Henry David Thoreau (1817–1862)
The American author Henry David Thoreau is best known for his magnum opus Walden, or Life in the Woods (1854); second to this in popularity is his essay, “Resistance to Civil Government” (1849), which was later republished posthumously as “Civil Disobedience” (1866). His fame largely rests on his role as a literary figure exploring the wilds of the natural world, not as a philosopher.
Thoreau gravitated toward Stoic philosophy, Hindu and Buddhist insights, and European idealism and romanticism; he was an eclectic thinker weaving together various philosophies to formulate his own unique strain of American thought.
This article helps readers understand Thoreau’s philosophical inclinations and his contributions to American philosophy that allow him to stand as an early innovator of American thought and literature, and it does so based on Thoreau’s concept of wildness and his penchant to preserve wildness in all he encountered.
Thoreau’s emphasis on the individual’s encounter with wildness oriented his outlook on authorship and philosophy, education, ontology, religion, ethics, and politics. The following sections of this article will show this through evidence provided in Thoreau’s literary and personal writings: his essays, books, journal entries, and letters.
In the twenty-first century, scholars have begun to take Thoreau more seriously as a philosopher. In The Senses of Walden, Stanley Cavell addresses Thoreau as an analyst of language who works against skeptical foundations. Cavell’s engagement associates Thoreau with other philosophers of language, such as Ludwig Wittgenstein and J. L. Austin. Alfred I. Tauber focuses on Thoreau as a moral thinker, and the essays in Thoreau’s Importance for Philosophy address Thoreau’s aesthetics, environmental ethics, ideas on embodiment, moral epistemology, political ideas, and Stoic affinities. A similar philosophical emphasis can be found in The Concord Saunter, a peer-reviewed journal dedicated to the study of Thoreau’s life and texts; an example is Edward F. Mooney’s article examining Thoreau’s wild ethics, which concludes with a summary of Thoreau’s ethics of care, or more accurately, Thoreau’s preservative care for all that is wild.
In the end, this emphasis on a more philosophical Thoreau makes sense. Because of Harvard College’s reliance on John Locke’s empirical philosophy, Thoreau extensively examined Locke’s Essay on Human Understanding, and he had to study the Scottish Common Sense philosophy of Thomas Reid and Dugald Stewart. As a Transcendentalist and through his friendships with thinkers steeped in German thought, Thoreau became acquainted with German philosophers and literary figures, such as Johann Gottlieb Fichte, Johan Wolfgang von Goethe, Immanuel Kant, G. W. F. Hegel, and Friedrich von Schlegel. Finally, in Thoreau’s library one could find various philosophical texts: Thomas Brown’s Philosophy of the Human Mind, William Paley’s The Principles of Moral and Political Philosophy, Dugald Stewart’s Elements of the Philosophy of the Human Mind, and books on Nyāya and Sāṅkhya philosophies (leading schools in Hindu philosophy). Immersion in philosophy, therefore, was a crucial part of Thoreau’s development as an American thinker and writer.
Table of Contents
- Biographical Information
- Subjectivity, Philosophy, and Writing
- Education and Uncommon Sense
- Nature and Ontology
- Religion and the Wild
- An Ethic of Preservative Care
- Disobedient Politics
- References and Further Reading
Thoreau was born in Concord, Massachusetts to a close-knit family. Within his house were his mother, father, two sisters, and brother. To help supplement their income, the Thoreau family took in boarders, and Thoreau helped out at his father’s pencil factory. Outside of brief excursions, most of Thoreau’s life was spent in and around Concord, and with the exception of his time living at Ralph Waldo Emerson’s house and in New York City as a tutor, Thoreau remained at home until his death at the age of forty-four from tuberculosis.
He was born during a period of rapid changes in the United States. Thoreau lived during the early phases of the American Industrial Revolution and the rise of populous textile mills at the confluence of the Concord and Merrimack rivers and up and down the Merrimack River; he lived during the rise of the telegraph; he lived during the time of westward expansion, the California gold rush, the Mexican-American War, and staunch resistance to slavery from the abolitionists. While all these play an important role in his texts, Thoreau chose the railroad as an enigmatic presence and force in New England.
The railroad was extending across the United States, and its whistle penetrated the recesses of the woods around Concord. In Walden, Thoreau writes, “The whistle of the locomotive penetrates my woods summer and winter, sounding like the scream of a hawk sailing over some farmer’s yard, informing me that many restless city merchants are arriving within the circle of the town, or adventurous country traders from the other side” (115). In A Week on the Concord and Merrimack Rivers (1849), Thoreau describes a similar phenomenon, but with more emphasis on the railroad’s undesirable effects on the natural world: “Instead of the scream of a fish-hawk scaring the fishes, is heard the whistle of the steam-engine arousing a country to its progress” (87). The train explicitly represents great power, technological innovation, the rule of commerce, and cultural progress, but it also carries the connotation of the displacement of animals, the destruction of the natural world, and the pernicious powers of the market. For Thoreau, therefore, “progress” was an ambiguous term; while the majority of Americans could honor this word, Thoreau recognized the constraints of capitalist democracy, and he was concerned about where a market-based culture was going to lead the nation and just how harmful “progress” could be.
He saw the unfavorable consequences of the market not only in the natural world, but the changes in human communities, and the diminishment of life worried him.
Most men, even in this comparatively free country, through mere ignorance and mistake, are so occupied with the factitious cares and superfluously coarse labors of life that its finer fruits cannot be plucked by them. Their fingers, from excessive toil, are too clumsy and tremble too much for that. Actually, the laboring man has not leisure for a true integrity day by day; he cannot afford to sustain the manliest relations to men; his labor would be depreciated in the market. He has no time to be anything but a machine. (Thoreau 6)
America’s market society was generating a level of artificiality in life and cultivating a desire for the accumulation of goods. A consumer society is based on the ability to create a desire for new products; to maintain this high level of dependence on material goods, people have to work more. These artificial cares, or desires for unneeded goods, diminished the time available for rejuvenating activities and quality interpersonal relations. In a society of technological advancement and the increased use of machines, human beings were beginning to become more mechanized. They were machines guided by the timetable of the market and robotic laborers doing unsatisfying jobs.
To counteract this dehumanizing process, Thoreau chose to make his life an example of simple living and his writings fruits of his countercultural lifestyle. Within this context, he is probably best known for his experiment at Walden Pond. This was his personal declaration of independence. Obtaining approval from Emerson to build a cabin on Emerson’s land, Thoreau built a ten-by-fifteen-foot cabin on the shores of Walden Pond. For two years, two months, and two days from July 4, 1845 to September 6, 1847, Thoreau dedicated his life to frugality and writing the only two books published during his lifetime: A Week and Walden. His townspeople persistently inquired why he chose to live aloof from society, and Thoreau gave his answer in a famous passage in the second chapter of Walden: “I went to the woods because I wished to live deliberately, to front only the essential facts of life, and see if I could not learn what it had to teach, and not, when I came to die, discover that I had not lived. I did not wish to live what was not life, living is so dear, nor did I wish to practice resignation, unless it was quite necessary. I wanted to live deep and suck out all the marrow of life . . .” (90-91). He partially withdrew from society, so he could experience life more directly, being able to confront it on its simplest terms. In doing so, Thoreau wanted to “suck out all the marrow of life,” which means he sought to ingest the vitality at the core of life itself—as “marrow” signified the best aspect of an entity. His withdrawal, then, concerned living more fully and as simply as possible.
Despite his serious efforts to be an accomplished writer, Thoreau’s writings, generally, were not warmly received. In 1849, he had to publish A Week with his own money, and Thoreau remained in debt to the publisher for several years. Walden, which was published in 1854, was more warmly received, but generally throughout his life, people did not see Thoreau as an accomplished author. It was not until years later, around the beginning of the twentieth century, when people started to appreciate Thoreau more, and Houghton Mifflin Co. helped to solidify his reputation in 1906 when the company published his books, essays, and journals, which totaled twenty volumes. Since 1906, Thoreau’s reputation as a literary figure has grown, and he has become an important intellectual figure for environmental movements.
The Transcendentalist movement, which was an intellectual, social, and religious movement of loosely gathered, like-minded individuals in and around Boston and Concord, helped to cultivate Thoreau’s intellectual pursuits. During his years at Harvard College, Thoreau had read Emerson’s Nature (1836), which he withdrew from the library on two occasions; Emerson’s book was one of the earliest expressions of New England Transcendentalism. Around the time of his graduation from college, he became better acquainted with Emerson personally, and they developed a type of mentoring friendship. While their relationship would decrease in intimacy and fondness later in life, the early support and inspiration Thoreau received from Emerson was crucial for Thoreau’s development as a writer. He had lived with Emerson from 1841 to 1843, for example, and this provided Thoreau with an environment that nurtured his writing and gave him the opportunity to interact intimately with Emerson’s wife and children. While serving as a handyman, Thoreau had access to Emerson’s library and Emerson’s supportive company, which sustained Thoreau’s hopes for authorial success.
For Thoreau, however, life and literature were not two distinct realms; in fact, he was accustomed to a way of seeing the world that merged different areas of study. He was comfortable with transgressing intellectual boundaries; this is seen most clearly, for example, in his study of the natural world. Thoreau was a land surveyor; in fact, he was one of the most accurate and trusted surveyors in, and around, the Concord area. He was accustomed to spending time outdoors, which was largely a daily routine and constituted hours of his day. Thoreau was fond of the natural world; arguably, one could see it as a type of romantic or friendly fondness. He studied nature intensively, such as documenting the date that specific flowers bloomed, the rise and fall of water levels, and the dispersion patterns of seeds.
At the time, this scientific outlook was called natural philosophy, and Thoreau often identified himself as a natural philosopher. This passion of his, however, went much deeper than science; he saw nature as an important part of the human context, so to study nature was to study humanity, too. This was not the only leap he would take to cross disciplinary boundaries. Math and poetry could be linked, nature and literature could be linked, and so could religion and politics. The important point for understanding Thoreau, then, is that study of all kinds should be integrated and assist pupils in living a freer, more responsible life marked by the quality, not the quantity, of life.
Outside of Walden, Thoreau is known best for his essay “Civil Disobedience.” This essay began as a lecture given on January 26 and February 16, 1848, and the original title was “The Rights and Duties of the Individual in Relation to Government.” When the essay was published in a journal called Aesthetic Papers in May 1849, Thoreau changed the title to “Resistance to Civil Government,” but it was not until 1866, four years after Thoreau’s death, that the essay would receive the new title of “Civil Disobedience.” This essay, arguably, provides one of the best starting points for Thoreau’s political philosophy and the best place to begin reading his other reform writings.
“Civil Disobedience” is also important, however, because it has played an important role in Thoreau’s global influence. While Thoreau’s influence on Mohandas Karamchand Gandhi is exaggerated at times, it is clear that Thoreau’s essay and other writings provided Gandhi with a strategic advantage because of Thoreau’s place in American literature and because of Thoreau’s admiration for Hindu philosophy. Thoreau’s influence proceeded from Gandhi to Martin Luther King, Jr.; through his reading of Gandhi, King encountered Thoreau as a political ally for the struggle for liberation from segregation and racism. Today, Thoreau’s influence extends to environmentalism and struggles for human rights within the U.S. and beyond.
A common description of Thoreau emphasizes his ardent individuality. One quote used to justify this comes from the concluding chapter of Walden: “If a man does not keep pace with his companions, perhaps it is because he hears a different drummer. Let him step to the music which he hears, however measured or far away” (Thoreau 326). But such descriptions need be tempered by his fondness for communion with others, which is clearly seen in how he furnished his cabin while residing at Walden Pond: “I think that I love society as much as most, and am ready enough to fasten myself like a bloodsucker for the time to any full-blooded man that comes in my way. I am naturally no hermit . . . I had three chairs in my house; one for solitude, two for friendship, three for society” (Thoreau 140). When we think of Thoreau, then, it should be with an awareness to both aspects, that is, his ability to march out of step with the rest of society and the satisfaction he gained from being with others. Any approach to his philosophy merits a balanced awareness of these dimensions. In the end, Thoreau wrote his philosophy from the subjective position, but he composed his works to transform and edify others, too.
From Thoreau’s perspective, it is naïve to think that any composition comes from a purely objective position; no author can ever remove the I from her or his work. Thoreau describes the dependence on the I in the second paragraph of Walden:
In most books, the I, or first person, is omitted; in this it will be retained; that, in respect to egotism, is the main difference. We commonly do not remember that it is, after all, always the first person that is speaking. I should not talk so much about myself if there were any body else whom I knew as well. Unfortunately, I am confined to this theme by the narrowness of my experience. (3)
While there have been thinkers who have wanted to escape the confines of the human being as a contextualized, limited animal, what we could associate with Thomas Nagel’s view from nowhere, Thoreau rejects a desire for complete objectivity. Yes, there is an external world that impinges on our senses, that poses limits, and may prove false our misguided conclusions and assumptions, but all experience is the experience of someone from a particular time and location.
This means that philosophy will never be objective; it will always carry within it the authorial I and the author’s prejudices, desires, and expectations. If we focus closely on the above passage, it also is clear that our experiences are quite limited; while we may know ourselves best, Thoreau never asserts that we know ourselves completely. Human endeavors, including philosophy, will be marked by incompleteness, which is a lack of intimacy with all that the world has to offer and a lack of intimacy with our own inner world, too. With every text, authors provide readers with only one perspective from within an infinite array of other possible angles.
Thoreau’s emphasis on infinite possibilities is not hyperbole. He bases this ability to divide perspectives infinitely on mathematical insights. Between any two points on a number line, for example, an infinite division is possible. The subjective view admits of infinite divisions; we can change our views by altering our relations with objects. Honoring perspectival shifts in A Week, Thoreau esteems what he calls “a separate intention of the eye.” Looking at the calm water’s surface as he and his brother float on the Concord River, Thoreau offers the following observation: “Wherever the trees and skies are reflected there is more than Atlantic depth, and no danger of fancy running aground. We noticed that it required a separate intention of the eye, a more free and abstracted vision, to see the reflected trees and the sky, than to see the river bottom merely; and so are there manifold visions in the direction of every object . . .” (48). Depending on how you approach any object and the emphases you select, or what separate intention of the eye you deploy, it is possible to encounter any object infinitely and to reposition it within its eternal relations (359).
This is why Thoreau values uncommon sense over common sense. Along with his emphasis on the perspectival nature of observations and writing, Thoreau’s reverence for uncommon sense is crucial to understanding his role as a philosopher and author. There are two passages in A Week emphasizing the tension between common and uncommon sense. He writes,
I perceive in the common train of my thoughts a natural and uninterrupted sequence, each implying the next, or, if interruption occurs it is occasioned by a new object being presented to my senses. But a steep, and sudden, and by these means unaccountable transition, is that from a comparatively narrow and partial, what is called common sense view of things, to an infinitely expanded and liberating one, from seeing things as men describe them, to seeing them as men cannot describe them. This implies a sense which is not common, but rare in the wisest man’s experience; which is sensible or sentient of more than common. (386)
In a passage on the following page, Thoreau writes, “What is called common sense is excellent in its department, and as invaluable as the virtue of conformity in the army and navy,–for there must be subordination,–but uncommon sense, that sense which is common only to the wisest, is as much more excellent as it is more rare” (387). Thoreau is directing the reader’s attention to experiences of liberation from the common ways of receiving, describing, and explaining the world. For Thoreau, humans become molded by customs and habits that affect our sensations, thoughts, and actions. He is not content with these common ways and wants to break free from them; being able to come to a rare angle of vision is not only liberating, but it is one of the elements of being wise.
As a philosopher and author, therefore, Thoreau is not satisfied with supposed objective writing. He encourages readers to experience the world and life through the first person, singular I, and he advocates freeing oneself from the commonplace thoughts and interpretations of life. He wants readers to explore life from many angles. While this honors the individual and her or his emplacement in a specific context, Thoreau wants people to transcend those constraints to experience the novelty and natural regenerative forces found in every context. This is arguably one of the most important reasons for writing, namely, the text’s potential to liberate readers. Thoreau writes,
Enough has been said in these days of the charm of fluent writing. We hear it complained of some works of genius, that they have fine thoughts, but are irregular and have no flow . . . We should consider that the flow of thought is more like a tidal wave than a prone river . . . The reader who expects to float down stream for the whole voyage, may well complain of nauseating swells and choppings of the sea when his frail shore-craft gets amidst the billows of the ocean stream . . . But if we would appreciate the flow that is in these books, we must expect to feel it rise from the page like an exhalation, and wash away our critical brains like burr millstones, flowing to higher levels above and behind ourselves. (A Week 102-03)
As a philosopher, then, Thoreau does not imagine his role as a comforter, nor does he imagine his role as a person who maintains the stability of society; his role, not dissimilar to Socrates’ role, is one of disturber and nonconformist, as he stands aloof from the state and the constraining elements of society. His essays and books, therefore, serve as an outlet for his short-circuiting thoughts: “Books, not which afford us a cowering enjoyment, but in which each thought is of unusual daring; such as an idle man cannot read, and a timid one would not be entertained by, which even make us dangerous to existing institutions,–such call I good books” (A Week 96). To be a self implies a level of disobedience, and this same disobedience will be found in the author’s works.
Thoreau was known for his ability to teach, to inspire students, and to foster creativity; and he was known for his practice of leaving the classroom to take his students on walks and exploring the woods with them. He resisted many commonplace educational practices; the most important example is his dislike for corporal punishment. Thoreau resisted its use in the burgeoning public school system of Concord, and he eventually left his post because he could not approve of attempts to make him do otherwise. This distaste for corporal punishment was part of a larger distrust of popular views of education in general; he had been educated in a system that emphasized rote learning. His educational values and distrust for standard educational practices, however, harmonized with those of his Transcendentalist friends; one of the recurring themes in Transcendentalism, for example, is how to improve education, its creative potential, and its ability to transform society. From within this context, Thoreau esteemed education as a freeing activity and as an integral part of the social fabric.
A common motif in Thoreau’s work is the unexpected; he esteems novel insights or fresh ways of seeing. On May 30, 1853, Thoreau wrote the following words in his journal: “That which had seemed a rigid wall of vast thickness unexpectedly proves a thin and undulating drapery. The boundaries of the actual are no more fixed and rigid than the elasticity of our imaginations. The fact that a rare and beautiful flower which we never saw, perhaps never heard [of], for which therefore there was no place in our thoughts, may at length be found in our immediate neighborhood, is very suggestive” (Journal 5 203-04). This passage returns to the tension between common and uncommon sense; for Thoreau, there is an attraction to seeing things in an uncommon way, encounters with the world that reveal how porous and flexible our understanding of the world should be. Instead of education being a way to train students through rote learning and rigid constructs, Thoreau envisioned education as being more about provocation, imagination, and freeing students to experience moments of insight more frequently. Education, therefore, had an element of cultivating a sensibility for the unforeseen, for the wild.
In a similar approach to his outlook on authorship, Thoreau understood education as a highly personal experience with transformative qualities. He esteems the subjective element in learning.
There is no such thing as purely objective observation. Your observation, to be interesting, i.e. to be significant, must be subjective. The sum of what the writer of whatever class has to report is simply some human experience, whether he be poet or philosopher or man of science. The man of most science is the man most alive, whose life is the greatest event. Senses that take cognizance of outward things merely are of no avail. It matters not where or how far you travel,—the farther commonly the worse,—but how much alive you are. (Journal 6 236-38)
The duality between objective and subjective observation has important implications for education. First, it means that education is not based on the model of a phlegmatic observer who is separate from that which is being observed; instead, observation and learning emerge from a life lived with intensity and subjective concerns. Secondly, the intensity of one’s life conditions one’s ability to look at the world in a more fruitful way; to live more freely and in a way not restrained by restrictive customs and habits will lead to greater appreciation for the unexpected in life, which keeps the senses attuned to the external world and its wildness. The terminus, however, is the integration of the external world with one’s internal world; eventually, all the data will take on the personal qualities of the observer, which leaves education a highly subjective act fully merged with daily life within specific contexts.
Thoreau offers a type of education that should aspire to a level of wildness or should be a little uncivilized. Not only is education stultifying for students who are forced to take part in rote learning, but pedantic teachers also cultivate a way of engaging life and studies that is constraining. In his journal, Thoreau explains, “Scholars have for the most part a diseased way of looking at the world. They mean by it a few cities and importunate assemblies of men and women—who might all be concealed in the grass of the prairie” (Journal 2 69). The overly pedantic learning of scholars is “diseased,” as it takes a very partial or narrow view of what counts for life, who counts as a person, and what locations are significant for human life. The end of Thoreau’s entry reintroduces the tension between civilization and the wilds of the natural world: “They describe their world as old or new—healthy or diseased—according to the state of their libraries—a little dust more or less on their shelves. When I go abroad from under this shingle or slate roof—I find several things which they have not considered—their conclusions seem imperfect.” Scholars remain content with the knowledge in their libraries and do not seek other forms of experience or fresh insights. Thoreau reuses the word “diseased” to emphasize a faculty not functioning at its healthiest capacity; unlike these scholars, however, Thoreau moves beyond the construction of the house and ventures into the world beyond books and libraries. It is beyond the bookish space of the scholar that he finds things that undo their arguments; they have come to the wrong conclusions; their encyclopedic knowledge is unsound.
To be an educator, a student, or a scholar means more than understanding the common sense of other writers; true education and learning exceed the encyclopedic knowledge of a community. Sitting in the same room or at the same desk day after day is an ineffective way to cultivate knowledge. Contrary to the cultivation of facts and the short time devoted to education in life, education is a life-long process for Thoreau that, ideally, should inform the community’s ethos, turning all members of society into a team of mutually-supportive learners or a culture based on continuing education.
We boast that we belong to the nineteenth century and are making the most rapid strides of any nation. But consider how little this village does for its own culture . . . We need to be provoked,—goaded like oxen, as we are, into a trot. We have a comparatively decent system of common schools, schools for infants only . . . and latterly the puny beginning of a library suggested by the state, no school for ourselves . . . It is time that we had uncommon schools, that we did not leave off our education when we begin to be men and women. It is time that villages were universities, and their elder inhabitants the fellows of universities, with leisure—if they are indeed so well off—to pursue liberal studies the rest of their lives. (Walden 108-09)
In this passage, which is as much a criticism of local and state practices as much as a comment on education, Thoreau advocates a communal emphasis and pride of place for education and schools. It is not enough to educate people for part of their lives; instead, education should be a continuous process throughout our lives. Against simple factual acquisition, early childhood education only, the devaluation of the schools, and a lack of funding, Thoreau paints a picture of education that is freeing, dynamic, done in shifting contexts, and invaluable to the health of society. Education should prepare us for engaging life in fresh ways and experiencing the flux that constitutes all existence.
Thoreau was an ardent lover of all things “natural”; contrary to caricatures of him, he was not so enamored with nature that he only saw its “positive” aspects. In fact, he came to understand quite well how diverse and complex the natural world is. It is accurate to say that he saw the beauty of nature and its life-giving potential, and this led him to reimagine who the human being is. In his essay “Walking” (1862), Thoreau addresses his desire for being more connected with the natural world: “I wish to speak a word for Nature, for absolute Freedom and Wildness, as contrasted with a Freedom and Culture merely civil,—to regard man as an inhabitant, or a part and parcel of Nature, rather than a member of society” (Excursions 185). Instead of ignoring the natural world, Thoreau wants to honor its importance, but he makes it clear that it is through nature and in nature that humanity is more than it is in civil society. In other words, society constructs a reductive image of humans as outside of nature and separate from it, but this is a dehumanizing process, as being fully human is realizing how we are part of the natural environment everywhere surrounding, embracing, penetrating, and integrating us.
This does not mean, however, that the natural world takes notice of humanity. Thoreau knew that the natural world provides humans with needed materials to survive, but just as much as it helps us to survive, it also can be violent and indifferent to humanity’s welfare. In Cape Cod (1865), Thoreau describes the tendency nature has of “wasting no thought on man.”
The sea-shore is a sort of neutral ground, a most advantageous point from which to contemplate this world . . . The waves forever rolling to the land are too far-travelled and untamable to be familiar . . . . It is a wild, rank place, and there is no flattery in it. Strewn with crabs, horse-shoes, and razor-clams, and whatever the sea casts up,—a vast morgue, where famished dogs may range in packs, and crows come daily to glean the pittance which the tide leaves them. The carcasses of men and beasts together lie stately up upon its shelf, rotting and bleaching in the sun and waves, and each tide turns them in their beds and tucks fresh sand under them. There is naked Nature,—inhumanly sincere, wasting no thought on man, nibbling at the cliffy shore where gulls wheel amid the spray. (147)
The ocean can be beautiful, but here Thoreau describes the very inhumane sincerity that gives the ocean its character. As much as the water supports a lively world below its surface, it harbors within it dead, decaying bodies that find little rest among the nonstop agitations and undulations of the waves.
While the popular perception of Thoreau can focus on his desire to preserve nature, its beauty, and its inspiring qualities, Thoreau does not ignore the potential danger that constitutes a great portion of nature. The ocean could carry commerce and people from continent to continent, but it could also toss boats around, sink them, and drown their passengers. Thoreau, therefore, was not blind to the immense power and dangers of nature, and he knew well the fear this could generate.
Based on his travels to Maine, Thoreau’s The Maine Woods (1864) provides startling accounts of the natural world and its relation with humans. One of the best-known passages concerns Thoreau’s ascent and descent of Mt. Ktaadn, which stands 5,269 feet high and is located almost in the center of Maine. Thoreau was not ready for the feeling of dislocation he would be subjected to as he crossed a rugged, lightning-charred portion of the mountain; being outside of commonly-encountered surroundings and traversing the harsh portion of Ktaadn, Thoreau explains,
Perhaps I most fully realized that this was primeval, untamed, and forever untameable Nature, or whatever else men call it, while coming down this part of the mountain. We were passing over Burnt Lands, burnt by lightning . . . It is difficult to conceive of a region uninhabited by man. We habitually presume his presence and influence everywhere. And yet we have not seen pure Nature, unless we have seen her thus vast, and drear, and inhuman, though in the midst of cities. Nature was here something savage and awful, though beautiful . . . I stand in awe of my body, this matter to which I am bound has become so strange to me. I fear not spirits, ghosts, of which I am one,—that my body might,—but I fear bodies, I tremble to meet them. What is this Titan that has possession of me. Talk of mysteries!—Think of our life in nature,—daily to be shown matter, to come in contact with it,—rocks, trees, wind on our cheeks! The solid earth! The actual world! The common sense! Contact! Contact! Who are we? Where are we? (69-71)
Here Thoreau becomes dispossessed of the familiarity he has felt in nature; the starkness of the landscape and the raw materiality of the mountain thrust his own materiality into question, which generates a desire for material contact. He moves from the land that is inhuman to his need for contact; he has encountered a part of nature that does not make him feel at home, but has reduced him to feeling less than himself, or other than himself. His materiality has become fleetingly insignificant in the face of the extremeness of the mountain’s overwhelming, non-comforting charred rockiness.
Nature is complex and without a consistent fond engagement with human life. At moments, it can be home and friend, a place for journeys and discoveries; at other times, it can be a threat to life, a brutal reminder of humanity’s dependence and finitude. To appreciate Thoreau’s outlook on the natural world, then, readers need to be aware of these disparate qualities of the natural world.
Despite this ambiguity concerning the character of the natural world, Thoreau’s writings continuously return to water for context and as a metaphor structuring his ontological outlook. From his earliest journal entries to his last years of journaling, the focus on water is prevalent. This emphasis is most evident in the final years of his life when he logged detailed data in his journals concerning the variations of water levels of the Concord River throughout the seasons. Similarly, the two books published during his life, A Week and Walden, are based on the importance of a source of water for the setting; in A Week, the setting is the Concord and Merrimack rivers, and in Walden, it is Walden Pond. In his two posthumously published books, The Maine Woods and Cape Cod, Thoreau is dependent on water, as it is inseparable from the overall progression of his writings; in The Maine Woods, for example, Thoreau travels by water from the Penobscot River and Chamberlain Lake to Moosehead Lake, and Cape Cod remains largely focused on the Atlantic Ocean and its impact on Cape Cod and its inhabitants.
Sherman Paul makes this clear in his book on Thoreau; he addresses the deep spiritual and ontological significance of water for Thoreau.
[There was] something irresistible in water for Thoreau, that something so spiritually akin to him that he felt himself called to it ‘by a natural impulse’ . . . the constant lure was the quest for a reality that had been encrusted by time and landed conventions, a reality to be regained by experience outside of time—that is, by immersion in its flux . . . The river had become the way of communion with the eternal. (199)
Thoreau makes water’s significance quite clear at the beginning of A Week when he focuses on rivers as highways and their constant ability to lure people into the deep recesses of uncharted territories: “Rivers must have been the guides which conducted the footsteps of the first travellers. They are the constant lure, when they flow by our doors, to distant enterprise and adventure, and, by a natural impulse, the dwellers of their banks will at length accompany their currents to the lowlands of the globe, or explore at their invitation the interior of continents. They are the natural highways of all nations . . .” (12). Human life and water are inseparable; water sustains life, travel, and the imagination.
Thoreau uses water for more than his settings, however, as he constructs his ontology on the flowing nature of water and the belief that change is a constant part of existence. Thoreau is comfortable with how all aspects of the world are changing; he made this discovery toward the end of his boating voyage with his brother, as he describes the flowing nature of all existence:
. . . all things seemed with us to flow; the shore itself, and the distant cliffs, were dissolved by the undiluted air. The hardest material seemed to obey the same law with the most fluid, and so indeed in the long run it does. Trees were but rivers of sap and woody fibre, flowing from the atmosphere, and emptying into the earth by their trunks, as their roots flowed upward to the surface. And in the heavens there were rivers of stars, and milky-ways, already beginning to gleam and ripple over our heads. There were rivers of rock on the surface of the earth, and rivers of ore in its bowels, and our thoughts flowed and circulated, and this portion of time was but the current of the hour. (A Week 244)
Instead of allowing readers to think that returning to land would be the halting point for encountering flows, Thoreau honors the changes going on below our feet and all around us. Instead of stability, there is flux everywhere, and this challenges our desires for permanence.
In a more famous passage from Walden, Thoreau brings the Earth’s alterations into the foreground.
Few phenomena gave me more delight than to observe the forms which thawing sand and clay assume in flowing down the sides of a deep cut on the railroad through which I passed on my way to the village, a phenomenon not very common on so large a scale . . . When the frost comes out in the spring, and even in a thawing day in the winter, the sand begins to flow down the slopes like lava, sometimes bursting out through the snow and overflowing it where no sand was to be seen before . . . . I am affected as if in a peculiar sense I stood in the laboratory of the Artists who made the world and me,—had come to where he was still at work . . . I feel as if I were nearer to the vitals of the globe . . . . What is man but a mass of thawing clay? . . . . Thus it seemed that this one hillside illustrated the principle of all the operations of Nature . . . It convinces me that Earth is still in her swaddling clothes, and stretches forth babe fingers on every side. (304-08)
This thawing, which is taking place around the railroad tracks, is a small portion of what is occurring on a larger scale. The flow of the sand and clay reminds Thoreau of the flowing taking place within the human body, and it convinces him that Earth is still in a process of changing and maturing. This is Thoreau’s “ontology of flows,” or his belief that the nature of being is in a constant state of perpetual flux. It is philosophically incorrect to emphasize permanence or stagnation over change.
This view of the natural world has serious implications for Thoreau’s outlook on life and interactions with others. Societal structures like to keep things orderly, and societies like to categorize aspects of the world and rank them according to which aspects are extremely valuable compared to those things that are insignificant. This is what Thoreau identifies as the “civilizing processes” in American society. He links this with domestication, taming, and scripted hospitality. These attempts to constrain people oppose the natural flows constituting all existence, so Thoreau pursues a process of “becoming feral.” He wants to become uncivilized, untamed, or wild.
He needs the natural world and its wildness to keep him healthy, and Thoreau is often quite condemnatory concerning the effects society has on humans, which is present as early as his “Natural History of Massachusetts” (1842):
In society you will not find health, but in nature. Unless our feet at least stood in the midst of nature, all our faces would be pale and livid. Society is always diseased, and the best is the most so. There is no scent in it so wholesome as that of the pines, nor any fragrance so penetrating and restorative as the life-everlasting in high pastures . . . The doctrines of despair, of spiritual or political tyranny or servitude, were never taught by such as shared the serenity of nature. (Excursions 5)
Despite the potential dangers found in the natural world, there is a rejuvenating element that restores the person to health and maintains a more agreeable perspective on life. To be trapped indoors and in the grips of customs and habits is anathema to Thoreau; he sought the healthy, resilient fluctuations of the natural world until he was bedridden in the last days of his life because of tuberculosis. The wildness of creation always called to him.
Thoreau has been quite influential in environmentalist circles. His unwavering respect for the natural world and its processes is part of a lineage of ecological concern in the United States. Beyond his emphasis on the scientific and aesthetic sides of the natural world, however, Thoreau also honored the religious or spiritual dimensions of the environment. He did so with a pluralistic penchant that allowed him to remain open to religious insights across traditions, such as Buddhism, Hinduism, and Native American teachings.
In contemporary academic parlance, Thoreau integrated these outlooks into a position classified as “nature religion” or “deep green religion” by Catherine L. Albanese and Bron Taylor, respectively. Taylor comments on Thoreau’s importance within this realm:
Henry David Thoreau is often regarded as a patron saint for such spirituality in America, casting a long shadow and influencing virtually all of the twentieth-century’s most important environmentalist thinkers, including John Muir, John Burroughs, Aldo Leopold, Rachel Carson, Wendell Berry, Edward Abbey, Gary Snyder, and James Lovelock. Indeed, both Thoreau and these progeny have assumed iconic status within the pantheon of saints favored among those who participate in contemporary nature religion. (“From the Ground Up” 91)
Nature religion is “a type of religion in which nature is the milieu of the sacred, and within which the idea of transcendence of nature is unimportant or irrelevant to religious practice” (Davy 1175), and Taylor asserts that dark green religion means “religion that considers nature to be sacred, imbued with intrinsic value, and worthy of reverent care” (Dark Green Religion ix). Thoreau’s naturalistic orientation, therefore, is actually highly religious in nature, and this aspect of his thought places religion beyond the constraints of an institution and places religion beyond the walls of human structures. In fact, Thoreau’s religious perspective perpetuates the motif of wildness, a becoming feral in matters of religion.
Thoreau’s unique religious outlook developed in opposition to New England’s Christian traditions. He found conservative and liberal Christianities to be irreligious; instead of honoring creation, they profaned it. New England’s Christianity was too doctrinaire, and in its rigidity, it established supposed truths that were anything but certain for Thoreau, and they also helped to create a boundary between people. In the end, he was uncomfortable with dogmatic certainty.
Most people with whom I talk, men and women even of some originality and genius, have their scheme of the universe all cut and dried,–very dry, I assure you, to hear, dry enough to burn, dry-rotted and powder-post, methinks,–which they set up between you and them in the shortest intercourse; an ancient and tottering frame with all its boards blown off . . . Some to me seemingly very unimportant and unsubstantial things and relations, are for them everlastingly settled,–as Father, Son, and Holy Ghost, and the like. These are like the everlasting hills to them. But in all my wanderings, I never came across that least vestige of authority for these things. They have not left so distinct a trace as the delicate flower of a remote geological period on the coal in my grate. The wisest man preaches no doctrines; he has no scheme; he sees no rafter, not even a cobweb, against the heavens. It is clear sky. (A Week 69-70)
Here Thoreau offers disparaging comments against such religious doctrines as the Trinity; instead of turning to the Bible for the veracity of such doctrines, Thoreau turns to his experiences within the natural world. As he sauntered in the natural world in Massachusetts and beyond, Thoreau found nothing to justify the Trinity and other outlooks that others believed to be accurate understandings of Earth and the universe. Quite the contrary was true; instead of opening up the complexity of the universe and life, such doctrines actually exclude the richness of life and creation. Instead of allowing for intimate encounters, religious and nonreligious dogmas actually prevent more authentic relationships from growing.
One of the common ways of thinking about the natural world during Thoreau’s time was to depict it as God’s creation, and nature pointed back toward God as though the natural world were language with God as the author. This is found in Emerson’s first book, Nature (1836): “We can foresee God in the coarse, and, as it were, distant phenomena of matter . . . the noblest ministry of nature is to stand as the apparition of God. It is the organ through which the universal spirit speaks to the individual, and strives to lead back the individual to it” (Essays 40). In many of his writings, Emerson provides the reader with a reverential assessment of nature, but this reverence is not for nature itself; instead, his esteem is based on nature’s ability to lead humanity to the spirit behind and emanating through the natural world.
Thoreau finds this problematic, and he will proclaim that nature itself is divine: “May we not see God? . . . Is not Nature, rightly read, that of which she is commonly taken to be the symbol?” (382). It is incorrect to think of God as somewhere beyond the natural world; for Thoreau, when we interact with and experience the natural world properly, God is present. It is no longer the symbol pointing beyond to God; the natural world is divinity itself. Thoreau’s boldest statement, however, concerns his pagan worship of the natural world: “In my Pantheon, Pan still reigns in his pristine glory . . . Pan is not dead, as was rumored . . . . Perhaps of all the gods of New England and of ancient Greece, I am most constant at his shrine” (A Week 65). Instead of being in front of altars and preachers within churches, Thoreau turns to Pan: the god most comfortable in wild places, a god who dances and is supportive of shepherds and goatherds. Thoreau links immediacy, wildness, and playfulness to his religious orientation and worship.
In his examination and criticism of some of Hinduism’s shortcomings, Thoreau announces five qualities of the divine, which he calls the “Unnamed”: buoyancy, freedom, flexibility, variety, and possibility (A Week 136). In her analysis of Thoreau’s first book, Phyllida Anne Kent explains how Thoreau’s text is an elaboration of these qualities; each chapter variously emphasizes these qualities, and this guides the structure of the book: “In composing the Week Thoreau has constructed a myth of creation which embraces and transcends all other attempts to explain the universe in mythic form . . . The central figure of Thoreau’s myth seems to be a nameless spirit of the shore which represents creative power in man and in Nature” (14). The Unnamed plays an important role. First, all creation takes part in the divine processes of creation and recreation, and this implies that we need to honor these five qualities in the natural world, in ourselves, and in all human relationships. Second, the five qualities point to an ability to resist constraints, burdens, and rigidity. Instead of drowning in the difficulties of the world, we should rise above them. Instead of being constrained, we should maintain liberty. Instead of being inflexible, we should be more pliable. Instead of being comfortable with homogeneity, we should engage heterogeneity. Instead of focusing on those things that are unquestionably possible, we should move more toward unexpected and new potentials. These five qualities are best encountered in the natural world, and the natural world reminds us of their presence within every human being.
To many, this may seem an odd religious construct, and it may seem irrelevant and without much ability to shape or engage the world. The opposite is true, however, as this religious orientation has serious consequences for Thoreau’s outlook on ethics and politics. What takes shape in Thoreau’s writings is a concern for preserving these qualities in all he encounters. From friendships and his relationship with nature to his criticisms of society and slavery, it is clear that Thoreau’s guiding focus is on how to maintain the divine, wild qualities and how to resist those elements of society that try to constrain them or destroy them. It is from within this religious context that he develops an ethic of preservative care and a political outlook focused on a higher law, both trying to maintain the five qualities of the Unnamed. This religious perspective, therefore, is inseparable from his ethical and political concerns.
A brief reading of Thoreau’s comments leaves readers initially uncertain about his ethical position. For example, he unambiguously offers a pseudo-hedonistic sentiment in “Natural History of Massachusetts”: “Surely joy is the condition of life” (Excursions 5). In his first letter to his friend Harrison G. O. Blake in 1848, Thoreau offers the following advice clearly limiting the extent and importance of morality: “Do not be too moral. You may cheat yourself out of much life so. Aim above morality. Be not simply good—be good for something.—All fables indeed have their morals, but the innocent enjoy the story” (Correspondence, Volume 1 362). There is something in morality, if taken too seriously, that can diminish life, which means Thoreau establishes a tension between joyous living and a purely moral life. A similar anti-moral sentiment is found in A Week that expresses the limits of one’s conscience: “The conscience really does not, and ought not to, monopolize the whole of our lives, any more than the heart or the head. It is as liable to disease as any other part” (74). Against a Kantian appraisal of morality that foregrounds the moral law in all we do, Thoreau foregrounds how life exceeds morality, a dominating conscience, and an abstract goodness divorced from content or contexts.
What we get in Walden, however, is a very pragmatic assessment for being moral, which is drawn from his well-known hesitation to eat meat: “Yet, for my part, I was never unusually squeamish; I could sometimes eat a fried rat with a good relish, if it were necessary” (217). The important part of this quotation is the final conditional pronouncement, “if it were necessary.” Cross referencing this sentence with A Week, Thoreau clearly judges the eating of animal flesh problematic: “The carcasses of some poor squirrels, however, the same that frisked so merrily in the morning, which we had skinned and embowelled for our dinner, we abandoned in disgust, with tardy humanity, as too wretched a resource for any but starving men” (224). Those who come to humanity early see that killing such animals is less than a moral necessity; it is a disgusting act. When necessity demands it, when survival is the criterion, however, the morality of eating animal flesh changes. Changing conditions may alter the ethical demands we face, so a type of situational ethics or a pragmatic moral posture appears to guide Thoreau.
A better way to frame his ethics, however, is to concentrate on the ever-changing nature of the inward condition of human beings and their dynamic relationships with the world, both human and nonhuman. As Mooney indicates, one of Thoreau’s concerns is the wildness within every human being (“Thoreau’s Wild Ethics” 107-08). In a journal entry for August 19, 1851, Thoreau writes, “The poet must be continually watching the moods of his mind as the astronomer watches the aspects of the heavens . . . A meteorological journal of the mind” (Journal 3 377). This comparison between the mind and the skies offer a clear indication of the ceaselessly changing nature of one’s emotions and fluctuating moods. Part of the ethical task is to be aware of these shifts, meteorological alterations of the mind that affect life and relationships. In other words, any ethical position that seeks to impose stability and necessity on human life will encounter problems as the internal world, like nature, is filled with fluctuations. Ethics, then, needs to take account of this wildness within, or this undomesticated nature of our inner world.
Thoreau’s emphasis on being watchful is important, for he thought too many people lived their lives in a condition of sleep. Watchfulness and reawakening oppose inattentiveness and sleep. Thoreau tells readers, “We must learn to reawaken and keep ourselves awake, not by mechanical aids, but by an infinite expectation of the dawn, which does not forsake us in our soundest sleep. I know of no more encouraging fact than the unquestionable ability of man to elevate his life by a conscious endeavor . . . To effect the quality of the day, that is the highest of arts” (Walden 90). There is a perpetual newness immanent within human life that should not go unnoticed, and to live a fuller life, it needs to be one of fighting off sleep and living awakened; this will be done with an expectation of something like the renewal of dawn in life. This means fighting the habits and customs ingrained in us by society and disengaged living; it is the struggle to bring more quality to our lives through active engagement and attention to all we encounter.
The somnolent propensities of society leave people in a zombie-like state, focused on acquisitions, and in a state of desperation. In A Week, Thoreau offers a vivid picture of this condition: “All men are partially buried in the grave of custom, and of some we see only the crown of the head above ground. Better are the physically dead, for they more lively rot. Even virtue is no longer such if it be stagnant. A man’s life should be constantly as fresh as this river. It should be the same channel, but a new water every instant” (132). The slow accumulation of custom, its rules, and expectations leave people in a process of being buried alive; this diminishes life to such a great extent, that they are neither alive nor dead. To be buried alive and constrained by society’s customs is like being in a stagnant state where change is absent or nearly absent. The best life is one that is coursing and fresh, elevating the quality of life.
To understand this orientation in his ethics, it is important to understand Thoreau’s distrust of the market economy he was living in; instead of simple living and appreciation of one’s milieu, people were enticed to live unnecessarily complicated lives focused on the acquisition of new goods. People were enticed to take on more activities and possessions than was necessary, and Thoreau openly criticizes this through his emphasis on simple living.
Simplicity, simplicity, simplicity! I say, let your affairs be as two or three, and not a hundred or a thousand; instead of a million count half a dozen, and keep your accounts on your thumb nail. In the midst of this chopping sea of civilized life, such are the clouds and storms and quicksands and thousand-and-one items to be allowed for, that a man has to live, if he would not founder and go to the bottom and not make his port at all, by dead reckoning, and he must be a great calculator indeed who succeeds. Simplify, simplify. (Walden 91)
Society is like a dangerous ocean that is likely to submerge one’s life, taking the person down to the bottom of the ocean. Part of the difficulty is being able to calculate the simplest life against the impositions of society. Not only is life about paying attention, keeping awake amid the sleep-inducing qualities of society, and allowing one’s life to remain fresh, but Thoreau makes it clear that life has to be a strategic avoidance of the enticements and dangers of society.
Instead of falling into the trap of a consumer culture and the hoarding of unneeded products, Thoreau urges people to live as simply as possible, which in his words is similar to mathematical reductions: “I do believe in simplicity. It is astonishing as well as sad, how many trivial affairs even the wisest man thinks he must attend to in a day. When a mathematician would solve a difficult problem, he first frees the equation of all encumbrances, and reduces it to its simplest terms. So simplify the problem of life, distinguish the necessary and the real” (Thoreau, Dean, and Blake 36). The crucial ethical task, the crucial part of living a quality life, is the discernment of the real and the necessary, while recognizing and avoiding what is inauthentic and unnecessary.
Mooney rightly describes this orientation as a wild ethic and an ethic of preservative care (“Thoreau’s Wild Ethics”). From his essay “Walking” comes Thoreau’s most ardent statement about preserving wildness, a wildness present in the world around us and within us: “. . . and what I have been preparing to say is, that in Wildness is the preservation of the world” (Excursions 202). This wildness is not simply the trees and untamed aspects of the forest; there is a common wildness within the natural world and humanity, and ideally, society would integrate and nurture this wildness in the community:
Life consists with Wildness. The most alive is the wildest. Not yet subdued to man, its presence refreshes him. One who pressed forward incessantly and never rested from his labors, who grew fast and made infinite demands on life, would always find himself in a new country or wilderness, and surrounded by the raw material of life. He would be climbing over the prostrate stems of primitive forest trees. (202-04)
Within each person is a force with great potential that allows for an infinite demand on life, expectations that life will continue to grow and be fresh. This wildness is not focused satisfied with how things are, letting life stagnate; as Thoreau saw it, life, the woods, and all that is worthy of respect do not settle into a state of stagnant equilibrium. Instead, as with the natural world and its flowing, human life should be flowing and changing, too.
Wildness is a characteristic that people should have within themselves, and they should preserve this wild quality in their actions, thoughts, and speech. Jane Bennett aptly summarizes this quality: “. . . the Wild, that which disturbs and confounds settled projects, techniques, and myths . . . . the Wild speaks to the idea that there always remains a surplus that escapes our categories and organizational practices, even as it is generated by them” (xxvii). In the end, Thoreau’s ethic of preservative care—preserving wildness and the wild in all we encounter—entails a countercultural propensity, a disobedient way of life.
Because of Thoreau’s emphasis on wildness and his countercultural stance, writers have had a difficult time establishing where Thoreau belongs in relation to politics and other topics; his political philosophy has often fallen into contradictory categories.
In “Thoreau’s Ideas,” Walter Harding shows how variable Thoreau is and how difficult it is to categorize him; he examines this phenomenon of disparate Thoreaus as scholars have identified Thoreau as a stoic, epicurean, nature writer, ecologist, reformer, ardent supporter of abolitionism, critic of government, critic of economic systems, antisocial figure, and a person dedicated to friendship (97-138). Slight shifts of vision generate different Thoreaus; different emphases lead to different conclusions about Thoreau’s goals.
Behind this is another insight, however: Thoreau was an eclectic thinker enjoying interdisciplinary pursuits, and he followed Emerson concerning consistency. In “Self-Reliance,” Emerson proclaims, “A foolish consistency is the hobgoblin of little minds, adored by little statesmen and philosophers and divines. With consistency a great soul has simply nothing to do . . . Speak what you think now in hard words and to-morrow speak what tomorrow thinks in hard words again, though it contradict every thing you said to-day . . . To be great is to be misunderstood” (Essays 265). Thoreau’s interests, moods, and declarations about those interests and moods changed from day to day. Relating to politics, this variation has led to Thoreau the anarchist (Drinnon), Thoreau the Marxist comrade (Lynd 92-96), Thoreau as an un-Marxist thinker (Diggins), Thoreau as a comrade of Theodore W. Adorno—both examining democracy and alienation from a negative-dialectical perspective (Mariotti), Thoreau as an impotent critic of capitalism (Germic), and Thoreau as a liberation thinker (Ruehl). To appreciate why Thoreau seems uncontainable, and to appreciate his political philosophy, it is important to keep his emphasis on wildness and fluctuation in mind.
As described in the sections above, Thoreau was critical of attempts to constrain the freshness of life; he revered the processes of creation and regeneration that sustained all existence. One of the problems with society and government is that they attempt to constrain or dam the flows of life, which reduces life’s resiliency and freshness. Another serious problem, however, is that government and society do the opposite of what they are established to do; instead of protecting freedoms, democracy, and property, they imprison, dictate dogmatically, and steal:
I have not so surely foreseen that any Cossack or Chippeway would come to disturb the honest and simple commonwealth, as that some monster institution would at length embrace and crush its free members in its scaly folds; for it is not to be forgotten, that while the law holds fast the thief and murderer, it lets itself go loose. When I have not paid the tax which the State demanded for that protection which I did not want, itself has robbed me; when I have asserted the liberty it presumed to declare, itself has imprisoned me. Poor creature! If it knows no better I will not blame it. If it cannot live but by these means, I can. I do not wish, it happens, to be associated with Massachusetts, either in holding slaves or in conquering Mexico. (A Week 130)
This is a crucial passage in Thoreau’s thought for several reasons. First, it claims that the dangers do not originate beyond civil society and the state; people do not have to worry about nomadic groups or “tribal” peoples beyond the boundaries of “civilized” life. Instead, people need to fear the government, its institutions, and the willingness of citizens to support the state’s misdeeds. The commonwealth itself is the monster. Second, Thoreau is making a clear declaration that he wants to stand aloof from the state, which is the same declaration he makes in “Resistance to Civil Government”: “I simply wish to refuse allegiance to the State, to withdraw and stand aloof from it effectually . . . In fact, I quietly declare war with the State, after my fashion, though I will still make what use and get what advantage of her I can, as is usual in such cases” (Reform Papers 84). Third, the reason for distancing himself from the state is a result of the state’s corrupt nature; it uses taxes, authority, and power to maintain unjust conditions: slavery, the war with Mexico, and the decimation of Native American communities.
Thoreau, therefore, is comfortable with refusing to follow the rules of any authority, especially when that authority is oppressing another person or group. For Thoreau, the least duty we must follow is to not take part in oppression. If we have the courage and inclination, then active resistance is acceptable, too, but it is not necessary. He writes in “Civil Disobedience,”
It is not a man’s duty, as a matter of course, to devote himself to the eradication of any, even the most enormous wrong; he may still properly have other concerns to engage him; but it is his duty, at least, to wash his hands of it, and, if he gives it no thought longer, not to give it practically his support. If I devote myself to other pursuits and contemplations, I must first see, at least, that I do not pursue them sitting upon another man’s shoulders. I must get off him first, that he may purse his contemplations too. (Reform Papers 71)
Distance from the state is permissible, and avoidance of taking part in oppression is a duty. Active resistance and taking part in reform movements is an option. Life does not have to be reduced to militant activism, but we must at least make sure we neither oppress others nor contribute in any way to the oppression of others, whether through taxes, speech, or actions.
Slavery incited Thoreau to disobedience. He never joined the abolitionist movement, but he was an ardent supporter of abolition. Thoreau spoke at abolitionist rallies, even speaking at an antislavery celebration in Framingham on July 4, 1854 where William Lloyd Garrison burned the Constitution in protest. He supported John Brown, and Thoreau played a minor role in supporting the Underground Railroad, as he helped to usher slaves to safety, especially in 1851 and 1853 (Petrulionis 92-95; Richardson 249). His mother, aunts, and sisters were strong supporters of Concord’s antislavery movement, and the Thoreau family gladly took in fleeing slaves.
A friend of the family, Moncure Daniel Conway, describes the warmth of Thoreau in one of his writings concerning July 27, 1853:
I found the Thoreaus agitated by the arrival of a coloured fugitive from Virginia, who had come to their door at daybreak. Thoreau took me to a room where his excellent sister, Sophia, was ministering to the fugitive . . . I observed the tender and lowly devotion of Thoreau to the African. He now and then drew nearer to the trembling man, and with a cheerful voice bade him feel at home, and have no fear that any power should again wrong him. That whole day he mounted guard over the fugitive, for it was a slave-hunting time. (As quoted in Petrulionis 94)
Thoreau was convinced that we do not need movements, parties, and votes; what we need are people who will actively think about others and do what is best for them in every interaction.
As with the state, parties and movements can deteriorate into unthinking, dogmatic domains that impose conformity on others. When people are able to act disobediently, courageously, and in a responsible, reflective way, the state can wither away: “I heartily accept the motto,—‘That government is best which governs least;’ and I should like to see it acted up to more rapidly and systematically. Carried out, it finally amounts to this, which also I believe,—‘That government is best which governs not at all;’ and when men are prepared for it, that will be the kind of government which they hill have” (Reform Papers 63). When people finally live the lives they are created for, government will not be needed.
But what may be an even more important proclamation is the fact that one should never vote on issues of justice and injustice, but always act in support of justice no matter what the law, government, and masses say:
All voting is a sort of gaming, like chequers or backgammon, with a slight moral tinge to it, a playing with right and wrong, with moral questions; and betting naturally accompanies it . . . I cast my vote, perchance, as I think right; but I am not vitally concerned that that right should prevail. I am willing to leave it to the majority . . . Even voting for the right is doing nothing for it. It is only expressing to men feebly your desire that it should prevail. A wise man will not leave the right to the mercy of chance, nor wish it to prevail through the power of the majority. There is but little virtue in the action of masses of men. (Reforms Papers 69-70)
Consonant with the exemplary actions of his family and their ability to help people through personal contact and a strong inward devotion to what was right, Thoreau advocates a life lived well, based on justice and the courage to stand against common sense, the majority, and the state. One’s life should be the revolutionary change desired in one’s circumstances: “I think that we should be men first, and subjects afterward. It is not desirable to cultivate a respect for the law, so much as for the right . . . . Action from principle . . . changes things and relations; it is essentially revolutionary, and does not consist wholly with any thing which was” (Reform Papers 65-72). Your own life, therefore, can be the revolution.
Thoreau’s philosophy begins from an affirmative position, as he reveres, endorses, and remains faithful to wildness around and within him; his concern is to preserve wildness in his life and in every encounter. Where wildness is constrained, Thoreau wants to create the conditions for its liberation or to offer a criticism of the circumstances subjugating it. This constitutes Thoreau’s “feral philosophy,” a philosophy continuously seeking to be free from the domesticating activities of society and a philosophy seeking to liberate the rest of existence from those same domesticating activities. He intends to reframe things in fresh ways to subvert stale, common sense understandings of life and the world. Concerning this approach, Emerson offered an insightful point when he spoke at Thoreau’s funeral; to those in attendance, Emerson offered the following observation in a somewhat critical, hostile tone,
The habit of a realist to find things the reverse of their appearance inclined him to put every statement in a paradox. A certain habit of antagonism defaced his earlier writings—a trick of rhetoric not quite outgrown in his later, of substituting for the obvious word and thought its diametrical opposite. He praised wild mountains and winter forests for their domestic air, in snow and ice he would find sultriness, and commended the wilderness for resembling Rome and Paris. “It was so dry, that you might call it wet.” (“Introduction” xxvii-xxviii)
While his comment is overly reductive, simplifying Thoreau’s creativity and his writing skills too much, Emerson is on target to a certain extent; through paradox and reversals, Thoreau’s philosophy seeks to bring out the uncommon in the common. This is the approach guiding Thoreau’s philosophy, but in his deployment of it on diverse topics, Thoreau’s creativity offers startling observations and insights. His creativity, his highly refined prose, and the autobiographical origins of his writings often conceal Thoreau’s philosophical rigor; but woven throughout his texts are the concept of wildness and Thoreau’s ceaseless attempts to celebrate and elaborate what it means. From his antislavery essays to his travel narratives, wildness is the recurring philosophical theme.
- Thoreau, Henry David. Cape Cod. Edited by Joseph J. Moldenhauer. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1988.
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Robert Michael Ruehl
St. John Fisher College
U. S. A.