Paradigm Case Arguments

From time to time philosophers and scientists have made sensational, provocative claims that certain things do not exist or never happen that, in everyday life, we unquestioningly take for granted as existing or happening. These claims have included denying the existence of matter, space, time, the self, free will, and other sturdy and basic elements of our common-sense or naïve world-view. Around the middle of the twentieth century an argument was developed that can be used to challenge many such skeptical claims based on linguistic considerations, which came to be known as the Paradigm Case Argument (henceforth, the PCA).

Consider, for instance, the following argument from a skeptic who denies that there are cases of seeing people. First, it cannot be said that we see the people who walk our streets, since they are mostly covered with clothes. All that we see, strictly speaking, are their faces and hands. But to see any such people stripped naked would be little better, since we then would be seeing only their facing surfaces while only imagining or anticipating, not seeing, their rear sides. With well-placed mirrors we might be able to see all their sides at once, but we are still seeing only their exterior, which does not constitute the whole person. No, to see these people proper we would need to have them opened up, with all their interior parts displayed for us too. But then we would no longer have a person, but a corpse or a display of people-parts. Hence there are no cases of seeing people.

A philosopher using the PCA could then counter this by pointing out that it is in fact a perfectly natural and proper use of the word ‘see’ to say that you see a person in ordinary cases where you are looking at a fully intact person with his or her clothes on. She might then, if necessary, describe situations where we do or would say this. She might point out that we teach or train children and also adults who are learning English how to use the expression ‘see a person’ with reference to everyday cases when one sees them clothed. (Teacher: ‘What do you see on page seven?’ Learner: ‘A person.’ Teacher: ‘That’s correct.’)  These are paradigm cases of seeing people, exemplars that we use when teaching and explaining the meaning of that expression. That being so, there is no logical room for a philosophical argument showing that these are not cases of seeing people. Trying to argue that they are not would be like trying to argue that the paintings of Picasso that the term ‘cubism’ was coined to denote are not cubist (because they do not depict geometrically exact cubes, say).

This article shows the PCA being applied to the more controversial topic of free will skepticism, examines its logical structure, and looks at some common objections to it. The appraisal of the PCA leads to issues of some depth and importance.

Table of Contents

  1. History and Significance of the Argument
  2. Paradigm Cases
  3. The PCA as Part of a Wider Response to the Skeptic
  4. Malcolm’s Version of the PCA
  5. Flew’s Version of the PCA
  6. Critical Responses to Flew’s PCA
    1. Challenging the First Premise
    2. Challenging the Second Premise
    3. The Charge of Irrelevance
  7. "Ordinary Language is Correct Language"
  8. Ordinary Usage as Practices
  9. Conclusion
  10. References and Further Reading

1. History and Significance of the Argument

The PCA is closely associated with the linguistic philosophy movement that peaked in the mid-twentieth century, when many philosophers were urging that philosophical questions and problems should be approached by paying careful attention to the language that we use for expressing them. More specifically, it was associated with the ordinary language philosophy approach within that broader movement, where the emphasis was on examining the ordinary use of terms. Both advocates and critics of the PCA have claimed that it is foundational to those philosophical outlooks and key to understanding them (for example, Flew 1966, p. 261; Gellner 1959, pp. 30–32; Parker-Ryan 2010, p. 123).

The first explicit presentation of the PCA was in a classic paper of the ordinary language philosophy tradition by Norman Malcolm, originally published in 1942, called ‘Moore and Ordinary Language’ (also see Malcolm 1963). Malcolm studied under and was influenced by G. E. Moore and Ludwig Wittgenstein at Cambridge. He then returned to the USA and became a leading exponent of Wittgenstein’s philosophy there. He believed that the PCA was inchoate in Moore’s famous ‘proof’ (1939) of an external world, and he also stated (1963, p. 183) that grasping it was essential for understanding some of Wittgenstein’s most distinctive remarks on the nature of philosophy, such as, ‘Philosophy must not interfere in any way with the actual use of language, so it can in the end only describe it. For it cannot justify it either. It leaves everything as it is’ (Wittgenstein 2009/1953, §124). Anthony Flew was another prominent early exponent of the PCA, who applied and defended it in a series of articles beginning in the 1950s.

The argument was employed by Malcolm, Flew, and others to defend the existence of a variety of things from skeptical attack, such as cases of acting freely (Black 1958; Danto 1959; Flew 1954 & 1955a; Hanfling 1990; Hardie 1957), causation (Black 1958), solidity (Stebbing 1937; Urmson 1953), space and time (Malcolm 1992/1942), material things and perceptions of material things (Malcolm 1992/1942; 1963), and certain knowledge of empirical propositions (Malcolm 1992/1942). For convenience, in what follows people who argue against the existence of such things are called ‘skeptics’, and people who use the PCA to counter such arguments are called ‘defenders’.

2. Paradigm Cases

The PCA exploits the idea of a paradigm case. Minimally, a paradigm case of something is a case that is supposed to come within the denotation or extension of the relevant word. But what is more, it is supposed to centrally come within its denotation; it is supposed to be a model example or exemplar, something about which we are inclined to say, ‘That’s an X if anything is’ or ‘If that’s not an X, I don’t know what is’. It is the kind of case that psychologists who study concepts would call a ‘prototypical category member’ and which has been found to be associated with various psychological phenomena, such as tending to first spring to mind when people are told to think of examples of an X, or being more rapidly categorized as an X compared to other category members in categorization tasks. This exemplar status makes it especially fit for the purpose of explaining the meaning of the relevant word in ostensive definitions (and its being used for that purpose reinforces its exemplar status in turn).

A particularly striking example of a paradigm case in this sense (an exemplar of an exemplar, if you will) might be the International Prototype of the Kilogram, a lump of platinum kept in Paris that was used to define what a kilogram is, such that anything else was a kilogram in weight if and only if it was the same weight as this object. The cases that the defender refers to as paradigm Xs are thought of as playing a similar meaning-setting role in relation to the relevant term ‘X’ (though this comparison has its limits; for example, the cases might not have come to play that role through explicit stipulation or formal decision). The problem, then, that the defender has with the skeptic is that in denying that there are any Xs, the skeptic seems to be denying that what apparently are paradigm cases of Xs are Xs, which would be analogous to denying that the International Prototype of the Kilogram is a kilogram in weight.

3. The PCA as Part of a Wider Response to the Skeptic

Of course, when the skeptic denies that there are any Xs, he does so due to some reasons or arguments. The PCA, however, does not directly engage with the arguments that the skeptic gives or the significant complexities they can give rise to. This is because, from the defender’s perspective, the skeptic’s claims can ‘be seen to be false in advance of an examination of the arguments adduced in support of them’ (Malcolm 1963, p. 181; also see Malcolm 1992/1942, p. 114), since the PCA is supposed to show that the skeptical claim must be wrong. In other words, for the defender, the skeptical argument (assuming it is logically valid) should be regarded as a reductio ad absurdum of a premise in the argument, since it leads to an absurd or impossible conclusion.

It is this apparently brusque way of treating the skeptic’s arguments that provoked suspicion and even hostility towards the PCA on the part of some critics. Thus some have sarcastically referred to it as a ‘remarkably economical device for resolving complex philosophical disputes’ (Beattie 1981, p. 78), or as ‘a very simple way of disposing of immense quantities of metaphysical and other argument, without the smallest trouble or exertion’ (Heath 1952, p. 1). For others it seems to take the fascination and wonder out of philosophy by its summary rejection of intriguing claims and arguments (Watkins 1957a, p. 26). Why the defender feels entitled to treat the skeptic’s arguments in this way is explained in section eight.

Defenders do not give the skeptic’s arguments quite the short shrift that these remarks suggest, however, since they see the PCA as being only a part of an adequate philosophical response to the skeptic. Accordingly, both Malcolm and Flew stated that to truly free us from the skeptic’s position, reminding us of ordinary linguistic usage is not enough. We also need to reconstruct and examine the reasoning (Malcolm 1951, p. 340; 1992/1942, p. 123) or to identify the ‘intellectual sources’ (Flew 1966, p. 264) that drew us towards the skeptical conclusion. (The importance of this is especially evident in the free will debate, where even philosophers who sympathize with the PCA defense of free will can still feel troubled by the skeptical arguments.) This part of the response to skepticism involves examining the skeptical arguments, and it can also involve unearthing any unstated presuppositions, comparisons, or pictures that might be informing those arguments. Sometimes these sources get their intellectual power over us precisely from the fact that we are not explicitly conscious of them, and they can lose this power when we become conscious of them (Wittgensteinians sometimes call this the ‘therapeutic’ part of the investigation). For instance, regarding the argument that we never see people—a sort of argument that is not unprecedented (see Campbell 1944–45, pp. 14–18; Descartes 2008/1641, p. 23)—the implicit assumption might be that in order to truly see something you must see all its parts or aspects, or the implicit comparison might be with cases of seeing a movie or a play, which one has not properly done unless one has seen it from beginning to end (if we miss a bit, we qualify our statement: ‘I saw most of it’). In sum, defenders believe that ‘the application of a PCA is only a begin-all and not a be-all and end-all of the satisfactory treatment’ of the skeptic’s challenge (Flew 1982, p. 117; 1966 pp. 264-265).

It is also recognized by some defenders that identifying the paradigm cases of something is a far cry from giving an account or theory of it. If something is a paradigm case of an X it is so because of certain features that it has and does not have, and philosophers often want to know what these features are, though they cannot simply be ‘read off’ some paradigm cases. Identifying paradigm cases can then be only a ‘jumping-off point for establishing the relevant rules and conventions’ (Black 1973, p. 271) governing the term, and a preliminary to developing an alternative account of the phenomenon to the one implicit in the skeptic’s argument.

4. Malcolm’s Version of the PCA

A close reading of the literature on the PCA reveals that there is not one but two different kinds of arguments that go by the name ‘paradigm case argument’, the first of which is especially evident in Malcolm’s 1942 paper and which is of more limited application. Distinguishing between these versions is important as not doing so can lead to confusion in the critical appraisal of these sorts of arguments.

The key feature of what we may call ‘Malcolm’s version’ is that it exploits the idea that there are certain expressions ‘the meanings of which must be shown and cannot be explained’ (Malcolm, 1992/1942, p. 120). Color terms are often mentioned to illustrate this; to make someone fully understand what ‘yellow’ means you must go beyond verbal explanations and produce a sample. Consider, for instance, a philosopher who claims that space and time do not exist. Malcolm first uses Moore’s method of ‘translating into the concrete’ (Moore 1918, p. 112), where an abstract statement is considered in terms of its specific implications. Thus he understands this as amounting to the denial that anything is ever to the left of anything else, that anything is ever above anything else, that anything ever happens earlier or later than anything else, and so on. It is the denial that such states of affairs ever exist. Furthermore, for a philosopher to actually make such a denial (as opposed to just parroting words), she must understand the meanings of the expressions contained therein. She must understand what it means to say that one thing is under another, that one event occurred after another, and so forth.

But how, Malcolm asks, could one ever have come to understand the meaning of such expressions as ‘after’, ‘to the left of’, ‘above’, and ‘under’? Only, he maintains, by our being shown or being acquainted with actual instances (or ‘paradigms’) of things being to the left of other things, of things being above other things, and so on (1992/1942, p. 120). Therefore, for Malcolm, spatial and temporal relations must exist for us to understand the meanings of such expressions and thus, ironically, the existence of space and time is a precondition for the possibility of denying their existence. Or at least the skeptic owes us an explanation of how he can understand spatial and temporal vocabulary on the assumption that spatial and temporal relations do not exist (Soames 2003, p. 166).

The skeptic could respond, however, by simply denying that he understands spatial and temporal vocabulary. That is, the skeptic’s claim might be that such vocabulary has no intelligible meaning, a claim which he perhaps misleadingly expressed by saying ‘Space and time don’t exist’ (as misleading as it would be to say ‘Square circles don’t exist’, as if to imply that there is an intelligible description there that nothing happens to satisfy). And Malcolm does suggest something of this sort in saying that the skeptic’s real point is that these ideas are subtly self-contradictory. However, Malcolm claims that no expression that has a descriptive use is self-contradictory, and he maintains that these expressions do have descriptive uses.

Taking their cue from Malcolm, some commentators have interpreted the PCA as applying only to expressions whose meanings are so fundamental or irreducible that they can be conveyed only ostensively (for example, Alexander 1958, p. 119). Certain defenders were then reproached for attempting paradigm case arguments with expressions apparently not of this type (Passmore 1961, p. 115; Watkins 1957a, p. 29). For instance, the most intense discussion of the PCA was in relation to the expression ‘free will’, which should probably not be regarded as this kind of expression. It was noted that the meanings of certain expressions can be formed and learned by our associating them with an abstract specification or definition. In other cases, our understanding can be derived from examples, but examples that are fictional, like when we learn what miracles are by reading about miraculous events in myths and stories (Watkins 1957a, p. 27). In both cases it remains an open question whether the expression denotes anything real. Given that ‘free will’ could be an expression of those types, no inference can be made from the fact that ‘free will’ has a meaning or is understood by us to the conclusion that there is free will.

However, a different version of the PCA exists that does not rely on the idea that the meaning of the relevant expression ‘must be shown and cannot be explained’. To see this, we will look in some detail at how the PCA works in relation to the controversial topic of free will skepticism.

5. Flew’s Version of the PCA

Next we will examine a particular application of the PCA, Anthony Flew’s use of it to rebut skepticism about actions done of one’s own free will, which we may call ‘free actions’ for short. By focusing on a particular application, and the one that has generated the most discussion, we can examine the argument’s logical features in some depth. The following quotations, then, are Flew’s presentation of it from his earlier papers on the topic. Though these were the most frequently quoted and discussed presentations of the PCA, we will see that they were problematic and that he reached a more mature understanding of it in his later work. These problems largely stem from clinging to Malcolm’s model of the PCA with a concept for which it is not appropriate.

Crudely: if there is any word the meaning of which can be taught by reference to paradigm cases, then no argument whatever could ever prove that there are no cases whatsoever of whatever it is. Thus, since the meaning of ‘of his own freewill’ can be taught by reference to such paradigm cases as that in which a man, under no social pressure, marries the girl he wants to marry (how else could it be taught?): it cannot be right, on any grounds whatsoever, to say that no one ever acts of his own freewill. For cases such as the paradigm, which must occur if the word is ever to be thus explained (and which certainly do in fact occur), are not in that case specimens which might have been wrongly identified: to the extent that the meaning of the expression is given in terms of them they are, by definition, what ‘acting of one’s own freewill’ is. (Flew 1955a, p. 35)

Here is another more concise statement of the argument:

As the meaning of expressions such as ‘of his own free will’ is and must ultimately be given by indicating cases of the sort to which it is pre-eminently and by ostensive definition applicable, and not in terms of some description (which might conceivably be found as a matter of fact not to apply to anything which ever occurs); it is out of the question that anyone ever could now discover that there are not and never have been any cases to which these expressions may correctly be applied. (Flew 1954, p. 54)

There are at least two errors with this. Firstly, Flew claims in places that the meaning of ‘free will’ must be given by referring to paradigm cases. But this is not right. As suggested above, it seems possible that its meaning could be given with a definition (‘A free action is an action that . . .’). It would then be an open question whether there is anything satisfying the definition. Flew came to think that this ‘must’ claim was unnecessarily strong, and that for his argument to work it is enough that the meaning of ‘free action’ can be given by referring to paradigm cases (1957, p. 37).

But secondly, even if the meaning of ‘free action’ can be given by referring to paradigm cases, that would not entail that there must be cases of free action (that is, Flew is wrong in saying that the paradigm cases ‘must occur if the word is ever to be thus explained’). For cases can be real or hypothetical, and it is not necessary that the paradigm cases occur for it to be possible to explain the meaning of a term by describing them (Chisholm 1951, pp. 327–328; Hallett 2008, p. 86). Indeed, even Flew himself, in the first passage, seems to describe a hypothetical case of a man who under no social pressure marries the woman he wants to marry to explain the meaning of ‘free will’ (at least he does not tell us that he is referring to some actual case he is familiar with). We all know that such cases occur of course, but it is a contingent fact that they do (our world might have been one where all marriages were arranged and obligatory) and that fact has no bearing on the pedagogical usefulness of the case.

Thus it would not be the mere fact that the meaning of ‘free action’ is or can be explained in terms of paradigm cases that guarantees that there are free actions. It would, rather, be the fact that the meaning of ‘free action’ can be explained in terms of certain paradigm cases, plus the fact that such paradigm cases actually occur which would guarantee that there are free actions. This two-step structure of the PCA is noted by Marconi when he says, ‘it is not enough, to refute skepticism about miracles, that the turning of water into wine would be ordinarily described as a miracle, for it is far from uncontroversial that such an event ever took place’ (2009, pp. 118–119).

Flew elucidates the structure of the argument along these lines, and achieves a more mature understanding of the PCA, in a later paper. There he says that the ‘logical form of this argument type consists in two steps: The first is an insistence upon (what is taken to be) a plain matter of fact [that is, that certain cases exist or happen] . . . The second step consists in the assertion that examples such as those presented just are paradigm cases of whatever it is which it is being so paradoxically denied’ (1982, p. 116; also see Donnellan 1967, p. 108). Thus Flew’s paradigm case argument for free actions consists of two premises.

P1: As ‘a plain matter of fact’, cases exist where a man marries the woman he loves and wants to marry without threats, pressure, or compulsion.

P2: Such cases are paradigm cases of free actions.

            Conclusion: Free actions exist.

Here we can see that one of the premises is an existential statement, with the other saying that the thing quantified over is a paradigm case of whatever the skeptic is denying. In other words, one premise says that there exist cases matching a particular description, while the other says that anything matching such a description is a paradigm case of an X (where ‘X’ refers to what the skeptic claimed not to exist). Together they yield the conclusion that there are Xs.

But that is not all, since the PCA is known to draw on linguistic considerations somehow. This is not evident in the above argument schema, so where do they enter into it? They enter into it, it seems, in justifying the second premise. Thus the defender will say that those cases are paradigms of free actions because the meaning of ‘free action’ is taught or explained with reference to such cases, or because we ordinarily say of such cases that the agent ‘acted of his own free will’.

The justificatory significance of ordinary linguistic usage is discussed below. But now that we have identified the basic structure of Flew’s argument, let us first look at the various avenues of criticism available to the skeptic.

6. Critical Responses to Flew’s PCA

a. Challenging the First Premise

Critics of Flew’s PCA have tended to grant premise 1 as just being an uncontroversial empirical truth. Yet perhaps premise 1 could be resisted if we insist on understanding ‘compulsion’ or ‘being forced/constrained’ in a particular way, such that any kind of deterministic cause ‘compels’ its effect or ‘forces’ the effect to happen, so that nobody could act without compulsion in a deterministic universe (see Beebee 2013, p. 110; Hardie 1957, p. 21). Here the analytic effort would move to the ideas of compulsion or of being forced, which would need to be clarified. So although the premise here is supposed to be a statement of plain empirical fact, it could be challenged through the development of a conceptual point.

b. Challenging the Second Premise

But the main focus of attention has been on premise 2. Are such marriages indeed paradigm cases of acting freely? Or if we tend to judge that they are, is this only because of certain assumptions we are making about those cases that were unmentioned in Flew’s description, assumptions that might be open to challenge?

Some critics have argued that advocates of the PCA err by assuming a sharp distinction between teaching the meaning of a word by presenting cases and by giving criteria. For mixtures of these can also occur when we explain the meaning of a word with reference to cases, but cases that are interpreted as satisfying certain criteria (Ayer 1963, pp. 17–18; Gellner 1959, p. 34; Passmore 1961, pp. 115–116). Consider, for instance, a superstitious society where people believe in miracles. There, when explaining what a miracle is, people might refer to cases such as when the leader suddenly and inexplicably recovered from a grave illness, and others involving a sharp turnaround in fortune, but it is being assumed that these turnarounds satisfy the description of being caused by the intervention of a spiritual being. Notice that here the meaning of ‘miracle’ is being explained with reference to real cases, but this does not prove that there are miracles. For the cases are being interpreted in a certain way and the interpretation could be wrong. Could it be the same with the marriage cases? Do we think they are cases of acting freely only because of some contentious background features that we assume to apply to them?

This thinking is evident in David Papineau’s criticism of the PCA when he says, ‘Maybe ordinary people are happy to apply the term “free will” to such actions as drinking a cup of coffee or buying a new car. But this is only because they are implicitly assuming that these actions are not determined by past causes. But in fact they are wrong in this assumption. All human actions are determined by past causes’ (1998, p. 133). Similarly, John Passmore grants that it is natural for us to describe grooms as acting freely in the circumstances described by Flew, but he adds that ‘we have also learned criteria: we have been told that a person acts of his own free will only when his action proceeds from an act of will . . . [with] the metaphysical peculiarity of being uncaused’ (1961, p. 118; also see Ayer 1963, p. 18; Lucas 1970, p. 12). Passmore’s implication is that in saying that the groom acted freely, we are implicitly assuming that he satisfied this criterion.

Note that these philosophers are making claims about what ordinary speakers mean when they talk of free actions, and thus about the ordinary or ‘folk’ concept of free action, saying that it involves the idea of an uncaused or undetermined act. They are, in that respect, engaging in ‘ordinary language philosophy’ with Flew, and disputing his (more implied than stated) characterization of the ordinary concept. However, it is not enough for them to simply claim that this is a feature of the ordinary concept of a free action. There is an onus on them to support that claim with methods or evidence appropriate for this task.

But what support could they provide? An old-school ordinary language philosopher like Flew would appeal to ordinary linguistic usage to support the idea that free action is, roughly, doing what you want to do without pressure or duress, pointing out that this explains the fact that we say of a groom who marries the woman he loves and wants to marry that he marries of his own free will, but not of the groom in an arranged marriage or shotgun marriage. As an old-schooler, moreover, he would be confident that he knows well what the ordinary use of ‘free will’ is just by being fluent in English. Others who think that philosophy should be more ‘scientific’ in its methods would think it necessary to gather some empirical data on ordinary speakers’ judgments through surveys. (Interestingly, one such study yielded ideas similar to Flew’s; see Monroe and Malle 2010.) However, Papineau’s and Passmore’s criterion—that a free action is one not determined by past causes—does not seem to explain this usage at all. For we might not doubt that in both happy marriages and ones involving coercion the groom’s saying ‘I do’ can be causally explained—crudely, by love in the former and fear in the latter—and that neither sort of explanation is any less deterministic than the other. We would not speak of these cases differently if this was our criterion of free action, and it is not clear what practical usefulness the expression would have on that understanding.

Another kind of support for claims about what speakers mean or are implicitly assuming is the speakers’ own admissions or acknowledgments. When someone describes an event as a miracle, for instance, we can elicit his acknowledgment that in doing so he was thinking that a deity intervened. But will we be able to elicit from an ordinary speaker the acknowledgment that when he said that Debora married of her own free will, he meant that her marrying was not determined by past causes? Can we regard something as part of what a person meant in saying something if he does not acknowledge it as part of what he meant? Papineau and Passmore would need to allay the suspicion that their characterization of the ordinary meaning of ‘free action’ is an imposition from philosophical theory. It is not clear, for instance, where exactly we have ‘been told’ the criteria for free action that Passmore says we have been told, besides in the philosophy classroom.

Of course, these critics’ assumption that a free act is uncaused or undetermined must have come from somewhere, and Flew and Malcolm insisted that a thorough investigation of the ‘intellectual sources’ of the skeptic’s claim must be carried out, to identify the comparisons, pictures, analogies, and so forth that lure us towards it. Any PCA will seem shallow without this concomitant.

To sum up, these ways of challenging the paradigm case argument involve contesting the defender’s claim about what the relevant expression ordinarily means. But this requires that the skeptic play and beat the ordinary language philosophers (in the wide sense of those who work on elucidating the meanings of ordinary expressions, which could include certain experimental philosophers) at their own game. Skeptics who dispute a defender’s claim about what ordinary speakers identify as the paradigm cases of something, or about what exactly ordinary speakers are assuming in making such identifications, must supply evidence appropriate for determining the character of ordinary concepts, a burden which, of course, also applies to the defenders.

Another philosopher who questioned whether Flew’s description identifies a paradigm case of free action is MacIntyre (1957). Suppose we are told that the groom’s falling in love with the bride was due to a hypnotic suggestion (assuming such things are authentic). MacIntyre maintains that in that case, he would not have married of his own free will (though it could be autonomy that is lacking here, rather than free will; on this distinction, see Christman 2015, section 1.1; Piper 2010, section 2c). The defender would reply that though such an etiology was not explicitly ruled out by Flew’s description of the case, we were supposed to imagine that this was an ordinary case and thus that no such extraordinary things happened. But to this MacIntyre says that there ‘is no relevant difference in the logical status between explanations in terms of endocrine glands [or whatever the explanation is in ordinary cases] and those which refer us to hypnotic suggestion’ (1957, p. 31).

This kind of move—claiming that there is no important difference between putative paradigm cases of free action and of unfree action—is a familiar one from free will skeptics, and it is independent of the particulars of the paradigm case argument. It also leads to stalemate, since given that sameness and difference are symmetrical relations we can argue the other way around just as cogently: we can take our intuitions about the free action case for granted and say that because the unfree action case is no different in its essentials, it is, despite initial appearances, a case of free action (see Beebee 2013, p. 85).

c. The Charge of Irrelevance

Other critics have taken a different, more concessionary approach to dealing with the PCA over the free will issue. Rather than contesting Flew’s characterization of the ordinary meaning of ‘free will’, they agree with it, but maintain that this is just not the concept of free will that is relevant to the philosophical debates. For instance, Danto agrees with Flew that ‘when, in ordinary contexts, we say that Smith married of his own free-will, we mean only that there was no shotgun being pointed at him by an angry father (or something like this). We do not deny that marriages are predictable, or even that this marriage was’ (1959, p. 124). We just mean that he was not made to do it against his will, pressured or strong-armed into doing something he did not want to do (Ibid., p. 123). However, ‘ordinary language so construed is simply irrelevant to the celebrated problem of the freedom of the will’ (p. 121), which is a ‘metaphysical problem’ that can be solved only with a ‘metaphysical solution’ (p. 124). Similarly, some philosophers have been explicit in saying that the free will that philosophers are curious about is not the free will that we speak of in daily life (Hardie 1957, p. 30; van Inwagen 2008, p. 329, note 1). Relatedly, others try to distinguish freedom of action from freedom of will and shift the debate towards the latter idea (see McKenna and Pereboom 2016, p. 10). The former idea roughly corresponds to what Flew was talking about, while the latter is supposedly something quite different and concerns choice or decision rather than action, and is less in common currency.

Though the sharp disparity between the views of the defender and the skeptic would be well explained by this idea that they are ‘talking past each other’, operating with different notions, there is a problem with it. There is an unwritten rule (or a ‘conversational maxim’, to use a Gricean expression) that we must tell our readers that we are using some expression in an unusual sense if we are doing so. This is to prevent misunderstanding and confusion, since we naturally interpret a person’s words to have their ordinary signification unless told to do otherwise. However, most philosophers, not to mention psychologists and neuroscientists, do not say that they are using ‘free will’ or ‘free action’ in some special or unusual sense in their written works on this topic. Thus, if they are doing this, then many of them are being irresponsible by not being upfront about it. This omission would be excusable if it were common knowledge that ‘free will’ is being used in some non-standard sense in the literature, but this is hardly true, especially considering that some philosophers have said the exact opposite: that in the free will debate we are investigating whether free will exists as ordinarily conceived (see, for example, Jackson 1998, p. 31).

In light of these conflicting indications, it is simply not clear whether in the debates about the existence of free action it is free action in the ordinary sense that is being discussed. One way to find clarity on this, however, might be through reflection on the related phenomenon of moral responsibility. Most philosophers have not been interested in free will just for its own sake but because of its importance for moral responsibility, believing that whether we can be held morally accountable for our actions, and can be deserving of praise and blame, turns on whether we can act freely. Thus, to the question ‘What sense of free will are you talking about?’, some might reply, ‘The one that matters for moral responsibility’. However, this might not be of great help because even if there is some ‘metaphysical’ notion of free will that is critical for moral responsibility, the ordinary notion of free will is also important for it. For ordinarily if we are told that someone did something terrible, but are then told that he did not do it of his own free will, we will (if we believe this) infer that he is less responsible for having done it.

7. "Ordinary Language is Correct Language"

Let us look again at premise 2 of Flew’s PCA. This stated that cases matching a certain description are paradigm cases of free action. But how does a defender support such a claim? By referring to linguistic considerations. By saying that these are the kinds of cases that we ordinarily or standardly call ‘free actions’, or that these are the kinds of cases that we would refer to when teaching or explaining the meaning of ‘free action’. Furthermore, we can take the former to be the most fundamental consideration because the meaning of a term can be taught or explained correctly or incorrectly, depending on whether the instruction reflects the ordinary use, and besides, much of our native language is not learned from explicit instruction.

But can we safely infer from the fact that a certain sort of case or thing is ordinarily called ‘X’ that it is in fact an X? It seems easy to find reasons to dismiss this principle. After all, didn’t people in superstitious societies ordinarily refer to certain events as miracles, or to the Sun as a deity, while being incorrect in saying those things?

The idea that if something is ordinarily called ‘an X’ then it is an X was expressed by Malcolm in his statement that ‘ordinary language is correct language’ (Malcolm 1992/1942, p. 118, p. 120), which came to be regarded as a central slogan of ordinary language philosophy. As a slogan, however, this needs deciphering. Malcolm explained what he meant in saying this by distinguishing between two kinds of mistakes that can be made when making a statement, being mistaken about the facts, and using incorrect language (1992/1942, p. 117). The distinction can be illustrated with a case adapted from Malcolm. Suppose that Jones and Smith see an animal in some bushes at a distance, and Jones claims it is a wolf while Smith claims it is a fox. After it emerges from the bushes, Jones clearly sees that it has the characteristics of a fox and that he was mistaken. This was a factual mistake. But imagine another case where they both see the animal clearly and are in full agreement on what its characteristics are, though Jones claims it is a wolf while Smith claims it is a fox. Though the form of their disagreement is the same as before, we now have a linguistic rather than a factual disagreement: they disagree about what a thing of this sort is called. At least one of them is mistaken about the meaning of these words. (Though Malcolm contrasts ‘factual’ with ‘linguistic’ disagreement here, he would not deny that a linguistic mistake is based on a factual error (see Malcolm 1940). That a word has the particular meaning that it has is, of course, a kind of fact. This contrast might therefore be better described as one between linguistic and non-linguistic facts, and one might want to press Malcolm to clarify it further.)

But then Malcolm asks us to imagine the second disagreement again, though with Jones acknowledging that an animal of this sort is ordinarily called ‘a fox’ while maintaining that it is nevertheless incorrect to call it that and correct to call it ‘a wolf’. According to Malcolm, this would be absurd. It is absurd, he says, because ordinary language is correct language. To refute Jones’ claim here it suffices to say, ‘But that’s not what people call it.’

In his discussion of the paradigm case argument, Diego Marconi criticizes this view. He agrees that if some things are correctly called ‘Xs’ then they are Xs (2009, p. 116). But he disagrees that if some things are ordinarily called ‘Xs’ then they are correctly called ‘Xs’. For people might only be calling them ‘Xs’ because they appear to be Xs when in fact they are not Xs (p. 119). This seems right as far as it goes. However, if people are always calling some things ‘Xs’ because they appear to be Xs while not being Xs, then they are like Jones who called a fox ‘a wolf’ because it appeared to be a wolf to him: they are factually mistaken. Malcolm’s idea was that if some things are ordinarily called ‘Xs’ and if no factual mistakes are being made about them, then they are Xs. That is, Malcolm’s slogan represented an attempt to characterize a notion of linguistic correctness, saying that, assuming no factual mistakes are being made about it, the correct thing to call something is what everyone calls it (but for a hard case, see Watkins 1957a, p. 28). The factual/linguistic error distinction is indispensable for understanding the slogan.

8. Ordinary Usage as Practices

It is possible to gain a deeper understanding of why the defender puts so much weight on ordinary usage. But first let us return to an earlier point. We saw earlier that according to the defender, the PCA allows us to reject the skeptical position that there are no Xs without having to examine the skeptical argument. What is the source of this supposed imperviousness to skeptical argument? Can such an apparently dogmatic attitude be tolerated in philosophy? Consider again the skeptic who argued that there are no cases of seeing people. The defender responded by making the simple point that we ordinarily say that we see people in cases where we look at them clothed, cases that were deemed not to be cases of seeing people by the skeptical argument. But why exactly does the fact that we ordinarily say that make it correct to say that? And why should that ordinary usage be unassailable?

The reason is that the defender thinks she is describing what could be called a linguistic practice, custom, convention, or rule. She is trying to point out that it is our practice or custom, or a rule of our language, to call cases of this sort cases of seeing people. Now such things as practices, customs, or rules are open to criticism in various ways. For instance, a rule of a game can be criticized for making the game too long, too complicated, too inconvenient, too dangerous, or less exciting, and rules are sometimes changed to improve games along these lines. But it cannot be criticized for being incorrect, since practices, customs, or rules cannot be correct or incorrect.

Consider the rule in chess that the bishops can move only diagonally, for instance. What sense can there be in saying that this rule is correct? It is, indeed, one of the rules of chess. It is correct to say that this is a rule of chess. The statement that this is a rule of chess is correct. A move may be correct by being in conformity with it. But the rule itself is not correct; it is simply followed, and its being followed makes it one of the rules of chess (though something can also be a rule in virtue of being decreed by a relevant authority, even if people ignore it). Admittedly, we might sometimes speak loosely of a ‘correct rule’. But ‘correct’ here is redundant; ‘These are the correct rules of chess’ is just an emphatic way of saying, ‘These are the rules of chess’. For we have no understanding of what an incorrect rule of chess would be. Would moving the bishop vertically and horizontally be an example? No, since we can reprimand someone doing that by saying, ‘That’s not the rule for the bishop’. (It would confuse him to say ‘That is indeed a rule for the bishop, but an incorrect one’.)

So when a defender says, ‘We (ordinarily) call cases of this sort cases of seeing a person’, she is trying to say, ‘It is our practice/custom/rule to call cases of this sort cases of seeing a person’, and as such it is not the kind of thing that could be refuted by an argument. It is not something that could be proven by any argument either, just as a rule of chess can be neither proven nor refuted (though statements as to what are the rules of chess can be proven or refuted). Wittgenstein called this ‘bedrock’, where ‘I am inclined to say: “This is simply what I [or better, what we] do”’ (2009/1953, §217; also see §654). As practices or rules of our ‘language-game’ they are self-standing; they are things that philosophers ‘cannot justify’ in an evidential sense and must ‘leave as they are’.

But if a linguistic practice cannot be correct or incorrect, how does this help the defender? For didn’t the defender want to claim that it is correct to say that such-and-such a case is a case of seeing a person? Indeed, but note what she is claiming here: that it is correct to say that such-and-such a case is a case of seeing a person. The statement is what is correct here, not the practice, and it is correct by being in conformity with the practice. The point here is that though practices cannot be correct or incorrect, they are determiners of correctness. Thus a move in chess can be correct by being in conformity with the rules of chess, or a man’s manner of addressing the Queen can be correct by being in conformity with the accepted customs for addressing the Queen. Similarly, certain kinds of statements can be correct (not just grammatically correct, but true) by being in conformity with the rules of English. Thus the statement that some case, C, is a case of an X can be a correct and true statement by being in conformity with the practice of calling Cs ‘X’. (To take a simple example, ‘This color is orange’ can be true and correct by being in line with our practice of calling that color ‘orange’.) And this can be a practice just because it is followed, because the relevant people ordinarily do it.

Thus the paradigm case argument works in part by reminding us of what our linguistic practices are, practices that determine what it is to play the ‘game’ of speaking the relevant language, practices that the skeptic too, in unguarded moments or as a layperson, can be seen to participate in. This, however, is not to say that we should never break the linguistic rules that we currently follow. No prohibition is being urged here on creativity or novelty in the use of language; we are not being urged to never stray from the bounds of conventional and correct speech. The defender only wishes to maintain, against the skeptic, that calling certain things cases of seeing people, calling certain other ones cases of acting freely, and so forth, is not incorrect speech, insofar as it is in conformity with our linguistic customs to do so. Nor is it to deny that those linguistic practices can be criticized as problematic for reasons unrelated to correctness or truth, such as for pragmatic, moral, or political reasons.

9. Conclusion

So, does the paradigm case argument work? There does not seem to be anything intrinsically fallacious about it at least, but this general sort of question is not a good one to ask. First, we have seen that it is problematic to speak of the paradigm case argument, since two versions of it can be distinguished. But more importantly, it may be a bad question to ask because every topic to which it is applied may have its own peculiarities, such that a PCA may work in one application but not in another. For instance, we have seen that with free will skepticism there is a possibility that ‘free will’ is being used in a technical or unusual sense, which would make a PCA type of argument inapplicable to that topic, though nothing similar might be going on with some other topics. Applications of the PCA thus should be judged on a case-by-case basis.

Assessing the influence of the PCA on the analytic philosophical tradition is less easy than it would seem. By one measure, that of observing philosophers explicitly using or referring to the argument and accepting its conclusions, we would have to say that its influence has not been great. However, it is unclear just how much weight we should put on that measure since, as Gilbert Harman said, a ‘philosopher’s acceptance of the paradigm case argument need not be revealed in any explicit statement of the argument, since this acceptance may show itself in the philosopher’s attitude towards skepticism’ (1990, p. 7; also see Gellner 1959, p. 32).

For instance, this acceptance might be manifested in a philosopher’s tendency to treat things commonly or ‘intuitively’ identified as paradigms cases of an X as a datum for the purpose of developing a theory of X (by, for instance, trying to extract necessary or sufficient conditions from the cases), despite the existence of skeptical traditions that deny the existence of Xs. It is not uncommon to see philosophers proceeding in this way (sometimes called ‘the method of cases’) in positive theory development. If pushed to justify this procedure, the philosopher could (but might not) resort to something like the PCA. Skeptics might insist that this philosopher has no right to assume that those ‘paradigm cases’ are genuine paradigms without refuting their skeptical arguments. But defenders can attempt to turn the tables on the skeptics by requesting that they answer these questions. Any skeptical argument against the existence of any X must be based on some conception or analysis, implicit though it may be, of what X is. But how can we know that we have the right conception or analysis of X? Is there a better alternative to using the method of cases? And if not, might depending on the method of cases commit us to non-skepticism about X?

10. References and Further Reading

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  • Watkins, J. W. N. (1957a). Farewell to the paradigm-case argument. Analysis, 18(2), pp. 25–33.
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Author Information

Kevin Lynch
Email: kevinlynch405@eircom.net
Huaqiao University
China