Referential Opacity

The problem of referential opacity is to explain why a certain inference rule of classical logic about substitution of different terms for the same object sometimes will produce invalid inferences when applied to ascriptions of mental states. Here is an example involving the mental state of Lois Lane, who admires Superman. She does not know Superman is her coworker Clark Kent, and she does not admire Clark Kent. Yet the inference rule apparently allows the following invalid inference:

   Lois Lane admires Superman.

   Superman is Clark Kent.

   So, Lois Lane admires Clark Kent.

The inference rule is commonly called Leibniz’s Law, or Substitutivity of Identicals, or Identity Elimination. The problem it creates is called Frege’s Puzzle and the problem of referential opacity, but because the word “opacity” presumes a particular theory, this article often uses the more neutral name of the problem “(apparent) substitution-failure.” The phrase “Leibniz’s Law” is used for

(1)
If x and y are the same object, then x and y have the same properties.

And the terms “Identity Elimination” and “Substitutivity of Identicals” are reserved for a specific rule “E=” about substitution during an inference.

To turn Leibniz’s Law (1) into a rule of inference, we need to specify the form of the rule as it applies within language. To do this, we say the rule of Identity Elimination (=E) permits substitution, into a sentence, of a term for another term that denotes the same object in the following manner. The rule applies to a major premise which is an

identity sentence and a minor premise which uses the term on the left of the major premise. For example, the rule =E permits this benign inference:

Istanbul straddles Europe and Asia.
Istanbul is identical to Constantinople.
So, Constantinople straddles Europe and Asia.

This particular application of the rule produces a valid argument. However, applications of the rule in other sentences sometime produces suspicious results and thus the problem of apparent substitution-failure. Philosophers of language disagree about how to solve the problem.

The problem was introduced into modern discussion by Quine (1956, 1961). Important early contributions include Marcus (1961, 1962, 1975) and Smullyan (1948). Influential engagements with Quine are the works by Kaplan (1986) and Fine (1989). However, the essential problem was raised in the seminal (Frege 1892), and so it is also known as Frege’s Puzzle.

Table of Contents

  1. Identity Elimination and Its Misuses
    1. Quotation
    2. “So-Called”
    3. Modality
  2. The De Re/De Dicto Distinction
    1. Defining the Distinction
    2. Skepticism about the Distinction
    3. The de re and Leibniz’s Law
  3. Frege’s Theory of Substitution-Resistance
    1. The Sense/Reference Distinction Applied to Attitude Ascriptions
    2. The Hierarchy Problem
    3. The Semantic Innocence Objection
    4. Do Name-Senses Exist Anyway?
    5. Alternative Accounts of the Sense of a Name
  4. Hidden-Indexical Semantics
    1. Two Kinds of Hidden-Indexical Theories
    2. Kripke’s Puzzle
  5. Russellianism
    1. Salmon’s Theory
    2. Commonsense Psychology
    3. Saul on Simple Sentences
    4. Richard’s Phone Booth
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Identity Elimination and Its Misuses

A little more formally, the rule of inference =E can be stated as:

Identity Elimination Schema

Major: t1 = t2

Minor: ϕ(t1)

Conclusion: ϕ(t2)

Here t1 and t2 are expressions which refer to entities (for example, proper names of people or cities). ϕ(t1) is a sentence containing at least one occurrence of t1, and ϕ(t2) is a sentence that results from replacing at least one occurrence of t1 in ϕ(t1) with an occurrence of t2, eliminating the “=” of t1 = t2. Recurring ti presumes that ti is univocal throughout, and recurring ϕ presumes that the sentential context ϕ is not altered, syntactically or semantically, by the replacement. If these uniformity conditions are not met, then the inference scheme is being misapplied, and it is no wonder that false conclusions are derivable. For example, in the inference “The man behind Fred = the man in front of Bill; the man behind Fred saw him leave; therefore, the man in front of Bill saw him leave,” the context “saw him leave” is not uniform, since substitution of “the man behind Fred” by “the man in front of Bill” changes the reference of “him” (Fine 1989:222–3; Linsky 1967:104).

In discussing the problem with apparent substitution-failure by using =E, many examples will be drawn from the fictional story of Superman, treated as if it were true. In the story, a child from the planet Krypton, Kal-El, is sent to Earth, where physical conditions cause him to acquire superpowers. Wearing specific clothing (red cape, blue jumpsuit), Kal-El prevents disasters, rescues endangered innocents, and foils would-be perpetrators of crimes, such as Lex Luthor. People call Kal-El “Superman” when talking about Kal-El’s actions of this kind.

But Kal-El also takes a day job as a reporter, using the name “Clark Kent.” A coworker, Lois Lane, treats him with indifference in the office, but has a pronounced crush on, as she would put it, Superman, unaware they are the same individual.

The problematic examples discussed below involve ascriptions of mental states to Lois (or occasionally Lex), arrived at by applying the rule =E to the major premise “Superman is Clark” and a carefully chosen minor premise. Lois has a crush on Superman (minor premise), so, by =E, Lois has a crush on Clark. But this latter seems false, and would certainly be rejected by Lois herself. Also, Lois believes that Superman can fly, but does not seem to believe that Clark can; she hopes to see Superman again soon, but seems not much to care when she next sees Clark; she would like a date with Superman, but apparently has no interest in one with Clark; and so on. For a problematic use of =E, consider this paradigm example:

(2)
a. Superman is Clark Kent.                                      Major
b. Lois believes that Superman can fly.             Minor
c. ∴ Lois believes that Clark Kent can fly.         a, b =E

It is not a solution to the problem of referential opacity to say that when we apply the rule in an instance like (2), the flaw is that the major premise is one that Lois does not realize is true. No doubt her ignorance explains psychologically why she does not draw the conclusion that Clark can fly, in those very words, but it does not explain semantically how the inference rule can carry us from two truths to a seeming falsehood: “Lois realizes (2a) is true” is not itself a premise for the application of the rule in (2), so its falsehood is irrelevant to what is dubious about the application. Indeed, the rule enables the inference that Lois does realize (2a) is true: simply change the minor premise of (2) to “Lois realizes Superman is Superman,” surely unobjectionable once she has acquired the name “Superman” from watching Kal-El perform heroic deeds.

Some terminology is commonly encountered in discussions of cases like (2). Mental-state ascriptions like (2b) and (2c) are called attitude ascriptions, since the subject is being ascribed a mental attitude. When the thing the attitude is toward is specified by a “that”-clause (or by a clause complementized by “if” or “whether”), the ascription is called a propositional attitude ascription. This is because the “that”-clause is standardly taken to specify a proposition, the one expressed by the sentence which “that” prefixes (but see, for example, Davidson 1969, Bach 1997, and Moltmann 2003, 2008, 2017 for criticism of this). So (2b) says that Lois has the attitude of belief toward the proposition that Superman can fly. The sentence following the “that” in (2b) and (2c) is called the content-sentence, though in English, “that” can often be dropped (it is not obligatory in (2b) and (2c)).

a. Quotation

There is mileage to be gained from the idea that the reason we get counterintuitive instances such as (2) is that the rule of =E is being misapplied in some way, or, relatedly, that the rule as formulated is not a faithful reflection of the motivation provided by Leibniz’s Law, as stated in (1)—a better formulation would have to be misapplied to get (2). There are some well-known cases of misapplication of the rule which motivate critiques of (2) as a relevantly similar misapplication. One sort of case, emphasized by Quine (1961), is

(3)
a. Istanbul is Constantinople.
b. “Istanbul” has eight letters.
c. ∴ “Constantinople” has eight letters.

This is a misapplication of =E because the name “Istanbul” does not occur univocally in (3). In the major premise, it is used in the normal way to refer to a certain city. But in the minor premise, it is not used to refer to that city (perhaps it is not used to refer at all). Rather, it occurs as part of the complex quotation-name “‘Istanbul,’” referring to the name “Istanbul,” not the city Istanbul (this is a Tarskian rather than Fregean account of quotation—see further Richard 1986, Washington 1992, Saka 2006—but the nonuniformity objection to (3) holds on either). (3b) correctly predicates “has eight letters” of the word “Istanbul,” as opposed to unintelligibly predicating “has eight letters” of the city Istanbul. So (3) has no more force than a variant in which the minor premise reads “the first name used in (3a) has eight letters” and the conclusion reads “the second name used in (3a) has eight letters,” and which at best seems to presume the absurd principle that if two names refer to the same thing then they have the same number of letters.

Quine thought examples like (3) instructive. The position of “Istanbul” in (3b) is not open to substitution, like the position of “Superman” in (2b), and “Istanbul” does not seem to be referring normally in (3b), so perhaps the same should be said of “Superman” in (2b): the position “Superman” occupies in (2b) is referentially opaque, hence the terminology. But it is unclear how instructive (3) really is. Quine suggests (1956:186) that we should give “serious consideration” to construing mental state ascriptions such as (2b) as involving quotation. (2b) so-construed would say that Lois believes-true “Superman can fly” as a sentence of English.

But he immediately hedges by adding that this “is not to suggest that the subject speaks the language of the quotation, or any language…We may treat a mouse’s fear of the cat as his fearing-true a certain English sentence.” Unfortunately, we are left in the dark about what it is to believe-true or fear-true a sentence as a sentence of L when one does not know L. Quine then admits that the quotational construal of mental state ascriptions will only yield a “systematic agreement in truth-value…and no more.” But even that is doubtful. If “believes-true … as a sentence of L” is simply jargon for “believes that … is true-in-L,” a monolingual Czech who believes that Superman can fly would not do so according to this analysis (she may not even have heard of English); conversely, she may believe that “Superman can fly” is an example of a sentence that is true in English, because she has been told so by a reliable informant; clearly, this does not mean she believes Superman can fly, since she does not know what “fly” means. (See Church 1950 for a famous discussion of quotational accounts, and Schweizer 1993 for a technical investigation of quotational accounts of modal logic.)

A quotational account that does rather better, Quine notes, is that (2b) says that Lois believes the meaning of “Superman can fly,” which avoids the problem of the monolingual Czech. But then it is not really the presence of quotation that is blocking substitution. For if this new quotational account is correct, (2) is valid reasoning if (2a) guarantees that “Superman can fly” and “Clark can fly” mean the same. So (2)’s being a fallacy will require that (2a) not be sufficient for these two sentences to mean the same. This in turn seems to require an account of names on which names can be coreferential yet, one way or another, differ in meaning; and indeed, some accounts to be considered below pursue this. And then substitution-resistance need not be pinned on the presence of quotation.

b. “So-Called”

Quine has another example of misapplication of =E, but one which tends to undermine the thought that there is something referentially peculiar about the position occupied by the substitution-resistant name (though he appears to regard the example as supporting this idea). His well-known “Giorgione” case (Quine 1961:17) is as follows:

(4)
a. Giorgione is Barbarelli.
b. Giorgione is so-called because of his size.
c. ∴ Barbarelli is so-called because of his size.

In (4), there is nothing unusual about the way in which any of the names is used: in each use, there is simply reference to a certain artist. The reason the inference fails to be a legal application of =E is that the sentential context “is so-called because of his size” does not recur uniformly, since the reference of “so” changes in moving from (4b) to (4c): in (4b), “so” refers to the name “Giorgione,” but in (4c), it refers to the name “Barbarelli.” The supposed application of =E is therefore a simple fallacy of equivocation, brought about by the substitution having a hidden truth-condition-altering side-effect (altering the reference of “so”). But it may be an instructive fallacy, if anything like a covert “so” is present in attitude ascriptions. (For other examples of nonuniformity, see Fine 1989:222–36; for more on “so-called,” Forbes 2006:154–7, Corazza 2010, and Predelli 2010.)

c. Modality

Our last example of misuse of =E involves intensional operators, which are operators which do not allow interchange within their scope of accidentally coextensive expressions (two predicates are coextensive if and only if (iff ) they actually apply to exactly the same things, and accidentally coextensive iff they are coextensive, but there could have been something to which one applies and the other does not; two sentences are accidentally coextensive iff they have the same actual truth-value but could have differed in truth-value). The standard cases of intensional operators are modal operators such as “it is necessary that,” “it is possible that,” and “it is contingent that.”

To illustrate how intensional operators can induce failure of substitution of accidentally coextensive predicates, suppose I have in my garage three cars, all

Bentley racing cars from the 1920s, and that these are the only three in existence (the only three that Bentley ever built). Then for any x, x is a car in my garage iff x is a Bentley racing car. But it surely could have been that a car in my garage is not a Bentley, in the sense that there is a way things could have gone as a result of which a car from a different manufacturer ends up in my garage. By contrast, it is not possible that a Bentley racing car is not a Bentley. The problem is that the two predicates “x is a car in my garage” and “x is a Bentley racing car” are only accidentally coextensive, while modal operators are sensitive to what might be called the “modal profile” of expressions within their scope: the array of semantic values they have, sets in the case of predicates, across ways things could have gone, or “possible worlds.” “x is a car in my garage” and “x is a Bentley racing car” would have the same modal profile iff at each world, the set of things the first applies to is the same set as the set of things the second applies to. But as we have said, there is a possible world w where the set of things one predicate applies to is different from the set of things the other applies to, since there is, say, a Bugatti in my garage in w. As the example shows, attempts to substitute predicates which are not necessarily coextensive within the scope of a modal operator easily go awry, resulting in absurdities such as a Bentley that is not a Bentley: within the scope of “possibly” or “it could have been that,” “car in my garage” cannot be replaced by the accidentally coextensive “Bentley racing car” in the sentence “a car in my garage isn’t a Bentley.”

The same can happen with expressions which are accidentally coreferential. Suppose there are nine planets in our solar system, and that this is a contingent fact: there could have been more or fewer planets (on that definition of “planet”).

Then the following use of =E derives a false conclusion from true premises:

(5)
a. The number of planets = 32
b. It is contingent that the number of planets = 9
c. ∴ It is contingent that 32 = 9.

The conclusion is false because true mathematical identities such as “32 = 9” are the paradigm cases of necessary truths: in every way things could have gone, the number 9 is the outcome when the number 3 is multiplied by itself.

(5) differs from previous examples in that one of the terms in the major premise, “the number of planets,” is not a proper name, but rather what is called a singular definite description: “definite” because “the” coupled with a singular nominal implies exactly one, and “description” because the expression, if it picks out anything, picks out the individual that is the unique satisfier of the descriptive condition “F” in “the F,” in this case “number of planets.”

However, definite descriptions can be classified in at least two ways. One option is that they are treated as belonging to a unitary semantic category of singular terms, together with other grammatical categories such as proper names, demonstratives, and indexicals: expressions of all these types “designate” objects. The classification of definite descriptions with names goes back to Frege (1892). The other approach classifies a definite description “the F” as a first-order quantifier, like “some F,” “each F,” “no F,” and so on (the apparent structural similarity between “the F is G” and “{some/each/no} F is G” is seen as genuine). A quantifier like “some F” is a combination of a det(erminer) “some” with a predicate F, that then combines with a second predicate. In “(det F is G),” “F” is the restriction, or restrictor, in the quantifier “det F,” and “is G” is the quantifier’s scope. In symbols, to take a simple example, “no dog barked” would be represented as “(no x: x is a dog)[x barked],” and so by parallelism, “the dog barked” would be “(the x: x is a dog)[x barked]”: as in English, only det changes as we formalize “the dog barked,” “each dog barked,” “some dog barked,” and so on (for further discussion, see Davies 1981:149–52). (Russell’s Theory of Descriptions (1905) is a quantificational account in the looser sense that Russell took “the F” to be an apparent singular term in need of analysis by the standard determiners some and every. There is also a “predicate” account of some descriptions, as in Fara 2001.)

Only the singular-term account of descriptions raises the problem of referential opacity, for if the descriptions in (5a) are quantifiers rather than singular terms, they are not referential and =E could not be applied in the first place: the major premise is not of the form t1 = t2, but is rather “(the x: Fx)[(the y: Gy)[x = y]].”

However, even if descriptions are singular terms, they may be a special case semantically, which could make (5) not very illuminating about (2). Assuming the singular-term analysis, definite descriptions other than mathematical ones are, apart from certain unusual cases, nonrigid designators: they do not pick out the same object at all possible worlds (Kripke 1972, 1980:48ff). For example, the number nine is the unique satisfier of “number of planets” at the actual world, but in some other possible world, a different (natural) number is the unique satisfier, or, perhaps, there is no satisfier because there are no planets. “32” is the less common case, a rigid definite description: “32” abbreviates “the product of the number three with itself,” and nine uniquely satisfies “product of the number three with itself” at every possible world, since numbers exist in every possible world, “the number three” is another rigid description, and the product operation is the same at every possible world. (As hinted above, there are other ways of cooking up rigid descriptions; see Davies and Humberstone 1980. For more on nonrigidity, see Tichy 2004.)

According to Kripke (1972), proper names, unlike typical descriptions, are rigid designators: they denote the same object with respect to every possible world. To see the case for rigidity, suppose we say that the planet Jupiter could have failed to exist. Here we are talking about a specific heavenly body which in the actual world orbits the Sun between Mars and Saturn, but which, we might say, in certain other possible worlds, is simply never formed, because of different behavior on the part of the original protoplanetary disk, or because a physical universe never comes into existence, or for whatever possible reason. When we say that Jupiter does not exist in such circumstances, we mean to be talking about our relatively familiar planet (it is the third brightest object in the night sky) and saying that it does not exist. So “Jupiter” denotes Jupiter at each possible world w, no matter what happens in w, even failure of Jupiter to exist (see further Salmon 1981:32–40).

It is crucial to problematic uses of =E in the style of (5) that at least one of the singular terms in the major premise be nonrigid. For if they are both rigid and also codesignate, then the minor premise and the conclusion will agree in truth-value. So we might propose a restriction on =E that makes the application in (5) illegal. The weakest restriction motivated by the failure of (5) is that t1 and t2 must have the same modal profile: for each w, either t1 designates the same thing as t2 at w, or neither designates anything at w. A slightly stronger restriction is that t1 and t2 have the same modal profile and at each w, each designates something. Here we are proposing a sui generis addition to the constraints that correct application of =E in modal languages must meet, a constraint that is required because we are treating definite descriptions as singular terms. But allowing application of =E in formal modal languages only if the terms in the major premise have the same modal profile is not workable, since two terms which have the same profile in one interpretation of the language (at each world, they denote the same thing) may have different profiles in another interpretation. So the standard approach is (i) to decree that =E is only applicable when t1 and t2 are proper names, and (ii) in the semantics stipulate that names are always rigid designators. (Some might object that it is illegitimate to sneak semantics into the statement of an inference rule, as the combination of (i) and (ii) does.)

Using “□” for “necessarily,” we can then prove

(6)
c
= d  ⊢ □(c = d),

simply using =E once, with the minor premise “□(c = c),” which is a theorem and therefore does not need to be mentioned on the left in (6). But (using “∃!” for “there exists exactly one”) we will not be able to prove even

(7)
the F
= the G ⊢ □([(∃!x)Fx & (∃!x)Gx] → (the F = the G)),

much less with the unconditional version of the conclusion, “□(the F = the G).” The restriction in =E to names blocks anything like a proof of (7) analogous to that of (6) just mentioned, and there is no way of formulating sound rules for “the” to get round this. So we can classify (5) as a misuse of =E, since in (5a) at least one term is not a proper name.

The relevant question for us is whether there is anything in our discussion to justify the claim that the definite description “the number of planets” occurs opaquely in (5b). As already noted, the idea that “the F” is really a quantifier would have to be rejected before the question whether descriptions are referentially opaque in modal contexts could even arise, since quantifiers are not referential. So for “referentially opaque” to be an accurate characterization of the occurrence of “the number of planets” in (5b), we must take a side, not necessarily the most plausible side, on the singular-term/quantifier issue.

Yet even granting that definite descriptions are singular terms, it is implausible that

“the number of planets” is functioning deviantly in (5b), or in some other way that merits the term “opaque.” In an extensional language, the designation of a definite description in given circumstances is calculated following the semantic structure of the description. For example, “the man who first set foot on the Moon” will designate the unique entity, if there is one, that satisfies both “is a man” and “first set foot on the Moon.” To satisfy “first set foot on the Moon,” such an entity must be the first satisfier of “set foot on the moon,” which in turn has further semantic structure. This evaluation procedure, of following the structure to arrive at a unique object (if there is one), does not change when we move to an intensional language; it is simply that in interpreting an intensional language there are varying circumstances with respect to which an expression can be evaluated. A conjunction A & B may have different truth-values in different circumstances, but no one would accuse “&” of being problematic on account of this. Similarly, the fact that “the F” can have different designations in different circumstances is hardly a cause for concern.

Of course, (5) may seem to indicate a problem; but then, so may the sequent

(8)
A B, ◇(A & C) ⊬ ◇(B & C)

(here “◇” means “possibly”; consider the case where C = ¬B). From (8), we learn that substitution on the basis of accidental equivalence does not work in modal languages, and we must constrain any substitution rule to require necessary equivalence. In the same way, from (5) we learn that substitution on the basis of accidental codesignation is invalid in modal languages, and we must constrain =E to allow its application only if the codesignation is necessary. This is exactly what we have done, by restricting the singular terms of the major premise to individual constants, whose semantics requires them to be rigid designators.

Is there an analogous restriction on =E that we could employ to make the rule acceptable for languages with attitude verbs like “believe”? That t1 = t2 be rigid designators is insufficient, as (2) shows. And we want a condition that does not make it a matter of mere mental compulsion that any thinker in the minor premise’s propositional attitude comes to be in the conclusion’s propositional attitude: it has to be logically guaranteed. Plausibly, nothing weaker than identity of proposition determined by the two “that”-clauses satisfies this demand. So if we agree that a difference in the semantics of the two names would result in the two content-sentences in (2) expressing different propositions, we will have to say that the two names in a use of =E in the likes of (2) must be synonymous.

But it is not clear what it means to apply “synonymous” to a pair of names. Names are not usually found in dictionaries, so the normal notion of synonymy, on which, say, “attorney” and “lawyer” are synonyms in virtue of having the same dictionary definition, will not help. There is also a more serious objection, due to Mates (1952), to the effect that even substitution of dictionary synonyms in attitude ascriptions can produce results not much more comfortable than (5). For example, (9a) below may well be false, yet it seems (9b) could still be true:

(9)
a. I suspect that many people doubt that everyone believes all lawyers are lawyers.
b. I suspect that many people doubt that everyone believes all lawyers are attorneys.

One moral we might draw from “Mates cases” like this is that searching for a criterion which allows substitution of t2 for t1 in attitude reports is likely to be futile. (For further discussion of attitude reports differing by a synonym, see Burge 1978 and Kripke 1979:160–1.)

To summarize, we have considered three incorrect uses of =E, (3), (4), and (5), in the hope that understanding why they go wrong will help us gain clarity about (2). But (3) turned out not to be so useful, given the drawbacks to quotational accounts of attitude ascriptions. (5) suggests trying to modify =E by limiting its use to some favored class of singular terms, but Mates cases cast doubt on whether this line will be productive (see also Kaplan 1969, Section xi). This leaves (4), which shows how a substitution can have a hidden truth-condition-altering side-effect, a paradigm to which we will return.

For the moment, we note a distinction which emerges from the unhelpfulness of (5). (5) illustrates difficulties for =E which arise from the intensionality of certain vocabulary, primarily modal operators, difficulties resolved by a more careful statement of the rule. On the other hand, the difficulties for =E illustrated by (2) do not seem to be resolvable in a similar way. So the problem manifest in (2) is said to arise from the hyperintensionality, or fine-grained intensionality, of psychological vocabulary such as attitude verbs (a context is hyperintensional iff interchange of necessarily coextensive expressions in it can fail). However, even hyperintensional semantics does not necessarily legitimize a qualified version of =E. (For a version of hyperintensional semantics that takes propositions as primitive, see Thomason 1980, Muskens 2005; for a study of some alternatives, see Fox and Lappin 2005; for the use of “impossible worlds” to analyze hyperintensionality, see the exposition and references in Berto 2013; for a derivational account of hyperintensionality, see Bjerring and Rasmussen 2018; and for an argument that “probably” is hyperintensional, see Moss 2018:§7.5).

2. The De Re/De Dicto Distinction

It is possible to get oneself into a frame of mind according to which there is no such thing as hyperintensionality, and the reasoning of (2) is not flawed at all. For if Lois believes that Superman can fly, then, since Superman is Clark, she just does believe that Clark can fly, even though she would not put it that way. What you believe is one thing, which words you are inclined to use when stating your beliefs is another, and if you are ignorant of an identity, you may disprefer or even reject particular wording that nevertheless captures what you believe. So even though Lois would laugh if someone suggested to her that Clark has superpowers (in those very words), she may still believe it.

One view about this argument in favor of (2) is that it is essentially correct. We shall return to this Russellian position later. But a second view is that it exploits an ambiguity that is present in (2b), “Lois believes that Superman can fly,” and in (2c), “Lois believes that Clark can fly.” According to this view, an attitude ascription such as (2b) can be read in a way that permits substitution and in a way that does not. Normally, we understand such ascriptions in the way that does not, which is why we reject (2), but if cajoled enough (“look, she does believe Clark can fly, she just wouldn’t say it like that”), we may switch to a reading that allows substitution. In the usual terminology, this is called the de re reading, contrasting with the more common de dicto reading, which disallows substitution. Other terminology for this reading is relational, contrasting with notional; transparent, contrasting with opaque; and wide scope, contrasting with narrow scope. We turn now to explaining what distinction these labels attempt to mark.

a. Defining the Distinction

None of the above terminology is entirely happy. It is unclear in what sense the substitution-resistant reading of (2b) is any less “about the thing” (“de re”) than a putative substitution-permitting reading, nor is it clear why the truth of (2b) understood in a substitution-resistant way makes the subject of the ascription any less related to the object the attitude is about (Lois believes Superman can fly because she has seen him do it). And “transparent/opaque” employs the notion of opacity, which, if it is not just a synonym for “substitution resisting,” suggests failure to refer in the normal way, an idea we have yet to find a justification for.

But “wide scope/narrow scope” is more useful. The rationale for “wide scope” is the thought that a substitution-permitting reading of (2) can be brought out by a formulation in which the crucial name is moved to a position in front of the attitude verb (it has wide scope with respect to the verb), as illustrated in

(10)
a. Superman is such that Lois believes that he can fly.
b. Superman is someone who Lois believes can fly.

The step from (2b) to (10a) or (10b) is called exportation, and it is intuitively plausible that the exported forms permit substitution: if Superman is someone Lois believes can fly and if Superman is Clark, then indeed Clark is someone Lois believes can fly. So if we read the minor premise and conclusion of (2) in the exported way, we have an explanation of why someone might, under pressure, accept (2) after all. For (2a) and either (10a) or (10b) entail the exported variant of (2c). Note that we are not saying that exportation is valid, for example, that (2b) entails (10a) (though it seems to—for worries about existential commitment of the kind raised in Donnellan 1974, see Forbes 1996:357–62, and more generally Kvart 1984). The point here is just that (2b) and (2c) could be understood straight off in the style of (10), which would explain why (2) might be swallowed.

One advantage of the wide-scope/narrow-scope terminology is that it reflects a difference whose existence is not in doubt, insofar as it is simply syntactic, manifested in the contrast between, say, (2a) and (10a). But of course, there is a question whether the syntactic difference marks any interesting semantic one.

To argue for a semantic difference, we may observe that the same syntactic distinction arises with definite descriptions and (other) quantifiers, where a semantic difference is undeniable. For example, we have

(11)
a. Lois believes the extraterrestrial who works at The Daily Planet likes her.
b. Lois thinks that no extraterrestrial is in this conference room.
c. Lois hopes that someone born on Krypton will come to her aid.

If the quantifiers are given narrow scope, that is, if the examples in (11) are interpreted following word-order, (11a) is false, (11b) is (say) true, and (11c) is false. (11a) is false because Lois does not think that there are any extraterrestrials who work at The Daily Planet, so would not use “The extraterrestrial who works at The Daily Planet likes me” to express any belief of hers. (11b) is true even though

Clark is in the conference room along with Lois and she sees and recognizes him. But since Lois presumes none of her colleagues is an extraterrestrial, she will happily use “No extraterrestrial is in this conference room” to say what she believes about the planetary origins of those in the room. And (11c) is false because (let us suppose) Lois has never heard of the planet Krypton; therefore, she will not think or say “Would that someone born on Krypton comes to my aid!” At least, these are the commonsense verdicts about the examples in (11), based, as is evident, on maintaining a close connection between the content of mental states and their verbal expression by the subject (on which, see Burge 1978:132).

However, these judgments of truth-value reverse themselves when we consider the exported forms:

(12)
a. The extraterrestrial who works at The Daily Planet is someone who Lois believes likes her.
b. No extraterrestrial is someone Lois thinks is in the conference room.
c. Someone born on Krypton is such that Lois hopes that person will come to her aid.

(12a) is true because Clark is the extraterrestrial who works at The Daily Planet and Lois believes Clark likes her; (12b) is false because Clark is an extraterrestrial and Lois thinks Clark is in the conference room; and (12c) is true because Superman was born on Krypton and Lois hopes Superman will come to her assistance. (The intuition that (12a) and (12c) are true and (12b) false suggests that what is required for the truth of, say, (12a), is that Lois have at least one name t of Kal-El such that she expresses a belief of hers with an assertion of “t likes me” literally construed. So the falsehood of (12a) would require her to have no such name; that she will not use “Superman likes me” to express a belief of hers is insufficient for the falsity of (12a).)

Not only does this contrast between (11) and (12) indicate that exportation makes a semantic difference, it also indicates what that difference is. The false cases in (11) are false because they make attitude attributions to Lois using concepts that either she lacks (“born on Krypton”), or thinks empty (“extraterrestrial who works at the Daily Planet”) and so would not employ positively in any belief she has; while the true case, (11b), is true precisely because “no extraterrestrial” is used to specify the content of her belief. In (12), on the other hand, problematic material is kept out of the specification of Lois’s mental states, which allows (12a) and (12c) to be true, while in (12b), we get a falsehood precisely because “no extraterrestrial” functions simply as an objectual quantifier, without characterizing the content of her belief. So in propositional attitude attributions with wide-scope material binding into the content-sentence, the content-sentence only partially characterizes the attitude, while if there is a “closed” content-sentence within the scope of the attitude verb, that is, if there is no exported material, the content-sentence fully characterizes the attitude. And we can then, if we like, resurrect the “de re/de dicto” terminology and use it in the same way as “wide scope/narrow scope.” The hallmark of a de re attribution is not that it says that the subject of the attribution stands in a special relation to the thing the attitude is about, but that the attribution designates or characterizes that thing in a way the ascriber chooses irrespective of whether the subject would accept the characterization, and the subject’s resisting the characterization is not even prima facie reason to think the attribution false; while a contested de dicto attribution is prima facie false. (See further Brogaard 2008:105–7 and Yalcin 2015:210–13; also see Marcus 1962 and Kazmi 1987 on the interpretation of exported quantifiers.)

This gives us a nontendentious way of using “de re/de dicto,” aligned with “wide scope/narrow scope,” that justifies our proposed diagnosis of any inclination to say that (2) passes muster: the diagnosis is that such judgment relies on construing the minor premise and conclusion as if they were in exported form, that is, construing them as de re attributions in the just explained sense. Still, it is worth observing that on this account we are equating the permits-substitution/resists-substitution distinction in the examples in question with a scope ambiguity. This may be too strong: there may be a substitution-permitting reading of, say, (2b), “Lois believes that Clark can fly,” which is not to be explained as involving a wide-scope reading for “Clark.” We will return to this point later, in connection with hidden-indexical semantics.

b. Skepticism about the Distinction

We have arrived at an apparently defensible way of understanding the de re/de dicto distinction, however the distinction is to be employed. We must therefore note that there are expressions of skepticism about it in the literature, for example Dennett (1982), Richard (1990:128–31), Sosa (1970), and Taylor (2002), whose points have not been addressed here. So, let us briefly consider a selection.

Taylor points out that even if using a definite description provides an accurate characterization of what a subject J believes or doubts, in the sense that the content-sentence containing the description echoes the sentence J would produce to express J ’s attitude, an ascriber will in certain cases resist using the description. These are cases where the ascriber thinks that the definite description is improper (a singular definite description the F is improper iff it is not the case that there is exactly one F). Thus, on seeing Smith’s dismembered corpse, Jones may leap to the conclusion that he was murdered and say “Smith’s murderer must be insane”; this is a “whoever that is” use of a description (Donnellan 1966; I am assuming “Smith’s murderer” is a form of “the murderer of Smith”). But if Black knows or believes that Smith was in fact savaged to death by an escaped tiger, she will not make ascriptions like “Jones thinks Smith’s murderer is insane” or “Jones expects the police to capture Smith’s murderer quickly.” This is puzzling if we have the practice of making de dicto ascriptions to reflect the content of the subject’s attitudes, and there is no reason to doubt that Jones’s statement “Smith’s murderer must be insane” expresses in his mouth what he believes (see further Maier 2015).

This reluctance to ascribe may be a result of pragmatic considerations. One reason to think so is that even in the circumstances of the case, it seems that Jones can properly self-ascribe notionally with “I believe Smith’s murderer is insane.” If Black asserts “Jones believes Smith’s murderer is insane” just before realizing she should not, and if “believe Smith’s murderer is insane” is univocal between Black’s ascription and Jones’s self-ascription, the difference in assertibility most probably has to do with the shift in context of utterance, specifically the shift in speaker. One might flesh this out in terms of “the” being a presupposition-trigger, entailing, even when in the scope of normally entailment-canceling operators such as negation, that its restriction is uniquely satisfied, which in our case means that exactly one person murdered Smith. Then since Black knows that Smith was not murdered, she will not say anything that entails that he was. Nonfactive attitude verbs are often said to suppress the triggering (“projection”) of presuppositions (see Kadmon 2001:116), but in view of Taylor’s examples, this may be wrong, or at least too simple.

A weaker pragmatic approach proposes that using a definite description in a belief-ascription conveys (merely) that the ascriber grants or takes the description to be proper. And cooperative speakers who know this do not use descriptions they think improper. So the difference between Black’s ascription and Jones’s self-ascription is explained. The question would then be how this implicature arises.

So far as undermining the idea that there are de dicto or notional ascriptions goes, one might say that the use of presupposition-triggers in the content-sentence creates a principled exception. One would then expect the phenomenon noted above to recur with other triggers. Jones may say “I think I will manage to save enough money,” but Black should not report “Jones thinks that he will manage to save enough money” unless Black grants Jones’s presupposition that saving enough money will be difficult. For if Black knows that the sum is small and that Jones can easily afford it, on this account she would not want to use “manage,” unless ironically.

There is also a question about how manifest the phenomenon that Taylor isolates is with other quantifiers. If Jones says “everyone who attacked Smith will be brought to justice” (he now thinks there were multiple killers), would Black, who knows about the tiger, happily report “Jones thinks everyone who attacked Smith will be brought to justice,” even though Jones says so? If the report seems infelicitous, that may be a point in favor of a pragmatic account if it is combined with a presuppositional account of “every F” in “every F is G.” According to such an account, the restriction F, in this case “person who attacked Smith,” is presupposed to be nonempty (see Heim and Kratzer 1998:159–72).

Sosa (1970) has an interesting example which tries to undercut the de re/de dicto distinction by suggesting that there are no hard-and-fast limits on exportability and so no substantial cognitive relation invoked by the exported form. In an extreme case (Sleigh 1968), if S believes there are spies but only finitely many, and that all have heights but no two have the same height, S may infer and come to believe “the shortest spy is a spy,” and Sosa would allow the exported ascription “the shortest spy is someone S believes is a spy.” So if Phil Kimbly is the shortest spy, Phil Kimbly is someone S believes is a spy (strangely, S, though the most upright of citizens, never thinks of contacting the FBI).

The argument for this laissez-faire stance about exportation is that there are examples where it is perfectly natural. For instance (Sosa 1970:890), the Commanding Officer (CO) may say to the captain, “Tomorrow I want the shortest platoon member to go first” or “I think the shortest platoon member should go first tomorrow.” The CO has no idea who the shortest platoon member is, but in fact it is the unfortunate Smith again (this is before he meets the tiger). The captain knows Smith is the shortest, and says to the sergeant, “The CO wants Smith to go first tomorrow”/“The CO thinks Smith should go first tomorrow,” or to Smith, “The CO wants you to go first tomorrow.” It is perfectly natural for the captain to say such things, yet the ascriptions seem to be arrived at by first exporting a description used by the CO in a whoever-that-is way, and then substituting a name or pronoun. But should not we object to the exporting, on the grounds that the CO does not have a desire or belief or doubt about Smith, that such-and-such? His desire that the shortest platoon-member go first seems to be no more about Smith than S’s belief that the shortest spy is a spy, arrived at as described, is about Phil Kimbly. But why then is “The CO wants Smith to go first tomorrow” so natural?

According to Kripke (2008:348), examples like these are “toy duck” cases: a child in a toy store points at a stuffed animal, asking his mother if it is a goose, and she replies “No, it’s a duck.” Kripke implies that what the mother says, no matter how natural, cannot really be true: “no dictionary should include an entry under ‘duck’ in which ducks…may not be living creatures at all” (346). Another example might be that you and I go to an exhibition of the work of a famous forger who specialized in analytic cubism. Pointing at one of his forgeries on the wall, I ask “Is that a Picasso?”, to which you reply, “No, it’s a Braque.” This is a natural conversation, but the painting is not really a Braque, and we should not explain the use of artists’ names as predicates of their works in a way that permits an NN not to be by NN. Of course, the simplest explanation of the naturalness of these dialogues is that the remarks “It’s a {duck/Braque}” are true, even though the duck is made of artificial fibers and Braque had nothing to do with the Braque (see Partee 2003 for how this could be). So if we follow Kripke in rejecting that explanation, we need to find another. Fortunately, at least in Sosa’s case of “The CO wants Smith to go first tomorrow,” it is not hard to see what the naturalness consists in: Smith is the person whose going first tomorrow will satisfy the CO’s desire that the smallest platoon-member, whoever he is, go first tomorrow; and Smith is the person whose going first tomorrow would realize the quantified eventuality the CO believes should obtain. Rather than leave it up to the sergeant to find out who the relevant individual is, the captain just tells him, and rather than do so by some laborious step-by-step reasoning about how to satisfy the CO’s desire, the captain makes an attitude ascription that is strictly false, but serves both his and the sergeant’s interests in seeing that the CO’s order is obeyed; for to obey the order, an individual has to be identified. By contrast, the Phil Kimbly ascription seems unnatural because there is no surrounding context to give it a rationale. Perhaps we could invent one, but doing so would not turn an incorrect exportation into a correct one, and nor does it in Sosa’s example. An ascription can be well motivated and promote efficiency in communication, but still be literally false.

c. The de re and Leibniz’s Law

Assuming that the de re/de dicto distinction survives skeptical attack, there is one more issue we can address with its aid. At the start of this essay, we distinguished Leibniz’s Law, “if x and y are the same object, then x and y have the same properties,” from the inference rule of =E. Problem cases for the rule might suggest that the Law itself is dubious. Why have we not considered this possibility?

The reason is that the Law is formulated in terms of objects and properties, and to regard examples like (2)–(5) as threats to it, we would have to construe these inferences as specifying properties of objects in their minor premises; but when we do this, we see that the apparent threat to the Law fades, as follows.

(3) is a “wrong object” case, for (3b) ascribes a property to a word, but in (3a) the objects x and y are cities. (4) is a case of failure to specify a property of an object: (4b) seems to involve the property being so-called because of its size, but the italicized phrase fails to specify a property, because of the uninterpretability of its “so”: “so” needs a context, linguistic or otherwise. There is certainly at least one property of objects in the offing, that of having a name which was endowed on the basis of size. But in conformity with the Law, that property is shared with Barbarelli, and the sentence attributing it, “Giorgione has a name endowed on the basis of his size,” falls short of what (4b) says. There is also the property being called “Giorgione” on account of size, but this is shared with Barbarelli too.

As for (5), there is certainly a reading of (5b) in terms of properties of objects: the property of contingently being 9 is ascribed to the number that numbers the planets. But then (5b) is false, since this number is 9, and 9 is not contingently 9. In other words, this property-of-objects construal requires a de re reading of (5b), with the description “the number of planets” exported, resulting in a falsehood.

Another property-of-objects construal of (5b) is one where the property is contingency and the object is the proposition that the number of planets is 9. On this reading, (5b) is true. But this turns (5) into another wrong object case, since in the major premise the objects are numbers, not propositions. And if we change (5a) to make it about propositions, it would have to say that the proposition that the number that numbers the planets is 9 is the same proposition as the proposition that 32 is 9. If (5) is reformulated this way, it is clearly a correct use of =E, but the falsity of the conclusion, that the proposition that 32 is 9 is contingent, means the rewriting of the major premise to state an identity between propositions produced a falsehood: they are not the same proposition at all.

So what of the original (2)? Here the property-of-objects construals of the minor premise are parallel to those in (5), but we do not want to say quite the same things about them. One property-of-objects reading of (2b) is that Superman has the property of being believed by Lois to be able to fly. (2a) is an identity involving Superman, so certainly we can use =E, in this case to infer that Clark has the property of being believed by Lois to be able to fly. This is just a slightly different formulation of the way of understanding the argument that we identified above as underlying an inclination to say that (2) is valid: the crucial point is that the names that are syntactically in the scope of “believes” are interpreted semantically to be exported from its scope. But we do not arrive at (2c), understood as false: that would require importation of “Clark” back into the scope of “believes,” and the fact that (2c) is by default understood as false shows that importation is invalid.

As with (5), we can reconstrue the minor premise and conclusion of (2) to be specifically about propositions. (2b) would then say that the proposition that Superman can fly is believed by Lois, and (2c) would say that the proposition that Clark can fly is believed by Lois. To prevent this just being another wrong-object case, (2a) would then have to be changed to an identity between propositions. Specifically, it would assert that the proposition that Superman can fly is the same proposition as the proposition that Clark can fly. The =E inference is then entirely in accord with Leibniz’s Law. The problem, of course, is that one is inclined to infer that the asserted identity between the propositions is false.

Perhaps we should say, then, that (5) is partially instructive as regards (2), in that there are parallel property-of-objects readings. What (5) does not help with is the formulation of a restriction on the terms used in =E that allows syntactically unstructured individual constants to be substituted in formulations like those actually used in (2); moreover, there seems to be no way to do this.

3. Frege’s Theory of Substitution-Resistance

a. The Sense/Reference Distinction Applied to Attitude Ascriptions

According to the framework for semantics of natural language sketched in Frege (1892), every meaningful phrase of natural language has potentially two sorts of meaning, a reference (Bedeutung) and a sense (Sinn, a cause of many puns in the titles of worthwhile pieces—for example, Dummett 1973 Ch. 17, Burge 1979, Forbes 1990 (if I may), Salmon 1990; for issues about the translations of these German words, see the discussion and references in Kripke 2001:254, n.1). A meaningful expression e, or a use of e, expresses a sense. Its sense determines its reference (if it has a reference) by virtue of being a way of thinking (or “mode of presentation”) of that reference, but whether there is a reference can depend on how things are in the world. In the case of a singular term, the reference is the thing it designates. For example, the sense of the name “Aristotle” might be articulated by “the pupil of Plato who tutored Alexander and wrote the Nicomachean Ethics.” Whether or not the name “Aristotle” has a reference then turns on whether or not there was such a person.

The same is true of sentences. A sentence expresses a thought, or, in current jargon, a proposition, and a proposition with a reference refers to a truth-value, true or false (the idea that propositions refer is a little odd, but see Dummett 1973:180–6). For example, the proposition that Aristotle was a philosopher is a way of thinking of a truth-value: this proposition is the proposition that the pupil of Plato who tutored Alexander and wrote the Nicomachean Ethics was a […] (here readers should substitute their favorite explanation of “philosopher” for the ellipsis, but please, not “one who philosophizes”). Assuming that there was such a person, then this proposition is a way of thinking of true. However, if “Aristotle” lacks a reference because there was no such person, the proposition “Aristotle was a philosopher” will lack a reference because it has a part that lacks a reference.

It is an important point about this apparatus that the calculation of the reference of the whole proposition or sentence expressing it proceeds via the references of the parts. In the case of “Aristotle was a philosopher,” the reference of the whole sentence is obtained by composing the references of “Aristotle” and “was a philosopher,” as determined by their senses, in a way which results in a truth-value. So, it is easiest to think of the reference of “was a philosopher” as a function, one which, applied to an object, produces a truth-value (functions are input-output operations, so in this case the object is the input, the truth-value the output). Then if “Aristotle” provides an object, we will get a truth-value from “was a philosopher.” But if there was no such person, this procedure will hang, waiting for an object when none is going to be provided. This motivates the verdict that in case the name is empty, the sentence is neither true nor false.

a. The Sense/Reference Distinction Applied to Attitude Ascriptions

The sense-reference distinction suggests that we may be able to explain how (13a) below can be true while (13b) is false:

(13)
a. Lois hopes Superman is nearby.
b. Lois hopes Clark is nearby.

Assuming that the names have different senses (perhaps “the red-caped superhero who flies” versus “the mild-mannered Daily Planet reporter with a crush on Lois Lane”), (13a) and (13b) will express different propositions because their embedded content-sentences do, and so (13a) and (13b) at least potentially may refer to (that is, have) different truth-values. But truth-value is at the level of reference, and the corresponding constituents of (13a) and (13b) are all coreferential (given a fixed context to determine what counts as “nearby”). Specifically, the references (truth-values) of (13a) and (13b) are calculated from the references of their three main constituents: (i) “Lois,” referring to Lois; (ii) “hopes,” referring to the hoping relation; and (iii) “Superman is nearby” and “Clark is nearby,” respectively, which refer to the same truth-value. Since (i) and (ii) are common to (13a) and (13b), (13a) and (13b) must also have the same reference, that is, same truth-value, even if they express different propositions by virtue of having content subsentences that express different propositions. So it looks as if Frege’s apparatus does not get us any closer to an account of how (13a) and (13b) might differ in truth-value.

Explanation of references as functions may be extended to expressions other than singular terms and sentences. For example, “hopes” at this point is assumed to refer to a function f that takes a truth-value as input, say the truth-value of “Superman is nearby,” and produces as output another function, g, the reference of the verb-phrase “hopes Superman is nearby.” g takes the referent of the name “Lois” as input and produces the truth-value of (13a) as output. The problem is then that “Superman is nearby” and “Clark is nearby” present the same truth-value to f, which must therefore output the same function g as the referent of the two verb-phrases “hopes Superman is nearby” and “hopes Clark is nearby” (same input requires same output). Thus, Lois is mapped to true by both verb-phrase functions, or to false by both, since they are both the function g; and so (13a) and (13b) are equivalent.

The source of the difficulty is clear: we have taken the reference of “hope” to be a function of the truth-values of content-sentences that follow it. This is not arbitrary, for the calculation of the reference of any complex phrase uses the references of its constituent phrases along the way, and the content-sentence of the ascription does indeed refer to a truth-value, at least when asserted in isolation, or more broadly, when it occurs extensionally, not in an intensional or hyperintensional context. But this is a very unintuitive account of the reference of “hope.” The thing the attitude of hoping is taken toward is surely a proposition, not a truth-value: the proposition that Superman is nearby is what Lois hopes to be true, not the proposition’s truth-value.

So, on the one hand, we want “hope” to take the reference of its complement sentence as its input, because reference is computed from referents. On the other hand, we want “hope” to take the proposition expressed by its complement sentence as its input, because it is propositions whose truth we hope for. But the proposition is the sense of the content-sentence, not the reference.

To solve this conundrum, Frege made a move of what Kaplan called “brilliant simplicity” (Kaplan 1969:117): we attribute to attitude verbs the property of switching the reference of the material that follows in the ascription from the “customary” reference of that material to a different reference, namely, the customary sense (also known as the “indirect” reference). So in (13a), the (customary) reference of “hopes Superman is nearby” is obtained by applying the (customary) reference of “hope” to the reference “Superman is nearby” has in (13a), its indirect reference, that is, its customary sense. Thus, the reference of “hope” gets the proposition that Superman is nearby as input, as we wanted. This means reference is relativized to linguistic context of occurrence. If “Superman is nearby” occurs extensionally, it refers to its truth-value. But if “Superman is nearby” is the S-part of a complex phrase V+(that)S, where V is an attitude verb, “Superman is nearby” refers to its sense, the proposition that Superman is nearby.

On this account, “hope” refers not to a function that takes a truth-value and produces, as the meaning of the verb-phrase “hopes Superman is nearby,” a function that takes individuals (such as Lois) to truth-values. Rather, “hope” refers to a function which takes a proposition as input, for example the proposition that Superman is nearby, though it still produces, as the meaning of the verb-phrase “hopes Superman is nearby,” a function which maps some individuals, like Lois, to true, and others, like Lex Luthor, to false. However, since we have already agreed that “Superman is nearby” and “Clark is nearby” express different propositions (when occurring extensionally, as we would now add) because of the different senses of “Superman” and “Clark,” this means that the input to the reference of “hope” in (13a) is different from its input in (13b): two different propositions, rather than the single truth-value which is all that is available in the absence of the switch in reference of the content-sentences. Consequently, the verb-phrases “hope Superman is nearby” and “hope Clark is nearby” can refer to different functions; “hope Superman is nearby” can refer to a function which maps Lois to true, while “hope Clark is nearby” can refer to a function which maps Lois to false. This is Frege’s account of how (13a) and (13b) can differ in truth-value, and is the first example of what is nowadays called “switcher semantics”(Gluer and Pagin 2006, 2012; Pagin and Westerståhl 2010).

The reference-switch thesis has immediate application to the question of what is wrong with (2). The Fregean answer is that (2) is a fallacy of equivocation. In (2a), “Superman” and “Clark Kent” have their customary referents, namely, Kal-El. But in (2b), “Superman” refers to its customary sense, the concept of being the red-caped superhero who flies; “Clark” also refers to its customary sense. As the example shows, identity of customary reference does not justify substituting one singular term for another in the content-sentence of an attitude attribution, since identity of customary reference falls far short of the identity of indirect reference (identity of sense) that would be needed for (2) to be valid.

Indeed, Frege’s theory predicts that it will be hard to find any nontrivial sound arguments in the style of (2), even if we change the major premise to be of the form “the sense of t1 = the sense of t2.” For then the major premise is true only if two different names have the same sense, and it is not clear under what circumstances that would happen. Perhaps it might be self-evident in the acquisition process that the names refer to the same person: the speaker introduces herself to x with “Hi! My name is Roberta, but people call me Bobbie.” But even if x correctly recalls this, Mates cases can be constructed: x may coherently think that everyone knows Roberta is Roberta but wonder if everyone knows Roberta is Bobbie. Perhaps we should say that for x, for a while, the two names have the same sense, but x envisages that others may use the names with different senses, and the semantics of “everyone knows that Roberta is Bobbie” allows, one way or another, for this possibility. (See also Schiffer’s discussion of the individuation of senses (1992:502–3). For a theory on which senses are never needed to deal with the likes of (2), see Millikan 2000, and for a pro-Fregean critique, Lawlor 2006.)

b. The Hierarchy Problem

There are problems of detail with Frege’s theory. One such is how to accommodate intersubjective variation in sense (see Zalta 2001). But perhaps the best known is the “infinite hierarchies” problem. As we have already seen with Mates sentences, one attitude ascription can be embedded within another. A simple case is:

(14)
a. Kal-El wonders if Lois has begun to notice that Clark is never around when Superman is.
b. Lois has begun to notice that Clark is never around when Superman is.
c. Clark is never around when Superman is.

According to Frege, “Lois has begun to notice that Clark is never around when Superman is” refers in (14a) to the sense it expresses in (14b), since it is within the scope of “wonders” in (14a). And “Clark is never around when Superman is” refers in (14b) to its customary sense, the sense it expresses in (14c) (curiously, the names in (14c) also seem to resist substitution, despite the lack of attitude verbs; we will return to this in our discussion of “simple sentences”). These sentence-senses are obtained systematically from the senses of their constituent words. So in (14b), “Clark” refers to the way of thinking of Kal-El it expresses in (14c), which we label m1. But whenever a word refers, it does so by expressing a way of thinking of that reference. So “Clark” in (14b), referring as it does to m1, must express a way of thinking of m1, which we label m2. Plausibly, m2 cannot be m1 over again, for (i) m2 = m1 would require the same way of thinking to be of both a person, Clark, and of a way of thinking of that person, m1; and, (ii), m2 = m1 means that m1 is a way of thinking of itself, an idea not breathtaking in its intelligibility (see further Peacocke 2009:162–3; but see also Dummett 1973:264–9 for an attempt to get by with just m1). So these considerations motivate the idea that in (14b), “Clark” expresses a way of thinking m2 which is of m1 and not identical to m1.

Now, (14b) occurs in (14a) within the scope of the hyperintensional “wonders,” so its reference in (14a) and the referents of its constituent words in (14a) must switch; they switch from the referents they have in (14b) to the senses they express in (14b). This means that in (14a), “Clark” refers to m2. But then, “Clark” in (14a) must express a sense which is a way of thinking of m2, since this is the only way “Clark” could refer to m2. Call this sense m2. As before, it is implausible that m2 is the same as m2, since, first, it would have to be a way of thinking of itself, and second, it would have to be both a way of thinking of m2, but also, since ex hypothesi it is m2, would have to be a way of thinking of m1. m2, then, appears to be something new.

And so we are off. We can make (14a) the content-sentence of a new attitude ascription, say

(15)
Lex suspects that Kal-El wonders if Lois has begun to notice that Clark is never around when Superman is.

Now the sense (14a) expresses becomes the reference of (14a) in its appearance as the content-sentence of (15), and the words of (14a) will express new senses in (15), ways of thinking of the senses they express in (14a); for example, in (15), “Clark” will express m, a way of thinking of m2, so that “Clark” in (15) can refer to m2. Since there is no principled restriction on how deeply attitude verbs may be embedded within other attitude verbs, we have, apparently, an unending sequence of senses. In particular, “Clark” can express infinitely many ways of thinking, none of which are intelligible beyond the first or second. Some Frege scholars have developed formal models of sense and reference which embody such hierarchies; see, for example, Church (1951) and Anderson (1980). However, others have tried, in effect, to stop at m2; see especially Parsons (1981, 2009).

c. The Semantic Innocence Objection

Problems of detail aside, there are two main objections to Frege’s account which have emerged in the last few decades, the semantic innocence objection and the no-such-thing-as-senses objection. We take the former first.

The semantic innocence objection is so-called because of its famous statement by Davidson (1969:172):

If we could recover our pre-Fregean semantic innocence… it would seem to us plainly incredible that…words [in the content-sentences of attitude attributions] mean anything different, or refer to anything else, than is their wont when they come in other environments.

This is, admittedly, simply an appeal to intuition, but it is a powerful one (see also Loar 1972:43). It is indeed very difficult to detect a switch in the reference of “Superman” if Lois remarks “Superman is nearby, if I’m in luck” versus if she remarks “I hope that Superman is nearby.” The reference-switch thesis also causes problems for the treatment of anaphoric pronouns. In “Galileo thought that the Earth moves, and he knew what he was talking about, so it moves,” it is undeniable that the “it” refers to the Earth. But then the pronoun does not directly inherit its reference from its antecedent (see further Segal 1989). No doubt there are epicycles which get round this, but it is questionable whether that road is worth going down, given the lack of intuitive support at its starting point.

d. Do Name-Senses Exist Anyway?

An even more damaging objection to Frege’s account of substitution-failure for names is that the entities which play the crucial role, senses or ways of thinking of individuals, are chimerical. That Fregean name-senses do not exist is the core argument of Kripke (1972). Briefly, suppose that “Aristotle” does express a reference-determining sense, captured by, say, the singular definite description “the pupil of Plato who tutored Alexander and wrote the Nicomachean Ethics.” One possibility is that this description articulates the meaning of the name in much the way that a dictionary might articulate the meaning of “philosopher.” Then it should be both necessary and a priori that Aristotle tutored Alexander. But it is neither. Aristotle could have been killed in an Athenian traffic accident in his youth, so it is not necessary that he tutored Alexander; and that he did so is clearly an empirical claim, which only historical evidence can confirm or disconfirm. Similarly, not even “if Aristotle and Alexander existed, the former tutored the latter” is necessary or a priori.

A somewhat weaker thesis is that the reference of “Aristotle” is fixed by the description, without being synonymous with it. But even merely this would predict, of some perfectly intelligible statements, that they are semantically problematic. For example (based on Kripke’s “Gödel case,” 1972, 1980:83–5), suppose that someone claims on a fake-news website to have found documents showing that Aristotle was not a pupil of Plato, did not tutor Alexander and did not write the Nicomachean Ethics. The first two items Aristotle deliberately falsified on his CV in order to attract students, and though he published the Nicomachean Ethics under his own name, that was after stealing the manuscript from the true author (not a pupil of Plato), whom he murdered to ensure his silence. And as time passed, the false claims became firmly lodged in popular lore about Aristotle.

If it went viral, this story about Aristotle would outrage historians of philosophy. But the very fact that they would be outraged shows that they understand the story well enough. Yet, if the reference of the name is fixed by the description, the story is self-refuting (if it is true, then it is not true): Aristotle did not lie about tutoring Alexander, for according to the story, “Aristotle” is an empty name, so “Aristotle lied” should be either false or neither true nor false. But no historian would contest the story on the grounds that it is self-refuting: the debate would be over the existence or trustworthiness of the documents that the story is based on. The ability to debate the truth of the story, with both sides treating “Aristotle lied about Plato” as at least debatable, is hard to explain if the reference of “Aristotle” is fixed by the proposed description. And if some other description of the same “famous deeds” sort is substituted, a similar example would surely be constructible.

If the weaker, reference-fixing thesis, does not support attribution of senses to names, perhaps we should go back to the stronger, meaning-giving thesis, and try a different kind of description. Kripke considers modifications like (whoever it is who is) “the person commonly thought to have been a pupil of Plato who tutored Alexander and wrote the Nicomachean Ethics.” He argues that this is vulnerable to counterexamples involving subjects who have not kept up with what is commonly thought about whom (1980:88), and he raises a circularity objection (loc. cit.).

The new description identifies Aristotle as the person commonly thought to be thus-and-so. So there is a certain range of thoughts s1,…,sn had by members of the linguistic community, thoughts of various people to the effect that Aristotle tutored Alexander, Aristotle was taught by Plato, and so on, and these determine the reference of “Aristotle.” But ex hypothesi, “Aristotle” as it occurs in these thoughts means “the person commonly thought to be…,” referring us back once again to s1,…,sn. There is an unending loop here, and we never escape from the thoughts s1,…,sn to a specific object as the reference of “Aristotle.”

Kripke also points out that we manage to refer easily enough even when there are no identifying descriptions we could cite. He gives the example of “Richard Feynman,” a name many people use without having an associated definite description (1980:81—this was before Feynman’s incisive testimony at the Challenger disaster inquiry). An associated indefinite description might be “a famous physicist at Caltech who won the Nobel Prize.” But “a” cannot be strengthened to “the,” since Murray Gell-Mann is also a famous physicist at Caltech who won the Nobel Prize. And if we insert “not identical to Gell-Mann” into the description, we make it impossible to refer to Feynman without having a way of thinking of Gell-Mann (not to get into the looming indeterminacy problem).

e. Alternative Accounts of the Sense of a Name

If Kripke’s arguments show that Fregean senses of names do not exist, then the Fregean solution to the problem of opacity collapses, rather like a well-worked-out theory of human behavior in which demonic possession plays a large and crucial role. However, it would be fair to say that Kripke’s counterexamples tell mainly against “famous deeds” descriptivism and some modifications of it involving qualifiers like “commonly thought.” It is reasonable to focus on famous-deeds descriptions, since Frege says that everyone who uses the name expresses a reference-determining sense with it, and so to guarantee that each individual is in possession of such a sense, one naturally looks to information that is easily come by. But perhaps there are other options for the content of name-senses besides famous deeds.

One alternative, due to Chalmers and developed in the two-dimensional framework of Stalnaker (1987), is two-dimensional sense. A two-dimensional sense is an ordered pair consisting in an epistemic sense and a subjunctive sense. For a name, the epistemic sense is a function from “scenarios” to individuals, and the subjunctive sense is a function from possible worlds to individuals (Chalmers 2011:596–9). A scenario is something like a coherent total description of how things might have turned out to be, and the epistemic sense of a name may be a nonrigid function on such items: in one scenario, a name may refer to x, while in another it may refer to a distinct y. But subjunctive senses are rigid: they denote the same object in any two worlds. The idea is then that epistemic operators are sensitive to the epistemic sense, and modal operators to the subjunctive sense, which, since it is a rigid function, may be identified with the object to which it stably refers (2011:597, T4, T5).

If epistemic senses are just famous-deeds descriptions or their like, Kripke’s objections arise over again. And it would certainly be unfortunate if epistemic and subjunctive senses came apart over actual reference, since then statements like “it’s a posteriori that Aristotle was a philosopher” and “it’s contingent that Aristotle was a philosopher” would be about different people. However, Chalmers has a proposal on which this difficulty and certain others will not arise. Asking what might replace a famous-deeds descriptivist account of how names refer, Kripke suggested a “historical chain” account (1972; 1980:91–4):

[S]omeone, let’s say a baby, is born; his parents call him by a certain name. They talk about him to their friends. Other people meet him. Through various sorts of talk the name is spread from link to link as if by a chain… it’s in virtue of our connection with other speakers in the community, going back to the referent himself, that we refer to a certain man.

The same idea was advanced by Geach (1969:288–9):

[F]or the use of…a proper name there must in the first instance be someone acquainted with the object named…But …the…name…can be handed on from one generation to another… Plato knew Socrates, and Aristotle knew Plato, and Theophrastus knew Aristotle, and so on in apostolic succession down to our own times. That is why we can… use “Socrates” as a name the way we do.

One thing required for x to refer to Socrates with “Socrates” nowadays, then, is that x belong to a linguistic community in which there is an apostolic succession from Socrates to x along which the name “Socrates” is passed. (Following Kripke, x also has to intend to defer in x’s use of the name to those from whom x acquired it—if x decides that “Socrates” would be a fine name for x’s pet turtle, that does not count.)

Kripke mentions that Nozick once remarked to him that if any theory of reference is correct, some descriptivist theory is immune to counterexamples in the style of Naming and Necessity. This would be a descriptivist theory on which the descriptions are theory-laden: they incorporate the reference-determining conditions the correct theory formulates (Kripke 1980:88, n.38). Chalmers exploits this option: taking the historical chain theory as a plausible account of reference-determination, he suggests that the epistemic sense of a name NN might just be “the object NN refers to in the mouths of those from whom I acquired it” or its like (Chalmers 2002:641). This will be a nonrigid function, since in some scenarios, the apostolic succession for “Socrates” will lead to contemporary users but start from an individual x who is not Socrates.

Since the description suggested above involves the term “refer,” there is an obvious circularity worry if the sense is to be reference-determining. Chalmers argues (2002:641–3) that there is no reason to worry, since the evaluation of one person’s epistemic sense takes us back to other people, and their epistemic senses will carry us back to even earlier people, until we arrive at the “initial baptism” introducing the name. The question would then be whether the concept of reference is ineliminably invoked at this point, as in “we hereby name this child NN,” and how significant a problem that would be.

A second question is whether epistemic senses are otiose as far as determining reference is concerned. Is the reason why I can use “Socrates” to refer to Socrates not simply that I belong to a community in which there is a chain of uses of “Socrates” linking me to Socrates in the way the historical chain theory describes, and I have added the name to my repertoire with the intention to use it in a way that preserves the reference of those from whom I acquired it? Perhaps adding the name to my repertoire with such a deferential intention is the very same thing as attaching a theory-laden sense to it. But if not, the postulation of an epistemic sense seems redundant: the reference of the name in my mouth is already determined by my social situation, and if I express a certain epistemic sense with it, that is just a private epiphenomenon.

A second alternative to famous-deeds senses is what we might call “cognitive descriptivism,” since it is based on a (somewhat metaphorical) hypothesis about cognitive architecture. The idea is that we organize our information about what we take to be separate objects that we have encountered into separate mental files, or dossiers. This seems to have first been proposed by Grice (1969:141–4), and was used in an account of the senses of names in Forbes (1990). The neo-Fregean idea is that the sense of a name NN for x is “the subject of this dossier,” where the mental demonstrative “this dossier” refers to the dossier labeled NN by x in x’s mental filing system.

Clearly, questions about circularity and redundancy arise much as they do for two-dimensional sense (see Fine 2007:67–8). If what makes x the subject of the dossier labeled NN is that x is the referent of the name NN, then we have circularity. But if being the subject of the dossier labeled NN consists in—to use the causal theory of Evans (1973)—being the dominant causal source of the information in the dossier, why not cut out the detour through dossiers and just say that the reference of a name NN is the dominant causal source of information that would be expressed in statements of the form “NN is...”? Such issues are pursued in Recanati (2012) and Saka (2018), and are far from settled in the literature. But it is clear from these examples that famous-deeds descriptivism is not in sole possession of the field as an elaboration of Frege’s notion of the sense of a name.

However, whatever viable theory of sense may ultimately be produced, the semantic innocence objection will have to be dealt with. Thomason (1980) is unmoved by it, but we shall next consider accounts of senses that may be invoked by attitude ascriptions in a way that explains failure of =E, yet allows those senses to have their customary references, thereby meeting Davidson’s complaint.

4. Hidden-Indexical Semantics

The reference-switch hypothesis is one version of the more general notion that the words used in the content-sentence of an attitude ascription have a special role that they do not play in other contexts. If the special role does not displace their normal role, we arrive at Loar’s idea of a dual contribution (1972:52–3). On the one hand, as Davidson insists, the words of the content-sentence play their normal role. But there is another semantic mechanism at work in which they are also complicit. There is a wide range of such dual contribution accounts in the modern discussion of opacity, perhaps starting with Loar (1972). Field (1978) has the content-sentence invoking a sentence of the “language of thought.” Bealer (1993) proposes an ambiguity theory, on which the content-sentence of an ascription introduces both an entity composed of the referents of the words, thereby explaining the innocence intuition, and an entity like a Fregean proposition, thereby accounting for the intuition of substitution-resistance in the likes of (2). And Larson and Ludlow (1993) develop a semantics on which a propositional attitude is an attitude to an “interpreted logical form” (ILF) which is a tree structure in which a node is occupied by both the reference of the expression at that node and the expression itself. Consequently, “Superman can fly” and “Clark can fly” are different ILFs simply in virtue of “Superman” and “Clark” being different names.

a. Two Kinds of Hidden-Indexical Theories

Some versions of the dual contribution approach are known as “hidden-indexical” accounts (Schiffer 1979), because of the role context-dependence plays in determining the second contribution of the content-sentence, or because there actually is an indexical expression postulated to occur covertly in the ascription. For example, in Crimmins and Perry (1989) and Crimmins (1992), belief-ascriptions are said to be made true by items supplied by the context in which the ascription is made, items called “unarticulated constituents” because there is no expression in the ascription responsible for their intrusion into the truth-condition. Different but coreferential names may be associated with different normal notions of the same object, and an inference like (2) fails because the substitution changes which normal notion of Kal-El is, in their technical sense, “involved” (there is no reference-switch on the part of the names). Similarly, in Richard (1990), the content-sentence of a belief-ascription invokes a “Russellian annotated matrix” (RAM), which, like an ILF, is an item that contains both Fregean referents and the expressions referring to them, and the truth-condition requires that the RAM in the ascription correlate with a RAM believed by the subject of the ascription. What correlates with what is context-dependent, and (2) fails because substitution need not preserve correlation, even though it preserves Fregean reference (Richard 1990:133–41). While in Forbes (1990, 1996) and Recanati (2000:137–63) there is a hidden “so” in belief-ascriptions, as if “believes” were “so-believes,” which blocks substitution much as it does in Quine’s “Giorgione” case, (4), since the “so” refers to the content-sentence of the ascription.

One respect in which the above theories differ is over what kind of thing is believed. In Schiffer’s general scheme for hidden-indexical theories (1992:503–4), what is believed is a proposition of a non-Fregean kind, but the ascription includes as part of its literal meaning that this proposition is believed under a way w of thinking of it. Here w is something like a Fregean proposition in certain respects, and is specified by the very words used in the content-sentence of the ascription. Substitution then has the side-effect of changing the relevant way of thinking, say from the “Superman can fly”-way to the “Clark can fly”-way, and this opens the door to change of truth-value.

The kind of proposition of which w is a way of thinking is known as a “Russellian” proposition, after a famous exchange between Russell and Frege (Frege and Russell 1904). Frege had claimed that Mont Blanc “with its snowfields” is not itself a component of the thought that Mont Blanc is more than 4,000 meters high, to which Russell replied that “in spite of all its snowfields Mont Blanc itself is a component part of what is actually asserted…a certain complex.” Accounts of Russellian propositions have been given in some detail (for example, Cresswell 1985, Crimmins 1992:117–24; see Jespersen 2003 for critical discussion), and in Schiffer’s scheme, attitude ascriptions invoke quasi-Fregean ways of thinking of such complexes, while the attitude itself is to a Russellian proposition.

In the approach of Forbes (1990, 1996), however, it is a Fregean proposition to which an attitude is held, but one that is specified as the way of thinking of the referent of the content-sentence, where this way is determined by that very sentence. The referent is not a truth-value, as Frege would have had it, but rather an abstract state of affairs, which is a structured entity not unlike a Russellian proposition, though one that fits better into a Fregean scheme. So (2a) becomes

(16)
That Superman can fly is so-believed by Lois or more long-windedly,

(17)
Lois believes her so-labeled way of thinking of the state of affairs that Superman can fly

in which “so” refers to “Superman can fly,” sealing it off from substitution in the same way as it does for “Giorgione” in (4). (17) requires for its truth that the ascriber’s content-sentence be a “linguistic counterpart” of some sentence of Lois’s that she would use to express the belief that (17) is attempting to ascribe to her (compare Richard’s notion of correlation), a belief which is a way of thinking of the state of affairs that Superman can fly (which is equally the state of affairs that Clark can fly and equally the state of affairs that Kal-El can fly).

One problem for (17) is that it requires reference-determining senses, whereas Schiffer-style approaches need not. Additionally, (17) departs from (16) in a rather substantial, if not frequently noticed, way: the “that”-clause disappears, and the clausal form of “believes” is replaced by the transitive one (the direct object in (17) is everything following “believes”). But though there seems to be an equivalence between believing that… and believing the proposition (thought, so-labeled way of thinking) that…, it does not generalize to other attitude verbs. For example, suspecting that Lex Luthor is involved is not the same thing as suspecting the proposition that Lex Luthor is involved (is anyone so paranoid as to suspect propositions?—Moltmann (2003:82) credits Arthur Prior with first noticing this issue). The same thing occurs, though for different reasons in different cases, with such verbs as “announce,” “anticipate,” “ask,” “boast,” “calculate,” “caution,” “complain,” “conclude,” “crow,” “decide,” “detect,” “discover,” “dream,” “estimate,” “forget,” “guess,” “hope,” “insinuate,” “insist,” “interrogate” (literary theory), “judge,” “know,” “notice,” “observe,” “plan,” “prefer,” “pretend,” “rejoice,” “require,” “see,” “suggest,” “surmise,” “suspect,” “understand,” and various cognates of these. The verbs for which the equivalence holds include inference verbs like “deduce” and “infer,” plus a few other examples like “doubt,” “establish,” and “verify.” Unfortunately, it would take us far afield were we to address the issue of how to modify (17) for the verbs for which the equivalence fails (see Forbes 2018 for one account).

As the previous paragraph indicates, some hyperintensional clausal verbs that can be used to ascribe propositional attitudes have hyperintensional transitive forms that can be used to ascribe what we might call objectual attitudes. These seem to generate failures of =E much as their clausal counterparts do. For example, “Lex fears Superman” is true, but “Lex fears Clark” does not seem any more plausible than “Lex fears that Clark will crush him.” The apparatus in (17) can be employed to express a hidden-indexical theory for the transitive verb case: the substitution-resistant reading of “Lex fears Superman” is “Lex fears Superman as such,” or “Lex fears Superman so-personified,” and the references of the “such” and “so” will change if “Clark” replaces “Superman,” producing the false “Lex fears Clark {as such/so-personified}.” A fuller version of the substitution-resisting semantics for “Lex fears Superman” might be

(18)
Lex fears Superman under the way of thinking of him that is so-labeled.

Here “under” forms an adverbial phrase modifying the whole verb-phrase in (18) headed by “fears” (there is some dispute about how such an “under” is to be accommodated; see Schiffer 1996, Ludlow 1996).

Hidden-indexical theories all preserve semantic innocence in roughly the same way: there is some entity, whether Russellian proposition or abstract state of affairs, determined by the customary referents of the words of the content-sentence, so the result is compatible with a Davidsonian decrying of any theory which claims that words in attitude ascriptions abandon their customary referents for something else. The “something else” is involved in a different way, a strategy which (17) and (18) illustrate.

Hidden-indexical semantics also offers an alternative formal account of the de re/de dicto distinction. Standardly, the difference is brought out in terms of scope distinctions, as we did in (10). But another possibility is that de re readings are those in which a hidden-indexical refers only to a part of the content-sentence: if Lois believes that her coworker Mary has gone to St. Petersburg, we may point at Mary and say “Lois believes that that woman is in St. Petersburg,” meaning that she believes some way of thinking of the state of affairs, partially labeled “is in St. Petersburg.” This would explain why the awkward locutions in (10) are rarely encountered in ordinary speech and writing.

b. Kripke’s Puzzle

One application of hidden-indexical semantics is to Kripke’s “puzzle about belief” (1979). Kripke doubts that there is a specific problem of interchange of coreferential names in attitude ascriptions, to be resolved by a semantics on which such substitution is fallacious. Rather, he thinks substitutivity problems are a mere symptom of broader anomalies in psychological discourse (“It would be wrong to blame…substitutivity. The reason does not lie in any specific fallacy [for example in (2)] but rather in the nature of the realm being entered,” 1979:157). So he gives examples meant to bring out anomalies even in the absence of substitution.

His main example is that of a subject, Peter, who encounters the same individual under the same name in different contexts and does not realize it was the same person all the time. Suppose Peter goes to a recital by a pianist named Paderewski, and, picking up the name from the recital program, comes to believe on the basis of the performance that Paderewski has musical talent. Later, at a railway station, he observes an individual surrounded by reporters, and someone tells him “That’s Paderewski, the Polish Prime Minister.” Far from connecting the man he sees with the man he heard play, Peter, who believes that no politician has musical talent, remarks out loud, “Ah, a person of no musical talent, then.” But, of course, Ignacy Jan Paderewski, the Prime Minister of Poland after the First World War, was also a celebrated composer and concert pianist.

Kripke wants us to try to answer the question, “Does Peter, or does he not, believe that Paderewski has musical talent?”, and in the course of our attempting to answer it, to realize that no answer can be given, because of “the nature of the realm being entered.” However, from the Fregean perspective, the example is less troubling, as Kripke recognizes (see also Taschek 1988). Peter has two lexical entries for “Paderewski,” in the same way that the present writer has three for “Socrates”—one for the Ancient Greek philosopher, another for the late Brazilian footballer, and a third for the former Portuguese Prime Minister (the latter two individuals had different first names, but I do not know what they are, and I do not know if the first individual had any other name; on the individuation of names, see Kaplan 1990). Of course, the difference between Peter and myself is that the names in Peter’s two lexical entries are coreferential, while the names in my three are, pairwise, not, unless the footballer, on retiring from the game, moved to Portugal and went into politics.

However, an ascriber A may only have one name for Paderewski (one mental file so-labeled), which puts A at a certain expressive disadvantage relative to Peter, if the ability to make an accurate report about Peter’s beliefs requires A to use names which match Peter’s. A would then need two names for Paderewski. But there is a very natural way around this (which Kripke uses himself, in n.37): A can simply say that Peter believes that Paderewski the pianist has musical talent, while Paderewski the statesman does not (Forbes 1990:561). From the perspective of a semantics like that of (17), the appositive uses of “the pianist” and “the statesman” determine different ways of thinking of the single state of affairs that Paderewski had musical talent. And it is only the way of thinking labeled with Peter’s linguistic counterpart of A’s “Paderewski the pianist has musical talent” that he believes: the appositives help us identify which of Peter’s ways of thinking of Paderewski we wish to invoke in our ascriptions. The question remains to explain why the major premise that Paderewski the pianist is Paderewski the statesman does not license the inference to “Peter believes that Paderewski the statesman has musical talent.” This would partly recapitulate our discussion of (2), though of course the appositives may bring their own complications.

It is also conceivable that ascribers in the know about Peter’s situation, addressing an audience also in the know, can rely on context to fix which belief is ascribed to Peter using “Paderewski has musical talent”; for instance, if the discussion concerns Peter’s evaluations of various pianists, the possessive description “Peter’s so-labeled way of thinking” is proper, rather than improper, since the other way of thinking, labeled with Peter’s linguistic counterpart of “Paderewski the statesman has musical talent,” will not be in the domain of the context, even if the discussion takes place after the railway-station encounter.

One can therefore resist Kripke’s question whether Peter does or does not believe that Paderewski had musical talent, just as I would resist the question “Was Socrates, or was he not, a chain-smoker?” The footballer was, but (I suppose) the philosopher was not, so absent contextual clues I would require disambiguation of the question: “Are you asking whether Socrates the footballer was a chain-smoker, or Socrates the philosopher?” In the Paderewski case, there is no referential ambiguity, but there is still an ambiguity, or indeterminacy, over which way of thinking of the state of affairs in question is being invoked: “Are you asking whether Peter believes Paderewski the pianist has musical talent, or Paderewski the politician?” would be a perfectly proper response. The explanation why it is perfectly proper is clear enough on hidden-indexical theories, but may not be so on others (see also Soames 2002, Chs. 2, 3).

Obviously, this account only works if there is a viable notion of the sense of a name. For those skeptical about the prospects of such a thing, Fine (2007) offers an alternative treatment of the puzzle. Fine begins with an explanation of the difference between “Superman is Superman” and “Superman is Clark”: in “Superman is Superman,” the two names are coordinated, but not in “Superman is Clark.” One manifestation of this is that someone who wonders whether Superman is Superman thereby demonstrates a failure to grasp what is said, while Lex can wonder whether Superman is Clark without demonstrating any failure of understanding. Since Fine takes the coordinated/uncoordinated distinction to be of semantic import, his view could be regarded as neo-Fregean, since he thinks “Superman is Superman” and “Superman is Clark” have different semantics, though his view of how the difference arises is quite unlike Frege’s (see Pickel and Rabern 2017 on some questions that arise for Fine’s account here).

Fine then argues that the case of Peter presents us with a puzzle whose solution is to be formulated in terms of this notion of coordination (2007:100–105). The puzzle is that our normal practices of belief-reporting dictate that we report Peter as believing that Paderewski has musical talent, and that we also report him as believing that Paderewski has no musical talent. At the same time, according to Fine, we do not want to make a “composite” report, that Peter believes that Paderewski has musical talent and believes that Paderewski has no musical talent, since this represents Peter as rather unreflective, which is unjustified (more reflection will not help). Yet the composite report is a simple “and”-Introduction inference from the acceptable reports. How can it sensibly be resisted?

Fine’s suggestion (2007:102–3) is that the composite report is unacceptable precisely because the reporter (who is in the know about Peter’s situation) uses

“Paderewski” in a coordinated way across the content-sentences of the composite report, while Peter does not use coordinated “Paderewski’s” in giving voice to his two beliefs. But the individual reports are acceptable, taken in isolation: there is nothing to be coordinated in an individual report, so we can simply take at face value Peter’s assertion of “Paderewski has musical talent,” even asserted after he has both entries in his lexicon, and ascribe such a belief to him. Whereas, for the Fregean, if there is nothing in the context to point toward one of “Paderewski the pianist” and “Paderewski the statesman” rather than the other, it will be indeterminate what belief is being ascribed (unless some feature of context settles it). And for the Fregean, the composite report, if it is the conjunction of two determinate ascriptions, is acceptable. Perhaps it makes Peter sound unreflective; but so does “The present writer believes Socrates was a chain-smoker and believes Socrates was not (ever) a chain-smoker,” though as I write it, it is true.

5. Russellianism

At the beginning of section 2, we noted that there is a possible response to the appearance of substitution-failure in (2) according to which the reasoning is not flawed at all: if Superman is Clark and Lois believes Superman can fly, she simply does believe that Clark can fly, even though she would not put it that way. The main motivation for this account is the view of propositions advanced by Russell in his letter to Frege quoted above, according to which Mont Blanc itself, not a way of thinking of it, is the sole constituent the name contributes to the proposition about its height. The locus classicus of this theory is Salmon (1986); other prominent contributions include Soames (1987), Saul (1997), and Braun (1998).

a. Salmon’s Theory

According to Salmon, belief-ascriptions invoke both Russellian propositions and ways of taking or of grasping those propositions. The apparently two-place attitude relation of belief unfolds into a three-place relation, with a position for a variable over ways of grasping. So for A believes p, Salmon offers (1986:111)

(19)
for some way of grasping propositions w, A grasps p by means of w and bel(A,p,w).

The correctness of the substitution inference (2) is immediate from this. If (2b) is true, Lois has a way of grasping the proposition that Superman can fly under which she believes this proposition. Ipso facto, she has a way of grasping the proposition that Clark can fly under which she believes this proposition, for it is the same proposition. Thus, (2c) is also true. Ways of grasping may be like Frege’s ways of thinking in some respects, but they are not what is believed, and they are not meant to determine reference.

Also note that Fine’s concern to avoid the composite ascription “Peter believes Paderewski has musical talent and believes Paderewski has no musical talent” is allayed, since the composite ascription is harmless on Salmon’s theory. For it involves two existential quantifiers over ways of grasping: there is some way of grasping the proposition that Paderewski has musical talent under which he believes it (more accurately, bels it), and some way of grasping the proposition that Paderewski has no musical talent, under which he believes it. The second way of grasping is no mere negation of the first, so there is nothing that imputes an intellectual deficiency to Peter (Salmon 1986:130–1).

The main question this account raises is why it seems so clear that there is a way of understanding (2) on which it is invalid. Salmon answers this question by distinguishing between semantically encoded and pragmatically imparted information (Salmon 1986:78). As far as what is semantically encoded is concerned, (2b) and (2c) are the same. But they differ over what they pragmatically convey, and those who think (2b) and (2c) can have opposite truth-values are mistakenly projecting the pragmatic difference onto the semantics. For example, it may be that (2c) pragmatically conveys that Lois believes that “Clark can fly” expresses a truth and that she would assent to it if asked. Loading this into the semantics would be like the mistake made by students in beginning logic classes when they reject “all Fs are G” on being informed that some Fs are G. The defeasible “not all” conveyed pragmatically by “some” obscures their view of the consistency of the two quantified statements.

A different explaining-away of the appearance of falsity in (2c) is provided by Braun (1998). Braun notes that since “Superman can fly” and “Clark can fly” express the same Russellian proposition, (2b) and (2c) express the same Russellian proposition as well. But someone judging (2b) and (2c) may take their common content in one way when judging (2b) and in another when judging (2c), which makes it at least intelligible that they resist the substitution inference.

So, there are things the Russellian can say about conversations among the screenwriters for Superman II, when they agree that at the start of the movie Lois should be shown beginning to suspect that Clark is Superman, and should then confirm that he is, by tricking him when he is personified as Clark into giving himself away. That the screenplay will thereby have Lois beginning to suspect that Clark is Clark, and then tricking him into revealing it, is overlooked by the writers: it never occurs to them (as a non-Russellian would say) that these are the same identity-proposition, taken in different ways.

Russellian propositions are “coarse-grained” compared to Fregean ones, for the latter are individuated in such a way that the propositions that Clark is Clark and that Clark is Superman are two. But once one accepts the distinction between proposition and way of taking the same, it is not clear what limits there are on the coarseness of grain that may be tolerated. There seems to be no obstacle to an unstructured conception of propositions as classes of possible worlds (Lewis 1979; Stalnaker 1984, 1987), and conceivably, it is defensible that true and false are the only propositions. (The same question about how much coarseness of grain is tolerable arises for hidden-indexical theorists who postulate indexically specified ways of thinking of Russellian propositions.)

b. Commonsense Psychology

Another question for Russellianism stems from the main purpose we have in ascribing attitudes: to arrive by abduction at explanations of behavior based on psychological generalizations (“those who believe Superman is present feel safer,” Rupert 2008:83). Someone who (i) feels safer if he believes that Superman is present, and (ii) sees that Clark is present, may still behave nervously or flee, which on the face of it is hard to understand if seeing that Clark is present is the same thing as seeing that Superman is present. Similarly, there are general normative principles of rationality such as

(20)
Anyone who believes a conditional proposition and its antecedent ought to infer its consequent.

This is not to say that such a person ought to believe its consequent: once the consequent is inferred, the thinker has various options, such as rejecting the conditional, or its antecedent, as alternatives to accepting its consequent. But a person who, at a minimum, does not make the inference, betrays a failure of rationality. However, Lex may believe the proposition that if Superman is nearby, then he, Lex, should hide. Lex may then notice and so come to believe that Clark is nearby, but take no steps to conceal himself. Yet if believing that Clark is nearby is the same thing as believing that Superman is nearby (bel-ing a certain proposition via some way of taking it), it seems that we should convict Lex of a failure of rationality, in that he remains unmoved by his two beliefs and so has apparently failed to use modus ponens. (The literature on logic, rationality, and closure under consequence is relevant here; see, for instance, Jago 2009, MacFarlane 2018, Staffel 2018.)

In response to this, Braun (2000) argues that psychological explanation employs ceteris paribus (other-things-equal) principles. For example, even in a case where it is clear to Lex that Superman is nearby, his making no attempt to hide does not mean, say, that he no longer believes he should hide if Superman is nearby, or no longer trusts modus ponens. He will only hide, or try to hide, other things equal. And if he already knows that he is in a location where there are no hiding places, his motivation to seek one is thereby overridden.

So far, this is just commonsense psychology. But according to Braun, there is a special way in which things might not be equal: although a conditional and its antecedent are believed, the antecedent as it occurs as minor premise of the modus ponens and the antecedent as it occurs as a constituent of the major premise may not be grasped in matching ways (2000:209). And if they are not, grounds for anticipating the expected behavior are removed. This means the principle stated in (20) is incorrect as it stands: the correct version would require a “matching ways” restriction. So there is no lapse of rationality on Lex’s part when he fails to use modus ponens in the case where he notices Clark is nearby, and so believes that Superman is nearby, and also believes he should hide if Superman is nearby. For the constituent corresponding to “Superman is nearby” in the way he takes the conditional is different from the way he takes the proposition that Superman is nearby when he comes to believe it once he has noticed that Clark is nearby. Braun admits (2000:234) that he cannot see any other way in which (20) is in need of qualification, so there is a whiff of the ad hoc about his response; but it does allow for a version of (20) acceptable to Russellians.

c. Saul on Simple Sentences

Another prominent defense of Russellianism, due to Saul (1997a, 1997b, 1999, 2007), focuses on “simple sentences,” sentences where we have a strong intuition of substitution-resistance, but there is no sense-invoking expression in the sentence whose semantics might underwrite the intuition. We have already noted one example, (21a) below. The other examples in (21) also manifest the phenomenon:

(21)
a. Clark is never around when Superman is.
b. Clark went into the phone booth and Superman came out.
c. Superman is more successful with women than Clark is.

There is a clear challenge to the Fregean in these examples. The inference in (2) fails, according to the Fregean, because of the semantics of “believes,” which requires its complement content-sentence to behave in a special way: to switch its reference, to make a double contribution to the truth-condition of the whole ascription, or to do whatever else one’s favored account of hyperintensionality proposes. But in the examples in (21), there is no expression which might force analogous behavior on the part of the names. Yet substitution of one name for the other in (21a) and (21c) produces something impossible, so, despite their apparent truth, (21a) and (21c) must be false. And substitution in (21b) seems to alter the meaning enough that the inference fails to be truth-preserving: (21b) appears to require a change of clothing or role, but a single substitution produces something which does not. These examples show that intuitions of substitution-failure do not depend on the presence of psychological vocabulary. And in the absence of anything else to explain them, they show that such intuitions must be mistaken.

Why, then, put any store in corresponding intuitions about (2)? However, hidden-indexical theorists can justify substitution-failure for the examples in (21) if they are willing to extend the scope of hidden-indexical introduction beyond attitude verbs. For instance, perhaps what we mean by (21b) is something along the lines of “Clark, so-attired, went into the phone booth, and Superman, so-attired, came out.” The “so” here accounts for substitution-failure as usual, since the names are associated with distinct ways of dressing: the “Superman” way (dressing as Superman) and the “Clark” way. For other examples, something more general than ways of dressing is needed, and this affords us an opportunity to make a partial unification of the cases of hyperintensional and simple sentences. A more general concept is that of personification, and using it, for (21a) we would have

(22)
Clark, so-personified, is never around when Superman, so-personified, is.

We have the same element of personification in the explanation of why fear of Superman is not the same thing as fear of Clark: to fear Superman, so-personified, is a very different thing from fearing Clark, so-personified (Forbes 2006:166–74).

A possible Fregean view, then, is that (22) is the literal meaning of (21a). According to Braun and Saul (2002) however, the intuition that (21a) can be true rests on some kind of confusion between it and the likes of (22); the latter certainly resists substitution, but differs in meaning from the former precisely because of that. Why would we suffer from such a confusion? Here Braun and Saul make use of the mental files metaphor, but they do not regard it as part of an account of difference in semantic content (see also Rupert 2008). We put information we would naturally express with one name in the file labeled with that name, and information we would naturally express with the other name goes into the file that other name labels. Then in assessing (21c), say, we compare the romantic history recounted in the entries in one file with that recounted in the other, and this task diverts our attention from the fact that the files concern the same individual. The attention-diverting element then explains why we judge (21c) to be true rather than impossible. Braun and Saul draw a parallel with the “Moses illusion” (2002:15–16), in which a large majority of subjects, when asked “How many animals of each kind did Moses take into the Ark?”, respond “Two,” partly because the “how many?” question diverts their attention from their knowledge that in the Bible it was Noah who took animals into his Ark (perhaps this happened to the reader just now).

But such an account cannot apply to speakers and writers who knowingly produce sentences like those in (21). For example, in a review of books about Shostakovich, the historian Orlando Figes wrote, “Shostakovich always signalled his connections to the classical traditions of St. Petersburg, even if he was forced to live in Leningrad” (The New York Review of Books, June 10, 2004, p.14). Far from having his attention somehow diverted from the fact that St. Petersburg is Leningrad, Figes is consciously writing for an audience aware of the identity, since only they will appreciate the rhetorical punch of his remark. And he will certainly resist an editor who proposes to replace “Leningrad” with a second “St. Petersburg,” even though there is nothing hyperintensional about being forced to live somewhere.

Another example comes from an article on the transformation of Eric Blair into George Orwell (Lingua Franca vol.9 #9). The writer of the article is hardly diverted from the fact that Blair is Orwell, since his topic is exactly how one personification came to be abandoned for another in the same individual:

Diffident in private, Blair so feared failure in the literary marketplace that he invented a pseudonym for the book he wrote based on his diaries, Down and Out in Paris and London. Criticism would be directed at George Orwell, not Eric Blair. But since the book, when published in 1933, was a literary success, Eric Blair became George Orwell.

Perhaps, “criticism would be directed at George Orwell, not Eric Blair” is hyperintensional, but “Eric Blair became George Orwell” is not; it clearly resists substitution of “George Orwell,” and it would be absurd to say that the writer only makes the claim because he has allowed himself to lose sight of the fact that Blair and Orwell are the same person.

A third example: a New Yorker cartoon in which Superman, so-personified, is talking to his therapist, and reports, “I’m doing super, but Clark can’t find a paper that’s hiring.” It is unclear who the cartoonist thought would find this funny, but knowing that it is the same person is required to get the joke.

These examples and others (including my favorite, in The New York Times’s “The Philosopher Stripper” article—see Forbes 2006:167–8) show that cases like (21)’s occur outside fiction, and that those who create them do so in full awareness of the relevant identity. That (21a) means what (22) means is certainly the most straightforward explanation of why (21a) is perfectly natural. So substitution-resistance in some simple sentences does not provide as great a threat to the claim of substitution-resistance in (2) as might at first seem, since the mechanisms producing the substitution-resistance may be seen as fundamentally the same in the two cases.

d. Richard’s Phone Booth

The final argument for Russellianism to be considered here is the well-known phone booth case in Richard (1983); I have updated it to cell phones. This example exploits the context-dependence of indexical expressions such as “I,” “here,” and “now.” The phenomenon of indexicality was one on which Frege had pronounced views: he wrote about “I” that (Frege 1967:25–6)

…everyone is presented to himself in a particular and primitive way, in which he is presented to no-one else. So when Dr. Lauben thinks he has been wounded, he will probably take as a basis this primitive way in which he is presented to himself. And only Dr. Lauben can grasp thoughts determined in this way. But now Lauben may want to communicate with others. He cannot communicate a thought which he alone can grasp. Therefore, if he now says “I have been wounded,” he must use “I” in a sense which can be grasped by others, perhaps in the sense of “he who is speaking to you at this moment”….

Whatever one thinks of the last remark, the idea that for each thinker x, “I” can be used by x to express a private first-person way of thinking of x, is one which has persisted since Frege proposed it, and is of course implicitly present in much of the history of philosophy, for example, in Descartes’ cogito. (For further discussion of first-person and more generally indexical and demonstrative thought, see Anscombe 1974, Castaneda 1968, Evans 1981, Lewis 1979, Magidor 2015, Peacocke 1983, 2008 Ch. 3, and Perry 1977, 1979.)

An example in Perry (1979) provides a dramatic illustration. Perry is pushing a grocery cart around the aisles in a store when he comes across a trail of sugar on the floor. He thinks “that person is making a mess” and sets off in pursuit to let them know that a bag of sugar in their cart has burst (“that person” is an example of “deferred ostension,” referring via the sugar trail to the person whose cart the sugar bag is in; see further Borg 2002). His pursuit brings him back to the same point in the store, and he realizes, “I am the one who is making a mess.” This appears to be a new thought, and a Fregean would say it differs from “that person is making a mess” in view of the difference between Perry’s demonstrative way of thinking expressed by “that person” and his first-person way of thinking, “I.”

Fregean first-person ways of thinking are private in the sense that if x and y are distinct thinkers, y cannot employ x’s “I”-way of thinking in y’s thoughts, certainly not as a way of thinking of y. However, this does not stop y from ascribing attitudes to x that require x to be employing x’s own first-person way of thinking (see Peacocke 1981, Percus and Sauerland 2003). y might say that Perry has just realized he himself is the one making a mess, which is to make the ascription “Perry has just so-realized that he himself is the one making a mess.” The ability to describe a Fregean proposition as one that is a special way of thinking of the state of affairs that Perry is making a mess does not imply that the constituents of that proposition are available to the ascriber to use in his or her own thoughts.

But de dicto ascriptions may not always be possible. If Perry says of some store employee, “she knows that I made the mess,” he is not ascribing knowledge to her of the proposition that is his “I made the mess”-labeled way of thinking of the state of affairs that Perry made the mess. From a Fregean point of view, the most Perry can mean is the de re “I am known by her to have made the mess,” since the store employee will probably have identified the culprit demonstratively, “that guy is making the mess,” after following the sugar trail. Perry cannot even ascribe a de dicto demonstrative belief to the employee using “she believes that guy is making a mess” pointing at his own reflection in a mirror. Ascribers using a demonstrative in the content-sentences of their ascriptions are expressing their own demonstrative ways of thinking of the relevant object, not characterizing the subject’s thought, which means that the ascriptions are de re (Forbes 1987:13–15).

Let us now return to Richard’s example. It involves switching contexts (“context-hopping”) and uses Kaplan’s (1989) apparatus to manage context-dependence. In Kaplan’s semantics for context-dependent expressions, sentences are evaluated taken in a context and with respect to a possible world, the circumstances of evaluation (1989:544). A context is a sequence of entities which provides referents for the indexicals and demonstratives in a sentence S and so determines the Russellian proposition S expresses. At a minimum, we would have an agent, a time, a place, and an addressee, to be the referents of “I,” “now,” “here,” and “you,” and an object x to be the referent of a demonstrative or demonstrative pronoun (Kaplan uses “agent” rather than “speaker” to allow for a sentence such as “I am not speaking right now” to be true with respect to silent circumstances). When contexts are systematically related, the truth-values of sentences given fixed circumstances are systematically related. For example, suppose that in circumstances w, X is listening to Y at noon Mountain Time (MT), 11/16/17, and let c be a context with X as its agent, noon 11/16/17 MT as its time, and Y as its addressee.

Then the sentence “I am now listening to you” is true taken in c with respect to w. But if we obtain a new context c* from c by switching agent and addressee, then “I am now listening to you” is false taken in c* with respect to w, since Y is speaking, not listening, to X at noon MT 11/16/17, in w. However, “you are now listening to me” is true taken in c* with respect to w, since “I am now listening to you” taken in c identifies the same state of affairs as “you are now listening to me” taken in c*, the state of affairs that X is listening to Y at noon MT, 11/16/17.

In the circumstances w of Richard’s example, a man a is in his apartment, talking to a woman o on his cell phone. a is also looking out the window onto the street below, where he sees a woman talking on her cell phone. It does not occur to a that the woman he is talking to on his phone might be the woman he is watching through his window; but in fact both are o. Then a notices a man in the street acting suspiciously, apparently trying to sneak up on o from behind. In this situation, a could use “she is in danger” to make a sincere assertion to o on his phone about what he sees. But a would not use “you are in danger” to make a sincere assertion to o speaking into his phone (a might instead open the window and shout down to the street). So in the context c with a as agent, o as phone addressee, and o as the referent of “she,” and taking at face value the facts about what a would and would not say with which referential intention as indicative of what a does and does not believe, the following appear to be true:

(23)
a. I believe she is in danger.
b. I do not believe you are in danger.

But Richard argues (1990:117–8) that (23b) is in fact false; in other words, that a does have a belief he could express by asserting into his phone “you are in danger” with the intention to address the person he is talking to. For if we now consider a context c* in which the woman o is agent (and, if we like, a is addressee), the truth of (23a) in c guarantees the truth of

(24)
The person watching me believes I am in danger

in c*. Consequently, if we switch back to the context c,

(25)
The person watching you believes you are in danger is true.

But there is a true identity in c which entails the falsity of (23b), namely,

(26)
I am the person watching you.

By =E, we have the anti-Fregean conclusion

(27)
I believe you are in danger

now seen to be true in c after all.

By Russellian lights, the reasoning is impeccable. But should it move the Fregean? For the Fregean, attitude ascriptions can be ambiguous between de re and de dicto construals, and this applies to (27) in particular. Does the derivability of (27) really show that in c the protagonist a can express a belief of his by asserting “you are in danger” into his phone, using “you” with the intention to refer to the woman he is talking to? Perhaps all that the derivation establishes is the truth of the de re reading of (27), “you are someone I believe to be in danger.” Note that to say that (27)’s de re reading is true in c is not to say that the agent of c believes that it is true, so it still does not give a grounds to say “you are in danger” into his phone.

(23a) can be understood de re as “she is someone I believe to be in danger,” and if the argument is construed de re throughout, the reasoning is correct. But of course the de re conclusion is not a problem for the Fregean. A de dicto conclusion might well be problematic, but to get one we must at least start with the reading of the premise (23a) on which it is a true de dicto self-ascription. Then, if the de re but not the de dicto reading of (27) is true, there must be some step in which there is a de dicto to de re switch. The switch appears to occur in moving from (23a) to (24).

(24) is relevantly similar to an ascription of Perry’s, “the store employee knows that I made the mess.” Here Perry is not ascribing knowledge of the proposition that is his “I made the mess”-labeled way of thinking of the state of affairs that Perry made the mess. By the same token, we should not construe (24) as o’s making an ascription to a of belief in the proposition that o expresses by “I am in danger.” For that way of thinking of the state of affairs that o is in danger is simply unavailable to a, since it involves o’s first-person way of thinking of herself. The truth of (24), then, is no more than the truth of “I am someone who the man watching me believes is in danger,” whose truth in c* is a consequence of (23a)’s truth in c. Thus, the de re conclusion follows from the de dicto starting point, but, to repeat, the de re conclusion is acceptable to the Fregean, since it is silent on what way of thinking the man watching o employs in his “she is in danger” thought.

Richard considers this kind of response (1990:128–32; see also 190–6 for his own critique of his earlier argument) and rejects it. This is partly because he thinks the response imputes opacity to subject-position in ascriptions, and partly because he is generally skeptical about the de re/de dicto distinction. But the above criticism does not seem to involve any opacity in subject-position, that is, a failure of =E when applied to ascriber, for the use of (26) is legitimate, there is no single context in which (23a)’s “I” and (24)’s “the man watching me” are coreferential, and the content-sentence is different in (23a) and (24). Certainly, the reference of “I” in c is the same as the reference of “the man watching me” in c*, but this does not threaten the use of =E if the content-sentence is fixed and interpreted uniformly, in Fine’s sense: “the man who is agent of c believes she is in danger” and “the man who is watching the agent of c* believes she is in danger” have the same truth-value if “she” is unequivocal, and in the second ascription, “she” is not anaphoric upon the embedded “the agent of c*.”

As for general skepticism about de re/de dicto, the reader may refer to the discussion in section 2. Relevant examples arise in extensions of Richard’s case, where the apparent truth of certain statements is easily explained using the distinction, but not without. Suppose that the suspiciously behaving man turns out to be a harmless drunk who staggers on by. The phone conversation then continues in such a way that a soon realizes that the woman he is talking to is the woman he was watching. a may then say such things to o over the phone as “so it was you I thought was in danger” or “I thought you were in danger but didn’t say anything because I didn’t realize it was you I was watching.” These are perfectly natural remarks and seem to be true along with (23b). Employment of the de re/de dicto distinction provides a straightforward explanation of how they can all be true together. So there is no need to take on the obligation burdening the Russellian, of always having to explain away the appearance of truth.

6. References and Further Reading

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Author Information

Graeme Forbes
Email: graeme.forbes@colorado.edu
University of Colorado
U. S. A.