The heart of tolerance is self-control. When we tolerate an activity, we resist our urge to forcefully prohibit the expression of activities that we find unpleasant. More abstractly, toleration can be understood as a political practice aiming at neutrality, objectivity, or fairness on the part of political agents. These ideas are related in that the goal of political neutrality is deliberate restraint of the power that political authorities have to negate the life activities of its citizens and subjects. Related to toleration is the virtue of tolerance, which can be defined as a tendency toward toleration. Toleration is usually grounded upon an assumption about the importance of the autonomy of individuals. This assumption and the idea of toleration are central ideas in modern liberal theory and practice.
The virtue of toleration is implicit in Socrates’ method of allowing many diverse perspectives to be expressed. In seventeenth century Europe, the concept of tolerance was developed as liberal thinkers sought to limit the coercive actions of government and the Church. They argued that human beings are fallible and should have epistemic modesty. Further, an individual know his or her interests best and requires tolerance by others in order to find the best way to live.
The following article provides a conceptual and historical overview of the concept of toleration, surveying thinkers such as Socrates, John Locke, John Stuart Mill, Immanuel Kant, John Rawls and other contemporary political philosophers who have weighed in on this important yet problematic idea.
Table of Contents
- Conceptual Analysis
- Historical Development
- Epistemological Toleration
- Moral Toleration
- Political Toleration
- References and Further Reading
The English words, ‘tolerate’, ‘toleration’, and ‘tolerance’ are derived from the Latin terms tolerare and tolerantia, which imply enduring, suffering, bearing, and forbearance. Ancient Greek terms, which may also have influenced philosophical thinking on toleration, include: phoretos which means bearable, endurable, or phoreo, literally ‘to carry’; and anektikos meaning bearable, sufferable, tolerable, from anexo, ‘to hold up’.
Today, when we say that someone has a ‘high tolerance for pain,’ we mean that he or she is able to endure pain. This ordinary way of thinking is useful for understanding the idea of toleration and the virtue of tolerance: it underscores the fact that toleration is directed by an agent toward something perceived as negative. It would be odd to say, for example, that someone has a high tolerance for pleasure.
With this in mind, we can formulate a general definition of toleration that involves three interrelated conditions. When an agent tolerates something:
(1) the agent holds a negative judgment about this thing;
(2) the agent has the power to negate this thing; and
(3) the agent deliberately refrains from negation.
The first condition requires a negative judgment, which can be anything from disapproval to disgust. Judgment here is meant to be a broad concept that can include emotions, dispositions, tastes, and reasoned evaluations. This negative judgment inclines the agent toward a negative action toward the thing that is perceived as being negative. This broadly Stoic conception of judgment is a common assumption in discussions of toleration. Defenders of toleration assume that we can, to a certain extent, voluntarily control the expression of our negative reactions by opposing them with different, countervailing, judgments. Although judgments and emotions are both thought to have motivating force, they can be resisted by some other judgment, habit or virtue.
The entity toward which an agent has a negative judgment can be an event, an object, or a person, although with regard to tolerance as a moral and political disposition, the entity is usually thought to be a person. Although we speak of tolerating pain, for example, the moral and political emphasis is on tolerating some other person, a group of people, or their activities.
The second condition states that the agent has the power to negate the entity in question. Toleration is concerned with resisting the temptation to actively negate the thing in question. To distinguish toleration from cowardice or weakness of will the agent must have some capacity to enact his negative judgment. Toleration occurs when the agent could actively negate or destroy the person or object in question, but chooses not to.
The word negate is used here in a broad sense that allows for a variety of negative reactions. Negative actions can include: expressions of condemnation, acts of avoidance, or violent attacks. The continuum of negations is decidedly vague. It is not clear, for example, whether condemnation and avoidance are negations of the same sort as violent action. Despite the vagueness of the continuum of negative activities, the focal point of the second criterion is the power to negate: toleration is restraint of the power to negate.
The third condition states that the agent deliberately refrains from exercising his power to negate. Tolerant agents deliberately choose not to negate those things they view negatively. The negative formulation, ‘not negating,’ is important because toleration is not the same thing as positive evaluation, approbation, or approval.
Tolerant restraint of the negative judgment is supposed to be free and deliberate: one refrains from negating the thing because one has a reason not to negate it and is free to act. Good reasons for toleration are plural. They include: respect for autonomy; a general commitment to pacifism; concern for other virtues such as kindness and generosity; pedagogical concerns; a desire for reciprocity; and a sense of modesty about one’s ability to judge the beliefs and actions of others. Each of these provides us with a reason for thinking that it is good not to negate the thing in question. As mentioned already, there also may be other non-tolerant reasons for refraining from negation: fear, weakness of will, profit motive, self-interest, arrogance, and so forth.
Although there are many reasons to be tolerant, traditional discussions have emphasized respect for autonomy and pedagogical concerns. Underlying both of these approaches is often a form of self-conscious philosophical modesty that is linked to the value of respect for autonomy. As John Stuart Mill and others have argued, individuals ought to be left to pursue their own good in their own way in part because each individual knows himself and his own needs and interests best. This view does, however, leave us with a lingering problem as toleration can easily slip toward moral skepticism and relativism. It is important to note then that toleration is a positive value that is not based upon total moral skepticism. Proponents of toleration think that toleration is good not because they are unsure of their moral values but, rather, because toleration fits within a scheme of moral values that includes values such as autonomy, peace, cooperation, and other values that are thought to be good for human flourishing.
The spirit of tolerance is evident in Socrates’ dialogical method as a component of his search for truth. Throughout the early Platonic dialogues, Socrates tolerantly allows his interlocutors to pursue the truth wherever this pursuit might lead. And he encourages his interlocutors to offer refutations so that the truth might be revealed. Sometimes Socrates’ tolerance can appear to go too far. The Euthyrphro concludes, for example, with Socrates allowing Euthyphro to proceed in the prosecution of a questionable court case. And Socrates’ relationship with Alcibiades, as discussed in the Symposium, shows Socrates as perhaps too tolerant toward this reckless Athenian youth. In the Gorgias (at 458a) Socrates describes himself in terms that establish a link between philosophical method and a form of toleration. Socrates says,
And what kind of man am I? One of those who would gladly be refuted if anything I say is not true, and would gladly refute another who says what is not true, but would be no less happy to be refuted myself than to refute, for I consider that a greater benefit, inasmuch as it is a greater boon to be delivered from the worst of evils oneself than to deliver another.
For Socrates, then, the pursuit of truth is linked to an open mind, although of course this form of dialogical toleration is supposed to lead to a unitary vision of the truth.
One can see a more developed form of tolerance celebrated in the Stoicism of Epictetus (55-135 C.E.) and Marcus Aurelius (121-180 C.E.). The Stoic idea is that we should focus on those things we can control—our own opinions and behaviors—while ignoring those things we cannot control, especially the opinions and behaviors of others. The Stoic idea is linked to resignation and apathy, as is clear in the case of Epictetus, whose social position—raised as a Roman slave—might explain his advice about bearing and forbearing. Of course, the problem here is that slavish forbearance is not the same as tolerance: it seems clear that tolerance properly requires the power to negate, which the slave does not possess. With the Emperor Marcus Aurelius, however, tolerance is seen as a virtue of power. Tolerance might be linked to other virtues of power such as mercy and benevolence, as suggested, for example by Seneca. However, it is important to note that the Stoic approach to tolerance was not explicitly linked to a general idea about political respect for autonomy and freedom of conscience, as it is in the modern liberal tradition. Moreover, Roman political life was not nearly as tolerant as modern political life. For example, although Marcus’ Meditations contain many passages invoking the spirit of tolerance, Marcus was responsible for continuing the persecution of Christians.
Religious traditions provide further historical background for the idea of toleration. For example, the spirit of tolerance can be discovered in the Christian Gospel’s message of loving enemies, forgiving others, and refraining from judging others. Christian tolerance is linked to other virtues such as charity and self-sacrifice. Furthermore, it seems to go beyond tolerance toward a self-abnegating type of love and acceptance. Christ’s command to love your enemies is one example of this attempt to go beyond tolerance. It should be noted that other religious traditions also contain resources for developing toleration. For example, Buddhist compassion can be linked to the idea of toleration. Indeed, in the third century B.C.E., the Buddhist emperor of India, Ashoka, called for official religious toleration. Likewise, in the 16th Century C.E., the Islamic emperor Akhbar made a similar attempt at establishing religious toleration on the Indian subcontinent.
Despite these antecedents, toleration does not become a serious subject of philosophical and political concern in Europe until the 16th and 17th Centuries. During the Renaissance and Reformation of the 15th and 16th Centuries, humanists such as Erasmus (1466-1536), De Las Casas (1484-1566), and Montaigne (1533-1592) asserted the autonomy of human reason against the dogmatism of the Church. Although religious authorities reacted with the formation of the Inquisition and the Index of Forbidden Books, by the 17th Century philosophers were seriously considering the question of toleration.
Following the divisions created by the Lutheran Reformation and the Counter-Reformation, Europe was decimated by war and violence fomented in the name of religion, which culminated in the Thirty Years War (1618-1648). Through events such as these scholars became acutely aware of the destructive power of intolerance and sought to limit this destructive force by re-examining the biblical roots of toleration and by re-considering the relation between religious belief and political power. Additional influences on the cultural landscape of Europe during this time include the struggle to define sovereignty and to “purify” religion in Britain during the British Civil Wars (1640-1660), as well as increased information about cultural differences with the beginning of global exploration. Among the thinkers of this period, those who defended tolerance were Milton (1608-1674), Bayle (1647-1706), Spinoza (1634-1677), and Locke (1632-1704).
One of the worries of the humanist thinkers of the Reformation was whether it was possible to have infallible knowledge of the Divine Will such that one could justify the persecution of heretics. This concern with human fallibility lies at the heart of what will be described subsequently as “epistemological toleration.” When recognition of human fallibility is combined with critique of political and ecclesiastical power, more robust forms of political toleration develop.
In this vein, Spinoza concluded his Theological-Political Treatise (1670) with an argument for freedom of thought. It is not surprising that Spinoza should have written this treatise, for he was himself a product of a tolerant society: he was a Portuguese Jew living in Holland. Indeed, the 17th Century saw the rise of toleration in practice in certain parts of Europe, perhaps as a result of increased trade and social mobility. Spinoza’s argument for toleration focuses on three claims: first, he claims that it is impossible for the state to effectively curtail liberty of thought; second, he claims that liberty of thought can in fact be allowed without detriment to state power; and finally, Spinoza argues that political authority should focus on controlling actions and not on restricting thought. This emphasis on the difference between thought and action is crucial for subsequent discussions of toleration in Locke, Mill, and Kant.
Somewhat different versions of Spinoza’s basic insights can be found in Locke’s famous Letter Concerning Toleration (1689), an essay that was written during Locke’s exile in Holland. Locke’s argument focuses specifically on the conflict between political authority and religious belief. He articulated a view of toleration based on the epistemological claim that it is impossible for the state to coerce genuine religious belief. He argued that the state should refrain from interfering in the religious beliefs of its subjects, except when these religious beliefs lead to behaviors or attitudes that run counter to the security of the state. This exception allowed him to conclude that the state need not tolerate Catholics who were loyal to a foreign authority or atheists whose lack of religious conviction left them entirely untrustworthy.
In the 18th Century, discussion of toleration was tied to the problem of skepticism and to a more sustained critique of absolutism in politics. Voltaire (1694-1778), who expressed his admiration for the development of religious tolerance in England in his Philosophical Letters (1734), was extremely worried about the tendency of religion to become violent and intolerant. Moreover, he suffered under the intolerant hands of the French authorities: he was thrown in jail for his views and his books were censored and publicly burned. Religious tolerance forms the theme of his Treatise on Tolerance (1763), which argues vigorously for tolerance even though it retains a bias toward Christianity. A concise summary of Voltaire’s argument for tolerance can be found in the entry on Tolerance in his Philosophical Dictionary (1764). Voltaire’s claim is that toleration follows from human frailty and error. Since none of us has perfect knowledge, and since we are all weak, inconsistent, liable to fickleness and error, we should pardon one another for our failings. Voltaire’s approach focuses on tolerance at the level of personal interaction and risks slipping toward moral skepticism and relativism: like his contemporary David Hume (1711-1777), Voltaire presented a skeptical challenge to orthodox belief.
Immanuel Kant (1724-1804), in response to skeptics such as Voltaire and Hume, tried to avoid skepticism while focusing on the limits of human knowledge and the limits of political power. In his essay, “What is Enlightenment?” (1784), Kant argues for an enlightened form of political power that would allow subjects to argue among themselves, so long as they remained obedient to authority. This position is further clarified by Kant’s claim in Perpetual Peace (1795) that philosophers should be allowed and encouraged to speak publicly. Kant’s point in this later essay is that public debate and discussion lead to the truth, and that kings should have nothing to fear from the truth. Kant’s views on religious toleration are clarified in his Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone (1793). Here Kant argues against religious intolerance by pointing out that although we are certain of our moral duties, human beings do not have apodictic certainty of God’s commands. Thus a religious belief that demands a contravention of morality (such as the burning of a heretic) can never be justified.
Bridging the gap between the Old World and the New World, the writings of Thomas Paine (1737-1809) and Thomas Jefferson (1743-1826) express a theory of toleration that is tied directly to political practice. Paine’s and Jefferson’s ideas followed Locke’s. Not only were they critical of unrestrained political power but they were also committed to an ecumenical approach to religious belief known as deism. Paine makes it clear in his Rights of Man (1791) that toleration for religious diversity is essential because political and ecclesiastical authorities do not have the capacity to adjudicate matters of conscience. “Mind thine own concerns. If he believes not as thou believest, it is a proof that thou believest not as he believeth, and there is no earthly power can determine between you.”
At the end of the 18th Century, we see tolerant ideas embodied in practice in the U.S. Constitution’s Bill of Rights—the first 10 Amendments to the Constitution (ratified in 1791). Collectively these amendments serve to restrain political power. Specifically, the First Amendment states that there can be no law, which prohibits freedom of religion, freedom of speech, freedom of the press, freedom of assembly, and freedom to petition to the government. Subsequent developments in U.S. Constitutional law have led to a tradition of respect for citizens’ freedom of thought, speech, and action.
In the 19th Century, the idea of toleration was developed further in line with the liberal, enlightenment idea that moral autonomy is essential to human flourishing. The most famous argument for toleration in the 19th Century was made by John Stuart Mill in On Liberty (1859). Mill argues here that the only proper limit of liberty is harm: one is entitled to be as free as possible, except where one’s liberty poses a threat to the well-being of someone else: “the only purpose for which power can rightfully be exercised over any member of a civilized community, against his will, is to prevent harm to others.”
Mill expands the notion of privacy that was implicit in Locke and Kant to argue that political power should have no authority to regulate those activities and interests of individuals that are purely private and have no secondary effects on others. Mill also vigorously argues that freedom of thought is essential for the development of knowledge. Mill’s general approach is utilitarian: he claims that individuals will be happier if their private differences are tolerated and that society in general will be better off if individuals are left to pursue their own good in their own way.
In the 19th Century and into the early 20th Century, religious toleration was also a subject of consideration for thinkers such as Soren Kierkegaard (1813-1855), Ralph Waldo Emerson (1803-1882), and William James (1842-1910), who emphasized the subjective nature of religious faith. For example, in his Varieties of Religious Experience (1902), James argued that religious experience was diverse and not subject to a definitive interpretation. Although this fits with James’s larger metaphysical commitment to pluralism, his point is that religious commitment is personal—a matter of what he calls in another essay, “the will to believe.” It is up to each individual to decide for himself what he will believe: if we properly understand the nature of religious belief, we should respect the religious liberty of others and learn to tolerate our differences.
In the 20th Century, toleration has become an important component of what is now known as liberal theory. The bloody history of the 20th Century has led many to believe that toleration is needed to end political and religious violence. Toleration has been defended by liberal philosophers and political theorists such as John Dewey, Isaiah Berlin, Karl Popper, Michael Walzer, Ronald Dworkin, and John Rawls. It has been criticized by Herbert Marcuse and others such as Iris Young who worry that toleration and its ideal of state neutrality is merely another hegemonic Western ideology. Toleration has been the explicit subject of many recent works in political philosophy by Susan Mendus, John Horton, Preston King, and Bernard Williams. Much of the current discussion focuses on responding to John Rawls, whose theory of “political liberalism” conceives of toleration as a pragmatic response to the fact of diversity (see “Political Toleration” below). A recurring question in the current debate is whether there can be a more substantive commitment to toleration that does not lead to the paradoxical consequence that the tolerant must tolerate those who are intolerant.
Further recent discussion, by David Heyd, Glenn Newey, and others, has attempted to re-establish the link between tolerance and virtue. These writers wonder whether tolerance is in fact a virtue and if so, what sort of a virtue it is. A concern for racial equality, gender neutrality, an end of prejudice, respect for cultural and ethnic difference, and a general commitment to multiculturalism has fueled ongoing debates about the nature of toleration in our age of globalization and homogenization. Finally, in the U.S., First Amendment Law has developed to allow for a broad idea of freedom of speech, freedom of the press, and freedom of religion. And under the influence of an interpretation of the equal protection clause of the 14th Amendment, mechanisms to ensure equality have given support to those minority groups who were once the victims of political intolerance.
An epistemological argument for toleration can be traced to Socrates. However, this ideal becomes explicit in the thinking of Milton, Locke, and Mill. The epistemological claim is that one should tolerate the opinions and beliefs of the other because it is either impossible to coerce belief or because such coercion is not the most useful pedagogical approach. This idea can be developed into a claim about the importance of diversity, dialogue, and debate for the establishment of truth. Finally, this approach might lead to a form of relativism or skepticism that puts the idea of toleration itself at risk.
Socratic tolerance is discovered if we take seriously Socrates’ claims to ignorance. Socratic ignorance is linked to virtues, such as sophrosyne (self-control), modesty and tolerance. These virtues are essential components in the formation of the philosophical community and the pursuit of philosophical truth. Throughout Plato’s dialogues, Socrates restrains himself deliberately—he modestly claims ignorance and allows others to develop their own positions and make their own mistakes—out of recognition that this is the best, perhaps the only, way to proceed in the communal pursuit of truth. Socrates’ main goal is to discover the truth through open-minded debate. But there would be no dialogue and indeed no education without tolerance. Socrates’ commitment to tolerance is part of his epistemological faith in the autonomy of reason. We each must discover the truth for ourselves by way of disciplined, modest, and tolerant dialogue.
Centuries later, John Milton’s Areopagitica (1644) offers a similar defense of the truth. Milton vigorously defended freedom of speech in response to a censorship decree of the English parliament. His argument relies upon the epistemological claim that open dialogue supported by a tolerant government fosters the development of truth. Milton’s basic assumption is that the truth is able to defend itself in a free debate. “Let truth and falsehood grapple; who ever knew truth put to the worse, in a free and open encounter?” Milton further argues that outward conformity to orthodoxy is not the same as genuine belief.
These ideas were developed further by Locke in his Letter Concerning Toleration. Locke argues that the civil and ecclesiastical authorities ought to tolerate diversity of belief because one cannot force another human being to have faith. In a claim that is reminiscent of Milton, Locke claims “the truth certainly would do well enough if she were left to shift for herself… She is not taught by laws, nor has she any need of force to procure her entrance into the minds of men.” This is so because the authority of judgment resides within the free individual. It is impossible to force someone to believe something for external reasons. Rather, truth must be arrived at and believed for internal reasons.
This epistemological claim is the focal point of Jeremy Waldron’s recent critique of Locke’s account. Waldron claims that Locke’s argument is weak because it relies upon the false assumption that beliefs cannot be coerced. The point is that we often believe things quite sincerely without any good reason whatsoever. Moreover, Waldron argues that the epistemological argument is too weak to provide a moral limitation on coercion. Even though coercion cannot produce genuine belief, an intolerant regime may not be interested in producing genuine belief. It may simply be interested in guaranteeing conformity. Waldron’s point is important: the epistemological critique is useful only if one is committed to the claim that genuine belief in the truth is an important political or moral value. An epistemological argument for toleration must claim not only that it is impractical or impossible to impose belief upon others, but also that we ought to value genuine commitment over mere conformity.
Mill’s epistemological argument is quite similar to Locke’s, although Mill goes farther in advocating freedom of speech as essential for the discovery of truth. Mill’s epistemological argument begins with the assumption that individuals know best what is good for them. This claim runs counter to the traditional Platonic claim that often individuals do not know what is in their own best interest. Mill supports his claim by pointing out that the individual always has the best access to his/her own interests and desires: others do not have access to the kinds of internal evidence that would allow them to judge for the individual. It is important to note that Mill does not equate this access problem with relativism. Indeed, in his essay Utilitarianism (1863), he famously defends a hierarchy of goods based on the fact that those who have experienced both “lower” and “higher” goods will prefer the higher ones (for example, “it is better to be Socrates dissatisfied than a fool satisfied”). The epistemological point remains the same here, however: it is up to the individual to judge for himself about what is good for him.
Mill’s general argument for freedom of thought is based upon a recognition of human fallibility and on the need for dialogue and debate. Mill’s argument for freedom of thought in On Liberty contains the following claims. (1) Silenced opinions may be true. To assume they are not is to assume that we are infallible. (2) Even false opinions may contain valid points of contention and parts of the truth. To know the whole of truth we might have to weave together parts of truth from different sources. (3) To claim to know the truth means that we are able to defend it against all vigorous opposition. Thus we need to be able to hear and respond to false opinions in order to know all of the arguments for a proposition. (4) Truth that is not continuously and vigorously contested becomes mere superstition. Such dogmatically held superstitions may thus crumble before even weak opposition and will not be heartily believed or defended.
Like Socrates, Mill and Locke both arrive at the notion of toleration from a non-relativistic understanding of belief and truth. However, under the general rubric of epistemological toleration we might also include the sort of toleration that follows from skepticism or relativism. For the relativist or skeptic, since we cannot know the truth or since all truths are relative, we ought to be tolerant of those who hold different points of view. Contemporary American philosopher, Richard Rorty has articulated an argument something like this. The problem with this approach is the same problem with all sorts of skepticism and relativism: either the claim self-referentially undermines itself or it provides us with no compelling reason to believe it. If we are skeptical about knowledge, then we have no way of knowing that toleration is good. Likewise, if truth is relative to a system of thought, then the claim that toleration is required is itself merely a relatively justified claim. The form of epistemological toleration espoused by Mill, at least, attempts to avoid these problems by appealing to a form of fallibilism that is not completely skeptical or relativistic. Mill’s point is not that there is no truth but, rather, that toleration is required for us to come to know the truth.
We have seen that epistemological concerns can lead us to toleration. Moral concerns can also bring us to toleration. Tolerance as a moral virtue might be linked to other moral virtues such as modesty and self-control. However, the most common moral value that is thought to ground toleration is a concern for autonomy. We ought to refrain from negating the other when concern for the other’s autonomy provides us with a good reason not to act. Toleration that follows from a commitment to autonomy should not be confused with moral relativism. Moral relativism holds that values are relative to culture or context. A commitment to autonomy, in opposition to this, holds that autonomy is good in a non-relative sense. A commitment to autonomy might require that I allow another person to do something that I find abhorrent, not because I believe that values are relative, but because I believe that autonomy is so important that it requires me to refrain from negating the autonomous action of another free agent. Of course, there are limits here. Autonomous action that violates the autonomy of another cannot be tolerated.
Mill’s account of the principle of liberty is helpful for understanding this idea of toleration. Mill tells us that we should be given as much liberty as possible, as long as our liberty does not harm others. This is in fact a recipe for toleration. Mill’s argument follows from certain basic assumptions about individuals.
1. Each individual has a will of his own.
2. Each individual is better off when not compelled to do better.
3. Each individual knows best what is good for him.
4. Each individual is motivated to attain his own good and to avoid actions that are contrary to his self-interest.
5. Self-regarding thought and activity can be distinguished from its effects upon others.
Some of these claims (for example, #3) are linked to epistemological toleration. However, the point here is not only that individuals know what is in their own self-interest but also that it is good for individuals to be able to pursue their own good in their own way. Such an approach makes several important metaphysical assumptions about the nature of human being: that autonomy is possible and important, that individuals do know their own good, that there is a distinction between self-regarding action and actions that effects others. Moral toleration follows from these sorts of claims about human being.
Of course, toleration and respect for autonomy are not simple ideas. Much has been made about the so-called “paradox of toleration”: the fact that toleration seems to ask us to tolerate those things we find intolerable. Toleration does require that we refrain from enacting the negative consequences of our negative judgments. This becomes paradoxical when we find ourselves confronting persons, attitudes, or behaviors, which we vigorously reject: we then must, paradoxically, tolerate that which we find intolerable. This becomes especially difficult when the other who is to be tolerated expresses views or activities that are themselves intolerant.
One way of resolving this paradox is to recognize that there is a distinction between first-order judgments and second-order moral commitments. First-order judgments include emotional reactions and other practical judgments that focus on concrete and particular attitudes and behaviors. Second-order moral commitments include more complicated judgments that aim beyond emotion and particularity toward rational universal principles. With regard to the paradox of toleration there is a conflict between a first-order reaction against something and a second-order commitment to the principle of respecting autonomy or to the virtues of modesty or self-control. The paradox is resolved by recognizing that this second-order commitment trumps the first-order reaction: principle is supposed to outweigh emotion. Thus we might have good reasons (based upon our second-order commitments) to refrain from following through on the normal consequences of negative first-order judgments. However, when there is a genuine conflict of second-order commitments, that is, when the tolerant commitment to autonomy runs up against an intolerant rejection of autonomy, then there is no need to tolerate. In other words the paradox is resolved when we realize that toleration is not a commitment to relativism but, rather, that it is a commitment to the value of autonomy and to the distinction between first-order judgments and second-order moral commitments.
Of course, the ideal of toleration is a difficult one to enact. This difficulty is related to the tension between first-order reactions and second-order commitments that is found within the spiritual economy of an individual. This is why the idea of tolerance as a virtue is important. Virtues are tendencies or habits toward good action. In the case of the virtue of tolerance, the tendency is toward respect for the autonomy of others and toward the self-discipline necessary for deliberately restraining first-order reactions. Virtues are usually thought to be integrated into a system of virtues. Tolerance is no exception. The virtue of tolerance is closely related to other virtues such as self-control, modesty, generosity, kindness, mercy, and forgiveness. One must be careful, however, not to conclude that the virtue of tolerance is a tendency toward indifference or apathy. Tolerance demands that we moderate and control our passions in light of some larger good, whether that good be respect for autonomy or an interest in self-control; tolerance does not demand that we completely refrain from judging another free agent.
Moral toleration asks us to restrain some of our most powerful first-order reactions: negative reactions to persons, attitudes, and behaviors which we find repugnant. Without the tension between first-order reactions and second-order commitment, toleration is merely indifference. Indifference usually indicates a failure at the level of first-order judgment: when we are indifferent, we do not have any reaction, negative or positive, to the other. Such a state of indifference is not virtuous. Indeed, it would be vicious and wrong not to react strongly against injustice or violations of autonomy.
We often confuse indifference with toleration. However, indifference is flawed as a human response for two reasons. First, it rejects the truth of first-order reactions. First-order reactions should not be ignored. Our emotional responses are important ways in which we connect with the world around us. When we react negatively to something, this emotional reaction provides important information about the world and ourselves. Tolerance does not ask us to deaden our emotional responses to others; rather it asks us to restrain the negative consequences of our negative emotional responses out of deference to a more universal set of commitments. Second, indifference is often closely related to general skepticism about moral judgment. The moral skeptic claims that no set of values is true. From this perspective, both first-order reactions and second-order commitments are mere tastes or preferences without any final moral significance. From this skepticism, indifference with regard to any moral evaluation is cultivated because all of our moral values are thought to be equally groundless. The difficulty here is that moral skepticism cannot lead to the conclusion that it is good to be tolerant, since the skeptic holds that no moral value can be justified. If we claim that toleration is good and that tolerance is a virtue, toleration cannot be the same thing as indifference.
This distinction between tolerance and indifference is important for explaining the spiritual disruption that occurs when we strive to become tolerant. Indeed, the difficulty of toleration can be understood in terms of the difficulty of the middle path between indifference and dogmatism. Indifference is easy and satisfying because it sets us free, as it were, from the difficult human task of judging. Likewise, dogmatism is easy and satisfying because it follows from a seamless synthesis of first-order reaction and second-order commitment. Toleration is the middle path in which there is a conflict between first-order reaction and second-order commitment. Toleration thus requires self-consciousness and self-control in order to coordinate conflicting parts of the spiritual economy. The discipline required for toleration is part of any idea of education: we must learn to distance ourselves from first-order reactions in order to move toward universal principles. First-order reactions are often wrong or incomplete, as are immediate sense perceptions. And yet, education does not ask us to give up on first-order reactions or sense perceptions. Rather, it asks us to be disciplined and self-critical, so that we might control first-order reactions in order to uphold more important principles.
Moral toleration emphasizes a moral commitment to the value of autonomy. Although it is linked, by Mill, for example to a political idea about restraint of state power, moral toleration is ultimately concerned with clarifying the second-order principle that is supposed to lead to toleration.
While moral toleration is about relations between agents, political toleration is about restraint of political power. The modern liberal state is usually not thought to be a moral agent. Rather, the state is supposed to be something like a third party referee: it is not thought to be one of the parties engaged directly in the process of judgment and negation. Political toleration is thus an ideal that holds that the political referee should be impartial and unbiased. The term toleration has been used, since Locke, in this political context to describe a principle of state neutrality. The connection between moral and political toleration can be understood in terms of the history of the pre-modern era when the state was an agent—a monarch, for example—who had particular judgments and the power to negate. As the idea of the state has evolved since the 17th Century toward liberal democratic notions of self-government and civil rights, the notion of political toleration has evolved to mean something like state indifference. Political toleration is now thought to entail respect for privacy, separation of church and state, and a general respect for human rights.
In the 20th Century, the idea of political toleration has developed, especially under the influence of John Rawls (1921-2002) and his books, Theory of Justice (1971) and Political Liberalism (1995). Rawls’ approach attempts to be neutral about moral values in order to establish political principles of toleration. Rawls argues for toleration in a pragmatic fashion as that which works best to achieve political unity and an idea of justice among diverse individuals. Although the idea of political toleration has been most vigorously defended by Rawls, it also forms the basis of other pragmatic and political accounts of toleration, including those of John Dewey, Jürgen Habermas, Michael Walzer, and Richard Rorty. The danger with this approach is that it tends toward relativism by self-consciously limiting itself from articulating a metaphysical defense of autonomy and toleration. The difficulty is that the idea of state neutrality can become paradoxical: a state that is neutral about everything will undermine its own existence.
The idea of political toleration begins from the claim that diverse individuals will come to tolerate one another by developing what Rawls called “overlapping consensus”: individuals and groups with diverse metaphysical views or comprehensive schemes will find reasons to agree about certain principles of justice that will include principles of toleration. This is in part an empirical or historical argument about the way in which diverse individuals or groups eventually resolve their differences by way of a pragmatic commitment to toleration as a modus vivendi, or means of life. One could trace this idea back to Hobbes’ idea of the social contract as a peace treaty. Diverse individuals in the state of nature will, according to Hobbes’s argument in The Leviathan (1651), engage in the war of all against all. This war is ultimately unsatisfying and so individuals relinquish their warring power and create the social contract. The problem is that this pragmatic account leaves us without a metaphysical justification of the principles of toleration. Rather it comes to toleration from the pragmatic assumption that diverse individuals motivated by self-interest will agree to support the neutral state, which is then supposed to act as a referee in their disputes. Of course, Hobbes’ account of the absolute sovereignty of the Leviathan calls into question the idea that a social contract view will always lead to a tolerant liberal state.
Rawls’ idea of “justice as fairness” attempts to set limits to political power without trying to evaluate the relative merits of different conceptions of the good. Rawls clarified his approach by insisting that the principles of justice are political and not moral principles. They are based upon what he called “reasonable pluralism.” What he means by this is that the principles of toleration will be agreed to by individuals from diverse perspectives because these principles will appear reasonable to each individual despite their differences. The idea of toleration results from a political consensus that is developed by way of the ideal social contract that Rawls describes at length in Theory of Justice. Like Mill, Rawls theory of justice claims that the first principle of justice is the liberty principle: “Each person has an equal right to a fully adequate scheme of equal basic liberties which is compatible with a similar scheme of liberties for all.” These basic civil liberties form the basis for political toleration.
Political liberalism focuses on the problem of diversity without appealing to a larger metaphysical theory. This problem is exacerbated when political liberalism takes up the question of international human rights and the problem of intolerant groups or individual who demand to be tolerated. Political liberalism aims at the creation of a global human rights regime that is supposed to support politically tolerant states and that is sensitive to the issue of group rights. From the perspective of political liberalism, human rights—basic defenses against the intolerant expansion of state power—are thought to be the result of overlapping political consensus. From this perspective, human rights, such as the right to autonomy that forms the basis of moral toleration, are thought to be, not metaphysical givens, but the conditions for the possibility of political consensus building.
The idea of a developing “overlapping consensus” in international affairs was articulated in the 1950’s by Jacques Maritain and was developed in practice by international agencies such as the United Nations. In the final decade of the twentieth century, Jürgen Habermas’ approach linked principles of toleration to the very nature of political argument: for us to have a political argument, we must agree to certain principles of fair argumentation. The difficultly here is that diversity is even more of a problem on the international scene, where discussions of human rights are essential. At the local or national level, the point of liberalism is that the neutral state ought not interfere or comment on the quality of individual lives unless the lives and actions of private individuals become a menace to the rights and privacy of other individuals. Internationally, Rawls follows Kant in specifying the Law of Peoples that is supposed to maintain order among diverse mutually tolerant nations.
A further complication arises at the level of group rights (both within national and international politics), where groups and their members claim the right to be tolerated by larger political organizations. Here the idea of tolerating the practices and identities of groups may paradoxically result in toleration for intolerant groups. This is the case for example, when tolerant governments consider groups who advocate violence, discrimination, and other intolerant practices. Such groups can be intolerant toward their own members, toward the tolerant liberal societies in which they subside, and indeed toward those international organizations who support toleration throughout the globe.
The risk of political liberalism is that it hovers uneasily between pluralism and relativism, while seeking to avoid metaphysical dogmatism or political imperialism. The basic pluralism of political liberalism supports political toleration by recognizing that conflicting comprehensive doctrines can each be justified as reasonable according to the standards internal to them. This leaves us with the conflicts of reasonable pluralism: each of the conflicting comprehensive doctrines is reasonable on its own terms and to the extent that it recognizes the reasonableness of other comprehensive doctrines. Thus, for Rawls, cooperation between reasonable comprehensive doctrines is a practical political task. The state should refrain from entering into a discussion of which comprehensive doctrine is better morally, epistemologically, or metaphysically quite simply because such a discussion would be unjust for a neutral state confronted with the fact of diversity. By defining his account of state neutrality as political, Rawls wants to distance his account of reasonable pluralism from a more robust form of philosophical skepticism. This is reminiscent of Locke’s approach to epistemological toleration: since we cannot in practice force individuals to agree about moral or metaphysical truths, we should tolerate diversity at the political level.
Rawls does, however, hold that there is a best political arrangement, even if the truth about the best political arrangement is arrived at by way of pragmatic concerns for what works politically in light of the fact of diversity. And thus his idea of political consensus tries to avoid the slide toward skepticism and relativism. It seems that for political toleration, there is at least one non-relative value—that of toleration and peaceful coexistence—even if this is merely pragmatically justified by the concrete historical need for peaceful coexistence among those who cannot arrive at consensus about their views of the good.
The approach of political liberalism has appeared to succeed in practice. One could argue that the idea of the neutral state and of political consensus about the need for toleration has been gradually developing in Constitutional Law in the U.S. and in international law by way of the U.N.’s Declaration of Human Rights. Article 26 of the U.N. Declaration states explicitly that education is a universal right and that education should aim to “promote understanding, tolerance and friendship among all nations, racial or religious groups.” We are still far from actualizing the idea of a tolerant international community. However, it is fairly clear that in the last several decades the idea of political toleration has succeeded in the United States and in other Western countries.
Despite this success, critics such as Michael Sandel, in his Democracy’s Discontent (1998), have argued that the tolerant attitude of what he calls “the procedural republic” must be grounded in a more comprehensive moral theory. Without such a ground, Sandel worries that the tolerant neutral state will ultimately lose its connection with the moral lives of individuals. Sandel claims in his arguments against Rawls and against certain developments in Constitutional Law that the approach of political liberalism cannot ultimately take account of the depth of commitment that most individuals have to their own comprehensive doctrines. Rawls admits that for his idea of overlapping consensus to work, he must assume a weakening of private faith in comprehensive doctrines. The problem here is that it argues for toleration by underestimating the power of those forms of private faith that must be tolerated.
A further problem of the political approach to toleration is that it struggles to define the nature of privacy. Moral toleration claims that there are certain private activities which are only of concern to the individual and that the state would be unjustified in interfering with these private activities. A merely political approach to toleration is however unable to draw the line dividing public and private in a metaphysical fashion. Rather, the sphere of privacy is itself defined only as a result of the process of building political consensus. Thus the worry is that the principles of political liberalism are not clearly defined and that toleration, as a mere modus vivendi, could be violated if the political consensus were to shift. In other words, if there is no metaphysical basis for a sphere of privacy, then it is not exactly clear what the politically grounded idea of liberal toleration is supposed to tolerate.
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