Sayyid Qutb (1906—1966)
Sayyid Qutb was one of the leading Islamist ideological thinkers of the twentieth century. Living and working in Egypt, he turned to Islamism in his early forties after about two decades as a secular educator and literary writer. As an Islamist, he held that all aspects of society should be conducted according to the Shari’a, that is, laws of God as derived from the Qur’an and the practice (sunna) of the Prophet Muhammad. Probably his best known and most distinctive doctrine is his interpretation of jahiliyya (pre-Islamic ignorance) as characterizing all of the societies of his time, including the Muslim ones. Another doctrine was his interpretation of faith in one God only (tawhid) as entailing the absolute sovereignty of God (hakimiyyat Allah) and the liberation of humans from service to other humans instead of God. He was executed by the Egyptian government for his Islamist activities and is thus considered a martyr, something that has added immeasurably to the impact of his ideas.
Although he did not consider himself a philosopher, he had opinions on a number of topics that interest philosophers, and he commented on the ideas of philosophers. He had a grand vision of the universe as a harmonious whole under God’s rule and of humans as called upon to be God’s deputies in managing the Earth. Humans, however, were given a measure of freedom that other beings do not have. Rightly used, this freedom would allow humans to fit in harmoniously with the rest of creation and have the highest status under God. Misused, it would introduce discord into the world and misery into human life. Jahiliyya equates to misuse of this freedom, and Qutb calls for jihad, conceived along the lines of revolution, as the response. In discussing these things, he touches on a range of topics, including the nature of God and the universe, human nature, knowledge and revelation, ethics, society, human history, death, and judgment. This article presents only the latest and most radical phase of his thought.
- Basic Conception
- Human Nature and Purpose, Other Spiritual Beings
- Free Will and Predetermination, The Problem of Evil
- Knowledge: Revelation, Worldly Knowledge
- Ethical Values, Shari’a
- The Ideal Society (Utopia), Economics. Gender Relations
- Jahiliyya (Dystopia) and Jihad (Revolution)
- Human History
- Death, Judgment, Martyrdom
- Qutb’s Legacy
- Final Remarks: Aesthetics, Harmony, and Essentialism
- References and Further Reading
Sayyid Qutb (1906—1966) was and is one of the most important ideologues of the Islamist movement, which seeks to re-establish truly Islamic values and practices in Muslim societies that have become more or less Westernized. He was born and raised in an Egyptian village, attended the state primary school there, and in 1920 moved to Cairo to attend secondary school and then Dar al-‘Ulum, a teacher training institute that sought to balance traditional and modern ways. From 1933 to 1952 he worked in the Ministry of Education, first as a teacher and later as an inspector and administrator. He also became one of the secular literary elite prominent at the time, publishing more than 100 poems as well as articles and books on literary and social topics. In 1948, he rather abruptly began to publish Islamist articles and the next year published a major Islamist book, Social Justice in Islam, which was to go through a total of six editions. The reasons for this shift are not totally clear, but the chaos of Egyptian politics, the efforts of imperialist powers to reassert their position, and the establishment of the state of Israel presumably played a role. His Islamism was confirmed during a two-year (1948-1950) study tour of the United States, which he found to be technologically impressive but hopelessly corrupt morally.
After his return to Egypt he joined the Muslim Brothers, the leading Islamist organization, founded in 1928 by Hasan al-Banna, and soon became one of its leading spokespersons. The Brothers supported the Free Officers’ revolution in 1952 at first but soon withdrew support. After an attempt on the life of Abdel Nasser in 1954, the leading Brothers were imprisoned, Sayyid Qutb among them. In prison, they suffered very harsh treatment, though poor health spared Qutb the worst of it. This led to a radicalization of his ideas, including the claim that the whole world, including the “Muslim” world, is in a state of jahiliyya, that is, un-Islamic ignorance and barbarism. This radicalization was assisted by the ideas of the extremely influential Indo-Pakistani Islamist Abu’l ‘Ala’ Mawdudi (1903-1979), whose writings became known to Qutb and other Arab thinkers from about 1951. Mawdudi’s ideas about divine sovereignty, the Islamic state, jahiliyya, and other things spoke very much to Qutb’s condition and helped him to crystalize and articulate his views.
In 1964, Qutb was released from prison and published his best-known book, Milestones, effectively calling for an Islamic revolution. He also became mentor to a group of young Brothers and was soon arrested for conspiring to overthrow the government. In 1966, he was convicted of this charge and executed. He thus became a martyr to his cause, considerably multiplying his influence.
Qutb wrote a number of books during his Islamist period in addition to those mentioned, especially a multi-volume commentary on the Qur’an, In the Shadow of the Qur’an, which he began in 1952 and was still revising at the time of his death.
Qutb’s radical ideas divided the Muslim Brothers after his death. The main line group rejected them and sought to work within the existing political system, briefly achieving the presidency in 2012-2013. Smaller groups, such as the so-called Takfir wa-Hijra group, Jama‘at al-Islamiyya (Islamic group), and Tanzim al-Jihad (Jihad organization), adopted and modified Qutb’s ideas and were responsible for considerable terrorism through the 1990s (see below). His influence spread far beyond Egypt, indeed throughout the whole of the Islamic world and its diaspora. This included extreme groups such al-Qaeda, whose second leader, Ayman al-Zawahiri, was very much influenced by Qutb’s main ideas and his example as a martyr, and who first joined an Islamist group the year that Qutb was executed. In fact, Qutb has come to be seen by many as the spiritual “godfather” of such groups. On the other hand, it is possible to read him selectively, and so he has influenced many who do not fully accept his extreme views. There is a considerable literature on him both in Islamic and Western languages.
Qutb was not a philosopher by most definitions of the term, and he consciously rejected philosophy as he understood it, both Western philosophy and classical Islamic philosophy. He considered the discipline to be an effort to accomplish with human reason what can only be accomplished on the basis of divine revelation and also as a foreign intrusion on pure Islamic thought. Nevertheless, his thinking was quite systematic and did have a place for reason; moreover, he used rational arguments in criticizing philosophy and made reference to Western philosophers (mostly known to him through Arabic translations) in the process. He also deals with many topics that are of interest to philosophers. He is a good example of Weber’s Wertrationalität (rationality in accordance with moral demands).
The following article is based entirely on the last phase of his writing, from about 1958, during which he rejected many of his earlier ideas. This phase was the most radical, most systematic, and most influential.
Qutb saw his ideas as a necessary interpretation and corollary of the basic Muslim creed: “There is no god but God; Muhammad is the Messenger of God.” His views fall within the wide spectrum of Sunni Islamic thinking but particularly within the forms of it commonly labelled “Islamist” (stressing the application of Islamic norms to society) and “Salafi” (broadly, those who emphasize the authority of the Qur’an, Sunna, and the earliest generations of successors, the salaf, over against later “innovations”). Like many popular writers on religious topics in modern times, he did not have the traditional education given to the ‘ulama’ (religious scholars) and was to some extent self-taught in this area.
The article focuses primarily on the more basic and theoretical aspects of Qutb’s writing (what we might call his philosophy or theology), which he calls the Islamic tasawwur, a word usually translated “concept” or “conception,” but which here could also be translated “worldview” or “vision.” Qutb, in the manner of fundamentalists and also scientists, does not consider this his conception but the true conception. He characterizes this conception as divinely sourced, and following from that: fixed in its basics, comprehensive, balanced, dynamically positive, realistic, and unified.
The tasawwur grows out of its divine source and does not need or accept significant influence from the outside. Therefore, Qutb criticizes not only contemporary modernists, who wish to “reform” Islam in terms of modern, that is, Western ideas and ideologies, but also the earlier Muslim philosophers and theologians, who made use of Greek philosophical ideas. We may note that Qutb is firmly of the view that ideas are prior to actions, which flow from them. The ideas are not ends in themselves, however, but are meant to undergird actions and activities. In fact, all of human life and activity flows from a creedal tasawwur of some kind. Qutb often describes Islam (and religion more generally) in terms of three stages: tasawwur, manhaj (method, program), nizam (social and political order). Each stage proceeds from the former one with almost logical necessity. All three are necessary for Islam to exist. Since Qutb believed that there was no Islamic nizam in his time, he often said that Islam has no “existence.” We may note that Qutb’s Islam is a highly reified concept, not just a label applied variously to diverse human ideas and practices.
The centrepiece of the tasawwur is God (Allah), that awesome being Whose essence and some of Whose attributes are beyond the reach of human understanding, though many attributes can be understood by the human mind. (Qutb does not discuss the relation between God’s essence and attributes, an important theme in traditional Muslim theology.) These attributes belong only to God and comprise his divinity; no other being shares in them. God is one and unique. This is the first and most basic constituent of the tasawwur, and recognition of it is called tawhid (the usual Arabic term for belief in one God). God is also eternal, without beginning or end.
This God is the creator and source of everything else in existence. These things are separate from God but totally dependent on Him and harmoniously obey regular laws, some of which can be and have been discovered by human science. These laws are not separate from God, however. God acts directly in all that happens, so that these “laws” are just His customary way of acting. Since His will is completely free, He can and sometimes does vary His action and produce what we call miracles. For example, fire usually burns things, but God might make it not do so on some occasion, as in the story of the prophet Ibrahim (Abraham) in the Qur’an. Such events do not disrupt the general order and harmony of the universe, however, since they are part of God’s larger plan. While most of creation obeys God necessarily, humans in their moral aspect may or may not obey. Instead, they are subject to a moral law established by God, the Shari’a, which will put them in harmony with creation if they obey it.
God is therefore the Lord and Sustainer of all creation, while all creation stands in a relation of servanthood to Him, necessarily in the case of most things, willingly or unwillingly in the case of humans (disobedient humans are still servants). It follows necessarily from all of these attributes that God is the only source of authority and the only sovereign in the universe, not only physically but also morally, legally, and politically. No human ruler or nation may claim sovereignty, a point of major importance for Qutb’s revolutionary doctrine. These central ideas reflect those of Mawdudi, though Qutb probably stresses them more. His term for the sovereignty of God, hakimiyyat Allah, comes from the Arabic translation of Mawdudi’s term for the same thing.
Humans hold a very special place in God’s creation, as already indicated. According to the Qur’an, God created the human body and breathed His spirit into it, and He gave humans a status above the angels, whom he commanded to prostrate to the first man. Human nature as originally created, and in its proper state, is called fitra, and this fitra has a need for God and a predisposition to serve Him. The Islamic tasawwur is congruent with it. The fitra may be obscured by human whims, desires and negligence, but is not destroyed.
The basic purpose of humans is to serve God willingly in all aspects of life. They are to do so in the honorable role of God’s deputy, khalifa, over the earth. They are responsible for making it fruitful, developing it technologically, caring for it, and organizing a just society in accordance with God’s Shari’a. This idea is very important to Qutb.
The only significant distinctions among humans in God’s sight are based on their obedience or disobedience to His will. Otherwise all are of equal value regardless of race, ethnicity, nationality, class, or gender, although in the last case there are significant differences of function to be discussed below.
Angels are spiritual beings who serve God and are always obedient to Him. They carry God’s throne, deliver God’s messages to the prophets, watch over the gates of paradise and hell, record the actions of humans, support them in their struggle against evil, pray for them, and cause them to die when their time comes. Jinn (the “genies” of the Arabian Nights) are made of fire, can live on the face of the earth or inside it, can move very swiftly, and are invisible, though they may become visible to humans. They have the power of moral choice and are commanded to serve God just as humans are. Some are believers, and some are not. They will be resurrected on the last day and go to paradise or hell. The Devil is a jinn. Satans may be humans or jinn; they tempt human beings and are enemies to prophets. We know about all of these because the Qur’an tells us. Human science knows nothing of them, though it may discover something about them some day. Awareness of these creatures expands our world beyond the limited one of physical perception.
But are humans really free in their moral choices, given that God is directly involved in determining everything that happens? Like earlier Muslim theologians, Qutb seeks to affirm both (this is one of the ways the Islamic tasawwur is balanced). He states that the human will works within the bounds of divine determination and that this divine determination is realized through human will. The precise relationship between them is one of those things that are beyond the capacity of human reason to comprehend. Some degree of human freedom is necessary for moral responsibility and for the activist position that Qutb took, while certainty that God is in control is important for the small, struggling revolutionary movement of which he was a part.
But why does evil exist at all and why do good people suffer? From time to time Qutb suggests various partial answers to the latter question. People suffer because they violate the physical or moral laws, or God causes them to suffer to teach them or to provide challenges. This world is a place of trial and striving, and the suffering of a good person will be compensated in the future life, and possibly also in this life. As to why God did not create a world without suffering and evil, this question is not raised by sincere believers, who respect God too much and know that the issue is beyond the capacity of the human intellect to deal with, nor is it raised by serious atheists since they do not believe in God. It is raised by those who are argumentative or not serious.
How do humans know of God and of the truths enshrined in the Islamic tasawwur? The human fitra can perceive something about God in the harmony of the universe that He has created and runs (that is, the Teleological Argument), but of primary importance is God’s word revealed to messengers to whom He has given a special nature that allows them to receive His messages and particularly that given to the Prophet Muhammad in the Qur’an. The text of the Qur’an contains the verbatim words of God and provides information about God, the universe, aspects of human, divine moral and legal commands, and the final judgment of human by God. It calls on humans to reflect on the signs of God in the harmony of the universe. It is from the Qur’an that the Islamic tasawwur is directly and exclusively derived.
The Qur’an speaks to all aspects of the human fitra, not only to reason but also to the emotions and the aesthetic sense. According to Qutb and most Muslims, it has the power to influence people directly through these. Qutb gives examples of this, including one in which a woman was converted to Islam by hearing the recitation of the Qur’an. In the years before he embraced Islamism, Qutb wrote two books exploring the literary nature of the Qur’an (Artistic Depiction in the Qur’an and Scenes of the Resurrection in the Qur’an) and concluded that its power comes from producing extremely evocative word pictures for the reader. He appears to have continued to hold this theory in his Islamist period though not limiting the power of the Qur’an to it.
Qutb generally insists on interpreting the text in terms of its plain meaning, but in the case of realities that are beyond human comprehension he understands it to provide allusions that inspire the human soul. These realities include the divine essence, the connection between will of creator and creation, and the nature of the spirit. For the rest, reason can receive the revelation and interpret it, along with other faculties. On the whole, Qutb avoids metaphorical or esoteric interpretations of the Qur’an.
One should seek and may derive direct inspiration from the Qur’an, especially if one has a close and ongoing relation to it. Qutb claims to have lived for years “in the shadow of the Qur’an” (this is also the title of his Qur’an commentary). Especially important is the intention to act on what one reads. One is not to read the Qur’an simply as a devotional exercise, or to get information, but to find out what God wants one to do at a particular time and to do it. Qutb is convinced that the Qur’an will guide such a person. (This is part of what is meant by saying that the tasawwur is practical). One will not truly understand the Qur’an unless one is engaged in the struggle (jihad) for an Islamic society.
For most Muslims, the Sunna (words and deeds) of the Prophet Muhammad is authoritative along with the Qur’an; and also authoritative is the tradition of scholarship related to these. Qutb likewise relies on the Sunna and, somewhat selectively, on the later tradition. He emphasizes the Qur’an, however, more than most. He also emphasizes the generation of Muslims contemporary with Muhammad, the “Unique Qur’anic Generation” as he terms them. This generation was present at the time of revelation and drew their understanding of life and their duties exclusively from it; they received it with the intention to obey as a soldier would receive marching orders for the day; also, they broke completely with their former life. No later generation has equalled them, but they should be the model for Islamic activists today.
Still, there are many areas of life in which human reason is sufficient for understanding and making discoveries, and in so doing fulfilling part of the human role as God’s khalifa. These involve what Qutb calls the “pure” sciences, mainly the physical sciences insofar as they do not involve moral or metaphysical issues.
Splitting the atom would be included but not its use in atomic bombs. Biology is included but not Darwinian evolution. The Islamic tasawwur encourages this kind of science. It does not have the certainty of revelation but, properly done, it will not conflict with revelation. Qutb speaks of the “open book of the universe” (possibly echoing the 19th century Indian modernist, Sayyid Ahmad Khan). In fact, Western science is historically rooted in the past scientific activities of Muslims. It has developed in an anti-religious direction, but Islam can purify this science and put it on the sound basis of the fitra.
General ethical values are of course part of the Islamic tasawwur. They are fixed and do not “develop” over time, although their application may vary. They provide a “fixed axis” and “fixed framework” around and within which human activity takes place. These values are not scattered or ad hoc but are systematic, constituting a complete system for all of life. As they derive from the one God, they unify humans with the creation and its Creator, and integrate individual personalities. To be valid, ethical action must be accompanied by faith in this God. Because they come from God, they provide a greater sense of obligation than secular morality can. Qutb criticizes various forms of secular morality at length.
In principle, there is no grey area in Qutb’s ethics. The contrast is stark between guidance and error, faith and kufr (unbelief, wilful rejection of faith), tawhid (recognition of God’s unity) and shirk (ascribing divinity to other beings than God). Along with this, however, he recognized that although basic ethical values do not change, their application does change with changing times and situations, both of which are experienced very much by modern revolutionaries.
The specific ethical rules and values are enshrined in the Shari’a, to which Qutb makes very frequent reference. This is commonly called the law of God but is more accurately described as a moral classification by God of all human actions into five categories: obligatory, approved, neutral, reprehensible or forbidden. The human understanding of the Shari’a is called fiqh (“understanding”) and is based on the Qur’an and the Sunna of the Prophet, along with the effort (ijtihad) of later scholars to interpret and apply these. Among Sunnis, the consensus of these scholars on any ruling has been considered to guarantee its validity, with the result that the scope for ijtihad has diminished over time. One of the major issues of modern times has been the degree of freedom contemporary interpreters should have to reverse past rulings in the light of current needs. Modernists seek a high degree of freedom in order to bring fiqh in line with prevailing values derived from the West. Qutb opposes ijtihad for this purpose, which he considers defeatism in the face of the West, and insists that there should be no ijtihad where there is a clear and authoritative text. He favors it, however, where, in his view, it represents an authentic Islamic response to current conditions. He calls this fiqh haraki (that is, a fiqh that reflects changing human activities or needs of the current Islamic movement). He also indicates approval of the unfettered use of the principle of public interest (maslaha), a principle recognized in traditional fiqh but usually with restrictions. At the same time, he regularly canvasses the views of earlier scholars on specific matters and sometimes accepts them. All of this accords with his claim that the Islamic tasawwur is realistic and practical. The term Shari’a is to some extent interchangeable or correlated with the term manhaj, and he seems to see the Shari’a as part of the Islamic manhaj. Qutb also claims that the Shari’a is perfectly harmonious with the general laws of the universe, including the physical laws of human biology, and is the only means by which the voluntary life of humans can be integrated with them, as briefly mentioned above.
The ideal society is one that recognizes the sovereignty of God alone, not the people, the nation, or the human ruler, and is governed by the Islamic Shari’a. Since the Shari’a is part of God’s overall law for the universe, a society truly governed by it will be in accord with the whole of the universe and with the human nature and needs of its members. It will be just, progressive, and tolerant. Class, racial, and ethnic distinctions will not influence people’s status, but rather piety, virtue, and competence. It will be a society in which people generally know who the virtuous and competent are and can choose them for leadership. He backs this up with descriptions of the society governed by the prophet Muhammad and his earliest successors, especially in Social Justice in Islam. Though the historical critic would probably claim that he is selective in his examples, Qutb’s view is that the history of Islam is not identical to the whole history of those societies called Muslim, but to the history of those societies insofar as they were truly following the Shari’a and implementing Islam.
While class, racial, and ethnic differences will not matter, religious differences will matter since the society is based on a religious creed. Qutb sometimes states that people have absolute freedom of conscience in matters of belief and that the freedom of any individual to hold and propagate his religious belief, free of compulsion, is a fundamental human right. It is not clear just how far this goes, however. No one should be forcibly converted to Islam. Jews and Christians (and possibly others) will have a place in society as granted by the Qur’an and Sunna. They may follow their own creeds and rites of worship but are limited in some areas, as specified in the traditional idea of dhimma (protected status), which Qutb generally accepts and defends. For example, they will pay a special tax called jizya, for which Qutb gives three reasons: it is a symbol of their acceptance of Islamic rule, it is in return for their protection by the Islamic government, and it contributes to the social expenses of the state. While dhimmis would be granted freedom of belief and worship, and Qutb speaks of freedom to propagate religious belief, it seems unlikely that a state run on Qutb’s interpretation would allow non-Islamic religious views to be propagated freely, among Muslims or anti-religious views at all. This is especially the case given Qutb’s view that Islam alone is the true religion and his statement in at least one place that abandoning the truth is corruption. Such a state would hardly accept the kind of religious pluralism, the legal equality in principle of all religions, assumed by many Westerners and others.
An Islamic government will be governed by the principle of consultation (shura). Qutb gives many examples of it from the early days of Islam. The exact form of shura varies with circumstances and, in accordance with the realistic and practical nature of the Islamic tasawwur, will be determined only when such a government is actually formed. Nevertheless, in a least one place he does outline a structure of government involving a ruler (imam) nominated by the recognized leaders of the community (literally: “people of binding and loosing”, a recognized phrase in Arabic) and chosen by the whole community. There will also be a parliament (majlis al-shura) whose members are chosen by the people locally. The high moral tone the government is more important, however, than these details. Qutb seems to envisage the imam as a strong and righteous leader who is normally to be obeyed implicitly, but not if he commands people to disobey God. He rejects the term “democracy” because he sees it as a Western concept involving government by the people instead of by God.
For all that Qutb seems to envisage the true Islamic state and society as a kind of utopia, he recognizes that actual Islamic societies have been less than ideal, and he severely criticizes many of the historical Muslim rulers without quite calling their government and society un-Islamic. In at least one place he states a ruler may be unjust but still be considered Islamic if he basically recognizes the authority of God.
Economics in an Islamic society is based on the fact that all wealth belongs to God, who entrusts it to human societies and thence to individuals as his khalifas. On this basis, the right to private property is guaranteed as a reward for work so that individuals are encouraged to work for their own benefit and the benefit of all. This strikes a just balance between effort and reward and accords with human nature. Private property, however, is limited legally by the institution of Zakat, which requires a portion of one’s wealth to be given away and is one of the Pillars of Islam. It is also limited by the right of the political leader to tax further when this is necessary for the welfare of the community and to assist the needy, who have a recognized right to a share in the community’s wealth. Islam also opposes the concentration of wealth in a few hands, and its rules on inheritance and opposition to usury are designed to discourage this. Likewise, the community should own collectively resources needed for the general wellbeing, and these have expanded considerably in modern times. Added to all of this is the additional moral obligation on individuals to assist the needy and contribute to social causes. In discussing economics, Qutb often goes beyond what the traditional sources of authority prescribe, especially in relation to the economic power of the state. What he writes would be largely acceptable to modernists with a moderate socialist inclination.
Qutb is at pains to point out that women and men are equal in respect of their humanity as such. He even argues that Eve was not created from Adam’s rib but created in the same way as Adam (the account of Adam’s rib is not in the Qur’an but is in later sources). In temperament, however, women and men differ. Women are more emotional and men more rational. Women’s temperament fits them for raising children and other domestic tasks, whereas men are more fitted for the world of work outside the home. Hence, men have the right to leadership within the family and women the right to protection.
The family is the basic unit of society and the institution that produces human values; its place is rooted in the cosmic order. Obedience to God in matters relating to marriage, divorce, and family is service to God no less than formal prayer. Thus, women’s primary role of caring for the family is extremely important. For this reason, women should not work outside the home unless it is absolutely necessary. Moreover, those who do are likely to be exploited both sexually and economically, turned into sex objects and underpaid. He also believes that young children should be cared for within the home, not in crèches. He draws on his experiences in the United States, among other things, to support these points. All of these things characterize a jahili society, according to him. He also argued that Western women sought election to parliament because men had been making laws unfair to women, but under a system of divinely based law the laws will be fair.
Women should dress in a manner that shows only their faces and hands but not be secluded, as in some societies. They also should not mix publicly with men as this may lead to promiscuity and weaken marriages. He defends divorce and polygyny, at least under certain conditions. If these seem to make women insecure it is because the present society is jahili and not sufficiently attuned to Islamic values. Although Muslim men are permitted in traditional fiqh to marry Jewish or Christian women, Qutb is inclined to oppose this today since it may weaken Muslims’ faith and sense of identity, given that current Muslim societies are only nominally Muslim. It is worth noting that Qutb evidently had no objection to women’s involvement in the Islamic movement. Both of his sisters were involved, and one went to prison. He was also a mentor to Zaynab al-Ghazali, a well-known woman Islamic activist in Egypt who had put into her marriage contract that her husband would not interfere with her Islamist activities.
Any society that is not governed according to the Shari’a is a jahili society. The term jahiliyya literally means ignorance with a connotation of barbarism and has most often been applied to the Arabian society on the eve of Muhammad’s mission. The term and general idea come from Mawdudi, but Qutb makes it more extreme. For Mawdudi, contemporary Muslim societies are part Muslim and part jahili, while for Qutb there is no such mid-term. The contrast is stark: a society is either Islamic or jahili. A jahili society compels or at least pressures its member to serve other humans rather than God, and its leaders presume to create values and laws rather than apply the values and laws of God, effectively claiming divine attributes and making themselves gods beside God. The moral, psychological, and social results are disastrous, though it is not these results these results that define a jahili society. Many states claim to be Islamic and claim that their laws are based on the Shari’a or partly so when in reality the laws are man-made and they are jahili societies. In fact, Qutb claimed that all so-called Islamic countries in his time were jahili, with the result that, as he put it, Islam does not exist. This does not mean that there are no Muslims, but it does mean that they cannot live a complete Muslim life. While Qutb labels societies jahili he is much less inclined to label individuals as unbelievers (kafir), unlike some of his Qutbist successors.
Although the line between Islam and jahiliyya is stark in principle, Qutb does not clearly indicate exactly how and where it is drawn. It seems that societies whose leaders sincerely recognize the Shari’a even if they often fall short in practice will still be Islamic, while others that appear morally superior but whose leaders do not accept the Shari’a, or who interpret it in a Westernizing way, will be jahili, though Qutb will assume that the moral difference is temporary or more apparent than real. This is consistent with Qutb’s views, mentioned above, that ideas are primary and that faith is necessary for works to be valid.
The answer to jahiliyya for Qutb is jihad. This word, which appears frequently in the Qur’an and the later tradition, means “striving” and the full phrase is “striving in the path of God”. It may take non-violent forms, such as the “greater jihad”, the struggle against evil tendencies within one’s self (referred to by the prophet), or other forms of righteous striving. In juristic and political circles, the term has mainly referred to the violent activity of war, with rules for proper behavior in warfare elaborated. Thus, the term is often translated “holy war”. This is the usage that Qutb draws on. In modern times, many Muslims have preferred to emphasize the non-violent forms of jihad and to limit violent jihad to defensive warfare. Qutb considers this defeatist and argues the need for both violence and the initiating of violence at times. Jahiliyya is not merely a condition of society but an aggressive and unrelenting force that can only finally be defeated by violence. Moreover, Muslims have an obligation not only to defend themselves but to fight tyranny wherever it appears and to remove obstacles to the preaching of Islam. Jihad is part of the Islamic mission to liberate humans from servitude to other humans and realize the rule of God on earth. This is the greatest of all human tasks and one should not apologize for using force when necessary. God knows that evil must be confronted in this way. (Perhaps this attitude is not so different from the actions of Western powers fighting to spread civilization, democracy, and/or human rights.) Qutb relates the “greater jihad” to this by describing it as the inner battle of the warrior to purify himself of personal desires and any other obstacles to his serving God and establishing God’s authority on earth.
In the present situation jihad takes effectively the form of revolution, though Qutb does not use this term. (He may be influenced by Mawdudi’s book, Jihad in Islam, which explicitly calls it “revolutionary struggle”, at least in the English translation.) Individuals or groups of Muslims must come together to organize their lives on the basis of Islam, thus giving birth to a new society and isolating themselves psychologically, though not physically, from the jahili society around them. These groups will for a long time devote themselves to studying and internalizing the basic Muslim creed, there is no god but God. This is what Muhammad did for thirteen years in Mecca, before any attempt to establish an Islamic society was made. Soon enough, the Muslim group will be attacked by the jahiliyya and have to respond in ways that probably include violence until it replaces or at least holds its own against the jahiliyya. In the early stages, violence is to be avoided except for self-defence though later it may be initiated, as mentioned above. All of this according to Qutb is based on the example of the Prophet’s actions in Mecca and Medina and represents a realization of the second part of the creed, “Muhammad is the Messenger of God.”
Qutb explicitly rejects the Enlightenment idea of continuous human progress, at least in the moral area. Rather, in accordance with the traditional Muslim view, history is characterized by a series of prophetic missions, often representing moral high points, followed by decline. The first prophet was the first man, Adam. Although he and his wife disobeyed God and were expelled from Paradise, they repented and were pardoned; their pure fitra was re-established though they now lived in a world of physical and moral struggle. Many of the ensuing prophets preached to peoples who rejected them and were destroyed by God, but some, in particular Ibrahim (Abraham), Musa (Moses), Daud (David), and ‘Isa (Jesus) left continuing communities, though these communities changed the revelations they had received. Each of the messengers taught the same truths about God and the universe, though in increasingly advanced forms as befit their societies’ development, until the human race reached its maturity and Muhammad brought the final revelation and most complete and universal message, confirming but superseding the previous messages. The high point of human moral and social history was the community in Medina under the prophet and his immediate successors. The Muslim community continued for some twelve centuries, often prospering politically and culturally though declining morally.
In the West, a corrupted form of Christianity was imposed on people and this eventually led to a rebellion against religion and to the anti-religious philosophies (“Positivism”, “Dialectical Materialism”, etc.) so prevalent by the twentieth century. The West also began to attack the Muslim world militarily during the medieval crusades and this crusading continued later in the form of Western imperialism. This is a common idea among Islamists today, who regularly refer to Westerners as crusaders. As a result of Western imperialism, Muslim societies began to adopt Western ways and abandoned the Shari’a, often without admitting it, so that by Qutb’s time there was no longer a truly Islamic society anywhere. The whole world is in a state of jahiliyya, and this jahiliyya, because of its material advancement and sophistication, is deeper than previous ones. Although the previous wave of Islam has left some traces, such as the idea of the unity of the human race, that might ease the rebirth of Islam, this will happen only by God’s will working through Islamic activists. A new Islamic society will not be morally better than the “unique Qur’anic generation” except (one may note, though Qutb does not say) that its moral status will be linked to much better technology.
Qutb held to the traditional view that death is followed by resurrection on the Last Day, by divine judgment on the basis on one’s action, and a final abode in paradise or hell. This, finally, is the greatest motive for service to God in this life. How God will raise people to life after they are dead is one of the divine secrets that human reason cannot understand, just as it cannot understand the secret of life generally. He seems to take the Qur’anic descriptions of judgment, heaven, and hell, at face value, sometimes analysing the language and literary force of the accounts. These scenes are related to this world since worldly actions lead to them and worldly joy and suffering foreshadow them. They also widen the individual’s perspective beyond the bounds of this life. He also held to the common view that God has fixed the date of each person’s death, a good reason to risk martyrdom in revolutionary action.
The situation of martyrs, those who die in jihad, is distinctive. The Qur’an says, “Do not say of those who are killed in the path of God, ‘They are dead.’ They are alive . . .” (Qur’an 2:154; 3:169). Qutb says that they are alive in the sense that they continue to be an active force directing the community, but that they also may be more literally alive on another level of existence that we cannot conceive of. Toward the end of Milestones, he says that martyrs receive three rewards: contentment and freedom from fear and sorrow, praise from angels and humans and favorable accounting in the final judgment (I have seen no mention of 72 virgins, however). Qutb is considered a martyr by many, probably most, Muslims. It is reported that on learning that he was to be executed he praised God for earning martyrdom. Both Zaynab al-Ghazali and Qutb’s sister, Hamida, claimed to have had visions just after his death assuring them that he is in paradise.
Qutb’s ideas, strengthened by his status as a martyr, have had considerable influence among Muslims. His close linking of belief in one God with the need for the rule of a divinely derived law, and his insistence on a clear line between Islam and non-Islam, has strengthened Islamism generally. His understanding of jahiliyya has broadened the scope and depth of the struggle. His conceptualization of the movement as one for “liberation” resonates with many people, as does his view that all forms of activity should be service to God. His understanding of jihad and his own martyrdom has strengthened the willingness for both violence and self-sacrifice. One young man, who was moved by his execution to join an Islamist cell, was Ayman al-Zawahiri, who later became a leader in the radical group Tanzim al-Jihad, and still later leader of al-Qaeda. Within the Muslim Brothers organization, Qutb’s legacy has been ambivalent, a threat to their ability to function with some freedom, but not possible to ignore. In 2009, his ideas were at the forefront of a debate between those who wanted less accommodation to secular society and those who wanted more.
Those who particularly claim to follow his legacy, mostly outside the Brothers, have commonly been called Qutbists or Qutbians. They include the so-called Takfir wa Hijra (the label refers to their condemnation of society and separation from it), Jama‘a Islamiyya (Islamic Group), and Tanzim al-Jihad (Jihad Organization) in Egypt, and al-Qaeda. (It is not clear where “Islamic State” or ISIS stands on Qutb.) They tend to simplify Qutb’s ideas or take them to extremes that he might not have accepted. This article considers their interpretations of some of Qutb’s ideas.
Qutb’s idea of jahiliyya is a fairly easy idea to misunderstand. It has often been interpreted as takfir, the declaration of individuals as unbelievers or apostates, usually applied to enemies or government representatives. Jama‘a Islamiyya and Tanzim al-Jihad spoke more of kufr than jahiliyya. They considered Egyptian society as a whole to be Muslims and only the leaders of society to be kafirs. On this assumption, some of the Tanzim al-Jihad members assassinated the Egyptian president in 1981, hoping by this to spark a revolt and overthrow the government, something that did not happen. On Qutb’s view of jahiliyya, this effort would have been hopelessly misguided and premature.
The leader of the so-called Takfir wa Hijra group, who had reportedly studied Qutb’s writings in prison, accepted the claim that the whole Egyptian society was jahili, but with a more extreme interpretation than Qutb’s. He claimed that any of its members who left his group were abandoning Islam and that the standard Friday prayers were illicit in a jahili society. He also tried to isolate the group physically from society more than Qutb called for. Outsiders have interpreted its position as takfir and apparently insiders have too, since they came to accept the label.
The distinction between the “near enemy” (their own rulers) and the “far enemy” (for example, Israel and the United States) made by the Jama‘a Islamiyya and Tanzim al-Jihad, and their choice to attack the “near enemies” first, does owe something to Qutb’s idea of jahiliyya, since this idea removes Egyptian society from the category of Islamic. Al-Qaeda’s view of the world-wide struggle also seems to fit Qutb’s idea, though al-Qaeda changed the priority to the “far enemy”. Qutb might have accepted this as a practical example of flexibility after the attack on the “near enemy” failed.
Qutb called for a long period of preparation before engaging in jihad, but Tanzim al-Jihad and Jama‘a Islamiyya advocated immediate action. While al-Qaeda trains its recruits militarily and indoctrinates them, it does not appear to provide the sort of long term spiritual preparation Qutb had in mind. The leader of Takfir wa-Hijra appreciated the need for a long period of preparation, which is one of the reasons he sought to isolate the group. He hoped to build a model community that would eventually be strong enough to bring down the government. Unfortunately for them, police arrested some of the group and the group in return kidnapped a former government minister, whom they killed when the government refused to release the prisoners. The government then cracked down and succeed in capturing and executing the group’s leaders.
While Qutb defended the need for, and almost the inevitability of, violence in certain circumstances, this was to counter those who downplayed it, often for apologetic reasons. It is doubtful (though impossible to know) whether Qutb would have approved of the terrorist activities of the Qutbist groups. For the most part, they do not make sense if jahiliyya is as deeply rooted as Qutb claims and, in any case, Qutb accepted the traditional fiqh view that non-combatants should not be targeted. Also, revenge has often been a motive for violent actions, but Qutb appears to have rejected that motive. Perhaps the most important contribution of Qutb’s theories is that they remove the legitimacy from the existing authorities for his followers and make the followers look ultimately like “paper tigers.”
Qutb has been criticized by traditional scholars on particular points of fiqh and history and generally for making judgments about religion without the sort of training they consider necessary. Also, Sunnis have generally taken the position that for this worldly purpose a person is to be treated as Muslim if he is outwardly one, whatever his behaviour, and likewise, the government is to be treated as Muslim as long as the rulers are outwardly so. Many see Qutb’s views about jahiliyya and jihad as violations of this.
Many who are not radical Islamists still appreciate many of Qutb’s ideas and ultimate goals. Often it is argued that his extreme views were the result of his imprisonment and torture and that, had he lived longer, his ideas and activities would have developed in a more moderate direction. They also like to call attention to his earlier works, which contain less extreme views than those discussed in this article.
There is a strongly aesthetic dimension to Qutb’s writing, and one could say that its master theme is harmony. God’s universe is a perfectly harmonious system into which everything fits beautifully and practically. This universe is friendly to life, and human life can be in full harmony with it and blessed. Disharmony comes when humans act in ways that contravene the ways God has set out for them. The beauty of God’s harmony makes the disharmony introduced by humans all the worse, like a beautiful painting disfigured. Hence the horror of jahiliyya and seriousness of the effort to end it.
Connected with this is the resolutely essentialist nature of Qutb’s thinking. Everything is essentialized, including nature, humanity, gender, Islam, the West, jahiliyya, Shari’a, belief, and unbelief. Perhaps God is a partial exception, since His essence is unknowable and His freedom to produce miracles may break the regularities on which human essentialism depends. A major aspect of this essentialism is the dichotomously “Manichean” way in which he treats good and evil. As mentioned above, there is no mid-term between guidance and error, faith and unbelief, tawhid and shirk, or between Islam and jahiliyya or Shari’a and human legislation, Although the interpretation of the Shari’a may require human effort (ijtihad), and its application may vary with circumstances, the difference in principle between divinely sourced and humanly sourced is stark.
This combination of aesthetics, essentialism, and “Manicheism,” while very much open to criticism from scientists and philosophers, is undoubtedly one of the keys to the power of his ideology. The strong contrast between good and evil, the sense that evil is currently in charge in the world though good is in ultimate control, and the conviction that something can be done must and must be done at any cost to change this situation has characterized and driven many a revolutionary ideology.
- Qutb, Sayyid, In the Shade of the Qur’an (Fi zilal al-Qur’an), 18 vols, Translated & Edited by: M.A. Salahi & A.A Shamis, Leicester, UK: The Islamic Foundation, 1999-2005.
- Qutb’s massive and popular commentary on the Qur’an. Much of it was written before his most radical period but the first 13 (of 30) parts were revised during that period.
- Qutb, Sayyid, The Islamic Concept and its Characteristics (Khasa’is al-tasawwur al-islami wa-muqawwimatuhu), trans. Mohammed M. Siddiqui. Indianapolis: American Trust Publications, 1991.
- The most “philosophical” of Qutb’s late works, used considerably for this article. It is the first of two volumes on the subject; the second has not been translated into English.
- Qutb, Sayyid, Basic Principles of the Islamic Worldview, trans. Rami David. North Haledon, N.J.: Islamic Publications International IPI, 2006.
- A later translation of the same work as above.
- Qutb, Sayyid, Islam: The Religion of the Future (Al-mustaqbal li-hadha al-din), translator not given. Beirut and Damascus: The Holy Koran Publishing House, n.d.
- A shorter book stating main point and emphasizing the need of humanity for Islam. Comments on quotes from Alexis Carrel and John Foster Dulles.
- Qutb, Sayyid, Milestones (Ma‘alim fi al-tariq), trans. S. Badrul Hasan [?]. Kuwait: International Islamic Federation of Student Organizations, 1978. Also, Lahore: Kazi Publications, nd. The title is sometimes translated “Signposts”.
- Qutb’s best known radical work, a handbook for Islamic revolution.
- Qutb, Sayyid, Milestones, “revised translation”, translator not given. Indianapolis: American Trust Publications, 1990.
- Claims to provide “a fresh editing and rereading” but I cannot confirm that does so from what I have read of it.
- Qutb, Sayyid, This Religion of Islam (Hadha al-din), translator not given. Kuwait: International Islamic Federation of Student Organizations, 1972.
- Summarizes the characteristics of the Islamic manhaj and its positive effect on the world in the past. Relatively optimistic.
- [Qutb, Sayyid] Sayyid Qutb and Islamic Activism: A translation and critical analysis of Social Justice in Islam (Al-‘adala al-ijtima‘iyya fi al-islam). By William Shepard, Leiden: Brill, 1996.
- Last edition of Qutb’s major work on Islamic social and political teachings. Comparisons are made with earlier editions.
- The Sayyid Qutb Reader, ed. Albert J. Bergesen. Routledge, 2007.
- Includes an introduction to Qutb’s career and ideas, and selections mainly from the radical parts of In the Shade of the Qur’an , along with some from Milestones, Social Justice in Islam, and A Child from the Village (autobiographical account of his childhood village, written before he became Islamist).
- Abu-Rabi‘, Ibrahim, Intellectual Origins of Islamic Resurgence in the Modern Arab World. Albany: SUNY Press, 1996.
- Chapter 3 deals with the Muslim Brothers and chapters 4 to 6 cover Qutb’s pre-Islamist, early Islamist and later Islamist thinking.
- Calvert, John, Sayyid Qutb and the Origins of Radical Islamism. New York: Columbia University Press, 2010.
- Excellent study of Qutb’s activities and writings during both is secularist and Islamist period; with helpful information on the social and political background and a survey of later “Qutbists”.
- Carré, Olivier, Mysticism and Politics: A Critical Reading of Fî Zilal al-Qur’an by Sayyid Qutb (1906-1966), Leiden, Boston: Brill, 2003.
- An in-depth study of Qutb’s Qur’an commentary. Includes selections from the text.
- Haddad, Yvonne Y., ‘Sayyid Qutb: Ideologue of Islamic Revival’, ch. 4 in Voices of Resurgent Islam, ed. J. Esposito. New York and Oxford: Oxford U. P., 1983.
- Includes a discussion of Qutb’s main concepts.
- Kepel, Gilles, Muslim Extremism in Egypt: The Prophet and the Pharoah. Berkeley & Los Angeles, 1986 and Berkeley: University of California Press, 2003.
- Chapters 1 and 2 discuss Qutb’s last years and Milestones. The rest of the book deals with later radical groups in Egypt.
- Musallam, Adnan, From Secularism to Jihad: Sayyid Qutb and the Foundations of Radical Islamism. Praeger, 2005.
- Thoughtful account of the whole of Qutb’s life, career and writings, especially good on the earlier years. Also deals with Qutb’s influence on later radicals.
- Shepard, William, “Sayyid Qutb’s doctrine of Jahiliyya “, International Journal of Middle East Studies 35/4 (Nov. 2003): 521-545.
- Discusses the background to and components of this doctrine.
- Shepard, W., “Islam as a ‘System’ in the Later Writings of Sayyid Qutb”, Middle Eastern Studies 25/1 (January 1989): 31-50.
- Discusses key terms such as tasawwur and manhaj.
- Toth, James. Sayyid Qutb: The Life and Legacy of a Radical Islamic Intellectual. Oxford: Oxford UP, 2013.
- A good study of Qutb’s life and ideas with a lot of interesting information.
William E. Shepard
University of Canterbury