Benedict De Spinoza: Moral Philosophy
Like many European philosophers in the early modern period, Benedict de Spinoza (1632-1677) developed a moral philosophy that fused the insights of ancient theories of virtue with a modern conception of humans, their place in nature, and their relationship to God. Unlike many other authors in this period, however, Spinoza was strongly opposed to anthropocentrism and had no commitment whatsoever to traditional theological views. His unique metaphysics motivated an intriguing moral philosophy. Spinoza was a moral anti-realist, in that he denied that anything is good or bad independently of human desires and beliefs. He also endorsed a version of ethical egoism, according to which everyone ought to seek their own advantage; and, just as it did for Thomas Hobbes, this in turn led him to develop a version of contractarianism. However, Spinoza’s versions of each of these views, and the way in which he reconciles them with one another, are influenced in fascinating ways by his very unorthodox metaphysical picture.
The topics mentioned so far can be related comfortably to twenty-first century debates in moral philosophy. Yet Spinoza was also very interested in another issue that is moral only in the more archaic sense that it pertains to the good life: namely, the means by which humans may (to some extent) achieve mastery over their passions. Though this topic was of central importance to Spinoza, the pride of place he awarded it in his Ethics reflects the fact that seventeenth-century conceptions of moral philosophy were, in subtle but important ways, different than our own.
Table of Contents
- Guiding Metaphysical Principles
- Moral Philosophy in Spinoza’s System
- Spinoza’s Metaethics: Moral Anti-Realism
- Spinoza’s Ethics: Ethical Egoism, Contractarianism, and Virtue Theory
- Applications of Spinoza’s Moral Theory
- Spinoza’s Remedies for the Passions
- References and Further Reading
The name of Spinoza’s most famous work is the Ethics, but he does not really broach the topic of ethics until part four of the five-part work. The reason for this is that although his aim is to set forth “the right way of living” (E4app, G II/266) and to explain “what freedom of mind, or blessedness, is” (E5pref, G II/277), his accounts of these things depend upon certain key metaphysical principles that he feels must be established first.
This article provides only brief explanations of the relevant principles. For more detailed discussions of each of them, see the main article on Spinoza.
In Cartesian philosophy, a substance is something that does not depend for its existence on anything else—or, in the case of created substances, anything other than God (CSM I, 210). A mode is something that is not a substance (for instance, a property, quality, or attribute). Descartes appears to take the human body and mind to be paradigmatic substances, and the extended properties and thoughts of the body and mind (respectively) to be paradigmatic modes. Spinoza was critical of Descartes for giving a non-univocal definition of the term ‘substance,’ so that the predicate means something different when applied to God than when applied to a human. Spinoza’s alternative approach was to stick to the most general definition: a substance is something that is “in itself and is conceived through itself, that is, that whose concept does not require the concept of another thing, from which it must be formed” (E1d3).
In defining a substance this way, Spinoza avoids the equivocation involved in the Cartesian conception of substances. However, he also quickly concludes that given this definition, humans are not substances. Indeed, Spinoza argues, there can be only one substance, God (E1p14), and everything else is merely a mode of God (E1p15). As a result, Spinoza conceives of God as a being that is absolute and perfect by its very nature; humans, by contrast, are dependent and imperfect by their very nature.
Although ordinarily we speak as though things could have been different than they in fact are—you could have turned left rather than right, the election might have gone differently, and so on—Spinoza denies that these alternative scenarios are genuinely possible. He provides several different arguments for this conclusion, but perhaps the simplest is based upon the thought that, since the world is a mode of God, and God could not be different than it is, it follows that “Things could have been produced by God in no other way, and in no other order than they have been produced” (E1p33). This divine necessitarianism trickles down: humans, too, could not have acted otherwise than they did. The fact that we ordinarily believe ourselves capable of acting otherwise is an illusion produced by our ignorance of both the physical and psychological forces influencing us, as well as of our own nature (E3p2s).
Perhaps the most important metaphysical principle involved in Spinoza’s ethical theory is his view that “Each thing, as far as it can by its own power, strives to persevere in its being” (E3p6). The interpretation of this principle is the source of much scholarly disagreement, but a few things are clear. The striving [conatus] at issue is not to be confused with conscious effort, since Spinoza takes the principle to govern bodies as well as minds. Nor is the conatus to be confused with the metabolic processes of a living organism, since Spinoza takes the principle to govern (what we ordinarily consider to be) non-living things as well as living ones. Spinoza is making the metaphysical claim that each thing is possessed of an inner force, by which it continuously reasserts its own existence.
This doctrine is particularly important for understanding Spinoza’s moral theory, since Spinoza accepts psychological egoism on the basis of it: “When this striving is related only to the mind, it is called will; but when it is related to the mind and body together, it is called appetite. This appetite…is the very essence of man, from whose nature there necessarily follow those things that promote his preservation” (E3p9s).
In transitioning from his metaphysics to his moral theory, Spinoza relies heavily upon two concepts, activity and passivity, that come to take the place of traditional axiological concepts like good and evil. Something is active insofar as it produces various effects through its striving; conversely, it is passive insofar as it and its states are produced by external causes (E3d1–3). Both activity and passivity are treated as matters of degree. Thus God, the total cause of all things, is active in the highest degree and not at all passive, while humans (since they are not substances) are always partly active and partly passive, causally dependent upon God as well as upon other modes.
With respect to the human mind, activity takes the form of rational or adequate cognition (E3p1). Actions of the mind are adequate ideas, which increase its power of acting, while passions of the mind are inadequate, confused ideas, which decrease its power of acting. Spinoza’s conception of passions is quite general, so, for example, what we would call a “dispassionate” state of melancholy could for him qualify as a powerful passion because of how much it diminishes our activity. This should be borne in mind when we turn, in section 3, to considering Spinoza’s account of how to overcome our passions.
Spinoza’s metaphysical views quickly commit him to a version of moral anti-realism. A moral realist holds that at least some things are good or bad independently of what we desire or believe to be the case. Spinoza, in numerous passages in the Ethics and earlier works, denies that there are any such moral qualities. His rejection of moral realism is tied up with his rejection of teleological explanations of nature, for he sees the attribution of qualities like goodness or perfection as an error that is based upon the false belief that nature was designed by God with humanity in mind. Spinoza explains, “After men persuaded themselves that everything which happens, happens on their account, they had to judge that what is most important in each thing is what is most useful to them… Hence, they had to form these notions, by which they explained natural things: good, evil, order, confusion, warm, cold, beauty, ugliness” (E1app, G II/82). This family of concepts, which includes moral and aesthetic concepts along with concepts of sensible qualities, Spinoza holds to be produced by the imagination rather than reason. Hence the concepts “by which ordinary people are accustomed to explain Nature…do not indicate the nature of anything, only the constitution of the imagination” (E1app, G II/83).
In addition to providing etiological accounts intended to explain why people make the mistake of treating moral qualities as objective (and thereby to undermine the belief that they are objective), Spinoza develops two distinct arguments for his anti-realism. His first argument for anti-realism is that if moral qualities like evil or imperfection were objective, then it would be conceivable “that Nature sometimes fails or sins, and produces imperfect things” (E4pref, G II/207). But this is inconceivable: such a possibility supposes that there is a goal or standard that nature has fallen short of, yet there is no such goal or standard: “The reason why…God, or Nature, acts and the reason why it exists, are one and the same. As it exists for the sake of no end, it also acts for the sake of no end” (ibid). Again, just as in his earlier discussion, Spinoza’s denial of the objectivity of moral qualities is based upon his rejection of natural teleology. The rejection of natural teleology, in turn, is based upon his substance monism and necessitarianism: “all things follow from the necessity of the divine nature, and hence…whatever seems immoral, dreadful, unjust, and dishonorable, arises from the fact that [we conceive] the things themselves in a way which is disordered, mutilated, and confused” (E4p73s).
It is worth mentioning a second argument that comes shortly after, but appears to have very different motivations: “As far as good and evil are concerned, they also indicate nothing positive in things, considered in themselves… For one and the same thing can, at the same time, be good, and bad, and also indifferent. For example, music is good for one who is melancholy, bad for one who is mourning, and neither good nor bad to one who is deaf” (E4pref, G II/208). If moral qualities were objective, then nothing could have contrary moral qualities at one and the same time. But many things do have contrary moral qualities at one and the same time, with respect to different observers. Therefore, moral qualities are not objective, in the sense that they “indicate nothing positive in things, considered in themselves” (ibid). This argument is quite different than the previous one. The first argument draws out the a priori incoherence that would be involved in the very idea of objective moral qualities, while the second is based upon the empirical premise that different people may judge a thing to have contrary moral qualities. It is an ancestor of the argument from disagreement often used to defend moral relativism.
In spite of the fact that Spinoza rejects moral realism, he does not advocate for the elimination of moral language. To see why, consider an advantage that the moral realist seems to have over Spinoza’s anti-realism. The moral realist, as Spinoza sees it, holds that in cases of moral judgment, we first recognize something to be good (for example), and then this results in our forming a desire for that thing. Though Spinoza rejects this account of moral judgment, one of its benefits is that it allows us to distinguish between what is desired and what is genuinely desirable. Since it often happens that a person wants something and later discovers it really to be undesirable — or even wants something in spite of the fact that he knows it to be undesirable — the distinction is an important one to preserve. For example, we want to be able to make sense of the fact that although someone wants to commit suicide, this is not really desirable; the moral realist’s picture gives us a way to do this by distinguishing the (true) claim that this person desires to commit suicide from the (false) claim that it is good/desirable for this person to commit suicide.
Yet Spinoza thinks the moral realist’s story is exactly backwards: “we neither strive for, nor will, neither want, nor desire anything because we judge it to be good; on the contrary, we judge something to be good because we strive for it, will it, want it, and desire it” (E3p9s; cf. 3p39s). He thus subscribes to a desire-satisfaction theory of value: what is ultimately of value is the satisfaction of desire; things become valuable only by virtue of their being desired, or their serving to satisfy some desire. (For more on this, see Youpa [2010, 209, fn. 1], and Lebuffe [2010, 152–9].) So it may seem that Spinoza will have a problem making the distinction between what we think is good and what is genuinely good for us.
Spinoza agrees that we need this distinction, but holds that our judgments about what is genuinely good for us are based upon an “idea of man” we have formed “as a model of human nature” (E4pref, G II/208). To hold on to the distinction between what a person desires and what is genuinely desirable, then, Spinoza wants to preserve our ordinary talk of good and evil, with the caveat that such talk refers only to the relation between ourselves and an idealized model human (Curley [1979, 356–62], Nadler [2006, 215–9], and Hübner [2014, 136–140]). Hence, Spinoza writes, “I shall understand by good what we know certainly is a means by which we may approach nearer and nearer to the model of human nature we set before ourselves. By evil, what we certainly know prevents us from becoming like that model” (ibid). Since the model is an idealization, the judgment that something is good or evil does not involve any commitment to objective, mind-independent qualities of goodness or evilness. Yet having such a model is useful, since it allows us to make judgments about what will be good or bad for us as distinct from what we presently happen to desire.
The previous section established that Spinoza is a moral anti-realist in the sense that he denies that there exist mind-independent moral properties. Nevertheless, on most readings of the Ethics, Spinoza is also an ethical egoist, since he holds that reason “demands that everyone love himself, seek his own advantage...and absolutely, that everyone should strive to preserve his own being as far as he can” (E4p18s; see also TTP Ch. 16, 175). These two views are compatible, however, since Spinoza’s approach to developing his positive moral theory is to reduce normative claims to considerations of self-interest in a manner reminiscent of Hobbes (Curley 1988, 119–124). Perhaps the major difference between the Spinozist and the Hobbist approaches to egoism is that Spinoza provides a metaphysical argument for the view, in contrast to Hobbes’ psychological argument. Specifically, Spinoza bases his ethical egoism upon his conatus doctrine.
Spinoza’s initial argument for the claim that reason demands that everyone seek his own advantage is brief: “Since reason demands nothing contrary to Nature, it demands that everyone…seek his own advantage… This, indeed, is as necessarily true as that the whole is greater than its part” (E4p18s). Breaking the argument down:
- Reason demands nothing contrary to Nature.
- It is contrary to Nature for someone not to seek his own advantage.
- So, reason demands that everyone seek his own advantage.
Both premises hinge upon what is meant by the claim that something is “contrary to Nature.” By this, Spinoza seems to mean something impossible, something that cannot be, by virtue of incompatibility with either the laws of logic or of nature. In this interpretation, premise (1) is Spinoza’s nod to the commonly held principle that ought implies can: you can be morally bound to do only something that you are able to do. More importantly, given this interpretation, the second premise comes out as a conceptual truth grounded in part of the conatus doctrine.
In E3p4, which he references in his argument for egoism, Spinoza argued, “No thing can be destroyed except through an external cause.” He takes this to entail that “Each thing, as far as it can by its own power, strives to persevere in its being” (E3p6). So, in Spinoza’s view, we have a purely metaphysical argument that it would be “contrary to Nature” for someone not to seek his own advantage. It would be contrary to Nature for anything not to seek its own advantage, insofar as it has the power to do so.
The second premise entails psychological egoism, for it entails that each person will seek his own advantage at all times. Spinoza’s argument for ethical egoism in this sense depends upon psychological egoism, and so it may seem reminiscent of Hobbes’ rationale for the similar conclusion that “of the voluntary acts of every man the object is some good to himself” (L I.xiv; p. 82). However, Hobbes reaches this view on the basis of his account of the psychology of voluntary acts: a voluntary act proceeds from the will, and a person’s will is just the last appetite that strikes him after a process of deliberation (L I.vi; p. 33). Since “whatsoever is the object of any man’s appetite…he for his part calleth good” (L I.vi; p. 28), Hobbes would agree with Spinoza that each person will seek what he considers to be his own advantage at all times. In spite of the similarity of their conclusions, Spinoza’s argument is grounded in the metaphysics of the conatus doctrine, while Hobbes’ argument is grounded in his psychological theory.
One of the philosophical problems with Spinoza’s version of ethical egoism has to do with whether, and to what extent, Spinoza’s view can really be a moral theory at all. Given the argument for the view, it is unclear how Spinoza can take the dictates of reason to be prescriptive. For example, according to Rutherford (2008), Spinoza treats the dictates of reason as adequate ideas that, when we possess them, cause us to act in ways that are conducive to our actual self-interest. If so, to follow the dictates of reason is just to be caused to behave in certain ways, which sits awkwardly alongside the thought that such dictates are prescriptive in any ordinary sense. This topic is the subject of ongoing scholarly inquiry—responses to the problem have been proposed by Kisner (2011, 118) and Steinberg (2014)—and it is closely related to the issue (flagged at the outset of this article) that Spinoza’s conception of ethics is in many ways quite different from our own.
For an egoist, the question as to what is good for an individual is crucial, for the answer to this question will determine what that individual ought, morally, to do. And Spinoza’s conception of the good is stereotypically egoistic: “By good I shall understand what we certainly know to be useful to us” (E4d1). Likewise, to be virtuous is simply to have and to exercise the power to do what is in our nature, and (as per the conatus doctrine) what is in your nature is to seek your own advantage as far as you are able (E4d8; 4p20). As a result, strength of character is also accounted for in self-interested terms.
Many passages in the Ethics make it appear that Spinoza simply thinks that what is best for each of us is the continuation of our lives. For example, he writes that “No one can desire to be blessed, to act well and to live well, unless at the same time he desires to be, to act, and to live, that is, to actually exist” (E4p21). Hence, the principle of seeking one’s own advantage and preserving one’s being is “the first and only foundation of virtue” (E4p22c), and obeying this principle is the only pursuit that is good for its own sake (E4p25). If this were so, then we might expect Spinozist morality to license all manner of violations of traditional morality in the name of self-preservation and the advancement of our own interests. Surprisingly, although he takes self-interest and self-preservation as the foundations of morality, Spinoza nevertheless holds that “The good which everyone who seeks virtue wants for himself, he also desires for other men” (E4p37). Although virtue is founded in rational self-interest, rational self-interest in turn urges us to desire the good of others.
To see why Spinoza thinks this, we need to understand this “good” that is desired by “everyone who seeks virtue.” The good in question, which is supposed to trump all other goods, is not actually our own lives, but what those lives are best spent in obtaining—the knowledge of God. Spinoza writes, “Knowledge of God is the mind’s greatest good; its greatest virtue is to know God” (E4p28). The argument for this is characteristically metaphysical, and again based upon the conatus doctrine. Spinoza argues that the “striving of the mind…is nothing but understanding,” and “cannot conceive anything to be good for itself except what leads to understanding” (E4p26d). Our innate desire to understand nature is, in his view, the very essence of our minds, and so this drive to understand also characterizes the good for us. Finally, “The greatest thing the mind can understand is God” (E4p28d), since ‘God’ signifies the whole of nature, so it follows that “the mind’s greatest advantage…is knowledge of God” (ibid).
Therefore, in Spinoza’s view, our greatest good is not the sort of thing that is subject to natural scarcity, nor need it be the object of competition. Rather, it is “common to all, and can be enjoyed by all equally” (E4p36). And because, in Spinoza’s view, other humans are more useful to us to the extent that they are rational (E4p35c1), it is entirely to our benefit when others pursue the same good—understanding—that we ourselves seek; for detailed exposition of Spinoza’s argument that it is to our benefit to pursue the good of others, see Della Rocca (2004, 125–8), Kisner (2009), and Grey (2013). This is why Spinoza thinks humans have a rational impetus to act in moral (that is, benevolent) ways toward others from a starting point of pure self-interest: “The desire to do good generated in us by our living according to the guidance of reason, I call morality” (E4p37s1).
So far, Spinoza’s moral theory might not appear to be capable of answering the practical questions it is ordinarily hoped such a theory will answer. The conception of the good just outlined is so strikingly focused on human intellectual life that the resulting moral theory may seem far removed from ordinary moral matters. However, Spinoza has a bit more to say about morality beyond his claim that it is constituted by the pursuit of knowledge of God and the desire to do good for others. One important strand of Spinoza’s moral thought is a version of moral contractarianism, the view that we may become normatively bound to behave in certain ways on the basis of agreements or contracts we make when we live in society with others. His version of contractarianism is heavily influenced by Hobbes, from whom Spinoza appears to have drawn a number of key ideas. (This article deals only briefly with those aspects of Spinoza’s contractarianism that bear upon morality; see the article on Spinoza’s Political Philosophy for more information about this topic.)
It might seem surprising that Spinoza thinks humans need to live in society at all. Given that our greatest good is knowledge of God, ought we not all retreat to the mountaintop and spend our time in metaphysical inquiry? Spinoza’s reason for denying this is his pessimistic view of the prospects for humans overcoming all of their passions. Even the wisest philosopher requires assistance from her community in the pursuit of her greatest good. On this point, Spinoza disagrees with Descartes, who holds that “Even those who have the weakest souls could acquire absolute mastery over all their passions” (CSM I, 348). Spinoza’s view, by contrast, is that on account of the force of their passions, people “are often drawn in different directions and are contrary to one another, while they require one another’s aid” (E4p37s2, citations elided), and that these passions can never completely be overcome. Thus even the most wise and temperate among us has reason to enter a social contract. Because of our need for one another’s aid—whether to study philosophy or gain security—we have reason to live together with others in society. And because it is extremely difficult to moderate and restrain people’s worst passions, we cannot enjoy the benefits of civil society without entering a social contract.
With this observation in the background, the argument for moral contractarianism appears in a very abbreviated form in a scholium in the Ethics:
In order, therefore, that men may be able to live harmoniously and be of assistance to one another, it is necessary for them to give up their natural right and to make one another confident that they will do nothing which could harm others… By this law, therefore, society can be maintained, provided it appropriates to itself the right everyone has of avenging himself, and of judging good and evil. (E4p37s2, G II/237–8)
The argument is one commonly associated with classical social contract theories. Because humans are unable to live peacefully with one another so long as they retain their natural right to act as they please, it is in each person’s best interest to give up that right to the state, on the condition that everyone else does the same.
For this reason, Spinoza holds the prima facie surprising view that laws are morally binding on us even in cases in which those laws are not rational. In conflicts between the laws of our society and the dictates of our reason, the laws win out. Likewise, although in the context of his metaphysics, Spinoza treats evil and sin as functions of an individual’s power; when he is writing about such things in the context of civil society, he provides a very different picture. For example, he writes, “[E]veryone is bound to submit to the state. Sin, therefore, is nothing but disobedience…” (E4p37s2, G II/238); “A wrong occurs when a citizen or subject is forced to suffer some injury at the hands of another…contrary to the edict of the sovereign power” (TTP Ch. 16, 179). Why does law figure so prominently in discussions of morality in the context of civil society? In his Theological-Political Treatise, where he develops these ideas at length, Spinoza argues, “it is our duty [tenemur] to carry out all the orders of the sovereign power without exception, even if those orders are quite irrational. For reason bids us carry out even such orders so as to choose the lesser of two evils” (TTP Ch. 16, 177). The argument is that even if we recognize what is required by law to be irrational, it cannot be as irrational as it would be to violate the law, and thereby to become “enemies of the state and to act against reason which urges us to uphold the state with all our might” (ibid).
Another way in which Spinoza attempts to make his moral theory easier to put into practice is by providing a virtue theory based on it. Spinoza spends the latter sections of part of the Ethics developing a virtue theory of a fairly traditional sort, outlining which character traits and behaviors are virtues, and which are vices, in the conception of morality he has developed. He concludes this part of the work with some claims “concerning the free man’s temperament and manner of living,” where the “free man” is understood to be someone who lives wholly according to the guidance of reason. Since the very idea of a human being who lives wholly according to the guidance of reason is apparently contradictory—Spinoza has earlier observed that “man is necessarily always subject to passions” (E4p4c)—the discussion of the free man is not properly understood as describing an attainable goal. However, many scholars (such as Garrett [1990, 229–30] and Nadler [2006, 219]) take this discussion of the free man to be Spinoza’s presentation of the model of human nature he promised in the preface to Ethics 4. If so, then the description of the free man may best be seen as a guiding ideal, a character that ordinary people should aspire to be like, at least insofar as they are able.
Spinoza’s description of the free man’s way of living is based upon his account of virtues: if a character trait is grounded in our reason and our pursuit of understanding, it is a virtue; if it is grounded in our passions or ignorance, it is a vice. These considerations are clearly rooted in his conception of our greatest good (as outlined above). Although Spinoza’s treatment of many of the virtues is in keeping with traditional conceptions of virtue, he often parts ways with these traditional conceptions. For example, his conclusion that tenacity and nobility are virtues is in keeping with tradition. (Why are they virtues? Tenacity, he says, is the character trait corresponding to our rational striving for self-preservation, and nobility is the character trait corresponding to our rational striving for the benefit of others [E3p59s]. So both character traits are grounded in reason, not the passions.) However, Spinoza also argues that humility, repentance, and pity—character traits highly esteemed by traditional religious authorities—are not virtues, for they are “useless” and “do not arise from reason” (E4p50, 53, and 54). In his view, these character traits are not really virtues even if they do occasionally cause us to pursue the good, for they are only accidentally connected to the pursuit of the good. Reason, by contrast, is essentially connected to the pursuit of the good. As a result, anything good that we might be led to do out of pity (for instance), we could just as well have been led to do by reason. Being guided by pity, then, can be no better than being guided by reason. Moreover, pity always involves sadness, a form of disempowerment, so considered in itself, it is evil. Hence being guided by pity is inevitably worse than being guided by reason: “a man who lives according to the dictate of reason strives, as far as he can, not to be touched by pity” (E4p50c).
When Spinoza characterizes the “free man,” someone who lives wholly according to the guidance of reason, we should therefore expect only partial continuity with traditional conceptions of morality and virtuous living. The free man, Spinoza reasons, will pick his battles wisely, showing his virtue both in avoiding danger and in overcoming it (E4p69). He will always act honestly (E4p72). And he will seek to live in society with others rather than in solitude (E4p73). Nevertheless, the free man will graciously decline favors or gifts from those who do not follow the guidance of reason and who are ruled by their emotions (E4p70). Accepting such favors or gifts is liable to be dangerous, for the irrational gift-giver will inevitably value them more highly than the free man; the free man reserves his gratitude for the friendship of other rational people (E4p71), insofar as such friendship aids him in his pursuit of greater understanding. In practice no actual human could live exactly as the free man does, for (as mentioned in part one above) only a substance can be fully rational and active, and humans are not substances. Nevertheless Spinoza’s presentation of these claims suggests that he takes them to be desirable ways of living, because they derive from “strength of character, that is, [from] tenacity and nobility” (E4p73), the primary virtues.
In the course of developing his moral theory, Spinoza sometimes applies it in passing to what he recognizes are traditional moral problems. He is often somewhat dismissive of many of these traditional moral problems, and his treatment of them rarely includes the sort of depth they receive in works of applied moral philosophy. However, his responses to such problems are often interesting because, given the demands of other parts of his philosophical system, his proposals are often surprising and idiosyncratic. This article discusses four of them: the moral permissibility of suicide, of lying, and of causing harm to animals or to the environment.
One traditional moral problem regards the moral permissibility of self-harm, the ultimate case of which is suicide. Spinoza does not agree with most of the traditional religious reasons for treating suicide as a sin. For example, an explanation of the wrongness of suicide common in the Judeo-Christian religious traditions appeals to one of the Ten Commandments: “Thou Shalt Not Kill.” According to this family of explanations, suicide is a sin because it involves taking a human life, which God has commanded humans not to do. Spinoza takes the conception of God upon which this explanation relies to be false: many imagine “God as a ruler, lawgiver, king, merciful, just and so forth; whereas these are all merely attributes of human nature, and not at all applicable to the divine nature” (TTP Ch. 5, 53). God simply does not issue commandments in the way that a king issues commandments. Given this fact, Spinoza thinks, it makes little sense to try to explain moral claims like “Suicide is a sin” by appeal to such commandments.
Although he disagrees with traditional reasons for taking suicide to be immoral, he nevertheless agrees that suicide is in fact immoral. On this point, Spinoza is very clear: someone who commits suicide is “weak-minded and completely conquered by external causes contrary to their nature” (E4p18s). This conclusion is primarily a result of the conatus doctrine, since that doctrine forces Spinoza to deny that anyone can kill himself, strictly speaking. There must always be external causes that can be assigned to explain suicide or self-harm. But that is merely a descriptive claim; the evaluative claim that it is a “weak-minded” act derives from Spinoza’s ethical egoism. To be virtuous is to strive to preserve one’s being, so suicide is as far from virtue as one can go, in Spinoza’s view.
In his characterization of the “free man” at the end of part of the Ethics, Spinoza argues that a perfectly rational being “always acts honestly, not deceptively” (E4p72). The argument for this, on the face of it, anticipates Kant’s famous argument for the same conclusion. Spinoza reasons that if a perfectly rational being acted deceptively, he would do so “from the dictate of reason” (because, presumably, that is how a perfectly rational being does anything); but then it would be rational to act in that way, and “men would be better advised to agree only in words, and be contrary to one another in fact” (E4p72d). Spinoza takes this consequence to be absurd, for it is in our interest to bring others into as much agreement with our natures as possible (E4p31c), which living deceitfully would prevent.
One puzzle that this argument raises is the apparent conflict between Spinoza’s claim that a perfectly rational being would always act honestly and his claim that such a being would never do anything that brought about its own destruction. Spinoza does not explicitly attempt to resolve this problem in the Ethics, though commentators have attempted to do so on his behalf in a variety of ways (Garrett 1990, 228–33).
As should not be surprising given his ethical egoism, Spinoza is not sympathetic to the thought that we ought to worry ourselves about either our treatment of animals or of the environment. With respect to animals, Spinoza writes, “the law against killing animals is based more on empty superstition and unmanly compassion than sound reason” (E4p37s1). Reason dictates that we seek out the companionship of other humans because they share our nature, and what is good for us is good for them. However, since non-human animals differ in nature from us, reason dictates that we “consider our own advantage, use them at our pleasure, and treat them as is most convenient for us” (ibid). So, in spite of the fact that Spinoza does not view humans as metaphysically privileged—for instance, he disagrees with the Cartesian view that humans, but not other animals, have minds (ibid)—he nevertheless holds that we need not concern ourselves with the welfare of non-human animals. There may be situations in which our own welfare depends upon the welfare of a non-human animal, as when a farmer’s livelihood depends upon the welfare of his stock. But only in such situations will a human have reason to care about the welfare of a non-human. That said, it is not clear that this is the view he ought to have adopted, given his first principles (Grey 2013, 378–382).
With respect to the environment, matters are less clear-cut. Spinoza does acknowledge that humans are by their nature dependent upon their environment:
It is the part of a wise man, I say, to refresh and restore himself in moderation with pleasant food and drink, with scents, with the beauty of green plants, with decoration, music, sports, the theater, and other things of this kind, which anyone can use without injury to another. For the human Body is composed of a great many parts of different natures, which constantly require new and varied nourishment… (E4p45s)
Unfortunately, after this picturesque passage, Spinoza does not go on to consider what our dependence upon our environment might entail with regard to our treatment of it. Much of our concern regarding environmental ethics today is based on our recognition that the environment is not an inexhaustible source of nourishment and wealth; to a seventeenth-century author, this possibility would have seemed bizarre.
That being said, Spinoza’s views about animal ethics can be applied more or less directly to the environment as well. It would be irrational to work to preserve the environment for its own sake, since what is good for the environment is not necessarily good for us. However, insofar as we are concerned for the well-being of ourselves and other humans, and we recognize that well-being to depend upon the environment, it will be rational for us to preserve the environment—not for its sake, but for ours. This thought is at least hinted at in the quoted passage, where Spinoza notes that we are to “refresh and restore” ourselves only using means that “anyone can use without injury to another.” Insofar as the production of our “pleasant food and drink” turns out to cause injury to the environment upon which our neighbors (or we ourselves) depend, the practice would be open to moral criticism.
Some, such as Naess (1977), have gone further than this, arguing that Spinoza’s system provides a hospitable metaphysical background for ecology. However, as Kober (2013, 58–9) notes, one of the consequences of Spinoza’s views is that important conceptual tools of ecology lose their purchase. For example, Spinoza allows no distinction between what is natural and what is artificial. And, more importantly, there is no sense to be made of the designation of certain types of human activities as exploitative of the environment or of animals.
In the 17th century, moral philosophy was not yet primarily preoccupied with either accounting for the nature and origins of morality or with establishing general principles governing moral obligation—though, as we have seen, Spinoza does develop some views on these topics en route to the final part of the Ethics. Rather, in this period, one of the central aims of moral philosophy was to provide the reader with psychological tools that could be used to cultivate desirable states of being. For this reason, seventeenth-century texts on moral philosophy tend to be more akin to self-help books than to twenty-first century moral philosophy. The first half of Ethics V exemplifies this tendency. There, Spinoza attempts to provide a guide to how to train our minds in order to “bring it about that we are not easily affected with evil affects” (E5p10s).
‘Passion’ [passio] is a technical term for which Spinoza provides a careful definition. He writes, “An affect which is called a passion of the mind is a confused idea, by which the mind affirms of its body, or of some part of it, a greater or lesser force of existing than before, which, when it is given, determines the mind to think of this rather than that” (EIII Gen. Def. of Aff., G II/203–4). This definition connects the passions to his theory of ideas, since all passions are confused ideas. It also connects the passions to the conatus doctrine: the passions represent changes in the body’s “force of existing” [existendi vim], and this force of existing is presumably the same force introduced in his discussion of the innate striving of all things to persevere in existing (see section 1 above).
Spinoza appeals to both of these pieces of theoretical machinery, along with a few interesting additions, when he presents his five remedies for overcoming or restraining the passions. It is worth noting that although the view that we should strive to diminish the strength of our emotions has a very Stoic ring to it, he expressly distances himself from the Stoics. His reason for this is their belief “that the emotions depended absolutely on our will, and that we could absolutely govern them” (E5pref), which Spinoza thinks involves a misunderstanding of the structure and powers of the human mind. This comes out in his remedies for the passions: of the five remedies, only two (the first and fifth) are plausibly activities that we can perform intentionally.
Spinoza claims that whenever we “form a clear and distinct idea” of a passion, it will no longer be a passion (E5p3). Since all passions are confused ideas—indeed, this is a core component of the definition of a passion—the most straightforward way to eliminate a passion is to eliminate the confusion that is the basis for that passion. In Spinoza’s view, the idea of an idea is not really distinct from the idea itself (E2p21s), so the clear and distinct idea we form of a passionate affect is not really distinct from that affect. But, since the clear and distinct idea is not confused, to conceive of it in this way is to eliminate the confusion from the original passion. Once we have eliminated this confusion, “the affect will cease to be a passion” (ibid). This approach to overcoming a passion does not eliminate the affect that constitutes the passion, but merely eliminates that feature of the affect in virtue of which it constituted a passion. The confusion a passionate affect involves is not intrinsic to that affect, in Spinoza’s view, and when that confusion is stripped away, the affect nevertheless remains.
Spinoza does not say much to clarify how this procedure is supposed to work. However, in at least one of Spinoza’s accounts of confusion, to say that an idea is confused is to say that it is partly determined by external causes (E2p29s). Thus, to strip away the confusion from a passion would require one somehow to strip away some of its causes. But that possibility appears to be inconsistent with Spinoza’s conception of causation, according to which an effect must be understood through its causes (Lin [2009, 270]; Bennett [1984, 336]). Scholars remain divided as to whether this difficulty, commonly referred to as the Changing Problem, is surmountable; see Marshall (2012) for some proposed solutions on Spinoza’s behalf.
All inadequate ideas have external causes (E3p1), so all passions are guaranteed to have external causes as well. In some cases, a passion not only has an external cause, but is such that it represents that cause (or purported cause). For example, love is joy accompanied by the idea of an external cause of that joy (E3 Def. of Affs. VI, G II/192). That is, the passion of love is a composite idea, and its parts are (i) joy, and (ii) the representation of something external as producing that joy. In such cases, we can destroy the passion by mentally separating the idea of the external cause that it includes. As Spinoza puts it: “For what constitutes the form of [such passions] is joy, or sadness, accompanied by an external cause… So if this is taken away, the form of love or hate is taken away at the same time. Hence, these affects, and those arising from them, are destroyed” (E5p2d).
Spinoza’s third remedy for overcoming the passions is less a method than an observation about a natural consequence of our emotional psychology. One factor that determines the force with which an emotion strikes us is whether we conceive of its cause as present. For instance, Spinoza writes, “An affect whose cause we imagine to be with us in the present is stronger than if we did not imagine it to be with us” (E4p9). Examples of this phenomenon are abundant. Whether snakes are present or absent, Yetta fears them. However, if she thinks snakes are present, that fact serves to fuel her fear; and if she thinks them absent, her fear is greatly diminished. Affects that are produced by ordinary external objects—fear of snakes, love for one’s car, desire for pie, and so forth—all naturally vacillate in force over time based on whether we take their objects to be present or absent.
By contrast, affects “arising from or aroused by reason” (E5p7) have a very different profile. The object of such an affect is “necessarily related to the common properties of things” (E5p7d), which are pervasive features of reality, such as the property of being extended. In Spinoza’s view, “we always regard [such properties] as present,” and we “always imagine [them] in the same way” (ibid). So, such an affect will endure over a longer period of time, and with a more constant degree of force, than affects produced by external things. In the long run, Spinoza thinks, irrational affects will be forced to “accommodate themselves” more and more frequently to the rational affects. In this way, we will naturally tend over time toward rational affects and away from irrational ones. Spinoza’s line of argument here is thus aimed at defending the consoling thought that reason will tend to win out, rather than at providing a technique we can apply to help reason win out.
Recall from section 2 that Spinoza takes the greatest good for all humans to be knowledge of God. Fortunately, the idea of God is one that we “really fully possess” (E5p20s, G II/294; cf. E2p45), and so our greatest good can be realized. Indeed, since everything in nature is a mode of God, in Spinoza’s view, the skilled philosopher can revive and meditate upon the idea of God on the basis of any experience whatsoever; every experience can occasion a train of thought that leads the mind back to its greatest good, and the joy that it brings. But these facts suggest a fourth way in which we may diminish the force of our passions, namely by means of “the multiplicity of causes by which affections related to common properties or to God are encouraged” (E5p20s, G II/293).
As with the third method, Spinoza here has in mind the comparative force of rational affections over irrational ones. While the third remedy appeals to Spinoza’s view that the objects of rational affections are constant and unchanging, the fourth remedy appeals to his view that the causes of rational affections are universal and omnipresent. This is relevant because Spinoza holds that
[A]s an image, or affect, is related to more things, there are more causes by which it can be aroused and encouraged, all of which the mind…considers together as a result of the affect itself. And so the affect is the more frequent, or flourishes more often, and engages the mind more. (E5p11d)
This is another way in which rational affects gradually become stronger and eventually may overpower the passionate affects. Passionate affects may be very strong for as long as their cause is present, but rational affects—in particular, the desire for knowledge and the love of God—have innumerably more and greater causes, and so rational affects will “flourish more often, and engage the mind more” than passionate ones (ibid).
The final remedy Spinoza offers is unlike the previous two in that it is an activity that we can intentionally perform to diminish the force of our passions. It is based upon the power that he believes the human mind has to intentionally join two ideas to one another by frequently thinking about them in unison, so that when the first idea occurs, the second idea is naturally aroused in the mind as well. One of the ways in which we may apply this power is by intentionally joining passionate affects together with mottos or rules, “sure maxims of life,” that are rational to follow whenever those passions take hold of us (E5p10s, G II/287).
Spinoza uses several examples to flesh out how this remedy is supposed to work; the main example he uses is the maxim “that hate is to be conquered by love, or nobility, not by repaying it with hate in return” (ibid). He writes,
[W]e ought to think about and meditate frequently on the common wrongs of men, and how they may be warded off best by nobility. For if we join the image of a wrong to the imagination of this maxim, it will always be ready for us…when wrong is done to us. (E5p10s, G II/288)
We originally determine that nobility is a virtue by means of rational inquiry. However, we are not best served by attempting to recreate the chain of reasoning that would lead us to act nobly when someone insults or harms us, but rather by having that maxim firmly committed to memory. Spinoza is admitting that in the heat of the moment, we are unlikely to be able to simply reason our way out of passion. But by means of carefully arranging the thoughts our passions are associated with in advance, we can ensure that “the wrong, or hate usually arising from [another’s wronging us], will occupy a very small part of the imagination, and will be easily overcome” (ibid).
In this way, a person may intentionally use irrational processes (memory and imagination) to safeguard his ability to act rationally: “he who will observe these [rules] carefully…and practice them, will soon be able to direct most of his actions according to the command of reason” (E5p10s, G II/289). By training ourselves to react in ways that, in our calmer, dispassionate moments, we recognize to be rational, we will be prepared to respond appropriately even when we lack time for reflection. This appears to connect to Spinoza’s claim in the preface to Ethics 4 that we ought to cultivate and hold before ourselves an idealized human being whom we can model our own behavior upon (discussed in section 2.3). Based on passages such as this, scholarship on Spinoza’s ethical theory has tended to depart from the traditional picture of imagination as something to be transcended through the use of reason; see, for example, Soyarslan (2014, 243–7), Steinberg (2014, 187–192) and James (2014, 154–159). Although Spinoza may rightly be called a rationalist in a number of senses, his account of how we achieve “freedom of mind, or blessedness” (E5pref) appears to depend as much on non-rational powers of imagination and memory as it does on reason.
In Spinoza’s view, human moral judgments are grounded in human desires or beliefs. However, in spite of this anti-realist metaethics, Spinoza endorses an intellectualist version of ethical egoism: reason dictates that we seek our greatest good, and this greatest good is understanding. He further tempers his ethical egoism by endorsing a version of contractarianism, according to which we may be bound to obey laws even when we recognize them to be irrational, and they seem to hinder our efforts to seek our greatest good, since the alternative (living without the help of civil society) will always be far worse. Finally, to aid us in the pursuit of understanding, which is often hindered by our passions, Spinoza provides a series of “remedies” by which the force of the passions may be mitigated.
Thus, in spite of the fact that Spinoza initially appears to have no interest in our contemporary notion of moral philosophy, the moral theory he develops has a surprising degree of depth and nuance. Indeed, since he builds his account of morality on top of a thoroughly naturalistic conception of the world, and of humanity’s place in it—and since our desire not to be mastered by our passions remains as strong today as it was in the 17th century—Spinoza’s moral philosophy remains alive for us today.
Passages from Spinoza’s Ethics are cited in the usual way. For example, ‘E1p25’ refers to Ethics part 1 proposition 25; ‘E1p25d’ refers to the demonstration of that proposition; ‘E1p25s’ to its scholium; and ‘E1p125c’ to its corollary. Reference to the Gebhardt edition page numbers is provided where the usual citation would refer to a span of more than one page.
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