agents’ behaviors in the historical stories. Both of Nietzsche’s projects were lauded by Ritschl, who transferred to the University of Leipzig, and indeed both were published in his still-active journal, Rheinisches Museum für Philologie. On their merits, Nietzsche famously graduated from Leipzig without a formal dissertation and was given appointment at the University of Basel as a replacement for another of Ritschl’s students, Adolf Kiessling.
In 1869, Nietzsche presented the lecture “Homer und die klassische Philologie” (KGW II/1, 247-69), full of hope for the potential of a renewed and invigorated field. Toward the end of the lecture, however, he declares that that goal must be accomplished by recognizing a new philosophical basis, that “each and every philological activity should be enclosed by and proceed from a philosophical worldview” (KGW II/1, 268). The reference is clearly to Schopenhauer, whom he had begun to read already in the Fall of 1865. Nietzsche and most of his associates at the time sought to combine Schopenhauer’s teaching with historiography. His childhood friend Paul Deussen studied oriental history and culture with Swami Vivekananda—and would found the Schopenahuer-Gesellschaft in 1911. Richard Wagner, who fancied himself at times the reviver of the ‘true’ historical Germanic culture, sent a personal copy of his Nibelungen directly to Schopenhauer, and sometimes touted that his opera was the expression of Schopenhauer's aesthetics. Erwin Rohde, himself the author of what remains one of the finest scholarly books on Ancient mystery cults and ‘Dionysian’ culture, Psyche: Seelencult und Unsterblichkeitsglaube der Griechen (1890-4), was a lifelong Schopenhauerian. Johann Jacob Bachofen’s psychology of the dark anti-rational undercurrents of ancient history in his Das Mutterrecht (1861) and his critique of scientific ‘objectivity’ both intimate Schopenhauerian influence. And although he is sometimes thought to be anti-philosophical, Jakob Burckhardt was an overt Schopenhauerian—as well as the most renowned cultural historian of his generation.
Nietzsche and Burckhardt had similar upbringings insofar as their introductions to the critical methods of philology extinguished the flame of their devotion to Christianity. Like Burckhardt, too, Nietzsche came to view the obsessive source criticism of Sprachphilologie as a necessary correction of romantic historiography, but also as a potentially detrimental step in the development of an individual scholar and, eventually, in the development of culture. The concern for both at this time is not to report the past with an unattainable degree of objectivity, “wie es eigentlich gewesen ist,” as Burckhardt’s teacher Leopold von Ranke demanded. Rather, “a single source happily chosen can,” for Burckhardt, “do duty for a whole multitude of possible other sources, since he who is really determined to learn, that is, to become rich in spirit, can by a simple unction of his mind, discern and feel the general in the particular” (Burckhardt 1930-4, VII 15). Burckhardt sought to intuit that which was constant, universal, and typical from the welter of particular passing forms. Like Schopenhauer, who himself—despite a massive historical erudition and a cordial acquaintance with Wolf—had almost nothing positive to say about historiography, Burckhardt believed that only the timeless and universal could rise to the level of truth, hence his and Nietzsche’s focus on Kulturgeschichte rather than the passing intrigues of political history. Furthermore, like Nietzsche (at least in these years), but in contradistinction to Schopenhauer, Burckhardt believed that the proper study of history could reveal precisely that: typological traits within people, forms of personalities, and characteristics of epochs. As Burckhardt writes, “Our point of departure is the one and the only thing which lasts in history and is its only possible center: man, this suffering, striving and active being, as he is and was and will forever be” (Burckhardt 1930-4, VII, 3). Indeed, as Nietzsche echoes in his preface to his Philosophy in the Tragic Age of the Greeks (1873), “I am going to emphasize only that point of each of their systems which constitutes a piece of character and hence belongs to that non-controvertible, non-discussable evidence which it is the task of history to preserve: […]” (PtG, P; KSA 1, 801f). For both Burckhardt and Nietzsche, what was most worthy of being taken up by history was never the common or mundane person, but the ‘great man’. For Burckhardt this mainly meant the leading figures of Renaissance Italy, while for Nietzsche, Pre-Socratic Greeks appeared like giants calling to each other in the spirit of competition from atop high mountain peaks.
However true to the philosophy of Schopenhauer Burckhardt styled himself, his conception of the historian’s ability to intuit common formal patterns within the myriad variegations of historical personages was closer to Goethe’s morphology than to Schopenhauer’s aesthetische Anschauung (Gay 1974, 178f). For Goethe, the close observation of the biological development of organic objects, as much as the composition of the dramatic development of a literary character, would reveal Urphänomene or the primary forms of the phenomenon which guided their development. In his dramatic works, Goethe sought to portray the Steigerung of typological characters like Werther, Tasso, or Goetz, whose development over time is not the alteration or transformation of character but its intensification over time. Burckhardt thought the historian’s task was similar insofar as the careful study of historical documents would reveal typological traits among great people, the course of whose development only intensified what was necessarily there from the start.
For Schopenhauer, by contrast, aesthetic intuition was never about discovering typical recurrences in history or a developmental intensification, but gazing beyond the ‘veil of Maya’ in a partial break from the spatio-temporal forms of subjective willing. Aesthetic intuition for Schopenhauer was a non-intellectual and thus non-discursive Auffassung of the Ideas which constitute the first objectification of the one panenthetic Will (that is, the will of a God who is everywhere and in everything). Aesthetic apprehension can only occur when these instrumental satisfactions in the here and now have been removed entirely, when the will of the spectator is silenced. In contrast to art, historiography was merely like science insofar as it only ever studied its objects subjectively, that is, insofar as they might satisfy the demands of the individuated will (Schopenhauer 1977, X/2 459f). Just as the sciences study their objects in order to use them, benefit from them, or solve problems with them, historians only research the topics they do with an eye toward explaining what was previously unknown, solving mysteries, or perhaps toward finding insights to contemporary problems. Indeed, precisely because of the subjective and necessarily temporal judgments of history, Schopenhauer, in opposition to both Burckhardt and Nietzsche at this time, esteemed history insufficient to attain the “deep truths” of the world in the manner of great art. “Wherever it is a question of knowledge of cause and effect or of grounds and consequences of any kind,” writes Schopenhauer, “that is to say in all branches of natural science and mathematics, as also in history, or with inventions, etc., the knowledge sought must be an aim of the will” (Schopenhauer 1977, X/2, 459f). Burckhardt and Nietzsche both thought that history failed to attain the level of science, but for different reasons. Unlike science, history is unable to construct laws by which the historian might predict future cases, and, more importantly, should not try to be scientific since its proper aim was not understanding but creating values. But although Burckhardt had nothing to do with the mystical elements of Schopenhauer’s thought, his younger Basel colleague was less concerned with scholarly restraint.
To Burckhardt’s and Ritschl’s consternation, Nietzsche tried to co-opt the Schopenhauerian aesthetic-metaphysical mysticism in his first ‘historical’ work, The Birth of Tragedy (1872). “But our Nietzsche!” Ritschl would write to Wilhelm Vischer, the man who a few years before hired Nietzsche at Basel, “It’s remarkable how in one person two souls live next to each other. On the one side, the strictest method of academic scientific research…on the other this fantastically-overreaching, over enthusiastic, beat-you-senseless, Wagnerian-Schopenhauerian art-mystery-religion-crap [Kunstmysterienreligionsschwärmerei]! […] What really makes me mad is his impiety against his true mother, who had suckled him at her breast: philology” (KSA 15, 46f). The justification for Nietzsche’s claims about the ‘inner’ or ‘real’ nature of tragedy was never intended to have utilized the same methodology as his earlier philology, no longer aiming at a correspondence between the account and what the evidence portrays to be real, as Ritschl sensed easily enough. In claiming that the real origin of tragedy is a happy confluence of Dionysian and Apolline drives at a particular moment in history, Nietzsche instead makes an intuitional claim that transgresses the boundaries of naturalistic explanation. Nietzsche, as Jahn’s student Ulrich von Wilamowitz Moellendorff famously charged, shunned source criticism, neglected linguistic analysis, couldn’t be bothered to footnote, was generally ignorant of archeology, and “revile[d] the historical-critical method, denouncing any intuition which deviates from his own, and [ascribed] a ‘complete misunderstanding of the study of antiquity’ to the age in which philology in Germany, due to Gottfried Hermann and Karl Lachmann was raised to an unprecedented height” (Wilamowitz-Moellendorff 1872, 5). Beyond traditional historical versions of intuition in the manner of Herder or Burckhardt, Nietzsche’s believes his own intuitions about tragedy are true precisely insofar as he has left the phenomenal realm behind and become identified with the inner nature of the tragic world in-itself. Through a sort of mystical echo of the ancient standard of truth as identity between the subject and object, the principle that “like is known by like,” Nietzsche thinks he can communicate the real inner Idea of tragedy:
Only insofar as the genius, during the act of artistic procreation, merges fully with that original artist of the world does he know anything of the eternal essence of art; for in this condition he resembles, miraculously, that uncanny image of fairy-tale which can turn its eyes around and look at itself; now he is at one and the same time subject and object, simultaneously poet, actor, and spectator. (BT 5, KSA 1, 47f.)
Like Wagner, who in his own aesthetic ecstasy was claimed by Nietzsche to have attained a “sort of omniscience [Allwissenheit] … as if the visual power of his eyes hovered not only upon surfaces, but ‘ins Innere’” (BT 22, KSA 1, 140), Nietzsche believed himself to inhabit the sort of aesthetic state of Schopenhauer’s genius. “I had discovered the only historical simile and facsimile of my own innermost experience,—and this led me to apprehend the amazing phenomenon of the Dionysian…” (EH 'Geburt' 2, KSA 6, 311). Another retrospective evaluation claims the work was, “Constructed entirely from precocious, wet-behind-the-ears personal experiences, all of which lay at the very threshold of what could be communicated.” This was apparently because the work was not scientific-philology but was, “located in the territory of art […] perhaps a book for artists with some subsidiary capacity for analysis and retrospection (in other words, for an exceptional type of artist […]), full of psychological innovations and artist-mysteries, with an artist’s metaphysics in the background…” (BT 'Versuch' 2, KSA 1, 13).
Shortly before the Birth of Tragedy, Nietzsche wrote to Erwin Rohde that “Scholarship, art, and philosophy are growing together inside me to such an extent that one day I’m bound to give birth to centaurs” (Letter to Rohde, January 15th, 1870; KSB 3, 95). Indeed, the book was just that, though it was no longer something to be proud of. Almost immediately after, Nietzsche rescinded his artistic-mystical view about the historian’s ability to intuit the real Ideas, in Schopenhauer’s technical sense, of the nature of tragedy beyond the mediated observation of the past through historical evidence. “For the readers of my earlier writings I wish to expressly clarify that I have abandoned the metaphysical-artistic views that fundamentally govern them” (N Ende 1876-Sommer 1877 23, KSA 8, 463). His increasingly skeptical attitude toward the mystical aspect of Schopenhauer’s philosophy led Nietzsche to revise major aspects of his own thought.
In 1874’s vom Nutzen und Nachteil der Historie für das Leben, Nietzsche presents three ‘types’ of historian, the critical, antiquarian, and monumental. None of these “merges with the original artist of the world”; none becomes the “subject and object” of their historical study. Instead, each type of historian represents the past according to the rules of an inner necessity, exaggerating or downplaying certain aspects of the past in order to tear down idols, preserve them, or build them up. Each type of historian and their accordant way of representing the past has its advantages and disadvantages for themselves and for the cultures in which they live, but none is able to represent the past as it ‘really’ was since into each of their judgments intrudes their psychologically-determined desires and interests.
If it is, as Nietzsche begins to think, that all judgments are constituted by unconscious psychological dynamics, then the ‘subject-free’ ideal of objectivity must be jettisoned. Certainly, the Schopenhauerian aesthetic escape from individual subjectivity will be impossible; but so will the Rankean ‘disinterested’ vision of scientific objectivity. The best one can hope for historians, Nietzsche thinks, is that the subjective facticities that distort their judgments would be in some sense ‘healthy’, or at least healthier than those judgments that infect modern schoolbooks. Only the strong have the right sort of subjective dynamics that would enable a healthy interpretation of historical events. “If you are to venture to interpret the past you can do so only out of the fullest exertion of the vigor of the present: only when you put forth your noblest qualities in all their strength will you divine what is worth knowing and preserving in the past. Like to like! Otherwise, you will draw the past down to you. Do not believe historiography that does not spring from the head of the rarest minds…” (UB II 6, KSA 1, 293f).
By looking at the psychological conditions within which historians construct their accounts, Nietzsche effectively focuses the ‘historical sense’—“the capacity for quickly guessing the order of rank of the valuations according to which a people, a society, a human being has lived” (BGE 224, KSA 5, 157)—on the historians themselves. “History belongs above all to the active and powerful man,” Nietzsche proclaims—like Schiller or Goethe who view the past as a model for inspiration, not merely to imitate, but as an “incentive to do as others have done and do it better” (UB II, 2, KSA 1, 259). Among those with highly-ranked drives Nietzsche declares Burckhardt (see among many examples, N Frühling-Sommer 1875 5, KSA 8, 56), Thucydides (e.g., GD Antike 2, KSA 6, 155f), Hekataeus (KGW II/5, 229f), Tacitus (N 1885 43, KSA 11, 702), Hippolyte Taine (JGB 254, KSA 5, 198), and Ritschl (EH 'klug' 9, KSA 6, 295). Among those badly ranked are Karl Lachmann (N März 1875 3, KSA 8, 24), the historian of ancient philosophy Eduard Zeller (KGB II/1, 124), and Overbeck’s confidant Heinrich von Treitschke (EH 'Wagner' 3, KSA 6, 361). Relegated to a secondary consideration is whether these historians’ ‘facts’ are accurate; what is time and again foregrounded is the order of rank of the values and drives according to which their historiographical accounts are constructed.
The same is true of Nietzsche’s evaluation of teleological historiography. Although David Friedrich Strauss (see the entirety of UB I, KSA 1, 159-242) and Hegel (see N Frühling-Sommer 1875 5, KSA 8, 57) are also targets, much of what Nietzsche says in the latter chapters of Nutzen und Nachteil about teleological historiography is directed against Eduard von Hartmann (see also N 1884 26, KSA 11, 236; N November 1887-März 1888 11, KSA 13, 30). Hartmann’s philosophical history of consciousness was largely a synthesis of Schopenhauer’s depiction of the blind world will and Hegel’s teleological unfolding of both mind and the rational course of history itself (Hartmann 1923, I 329). Spiritual and moral progress are guaranteed by the Divine Will, whose ideas are instantiated first within the unconscious desires and drives of early peoples and then in an ever-increasing degree of conscious reflection within civilized nations. The aims of the Divine Will are accomplished, consciously or otherwise, regardless of whatever individuals would like to make of their futures.
Hartmann and the sort of Hegelian teleological historicism he represents have, of course, gone out of fashion. It would be rather absurd in today’s more naturalistic historiographical climate to try to prove that a particular decision by a particular agent was the effect of the Divine Will’s cosmic plan; but the focus of Nietzsche’s critique lay elsewhere. In keeping with his view that judgments are necessarily a function of the psychological fundament of their authors, Nietzsche targets the underlying motivations that would lead Hartmann, and for that matter Hegel, to interpret the historical world as teleological in the first place. What he discovers in these teleological historians is a ‘cynical’ outlook on life generally. Instead of a grim determination to affirm their lives they surrender themselves to the recognition that nothing they do is anything more than a preordained stepping-stone on the march toward the absolute. Teleological historians are driven by a nihilistic desire, by the need, Nietzsche contends, to absolve their own wills: “die volle Hingabe der Persönlichkeit an den Weltprozess” [the total sacrifice of individuality to the world-process] (UB II 9, KSA 1, 316). This surrender of today for the sake of some promised future ideal is a secularized version, Nietzsche ultimately thinks, of the Christian faith in heaven.
Although positivism and teleology are nearly antonyms today, this was not the case in Nietzsche’s century. Comte, and his sociological and economical descendants such as Durkheim and Marx, each envisioned an epochal and progressive scheme of history—a sort of one-way street from a repressed past to an enlightened future. Both, however, were careful to replace Hegel and Hartmann’s extra-natural teleological movers in history with a positivist or materialist theory of explanation respectively. In doing so, they considered their developmental schemes both equally demonstrable and as necessary as those of the natural sciences. “All historical writing,” Marx tells us, “must set out from these natural bases and their modification in the course of history through the action of men” (Marx & Engels 1845, 36). “Scientific history, or sociology,” according to Durkheim, “must be founded upon the direct observation of concrete facts” (Durkheim 1972, 78). Such scientific historical representations rested on their shared hope of ascribing causes that governed the behaviors of either individuals or groups as they undergo their progressive development, and that hope can be traced back to H.T. Buckle, the original ‘scientific historian’, whom Nietzsche himself recognizes in this context (See GM I 4, KSA 5, 262).
Nietzsche rejected grand architectonics whose purpose seemed only to convince people that they will someday soon be better off. He also criticized the efforts to regard the past as unfolding even to non-teleological laws insofar as their effort to deduce nomothetically betrayed either their desire to predict and thereby control future events or else their fear of the unknown. “In other disciplines, generalizations [Allgemeinheiten] are the most important thing since they contain the laws [Gesetze]. But if such assertions as that cited are meant to be valid laws, then we could reply that the historian’s work is wasted. For whatever truth is left in such statements, after subtracting that mysterious and irreducible residue we mentioned earlier, is obvious and even trivial since it is self-evident to anyone with the slightest range of experience” (UB II 6, KSA 1, 291f). While there may have been a certain admiration for positivism’s rigorous and anti-metaphysical methodologies, Nietzsche says very little about any of these proto-sociologists. Most notoriously, Nietzsche never names Marx a single time anywhere in his writing.
Nietzsche’s rejection of nomothetic schemata that purport to explain historical change, whether metaphysical or naturalistic, does not imply he was a radical outlier of the ‘historical’ 19th-Century. Every bit as historically-concerned as the teleologists, he thinks “philosophy, or that alone which I count it to be, [is] the most general form of history, the attempt to somehow describe and abbreviate in signs the Heraclitean world of becoming…” (N 1885 36, KSA 11, 562). Nietzsche’s attempt at historicizing philosophy would endure longer than his friendship with the man who helped to inspire it. For alongside Paul Rée he came to the conviction that values, whether moral, political, aesthetic, or even metaphysical, were a function of drives which were themselves conditioned subconsciously throughout a long historical process. Old religious and Platonic beliefs in good and evil as static metaphysical entities were, for both Rée and Nietzsche, to be replaced with a naturalistic and developmental account about how present-day values derive from a convoluted process of practical and often egoistical considerations. But where for Rée, like Darwin and Lamarck before him, acquired habits become inherited traits due to their role in helping both individuals and societies survive better relative to their competitors, Nietzsche viewed the historical inculcation of moral sentiments as a reflection of group attempts to instantiate power-aims.
In keeping with his exhortation that philosophy become historical, Nietzsche variously endeavors to construct a ‘history of the moral sensations’, a ‘natural history of morals’, and most famously, a Genealogy of Morals (1887), a book whose mission is derived from a deeply historicist conviction. “[W]e need to know about the conditions and circumstances under which the values grew up, developed, and changed…” (GM P 6, KSA 5, 253). To that end, Nietzsche would seem to require a set of demonstrable historical premises: that there really was a time during which a masterly set of values dominated and a later time at which it became displaced by the widely-flung inversion of those values known as slave morality. Indeed he claims to seek, “morality as it really existed and was really lived,” “the real history of morality,” which can “actually be confirmed and has actually existed” (GM P 7, KSA 5, 254).
But doing so enmeshes Nietzsche in considerable meta-historical problems, some of which he himself poses. The Genealogie is above all an attempt to articulate the history of the development of moral values in a way that undermines his contemporaries’ faith in the absoluteness of their own values. It does so on two levels: first by offering an historical explanation that reveals the intrinsically historical rather than absolute character of moral values. Nietzsche had formidable allies on this score in Rée and the ‘English School’ of moral psychology—represented foremost by Herbert Spencer—both of whom followed Charles Darwin’s intimation that even morality should be viewed as an evolutionary phenomenon. But whereas their interpretation of that evolution seemed to guarantee the progressive status of fundamentally Christian values like altruism, honesty, cooperation, and compassion, Nietzsche’s own psychologizing-historiography uncovered a darker underside of morality. In fact, as has been thoroughly argued, the text itself represents something like a new-Darwinism (Richardson 2004) or anti-Darwinism (Johnson 2010), insofar as it rejects evolutionary progress and substitutes a vision of the ‘competition of wills’ as a mechanism to explain historical change. Nietzsche rejects the Darwinian accounts by dismantling their presumptions about the origin of value resting with the recipient rather than the doer of ‘good’ or ‘bad’ deeds, about nature aiming at preservation rather than overcoming, about the passivity and accidental character of propagatory success, and about the possibility and value of altruism within social frameworks. The success of this refutation rests in its being somehow a ‘better’ historical account than social-Darwinian alternative, that is, a more accurate and comprehensive historical account than theirs. Given that Nietzsche offers scant historical data that would support his own interpretation of events—the few proffered etymologies would hardly prove much—his account, as an objective history of morality largely fails to demonstrate Nietzsche’s counter-hypotheses.
It is on the second level, a meta-historical level, that Nietzsche’s Genealogie proves its enduring originality. Nietzsche shows that the very attempt to reconstruct the story of development of morality “as it really happened” is occluded by the recognition that the narrator of events is intrinsic to the story, that the historian himself is no will-less, objective, static point of observation, but was himself a perpetually becoming, value-laden dynamic of subjectivity, who is every bit as historical and drive-constituted as the values he was trying to explain. Contrary to Darwinians of any stripe, Nietzsche recognized that historiography is never about ‘getting the facts straight’, ‘wie es eigentlich gewesen ist’, but about interpreting it according to the drive-informed perspective in which the historian was embedded. Whereas the Darwinians interpreted the historical evolution of morality as if they themselves stood outside of it, for Nietzsche, “[W]e count—after the fact—all the twelve trembling strokes of the clock of our experience, our lives, our being—alas! In the process we keep losing the count. So we remain necessarily strangers to ourselves, we do not understand ourselves, we have to keep ourselves confused” (GM P 1, KSA 5, 247). Values and also that conception of ourselves as the architects of values dynamically affects the way by which one interprets those values, such that the attempt to re-present the ‘first bell’, that original value, free of the distortions of generations of overwriting, reformulating, and above all re-valuing those values, becomes impossible.
How have the moral genealogists reacted so far in this matter? Naively, as is their wont: they highlight some ‘purpose’ in punishment, for example, revenge or deterrence, then innocently place the purpose at the start, as causa ﬁendi of punishment, and—have ﬁnished. But ‘purpose in law’ is the last thing we should apply to the history of the emergence of law: on the contrary, there is no more important proposition for every sort of history than that which we arrive at only with great effort but which we really should reach,—namely that the origin of the emergence of a thing and its ultimate usefulness, its practical application and incorporation into a system of ends, are toto coelo separate; that anything in existence, having somehow come about, is continually interpreted anew, requisitioned anew, transformed and redirected to a new purpose by a power superior to it; that everything that occurs in the organic world consists of overpowering, dominating, and in their turn, overpowering and dominating consist of re-interpretation, adjustment, in the process of which their former ‘meaning’ and ‘purpose’ must necessarily be obscured or completely obliterated. [...] But every purpose and use is just a sign that the will to power has achieved mastery over something less powerful, and has impressed upon it its own meaning of a use function; and the whole history of a ‘thing’, an organ, a tradition can to this extent be a continuous chain of signs, continually revealing new interpretations and adaptations, the causes of which need not be connected even amongst themselves, but rather sometimes just follow and replace one another at random. (GM II, 12; KSA 5, 312)
As this passage offers the most expansive explication of his mature historical theory, it is worth careful investigation. There seem to be three interrelated theses here. First, history practiced rightly must accord the genuine nature of reality. Other ‘genealogists’, who in this context are represented primarily by Nietzsche’s one-time friend Paul Rée and the Darwin-inspired moralists such as Herbert Spencer, are in a better position than ahistorical philosophers such as Plato and Spinoza insofar as they rightly recognize the fluidity of moral concepts. However, where the naively realist genealogists go wrong is in unreflectively presuming that their own interpretations of those moral concepts are somehow true for all time and all people, in other words, that their interpretations of the flow of history somehow stand outside the flow of history (see also Johnson 2010, 116-148; Born 2010, 202-52).
Second, Nietzsche’s mature genealogy adapts what might be called an anti-realist theory of historical explanation and description. Terms like ‘cause’, ‘effect’, and ‘purpose’ are not elements of a ‘real’ world, but signs that have been found useful for communicating meaning intersubjectively. Descriptions like ‘terrorist’, ‘revolution’, and ‘democracy’ identify in language what is actually a non-identical set of loosely-connected phenomena.
Third, and as a consequence of the first two theses, there can be no single ‘absolute’ interpretation of the past. Interpretations are a function of the historical world. Like all phenomena, they change and transmogrify over time in accordance to the deep and often unconscious demands of the agents who construct, accept, or reject those interpretations. The example of punishment in this passage illustrates particularly well how the meaning of a single word shifts over epochs and cultures. What accounts for that shift is the fluctuating power dynamics both within particular historians and among the wider sphere of what a culture considers an historical ‘fact’ over time.
Despite his conviction that philosophy must be historical, then, Nietzsche simultaneously understood writing philosophy historically to be a deeply problematic endeavor. Any attempt to describe or explain a historical event amounts to an illegitimate de-contextualization, an attempt to affix the unaffixable with allegedly static concepts. As he would write to his friend, the historical theologian Franz Overbeck, “At last my mistrust now turns to the question whether history is actually possible? What, then does one want to ascertain [feststellen]?—something, which in a moment of happening, does not itself ‘stand fast’ [‘feststand’]?” (an Overbeck 23.02.1887, KSB 8, 28). The situation is made worse in recognizing that not only is the reality to be described in a state of flux, but the one who recognizes it is in a similar state of flux. Not only has Heraclitus’s river changed, so has the subjectivity of the one who has entered it.
A similar cluster of problems was faced by Neo-Kantian thinkers in the years just following Nietzsche’s Genealogie. Wilhelm Windelband, Heinrich Rickert, and the quasi-Neo-Kantian Wilhelm Dilthey were each keen in their own ways to view historical judgment as a function of subjective facticities rather than as a mirror of an objective past. Each sought, like Nietzsche, to distinguish history from science both in terms of the methodology of its investigations and the sorts of objects it studies. Where science seeks to explain by deduction from general rules, history only contains such generalities in imprecise abstractions. Due to the singularity of every object under its purview, history cannot hope to explain scientifically by means of deduction under general laws. As Windelband phrases it in his inaugural address as rector at Strasbourg, “The nomological sciences are concerned with what is invariably the case. The sciences of process are concerned with what once was the case” (Windelband 1894, 175). The former sciences were famously designated nomothetic, the latter, like historiography, called idiographic. Finally, while historiography does involve the search for explanations in terms of causes, those causes must be regarded as value-imbued. “History,” Rickert writes, “with its individualizing method and its orientation to values, has to investigate the causal relations subsisting among the unique and individual events with which it is concerned. These causal relations do not coincide with any universal laws of nature…the selection of what is essential in history involves reference to values even in the inquiry into causes…” (Rickert 1889, 94; see also Windelband 1884, 205). In place of a universal dogmatic positivist explanation, philosophers of history following the neo-Kantians address which causal account best satisfies the subjective standards of the historians and of their audience. Compare this to Nietzsche’s claim in Ecce Homo, that “we are not looking for just any type of explanatory cause, we are looking for a chosen, preferred type of explanation, one that will most quickly and reliably get rid of the feeling of unfamiliarity and novelty, the feeling that we are dealing with something we have never encountered before,—the most common explanation” (GD Irrthümer 5, KSA 6.93).
Nietzsche rejects attempts to construe a past in-itself without acknowledging the tangled but inextricable web of interpretations cast upon it by later interpreters. “[T]he origin of the emergence of a thing and its ultimate usefulness, its practical application and incorporation into a system of ends, are toto coelo separate; anything in existence, having somehow come about, is continually interpreted anew, requisitioned anew, transformed and redirected to a new purpose” (GM II 12, KSA 5, 313). Any attempt to isolate Nietzsche’s historiographical ideas for the sake of contextualizing them would accordingly demand a reckoning of the many drives of its very many interpreters over the past century or so. Such a genealogical account of Nietzsche’s historiography would be severely unwieldy, if not impossible. It nevertheless serves to mention at least two of the most prominent lines of the interpretive reception of Nietzsche’s meta-history.
Although a broad generalization, continental thinkers from the 1930’s to the 1970’s such as Heidegger, Jaspers, Sartre, Arendt, Levinas, Ricouer and Patočka took their cue from Nietzsche’s demand that the human person be considered within the framework of his or her historicity. Specifically, they each appear influenced by Nietzsche’s 1874 characterization of the human animal as the one unable to ignore his or her temporality; being human means being forever tied to a continual process of becoming, the awareness of which it is our unique burden to bear (UB II 1, KSA 1, 248f). In fact, this single idea is arguably the most essential and unifying theme among all mid-20th Century continental thinkers. One must understand her existential condition as oriented in her birth and propelled toward her future possibilities, which fall under the inescapable common horizon of death. Orienting oneself to one’s history becomes the essential existential project.
Among later postmodern continental thinkers such as Foucault, DeMan, Lacoue-Labarthes, Lyotard, Derrida, and among the most noted contemporary postmodern meta-historians like Hayden White, Frank Ankersmit, and Keith Jenkins, the anthropological focus increasingly shifts to an epistemological one. The view of history as a mirror of the real events of a real objective past is ridiculed as an outdated conservative ideal. Historiography has historically not been used to discover truth, pure and unadulterated—and indeed cannot be. Historical writing hitherto has consisted in a set of authoritative narratives constructed in order to justify existing biases and power structures. Consistent with their interpretation of Nietzsche’s genealogical project, they see the West in a moment of cultural crisis, one which historiography has uncovered and which it must of itself help resolve. Historiography’s task is thus no longer to simply records facts, they hold, but to unmask the so-called ‘objective’ systems of values by deconstructing or revealing as mythic the ideological foundations on which they were built. After those grand-narratives have been exposed, historiography’s myth-making capacities are to be refocused to allow previously underrepresented groups to construct the story from their own perspectives. One senses here the rather freely-interpreted application of Nietzsche’s claim that “the more eyes, different eyes we learn to set upon the same object, the more complete will be our ‘concept’ of this thing, the more ‘objective’” (GM III 12, KSA 5, 365), but they are nevertheless correct to acknowledge the debt their own conception of power-interpretation owes to Nietzsche.
- BAW: Historisch-kritische Gesamtausgabe: Werke, 5 vols., edited by Joachim Mette et al. (Berlin, 1933–43).
- KGB: Kritische Gesamtausgabe: Briefwechsel, edited by Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari (Berlin, 1975ff).
- KGW: Kritische Gesamtausgabe: Werke, edited by Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari (Berlin, 1967ff).
- KSA: Sämtliche Werke: Kritische Studienausgabe, 15 vols., edited by Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari (Berlin, 1988).
- KSB: Sämtliche Briefe: Kritische Studienausgabe, 8 vols., edited by Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari (Berlin, 1986).
- Born, Marcus Andreas, Nihilistisches Geschichtsdenken: Nietzsches perspektivische Genealogie (München: Wilhelm Fink, 2010).
- Burckhardt, Jakob, Gesamtausgabe in 14 Bände, edited by Emil Dürr et al. (Stuttgart/Berlin/Leipzig: Deutsche Verlaganstalt, 1930-4).
- Durkheim, Émile, Selected Writings, edited by Anthony Giddens (Cambridge (Cambridge University Press, 1972).
- Gay, Peter, Style in History: Gibbon, Ranke, Macaulay, Burckhardt (New York /London: W.W. Norton, 1974).
- Hartmann, Eduard von, Philosophie des Unbewussten: Speculative Resultate nach inductiv-naturwissenschaftlicher Methode in 3 Bände (Leipzig: Kröner, 1923).
- Janz, Curt Paul, Friedrich Nietzsche. Biographie in drei Bände (Munich: Carl Hanser, 1993).
- Johnson, Dirk R., Nietzsche’s Anti-Darwinism (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010).
- Marx, Karl & Engels, Friedrich, The German Ideology, translated by S. Ryazanskaya (New York: Prometheus, 1998).
- Richardson, John, Nietzsche's New Darwinism (New York/Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2004).
- Rickert, Heinrich, Science and History: Critique of Positivist Epistemology, translated by G. Reisman (New York: Van Nostrand, 1962).
- Schopenhauer, Arthur, Zürcher Ausgabe. Werke in zehn Bände, edited by Hübscher et al. (Zürich: Diogenes Verlag, 1977).
- Wilamowitz-Moellendorff, Ulirch von, “Future Philology! A Reply to Friedrich Nietzsche’s ‘The Birth of Tragedy’,” translated by Gertrude Postl et al., New Nietzsche Studies 4 (2000): 1-32.
- Windelband, William, An Introduction to Philosophy, translated by J. McCabe (London: Unwin, 1921).
- Windelband, William, “History and Natural Science,” translated by G. Oakes, History and Theory 19 (1980): 165-85.
- Bahnsen, Julius, Zur Philosophie der Geschichte: Eine kritische Besprechung des Hegel-Hartmann’sche Evolutionismus aus Schopenhauer’schen Principien (Berlin: Duncker, 1872).
- One of Nietzsche’s principle sources for both his criticism of teleology and his formulation of a naturalistic theory of historical explanation.
- Benne, Christian, Nietzsche und die historisch-kritische Philologie (Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 2005)
- Exposits and analyzes the way Nietzsche’s early philological training enters his mature philosophical thinking.
- Bernoulli, Carl Albrecht, Das Dreigestirn: Bachofen, Jakob Burckhardt, Nietzsche (Basel: Schwabe & Co., 1931).
- A reliable and comprehensive account of the personal and intellectual interrelations of these three Basel professors.
- Blondel, Éric, The Body and Culture: Philosophy as Philological Genealogy, translated by Sean Hand (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1991).
- Highly insightful attempt to assimilate Nietzsche’s philological training with a postmodern account of his perspectivism.
- Born, Marcus Andreas, Nihilistisches Geschichtsdenken: Nietzsches perspektivische Genealogie (München: Wilhelm Fink, 2010).
- A Foucault-influenced account of Nietzsche’s critique of Hegelian teleology and the historical ramifications of the death of God.
- Brobjer, Thomas H. (2004): “Nietzsche’s View of the Value of Historical Studies and Methods” In: Journal of the History of Ideas. Bd. 65 (2), 301-22.
- Brobjer, Thomas H., “Nietzsche’s Relation to Historical Methods and Nineteenth-Century German Historiography,” History and Theory 46 (2007): 155–79.
- Both pieces by Brobjer present a wealth of information about Nietzsche’s historiographical context, reading, and influences.
- Campioni, Guiliano, Paolo D’Iorio, Maria Cristina Fornari, Francesco Fronterotta & Andrea Orsucci (eds.) (2003): Nietzsches persönliche Bibliothek. Berlin (Walter de Gruyter Press).
- A comprehensive collection of Nietzsche’s personal library, essential for reconstructing what Nietzsche read about history and historoical theory.
- Cancik, Hubert, Nietzsches Antike: Vorlesung (Stuttgart: J.B. Metzler Verlag, 1995).
- An examination of Nietzsche’s philological activities from one of the world’s leading historians of philology.
- Dries, Manuel (ed.), Nietzsche on Time and History (Berlin: De Gruyter Press, 2008).
- A fine collection of essays from leading and upcoming scholars, many of which address Nietzsche’s thinking about history.
- Drossbach, Maximillian, Über scheinbaren und wirklichen Ursachen des Geschehens in der Welt (Halle: Pfeffer, 1884).
- A naturalistic rejection of teleological historical explanation that Nietzsche read shortly before the composition of On the Genealogy of Morals.
- Emden, Christian, Friedrich Nietzsche and the Politics of History (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008).
- A highly-informative contextualized account of Nietzsche’s historical theory, with special reference to the culture and politics of Basel during Nietzsche’s tenure.
- Geuss, Raymond, “Nietzsche and Genealogy,” European Journal of Philosophy 2 (1994): 275–92.
- An especially clear account of Nietzsche’s explanatory strategies in the Genealogy of Morals.
- Gossman, Lionel, Basel in the Age of Burckhardt: A Study in Unseasonable Ideas (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2000).
- A foundational account of Nietzsche’s intellectual milieu in the 1860’s-70’s.
- Hartmann, Eduard von, Philosophie des Unbewussten: Speculative Resultate nach inductiv-naturwissenschaftlicher Methode (Berlin: Carl Duncker, 1869).
- One of Nietzsche’s most important sources of teleological historiography and the main target of his ire in the second Untimely Meditation.
- Jensen, Anthony K., Nietzsche’s Philosophy of History (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2013).
- A comprehensive account of Nietzsche’s historical theory and its shifts over the course of his career.
- Jensen, Anthony K. & Heit, Helmut (eds.), Nietzsche as a Scholar of Antiquity (New York / London: Bloomsbury Publishing, 2014).
- A collection of articles that covers the scope of Nietzsche’s publications and lecture notes during his time as a classical philologist.
- Lipperheide, Christian, Nietzsches Geschichtsstrategien. Die rhetorische Neuorganisation der Geschichte (Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, 1999).
- A narrativist and constructivist reading of Nietzsche’s philosophy of history.
- Meyer, Katrin, Ästhetik der Historie: Friedrich Nietzsches ‘vom Nutzen und Nachteil der Historie für das Leben’ (Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, 1998).
- An analysis of the second Untimely Meditation from the perspective of Nietzsche’s aesthetic theory.
- Nehamas, Alexander, “The Genealogy of Genealogy: Interpretation in Nietzsche’s Second Untimely Meditation and in On the Genealogy of Morals,” in Nietzsche, Genealogy, and Morality, edited by Richard Schacht (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1994), 269–83.
- Considers Nietzsche’s genealogical mode of philosophizing as a more elaborate but nevertheless consistent expression of his earlier philological methodology.
- Pletsch, Carl, Young Nietzsche: Becoming a Genius (New York: The Free Press, 1991).
- An intellectual biography of Nietzsche’s early years, with special attention to his schooling and time at Basel.
- Porter, James I., Nietzsche and the Philology of the Future (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2000).
- Remains the decisive account of Nietzsche’s philological study, articles, and lectures.
- Reinhardt, Karl, “Nietzsche und die Geschichte,” in his Vermächtnis der Antike. Gesammelte Essays zur Philosophie und Geschichtsschreibung (Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, 1960), 296–309.
- A dated, but still informative critique of Nietzsche’s contribution to philology from one of the leading classicists of the 20th Century.
- Ritschl, Friedrich, Opuscula Philologica, 5 vols., edited by Kurt Wachsmuth (Leipzig: Teubner, 1879).
- The badly-neglected collected works of Nietzsche’s teacher, containing, among many other things, observations and exhortations about the contemporary practice of classical philology as Nietzsche would have known them.
- Saar, Martin, Genealogie als Kritik: Geschichte und Theorie des Subjekts nach Nietzsche und Foucault (Frankfurt/New York: Campus Verlag, 2007).
- An admirable attempt to compare the historical theories of Foucault and Nietzsche from the standpoint of their respective notions of subjectivity.
- Salaquarda, Jörg, “Studien zur Zweiten Unzeitgemäßen Betrachtung,” Nietzsche-Studien 13 (1984): 1–45.
- The most comprehensive account of the genesis and context of the second Untimely Meditation in any language.
- Schrift, Alan, Nietzsche and the Question of Interpretation: Between Hermeneutics and Deconstruction (New York/London: Routledge, 1990).
- A decisive continental treatment of Nietzsche’s thinking generally, with special attention to Nietzsche’s theory of historical interpretation.
- Sommer, Andreas Urs, Der Geist der Historie und das Ende des Christentums. Zur „Waffengenossenschaft“ von Friedrich Nietzsche und Franz Overbeck (Berlin: Akademie Verlag, 1997).
- A highly-informed comparison of Nietzsche and the theological historian Franz Overbeck concerning especially teleology and Christian historiography.
- Stambaugh, Joan, The Problem of Time in Nietzsche, translated by John F. Humphrey (Philadelphia: Bucknell University Press, 1987).
- A seminal examination of the interrelation of history, temporality, subjectivity, and willing in Nietzsche.
- White, Hayden, Metahistory: The Historical Imagination in Nineteenth-Century Europe (Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1973).
- Includes an attempt to read Nietzsche as a precursor to post-modern historical narrativity. White is one of the leading philosophers of history in the world.
Anthony K. Jensen
U. S. A.