What Else Science Requires of Time

This article adds to the main "Time" article and its supplements. The three most fundamental theories of physical science are (i) the general theory of relativity, (ii) quantum theory, including the standard model of particle physics, and (iii) the big bang theory of cosmology.

Table of Contents

  1. Relativity and Quantum Mechanics
  2. The Big Bang
  3. Infinite Time

Relativity and Quantum Mechanics

EinsteinAccording to relativity and quantum mechanics, time is like a dimension of space. More specifically, spacetime is, loosely speaking, a collection of points called “spacetime locations” where the universe’s physical events occur. Spacetime is four-dimensional and a continuum and time is a distinguished, one-dimensional sub-space of this continuum. Because time is not really a dimension of space, it is less misleading to speak of 4-dimensional spacetime as (3 + 1)-dimensional spacetime.

In mathematical physics, the ordering of instants by the happens-before relation of temporal precedence is complete in the sense that there are no gaps in the sequence of instants. The instants are smooth or continuous. Unlike physical objects, physical time is believed to be infinitely divisible—divisible in the sense of the actually infinite, not merely in Aristotle's sense of potentially infinite. Regarding density of instants, the ordered instants are so densely packed that between any two there is a third, so that no instant has a next instant. Regarding continuity, time’s being a linear continuum implies that there is a nondenumerable infinity of instants between any two non-simultaneous instants. The rational number line does not have this feature; it is not continuous the way the real number line is. Time is "smooth" and not quantized or discrete, even according to quantum mechanics.

All physicists believe that relativity and quantum mechanics are logically inconsistent and need to be replaced by a theory of quantum gravity. A successful theory of quantum gravity is likely to have radical implications for our understanding of time. Two prominent suggestions of what those implications might be are that (i) time will be understood to be quantized, that is, to be discrete rather than continuous, and (ii) time will be seen to emerge from more basic entities. But today "the best game in town" says time is not discrete and does not emerge from a more basic timeless entity.

Aristotle, Newton, and everyone else before Einstein, believed there is a frame-independent notion of an interval of time. For example, if the time interval between two lightning flashes is 100 seconds on someone’s accurate clock, then it also is 100 seconds on your own accurate clock, even if you are flying by the other person at an incredible speed. Einstein rejected this piece of common sense in his 1905 special theory of relativity: “Every reference-body has its own particular time; unless we are told the reference-body to which the statement of time refers, there is no meaning in a statement of the time of an event.” Two reference frames, or reference-bodies, that are moving relative to each other will divide spacetime differently into its time part and its space part. In short, your accurate clock need not agree with another accurate clock, and any two initially synchronized clocks will not stay synchronized if they are in motion relative to each other or undergo different gravitational forces.

In 1908, the mathematician Hermann Minkowski had an original idea in metaphysics regarding space and time. He was the first person to claim that spacetime is more fundamental than either time or space alone. As he put it, “Henceforth space by itself, and time by itself, are doomed to fade away into mere shadows, and only a kind of union of the two will preserve an independent reality.” The metaphysical assumption behind Minkowski’s remark is that what is “independently real” and not merely a mathematical artifact does not vary from one reference frame to another. What does not vary is what we now call “spacetime.” It seems to follow that the division of events into the disjoint regions of the past ones, the present ones, and the future ones is also not “independently real.” One philosophical implication that Minkowski and Einstein accepted is that it’s an error to say, “Only my present is real.”

A coordinate system or reference frame is a way of representing space and time using ordered sets of numbers as names of spacetime points. Science specifies a time coordinate with a single number. Scientists do not believe time is two dimensional; they do not assign ordered pairs of numbers to times because they are confident that, in any reference frame, the happens-before order-relation on events is faithfully reflected in the less-than order-relation on the time numbers that we assign to events. In the fundamental theories such as relativity and quantum mechanics, the values of the time variable t in any reference frame are real numbers, not merely rational numbers. Each real number designates an instant of time, and time is a linear continuum of these instants ordered by the happens-before relation, similar to the mathematician’s real line segment whose points are ordered by the less-than relation. Physical time is treated as being one-dimensional rather than two-dimensional, and continuous rather than discrete. These features do not require time to be linear, however, because a segment of a circle is also a linear continuum, but there is no evidence for circular time, that is, for causal loops. Causal loops are represented in the physicists' spacetime diagrams as worldlines that are closed curves.

The actual temporal structure of events can be embedded in the real numbers, but how about the converse? That is, to what extent is it known that the real numbers can be adequately embedded into the structure of the instants? The problem here is that for times shorter than about 10-43 second (the so-called Planck time), science has no experimental grounds for the claim that between any two events there is a third. Instead, the justification of saying the reals can be embedded into an interval of instants is that the assumption of continuity is so convenient and useful [for example, it allows the mathematical methods of calculus to be used in physics], and that there are no known inconsistencies due to making this assumption, and that there are no better theories available.

Relativity theory challenges a great many of our intuitive beliefs about time. For two events A and B occurring at the same place but at different times, relativity theory implies their order is absolute in the sense of being independent of the frame of reference, and this agrees with common sense and the manifest image of time, but if they are distant from each other and occur close enough in time to be in each other’s absolute elsewhere (that is, for two events that are space-like relative to each other), then event A can occur before event B in one reference frame, but after B in another frame, and simultaneously with B in yet another frame. For example, suppose you are sitting exactly in the middle of a moving train when lightning strikes simultaneously in the front and back of the train, as judged in a reference frame in which the train is not moving. You will know the strikes were simultaneous if the light rays from the two strikes reach you at the same time. However, the two lightning strikes are in each other's absolute elsewhere. This implies that, in the reference frame of a person standing still on the ground outside the train, the lightning strike at the back of the train happened first because the center of the train is speeding away from the strike point. In a frame fixed to a fast plane flying overhead in the same direction as the train and toward the front of the train, then the lightning strike at the front of the train really happened first. It was Einstein's original idea that all three judgments about time order are correct. The event at the front of the train really did happen first, and it really did happen second, and it really did happen at the same time as the event at the back. It's all a matter of which reference frame is used to make the judgment.

In any reference frame, the speed of light is a certain value, customarily called "c". However, in relativity theory there is no allowable reference frame fixed to a photon from which one can ask about the speed of another photon. Only if a reference system moving with less than с speed is used, will the velocity of light be c.

Science impacts our understanding of time in other fundamental ways. Special relativity theory implies there is time dilation between one frame and another. For example, the faster a clock moves, the slower it runs, relative to stationary clocks. But this does not work just for clocks. If a human being moves fast, the human being also ages more slowly than their stationary twin. Time dilation effects occur for tiny protons, too, but protons do not show the effects of their aging the way human bodies and clocks do. Tiny particles with finite lifetimes, on the other hand, do show their aging. A stationary muon has a short half life, but it has a much longer half life when it is moving rapidly according to a stationary clock.

Time dilation also shows itself when a speeding twin returns to find that his (or her) Earth-bound twin has aged more rapidly. This surprising dilation result once caused some philosophers to question the consistency of relativity theory by arguing that, if motion is relative, then we could call the speeding twin “stationary” and it would follow that this twin is now the one who ages more rapidly. If each twin ages more rapidly than the other twin, then we have arrived at a contradiction. This argument for a contradiction is called the twins paradox. Experts now are agreed that the mistake is within the argument for the paradox, not within relativity theory.

Special relativity’s time dilation is due to speed; general relativity’s time dilation is due either to speed or to gravitational fields (and accelerations). Two ideally synchronized clocks do not stay in synchrony if they undergo different gravitational forces. This gravitational time dilation would be especially apparent if one, but not the other, of the two clocks were to approach a black hole. The time shown on the clock approaching the black hole slows upon approach to the horizon (not just at the center of the hole)—relative to time on a clock that remains safely back on Earth.

All this leads to strange visual effects because two observers in relative motion ascribe different directions to the same light ray.

If, as many physicists suspect, the microstructure of spacetime near the Planck length is a quantum foam of changing curvature of spacetime with black holes and perhaps wormholes rapidly forming and dissolving, then time loses its meaning at this small scale. The philosophical implication is that time exists only when we are speaking of regions large compared to the Planck length.

General Relativity theory has other profound implications for time. In 1948, the logician Kurt Gödel discovered radical solutions to Einstein’s equations, solutions in which there are closed time-like curves due to the rotation of the universe’s matter, so that as one progresses forward in time along one of these curves one arrives back at one’s starting point. Gödel drew the conclusion that if matter is distributed so that there is Gödelian spacetime (that is, with a preponderance of galaxies rotating in one direction rather than another), then the universe has no linear time. Fortunately, there is no empirical evidence that our universe has this rotation.

You may have heard the remark that according to relativity theory nothing can go faster than light speed. A number of points need to be made to clarify the remark. (1) First, the theory is about a specific, constant rate c, the speed which light moves in a vacuum. Light itself will move at speed c in a vacuum but at less than c when it goes through air and crystals and other material. Muons travel faster than light inside ice crystals. (2) Second, the light speed limit c applies only to objects within space relative to other objects within space, but relativity theory places no restrictions on how fast space itself can expand. Two objects in free fall can increase the distance between them faster than light speed if space expands fast enough. But during this expansion no object passes another object at faster than light speed. (3) Third, even though relativity theory places a speed limit c on how fast a causal influence can propagate through space, quantum mechanics does not have this limit. In fact, via quantum entanglement, it is claimed by some physicists that a measurement of one member of an entangled pair of particles will instantaneously determine the value of any similar measurement to be made on the other member of the pair. This is philosophically significant because in 1935, E. Schrodinger had said:

Measurements on (spatially) separated systems cannot directly influence each other—that would be magic.

Entangled pairs of particles are not well understood. There are no-go theorems that imply entangled particles cannot be used to send messages from one place to another instantaneously, but this does not rule out instantaneous, coordinated behavior across great distances. Also, with entanglement, there are not two particles separated by a distance, but rather a single extended particle-like system. Some speculate that the two particles in this system are connected in a higher dimension by a wormhole.

The Big Bang

The big bang theory declares that the universe was once in a very small, very compressed, and very hot state. It has been expanding and cooling ever since. The big bang event began as a violent explosion of all space. All material in the space was carried along, too. The explosion was not merely an explosion of material within an already existing space. The explosion began about 13.8 billion years ago, and the explosive process created, and is still creating, new space. The big bang theory in some form or other is accepted by the vast majority of astronomers, astrophysicists, and philosophers of physics; but it is not as firmly accepted as is the theory of relativity.

In 1922, the Russian physicist Alexander Friedmann discovered that the theory of general relativity allows an expanding universe. Einstein reacted by saying this was a mere physical possibility but not a correct description of the actual universe. The Belgian physicist Georges Lemaître independently suggested in 1927 that the universe could be expanding, and he defended his claim using previously published measurements to show a lawlike relationship between the distances of galaxies from Earth and their velocities away from Earth, which he calculated from their Doppler shifts. In 1929, the American astronomer Edwin Hubble observed clusters of galaxies mostly expanding away from each other, and this observation was very influential in causing scientists to accept what is now called the big bang theory of the universe's expansion.

The term "big bang" does not have a precise definition. It does not always refer to a single, first event; rather, it refers to a brief range of early events. Actually, the big bang theory itself is not a specific theory, but is a framework for more specific big bang theories. The popular, but unconfirmed and controversial big bang theories of eternal inflation and the multiverse are more specific frameworks for theories that fit within the big bang framework of theories.

Looking back toward times when the universe was smaller, let's call the time t = 0 the time when it was smallest. Then, according to inflationary theory, near t = 0 the universe underwent a radically fast expansion for some unknown reason. The universe today continues to expand even though the initial rapid expansion has stopped. Atoms are not expanding. What is most noticeably expanding is the average distances between clusters of galaxies, less so the expansion of any cluster. It is as if the clusters are exploding away from each other, and in the future they will be very much farther away from each other.

Think of running backwards a film of the expansion. At any earlier moment, the universe was more compact. Projecting to earlier and earlier times, and assuming that gravitation is the main force at work, the astronomers now conclude that 13.8 billion years ago our universe was smaller than an atom and outrageously dense with an extremely low entropy. Because all substances cool when they expand, physicists believe that the universe once was extremely hot.

However, the expansion rate has not been uniform because of a second source of expansion, the repulsion of dark energy. The influence of dark energy was initially insignificant, but its key feature is that it does not dilute as the space it is within undergoes expansion. So, finally after about eight billion years of space's expanding, the dark energy has become an influential form of accelerating expansion. Dark energy goes by other names: vacuum energy and cosmological constant.

The initial evidence for this dark energy came from observations in 1998 of Doppler shifts of supernovas. These are best explained by the assumption that distances between supernovas are increasing at an accelerating rate. Because of this rate increase, it is estimated that the volume of the universe will double every 1010 years, and any galaxy cluster that is now 100 light years away from our Milky Way will, in another 13.8 billion years, be more than 200 light years away and will be moving much faster away from us. Eventually it will be moving so fast away from us that it will become invisible. In time, so will all galaxy clusters, and then even the galaxes near our own will become invisible. Astronomers are never going to see more than they see now.

During the first three quarters of the twentieth century, it was commonly believed that the entire universe was created in the big bang, and time itself came into existence then. So, the day of the big bang was a day without a yesterday. With the appearance of the big bang theory of eternal inflation in the late 20th century and with new speculative theories of quantum gravity in the 21st century, the question of what happened before our big bang has been resurrected as scientifically legitimate, but there is no consensus among cosmologists as to exactly what happened before the big bang, if anything. The Big Bounce Theory is still an active possibility. More speculatively, perhaps our universe never underwent a period of early hyperinflation and is almost a mirror image of an antimatter universe extending backwards in time before the big bang.

The theory of inflation is still unconfirmed, but here is the argument in favor of it. The cosmic microwave background radiation reaching Earth from all directions is the same cold temperature everywhere, about 2.725 degrees Kelvin, but with ripples everywhere on the order of a hundred thousandth of a degree. Room temperature, by comparison, is 300 degrees Kelvin. The classical big bang theory can account for the number 2.725 but not for its uniformity in all directions nor for the slight deviations in uniformity in temperature on the order of a hundred thousandth of a degree. The big bang theory of inflation can account for these cosmological features, and in the early 21st century, there are no better accounts. The claim that there are no better accounts is challenged in (Ijjas, et. al., 2017).

The theory of inflation postulates that extremely early in the big bang process there was an exponential inflation of space, or perhaps a small patch of space, due to the presence of a gram of very dense material having negative pressure.

The primeval explosion was powered by energy that was predominantly negative and repulsive, perhaps the vacuum energy. Newton-style gravity (or energy) cannot be repulsive, but Einstein’s theory does not rule out there being both attractive gravity and repulsive gravity. The addition by Einstein of the so-called cosmological term to his equations allows for repulsive gravity. Einstein, however, did not consider the possibility of inflation.

Most of the big bang inflationary theories are theories of eternal inflation, of the eternal creation of more and more expanding bubbles of the primeval material. Our own bubble is called the Hubble Bubble. Our visible universe is just one of these expanding bubbles that expanded from the primordial patch; it is assumed that there are other patches of space that can expand, too. This is the multiverse theory. The original theory of inflation was created by Guth in 1981, and the multiverse theory of eternal inflation was created by Gott in 1982. Both theories are controversial, but let us explore more of their details.

Assuming the big bang began at t = 0, the Planck epoch is from t = 0 to t = 10−43 seconds. The epoch of inflation, assuming the controversial assumption that this inflation did exist, began later at about 10−36 seconds and lasted until about t = 10−33 seconds, during which time the volume of space increased by a factor of at least 1078, and any initial unevenness in the distribution of energy was almost all smoothed out. The universe was doubling in size every 10-38 seconds during this inflationary epoch. Another estimate for the doubling is 10-35 seconds. At the end of that epoch, the explosive material decayed for some unknown reason and left only normal matter with positive gravity. This began the period of the so-called quark soup. At this time, our universe continued to expand, although now less rapidly. It went into its "coasting" phase. No matter what the previous curvature of the space in our universe, by the time the inflationary period ended, space had been stretched very "flat," so it was extremely homogeneous, as is the universe we observe today. But at the beginning of that inflationary period there were some very tiny imperfections due to quantum fluctuations, and the densest of these quantum fluctuations turned into what would eventually become galaxies, and these fluctuations have left their traces in the very slight hundred thousandth of a degree differences in the cosmic background radiation.

According to the originator of the theory of inflation, Alan Guth, before inflation began, for some unknown reason the universe contained an unstable inflaton field or false vacuum field. This field underwent a spontaneous phase transition (somewhat analogous to superheated liquid water suddenly and spontaneously expanding into steam, or an insulator quickly changing into a conductor) causing its region of highly repulsive material to hyper-inflate exponentially in volume for a short time. During this primeval inflationary epoch, the field's stored, negative gravitational energy was rapidly released, and all space wildly expanded. At the end of this early inflationary epoch, the highly repulsive material decayed for some as yet unknown reason into ordinary matter and energy, and the universe's expansion rate settled down to just below the rate of expansion observed in the universe today.

Guth described the inflationary period this way:

There was a period of inflation driven by the repulsive gravity of a peculiar kind of material that filled the early universe. Sometimes I call this material a "false vacuum," but, in any case, it was a material which in fact had a negative pressure, which is what allows it to behave this way. Negative pressure causes repulsive gravity. Our particle physics tells us that we expect states of negative pressure to exist at very high energies, so we hypothesize that at least a small patch of the early universe contained this peculiar repulsive gravity material which then drove exponential expansion. Eventually, at least locally where we live, that expansion stopped because this peculiar repulsive gravity material is unstable; and it decayed, becoming normal matter with normal attractive gravity. At that time, the dark energy is there, we think. We think it's always been there, but it's not dominant. It's a tiny, tiny fraction of the total energy density, so at that stage at the end of inflation the universe just starts coasting outward. It has a tremendous outward thrust from the inflation, which carries it on. So, the expansion continues, and as the expansion happens the ordinary matter thins out. The dark energy, we think, remains approximately constant. If it's vacuum energy, it remains exactly constant. So, there comes a time later where the energy density of everything else drops to the level of the dark energy, and we think that happened about five or six billion years ago. After that, as the energy density of normal matter continues to thin out, the dark energy [density] remains constant [and] the dark energy starts to dominate; and that's the phase we are in now. We think about seventy percent or so of the total energy of our universe is dark energy, and that number will continue to increase with time as the normal matter continues to thin out.

World Science U Live Session: Alan Guth, published November 30, 2016 at https://www.youtube.com/watch?v=IWL-sd6PVtM.

Cosmologists actually know much more about the sequence of events at times close to t = 0. For example, before about t = 10-46 seconds, there was a single basic force rather than what we have now which are four separate basic forces: gravity, the strong nuclear force, the weak force, and the electromagnetic force. At about t = 10-46 seconds, the energy density of the primordial field was down to about 1015 GEV, which allowed spontaneous symmetry breaking (analogous to the spontaneous phase change in which steam cools enough to spontaneously change to liquid water); this phase change created the gravitational force as a separate basic force. The other three forces had not yet appeared as separate forces.

During the period of inflation, the universe (our bubble) expanded from the size of a proton to the size of a marble. Later at t = 10-12 seconds, there was more spontaneous symmetry breaking. First the strong nuclear force, and then the weak nuclear force and electromagnetic forces became separate forces. For the first time, the universe now had exactly four separate forces. At t = 10-10 seconds, the Higgs field turned on (that is, came into existence), and particles that now have mass began interacting with the field, which slowed these particles down from light speed and thereby made them have mass.

Much of the considerable energy left over at the end of the inflationary period was converted into matter, antimatter and radiation, such as quarks, antiquarks and photons. The universe's temperature escalated with this new radiation, and this period is called the period of cosmic reheating. Matter-antimatter pairs of particles combined and annihilated, removing the antimatter from the universe, and leaving a small amount of matter and even more radiation. At t = 10-6 seconds, quarks combined together and thereby created protons and neutrons. After t = 3 minutes, the universe had cooled sufficiently to allow these protons and neutrons to start combining strongly to produce hydrogen, deuterium, and helium nuclei. At about t = 380,000 years, the temperature was low enough for these nuclei to capture electrons and to form the initial hydrogen, deuterium and helium atoms of the universe. With these first atoms coming into existence, the universe became transparent in the sense that light was now able to travel freely without always being absorbed very soon by surrounding particles. Due to the expansion of the universe, this early light is today much lower in frequency than it was 380,000 years ago and is detected on Earth as the cosmic microwave background radiation and not as ordinary light. This microwave radiation is almost homogenous and almost isotropic. The energy is still arriving at the Earth's surface from all directions.

In the literature in both physics and philosophy, descriptions of the big bang often speak of it as if it were a first event, but the theory does not require a first event. This description mentioning a first event is a philosophical position, not something demanded by the scientific evidence. Physicists James Hartle and Stephen Hawking considered the past cosmic time-interval to be open rather than closed at t = 0. This means that looking back to the big bang is like following the positive real numbers back to ever smaller positive numbers without ever reaching a smallest positive one. If Hartle and Hawking are correct that time is actually like this, then the big bang had no initial point event. And if the Big Bounce Theory is correct, the past might even be eternal.

The classical big bang theory is based on the assumption that the universal expansion of clusters of galaxies can be projected all the way back to a singularity, a zero volume, at t = 0. Yet physicists agree that the projection must become untrustworthy in the Planck era before exponential expansion began. Current science cannot speak with confidence about the nature of time within this tiny Planck era. If a theory of quantum gravity does get confirmed, it is expected to provide more reliable information about this Planck era, and it may even allow physicists to answer the questions, "What caused the big bang?" and "Did anything happen before then?"

According to the multiverse theory, because most pairs of universes usually occur space-like separated from each other, it is not strictly correct to say the multiple bangs are ordered in time. We cannot make clear sense of these universes occurring before or after each other within the multiverse, although this way of speaking is compelling. Also, in some of these universes there is no time dimension at all.

Could the expansion of the multiverse eventually slow down? No. The primordial explosive material in any single universe decays, but as it decays the part that has not decayed becomes much larger and so the expansion of the multiverse continues. The rate of creation of new bubble universes is increasing exponentially.

Why does the big bang theory (and its revision as the Big Bounce Theory) say space exploded instead of saying matter-energy exploded into a pre-existing space? This is a subtle issue. If it had said matter-energy exploded but space did not, this would be awkward and complicated, for several reasons. There would be the uncomfortable question: Where is the point in space that it exploded from, and why that point? Picking one would be arbitrary. And there would be these additional uncomfortable questions: How large is this pre-existing space? When was it created? During the big bang's explosion, experimental observations clearly indicate that the clusters of galaxies separate from each other faster than the speed of light, but adding that they do this because they are moving that fast within a pre-existing space would require an ad hoc change to the theory of relativity to make exceptions to Einstein's speed limit. So, it is much more "comfortable" to say the big bang is an explosion of space or spacetime, not of matter-energy.

Because the big bang is an explosion of space and not of matter-energy into a pre-existing space, and because an expansion of space carries all its objects with it, the separation between some galaxies after the big bang surely increased faster than the speed of light. Even today, the separation between the Milky Way and some other galaxies is increasing faster than the speed of light. Nevertheless, in our universe, nothing is passing, or ever has passed, or will pass anything at faster than the speed of light; so, in that sense, light speed is still our cosmic speed limit.

Regarding this speed limit, if two firecrackers pass each other at nearly the speed of light and ignite just as they pass each other, their flashes of light will reach any other place in the universe at the same time, although the flashes will arrive with different colors.

Because the big bang happened about 14 billion years ago, you would think at first that no visible object can be more than 14 billion light years from Earth, but this would be a mistake. Spatial separation in the universe is allowed to be faster than the speed of light, despite relativity theory. The increasing separation of clusters of galaxies over the last 14 billion years is why astronomers can see about 45 billion light years in any direction and not just 14 billion light years.

When contemporary physicists speak of the age of our universe and of the time since our big bang, they are implicitly referring to cosmic time, the time in a reference frame in which the average motion of the galaxies is stationary. They are not assuming an arbitrary reference frame, nor one in which the Earth is stationary. To say this another way, cosmic time is time as measured locally by a clock that is sitting still while the universe expands around it.

Other implications of eternal inflation are that (i) everything that can happen will happen, (ii) the multiverse can have no maximum entropy, and (iii) the universe is never a fixed, finite system of particles so there are no Poincaré cycles requiring the universe to return infinitesimally close to every one of its earlier states.

Because of the lack of experimental evidence for the multiverse theories (or even theories of inflation), many physicists complain that their fellow physicists who are developing these theories are doing technical metaphysical speculation, not physics.

Infinite Time

clockThere are three ways to interpret the question, "Is time infinite?":

(a) Is time infinitely divisible?

(b) Will there be an infinite amount of time in the future?

(c) Was there an infinite amount of time in the past?

Let's answer all three questions.

(a) Is time infinitely divisible? Yes, because general relativity and quantum mechanics require time to be a continuum. But the answer will change to "no" if these theories are eventually replaced by a relativistic quantum mechanics that quantizes time. “Although there have been suggestions that spacetime may have a discrete structure,” Stephen Hawking said in 1996, “I see no reason to abandon the continuum theories that have been so successful.” Two decades later, physicists were much less sure.

(b) Will there be an infinite amount of time in the future? Very probably. According to the most popular cosmological theory, the Big Chill Theory, the universe's expansion will continue forever, so forever there will be new events produced from old events. But there is no consensus on this, and there are suggestions for how the universe's future will be finite, as was seen in the main time article's section on the future of time. According to the Big Chill Theory, in 10100 years, all the stars and dust in each galaxy will fall into the black hole at the galaxy's center, and then the material between galaxies will fall in as well, and finally all the black holes will evaporate, leaving only a soup of elementary particles that gets "chillier" and less dense as the universe's expansion continues. Future space will look more and more like empty space, but because of vacuum energy, the temperature will approach, but never reach, zero.

(c) Was there an infinite amount of time in the past? Aristotle argued “yes.” St. Augustine disagreed and said the past is finite. Newton said the world was created a finite time ago, but there was an infinity of time before that. After advances in astronomy in the late 19th and early 20th centuries, the question of the age of the universe became a scientific question. With the initial acceptance of the classical big bang theory, the amount of past time was judged to be finite. In the 21st century, with the rejection of the classical theory's singularity at t = 0, the implication is only that the amount of past time is at least 13.8 billion years.

If the controversial multiverse theory is correct, then every bubble has a finite past, so the inflation might not have been occurring forever. This does not imply necessarily that the multiverse itself began with some first bubble, but many cosmologists do believe this. However, there is no consensus.

Back to the main "Time" article.

Author Information

Bradley Dowden
Email: dowden@csus.edu
California State University, Sacramento
U. S. A.