Plotinus: Virtue Ethics

This article focuses on the virtue ethics of Plotinus (204—270 C.E.) and its implications for later accounts of virtue ethics, particularly in Porphyry and Iamblichus. Plotinus' ethical theory is discussed in relation to the aim of the virtuous person to become godlike, the role of disposition in the soul's intellectualization, the four cardinal virtues, well-being, human freedom, and self-determination. Plotinus' virtue ethics is also presented in regards to his theory of transmigration and his criticism of the Gnostics.

Plotinus was a neo-Platonist, and Plato's ethical teaching underlines Plotinus' conception of virtue as an intrinsic quality of human character and also underlies Plotinus' conception of excellence that derives from the soul's purity in the contemplation of the Forms. Aristotle's ethical theory influences Plotinus, particularly Aristotle's recognition of the gods as purely intelligible beings, which are not possessing virtues. Even more importantly, Aristotle's distinction between intellectual and ethical virtues was a great influence upon Plotinus.

Plotinus' virtue ethics has been used by later Neoplatonists such as Porphyry, Iamblichus, Macrobius, and Olympiodorus. Plotinus' treatment of virtues is also found in the ethical theories of Arabic Neoplatonists and in Neoplatonic commentaries on the Aristotelian ethics. Plotinus' analysis of the four Platonic cardinal virtues has been systematically treated by Porphyry.

Table of Contents

  1. Philosophical Background and Reception
  2. Becoming like God
  3. Disposition and Intellectual Qualities
  4. The Cardinal Virtues
    1. Courage
    2. Self-control
    3. Justice
    4. Wisdom
  5. Well-being
  6. Human Freedom and Self-Determination
  7. Soul and Transmigration
  8. Criticism of the Gnostics
  9. Virtue Ethics after Plotinus
    1. Porphyry
    2. Iamblichus
  10. References and Further Reading
    1. Texts and Translations
    2. Commentaries
    3. Introductory Sources
    4. Ethical Theory
    5. Human Freedom and Selfhood
    6. Post-Plotinian Virtue Ethics

1. Philosophical Background and Reception

Plato's and Aristotle's virtue ethics are found in the background of Plotinus' ethical theory. Plato's ethical teaching—particularly in the Symposium, the Phaedo, the Pheadrus, and the Republic—underlines Plotinus' conception of virtue as an intrinsic quality of human character and his conception of excellence that derives from the soul's purity in the contemplation of the Forms. Aristotle's ethical theory (Nicomachean Ethics) influences Plotinus, particularly Aristotle's recognition of the gods as purely intelligible beings, which are not possessing virtues (NE 1178), but even more importantly Aristotle's distinction between intellectual and ethical virtues (NE 1139).

Plotinus' virtue ethics, mainly exposed in Ennead I 2, has been used by later Neoplatonists such as Porphyry, Iamblichus, Macrobius, and Olympiodorus (O' Meara 2003). Plotinus' treatment of virtues is also found in the ethical theories of Arabic Neoplatonists and in Neoplatonic commentaries on the Aristotelian ethics (Smith 2004). Plotinus' analysis of the four Platonic cardinal virtues in Ennead I 2 has been systematically treated by Porphyry in his Sententiae ad intelligibilia ducentes (section 32).

Porphyry discussed a fourfold scale of virtues in correspondence to the area where the virtues apply: (1) political virtues correspond to the practical and civic sphere, (2) purificatory virtues correspond to soul's initial purification and ascent from the body, (3) theoretical virtues correspond to soul's contemplation of the Forms, and (4) the paradigmatic, or exemplary virtues, correspond directly to the Forms and the divine Nous.

Porphyry, in his biographical work of Plotinus, On the Life of Plotinus and the Order of his Books, classifies the nine treatises of the first Ennead as his master's work that is "mainly concerned with morals" (Life 24.17-18). Plotinus' ethical theory is mainly discussed in Enneads I 2 [19] On Virtues, I 4 [46] On Well-Being, and Ennead I 3 [20] On Dialectic. Whereas Ennead I 2 offers an analysis of Plato's four cardinal virtues:  (1) courage (andreia), (2) self-control (sophrosyne), (3) justice (dikaiosyne) and (4) wisdom (phronesis / sophia), Ennead I 4 focuses on the excellence of the wise man (spoudaios) and the nature of well-being (eudaimonia; see also Ennead I 5 [36] On Whether Well-Being Increases with Time). Furthermore, Ennead I 3 follows chronologically Ennead I 2 and actually supplements Plotinus' ethical analysis on virtues with special reference to the advantages of the Platonic dialectic in contrast to the Stoic and the Aristotelian logic. Plotinus highlights the significance of Plato's dialectic in respect to soul's intellectual purification and its aim for noetic ascent.

In addition, Plotinus' discussions on the nature of evil in Ennead I 8; on the metaphysics of beauty in Ennead I 6; on the philosophical comparison between the nature of human being and that of other living beings in Ennead I 1; and the very short treatise Ennead I 7 on the Platonic Good qua the primal good of all aspiration in life, include significant elements of his ethical theory. Finally, important implications of Plotinus' virtue ethics are highlighted in his theory of transmigration (see particularly Enneads I 1.11; III 2.15), his criticism of Gnosticism in Ennead II 9 [33] Against the Gnostics, as well as his conception of human freedom and self-determination, particularly maintained in Ennead VI 8 [39] On Free Will and the Will of the One. Plotinus' virtue ethics is further developed and systematized by later Neoplatonists such as Poprhyry (Sententiae ad intelligibilia ducentes 32) and Iamblichus (On Virtues).

Porphyry's pupil Iamblichus, in his work On Virtues (the work is not preserved today), developed further the scale of virtues of Sententiae 32 (Finamore 2012; O' Meara 2003). Iamblichus maintained a sevenfold scale of virtues. By tracing back to the Middle Platonists (Baltzly 2004), he added two more groups of virtues below the political and one group of virtues at the highest level above the paradigmatic virtues. Iamblichus’ classification developed from low to high with the following virtues: (1) natural, (2) ethical, (3) civic, (4) purifying, (5) contemplative, (6) paradigmatic, and (7) hieratic. Iamblichus’ scale of virtues testifies to the importance of theurgy for later Neoplatonists and influences St. Augustine’s early thought (Kalligas 2014).

2. Becoming like God

Plotinus' treatise Ennead I 2 On Virtues opens with a question on the soul's escape from evils in the earthly world: "Since it is here that evils are, and they must necessarily haunt this region, and the soul wants to escape from evils, we must escape from here. What, then, is this escape?" (I 2.1.1-3) For Plotinus, the answer should be found in Plato's Theaetetus 176a-b, "to become as like God as possible", and soul's likeness to God should be related to the virtue of wisdom qua the highest ruling principle of the universe and the world soul (I 2.1.3-10). The passage from Plato's Theaetetus marks Plotinus' exposition of virtues in Ennead I 2 (2.1-10; 3.1 ff.; 5.1-2; 6.1-11; 7.27-30; see also Ennead I 8.6-7 on the necessity of evils) and Armstrong, in his introductory note on the treatise, emphatically regards Ennead I 2 as a commentary on the passage from the Theaetetus. In addition to Plato's reference, Aristotelian and Stoic elements have been identified in Plotinus' theory of virtue as well as some Neo-Pythagorean influences. Plotinus' approach to "becoming like god" is discussed by later Neoplatonists such as Porphyry, Iamblichus, and Proclus (Baltzly 2004).

A careful reading of the first lines of Ennead I 2 shows a divergence from Plato's assertion in the Theaetetus 176a-b that likeness to god is achievable up to a certain point. This difference seems to be not without purpose for the Neoplatonist and explains Plotinus' interpretation of likeness to god in the same way as the Middle-Platonist Eudorus of Alexandria interpreted godlikeness “in virtue of that element in us which is capable of this”, and signifies the purpose of human life in Pythagoras, Socrates, and Plato (Dillon 1983). However, despite the omission of Plato's qualification, Plotinus appropriately conceives the meaning of the Theaetetus passage as it is related to soul’s purification and the divine excellence of the virtuous life (Kalligas 1984; see particularly I 2.6.9-10, 7.24 and II 9.9.50-1). Plotinus’ metaphysics of power justifies the possibility of the virtuous soul to ascent to the higher intelligible realm without inherent limitations or qualifications. Plotinus actually diminishes Plato's qualification of the Theaetetus since the soul's noetic and complete likeness to the god is possible. Plotinus puts an emphasis on the intelligible purity of the soul and the power of virtue to lead the human mind to noetic ascent and the higher intelligible principles; our virtues are intelligible powers in the soul and derive from the divine Intellect, so the soul is able to return to the intelligible realm of the Forms and become like the divine Nous. The goal of the virtuous and wise person is to become godlike (II 9.15.40). The wise person is likened through virtue to the self-sufficient, perfect, and pure life of the intelligible world.

3. Disposition and Intellectual Qualities

Aristotle in his Nicomachean Ethics (1106b36-1107a1) defines virtue as a "disposition" (hexis) of the soul that is concerned with deliberate choice. The disposition of the soul underlies moral action in terms of moderation (mesotes), that is, the appropriate mean between the two extremes of deficiency and excess (1107a2-6). Aristotle emphasized the habitual aspect of disposition both in terms of ethical exercise (praxis) and the desired excellence of the moral agent.

Plotinus, in the fifth chapter of Ennead VI 8 On Free Will and the Will of the One, defines virtue as a hexis of the soul, but not in habitual terms. The Neoplatonist stresses the intellectual qualities of virtue not in terms of ethical practice but mainly in terms of contemplation. Virtue is a hexis not in the dispositional sense of ethical praxis but as an active state of the soul, a contemplative disposition that "intellectualises the soul" beyond ethical practice: "being in our power does not belong to the realm of action but in intellect at rest from activity" (VI 8.5.35-36). Plotinus underlines a self-directed perspective of the moral soul's power of virtue. Virtue intellectualizes the soul in its internal contemplation of Nous and not in external considerations. The Plotinian hexis is not found in the moderation of praxis but in the soul's conscious apprehension of being, and particularly in the middle region of the soul, in between the higher intelligible and the lower perceptible regions of the psyche. The Plotinian virtue is an active hexis that consciously directs the soul in the contemplation of the intelligible world of the Forms.

4. The Cardinal Virtues

In Ennead II 9, Plotinus acknowledges the inherent value of virtue: “if we talk about God without true virtue, God is only a name” (15.40). For Plotinus, every virtue is purification, and the purified soul becomes both form and forming principle. The virtuous soul noetically ascends without body to the divine realm of Nous, the world of true goodness, intelligence, and beauty (I 6.6). In Ennead I 6 On Beauty, Plotinus particularly refers to the four cardinal virtues found in Plato's teaching­—wisdom, justice, self-control, and courage: "For, as was said in old times, self-control, and courage and every virtue, is a purification, and so is even wisdom itself.… For what can true self-control be except not keeping company with bodily pleasures, but avoiding them as impure and belonging to something impure? Courage, too, is not being afraid of death. And death is the separation of body and soul; and a man does not fear this if he welcomes the prospect of being alone. Again, greatness of soul is despising the things here: and wisdom is an intellectual activity which turns away from the things below and leads the soul to those above" (I 6.6.1-13).

In Ennead I 2, Plotinus focuses on the four cardinal virtues, emphasizing their intellectual and contemplative nature. However, as Smith claims, Plotinus' aim is not to suggest a fixed scale of virtues but an ascending schema of levels of the cardinal virtues in relation to the different levels and aspects of humanity's ethical and intellectual life (Smith 2004). Plotinus approaches the cardinal virtues from the following aspects: (P1) civic life (I 2.1.17-21), (P2) the purification of the soul in relation to the body (3.15-9), (P3) soul's contemplation of the higher intelligible world (6.12-27), and (P4) the intelligible purity and goodness of the Forms (7.3-6). Despite the fact that Plotinus' treatment of the four cardinal virtues in Ennead I 2 is not necessarily systematic, the following accounts are identified in relation to the four levels above.

a. Courage

In civic life courage deals with soul's emotions (P1); in the process of purification courage is characterized by soul's fearlessness to depart from the body (P2); in a contemplative state, courage is the virtue that frees the soul from lower affections in likeness of soul's higher intelligible part (P3); and the highest intelligible level of Nous courage is identified with "immateriality and abiding pure by itself" (P4).

b. Self-control

The agreement and harmony of the soul's passion and reason underlies self-control as civic virtue (P1). Whereas at a purificatory level self-control means that the soul is not sharing bodily experience (P2), at the level of contemplation it means the soul's inward turning to Intellect (P3), and at the highest intelligible level of the Forms, self-control is identified with self-concentration (P4).

c. Justice

In civic life, justice is defined in Plato's terms as the virtue that facilitates the agreement between the different parts of the soul in “minding their own business where ruling and being ruled are concerned" (P1), while in purificatory terms, justice is purely ruled by reason and intellect "without opposition" (P2). However, at a contemplative level, justice is not found in the plurality of the soul's parts but in the disposition of the unity to itself and so "the higher justice in the soul is its activity towards Intellect (P3). At this pure intelligible level, justice entails the soul's proper and paradigmatic activity in minding its own business beyond any plurality (P4).

d. Wisdom

As a civic virtue, phronesis, practical wisdom, is related to the discursive reason of the soul (P1), while as a purificatory virtue, it refers to the soul "acting alone" outside the experience of the body and mere opinion (P2). In a contemplative person, practical wisdom and theoretical wisdom (sophia) involve the contemplation of the intelligibles, that is, what the divine Intellect contains and possesses in immediate contact. Plotinus discriminates between the wisdom of Intellect and that of the soul; wisdom, as with all virtues, is not a virtue in Nous but manifests only in the soul. Wisdom in Intellect is its pure actuality (=intelligence) and what it really is (=being), in the soul, wisdom derives from Nous but is directed to other things (P3), and so the paradigm of wisdom is related to pure intelligence and knowledge manifested in soul's direct sight towards the hypostasis of Intellect (P4).

In Ennead I 3, Plotinus further distinguishes between higher virtues and lower virtues. Plotinus maintains that the higher virtues are interrelated and correspond to intelligible Forms, which are not virtues themselves, but contribute to the noetic ascent as well as the practical and theoretical excellence of the soul. Moral philosophy is not only about intellectual virtues but also deals with the production of the appropriate dispositions and exercises (I 3.6). However, the higher virtues contribute to the purification of the soul and "moral philosophy derives from dialectic in its contemplative side." Dialectic is the purest part of intelligence and wisdom that guides the soul to knowledge and apprehension in correct order and reason. As Plotinus maintains in Ennead I 2, if all virtues are purifications, the process of purification produces and perfects all virtues, and so the one who possesses the greater intellectual virtues must necessarily have the lesser civic virtues. However, this is not admitted to the one who possesses the lesser virtues. The intellectual virtues complete the lower virtues and not vice versa (I 3.6.5-7). For Plotinus, well-being (eudaimonia) is achieved only with the excellence of the higher virtues that lead to the intelligible world.

5. Well-being

In Ennead I 4 On Well-Being, Plotinus criticizes Aristotle's primal relation of well-being (eudaimonia) with practical accomplishment, proper functions, and the achievement of natural ends (chapter 1).  Plotinus is also skeptical with the Stoics and the Epicureans (chapter 2); eudaimonia should not be related either to the Stoic ‘extirpation of passion’ (apatheia) and the "study of primary natural needs which perfects reason", nor to the ataraxic pleasure of an unworried state of mind (ataraxia) supported by the Epicureans.  As a devoted Platonist, Plotinus returns for an answer on the question of eudaimonia to the original teaching of Plato. Plotinus follows Plato's metaphysical perspective on eudaimonia in relation to the contemplation of the Forms. For Plotinus, well-being (eudaimonia) is not achieved primarily in ethical practice (praxis), as Aristotle suggested, but mainly through the noetic ascent of the soul and in contemplation (theoria) of true being in the intelligible realm of Nous. The wise person (spoudaios) has to become godlike (see Ennead I 2.1) to be eudaimon, that is, to live the perfect life of Intellect, the life of the higher soul purely contemplating the eternal reality of Nous. The real virtue of the wise is to be aware of the perfection, self-sufficiency, and completeness of Intellect, the intelligible reality where the soul is truly purified beyond discursive reason and consciousness (I 4.3.34-41).

The excellence of virtue is achieved not by having intellect but by being intellect; the perfectly virtuous soul of the wise is self-sufficient, ascends purified to the intelligible world and so likens itself to Intellect’s divine and eternal eudaimonia (I 4.4). However, Plotinus clarifies that the meaning of likeness (homoiosis) in the wise and good person is not the likeness of two pictures in perceptible terms but the intelligible likeness of the soul to the divine model of Nous different from our perceptible self  (I 2.7.28-31). Hence, the soul of the wise man, purely concentrated on the divine realm, is not affected either by the sufferings or the misfortunes of the animated body (I 4.5-8), nor in any way influenced by the lower life of the material world (I 4.9). The spoudaios experiences a life in noetic purity guided only by the higher intelligible part, and any disturbances from the lower perceptible part hardly trouble the wise person (I 2.5.22 ff.). Any kinds of affections from the perceptible part of the soul are dim echoes for the mind of the wise man just because of the affinity between the two parts within the soul. The lower part is always benefited within the soul of the spoudaios "just as a man living next door to a sage would profit by the wise man's neighborhood, either by becoming like him, or by regarding him with such respect as not to dare to do anything of which the good man would not approve" (I 2.5.25-28). However, the wise person is not careless about the perceptible body despite the fact that bodily goods will not contribute to eudaimonia; the wise person has to give to the body what the body really needs (I 4.11-16). The concern of the wise person is "not to be out of sin, but to be God" (I 2.6.2-3), and so the virtue of the wise person that leads to true well-being is to exercise the higher activity of the soul’s intelligible self; true arete frees the spoudaios and leads the soul to the ultimate goal to become like the higher intelligible and eternal life of the divine Nous (I 2.6-7).

The wise man is also not inconsiderate to others (I 4.15.21-25) but does not belong to the mass of people (II 9.9.6-11). He chooses to be acquainted with virtuous friends and he is the paradigm of excellence and contemplative life. As Plotinus notes, the spoudaios is not "unfriendly" (aphilos) or careless about others, but he cares about his own soul as he cares about his own affairs and the excellence of his companions. The wise man manifests intelligible unity and purity by being an earthly paradigm of the divine Nous, and so "renders to his friends all that he renders to himself, and so will be the best of friends due to his union with Nous" (I 4.15.21-25). The wise man shares his eudaimonia by being present at the same time to his own self and the others (See Porphyry Life 8.19-23), and lives a friendship (philia) in the sensible world that imitates the friendship of the universal order and the higher divine realm of Nous and its unity with its Forms (VI 7.14). The power of philia traverses all the hypostases of being as it is identified with and derives from the supreme unity of the One (V 1.9.1-5).

6. Human Freedom and Self-Determination

Plotinus' theory of virtue ethics is closely related to human freedom and self-determination. In the beginning of Ennead VI 8 On Free Will and the Will of the One Plotinus wonders, “Is there anything in our power?” In his analysis a distinction is offered between internal determinations (that is, what depends on us) and external determinations (that is, what is not dependent on us) (Eliasson 2008; Remes 2006). An action is voluntary and depends on us not only if we are free and we are not obliged to act, but also if we are not following the path of reason without critical evaluation. For Plotinus, an action depends purely on us only if the soul defines its own self as a self-determined principle (VI 8.3.20-26).

Plotinus’ notion of self-determination is related to the concept of "what depends on us" (eph’ hemin) as having the connotation of a faculty describing either the quality of action or the agent himself (Leroux 1990). Furthermore, a distinction has been suggested between an inclusive notion of "what depends on us" (that is, the moral action has its origins in the agent) and an exclusive notion (that is, the moral action has its origins in rational decisions and judgments not necessarily determined by the agent) (Eliasson 2008). For Plotinus, voluntariness and awareness of an action are not sufficient for an action to be depended on us, but from our wish coming through the contemplation of virtue.

Furthermore, for Plotinus, moral actions that are determined by external factors are related to passive dispositions, but true virtue should be based on the internal state of the soul in relation to intellect (II 5.2.34-35). Moral agency reveals itself not primarily in ethical practice but in the excellence of the inner self in active contemplation of the Forms (II 3.9-10). The virtuous soul is purely dependent on its own self without considering external conditions or determinations; the free soul is self-determined only by internal conditions (III 1; see also VI 8.3.20-26) and acts autonomously in self-determination inconsiderate of external parameters or situational conditions (VI 8.6.19-23). The virtuous action is underlined by three conditions: firstly, an action is voluntary (that is, we should not be forced to act); secondly, an action must be conscious (that is, we should have knowledge of what we are doing); and, thirdly it must be self-determined (that is, we should be masters of ourselves) (Eliasson 2008). Considering a self-directed aspect of moral agency, Plotinus moves the emphasis from the outward activity of ethical practice (that is,  Aristotle’s primary concern in relation to virtue ethics) to the inner activity of the contemplating soul. A free and noble action is not justified or based mainly on practice (praxis), but on the intellectual virtues of the soul as qualities of its intelligible self prior to moral action that is found in the perceptible realm (VI 8.6.20-22). Virtue is an active disposition of the soul in terms of contemplation (theoria) that ends in an established state of mind internally tuned and moderated in accordance to the perfection of the intelligible world. In light of this approach, well-being is not found in actions but in the inner contemplation of the soul. As Plotinus puts it, "To place eudaimonia in actions is to locate it in something outside virtue and the soul; the activity of the soul lies in thought, and action of this kind within itself; and this is the state of eudaimonia" (I 5.10.20-23). True happiness of a free and moral soul is not established in external situations and activities but in internal determinations and intellectual virtues (I 5.1).

Moreover, whereas Aristotle conceives of human freedom as related to the problem of choice and contingency, Plotinus of conceives human freedom in relation to the freedom of the self (Leroux 1996) and the virtuous life of the wise person, without necessarily being defined by or dependent on voluntary choice (Ennead VI 8.1-7). Plotinus emphatically argues that no outward actions are purely dependent on us: “in practical actions self-determination and being in our power is not referred to practice and outward activity but to the inner activity of virtue itself, that is, its thought and contemplation” (VI 8.6.20-22). What depends on us can be found in the realm of intellect "at rest from actions" (VI 8.5.35-37). Only virtue as an intellectual quality purifies and frees the soul, and as Plotinus states by following Plato's expression in the Myth of Er in the Republic (617e3), virtue has “no master” as far as it intellectualizes the soul beyond any external determination (VI 8.5.30-37).

7. Soul and Transmigration

Plotinus' virtue ethics is a self-directed ethical theory that is related to his psychology and metaphysics. His ethical theory follows his theory of the psyche and its dual-aspect nature. The higher and lower virtues correspond to the higher intelligible and sense-perceptive parts of the soul (Ennead I 3). Whereas the lower virtues are related to passions and the lower sense-perceptive part of the soul, the higher virtues are related to wisdom and dialectic and refer to the higher intelligible part of the soul (I 3.6). Plotinus aims to stress the superiority of the soul's higher intelligible part, which is its inner self and is contrasted with the soul's sufferings and passions of the lower sense-perceptive part, which is related to the outer self. He maintains that tragic and cruel moments in life should not be taken seriously but should be regarded as incidents in the plot of a play: “we should be spectators of murders, and all deaths, and takings and sacking of cities, as if they were on the stages of theaters, all changes of scenery and costume and acted wailings and weepings” (III 2.15.43-47). It is not the soul's inner self that participates in the "game of life" but “the outside shadow of man” (47-50). The higher soul remains unaffected by bodily conditions and so “the outer man has to take off the play-costume in which he is dressed” (55-57). The inner man is clear from affections, and this is our true self that possesses the virtues that belong to the realm of intellect and "have their seat actually in the separate soul, separate and separable even while it is still here below” (I 1.10.7-10).

Plotinus' dual-aspect theory of the soul is related to his account of transmigration and its ethical implications. It is noteworthy that Plotinus never uses the term metempsychosis (reincarnation) but only metensomatosis (transmigration). Plotinus adopts a monistic view of transmigration. A monistic approach to transmigration agrees with the ontological unity and homogeneity of the soul and the non-eschatological aspect of human destiny. The transmigration of the soul should be conceived of as illumination of the living bodies. The soul is not literally transmigrated, since the bodies are just shadows and images of the higher soul. The bodies are projections of the soul and so transmigration is the illumination of the light of the soul transmitted into different bodily forms and without affecting the unity of the soul.

Plotinus stresses the ethical implications of transmigration originally found in the Platonic dialogues (Phaedo 81-82; Republic X. 620; Timaeus 91-92). However, in light of the soul’s ontological unity, homogeneity, and monism, Plotinus aims to reconcile some dualistic accounts of transmigration found in Plato, the early Pythagoreans, and some Presocratics such as Heraclitus and Empedocles (VI 4.16.4-7). His intention is to abolish the barriers between different psychic classes and hierarchies. Since the soul is one, homogenous, intelligible substance of life, all transmigrations into various life forms are possible (humans, animals, plants) and by extension, all animated bodies are rational and immortal (IV 7.14.1-8; see also VI 4.16; IV 8.1; III 4.2.16-30).

Plotinus’ reconsideration of Plato's accounts of transmigration also has an ethical side. The logos of the soul manifests at different facets of life and being: the man who exercised political virtue becomes a man again, while the one who is not active in community becomes a bee; the man who loved music a song-bird; kings who ruled stupidly into eagles; those who lived with the senses animals; even plants for those who lived with the desire of flesh coupled with dullness of perception (III 4.2). Nevertheless, for Plotinus, whereas the transmigration of human souls into animal bodies is possible, the soul's destiny has nothing to do with transmigration (I 1.11.8-15). It is not physical condition that affects the soul but the moral quality of the soul that affects the physical order, both of individual bodies and the cosmos. Plotinus denies an eschatological approach to transmigration for the soul's higher intelligible part. As an intelligible entity, the soul is pure and immortal logos and thus sinless in its very nature (I 1.12.1-4). Since the soul is sinless it cannot be judged or punished in after-life nor transmigrated by passing from body to body. The higher part of the soul never descends completely to the lower realm of the sensible world (IV 8.8), while the lower part is a shadow of the higher part, and the descent of the soul is an inclination of the intelligible part in the realm of becoming (I 1.12). The dual-aspect nature of the soul is vividly described in Ennead I 1, where Plotinus uses the dual image of the noble and virtuous hero Heracles who "had this active virtue and in view of his noble character was deemed worthy to be called a god—because he was an active and not a contemplative person (in which case he would be altogether in that intelligible world), he is above, but there is also still a part of him below” (35-39).

Whereas Plotinus accepted transmigration of the soul in different forms and in terms of the soul's purity and immortality while denying the soul's bodily affection and sin, later Neoplatonists interpreted transmigration in different ethical terms: the evil man becomes a beast-like character and the sinful soul is temporarily associated with an animal body or form. This is actually the central point of controversy between Plotinian and post-Plotinian accounts of transmigration. Whereas, for Plotinus, the ethics of transmigration is based on the non-hierarchical monism and homogenous, intelligible nature of the soul, for later Neoplatonists, transmigration is denied in terms of a hierarchical ontology in which the human soul possesses a higher ranking of existence in comparison to the other animals. On the one hand, Poprhyry seems to follow Plotinus’ transmigration of human soul into animal bodies as far as both human soul and animal souls are rational, deriving from the same intelligible source of the soul as second hypostasis of being (Smith, 1987; Wallis, 1995). On the other hand, Iamblichus and Proclus rejected human transmigration to animals as far as human and animal souls are essentially different and even denied that animals have souls at all in the strict sense of the term (Wallis, 1995).

8. Criticism of the Gnostics

In Ennead II 9 Against the Gnostics, Plotinus aims to defend Platonism against the immoral, pessimistic, and irrational doctrines of those who misinterpret Plato’s teaching and attribute evilness and darkness to the material universe (Puech 1960). Plotinus’ criticism is directed to a group of Gnostics who argued that knowledge should be not considered as a product of philosophical reasoning but of divine revelation (Wallis 1995). The Gnostics generally maintained that salvation is possible only through ‘knowledge’; gnosis is the only presupposition for the soul to find the pleroma, the spirit of the supreme God beyond this lesser and evil material universe. In order to emphasize the Gnostics’ irrational doctrines and perhaps their hypocritical and hyperbolic attitude, Plotinus describes them as speaking about Plato’s theories with “raving words” (II 9.18.20), like Sibyl’s delirious speech, as Heraclitus vividly expresses in fr. 92. In contrast to the Gnostics and other misinterpretations of Plato, Plotinus maintains that the material universe is the most perfect possible image of the intelligible world; the material world reflects in the best possible way the beauty and goodness of the divine realm.

Plotinus evaluates the Gnostic conceptions of the world, history, and ethics in three corresponding forms of alienation: firstly, alienation from the world, secondly, alienation from history, and thirdly, alienation from society (Kalligas 1997). Moreover, Plotinus’ objections are directed to the Gnostic doctrines of the denial of the divinity of the Word-Soul and the heavenly bodies, the rejection of salvation through true virtue and wisdom, the non-philosophical and irrational support of their arguments, and the arrogant view of themselves as saved by nature, that is, as privileged beings in whom alone God is interested (See Armstrong’ introductory note on Ennead II 9; cf. also Wallis 1995). For Plotinus, the Gnostics are deceived when they believe that the universe is created by a fallen soul (II 9.4-5) and when they speak of the divine creator as an ignorant or evil Demiurge who produced an imperfect material world (II 9.6). They are mistaken when they regard the creative activities of the Demiurge as the result of a spiritual fall within the intelligible hierarchy (II 9.10-12); they are melodramatic when they speak about the influence of the cosmic spheres (II 9.13); they are in the wrong direction when they lay claim to the higher powers of magic (II 9.14); and they are completely misled when they believe that immortality achievable through the complete rejection of and abstention from the material world.

Ennead II 9.15-18 includes an important account of Plotinus’ ethical criticism of the Gnostic movement. However, it is not only concerned with a polemic against Gnosticism but also with a defence of Platonism against the immoral, irrational, and pessimistic doctrines of negative otherworldliness. Plotinus draws a line between virtue, beauty, and truth, emphasizing Plato’s teaching of ethics, aesthetics, and metaphysics. Plotinus’ criticism of Gnosticism is an abridgment of his virtue ethics where the meaning of arete is justified for its importance for the soul’s purification, unity, and self-improvement. Plotinus shows his ethical standpoint on the value of human life. The life of the wise and virtuous soul is not to abandon the material world in a disinterested way of life, but to understand through virtue the divine origins of the soul and recognize the beauty and goodness of the intelligible world in the soul’s self-perfection.

Particularly, in chapter 15, Plotinus states that “we must be particularly careful and not to let escape us” what the immoral arguments of the Gnostics do to the souls (15.1-3). He distinguishes between two theoretical directions about the "end" (telos) of life (15.4-8): whereas, for the first, the end is the pleasure (hedone) of the body, for the second, the end is nobility (kalon) and virtue (arete).  Plotinus further divides the first theoretical direction into two schools of thought: (1) Epicurus and the Epicureans, who abolish divine providence and extol pleasure and enjoyment (8-22); (2) the Gnostics, who are pessimistic about the material world and promote an ascetic life without virtue and goodness (22-40). Prima facie the classification of the Epicureans and the Gnostics into the same category is puzzling: whereas the Epicureans were known for their hedonistic views, the Gnostics were known for their ascetic and detached views. Probably, Plotinus’ aim is to offer a philosophical comparison in a dialectic form in order to answer two dissimilar schools of thought, both of which, however, omit virtue ethics and divine goodness. According to another perspective, Plotinus perhaps considers a common alienated attitude both in the Epicurean life of pleasure and in the Gnostic life of asceticism.

For Plotinus, the Gnostics are immoral for neglecting the role of virtue in human life and noetic ascent. The Gnostics omit to define virtue, and they fail to explain how to attain the higher world without virtue. No treatise is devoted to virtue, and their treatment of virtue is completely absent from their doctrines: "they do not tell us what kind of thing virtue is, nor how many parts it has, nor about all the many noble studies of the subject to be found in the treatises of the ancients, nor from what virtue results and how it is to be attained, nor how the soul is taking care of itself, nor how it is purified." (II 9.15.30-33) Plotinus argues that "looking to god" without knowing how to look is insufficient because only virtue leads the soul to the goal of divine aspiration (15.33-40).

Plotinus further relates virtue to beauty and the divine (II 9.16-18). Perceptible beauty is a reflection of the intelligible beauty, and the wise soul is able to recognize the beauty and goodness of the intelligible world through an inner sight to the perceptible world (II 9.1639-48).  Plotinus justifies the difference between Platonic and Gnostic otherworldliness. Whereas Plato’s otherworldliness accepts the beauty and goodness of the material world (in Plato’s Timaeus), Gnostics’ otherworldliness denies the beauty of the universe and the divine goodness of the Demiurge (II 9.17). Plotinus defends Plato and the beauty of the earthly world by using the metaphor of two people living in the same fine house, "one of whom reviles the structure and the builder, but stays there none the less, while the other does not revile, but says the builder has built it with the utmost skill, and waits for the time to come in which he will go away, when he will not need a house any longer" (II 9.18.3-9; trans. Armstrong).

Virtue forces the soul to recognize both itself and its divine origins and to guard itself against the strokes of fortune (18.26-30). The higher soul of the universe is not troubled; "it has nothing that it can be troubled by. We, while we are here, can already repel the strokes of fortune by virtue and make some of them become less by greatness of mind and others not even troubles because of our strength”; when our soul contemplates the completely untroubled state of the world soul, the universe and the stars, we become our true selves, well prepared for any possible misfortune (30-35) (see also Ennead I 4.8).

9. Virtue Ethics after Plotinus

a. Porphyry

In Sententiae ad intelligibilia ducentes (section 32) Porphyry systematized Plotinus' treatment of the four cardinal virtues exposed in Ennead I 2 (O’ Meara 2003; Kalligas 2014). Porphyry stressed the importance of purification in virtue ethics and particularly the significance of purification in self-knowledge and the care of soul. He underlined the necessity of detachment from the soul's bodily pleasure and irrational passions, its inconsideration of pains produced by sense-objects, and any kind of inclination on the part of the soul to the corporeal world. For Porphyry, the virtuous soul achieves impassibility by completely removing bodily dispositions (Sententiae 32.89-140).

Porphyry suggested a specific scale of the cardinal virtues following an ascending exposition of the soul's need for purification: from the lower civil and practical life of the earthly realm to the higher paradigmatic life of the intelligible Forms. The scale of virtues begins (P1) from the level of political virtues and civic life, continues (P2) to the level of purificatory virtues and soul's primal noetic ascent, (P3) to the theoretical virtues of the contemplative mind, and (P4) to the exemplary or paradigmatic virtues of the intelligible world.  The cardinal virtues of courage, self-control, justice, and wisdom apply throughout the four levels or states of being. Whereas the object of the "civic virtues" (P1) is to moderate passions and to conform conduct to the laws of human nature, the "purificatory virtues" (P2) detach the soul completely from passions. The object of the "contemplative virtues" (P3) is to apply to the soul pure intellectual activities, without any concern about passions, while the paradigmatic virtues (P4) are the exemplars and archetypes of all other virtues (Sententiae 32.83-89)

Porphyry begins section 32 of the Sententiae with the application of virtues to different states of human experience and focuses on different expressions of virtues with respect to different levels of purification: between the virtues of the citizen, the virtues of the soul that attempts to rise to contemplation, the virtues of the soul that purely contemplates intelligence, and finally the mind that possesses pure intelligence and that is completely separated from the bodily level of the soul (1-5). As Porphyry summarizes, "the practical virtues make man virtuous (spoudaios); the purificatory virtues make man divine (daimonios), or make the good man a benign spirit (daimon agathos); the one who acts only in accordance to contemplative virtues becomes a god (theos); while the one who acts in accordance with the paradigmatic virtues is the father of gods (theon pater)" (89-94 translation Guthrie, 1988, modified).

Furthermore, Porphyry places an emphasis on the political virtues and their civic importance as the first stage of excellence in terms of moderation of the passions (metriopatheia) and appropriate moral duty underlined by pure reason. For Porphyry, political virtues contribute to the harmonious civic life with fellow human beings and "mutually unite all citizens". The political virtues are human virtues and a necessary precondition to the noetic ascent of the soul to the higher realms. There is a necessity to exercise humanity in the self before its application to fellow-humans or the purification at higher levels of being (Sententiae 32, 6-14).

For Porphyry, the contemplative man is detached from the political sphere and the virtues possessed are called "purifications" since they aim at higher realities and genuine existences. The soul of the contemplative man is raised above the passions of the earthly life to the intelligible realm and in likeness to the divine. (15-33). However, as Porphyry clarifies, there is "a difference between purifying oneself, and being pure" (33-35). The role of purificatory virtues is twofold: they both purify the soul and coexist as qualities in the purified soul. The importance of the purificatory virtues lies in their power to release the soul completely from any form of evil, either the one related to lower things or the one related to passions. The political virtues release the soul only from passions (35-50).

At a level higher than the purficatory virtues, Porphyry places the contemplative virtues, "the virtues of the soul that contemplates intelligence". The purified soul directs its activities to the higher intelligible realm, and the four cardinal virtues manifest different kinds of qualities of the soul in constant contemplation of the intelligible beings (51-63). Finally, Porphyry suggests a fourth kind of virtues, the paradigmatic virtues, which belong to the realm of the Forms and reside within the higher Nous.

At the intelligible level of the Forms, the virtues are identified with specific intelligibles (noeta). Porphyry's claim has been considered a departure from Plotinus' position in Ennead I 2 (by following Aristotle) that virtues should not be seen as archetypes in the intelligible world of the Forms. However, Porphyry follows Plotinus in claiming that one who possesses the superior virtues also possesses the lower virtues, but not vice versa. In fact, one who possesses the higher virtues is not interested in practicing the lower virtues. Furthermore, Porphyry underlines the intrinsic value of virtues by upgrading their ontological status, while Plotinus highlights their psychological value in the soul's noetic purification.

For Porphyry, the superiority of the paradigmatic virtues, compared with the virtues of the soul, lies in the fact that the virtues of the soul are images of the "archetypal" paradigmatic virtues, and so they subsist in the divine Nous simultaneously (63-70). As Porphyry synopsizes: "1, the paradigmatic virtues, characteristic of intelligence, and of the being or nature to which they belong; 2, the virtues of the soul turned towards intelligence, and filled with her contemplation; 3, the virtues of the soul that purifies herself, or which has purified herself from the brutal passions characteristic of the body; 4, the virtues that adorn the man by restraining within narrow limits the action of the irrational part, and by moderating the passions" (70-78; translation Guthrie 1988, modified).

b. Iamblichus

Iamblichus, in his work On Virtues (not preserved today), develops the scale of virtues of Porphyry's Sententiae 32 (O’Meara 2003; Kalligas 2014; Finamore 2012). Iamblichus added two more virtues below the political: the natural virtues (at the lowest level) and the ethical virtues (below the political virtues), as well as the hieratic virtues at the highest level of the scale. Iamblichus' scale of virtues, following an ascending order is: (1) natural; (2) ethical; (3) civic; (4) purifying; (5) contemplative; (6) paradigmatic and (7) hieratic (apud Damascius, In Phaedo I.138-144).

Iamblichus suggested a level below the civic or political virtues in order to underline the importance of virtues and their cultivation both in children and certain animals (O’Meara 2003). He emphasized the importance of "habituation" (ethismos) at the level of ethical virtues and highlights the classical association between virtue and habituation (hexis) found in Plato and Aristotle. However, Iamblichus, following closely Plato's teaching, reconsiders the educational importance of the ethical virtues in molding and bringing up children. A virtue ethics education is presupposed for political virtues, which entails maturity and rationality (O’Meara 2003).

In Iamblichus' canon— a selection (or curriculum) of twelve Platonic dialogues used to initiate the student to Plato's original teaching—the scale of virtues is important for the soul's purification and its progressive noetic ascent from the nature of the self (Alcibiades I) to a complete treatment of the divine nature (Parmenides). The virtues follow the purpose of the Platonic dialogues and the order of being to guide the soul's likeness to god. For instance, the Gorgias, the second dialogue in the list, involves civic virtues, while the Phaedo, the third dialogue in the list, involves purificatory virtues. Moreover, whereas the Cratylus and the Theaetetus, fourth and fifth in the list, refer to contemplative virtues and emphasize logic, the Sophist and the Statesman, sixth and seventh in the list, refer again to contemplative virtues but with an emphasis on nature and the perceptible world. The dialogues Phaedrus, the Symposium, and the Philebus (eighth, ninth, and tenth respectively in the list of the curriculum) are related to contemplative virtues with theological purposes and the nature of the Good. Finally, the Timaeus, eleventh in the list, entails physical education with reference to the nature of the cosmos.  It is noteworthy that the Timaeus and the Parmenides are considered "perfect" dialogues, which sum up the previous ten.

Iamblichus' detailed development of the scale of virtues offers a comprehensive and insightful analysis on human morality, from the natural level of being to the highest form of divination. As in Plotinus and Porphyry, the ascending scale of virtues follows the noetic ascent and the progressive purification of the virtuous soul that achieves likeness with the divine. As O'Meara (2003) maintains, "the Iamblichean scale of virtues remains a method of progressive divinization, a process of complexity worthy of the metaphysical world-view of the later Neoplatonists" (145). Iamblichus' fine elaboration of virtues was influential on the work of Marinus and Damascius and shows the importance of human excellence both in the practical and the theoretical sphere.

10. References and Further Reading

a. Texts and Translations

  • Armstrong, A. H. (1966-1988) Plotinus. 7 vols. Loeb Classical Library. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Henry, P., and Schwyzer, H. R. (1964, 1976, 1982) Plotini Opera. 3 vols. (editio minor) Oxford: Clarendon Press.

b. Commentaries

  • Kalligas, P. (2014) The Enneads of Plotinus: A CommentaryVolume 1, Elizabeth Key Fowden and Nicolas Pilavachi (trs.), Princeton; Oxford: Princeton University Press.
  • Kalligas, P. (1994-2009) Plotinus’ Enneads I-V: Ancient Greek text, translation and commentary. Athens: Academy of Athens.
  • Leroux, G. (1990) Traité sur la liberté et la volonté de l'Un. [VI.8 (39)] Paris: Vrin.
  • McGroarty, K. (2007) Plotinus on Eudaimonia. A Commentary on Ennead I.4. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

c. Introductory Sources

  • Gerson, L. P. (1994) Plotinus. London/New York: Routledge.
  • O'Meara, D. (2003) Platonopolis. Platonic Political Philosophy in Late Antiquity. Oxford:  Clarendon Press.
  • Smith, A. (2004) Philosophy in Late Antiquity.  London/New York:  Routledge.
  • Wallis, R. T. (1995) Neoplatonism. London: Duckworth.
  • Wright, M. R. (2009) Introducing Greek Philosophy. Acumen.

d. Ethical Theory

  • Baltzly, D. (2004) 'The Virtues and 'Becoming Like God': Alcinous to Proclus', Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 26: 297-321.
  • Dillon, J. M. (1996) ‘An ethic for the late antique sage’ in The Cambridge companion to Plotinus. Gerson, L. P. (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 315-335.
  • Dillon, J. M. (1983) 'Plotinus, Philo and Origen on the Grades of Virtue', in H.-D. Blume and F. Mann (eds), Platonismus und Christentum. Festschrift für Heinrich Dörrie, Münster Westfalen: 92-105.
  • Plass, P. (1982) ‘Plotinus’ ethical theory’, Illinois Classical Studies 7, 2: 241-259.
  • Remes, P. (2006) ‘Plotinus’ Ethics of Disinterested Interest’, Journal of the History of Philosophy 44: 1-23.
  • Rist, J. M. (1976) ‘Plotinus and Moral Obligation’ in The Significance of Neoplatonism. Harris, R. B. (ed.), Virginia: ISNS, 217-233.
  • Schniewind, A. (2003) L’Éthique du Sage chez Plotin. Le paradigme du spoudaios. Paris: Librairie Philosophique J. Vrin.
  • Smith, A. (1999) ‘The Significance of Practical Ethics for Plotinus’ in Traditions of Platonism: Essays in Honor of John Dillon. Cleary, J. J. (ed.), Aldershot, 227-236.
  • Stamatellos, G. (2015) 'Virtue and Hexis in Plotinus', International Journal of the Platonic Tradition 9 (2): 129-145.

e. Human Freedom and Selfhood

  • Eliasson, E. (2008) The Notion of That Which Depends on Us in Plotinus and Its Background. Leiden/Boston:  Brill.
  • Leroux, G. (1996) ‘Human Freedom in the thought of Plotinus’, in Gerson, L. P., The Cambridge companion to Plotinus. Cambridge: CUP, 292-314.
  • Remes, P. (2007) Plotinus on self: the philosophy of the 'We'. Cambridge, New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Stern-Gillet, S. (2009) ‘Dual Selfhood and Self-Perfection in the Enneads’, Epoché 13, 2: 331-345.

f. Post-Plotinian Virtue Ethics

  • Finamore, J. (2012) 'Iamblichus on the Grades of Virtue' in Iamblichus and the Foundations of Late Platonism. Eugene Afonasin, John Dillon, John F. Finamore (ed.), Leiden; Boston:  Brill, 113–132.
  • Guthrie, K. (1988) (tr.) PorphyryLaunching-Points to the Realm of Mind. Phanes Press.


Author Information

Giannis Stamatellos
The American College of Greece