Plato: The Timaeus
There is nothing easy about the Timaeus. Its length, limited dramatic discourse, and arid subject-matter make for a dense and menacing work. But make no mistake, it is a menacing work of great subtly and depth. Cosmology has traditionally received the bulk of scholarly attention. No less important, however, are the dialogue’s narrative elements, beginning with its characters. Socrates needs no introduction, yet who are Timaeus, Critias, and Hermocrates, and why does Plato give them starring roles? Also worth considering is the dialogue’s narrative structure. What begins as a snappy exchange between Socrates and Timaeus soon gives way to a pair of protracted speeches. It is not like Socrates to sit idly by while others pontificate, yet he does. Is this a sign that Socrates endorses these speeches or is there another reason for his silence? And where is Plato? He is absent from the drama, but to what extent is he philosophically present? When reading a dramatic work, one ordinarily assumes a critical distance between the author and his characters. Is the Timaeus any different? Does Plato endorse any of the ideas presented? If he does, is there any way of telling which ideas given that he never speaks for himself?
Like any Platonic dialogue, the Timaeus is dynamic and multifarious—a complex interplay between muthos and logos, art and argument, theatrics and theory. The purpose of this entry is not to render a definitive interpretation of the dialogue, but rather to reveal the possibilities afforded by a close reading of the text.
Table of Contents
- Date of Composition
- Dramatis Personæ
- Dramatic Date and Setting
- Narrative Structure
- Outline & Analysis of the Dialogue
- Concluding Remarks
- References and Further Reading
Most scholars agree that Plato wrote somewhere between 30 and 40 dialogues. The precise number, however, is an open question owing to disputes over authorship. A case in point is First Alcibiades. Some scholars (such as Denyer) believe that it is authentic; others (such as Schleiermacher) do not. More commonly included among the Platonic dubia are the Cleitophon, Epinomis, Eryxias, Lovers, Minos, Second Alcibiades, and Theages (but reference Altman’s “Reading Order and Authenticity: The Place of Theages and Cleitophon in Platonic Pedagogy”). While doubts surround the authorship of some dialogues, this is not so with the Timaeus, and for good reason. As evidence, we have, for starters, ancient testimony. We find, for instance, in Aristotle more references to the Timaeus than to any other dialogue. It seems unlikely that Aristotle—given his familiarity with Plato’s works, having spent nearly 20 years in the Academy—would have repeatedly attributed this work to Plato if its authorship were doubtful. The Timaeus retained its place in the Platonic corpus throughout late antiquity and the Middle Ages. It was translated into Latin by Cicero (whose translation ends at 47b) and Calcidius, and it inspired commentaries by Plutarch and Proclus. At no point in its transmission was its authorship seriously contested. Confidence in the dialogue’s authenticity remains steady today. Thus, although we may not have the autograph—the original, handwritten text by the author—we have excellent reason to include the Timaeus among, and no good reason to exclude it from, those works issuing from Plato’s hand.
No one knows exactly when Plato wrote his dialogues or their precise order of composition. Nevertheless, it has become commonplace to group them into three compositional periods: early, middle, and late. The Protagoras, for instance, is usually included among Plato’s early dialogues and, if the doxographical tradition is to be trusted, the Laws is his last. As for the Timaeus, scholars are divided. Some (for example Cherniss) include it among the late dialogues—along with the Critias, Sophist, Statesman, Philebus, and Laws—given their stylistic affinity. Others (including Owen) call attention to the Timaeus’s philosophical content—particularly its use of paradeigmata to explain predication—as evidence of an earlier dating. It is debatable, however, whether style can reliably establish a dialogue’s age. Consider, for example, the statue Laocoön and His Sons. One may ask: Is it a Greek original, a Roman original, or a Roman copy of a Greek original? Regrettably, there is little, if any, telling if style is the sole measure. A feel for style, after all, is what led Winkelmann to propose erroneously a fourth-century BCE date for the statue. Or consider another example: a mature artist who completes an unfinished work from his youth. Where does it fit in his oeuvre? Because the piece was finished late, classifying it as “early” would not be entirely fitting; but because it was started early, calling it “late” also seems mistaken. This is not to say that dating artwork is impossible, but it does suggest that knowing a work’s time of production requires knowing its method of production, which, concerning the dialogues, we know preciously little about.
Ordering the dialogues based on content is also problematic. Suppose that Plato writes three dialogues: one advancing an idea, a second expanding on that idea, and a third rejecting the more fully developed version of the idea. If we set these works side-by-side, there seems to be a progression of thought from an idea’s birth and development to its repudiation, which suggests that the dialogues were written in chronological order. Behind this thinking, however, lies an assumption: that the dialogues record Plato’s personal teachings as they emerged and evolved over time. This, admittedly, has some plausibility to it. Philosophers have been known to write dialogues for didactic purposes: Galileo’s Dialogues Concerning the Two Chief World Systems and Berkeley’s Three Dialogues between Hylas and Philonous come to mind. But the difference lies in the fact that Galileo and Berkeley, apart from dialogues, wrote treatises wherein they expressed their own thoughts in their own voices. With the exception of letters, several of which are likely spurious, Plato wrote dialogues exclusively, never once stepping out from behind his dramatis personæ. This makes attributing ideas to Plato considerably more difficult. If his purpose were to proselytize, then why did he not utilize a more direct form of discourse? It was, after all, not uncommon practice for ancient philosophers in their writings to speak for themselves. Heraclitus (Diogenes Laertius, IX. 5–6), Zeno of Elea (Plato, Parm. 127c–d) and Anaxagoras (Diogenes Laertius, II. 6; cf. Plato, Phd. 97b) all wrote books and, if the testimonia is any indication, wrote them in such a way that their voices were unmistakable. That Plato does not speak for himself suggests that his interests may have been less with dictation than with participation. Given their lively dramatic character, the dialogues act as powerful magnets, drawing us in, inviting us to listen to the conversation, to participate in the exchange, and to live the only kind of life that Socrates considered worth living. If this is what the dialogues are about—if they are more about the questions raised than about the answers given—then the Timaeus’s content will tell us little, if anything, about when it was written.
By no means do these considerations extinguish the heated debate over the Timaeus’s date of composition, but they do at least provide one with compelling reasons for thinking that rendering a decisive compositional chronology is a problem that will not soon be resolved.
There are many fine studies that may be consulted on the problems and possibilities of dating Plato’s dialogues. Excellent points of departure include Brandwood’s “Stylometry and Chronology” and Howland’s “Re-Reading Plato: The Problem of Platonic Chronology.”
Opinion has shifted over Timaeus’s historicity. The ancients (such as Cicero and Iamblichus) took him to be a real person, whereas scholars today tend to regard him as a literary invention. Be that as it may, his character, thanks to Plato’s creative genius, radiates an abundant life. Socrates introduces Timaeus as a foreigner from Locri, a town in southern Italy, praising him as a poet and sophist and as one who has managed high-ranking political offices and reached the summit in all areas of philosophy (20a). Timaeus’s philosophical credentials are reaffirmed by Critias, who honors him as an astronomer who investigates the nature of all things (27a). Philosopher, diplomat, and lyricist—Timaeus has the markings of a true polymath. These wide-ranging talents bring to mind the Republic’s philosopher-king who composes an autochthonous myth to explain human origins (414c–415c). The philosopher-statesman Timaeus will in similar fashion captivate his audience with a likely story about cosmic origins. But the philosopher-king in the Republic promulgates his story knowing it to be untrue. Does Timaeus do the same?
In practically every Platonic dialogue, from beginning to end, Socrates is the guiding narrative force. Often, he lures others into discussion, leading them through dialectic to see where their thinking has gone astray. Whether he is asking questions or providing answers, Socrates is usually engaged in conversation. In the Timaeus, however, he is conspicuously silent. He invites his companions to give speeches of their own, but once they begin, he listens intently, never interrupting. There are other dialogues—the Phaedrus, Symposium, and Republic, to name a few—where Socrates demonstrates patience while listening to lengthy discourses. But Timaeus’s speech easily surpasses these in duration and ambition. Why does Socrates hold his tongue? One reason seems to be that the day before he entertained his guests with a speech (17b ff.) and now they are expected to return the favor (20b). Dressed for the occasion, he vows to “keep his peace and listen” (27a1) while he dines on his “feast of speeches” (27b7–8). Another reason for Socrates’s speech: it is not an account but a story (muthos), and thus not to be scrutinized but savored. Still, Socrates is not himself—at least, not what we come to expect. What is he up to? Or maybe one should ask: What is Plato up to in depicting Socrates as he does?
The identity of Critias is disputed. The name brings to mind the notorious oligarch Critias: student of Socrates, uncle of Plato, and leader of the Thirty Tyrants. But the dialogue’s dramatic date suggests that we might be dealing with someone else. By most accounts, the dialogue takes place between 429 and 408 (see Dramatic Date and Setting). At that time, Critias the oligarch (b. 460) would have been an astute man between the age of 30 and 50. The dialogue’s Critias, however, struggles to recollect basic things discussed the day before (26b) while at the same time having little difficulty recalling a story he heard “a long time ago” (26c5–6). Short-term memory loss and a robust long-term memory are qualities typically associated not with a sharp-minded, middle-aged man, but rather with someone who is elderly. Also worth noting is Critias’s remark that when he first heard the Atlantis story from his grandfather, the poems of Solon were new (21b). Even if we assume that these poems were written late in Solon’s life (d. 560), it seems strange that someone living in the mid-fifth century would think of them as new. These considerations suggest that the dialogue’s Critias is probably not the oligarch, but more likely his grandfather or someone else with the same name. If that is the case, why does Plato include a character named Critias, knowing what that name would have connoted to his Athenian audience? For 21st century speculations on Critias’s identity, see Lampert and Planeaux “Who’s Who in Plato’s Timaeus-Critias and Why,” Welliver, Character, Plot, and Thought in Plato’s Timaeus-Critias, and Nails, The People of Plato: A Prosopography of Plato and Other Socratics.
There is little doubt that Hermocrates is the great Syracusan diplomat and general of the Peloponnesian War, whose intelligence, courage, and experience earned him praise from Thucydides (Thuc. 6.72). At the peace conference at Gela, Hermocrates alerted the Sicilian Greeks – and at Syracuse his fellow citizens – to the imperial threat posed by Athens. Moreover, because of his effort to unify warring factions, Athens met her defeat in the Sicilian expedition. Plato’s audience would have known Hermocrates not only for his ability to induce action through speech, but also as one of the chief adversaries of imperialistic Athens. Readers should therefore note the irony when Hermocrates cajoles Critias into telling his story about ancient Athens’ effort to liberate those nations subjugated by imperialistic Atlantis (20d).
There is no specific mention of locale, but since Socrates receives the speeches as “guest gifts” (20c1, 27a2), it is likely that, like Timaeus and Hermocrates, Socrates is a guest at Critias’s home in Athens. As for the dialogue’s dramatic date, based on Critias’s remark that his discourse will be both payment of debt to Socrates and a tribute to the goddess on her feast-day (21a; cf. 26e), it is reasonable to think that the Timaeus takes place during one of many Athenian festivals celebrated in honor of Athena. Opinions vary as to which festival Plato has in mind. Some (such as Cornford) argue that it is either the annual (Lesser) Panathenaea or the quadrennial (Greater) Panathenaea, both of which took place in Hecatombaeon (July/August). Others (such as Taylor), who regard the events described in the Republic and Timaeus as occurring on subsequent days, argue that it must be a different Athena-centered festival (like Plynteria), since the events in the Republic take place during the Bendideia, which was celebrated in Thargelion (May/June), a full two months before the Panathenaea. Opinions regarding the year of the drama also vary: 429 (Nails), 421 (Lampert and Planeaux), 411 (Press), and 409–408 (Zuckert).
Apart from the characters, dramatic date, and physical setting, narrative structure is an important feature of Plato’s dialogues. Some dialogues such as the Republic, Symposium, and Phaedo are narrated. Others such as the Euthyphro, Apology, and Crito are dramatic, consisting of direct dialogue between characters without narration. Although it may seem trivial, narrative structure can have a bearing on how one reads and interprets a dialogue. Unlike a narrated dialogue, which is presented by someone who has already digested and formed an opinion about the material that he is relating to his audience, a dramatic text is free of such bias. In a narrated dialogue, however, an author can provide extra-dialogical details such as a character’s body language and tone of voice, how characters are physically oriented to one another, and a running commentary. A narrated dialogue can also have varying degrees of depth, from a narrator reporting a conversation he himself heard to a narrator reporting a conversation he heard from someone else, who might have heard it from yet another person, and so on. This depth naturally raises questions about the narrator’s credibility. This is relevant to a dialogue such as the Symposium, which Aristodemus relates to Apollodorus, who in turn relates it to his friend Glaucon, an exchange that we ourselves witness as readers. Narrative depth also plays a role in the Republic, where we find Socrates criticizing mimetic speech while practicing it as the dialogue’s narrator. As a direct drama, the Timaeus lacks narrative depth, nor is it particularly rich in dramatic discourse. Although there are dialogical passages such as the opening exchange between Socrates and Timaeus, uninterrupted speeches account for over 70 of the work’s 75 Stephanus pages. This raises a fair number of concerns, many of which pertain to Plato’s relation to the text. One may argue that by not interrupting Timaeus’s speech, Plato is giving it his assent. Why else would he allow Socrates to fade uncharacteristically into the background? It is worth noting, however, that the narrative does not end at Timaeus 92c, but continues with Critias 106a. In other words, the Timaeus and Critias are published as separate dialogues, but they form a narrative unit. Because Plato left the Critias incomplete, we have no idea how it was to end or whether, as some have speculated, Plato planned a third dialogue, the Hermocrates, to round out a trilogy. Socrates might have remained a passive observer throughout, or he might have remained temporarily silent, waiting politely for Critias to finish his speech before launching his Socratic assault. But maybe Plato left the Critias unfinished on purpose as an exercise for his audience to pick up where he left off, to bring the dialogue to a close, and to be not just passive spectators but active participants, like the characters in the dialogues, makers of philosophical discourse. Open questions abound.
Socrates opens the dialogue with a question, although not the kind the reader expects. Rather than asking about piety, justice, or beauty—the usual Socratic fare—he enquires into the whereabouts of a missing guest. He counts those present, “One, two, three,” only to come up short: “But where is the fourth?” Timaeus attests that the guest’s absence is not intentional: “Some illness (astheneia) befell him” (17a). Nevertheless, one wonders whether Timaeus is telling the truth. Was the guest willing but unable to come, or might Timaeus be covering for someone unwilling to face Socrates? And who might this person be? Plato never reveals his identity. Theaetetus, Clitophon, and Plato himself were candidates put forward by ancient authorities (Procl. In Ti. 16–17). But a compelling case has been made in recent years for thinking that the missing guest is Alcibiades, whose absence may have had to do less with physical illness than with moral weakness (see Lampert and Planeaux). Timaeus does not say what kept the guest away, but only that it is astheneia, which could refer to either physical or moral infirmity. If moral sickness is the reason, one cannot accuse Timaeus of dishonesty. Then again, he is not completely forthcoming either, leaving ambiguous the real reason for the guest’s absence. This is not surprising given Timaeus’s own admission that he can give nothing more than an imprecise account of anything related to the physical world (29b)—a deficiency that would presumably extend to the physical or psychological condition of an absent party guest. At any rate, Timaeus, speaking for Critias and Hermocrates, assures Socrates not to worry: those who are present will repay Socrates for the gifts he so generously bestowed the day before.
Socrates’ gifts, it turns out, were speeches about the best kind of polis (17c–19a). At Timaeus’s request, Socrates rehearses his chief points. In the best polis:
1) everyone is given one occupation suited to his or her nature;
2) there is no gender discrimination: occupations are open to men and women alike;
3) the artisans occupy a class separate from the guardians, who are charged with making war on behalf of the polis;
4) the guardians, who have a spirited and philosophic nature, live communally, may not own private property, and undergo the same rigorous training regardless of gender;
5) all marriages and child-rearing are regulated by the polis; and
6) offspring of good citizens are reared as guardians while offspring of bad citizens are handed over to the polis to be raised presumably as artisans.
These points naturally bring to mind the Republic’s kallipolis, but what is included on the list is just as intriguing as what is excluded; for Socrates leaves untouched, among other things:
1) the deleterious effects of poetry on the soul (Rep. 3 and 10);
2) the search for justice and the analogy between the soul and the state (Rep. 4);
3) the distinction between knowledge and opinion and their respective objects (Rep. 5);
4) the metaphor of the sun, divided line, and allegory of the cave (Rep. 6 and 7);
5) the philosopher-king and his education in mathematics and dialectic (Rep. 7); and
6) the eventual decline and collapse of the kallipolis into tyranny (Rep. 9 and 10).
Socrates in the Timaeus paints a picture that pales in comparison to his account in the Republic, bringing to light the polis’s political foundations but disregarding the philosophical forces animating it. How strange for Socrates to assemble a political body only to leave it soulless. Equally strange is Timaeus’s reaction. Upon finishing his summary, Socrates asks whether he has omitted anything. Timaeus responds, “Not at all” (19b). Surely, this is contrary to the reader’s expectations. If, from a dramatic point of view, the Republic and Timaeus had taken place on subsequent days, Timaeus should have pointed out these omissions. What are we to make of this? One suggestion is thatTimaeus forgot parts of the discussion from the day before and answers to the best of his recollection. Or, maybe Timaeus knows Socrates left bits out, but responds as he does just to move the conversation along. Another possibility, however, is that Socrates has summarized his speech in its entirety, omitting nothing. In this case, the polis of the Timaeus is not the kallipolis of the Republic, but rather its likeness or approximation. This reading fits the rest of the drama quite well, especially when considering that the showpiece of the dialogue, Timaeus’s cosmology, is itself no more than a likely story, an approximation of the truth (29d).
Plato drives the wedge even deeper between the Republic and Timaeus by having Socrates express a desire to see his polis set in motion—like beautiful animals “moving and contending in some struggle” (19c). Contrast this with Socrates’ claim in the Republic that the kallipolis, regardless of whether it could actually come to be, would still serve as “a heavenly model for anyone who wants to see and found a polis within himself” (592b). Of course, this might be an inconsistency in Socrates’ thinking, but it might also be that he is up to his old ironic tricks. In the Republic, because Glaucon and Adeimantus were receptive to dialectic, Socrates’ traditional psychoanalytic approach of asking questions was enough to set their souls in motion. Timaeus and Critias, given their social status and alleged reputation for wisdom, would predictably be a bit more stubborn and less receptive to dialectic. For this reason, Socrates, like a behavioral psychologist, sets up a test with his speeches from the day before in order to draw from their responses insight into their natures. Just before he finishes, Socrates, as he so often does, flatters his companions, singling them out as the only living men capable of satisfying his desire (20b)—a transparent display of Socratic irony if there ever was one. Thus, the apparent inconsistency in Socrates’ thinking might be nothing more than a change in methodology. Socrates, as is so often the case, is toying with his interlocutors, using them as guinea pigs in his little experiment. One wonders whether it is for this reason that the fourth member of their party—if he is indeed Socrates’ spurned lover, Alcibiades, who had drunkenly embarrassed himself in the Symposium—failed to show.
Hermocrates, promising to repay Socrates’ guest gifts, invites Critias to recount a story that he shared the day before. Critias first heard the story as a ten-year old from his grandfather while attending the Apaturia (21b), a three-day festival associated with hereditary groups—phratries, as they were known—which gathered to celebrate their patrilineal kinship (homopatoria) and to receive new members. A legendary border dispute between Athens and Boeotia served as the festival’s etiological backdrop—an important fact omitted by Critias. The principal figures were two combatants: the Boeotian king Xanthus (“Fair One”) and the Athenian champion Melanthus (“Dark One”). The two proved to be equals—that is, until Melanthus at one point cried out to his opponent, “You are cheating, Xanthus, for there is someone behind you!” Xanthus, distracted, whirled around and Melanthus, seizing his opportunity, dealt a fatal blow. Some versions of the story allege that Melanthus tricked Xanthus; others blame Zeus Apātenōr (“Zeus Deceiver”) or Dionysus Melanaigis (“Dionysus of the Black Goatskin”) for the ruse. All versions explain the festival’s origins with a punning etymology: the Apaturia commemorates Athen’s victory by apatē (deception). Thus, “Apaturia” would have had for Plato’s audience a dual meaning, signifying both a reception and a deception. The reader should keep this in mind when listening to Critias, for his story emulates the Apaturia: it pays respect to common origins and fraternity, yet has an element of deception insofar as it presents a distorted picture of the state that Socrates wishes to be set in motion.
Before relating his story, Critias provides some background regarding its transmission. It dates back to Solon, Critias’s distant relative, who heard it from an old priest from Sais, an Egyptian city that shared with Athens the same patron goddess (Neith/Athena, 21e). This is significant; for just as the Apaturia reunited communities with blood ties, the meeting between Solon and the Egyptian priest marks the reunion of two cultures with tutelary ties. But there is another tie worth noting, namely the intellectual kinship between Critias and the priest. From his emphasis on the story’s lineage, Critias makes known his esteem for ancient records and hearsay. The Saisian priest likewise shows his preference for ancient hearsay by criticizing Solon’s speeches about antiquities. “You are young, young in soul, all of you,” the priest tells Solon. In particular, he criticizes the Greek myth of Phaethon, describing it as a story (muthos) with no basis in empirical fact (22c–d). Socrates, of course, was critical of this type of unimaginative positivism, which in the Phaedrus he refers to as a sort of “rural wisdom” (agroika sophia, 229e). The reader may wonder whether Socrates’ companions will ever fulfill his wish. He has presented them with a lifeless state and entreated that they set it in motion, yet it seems unlikely that an appeal to the lifeless science of the Egyptians will accomplish this end. This is worth bearing in mind when listening later to Timaeus’s strange, but lively, creation story (muthos).
With the background of the story out of the way, Critias gets to the story proper, which, like the Apaturia’s etiological myth, concerns an ancient dispute. The players are Atlantis and Athens—not the Athens familiar to Solon, but rather an Athens existing some 9,000 years before. Governed by excellent laws and unsurpassed in war, Athens struggled against the imperialistic Atlantis. Although the odds were stacked against her, Athens emerged victorious, liberating nations that Atlantis had enslaved along the way (25b–c). It is worth remembering that fifth-century Athens, far from being a spirited liberator, was herself an ambitious, imperialist power. These ambitions would contribute not only to Athens’ greatness, but also to her demise. Perhaps her greatest embarrassment was the disastrous Sicilian Expedition. Shortly after deploying a massive fleet of ships and hoplites, Athens recalled the expedition’s principal proponent, Alcibiades, to stand trial for sacrilege. Rather than returning to Athens, Alcibiades fled to Sparta, where he gave his best advice on how to overcome his mother city. The Athenian war effort deteriorated rapidly. Its eventual defeat was assisted by none other than Hermocrates, who, like Melanthus, achieved victory through deception (Thuc. 7.73–4). One night, he sent associates to the Athenian camp. Pretending to be traitors, they misled the Athenians into believing that Syracusans were guarding the roads and that it would be safer to withdraw during the day. Unaware of the ruse, the Athenians lingered, giving the Syracusans time to block the escape routes and disable the Athenian ships. Days later, the expedition would end in catastrophe with thousands of retreating Athenians killed and several thousand more sold into slavery or left to die in prisons.
Permeating Critias’s speech, therefore, is the theme of deception. He not only receives the story at a festival of deception, but transmits it at a time when Athens herself would fall victim to deception. One even begins to wonder whether Critias himself should be trusted. Consider his claim that Socrates’ speech the day before “was not far off the mark from agreeing with … what Solon said” (25e). This clearly overstates the truth. Not unlike Socrates’ polis, ancient Athens was a regimented society with discrete class divisions: (1) craftsmen, (2) shepherds, hunters, and farmers, (3) warriors responsible only for executing matters of war, and (4) priests (24a–b). But here the similarities end. Socrates makes no mention of priests; and although he does separate the artisans and farmers from the warriors, he does not separate the artisans from the farmers (17c). Moreover, Critias says nothing about how ancient Athens treated its women, the moral character of its warrior class, or whether marriages and child rearing were state-regulated. Socrates’ polis and ancient Athens have much less in common than Critias suggests, which prompts the question: What is the point of Critias’s story? Why does Plato include it in the dialogue? Two reasons come to mind. One is that Plato likely intends to invoke a sense of dramatic irony. Critias ironically relates a story of Atlantis’ imperial hubris at a time in history when Athens was planning the Sicilian Expedition. To do so at the behest of Hermocrates (20d) only intensifies the irony (see Dramatis Personæ: Hermocrates). Another reason is to invite his readers to ponder how the love of glory can obstruct the pursuit of truth. Critias believes that the poleis described by Solon and Socrates are the same, but because he is so enamored with the story’s lineage, he fails to notice their differences. By inflating his reputation (doxa), Critias leaves himself vulnerable to the deceptiveness of opinion (doxa).
Almost as a tease, Critias confesses that he stopped short of giving a full account of ancient Athens. If Socrates cares to hear the rest of the story, he must first listen to Timaeus, who will speak on cosmic origins and the creation of man (27a). Socrates, thrilled at his forthcoming feast of speeches, invites Timaeus to begin, requesting that he first follow custom by invoking the gods. What Timaeus does instead is peculiar. To start with, he pauses to reflect on the relevance of such an invocation, remarking that at the onset of any affair, small or great, everyone, even someone of “little prudence,” calls on some god (27c). What is to be made of this? Is it merely an incidental remark or a subtle jab at Socrates and Critias, who, having made no invocation themselves, lay bare their own imprudence? At any rate, there is an underlying irony to Timaeus’s remark: he sanctimoniously chides those who make no pious gestures, while making no pious gesture himself (27d). Instead of calling upon the gods, he calls upon ordinary men who will judge his speech (29d). Is this Plato’s way of suggesting to the reader that Timaeus is himself imprudent? Or is it that Timaeus, being a sophist, believes that there are two sets of rules: those that apply to him and those that apply to everyone else? It is difficult to say what precisely Plato intends by this, but one thing is for sure: as with Critias, the reader must guard himself against Timaeus’s potential deceptiveness.
As he begins, Timaeus lays some philosophical groundwork, discussing four issues vital to his cosmology:
1) the metaphysical distinction between Being and Becoming;
2) the principle that whatever comes to be does so owing to some cause;
3) the role played by a divine craftsman or demiurge in making the cosmos; and
4) the extent to which we can be confident that an account is true given the entities with which it is concerned.
The first of these—the Being-Becoming distinction—Timaeus introduces without hesitation or defense. There are, he says, two kinds of entities: (1) genuinely existing, un-generated and indestructible, changeless entities, which are grasped by reason together with a rational account and (2) entities that do not genuinely exist, that come to be and pass away, and that individuals form opinions about based on irrational sensation (27d–28a). Readers familiar with the Republic, Phaedo, and Symposium will recognize this as the traditional “Platonic” distinction between unchanging Forms and changing objects of everyday experience. Timaeus does not explicitly identify the first class of entities as “Forms” (ideai, eidē), but he does refer to them repeatedly as “models” or “paradigms” (paradeigmata, 28a–c, 29b, 31a, 37c, 38b–c, 39e, 48e–49a), a term that Plato uses elsewhere to denote the Forms (Euthphr. 6e, Rep. 472c, and Prm. 132c–d).
Next, Timaeus turns his attention to the cosmos, which is visible and tangible and hence something belonging to the second class of entities: those that come to be and pass away. But what caused the cosmos to be? In other dialogues, the Forms function as causes (Euthphr. 5d, 6d–e; Phd. 100b–103a, 103c–105c). In the Timaeus, the principal cause of cosmic order is the demiurge, or divine craftsman (dēmiourgos). Timaeus explains that a craftsman, when making something, bases his work on a model (paradeigma, 28a). This model, he argues, must belong to the class of unchanging things because craftsmen always intend their work to be beautiful and only an unchanging model can help craftsmen achieve this end. It is no different regarding the cosmos, which the demiurge makes by looking to “that which is grasped by reason and prudence and is in a self-same condition” (29a). As he prepares to give his account of cosmic origins, Timaeus offers a word of warning: an account concerned with changing things will always be less accurate than one concerned with unchanging things. Consider the difference between a mathematical proof and a forensic analysis: the latter, while it might be compelling, is merely probabilistic; the former, as long as one has done the calculation properly, guarantees that one has grasped the truth. Timaeus’s point is that insofar as the cosmos is itself something generated, any account pertaining to it, like a forensic analysis, can only be likely, never certain. With that in mind, he concludes, “It is fitting for us to receive the likely story (ton eikota muthon) about these things and not to search further for anything beyond it” (29d).
Socrates expresses his enthusiasm for Timaeus’s proposal, encouraging him to “perform the song (ton nomon) himself” (29d). This is an interesting choice of words. In the Republic, Socrates stresses the sovereignty of musical training, emphasizing how rhythm and harmony are able to permeate the soul and perfect it (401e). Socrates, by referring to Timaeus’s forthcoming speech as a “song,” acknowledges not only its overall significance, but also the potential impact, positive or negative, on those who are listening. Also noteworthy is Socrates’ seemingly complimentary remark, “We have received your prelude so wondrously (thaumasiōs).” The word thaumasios literally means “wonderful” or “marvelous,” which by itself seems innocuous enough, but Plato does occasionally uses it ironically (Phdr. 242a, Rep. 435c). Is this the case here? Is Socrates returning Timaeus’s earlier jab (27a), a final salvo before Timaeus begins his speech? It would certainly not be out of character for Socrates to let Timaeus know in a veiled manner, “Something is not right. I am on to you.” Plato, with his word choice, might be giving readers fair warning: something about Timaeus is not sitting well with Socrates, so his speech will be received gladly as a guest-gift should, but with the right amount of caution. It would be best for us too, as readers, to follow Socrates’ circumspect lead.
Resuming his speech, Timaeus gives a general account of how the demiurge began his work. “The god” (ho theos), as Timaeus calls him, being beautiful and intelligent, intended his creation to resemble him as much as possible (29e–30a). Onto pre-existing matter, therefore, which moved unmusically and without purpose, a rational order was imposed. Knowing the intelligent to be more beautiful than the unintelligent, the demiurge imbued the cosmic body with soul (30b). As his model, the demiurge used that living being (zōion, 30b) which embraces all living beings: “holds them within itself, just as this cosmos holds and embraces us and all the other nurslings constructed as visible” (30c–d). As for whether there is one cosmos or many, Timaeus argues against the Presocratic pluralists who posit an infinite number of kosmoi (for example, Democritus, DK 67A1). For Timaeus, because the cosmos resembles its model and its model is one in number, the cosmos too must be one in number. To create the cosmic body, the demiurge drew upon four elements—fire, air, earth and water—in equal proportion; and basing his work on a model, he created a body whole and perfect, one in number, free of old age and disease, and spherical in shape (31b, 33a–b). In addition, because the cosmic body was to be self-sufficient—in no need of anything external to it—it was made without eyes or ears, atmosphere for breathing, or organs for digestion (33c). It also lacked hands, legs, and feet; and the motion imposed on it was not directional—moving linearly in this or that direction—but rotational. The reader may rightly consider strange this so-called cosmic body, for even though it is based on a model embracing all living beings, its appearance is wholly unlike any other known living thing. But without any doubt, the strangeness does not end here.
Next comes the creation of the cosmic soul (34c–36d). This passage is notoriously difficult, as it contains a detailed account of how the demiurge fashions the substance of the soul from a mixture of pairs: (1) of the Indivisible and the Divisible and (2) of the Same and the Other. How can seemingly unmixable things like the indivisible and the divisible be mixed together? This is a puzzle that Timaeus leaves for his audience to work out. Just as puzzling is the subsequent passage on the movement of this soul according to certain mathematical ratios. Is the reader to take these passages seriously? Several ancient commentators including Aristotle, Xenocrates, and Plutarch did. Perhaps we should as well. But there is good reason to think that something else is intended, even though what that is might be somewhat obscure. For one thing, one might ask how Socrates, Critias, and Hermocrates could follow Timaeus’s incredibly complicated and arguably convoluted story. It is not as though Timaeus had visual aids—at least none of which the reader is aware. Would anyone listening to Timaeus not want some clarification? Would someone not think to ask a question or two? It is unusual for Socrates, of all persons, to not hit the pause button to engage his companion. This is not to say that Timaeus is being insincere or that he has something up his sleeve, but so much of the narrative up to this point has raised questions about trustworthiness. Perhaps there is something more devious, even diabolical, to Timaeus’s speech. Or perhaps this is being too cynical. There is much ground yet to cover.
Timaeus concludes the first part of his story by describing how the demiurge makes time (37c–38c), the planets (38c–39e), and lesser gods (39e–40b). The creation of man the demiurge delegates to these lesser gods (40d–47e, see Monologue, Part 3: The Creation Story of Man). Particularly strange is how Timaeus describes the divine revolutions of the soul. These motions, he says, are bound within a spheroform body named “head,” which is attached to a body in order to prevent it from rolling along on the ground (44d). This passage conjures up the nightmarish image of Empedoclean eyeballs rolling about on the ground in search of foreheads (DK 31B57). But it also should remind readers of the spherical humanoids featured in Aristophanes’ account of the origins of love in the Symposium. There is no questioning the ambitiousness and inventiveness of Timaeus’s story, yet its content, bordering on the absurd, makes it difficult to see it as something other than a parody. The suggestion that Timaeus is manufacturing a sort of parody becomes even more plausible in the second part of his story.
The cosmos, as Timaeus’s story continues, emerges not only from an act of divine reason; it also arises from brute necessity. Because reason and necessity are cosmic co-creators, Timaeus transitions from the role played by a calculating demiurge to that of unthinking necessity. For starters, he returns to the distinction drawn earlier between Forms and sensible things, basing this metaphysical distinction now on an epistemological distinction between intellect (nous) and true opinion (doxa alēthēs). Because different epistemic states require different objects, intellect and true opinion must be drawn to different objects—Forms and sensible things, respectively (51d–e). But here he argues that there must be a third item added to the list. Children are not born from a single parent, but rather from two: a father and a mother. Thus, in addition to that which comes to be (offspring ~ sensible thing) and that from which it comes (father ~ Form), there must be something in which the created thing comes to be (mother ~ space [chōras], 52a). Note, however, how Timaeus presents his argument. He does not say that any of this is demonstrably true—that there is some intellectual compulsion to believe it. Instead, he says, “Here’s how I myself cast my vote (psēphon)” (51d). Voting is how a legislature promulgates a law or how a law court arrives at a legal decision; it is not the preferred method of arriving at scientific truth. Timaeus draws a distinction between reason and true opinion—the former immovable by persuasion, the latter alterable by persuasion—yet given that he casts a vote, how can his account be anything other than mere opinion and hence something that he, or anyone else, might be persuaded against?
What follows is yet another complicated passage—a lengthy one concerning the constitution of matter (53c–55c). This is his famous discourse on triangles. As has already been established, there are four kinds of matter—fire, air, earth, and water—and each contains particles, which, we are now told, are geometrical solids (acting as molecules) composed of elementary right triangles (acting as atoms), either isosceles or scalene. In effect, all bodies can be reduced to collections of triangles. There is little need here to spell out Timaeus’s theory in detail. Other scholars have already performed that formidable task (see, for example, Cornford, Plato’s Cosmology and Kalkavage, Plato’s Timaeus, Appendix C). Suffice it to say, what Timaeus renders, if anything, is an aesthetically pleasant picture of the physical world with all of its beautiful geometrical shapes: tetrahedrons (fire), octahedrons (air), icosahedrons (water), hexahedrons (earth), and dodecahedrons (panels for the constellations). His picture is also a lyrical one; for in a brief digression on the subject of whether the cosmos is one or many, Timaeus says, “In reasoning about all these things, someone would do so musically (emmelōs)” (55c). It is as if he considers himself to be engaged in a dramatic contest of sorts. Who can render the most compelling, the most rhapsodic, the most beautiful song? Whose story (muthos) will collect the most votes from the judges? Timaeus has already let his audience know for whom his voting stone (psēphos), if he were given one, would be cast. Others, he confesses, may cast theirs for another (55d).
As one might expect from a highly refined literary work like Timaeus’s, word play abounds. Consider, for instance, the passage where Timaeus pauses to reflect on his storytelling (59c–d). He says at first that it would not be difficult to see where his story is headed—not for anyone “who pursues the look of likely stories.” Whenever such a person puts aside or buries (katathemenos) definite accounts of the unchanging and turns to likely accounts of transient things, he permits himself a pleasure (hēdonē) and time to engage in a sort of childish play (paidian). Thus, he invites his audience to “give free rein to this very play … [and] proceed to the likelihoods next in order.” The very next sentence engages in this sort of play: water mixed with fire, which Timaeus calls “fluid” (hugron), comes from “flowing over the earth” (huper gen reon, 59d). In this way, he presents the physical derivation in terms of a linguistic one. Clearly, this is Timaeus having a bit of fun, but it is consistent with his entire speech up to this point. Not long after, he claims that fire (thermon) is hot because it minces (kermon, 62a)—yet another play on words. Timaeus’s comedic storytelling continues with his account of eating, which he describes obscurely in terms of voiding (kenōseis) and refilling (plērōsis). His subsequent accounts of tastes (64a–65b), smells (66d–67a), sounds (67a–c), and colors (67c–68d) are just as impish, often stated matter of factly without explanation regardless of how absurd they might sound to his audience. Is the reader to take these accounts seriously, or are they in fact sly Platonic parodies of the detailed, yet cold and soulless accounts popular among scientists of his day? Timaeus’s most baffling claim perhaps—at least, among his more baffling claims—is in his discussion on color mixing. Red and black, he posits, when mixed together yield green (68d). This simply does not make sense—not from a scientific point of view, at any rate. How can this be taken seriously? What precisely is Timaeus doing?
Drawing his Story of Necessity to a close, Timaeus prepares to deliver his conclusion. In doing so, he adopts a more serious tone, but there is still something strange about what he says. He begins with a metaphor: “Now that the kinds of causes have been sifted out and lie ready to hand for us, like wood for builders, out of which we must weave together the account that remains…” (69a). A reasonable response to this would be a quizzical one. Flour and grains are sifted, not wood, and Timaeus clearly knows this given what he says earlier in his story about the movement and ordering of the elements in space: “just like the particles shaken and winnowed out by sieves and other instruments used for purifying grain: the dense and heavy are swept to one site and settle, the porous and light to another” (52e). What also could he mean by weaving wood together? Such strange metaphors he uses. Timaeus continues: “Let us go back again briefly to the beginning and make our way swiftly to the same point from which we arrived there; and let us attempt to add to our story a finish and a head that’s joined to what has gone before” (69a–b). He has already returned—more literally, retreated or withdrawn (anachōrēteon, 48b)—to the beginning once, namely when he transitioned from his Story of Intellect to his Story of Necessity. Now he is proposing a second return. What is the meaning behind these reversals? Earlier in the dialogue, Timaeus refers to the retrograde motions of outer planets (36d). Are his literary reversals a way of mimicking the reversals found in nature? Storytelling, for Plato, being an art form, is a form of mimesis, after all. Timaeus is creating a story about cosmic creation. Thus, what holds for the cosmos in its coming to be should also hold for Timaeus’s cosmo-muthos, and vice versa.
Socrates’ feast of speeches—at least the first course, served by Timaeus—is nearing its end. With the cosmos in place, Timaeus draws his story to a close by rhapsodizing on the creation of man. Earlier in his speech, he indicated that the demiurge fashioned the cosmos only up to a point; the creation of other life forms he left to other, lesser gods. Speaking to these gods, the demiurge explains that were he to create animals and plants, they would turn out as perfect as the gods themselves (41c). In that case, he would not be able to achieve his goal of realizing all levels and kinds of perfection. At first glance, this seems strange. How can a being capable of making something as enormous as the cosmos be unable to populate it with meager animals and plants? The problem, however, is not as it seems. It is not that the demiurge lacks power. On the contrary, being perfect, the demiurge always performs optimally; his actions yield only what is best. It would therefore be contrary to his nature—and, one may say, offensive to his impeccable aesthetic tastes—to make something that did not in the closest possible way resemble him in greatness and beauty. It would be tantamount to a masterful artist lowering himself to produce an amateurish painting. Creating a masterpiece is within his power; not doing so would be a shameful underachievement, unbefitting of his greatness. For this reason, the demiurge, exercising sovereignty over all things, delegates to lesser gods, who were themselves created (41b), the responsibility of creating animals and plants. Given their relative imperfection, they could do what the demiurge could not—namely, create less perfect life forms—and not disgrace themselves by doing so. By allowing them to complete what he started, the demiurge could fully realize his plan to ensure that the all (to pan) is genuinely all (hapan), full and complete, a plenitude lacking nothing (41c).
How, then, does man come to be? What is his origin and nature? Timaeus gives not one, but two accounts. The accounts do not conflict, but they do differ in length, detail, and artistry. The first appears at the end of the Story of Intellect (40d–47e). It begins with the demiurge creating the human soul from a mixture—not the same mixture from which the cosmic soul came to be, but a different one using the same ingredients blended less purely. Having combined these ingredients, the demiurge distributes bits of the mixture to the various stars (for example, lesser gods) like a farmer sowing seeds (42d). At this point, the lesser gods take over and begin fashioning the human body. Borrowing portions of the elements, the gods “went about gluing them together … with close-packed rivets invisible for their smallness” (42e–43a). It is worth noting here the difference in approach. Whereas the demiurge sows seeds, the lesser gods insert rivets. Whereas the demiurge creates with an eye to balance and beauty, the lesser gods simply get the job done by pasting things together. The demiurge uses art and agriculture to create; the gods appear to be workers on an assembly line. Note, too, how Timaeus’s account of vision reflects this same workmanlike approach. It tells how vision comes about, but not why it does beyond that it allows us to keep our soul in tune with the movements of the heavens (45b–46a, 47b). The creation of man, as related in the Story of Intellect, is much akin to the work of the lesser gods: it is practical, but not particularly meaningful. It relates the origin of man, but not his nature. In fact, it seems to serve as little more than a bridge between the Story of Intellect and the Story of Necessity. A far more robust account of man’s creation follows the Story of Necessity.
As with the account of man’s creation in the Story of Intellect, the Story of Man begins with the soul. From the start, however, the account is decidedly more lively and detailed. Timaeus opens by telling how the gods, still entrusted with the task of making man, sculpted a body around the immortal soul and housed within that body another kind of soul governed by “terrible and necessary affections” (deina kai anagkaia pathēmata): pleasure and pain, rashness and fear, anger and hope (69d). Notice that they do not rivet or glue the soul to the body, but sculpt the body around the soul. Already these lesser gods approach their job with more grace and flair than they did before. Moreover, they have enough sense to separate the two souls so that the mortal soul will not contaminate the immortal soul. They do this by placing the mortal soul within the chest and separating the chest from the head with an isthmus (namely, the neck) within which the spirited part of the soul resides. Next to be made is the heart, which communicates to other organs when an unjust deed has been committed, and after that the lungs, which cool the heart, enabling it to be more subservient to reason. The lungs, however, are not merely placed within man; they are implanted (enephuteusan, 70c). It is remarkable how the image of the gods from one story to another has changed. The Story of Intellect underplays their artistry, emphasizing instead their efficacy. The Story of Man, by contrast, draws them closer in nature and purpose to the demiurge: they are not only sculptor-like in how they shape the body around the soul, but also farmer-like in how they plant organs within the body. Also worth noting is the image of man himself. He is no longer an inert machine assembled with glue and rivets, but a dynamic organism animated by passions and emotions.
Continuing his story, Timaeus shifts his attention to the liver—one of his seemingly favorite organs. Reason and emotion have been physically separated—reason being located in the head and the appetites in the abdomen. Because the appetites cannot understand reason—evidently because they speak different languages—there was a need for a mediator to convey messages from the higher faculties to the lower (71a). This becomes the purpose of the liver. From the intellect, the liver receives images, which it projects onto its surface to frighten and restrain the appetites (72b). This is reminiscent of the Republic’s cave allegory, where prisoners passively watch as images flicker across a cave wall. Just as those images keep the prisoners pacified, the images projected by the liver keep the appetites at bay. Apart from helping the intellect control emotion, the liver also serves as the source of divination (71e, 72b). No one in his right mind, Timaeus says, has access to divine reason; yet when asleep or overcome by some inspiration, man receives divine messages, which must be reflected upon and interpreted. At no point does Timaeus condemn divination as a form of superstition or subterfuge, treating it instead with respect and sincerity—at least for those who think deeply and reason slowly about their divinations. But why does Timaeus treat divination with respect at all? Why not like the Saisian priest explain divination away naturalistically as either hallucination or huckstery? Perhaps the reason is that for Timaeus—and by extension Plato—man is not simply a patchwork of physical parts: cells, tissues, organs, and systems. Man is not a god, but he does have divine origins, a divine element within himself, and the ability to be divinely inspired. Whereas the Saisian priest ridiculed the idea of myth shedding light on the nature, Timaeus wants to preserve the link between the natural and supernatural. Far from setting man and the gods apart, Timaeus’s cosmo-muthos brings them closer together.
Much care and skill is brought to bear on the gods’ creative efforts. Consider how they make bone and flesh. It begins with marrow, which “gave the mortal kind its roots” (katerrixoun, 73b). Marrow, Timaeus tells his companions, comes from a universal seed-stuff (epephēmisen) comprised of smooth and unwarped triangles. Planted within the marrow are various kinds of souls (73c). The gods then take some of this marrow and form it into a spherical shape. This spherical field (aroura) receives the divine seed (to theion sperma) and becomes the brain (73d). Bone likewise comes to be through an intricate, creative process (73e). First, earth is sifted by the gods to be pure and smooth. Next, it is kneaded and soaked with marrow, baked in fire, dipped in water, placed back into the fire, and dipped once again in water. This is an utterly fantastic account—one that emphasizes the intelligence and imagination behind the creation of man and of his seemingly most mundane parts. Bone is created as if by a potter and flesh as if by a wax-modeler (74c). Man is not the product of necessity or blind chance; he arises from a series of deliberate actions. The gods—whether the demiurge or lesser gods—emerge as agents who care not only to complete their work, but to introduce into their products a sense of style and value. They care about what they make. Their artistic fingerprints can be found on everything from the cosmic soul to human skin, hair, and nails. But they also know how best to manipulate materials. Owing to their different shapes, the elements behave differently. Thus, by combining an artistic sensibility with a knowledge of how to engineer things given the materials at their disposal, the gods are able to imbue the cosmos and man with beauty, structural stability, and purposefulness.
To be sure, man is well-formed and beautiful, but he is also able to grow and flourish. In fact, he appears in Timaeus’s story as plant-like. In several passages, the gods act as farmers, planting organs within the human body. Marrow literally allows man, like a tree, to take root (73b). In addition, the gods equip man with an irrigation system: “[the gods] channelled through our body itself, just as they were cutting channels in gardens, so that the body might be refreshed as though from an inflowing stream” (77c–d). These channels help the “stream of nourishment” flow so that the “irrigation may be made uniform.” The gods use their agricultural knowledge frequently when creating man, who, Timaeus says, is “not an earthly but a heavenly plant” (phuton ouk eggeion alla ouranion, 90a). This naturally prompts the question: Why is so close a connection drawn between man and plants? One may think it is a joke. Anyone can tell the difference between humans and plants. Maybe Timaeus wanted to get a rise from his companions. But if it is a joke, it is not a very good one; for as most would agree, there are few things less amusing than an oft-repeated joke. A possible clue may be found just before the discussion of man’s irrigation system, where Timaeus tells a brief story about the origins of plants (70e–77c). After making man, the gods decide to create plants, unlike animals in appearance, yet having sensations and “a nature akin to man.” Plants are indeed animals, he notes, because “everything that partakes of living may justly and most correctly called an animal” (77a–b). Since plants are intended to be eaten (77c), this cannot be a solemn plea for vegetarianism. Even so, it is certainly possible that Timaeus’s message is ecological. Sometimes, because of our egocentric and homocentric concerns, we lose track of our place in the world. It would be an overstatement to suggest that Timaeus is advancing an environmentalist ethics; but his holistic view of creation, if taken seriously, does raise important questions (1) about the relationship between creator and created, that is, between planter and planted (87b), (2) about the kinship between man and nature, and (3) about how the good for man relates to the good for other living things. Rarely has Plato been considered a philosopher with ecological concerns, but perhaps a careful study of the Timaeus would help to change this opinion.
Although man is capable of flourishing, he is also subject to collapse and decay. For this reason, Timaeus pivots to the origin and nature of diseases. He uses a strange word to describe their origin, saying that they are “constructed” or “contrived” (sunistēmi, 81e). Is the implication that the gods have a hand in creating diseases? Was this to ensure the imperfection of man? Timaeus, unfortunately, leaves these questions unanswered. Instead, he launches into a discussion of diseases that specifically afflict the body. These arise from an excess, deficiency, or misplacement of elements (82a–b). In other words, there is a physical imbalance, causing a body to become unmusical (plēmmelēsēi) and out of harmony with the cosmos (82b). After bodily diseases, Timaeus turns to diseases of the soul, giving special attention to folly, which comes in two varities: stupidity and madness. Stupidity, he says, is the greatest disease, arising when a body becomes too large and the intellect too weak (88a–b). When this happens, bodily motions gain mastery, causing the soul to become dull, slow, and forgetful. But does this mean that only large people are stupid? Are small folk immune to this disease? It seems an obvious question to ask, but Timaeus does not consider it. Moving along, Timaeus traces madness to overly seeded marrow (86c–d), not to wickedness, as some do: “people hold the opinion that he’s not diseased but willingly bad. But the truth is…” (86d). Timaeus’s claim here is both Socratic and un-Socratic. It is Socratic in that it affirms that no one performs wrongful acts willingly; however, it is un-Socratic in that rather than attributing wrongdoing to ignorance, as Socrates does, Timaeus roots it in bodily disease. In fact, physical causes are responsible for madness and stupidity. As for treating disease, Timaeus prescribes physical exercise and an avoidance of medicinal drugs (89a–c). Idleness and inactivity will only make matters worse; the body must mimic the cosmos and stay in motion. In addition, a person should tune the motions in his soul by applying himself to the liberal arts and all philosophy (88c). Striking the right balance and keeping one’s mind on higher things—these, according to Timaeus, are the ingredients to a good life and healthy soul. At this point, one might wonder: Would the silent Socrates be nodding in agreement or shaking in disagreement? Perhaps he would be doing both.
This would seem like a good place for Timaeus to stop. Critias promised Socrates that Timaeus’s story would explain the origins and nature of mankind. Timaeus has clearly gone above and beyond. Not only has he explained the origins and nature of man, but he has also given his companions lessons in human anatomy and physiology and human pathology. But Timaeus is not finished yet. There is one topic left to cover: the invention of sex. One might assume that man and woman have the same origin, but that is not so. The gods created man beautiful and well-ordered, but man is prone to physical and moral decay. He is also destined to die and, as it turns out, be reincarnated. Timaeus does not say what happens to courageous and just men, but as for the cowardly and unjust, they return not as men, but as women (90e). Women are therefore derivative, being born from morally deficient men. It is hard to know what to make of this, especially in light of the fact that in Socrates’ polis—the one that Timaeus is helping to animate—men and women are social equals. The subsequent account of intercourse is likewise peculiar. The channel for releasing urine, Timaeus says, also releases marrow (that is, seed) from the brain (91b). This marrow, being imbued with soul, gives the male reproductive organ a desire for emission. As a result, male genitals have become unpersuadable and autocratic, like an irrational animal (91b–c). In other words, the love to procreate is a form of madness in which a man loses his mind—or more literally, his brain. But is this the extent of man’s erotic feelings? Eros compels physical love, but can it compel philosophy? Can it compel movement within a polis? Timaeus rounds out his speech by explaining the origins of other animals (91d–92c). Like women, they derive from deficient men: birds from light-minded men who rely overabundantly on sight in their scientific demonstrations, land animals from unphilosophical men, and fish from the stupidest men. With the cosmos now made and fully populated, Timaeus delivers his closing line, which dispenses with the puns, jokes, and tomfoolery: “having been filled up, this cosmos has come to be—a visible animal embracing visible animals, a likeness of the intelligible, a sensed god; greatest and best, most beautiful and most perfect—this one heaven being alone of its kind” (92c). So ends Timaeus’s story, but not Socrates’ feast of speeches, which continues in the Critias.
What is a contemporary audience to make of Plato’s Timaeus? Is it a serious attempt at natural philosophy or a farcical parody? There is no way of settling definitively Plato’s intent in writing the dialogue. In fact, that seems to be the nature of Plato’s art in general: he always wants his readers to keep wondering, to keep asking questions, to keep returning to his texts with the hope of discovering something new and exciting. Timaeus’s speech is very much a microcosm of the world around us with its multiple layers, interlocking pieces, and abrupt movements back and forth. But it also fits in well with a recurring theme in Plato’s dialogues. Time and again, we find in the dialogues a critique of science—not just any science, but the sort of science that tends to view nature in materialistic and mechanistic terms. In the Phaedrus, for instance, Socrates describes naturalized myths as displaying “rural wisdom” (229e). Scientific naturalism is also taken to task in the Phaedo, where Socrates recounts his youthful flirtations with the natural philosophy of Anaxagoras. Reading Anaxagoras, Socrates delighted in learning details about the shape and location of the earth and various facts about the sun, the moon, and the other heavenly bodies. Socrates also shares his delight when he learned from Anaxagoras that Mind (Nous) is the ordering principle of the world. But in the end, he was left disappointed: “I thought he’d go on to take me through the best for each and the good (agathon) common to all” (98b). Anaxagoras, therefore, impressed Socrates with his explanation of how things work, but he failed to explain why they are the way that they are and why they are good. In other words, Anaxagoras’s cosmos, in Socrates’ opinion, was without value: it moved, but without any rhyme or reason. Mind controlled everything, moving things about, but why did it move things in this way instead of that? Why did it move things at all?
If there is any message to be gleaned from the Timaeus, it is that material explanations alone cannot render a clear and complete picture of the world. Recall that the dialogue begins with Socrates recounting his speech, the day before, about the best polis. Not long after, he invites his companions to set this polis in motion—like beautiful animals “moving and contending in some struggle.” By the end of the dialogue, readers are left wondering: Has Timaeus really granted Socrates’ wish? Is Socrates’ polis any more alive at the end of the dialogue than it was at the beginning? Before rushing to judgment, one must remember that the Timaeus leads directly into the fragmentary Critias, which in turn may lead into a third dialogue, the Hermocrates. It would therefore be rash to answer these questions without taking the entire, unbroken narrative into account. Even so, there does seem to be an effort by Timaeus to create a living cosmos—one with more life and vitality than what the youthful Socrates found in Anaxagoras. It is true that Timaeus’ story at times radiates absurdity and silliness. At the same time, however, it is a lively artistic creation, much like the very cosmos his story depicts. There is craftsmanship behind its creation. Moreover, the cosmos is itself a living thing with a soul. The gods, as heavenly bodies, move in accord with reason, as does the entire cosmos itself. Beauty, goodness, and life permeate the universe. This might not be a direct response to Socrates’ invitation to set his polis in motion; but it is a step in the right direction and a powerful reminder from Plato that a philosophy that sacrifices the beautiful and the good—that sacrifices spirited muthos on the cold, antiseptic altar of logos—sacrifices a vital part of reality.
All translations of the Timaeus in this article are by Kalkavage, Plato’s Timaeus, Newburyport, MA: Focus Publishing, 2001.
- Burnet, John. “Clitopho,” “Respublica,” “Timaeus,” “Critias.” Platonis Opera, Vol. IV. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1902.
- Critical edition of the ancient Greek text. Essential for scholarly work.
- Bury, R. G. Plato: Timaeus, Critias, Cleitophon, Menexenus, Epistles, Cambridge, Mass.: Loeb Classical Library, 1960.
- Interlinear Greek-English translation. Includes an introduction and notes. Essential for scholarly work.
- Cornford, F. M. Plato’s Cosmology, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1937. Reprinted, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co., 1997.
- Good translation, although perhaps a bit dated. Includes a detailed commentary and notes.
- Jowett, Benjamin. “Timaeus,” The Collected Dialogues of Plato: Including the Letters. Eds. Edith Hamilton & Huntington Cairns, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1961.
- Kalkavage, Peter. Plato’s Timaeus. Newburyport, MA: Focus Publishing, 2001.
- Superb translation. Includes an interpretative essay, glossary, and several appendices.
- Lee, Desmond. Timaeus and Critias. Revised by Thomas Kjeller Johansen, 2008, London: Penguin Books, 1972.
- Good translation. Includes a lengthy introduction and notes.
- Waterfield, Robin. Timaeus and Critias. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2008.
- Good translation. Includes a lengthy introduction, summary, and explanatory notes by Andrew Gregory.
- Zeyl, Donald J. “Timaeus,” Plato: Complete Works. Ed. John M. Cooper, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1997.
- Good translation. Part of an anthology of Plato’s complete works with concise introductions and notes.
- Cherniss, H. F. “The Relation of the Timaeus to Plato’s Later Dialogues.” The American Journal of Philology, Vol. 78, No. 3 (1957): 225–266. Reprinted in Studies in Plato’s Metaphysics. Ed. R. E. Allen, London and New York: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1965. Also in Selected Papers. Ed. Leonardo Tarán, Leiden: Brill, 1977.
- Makes the case for placing the Timaeus in Plato’s late compositional period.
- Owen, G. E. L. “The Place of the Timaeus in Plato’s Dialogues.” The Classical Quarterly NS 3 (1953): 79–95. Reprinted in Studies in Plato’s Metaphysics. Ed. R. E. Allen, London and New York: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1965. Also in Logic, Science and Dialectic. Ed. Martha Nussbaum. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1986.
- Makes the case for placing the Timaeus in Plato’s middle compositional period.
- Taylor, A. E. A Commentary on Plato’s Timaeus. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1928. Reprinted, New York: Garland, 1967.
- Lengthy and ambitious commentary on the dialogue. An early effort to challenge the view that the dialogue presents Plato’s own thoughts on cosmology.
- Vlastos, Gregory. “The Disorderly Motion in the Timaeus.” Studies in Plato’s Metaphysics. Ed. R. E. Allen, London and New York: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1965. Reprinted in Studies in Greek Philosophy, Vol. 2, ed. D. W. Graham, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1995.
- Considers the nature of the disorderly motion discussed at Ti. 30a, 52d–53b, 69b.
- Vlastos, Gregory. “Creation in the Timaeus: Is It a Fiction?” Studies in Plato’s Metaphysics. Ed. R. E. Allen, London and New York: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1965b. Reprinted in Studies in Greek Philosophy, Vol. 2, ed. D. W. Graham, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1995.
- Follow-up to Vlastos’s essay “The Disorderly Motion in the Timaeus” in the light of Cherniss’s work.
- Vlastos, Gregory. Plato’s Universe. Seattle: University of Washington Press, 1975. Reprinted by Luc Brisson, Las Vegas: Parmenides Publishing, 2005.
- Offers an interpretation of the Timaeus’s cosmology within the broader context of Presocratic natural philosophy. Attributes the cosmological ideas in the dialogue to Plato himself.
The following ancient commentaries are mainly of historical and scholarly interest. Newcomers to the dialogue will likely want to consult more recent scholarship.
- Calcidius. On Plato’s Timaeus. Ed. and trans. John Magee, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 2016.
- Plutarch. “On the Generation of the Soul in the Timaeus.” Plutarch’s Moralia, Vol. 1, Pt. 1. Ed. and trans. Harold Tarrant, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1976.
- Proclus. “Commentary on Plato’s Timaeus.” Vol. 1, Book 1: Proclus on the Socratic State and Atlantis. Ed. and trans. Harold Tarrant, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007.
- Proclus. “Commentary on Plato’s Timaeus.” Vol. 2, Book 2: Proclus on the Causes of the Cosmos and its Creation. Eds. and trans. David T. Runia & Michael Share, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2009.
- Proclus. “Commentary on Plato’s Timaeus.” Vol. 3, Book 3, Part 1, Proclus on the World Soul. Ed. and trans. Dirk Baltzly, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010.
- Proclus. “Commentary on Plato’s Timaeus.” Vol. 4, Book 3, Part 2, Proclus on the World Soul. Ed. and trans. Dirk Baltzly, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010.
- Proclus. “Commentary on Plato’s Timaeus.” Vol. 5, Book 4: Proclus on Time and the Stars. Ed. and trans. Dirk Baltzly, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2016.
- Proclus. “Commentary on Plato’s Timaeus.” Vol. 6, Book 5: Proclus on the Gods of Generation and the Creation of Humans. Ed. and trans. Harold Tarrant, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2017.
- Altman, William H. F. “Reading Order and Authenticity: The Place of Theages and Cleitophon in Platonic Pedagogy.” The Electronic Journal of the International Plato Society, n 11, 2011: 1–50.
- Argues against the orthodoxy for the authenticity of Theages and Cleitophon. Relevant to the study of Platonic authorship.
- Arieti, James A. Interpreting Plato: The Dialogues as Drama. Savage, MD: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc., 1991.
- Offers a literary reading of eighteen dialogues, including the Timaeus. Argues that the dialogues ought to be approaches principally as dramas, not philosophical discourses.
- Brandwood, Leonard. “Stylometry and Chronology.” The Cambridge Companion to Plato. Ed. Richard Kraut, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992.
- Recounts attempts made by various scholars to date Plato’s dialogues using stylometry.
- Howland, Jacob. “Re-Reading Plato: The Problem of Platonic Chronology.” Phoenix, Vol. 45, No. 3 (Autumn 1991): 189–214.
- Offers a powerful and compelling case against efforts by some scholars to arrange Plato’s dialogues chronologically.
- Ives, Charles. Socrates’ Request and the Educational Narrative of the Timaeus. Lanham, MD: Lexington Books, 2017.
- Draws attention to the connection between Timaeus’s cosmology and Socrates’ request for a speech about war.
- Lampert, Lawrence and Planeaux, Christopher. “Who’s Who in Plato’s Timaeus-Critias and Why.” The Review of Metaphysics, Vol. 52, No. 1 (September 1998): 87–125.
- Important examination into the characters and historical-political background of the Timaeus and Critias.
- Lovejoy, Arthur O. The Great Chain of Being: A Study of the History of an Idea. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1936.
- Classic work in the history of ideas tracing the origin and evolution of three philosophical principles: plenitude, continuity, and graduation.
- Mohr, Richard. One Book, The Whole Universe: Plato’s Timaeus Today. Las Vegas/Zurich/Athens: Parmenides Publishing: 2010.
- Ambitious anthology covering a broad range of topics related to the Timaeus. Derived from the Timaeus Conference at University of Illinois at Urbana–Champaign, September 2007.
- Nails, Debra. The People of Plato: A Prosopography of Plato and Other Socratics. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 2002.
- Meticulous study of the individuals represented in Plato’s dialogues and their relationships to one another. Essential for scholarly work.
- Parke, Herbert W. Festivals of the Athenians. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1977.
- Valuable study of the religious festivals of ancient Athens. Contains a thorough discussion of the Apaturia.
- Press, Gerald A. Plato: A Guide for the Perplexed. London & New York: Continuum, 2007.
- Very nice introduction to Plato’s art and thought urging that the dialogues be read as both philosophical and dramatic works.
- Rutherford, R. B. The Art of Plato. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1995.
- Offers a literary interpretation of the dialogues, including the Timaeus, focusing on their formal structure, language, character development, and imagery.
- Sallis, John. Chorology: On Beginning in Plato’s Timaeus. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1999.
- Interesting study focusing on the dialogue’s strange and mysterious “space” (chōra).
- Welliver, Warman. Character, Plot, and Thought in Plato’s Timaeus-Critias. Leiden: E. J. Brill, 1977.
- Close and careful examination of the Timaeus’s characters and their underlying political antagonisms.
- Westra, Laura and Robinson, Thomas M. The Greeks and the Environment. Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, 1997.
- Anthology devoted to the examination early Greek thinking on nature and ecology. Several chapters are devoted to Plato.
- Zuckert, Catherine. Plato’s Philosophers: The Coherence of the Dialogues. Chicago; University of Chicago Press, 2012.
- Bold and ambitious interpretation of Plato’s dialogues based on their dramatic order.
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