Marie de Rabutin-Chantal, Marquise de Sévigné (1626—1696)
Madame de Sévigné was France’s preeminent writer of epistles in the seventeenth century. She appears at first glance to possess few philosophical credentials because she neither received formal philosophical instruction nor composed philosophical treatises. Yet in her extensive correspondence, De Sévigné develops a distinctive position on the philosophical disputes of her era. Rejecting the mechanistic account of nature, she supports a realist philosophy of nature, especially sensitive to the aesthetic structure of the cosmos. Sympathetic to Jansenism, De Sévigné develops a philosophy of God that stresses the divine will and the omnipresence of divine causation. Her moral psychology explores the amatory structure of human desire and the difficulty of accepting one’s mortality. Representative of neoclassicism, her philosophy of art privileges the values of harmony, proportion, and balance. An avid reader of theological and philosophical works, she provides a running commentary on the theories of her favorite contemporary authors. Her letters reflect the intellectual sophistication of the period’s salon culture, where the philosophical controversies spawned by Cartesianism had become the object of everyday discussion.
Table of Contents
- Philosophical Themes
- Reception and Interpretation
- References and Further Reading
Born on February 5, 1626, Marie de Rabutin-Chantal belonged to an ancient Burgundian aristocratic family. Her most famous ancestor was her paternal grandmother Jeanne de Chantal, the founder of the Visitation order of nuns, who was canonized a saint in 1767. Her father Celse-Bénigne de Rabutin, baron de Chantal, died during battle with the English on the island of Rhé in 1627. Her mother Marie de Coulanges, baroness de Chantal, died in 1633. The guardianship of the orphan passed to her maternal uncle Philippe de Coulanges, abbé de Livry.
Under Coulanges’s direction, the young Marie received a solid classical education. She studied Italian, Spanish, and Latin. She read passages from Virgil in the original Latin. The poet Jean Chapelain and the linguist Gilles Ménage, who would later write The History of Women Philosophers in1690, served as tutors.
On August 4 1644, Marie married Marquis Henri de Sévigné, scion of an ancient Breton noble family. The newly married couple shared their time between the husband’s ancestral Breton residence, Les Rochers, and their Parisian townhouse in the Place des Vosges, where they participated in the life of the capital’s salons. Madame de Sévigné gave birth to a daughter, Françoise in 1646 and to a son, Charles in 1648. Her husband perished ingloriously in 1651 in the course of a duel he fought over his mistress.
The handsome and wealthy widow was the object of numerous marriage proposals, but Madame de Sévigné never remarried. She became a regular participant in the literary salon of the Hôtel de Rambouillet. During the civil war of the Fronde in1648-52, she alternately opposed and supported the royalist party. She formed a close friendship with finance minister Nicolas Fouquet, whom she would openly support during his trial and imprisonment after he fell from power in the court of Louis XIV.
Among her salon acquaintances, Sévigné counted numerous prominent authors: the memorialist Cardinal de Retz, the novelist Madame Lafayette, the moralist La Rochefocuauld, and the Cartesian essayist Corbinelli. She participated in the literary quarrels of the time, championing Corneille over Racine and becoming the object of satire in works by her cousin, the chronicler Bussy-Rabutin. An avid reader, Sévigné studied a wide range of ancient and modern works. Among the classics, she preferred Virgil, Quintilian, and Tacitus; among Italian authors, Tasso and Ariosto; among French authors, Corneille, Molière, La Fontaine, Montaigne, and Rabelais. In theological literature, she preferred Saint Augustine and the neo-Augustinian authors of the Jansenist movement: Pascal and Nicole. She had a pronounced taste for pulpit oratory, the Jesuit Bourdaloue being her favorite preacher. Her correspondence frequently cited the conversations and books she has encountered. The writings of the neo-Augustinian moralistes proved particularly influential in the development of Sévigné’s philosophical theories.
In 1669 her daughter Françoise de Sévigné married François d’Adhémar, count of Grignan. When the Grignans moved to Provence in 1671 so that the Count of Grignan could fulfill a military commission, Madame de Sévigné faced an emotional crisis. Openly admitting her idolatrous love for her daughter, Sévigné could not accept the daughter’s absence. The solution was the initiation of a correspondence between mother and daughter, which would eventually include hundreds of letters. Her other correspondents included Charles de Sévigné, Abbé de Coulanges, and Bussy-Rabutin.
During her last decades, Sévigné alternated her residence between the estate at Les Rochers and her celebrated Parisian mansion, Hôtel de Carnavalet. She made numerous trips to visit her daughter, who became a partisan of Descartes. Sévigné’s ardent attachment to her daughter was not reciprocated by Madame de Grignan, who found her mother’s frequent letters and visits suffocating. Sévigné fared little better with her son Charles, whose career as a military officer was followed by a life of profligate expenses and sexual dissipation.
Madame de Sévigné died from small pox at Madame de Grignan’s estate on April 17, 1696.
The letters of Madame de Sévigné only slowly became a published collection of correspondence. During her lifetime, individual letters were already copied and read by members of her social circle. Circulation of letters and memoirs was not unusual in the era’s salons. The preeminent literary quality of the letters quickly established them as favored salon reading.
Bussy-Rabutin provided the first print version of Sévigné’s letters, embedded within editions of his own writings, published in 1696, 1697, and 1709. Her granddaughter Madame de Simiane supervised the first edition of her letters to Madame de Grignan in 1726; Chevalier de Perrin published a corrected edition of these letters in 1734, 1737, and 1754. An edition of newly discovered letters was published in 1773. The eighteenth-century editions of Sévigné’s correspondence should be treated with caution since the editors often corrected the prose of the letters to suit the tastes of the period.
In the nineteenth century the recognizable canon of Sévigné’s correspondence emerged. L.-J.-N. Monmerqué, after publishing editions of previously unpublished letters in 1824 and 1827, edited the 14-volume edition of the complete correspondence of Sévigné. This volume included letter fragments and newly discovered, previously unpublished, letters in 1862-66. After many expanded editions of her writings, Roger Duchêne’s 3-volume critical edition of Sévigné’s correspondence published in 1972-78 became the standard reference for scholars.
The wide diffusion of Sévigné’s writings was due primarily to the French academic establishment. Beginning in the nineteenth century, French secondary school officials used textbook and anthology versions of Sévigné’s letters to provide students with a model of epistolary French prose. Countless French courses throughout the French empire and the non-Francophone world followed the lead of French education ministers and incorporated the works of Sévigné into their curriculum.
Madame de Sévigné repeatedly admits to her daughter, an ardent disciple of Descartes, that she is not a systematic philosopher. Despite this, in her correspondence, Sévigné presents her personal position on contested philosophical questions of the day. In many passages she defends her theories concerning nature, religion, moral psychology, and art. If conversant with the Cartesianism of the salons, she is personally more sympathetic to the austere Jansenism of Pascal. Her correspondence is a chronicle of the philosophical debates of her era. As Sévigné recounts in salon conversations and in comments on her extensive reading, one overhears the philosophical quarrels which agitated the learned aristocracy of the period.
As commentators have long noted, Sévigné’s account of nature often appears to be a forerunner of romanticism. Nature is the place of an incomparable beauty best pursued in disciplined solitude. Sévigné opposes the Cartesian conception of nature as a machine reducible to mathematical attributes of extension and movement.
Sévigné’s opposition to the mechanistic theory of nature appears most clearly in her defense of nonhuman animals as ensouled beings. The easily observable conduct of pets indicates the mental and volitional actions of which they are capable.
Speak…about your machines, the machines which love, the machines which make an election of someone, the machines which are jealous, the machines which fear. Now go on; you are mocking us. Descartes never should have tried to make us believe this [Letter to Madame de Grignan; September 15, 1680].
The Cartesian theory of the machine-beast defies the data of common sense and empties nature of the various ensouled entities which populate it.
Sévigné praises those Cartesians who reject the mechanistic account of animals and defend the theory of the thinking animal.
He [Abbé de Montigny] spoke about the small parts [Cartesian language for atoms, the smallest particles of material objects] with this bishop [Bishop of Léon], who is a red-hot Cartesian, but with the same passion he also supported the theory that animals think [Letter to Madame de Grignan; September 2, 1671].
Opposed to the mechanistic conception of nature, Sévigné conceives nature in aesthetic terms. Nature is a place of enchantment where the engaged observer experiences a beauty which exists in no other physical setting.
These woods are always beautiful; their greenness is a hundred times more beautiful than that of Livry. I do not know whether it is due to the quality of the trees or to the freshness of the rains, but there can be no comparison. Everything today has the same green it had during the month of May. The leaves which fall are dead but those holding on are still green. You have never gazed on such beauty [Letter to Madame de Grignan; October 20, 1675].
The site of ecstatic beauty, nature becomes quasi-miraculous.
Such beautiful natural sites serve a key anthropological purpose: they permit human beings to exercise the soul’s highest faculties in solitude. In many passages Sévigné summons her daughter to experience the spiritual peace possible only within the solitary embrace of nature.
You are thirsting to be alone. Then by God, my beloved, come to our woods! It is a perfect solitude. We are having such splendid weather there that I spend all day there until night arrives. I think about you there a thousand or two thousand times with such tenderness that I would betray it if I believed I could describe it in writing [Letter to Madame de Grignan; December 22, 1675].
It is in such a natural oasis that the soul’s capacity for introspection, religious contemplation, and loving desire can flourish.
The garden constitutes the summit of human art, perfecting the bounty of nature and transforming it for the purposes of the meditative soul.
We are in a perfect solitude here and I find myself better for it. This park is much more beautiful than anything you have ever seen. The shade created by my small trees creates a beauty that was not so well projected by the sticks we used to have [Letter to Madame de Grignan; July 19, 1671].
In such a perfected natural refuge human thought and desire can reach their apex.
Many passages in the correspondence deal with theological issues. Sévigné’s concept of God draws primarily from Jansenism.This neo-Augustinian movement stresses divine sovereignty, predestination, the depth of human sinfulness, and complete dependence on grace for salvation. Her letters reference the many Jansenist authors who shape her theological perspective: Blaise Pascal, Pierre Nicole, Antoine Arnauld, Robert Arnauld d’Andilly, and Saint-Cyran. She describes the convent of Port Royal-des-Champs, the citadel of the Jansenist movement, with the enthusiasm of an acolyte.
This Port-Royal is a Thebiade [an austere, secluded place similar to that inhabited by the desert fathers of the church]. It is paradise. It is a desert where all the devotion of Christianity is spread out. It is a holiness radiating out into all the territory for a mile around it. There are five or six unknown solitaries [lay male auxiliaries of the convent] who live like the penitents in the days of John Climacus [a theologian of the desert fathers]. The nuns are angels on earth [Letter to Madame de Grignan; January 26, 1674].
Nonetheless, Sévigné absorbs this Jansenist theological culture with her characteristic moderation and irony. When a dispute breaks out over whether Jansenists should give written submission in relation to a church condemnation of several theses allegedly defended by Jansenius, she sides with neither the seigneuses nor the nonseigneuses.
Here is another example of caution. Our sisters of Saint Martha told me, “At last, may God be praised! God has touched the heart of this poor child [a signeuese]; she has been placed in the path of obedience and salvation.” From there I went to Port-Royal. There I found a certain esteemed solitaire that you know. He started by telling me, “Well, this poor gosling has signed. Finally, God has abandoned her. She has jumped away from him.” As for myself, I thought I would die laughing in reflecting on their preoccupations. Now, here is the world in all its natural color. I believe that the middle between these extremities is always better [Letter to Madame de Grignan; November 21, 1664].
Faithful to Jansenist theology, Sévigné stresses the divine will as God’s central attribute. Even the smallest occurrences in everyday life reflect the silent work of God’s ordering of time. The fulcrum of Sévigné’s emotional life, the rhythm of physical separation and union with her daughter is ultimately governed by God’s volition.
My dearly beloved, we’ve arrived at the point where we must go, must desire, and must pass our days one after the other just as God has pleased to give them to us. Following your example, I want to abandon myself to the sweet hope of seeing and embracing you in the upcoming month. I want to believe that God will permit us to have this perfect joy, although nothing in the world is so easy as adding some bitterness to this joy, if we so desire. There is no moment of rest in this life. It is a goodness of Providence that that we make a truce concerning those sad reflections which could clearly disturb us on a daily basis [Letter to Madame de Grignan; Letter of July 1, 1685].
Psychological movements and physical actions reflect God’s sovereign will in the working out of history.
This omnipresence of the divine will’s activity is expressed as divine providence in the life in the individual. Discrete events in an individual’s life express in fact a providential design for the person.
Providence guides us with so much goodness in all these different times of our life that we practically do not feel it at all. This movement takes place very gradually; it is imperceptible. It is the quiet hand of the sundial we do not see at work. If at the age of twenty, we were given a glimpse of our older state in our family and someone made us see in the mirror the face we have now and the face we will have when we are sixty, the comparison between the two would make us collapse. We would be terrified. But we advance day by day. Today we are like yesterday; tomorrow we will be like today. Thus, we move on without feeling it. This is one of the miracles of Providence which I adore [Letter to Moulceau; January 27, 1687].
Under the guise of Providence, the divine will’s actions become an object of devotion.
The light of faith reveals the presence of divine providence at work in what appear to be unrelated episodes of human action, although the nature and outcome of the divine will’s actions remain obscure.
We cannot see underneath the cards, but it is this Providence which guides us along these extraordinary paths. Far from revealing the end of the novel, this action does not permit us to draw any conclusions from it or to offer any reproaches against it. Therefore, we must return to our starting point and accept without murmuring all that it pleases God to do to us [Letter to Bussy-Rabutin; August 13, 1688].
This emphasis on the inscrutable nature of divine providence echoes the Jansenist insistence on the radical darkening of the human intellect, occasioned by the fall and propagated by human concupiscence.
Sévigné’s emphasis on the omnipresence of divine providence tends to reduce all causation to one cause: God. Like other Jansenist philosophers, Sévigné so underscores the omnipotence and sovereignty of God that secondary causes tend to recede, if not to disappear.
As Monsieur d’Angers says, one must let God do as he wills and ceaselessly look to his will and his providence. Without that, there is no other way to live in the world. Otherwise, one will do nothing but complain about all these poor secondary causes [Letter to Madame de Grignan; July 1, 1685].
Part of metaphysical wisdom is to grasp the unique divine causation operative behind the apparent and often contradictory secondary causes. These causes wrongly dominate the concerns of most human beings.
The philosophical emphasis on divine causation is tied to a theological emphasis on the doctrine of predestination. Even in small gestures of piety, it is the divine will which causes the virtuous actions of the Christian subject. The sacramental action of a friend of Sévigné illustrates this truth.
God gave her a very particular grace, one which indicates a true predestination. It is that she went to confession on the octave of Corpus Christ with a perfect disposition and an affection that could only come from God. She then received Our Lord [in communion] in the same manner [Letter to Madame de Guitaut; June 3, 1693].
The devout soul died shortly afterward in the state of grace.
Given the centrality of the will among the divine attributes, surrender to God’s will becomes the central spiritual disposition to be cultivated by the human subject. Indeed, sanctity is nothing but complete submission to the divine will. Sévigné’s moral portrait of her friend Corbinelli underscores the volitional foundation of sanctity.
He is a man who only thinks about destroying his own willfulness, who never ceases to commune with the enemies of the devil, who are the saints of the church, a man who counts as nothing his miserable body, who suffers poverty Christianly (you would say philosophically), who never ceases to celebrate the perfections and the existence of God, who passes his life in charity and service of his neighbor, who does not seek his own delights and pleasures, and who is completely submitted to the will of God [Letter to Madame de Grignan; January 15, 1690].
Like other Jansenist authors, Sévigné does not explain why this submission to the divine will is so important and so difficult, given the existence of a deterministic universe in which the divine will is omnipresent.
Authentic abandonment to the divine will manifests itself by a sharp opposition to the world. Sévigné’s portrait of a friend who has recently undergone a religious conversion indicates the strictness of this separation.
She told me it was true that God had given her graces, for which she was profoundly grateful. These graces are nothing other but a profound faith, a tender love of God, and a horror of the world, accompanied by a great distrust of herself and of her weaknesses. She is convinced that if she takes a pause from this for a moment, the divine grace would evaporate [Letter to Madame de Grignan; January 15, 1674.]
Echoing neo-Augustinian theology, this rigorous flight from the world stresses the grave sinfulness and concupiscence of a world disfigured by the fall and original sin.
Sévigné openly admits her own incapacity to live the austere renunciation from the world which she commends in her writing. She often laments her own spiritual mediocrity.
One of my great desires is to be devout….I belong neither to God nor to the devil. This state disturbs me, but between us, I find it the most natural thing in the world. We are not given to the devil because we fear God and at bottom we have religious principles; we are not given to God because his law is hard and because we don’t like to destroy ourselves. This is how the tepid operate. Their great number doesn’t bother me at all. But God hates them. So I must leave this state; there is the problem [Letter to Madame de Grignan; June 10, 1671].
Like many salonnières sympathetic to Jansenism, with its rigorous asceticism, Sévigné discovers that her aristocratic lifestyle would permit her to follow the path of renunciation only so far.
In developing her religious philosophy, Sévigné criticized two intellectual currents which she finds to be erroneous: libertinism and the Molinism of the Jesuits. Among the libertines, she singled out Ninon de Lenclos (1620-1705) for specific criticism. A religious skeptic and an emblem of sexual license, Lenclos embodied the anti-Christian creed of the more freethinking salons. “This Ninon is dangerous! If you knew how she dogmatized about religion, you would be horrified. Her zeal for perverting young people is similar to that of Monsieur Saint-Germain, whom we once saw at Livry” [Letter to Madame de Grignan; April 1, 1671]. Sévigné’s invective against Lenclos was sharpened by the fact that her own son Charles had been involved in a liaison with the famous courtesan. She also recognizes that Lenclos represented an intellectual threat to Christian orthodoxy because the courtesan promoted her sensual Epicureanism through a series of lectures she presented at her salon and a series of letters distributed by her admirers.
Luis de Molina (1535-1600) and his Jesuit confreres propagated another extreme in the long-simmering theological quarrel over grace ,the error of Molinism, an exaggerated defense of the role of free will in the act of salvation. Sévigné lamented the leaning of one of her granddaughters toward Molinism after having abandoned the strict Augustinianism of the convent of Gif. “It is certain that after having been at the school of Saint Augustine she finds herself at the school of Molina. This is not something to be endured” [Letter to Madame de Grignan; July 1, 1685]. Both the materialism of the salon libertines and the spiritual libertarianism of the Jesuits erred in their divergences from the Jansenist theories of divine causation, divine sovereignty, human sinfulness, free will, and the operations of grace.
Like other moralistes of the period, Sévigné studies the various psychic states of the human subject, especially those states which reveal a divided heart. She openly admits the many occasions when she herself participates in this psychological perplexity. Two phenomena in particular attract her analytic attention: the experience of human love and the difficulty in accepting one’s mortality.
In the era’s salon debates, the passion of love held pride of place. Salon authors disputed the nature of love, puzzled over its power, and distinguished the various gradations of love. In her own reflections on love, Sévigné considers love a passion so powerful that it structures personal time. The beginning, end, and recommencement of loving relationships constitute one’s personal history.
I don’t believe that I have ever read anything as moving as the account you [Bussy-Rabutin] have given me of your farewell to your mistress. Your point that love is a true re-commencer is so beautiful and so true that I am astonished that, although I’ve thought this a thousand times, I never had the wit to say it. Sometimes I’ve even noticed that friendship wanted to insert itself into this in order to alter love and that in its own way it was also a true re-commencer [Letter to Bussy-Rabutin; October 7, 1655].
The passage attends to the gradations of love, such as the difference between romantic love and more disinterested friendship. In its various guises, this passion shapes the human psyche by its incessant starts, ends, and revivals.
The empire of love reveals the irreducible power of emotions in human life. Sévigné openly admits that the passions are so dominant in her own personality that she could never subscribe to the fashionable Stoicism of the salons; a moral code based on reason and duty alone would be insupportable.
Love my tenderness, love my weaknesses. As for myself, I am very well adjusted to them. I like them far more than the sentiments of Seneca and Epictetus. My dear child, I am sentimental and affectionate up to the point of madness [Letter to Madame de Grignan; March 18, 1671].
Sévigné recognizes that in her ardent affection for her daughter love has reached the level of idolatry. The attempt to eliminate and reduce the power of love and associated passions like anger can only end in failure.
The letters also reflect a preoccupation with death. As many commentators have noted, Sévigné dwells at length on the state funerals of France’s leading political and military figures. She has a particular love for the genre of the funeral oration. In Sévigné’s perspective, the capacity to face and accept one’s mortality constitutes an essential trait of psychological maturity. Only then can one grasp one’s proper position in a mortal, perishing universe governed by an eternal God.
Life is brief and you [Bussy-Rabutin] are already well advanced in age. There’s no need to become impatient about it. This consolation [during a moment of misfortune] is a sad one and this remedy to your ill is worse than bad. Nonetheless, it should have its effect; so should the scarcely happier thought of the little place we have in the universe and how, in the end, it matters little whether the Count de Bussy was happy or unhappy. I know that during the tiny moment we are in this life we want to be completely happy but we must be convinced that nothing is more impossible and that if you didn’t have the worries you currently have, you would have others, according to the order of Providence [Letter to Bussy-Rabutin; August 13, 1688].
Sobering, the frank recognition of one’s mortality and one’s finiteness in the divine scheme of the universe permits the human subject to place the emotional turmoil in the pursuit of happiness within a framework of resignation.
From the time of her early correspondence with her tutor Ménage, Sévigné revealed her aesthetic preoccupations. Many letters present her critical judgments concerning particular authors, books, and dramas. Her aesthetic judgment reflects the neoclassical tastes of her milieu; harmony, balance, and proportion emerge as the central traits of artistic quality. Questions of form dominate her critical evaluation of the artworks which pass under review.
In literature, the capacity to appreciate a work lies largely in the ability to detect and savor its interior harmony. The classics of antiquity and the Italian Renaissance reveal this interior proportion.
Your readings are good. Petrarch must entertain you with the commentary you have. The one Mademoiselle Scudéry has made for us on certain sonnets makes them pleasant to read. As for Tacitus, you know how I was charmed by him during your recitations and how I often interrupted you to make you understand the passages where I found some harmony [Letter to Madame de Grignan; June 28, 1671].
The ability to isolate and appreciate the interior balance of a literary work is the central condition for its proper aesthetic appreciation. Despite her preference for the dramas of Corneille, Sévigné admits her admiration for Racine’s Esther. Originally performed by the students at Madame de Maintenon’s academy at Saint-Cyr, the biblical drama perfectly allies religious truth to a careful balance of its component parts.
As for Esther, I am in no way taking back all the praise which I already gave it. All my life I will be delighted by the perfection and the novelty of the show. I am thrilled by it. I found in it a thousand things so right, so well placed, so important to say to a king, that I would be delighted with the greatest conviction to say that it presented the greatest truths as it entertained and sang to us. I was moved by all these different beauties [Letter to Madame de Grignan; Letter of March 23, 1689].
Allied to the scriptural truths of supplication by an oppressed Israel, Esther provokes this aesthetic delight through its careful arrangement of a thousand things in a perfect harmony. It is this formal composition of disparate parts which constitutes the poignant beauty of Racine’s drama.
As in literature and theater, harmony forms the key criterion in the judgment of visual art. A spectacular temporary mausoleum designed by Le Brun in the church of the Oratoire elicits Sévigné’s praise. The exhibit not only perfectly balances its physical decorations; it brilliantly evokes the spiritual balance among the fine arts and among the moral virtues.
The mausoleum touched the ceiling and was decorated with a thousand lights and several figures appropriate to the deceased one wanted to praise. Four skeletons at the bottom were decorated with marks of his dignity, as if they had removed his honors as they had removed his life. One of them carried his staff, another his ducal crown, another signs of his rank, another the vestment of chancellor. The four Arts were bent over and desolate because they had lost their protector: they were Painting, Music, Eloquence, and Sculpture. Four Virtues supported the previous presentation: Force, Justice, Temperance, and Religion. Four angels or four genies received this beautiful soul above it all. In addition, the mausoleum was decorated with angels who held up a funeral tent suspended from the ceiling. Nowhere has there ever been anything so magnificent, so perfectly imagined. It is the masterpiece of Le Brun [Letter to Madame de Grignan; May 6, 1672].
It is the intricate harmony among the varied physical, aesthetic, moral, and religious components which gives Le Brun’s baroque construction its overwhelming aesthetic impact.
In her valorization of aesthetic pleasure, Sévigné criticizes a censorship which would eliminate certain works of art on the grounds of alleged immorality. “You know that I do not accommodate myself well with all this prudery which does not come naturally to me. I don’t consent to no longer like these [morally questionable] books. I let myself be amused by them” [Letter to Madame de Grignan; July 5, 1671]. As an example of such morally questionable reading, she cites her reading of the works of Rabelais with her son Charles.
In addition to the presentation of her own philosophical opinions, Sévigné provides a chronicle of the philosophical culture of the salon. Many of her letters describe the Cartesianism and anti-Cartesianism which had become a central feature of the intellectual culture of French salons in the middle of the seventeenth century. An avid reader, Sévigné often confides her reactions to the theories expounded by the fashionable philosophers of the day.
Among her chronicles of Cartesianism is Sévigné’s description of a philosophical debate which occurred in her own Breton home. The disputants weigh the merits of the Cartesian theory of innate ideas against the neo-Aristotelian theory of the role of sensation in the generation of knowledge.
We had here a little tempest of men and of theories and the next day was another scene. Monsieur de Montmoron, who as you know is quite intelligent, arrived; then there was Father Damaie, who lives only twenty leagues from here; and then my son, whom as you know excels in debate; and then we had some letters from Corbinelli….Monsieur de Montmoron knows your [Madame de Grignan’s] philosophy and contests it on every point. My son defended your father [Descartes]; Damaie was with him and the letters supported him. But three against one wasn’t too strong for Montmoron. He said that we could only have ideas of what had entered our minds through our senses. My son said that we could think independently of our senses: for example, we think what we think [Letter to Madame de Grignan; September 15, 1680].
Typically, Sévigné takes no personal position on the dispute concerning the Cartesian theory of innate ideas, which she faithfully reports. With her usual irony she deflates the philosophical dispute by emphasizing the entertaining (divertissement) nature of the controversy.
Sévigné not only chronicles the Cartesian controversies which characterized her social milieu; her vocabulary is saturated with Cartesian terms. “Innate ideas” (idées innées) echo Descartes’s epistemology; “whirlwinds” (tourbillons) Descartes’s physics; “animal spirits” (esprits d’animaux )Descartes’s biology; “brain traces” (traces dans le cerveau) Descartes’s philosophy of mind. Sévigné’s allegiance to Cartesianism is at best ambiguous. Her references to her daughter’s passion for Descartes are often ironic. Her philosophy of nature and of religion opposes central Cartesian theories.
A lifelong reader of philosophical works, Sévigné acquired a first-hand grasp of the philosophical controversies of the period through reading the most influential French philosophical authors of the day. Her correspondence alludes to Descartes’s Discourse of Method, Meditations, and Passions of the Soul; Malebranche’s Christian Conversations; and Pascal’s Provincial Letters and Pensées. But her favored philosophical author was Pierre Nicole (1625-95), a priest closely associated with the Jansenist movement. During Sévigné’s lifetime, Nicole was best known as a moralist for his popular series of Essais morales (1671-78). In twenty-first century philosophy he is best known as the co-author of The Logic of Port-Royal (1662).
It is his presentation of the virtues essential for the Christian life that attracts Sévigné to Nicole. His concept of the virtue of detachment is especially helpful for the acquisition of personal peace.
I find your [Madame de Grignan’s] reflection very good and very right concerning the indifference he [Nicole] wants us to have concerning the approval or disapproval of our neighbors. Like you, I think this requires a little grace and that philosophy alone cannot bring it about. He places peace and union with our neighbor on such a high level and counsels us to acquire this at the expense of so many other things that there is no way after all this that we could be anything but indifferent as to what others think of us [Letter to Madame de Grignan; November 4, 1671].
This detachment from self-concern is the fruit of an austere charity which seeks nothing but the service of one’s esteemed neighbor. In a typically Jansenist note, this peaceful self-possession can only come about through the operation of grace; reliance on philosophical reason alone inevitably falls short.
Another Jansenist trait of Nicole’s theory of virtue lies in his unmasking of natural moral virtues as covers for vice. The declared love of truth in violent philosophical disputes barely conceals the pride and willfulness of the disputants. “What he [Nicole] says about the pride and self-love one finds in all the disputes, which one covers up with the fine name of love of truth, is a point which overwhelms me” [Letter to Madame de Grignan; November 4, 1671]. Rooted in complete submission to the divine will, only the theological virtues can lead the human subject to an authentic moral life. The natural virtues defended by philosophers in their ardent disputes are often little more than the expression of self-interest and self-love.
From the time of the first publication of Madame de Sévigné’s works in the eighteenth century, the reception of her writings has been primarily literary. Literary critics have long analyzed the limpid prose style of Sévigné with its distinctive mix of naturel with vivacité. More historical critics have studied how the letters of Sévigné reflect the society of her time, especially the aristocratic subculture of the salon. Historians have paid special attention to Sévigné’s detailed chronicle of the trial of Fouquet; it constitutes one of the most detailed descriptions of judicial procedure in early modern literature. Sévigné has proved especially influential in subsequent generations of women authors. George Eliot, Elizabeth Gaskell, and Virginia Woolf praised Sévigné as a pioneer of the writing woman.
Twenty-first century commentators have developed a more philosophical analysis of Sévigné’s thought. Lyons in 2011 explores in what sense Sévigné can be classified as a philosophe; Reguig-Naya in 2002 studies the specific link between Sévigné and Descartes and Cartesianism. Several commentators interpret Sévigné’s philosophy from a gendered perspective. Montfort in 2008 employs a feminist angle; Longino Farrell in 1991 uses the category of maternal thinking. Other studies analyze Sévigné’s epistemology (Racevskis, 2002), moral theory (Cartmill, 2001), philosophy of language (Allentuch, 2008), and concept of imagination (Lyons, 2005). Sévigné’s philosophy of nature and theology invite further research.
All French to English translations above are by the author of this article.
- Sévigné, Marie de Rabutin-Chantal, marquise de. Correspondance, 3 vols.,ed Roger Duchêne. Paris: Gallimard, 1972-78.
- Duchêne’s magisterial critical edition of Sévigné’s correspondence has become the edition of reference for scholars.
- Sévigné, Marie de Rabutin-Chantal, marquise de. Selected Letters, trans. and ed. Leonard Tancock. London: Penguin Books, 1982.
- Tancock’s popular translation of Sévigné’s letters provides a useful guide to the principal persons cited by Sévigné and who serve as her correspondents.
- Allentuch, Harriet R. “Setting Feelings to Words: Language and Emotion in the Letters of Madame de Sévigné,” in Literature Criticism from 1400 to 1800, Vol. 140, eds. T. Schoenberg and L. Trudeau. Farmington Hills, MI: Thomson Gale, 2008: 205-225.
- The article explores the link between emotion and linguistic expression in the correspondence.
- Bernet, Anne. Madame de Sévigné, Mère Passion. Paris: Perrin, 1996.
- The biography examines the relationship between Sévigné’s personal emotions and her theory of the passions.
- Cartmill, Constance. “Madame de Sévigné et les maximes du marriage,” Dalhousie French Studies 2001 Fall; 56: 98-107.
- The article explores the moral positions defended by Sévigné in her counsels on marriage.
- Duchêne, Roger. Madame de Sévigné, ou, La chance d’être femme. Paris: Fayard, 1982.
- The book uses a gendered perspective to present the biography of Sévigné.
- Duchêne, Roger. Naissances d’un écrivain: Madame de Sévigné. Paris: Fayard, 1996.
- The biography underlines the central stages in the development of Sévigné’s writing.
- Farrell, Michèle Longino. Performing Motherhood: The Sévigné Correspondence. Hanover, NH: University Press of New England, 1991.
- This biography explores the various maternal poses adopted by Sévigné in her dealings with her daughter.
- Lyons, John D. Before Imagination and Embodied Thought from Montaigne to Rousseau. Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 2005: 122-147.
- The book’s chapter on Sévigné explores how she used the imagination to deal with various experiences of loss and grief.
- Lyons, John D. “The Marquise de Sévigné: Philosophe,” in Teaching Seventeenth and Eighteenth-Century Women Writers, ed. Faith Beasely. New York, NY: Modern Language Association of America, 2011: 178-187.
- The article examines the various ways in which Sévigné can be considered a philosophe.
- Montfort, Catherine R. “Mme de Sévigné: Seventeenth-Century Feminist?” in Literature Criticism from 1400 to 1800, vol. 140, eds. T. Schoenberg and L. Trudeau. Farmington Hills, MI: Thomson Gale: 114-132.
- The book chapter approaches Sévigné’s writing from a feminist perspective.
- Racevskis, Richard. “Time and Ways of Knowing under Louis XIV: Molière, Sévigné, Lafayette,” in Bucknell Studies in Eighteenth-Century Literature and Culture. Lewisburg, PA: Bucknell University Press, 2003: 76-84.
- The book chapter compares Sévigné’s epistemology with that of her artistic contemporaries.
- Reguig-Naya, Delphine. “Descartes à la lettre: poétique épistolaire et philosophie mondaine chez Mme de Sévigné,” in Dix-septième siècle 2002: no. 216: 152-171.
- The article offers a careful analysis of the various ways Cartesian concepts and terms penetrate Sévigné’s vocabulary.
John J. Conley
Loyola University Maryland
U. S. A.