What Else Science Requires of Time

This article adds to the main "Time" article and its supplements. The three most fundamental theories of physical science are (i) the general theory of relativity, (ii) quantum theory, including the standard model of particle physics, and (iii) the big bang theory of cosmology.

Table of Contents

  1. Relativity and Quantum Mechanics
  2. The Big Bang
  3. Infinite Time

Relativity and Quantum Mechanics

EinsteinGeneral relativity and quantum mechanics are the two fundamental theories of the universe. (For simplicity here, our term "quantum mechanics" includes the Standard Model of Particle Physics and thus quantum field theory.) In both relativity and quantum mechanics, time is like a dimension of space. More specifically, spacetime is, loosely speaking, a collection of points called “spacetime locations” where the universe’s physical events occur. Spacetime is four-dimensional and a continuum and time is a distinguished, one-dimensional sub-space of this continuum. Because time is not really a dimension of space, it is helpful to speak of 4-dimensional spacetime as (3+1)-dimensional spacetime. Technically, all spacetimes are required to be a differentiable manifold with a metric tensor defined on it, but this requirement will not be explained in this article.

In mathematical physics, the ordering of instants by the happens-before relation of temporal precedence is complete in the sense that there are no gaps in the sequence of instants. The instants are smooth; the technical term is that they are "continuous." Unlike physical objects, physical time is believed to be infinitely divisible—divisible in the sense of the actually infinite, not merely in Aristotle's sense of potentially infinite. Regarding density of instants, the ordered instants are so densely packed that between any two there is a third, so that no instant has a next instant. Regarding continuity, time’s being a linear continuum implies that there is a nondenumerable infinity of instants between any two non-simultaneous instants. The rational number line does not have this feature; it is not continuous the way the real number line is. Time is this "smooth" and is not quantized, even according to quantum mechanics.

The actual temporal structure of events can be embedded in the real numbers, but how about the converse? That is, to what extent is it known that the real numbers can be adequately embedded into the structure of the instants? The problem here is that for times shorter than about 10-43 second (the so-called Planck time), science has no experimental grounds for the claim that between any two events there is a third. Instead, the justification of saying the reals can be embedded into an interval of instants is that the assumption of continuity is so convenient and useful [for example, it allows the mathematical methods of calculus to be used in physics], and that there are no known inconsistencies due to making this assumption, and that there are no better theories available.

Leibniz's Principle of Sufficient Reason implies any single event happens for a reason, but quantum mechanics implies that when a single nucleus of radioactive uranium decays at a specific time, there is no reason for the decay; the best quantum mechanics can say is that there was a certain probability of the decay occurring at that time. The statistical veil of quantum mechanics cannot be penetrated. Quantum mechanics is, in this way and many other ways, radically unintuitive. Lee Smolin's reaction to quantum mechanics is that, "we can't make sense of it simply because it isn't true" (Smolin 2013, p. 141).

All physicists believe that relativity and the standard model (including quantum mechanics) are logically inconsistent and need to be replaced by a theory of quantum gravity. A successful theory of quantum gravity is likely to have radical implications for our understanding of time. Two prominent suggestions of what those implications might be are that (i) time will be understood to be quantized, that is, to be discrete rather than continuous, and (ii) time will be seen to emerge from more basic entities. Because there is no well-accepted theory of quantum gravity, so far "the best game in town" says time is not discrete and does not emerge from a more basic timeless entity.

With the acceptance of relativity theory, and its implication that there are many valid perspectives or reference frames and so no one frame is the correct frame, scientists have accepted that any objective description of the world can be made only with statements that are invariant under changes of the reference frame. So, saying you are standing still at 8:00 is not an objective remark if there is no implicit reference frame. You are not standing still as measured in a frame fixed to a spinning carousel that is fixed to the floor of a boat on a choppy sea.

Isaac Newton did not actually use the concept of a reference frame, but it is helpful to use it to succinctly describe his beliefs. Newton assumed that if event 1 lasts just as long as event 2 in one frame, then it does so in other frames. Newton also assumed that, if you are five feet tall in one reference frame, then you are that tall in other frames. Einstein undermined these two Newtonian assumptions.

Einstein said, "Time is relative." This means some, but not all, aspects of time are relative to the chosen reference frame. Relative to, in the sense of depending upon. Newton would say that if you are seated in a moving vehicle, then your speed relative to the vehicle is zero, but your speed relative to the road is not zero. Einstein would agree. However, he would surprise Newton by saying the length of your vehicle is slightly different in the two reference frames. Equally surprising to Newton, the duration of your drinking a cup of coffee while in the vehicle is slightly different in those two reference frames. These effects are called space contraction and time dilation, respectively. So, both length and duration are frame dependent and not objectively real characteristics of things.

With space contraction and time dilation, namely with the relativity of length and of duration, Einstein's theory is requiring a mixing of space and time. Spacetime divides into its space part and its time part differently for two reference frames that move relative to each other. Because there are an infinite number of frames that could be chosen, to claim that an event lasted three minutes without giving even an implicit indication of the reference frame is to make a very ambiguous claim.

Because there is no single correct frame to use for specifying which events are present and which are past, one philosophical implication of the relativity of time is that it seems to be more difficult to defend McTaggart's A-theory that says temporal properties of events such as "is happening now" or "happened in the past" are frame-free properties of those events.

Another profound implication of relativity theory is that two accurate, synchronized clocks do not usually stay synchronized if they move relative to each other or undergo different gravitational forces. Each clock has its own personal time. So does any other physical object. Personal time for an object is the physical time that would be shown by a very small clock if it were attached to the object as the object travels about. In the technical terminology of relativity theory, we adopt the "clock hypothesis" that any correct clock gives the elapsed time along its own world line. A clock's time depends on the clock's history, its history of speed and gravitational influence but not on other forces, such as an electromagnetic force. In short, speed and the presence of matter (and thus gravity) affects the behavior of clocks.

One noteworthy philosophical point here is that, according to general relativity, although the presence of gravity arising from a mass (or energy) implies spacetime has intrinsic curvature, not all spacetime curvature implies the presence of mass or energy. Spacetime containing no mass-energy can still have curvature; therefore, the geometry of spacetime is influenced by, but not always determined by, the behavior of its matter-energy. This point has been interpreted by many philosophers as a good reason to reject Leibniz's classical relationism. The point was first discovered by Arthur Eddington in his analysis of the de Sitter solution to Einstein's equations in his relativity theory.

Relativity theory challenges a great many of our intuitive beliefs about time. For two events A and B occurring at the same place but at different times, relativity theory implies their order is absolute in the sense of being independent of the frame of reference, and this agrees with common sense and thus the commonsense image of time, but if they are distant from each other and occur close enough in time to be in each other’s absolute elsewhere (that is, for two events that are space-like relative to each other), then event A can occur before event B in one reference frame, but after B in another frame, and simultaneously with B in yet another frame. For example, suppose you are sitting exactly in the middle of a moving train when lightning strikes simultaneously in the front and back of the train, as judged in a reference frame in which the train is not moving. You will know the strikes were simultaneous if the light rays from the two strikes reach you at the same time. However, the two lightning strikes are in each other's absolute elsewhere. This implies that, in the reference frame of a person standing still on the ground outside the train, the lightning strike at the back of the train happened first because the center of the train is speeding away from the strike point. In a frame fixed to a fast plane flying overhead in the same direction as the train and toward the front of the train, then the lightning strike at the front of the train really happened first. It was Einstein's original idea that all three judgments about time order are correct. The event at the front of the train really did happen first, and it really did happen second, and it really did happen at the same time as the event at the back. It's all a matter of which reference frame is used to make the judgment.

In any reference frame, the speed of light is a certain value, customarily called "c". However, in relativity theory there is no allowable reference frame fixed to a photon from which one can ask about the speed of another photon. Only if a reference system moving with less than с speed is used, will the velocity of light be c.

As we've just seen, science impacts our understanding of time in many ways. Special relativity theory's main impact is via the relativity of simultaneity and its support for the block univerese. Special relativity is special because it applies to situations in which gravity is non-existent or can be ignored. General relativity includes gravity. Special relativity implies there is time dilation between one frame and another moving one. For example, the faster a clock moves, the slower it runs, relative to stationary clocks. But this does not work just for clocks. If a human being moves fast, the human being also ages more slowly than their stationary twin. Time dilation effects occur for tiny protons, too, but protons do not show the effects of their aging the way human bodies and clocks do. Tiny particles with measurably finite lifetimes, on the other hand, do show their aging because their halflife increases with increasing speed, as measured by a stationary clock. The faster they go, the longer they live.

Time dilation also shows itself when a speeding twin returns to find that his (or her) Earth-bound twin has aged more rapidly. This surprising dilation result once caused some philosophers to question the consistency of relativity theory by arguing that, if motion is relative, then we could call the speeding twin “stationary” and it would follow that this twin is now the one who ages more rapidly. If each twin ages more rapidly than the other twin, then we have arrived at a contradiction. This argument for a contradiction is called the twins paradox. Experts now are agreed that the mistake is within the argument for the paradox, not within relativity theory.

Special relativity’s time dilation is due to speed; general relativity’s time dilation is due either to speed or to gravitational fields (and accelerations). Two ideally synchronized clocks do not stay in synchrony if they undergo different gravitational forces. This gravitational time dilation would be especially apparent if one, but not the other, of the two clocks were to approach a black hole. The time shown on the clock approaching the black hole slows upon approach to the horizon (not just at the center of the hole)—relative to time on a clock that remains safely back on Earth. This leads to strange visual effects because two observers in relative motion ascribe different directions to the same light ray.

If, as many physicists suspect, the microstructure of spacetime near the Planck length is a quantum foam of changing curvature of spacetime with black holes and perhaps wormholes rapidly forming and dissolving, then time loses its meaning at this small scale. The philosophical implication is that time exists only when we are speaking of regions large compared to the Planck length.

General Relativity theory has other profound implications for time. In 1948, the logician Kurt Gödel discovered radical solutions to Einstein’s equations, solutions in which there are closed time-like curves due to the rotation of the universe’s matter, so that as one progresses forward in time along one of these curves one arrives back at one’s starting point. Gödel drew the conclusion that if matter is distributed so that there is Gödelian spacetime (that is, with a preponderance of galaxies rotating in one direction rather than another), then the universe has no linear time. Fortunately, there is no empirical evidence that our universe has this rotation.

The remark that according to relativity theory nothing can go faster than light speed needs some clarification, else it is incorrect. (1) First, the theory is about a specific, constant rate c, the speed which light moves in a vacuum. Light itself will move at speed c in a vacuum but at less than c when it goes through air and crystals and other material. Muons travel faster than light inside ice crystals. (2) Second, the light speed limit c applies only to objects within space relative to other objects within space, but relativity theory places no restrictions on how fast space itself can expand. Two objects in free fall can increase the distance between them faster than light speed if space expands fast enough, as it actually does for objects extremely far from Earth. But during this expansion no object passes another object at faster than light speed. (3) Third, even though relativity theory places a speed limit c on how fast a causal influence can propagate through space, quantum mechanics does not have this limit. In fact, via quantum entanglement, it is claimed by some physicists that a measurement of one member of an entangled pair of particles will instantaneously determine the value of any similar measurement to be made on the other member of the pair. This is philosophically significant because in 1935, E. Schrodinger had said:

Measurements on (spatially) separated systems cannot directly influence each other—that would be magic.

Entangled pairs of particles are not well understood. There are no-go theorems that imply entangled particles cannot be used to send messages from one place to another instantaneously, but this does not rule out instantaneous, coordinated behavior across great distances. Also, with entanglement, there are not two particles separated by a distance, but rather a single extended particle-like system. Some speculate that the two particles in this system are connected in a higher dimension by a wormhole.

The Big Bang

The big bang theory declares that the universe was once in a very small, very compressed, and very hot state. It has been expanding and cooling ever since. The big bang event began as a violent explosion of all space. All material in the space was carried along, too. The explosion was not merely an explosion of material within an already existing space. The explosion began about 13.8 billion years ago, and the explosive process created, and is still creating, new space. The big bang theory in some form or other is accepted by the vast majority of astronomers, astrophysicists, and philosophers of physics; but it is not as firmly accepted as is the theory of relativity.

In 1922, the Russian physicist Alexander Friedmann discovered that the theory of general relativity allows an expanding universe. Einstein reacted by saying this was a mere physical possibility but not a correct description of the actual universe. The Belgian physicist Georges Lemaître independently suggested in 1927 that the universe could be expanding, and he defended his claim using previously published measurements to show a lawlike relationship between the distances of galaxies from Earth and their velocities away from Earth, which he calculated from their Doppler shifts. In 1929, the American astronomer Edwin Hubble observed clusters of galaxies mostly expanding away from each other, and this observation was very influential in causing scientists to accept what is now called the big bang theory of the universe's expansion.

The term "big bang" does not have a precise definition. It does not always refer to a single, first event; rather, it refers to a brief range of early events. Actually, the big bang theory itself is not a specific theory, but is a framework for more specific big bang theories. The popular, but unconfirmed and controversial big bang theories with a multiverse are more specific frameworks for theories that fit within the big bang framework.

Looking back toward times when the universe was smaller, let's call the time t = 0 the time when it might have had a zero volume. Then, according to inflationary theory, near t = 0 the universe underwent a radically fast expansion for some unknown reason, perhaps due to quantum fluctuations of an inflaton field. The universe today continues to expand even though the initial rapid expansion has stopped. Atoms are not expanding. What is most noticeably expanding is the average distances between clusters of galaxies, less so the expansion of any cluster. It is as if the clusters are exploding away from each other, and in the future they will be very much farther away from each other.

Think of running backwards a film of the expansion. At any earlier moment, the universe was more compact. Projecting to earlier and earlier times, and assuming that gravitation is the main force at work, the astronomers now conclude that 13.8 billion years ago our universe was smaller than an atom and outrageously dense with an extremely low entropy. Because all substances cool when they expand, physicists believe that the universe once was extremely hot.

However, the expansion rate has not been uniform because of a second source of expansion, the repulsion of dark energy. The influence of dark energy was initially insignificant, but its key feature is that it does not dilute as the space it is within undergoes expansion. So, finally after about eight billion years of space's expanding, the dark energy has become an influential form of accelerating expansion. Dark energy goes by other names: vacuum energy and cosmological constant.

The initial evidence for this dark energy came from observations in 1998 of Doppler shifts of supernovas. These are best explained by the assumption that distances between supernovas are increasing at an accelerating rate. Because of this rate increase, it is estimated that the volume of the universe will double every 1010 years, and any galaxy cluster that is now 100 light years away from our Milky Way will, in another 13.8 billion years, be more than 200 light years away and will be moving much faster away from us. Eventually it will be moving so fast away from us that it will become invisible. In time, so will all galaxy clusters, and then even the galaxes near our own will become invisible. Astronomers are never going to see more than they see now.

During the first three quarters of the twentieth century, it was commonly believed that the entire universe was created in the big bang, and time itself came into existence then. So, the day of the big bang was a day without a yesterday. With the appearance of the big bang theory of eternal inflation in the late 20th century and with new speculative theories of quantum gravity in the 21st century, the question of what happened before our big bang has been resurrected as scientifically legitimate, but there is no consensus among cosmologists as to exactly what happened before the big bang, if anything. The Big Bounce Theory is still an active possibility. More speculatively, perhaps our universe never underwent a period of early hyperinflation and is almost a mirror image of an antimatter universe extending backwards in time before the big bang.

The theory of inflation is still unconfirmed, but here is the argument in favor of it. The cosmic microwave background radiation reaching Earth from all directions is the same cold temperature everywhere, about 2.725 degrees Kelvin, but with ripples everywhere on the order of a hundred thousandth of a degree. Room temperature, by comparison, is 300 degrees Kelvin. The classical big bang theory can account for the number 2.725 but not for its uniformity in all directions nor for the slight deviations in uniformity in temperature on the order of a hundred thousandth of a degree. The big bang theory of inflation can account for these cosmological features, and in the early 21st century, there are no better accounts. The claim that there are no better accounts is challenged in (Ijjas, et. al., 2017).

The theory of inflation postulates that extremely early in the big bang process there was an exponential inflation of space, or perhaps a small patch of space, due to the presence of a gram of very dense material having negative pressure.

The primeval explosion was powered by energy that was predominantly negative and repulsive, perhaps the vacuum energy. Newton-style gravity (or energy) cannot be repulsive, but Einstein’s theory does not rule out there being both attractive gravity and repulsive gravity. The addition by Einstein of the so-called cosmological term to his equations allows for repulsive gravity. Einstein, however, did not consider the possibility of inflation.

Inflation can go on forever or for only a finite time, producing either an infinite number of universes or only a finite number. Most of the big bang inflationary theories are theories of eternal inflation, of the eternal creation of more and more expanding bubbles of the primeval material. Our own bubble is called the Hubble Bubble. Our visible universe is just one of these expanding bubbles that expanded from the primordial patch or at least from an earlier patch ; it is assumed that there are other patches of space that can expand, too. This is the multiverse theory. The original theory of inflation was created by Guth in 1981, and the multiverse theory of eternal inflation was created by Gott, Linde and Vilenkin in the early 1980s. These theories are controversial, but let us explore more of their details.

Assuming the big bang began at time t = 0, the Planck epoch is from t = 0 to t = 10−43 seconds. The epoch of inflation, assuming inflation did exist, began later at about 10−36 seconds and lasted until about t = 10−33 seconds, during which time the volume of space increased by a factor of at least 1078, and any initial unevenness in the distribution of energy was almost all smoothed out. At the end of that epoch, the explosive material decayed for some unknown reason and left only normal matter with attractive gravity. This began the period of the so-called quark soup. At this time, our universe continued to expand, although now less rapidly. It went into its "coasting" phase. No matter what the previous curvature of the space in our universe, by the time the inflationary period ended, space had been stretched very "flat," so it was extremely homogeneous, as is the universe we observe today. But at very the beginning of the inflationary period there were some very tiny imperfections due to quantum fluctuations, and the densest of these quantum fluctuations turned into what would eventually become galaxies, and these fluctuations have left their traces in the very slight hundred thousandth of a degree differences in the temperature of the cosmic background radiation.

Before inflation began, for some unknown reason the universe contained an unstable inflaton field or false vacuum field. This field underwent a spontaneous phase transition (somewhat analogous to superheated liquid water suddenly and spontaneously expanding into steam) causing its region of highly repulsive material to hyper-inflate exponentially in volume for a short time. During this primeval inflationary epoch, the field's stored, negative gravitational energy was rapidly released, and all space wildly expanded. At the end of this early inflationary epoch, the highly repulsive material decayed for some as yet unknown reason into ordinary matter and energy, and the universe's expansion rate settled down to just below the rate of expansion observed in the universe today.

Guth described the inflationary period this way:

There was a period of inflation driven by the repulsive gravity of a peculiar kind of material that filled the early universe. Sometimes I call this material a "false vacuum," but, in any case, it was a material which in fact had a negative pressure, which is what allows it to behave this way. Negative pressure causes repulsive gravity. Our particle physics tells us that we expect states of negative pressure to exist at very high energies, so we hypothesize that at least a small patch of the early universe contained this peculiar repulsive gravity material which then drove exponential expansion. Eventually, at least locally where we live, that expansion stopped because this peculiar repulsive gravity material is unstable; and it decayed, becoming normal matter with normal attractive gravity. At that time, the dark energy was there, the experts think. It has always been there, but it's not dominant. It's a tiny, tiny fraction of the total energy density, so at that stage at the end of inflation the universe just starts coasting outward. It has a tremendous outward thrust from the inflation, which carries it on. So, the expansion continues, and as the expansion happens the ordinary matter thins out. The dark energy, we think, remains approximately constant. If it's vacuum energy, it remains exactly constant. So, there comes a time later where the energy density of everything else drops to the level of the dark energy, and we think that happened about five or six billion years ago. After that, as the energy density of normal matter continues to thin out, the dark energy [density] remains constant [and] the dark energy starts to dominate; and that's the phase we are in now. We think about seventy percent or so of the total energy of our universe is dark energy, and that number will continue to increase with time as the normal matter continues to thin out.

World Science U Live Session: Alan Guth, published November 30, 2016 at https://www.youtube.com/watch?v=IWL-sd6PVtM.

Cosmologists actually know much more about the sequence of events at times close to t = 0. For example, before about t = 10-46 seconds, there was a single basic force rather than what we have now which are four separate basic forces: gravity, the strong nuclear force, the weak force, and the electromagnetic force. At about t = 10-46 seconds, the energy density of the primordial field was down to about 1015 GEV, which allowed spontaneous symmetry breaking (analogous to the spontaneous phase change in which steam cools enough to spontaneously change to liquid water); this phase change created the gravitational force as a separate basic force. The other three forces had not yet appeared as separate forces.

During the period of inflation, the universe (our bubble) expanded from the size of a proton to the size of a marble. Later at t = 10-12 seconds, there was more spontaneous symmetry breaking. First the strong nuclear force, and then the weak nuclear force and electromagnetic forces became separate forces. For the first time, the universe now had exactly four separate forces. At t = 10-10 seconds, the Higgs field turned on (that is, came into existence), and particles that now have mass began interacting with the field, which slowed these particles down from light speed and thereby made them have mass.

Much of the considerable energy left over at the end of the inflationary period was converted into matter, antimatter and radiation, such as quarks, antiquarks and photons. The universe's temperature escalated with this new radiation, and this period is called the period of cosmic reheating. Matter-antimatter pairs of particles combined and annihilated, removing the antimatter from the universe, and leaving a small amount of matter and even more radiation. At t = 10-6 seconds, quarks combined together and thereby created protons and neutrons. After t = 3 minutes, the universe had cooled sufficiently to allow these protons and neutrons to start combining strongly to produce hydrogen, deuterium, and helium nuclei. At about t = 380,000 years, the temperature was low enough for these nuclei to capture electrons and to form the initial hydrogen, deuterium and helium atoms of the universe. With these first atoms coming into existence, the universe became transparent in the sense that light was now able to travel freely without always being absorbed very soon by surrounding particles. Due to the expansion of the universe, this early light is today much lower in frequency than it was 380,000 years ago and is detected on Earth as the cosmic microwave background radiation and not as ordinary light. This microwave radiation is almost homogenous and almost isotropic. The energy is still arriving at the Earth's surface from all directions.

In the literature in both physics and philosophy, descriptions of the big bang often speak of it as if it were a first event, but the theory does not require a first event. This description mentioning a first event is a philosophical position, not something demanded by the scientific evidence. Physicists James Hartle and Stephen Hawking considered the past cosmic time-interval to be open rather than closed at t = 0. This means that looking back to the big bang is like following the positive real numbers back to ever smaller positive numbers without ever reaching a smallest positive one. If Hartle and Hawking are correct that time is actually like this, then the big bang had no initial point event or first time. But if the Big Bounce Theory is correct instead, then there was a past before the big bang.

The classical big bang theory is based on the assumption that the universal expansion of clusters of galaxies can be projected all the way back to a singularity, a zero volume, at t = 0. Yet physicists agree that the projection must become untrustworthy in the Planck era before exponential expansion began. Current science cannot speak with confidence about the nature of time within this tiny Planck era. If a theory of quantum gravity does get confirmed, it is expected to provide more reliable information about this Planck era, and it may even allow physicists to answer the questions, "What caused the big bang?" and "Did anything happen before then?"

According to the multiverse theory, because most pairs of universes usually occur space-like separated from each other, it is not strictly correct to say the multiple bangs are ordered in time. We cannot make clear sense of these universes occurring before or after each other within the multiverse, although this way of speaking is compelling. Also, in some of these universes there is no time dimension at all.

Could the expansion of the multiverse eventually slow down? No. The primordial explosive material in any single universe decays, but as it decays the part that has not decayed becomes much larger and so the expansion of the multiverse continues. The rate of creation of new bubble universes is increasing exponentially.

Why does the big bang theory (and its revision as the Big Bounce Theory) say space exploded instead of saying matter-energy exploded into a pre-existing space? This is a subtle issue. If it had said matter-energy exploded but space did not, this would be awkward and complicated, for several reasons. There would be the uncomfortable question: Where is the point in space that it exploded from, and why that point? Picking one would be arbitrary. And there would be these additional uncomfortable questions: How large is this pre-existing space? When was it created? During the big bang's explosion, experimental observations clearly indicate that the clusters of galaxies separate from each other faster than the speed of light, but adding that they do this because they are moving that fast within a pre-existing space would require an ad hoc change to the theory of relativity to make exceptions to Einstein's speed limit. So, it is much more "comfortable" to say the big bang is an explosion of space or spacetime, not of matter-energy.

Because the big bang is an explosion of space and not of matter-energy into a pre-existing space, and because an expansion of space carries all its objects with it, the separation between some galaxies after the big bang surely increased faster than the speed of light. Even today, the separation between the Milky Way and some other galaxies is increasing faster than the speed of light. Nevertheless, in our universe, nothing is passing, or ever has passed, or will pass anything at faster than the speed of light; so, in that sense, light speed is still our cosmic speed limit.

Regarding this speed limit, if two firecrackers pass each other at nearly the speed of light and ignite just as they pass each other, their flashes of light will reach any other place in the universe at the same time, although the flashes will arrive with different colors.

Because the big bang happened about 14 billion years ago, you would think at first that no visible object can be more than 14 billion light years from Earth, but this would be a mistake. Spatial separation in the universe is allowed to be faster than the speed of light, despite relativity theory. The increasing separation of clusters of galaxies over the last 14 billion years is why astronomers can see about 45 billion light years in any direction and not just 14 billion light years.

When contemporary physicists speak of the age of our universe and of the time since our big bang, they are implicitly referring to cosmic time, the time in a reference frame in which the average motion of the galaxies is stationary. They are not assuming an arbitrary reference frame, nor one in which the Earth is stationary. To say this another way, cosmic time is time as measured locally by a clock that is sitting still while the universe expands around it.

Other implications of eternal inflation are that (i) everything that can happen will happen, (ii) the multiverse can have no maximum entropy, and (iii) the universe is never a fixed, finite system of particles so there are no Poincaré cycles requiring the universe to return infinitesimally close to every one of its earlier states.

Because of the lack of experimental evidence for the multiverse theories (or even theories of inflation), many physicists complain that their fellow physicists who are developing these theories are doing technical metaphysical speculation, not physics.

Infinite Time

clockIs time infinitely divisible? Yes, because general relativity and quantum mechanics require time to be a continuum. But this answer will change to "no" if these theories are eventually replaced by a relativistic quantum mechanics that quantizes time, which is likely. “Although there have been suggestions that spacetime may have a discrete structure,” Stephen Hawking said in 1996, “I see no reason to abandon the continuum theories that have been so successful.” Two decades later, physicists were much less sure.

Will there be an infinite amount of time in the future? Maybe. As seen in the supplement to the main "Time" article, time ends within a black hole, but what about outside in the normal part of the universe? According to the most popular cosmological theory, the Big Chill Theory, the universe's expansion will continue forever because the dark energy will not disappear, and it is what causes the expansion of the universe. So, forever there will be new events produced from old events. But there is no solid consensus on this. According to the Big Chill Theory, the last star will burn out in 1015 years. Then all the stars and dust in each galaxy will fall into black holes, and then the material between galaxies will fall in as well, and finally in about 10100 years all the black holes will evaporate, leaving only a soup of elementary particles that gets "chillier" and less dense as the universe's expansion continues. Future space will look more and more like empty space, but because of vacuum energy, the temperature will only approach, but never reach, zero (on the Kelvin scale).

According to (Carroll 2016, pp. 197-199),

If the universe had a nonzero amount of some conserved quantity like energy or charge, it couldn't have an earliest moment in time—and still obey the laws of physics. The first moment of such a universe would be one in which energy or charge existed without any previous existence, which is against the rules.

What if the total is exactly zero? In this second scenario, temporal change is not fundamental but is a higher-level emergent feature. The universe in this zero-sum scenario is fundamentally a superposition of all individual moments as described by the timeless version of the Schrödinger equation, namely the Wheeler-DeWitt equation. Probably there are only a finite number of moments, and this implies that the past and future are finite. Experts disagree on which of the two scenarios is the most likely, but there is a bit more support for the nonzero-sum scenario, which requires time to be infinite.

Here is more commentary from Carroll (2016, pp. 197-8):

There are two possibilities: one where the universe is eternal, one where it had a beginning. That's because the Schrodinger equation of quantum mechanics turns out to have two very different kinds of solutions, corresponding to two different kinds of universe.

One possibility is that time is fundamental, and the universe changes as time passes. In that case, the Schrödinger equation is unequivocal: time is infinite. If the universe truly evolves, it always has been evolving and always will evolve. There is no starting and stopping. There may have been a moment that looks like our Big Bang, but it would have only been a temporary phase, and there would be more universe that was there even before the event.

The other possibility is that time is not truly fundamental, but rather emergent. Then, the universe can have a beginning. The Schrödinger equation has solutions describing universes that don't evolve at all: they just sit there, unchanging.

...And if that's true, then there's no problem at all with there being a first moment in time. The whole idea of "time" is just an approximation anyway.

Back to the main "Time" article.

Author Information

Bradley Dowden
Email: dowden@csus.edu
California State University, Sacramento
U. S. A.