Veṅkaṭanātha (Vedānta Deśika) (c. 1269—c. 1370)
Veṅkaṭanātha (also known as Vedānta Deśika “teacher of Vedānta”) was an Indian polymath who wrote philosophical as well as religious and poetical works in several languages, including Sanskrit, Maṇipravāḷa—a Sanskritised form of literary Tamil—and Tamil. He is traditionally dated to 1269-1370, but as explained by Neevel “the lifespans of the earliest teachers of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta have been prolonged in order to connect them with each other” (1977, p. 14-16). He constitutes a turning point in the history of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta philosophy, and his intellectual work shaped this current, as well as the tradition, of Śrī Vaiṣṇavism (the religious counterpart of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta ) in general. The number of works he produced (more than 100 are attributed to him) and their depth make each assessment of his contribution preliminary, and the present one is no exception. He is a major figure in the history of Indian philosophy who wrote on a variety of philosophical topics and in a variety of genres. Unlike other authors, it appears that Veṅkaṭanātha was able to convey his theological ideas in different genres and different styles, so that his poems express in a mystical and condensed way what his essays explain in a systematic language. Veṅkaṭanātha’s philosophical works are composed mostly in Sanskrit but in some cases also in Maṇipravāḷa. Veṅkaṭanātha wrote both independent treatises and commentaries on other works.
Table of Contents
- Veṅkaṭanātha’s Life, Works, and Formation
- Veṅkaṭanātha’s Role within the History of Indian Philosophy
- Veṅkaṭanātha’s Epistemology, Ontology, and Theology
- State of the Art of Research on Veṅkaṭanātha
- References and Further Reading
The Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta is a philosophical and theological school, chiefly active in South India from the last centuries of the first millennium until today, that holds that the Ultimate is a personal God who is the only existing entity and of whom everything else (from matter to human and other living beings) is a characteristic. This God is usually called Viṣṇu, hence the adjective Vaiṣṇava for His believers. As its name declares, Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta sees itself as a Vedānta school. The designation “Vedānta” (or “Uttara Mīmāṃsā”) is the name adopted by various concurring philosophical schools recognizing the Vedāntasūtras “Aphorisms on Vedānta” (also called Brahmasūtras “aphorisms on the brahman”) as one of their foundational texts focusing on the exegesis of the Upaniṣads. The latter are a collection of texts recognized by Vedāntins as the culmination of the Vedas, the Indian sacred texts, that elaborate on the brahman, the absolute, with theistic or a more or less monistic approach. By contrast, the philosophical school of Mīmāṃsā (or Pūrva Mīmāṃsā) is based on the Mīmāṃsāsūtra (or Pūrva Mīmāṃsā Sūtra) and focuses on the exegesis of the prescriptive portion of the Veda, namely the Brāhmaṇas. Further three schools will be mentioned in the next pages, namely the Advaita Vedānta, or monistic Vedānta, the Sāṅkhya, and the Nyāya one. The first one offers a monistic interpretation of the Upaniṣads, against which the Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta reacts vehemently. The Sāṅkhya school is a dualist school focusing on the opposition between a dynamic natura naturans, from which everything in the world originates, and an inert Spirit (see Sāṅkhya). The Nyāya school is the school of Indian philosophy focusing on logic, dialectics and epistemology, and it recognizes the Nyāyasūtra as its foundational text (see Nyāya).
The beginnings of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta as an independent school are usually connected to Rāmānuja (traditional dates 1017-1137, see Rāmānuja ), both in India and in Western scholarship. Rāmānuja was indeed the first one to write a new commentary on the Vedāntasūtras, and thus robustly collocating his school within Vedānta. Ex post and principally due to the work of Veṅkaṭanātha, further predecessors of Rāmānuja have been linked to the prehistory of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta, especially Nāthamuni, of whom no work is extant, and Yāmuna, of whom a complete work and various fragmentary ones are preserved.
The religious counterpart of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta is usually called Śrī Vaiṣṇavism (on the introduction of this term, see Colas 2003, p. 247) since it focuses on the devotion to Viṣṇu and His wife Śrī. Other Vaiṣṇava texts worth mentioning are the constellation of texts called Pāñcarātras, a heterogenous group of texts prescribing tantric rituals, and the devotional poetry in Tamil of the Āḻvārs. The heterogeneity of the extant Pāñcarātra texts make it difficult to reconstruct a Pāñcarātra theology, but all Pāñcarātrins agree on the doctrine of God’s manifestations (called vyūhas), a belief which appear to clash with the absolute monism of Advaita Vedānta.
On Veṅkaṭanātha, we have an unusual wealth of biographical material although much of it is based on later hagiographies and is, therefore, not necessarily reliable in terms of yielding sheer historical data. Nonetheless, it appears to be clear that Veṅkaṭanātha was born in a family closely linked to Śrī Vaiṣṇavism and that he was born and raised in the current state of Tamil Nadu. It seems that Veṅkaṭanātha was born in Tūppul, close to Kañcipūram, and was active in various key locations of Śrī Vaiṣṇavism and eventually settled in Śrīraṅgam, the temple town that is the chief centre of Śrī Vaiṣṇavism even in the 21st century. More than one hundred works (some of which are very short religious hymns) attributed to Veṅkaṭanātha have been preserved, and for most of them the attribution seems to be genuine. As noted earlier, Veṅkaṭanātha was able to convey his theological ideas in different genres and styles. One example is Veṅkaṭanātha’s hymn to Hayagrīva (Viṣṇu’s form as a horse and as God of knowledge), which glorifies the figure of the god Hayagrīva as the only God thus unifying, in a single symbol, Veṅkaṭanātha’s emphasis on a personal relation to God, his stress on Vedic learning, and his conception of a God who is not (only) transcendent.
This ability of mastering different approaches earned Veṅkaṭanātha the epithet of “lion [that is, foremost] among the poets and the philosophers,” which is widely found in most maṅgalas “auspicious verses” (found at the beginning of a work) dedicated to him. Through a comparison of his devotional, theological, and philosophical works, one can get an elaborate idea of his intellectual profile and contribution.
Veṅkaṭanātha’s philosophical works are composed mostly in Sanskrit but in some cases also in a highly Sanskritised form of Tamil called “Maṇipravāḷa.” For reasons that will be discussed below, Veṅkaṭanātha wrote both independent treatises and commentaries on other works. The former category includes such works as the Tattvamuktākalāpa, with its auto-commentary called Sarvārthasiddhi; the Nyāyasiddhāñjana and the Śatadūṣaṇī, all dealing with various philosophical topics in a relatively short number of pages for each topic; and works dealing with a single topic such as the Pāñcarātrarakṣā (Defense of Pāñcarātra) dedicated to the epistemic justification of the validity of the Pāñcarātra sacred texts. To the category of commentaries and the subcategory of the closer commentaries one can count Veṅkaṭanātha’s subcommentary (called Tātparyacandrikā) on Rāmānuja’s commentary on the Bhagavadgītā, and his subcommentary (called Tattvaṭīkā) on Rāmānuja’s Śrībhāṣya (henceforth ŚrīBh) on the Brahmasūtra. Less close are his Adhikaraṇasārāvalī, which comments on the topics of the Brahmasūtra according to their own sequence, and the Seśvaramīmāṃsā (“Theistic Mīmāṃsā” a new and independent commentary on the Mīmāṃsāsūtra). Akin to the latter work are works dealing with a specific tradition of thoughts, for example the Mīmāṃsāpādukā on Mīmāṃsā or the Nyāyapariśuddhi “Purification of Nyāya” on Nyāya and, more in general, the doxographic Paramatabhaṅga “Refutation of the other systems of thought,” written in Maṇipravāḷa. The Nyāyapariśuddhi and the Nyāsiddhāñjana are further linked insofar as the former deals with epistemology and the latter with ontology, thus mirroring the fundamental opposition of pramāṇa (“instrument of knowledge”) and prameya (“object of knowledge”) found in the Nyāya school since the Nyāyasūtra and paradigmatically in Jayanta’s masterwork, the Nyāyamañjarī, also divided in two major sections of six books each.
Veṅkaṭanātha’s maternal uncle and preceptor, Ātreya Rāmānuja, had a profound impact on his intellectual formation. Ātreya Rāmānuja is traditionally believed to have been born in Kañcipūram in the year 1220, the fourth in a lineage of disciples started by Rāmānuja himself (Ramanujachari and Srinivasacharya 1938, p. v). Several elements of Veṅkaṭanātha’s systematisation of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta can indeed be found in Ātreya Rāmānuja’s Nyāyakuliśa (henceforth NK). Like other texts by Veṅkaṭanātha, the NK focuses on various philosophical topics rather than commenting on a root text (like Rāmānuja’s ŚrīBh) or on a single topic (like Yāmuna’s ĀP or, for instance, Maṇḍana Miśra’s treatises). Further, the NK is in a constant dialogue with the other schools of Vedānta, primarily with Advaita Vedānta, but like in the case of Veṅkaṭanātha other schools of Indian philosophy play a major role in it, namely Nyāya and Mīmāṃsā.
Veṅkaṭanātha is an important figure in the history of Indian philosophy. Since he is a historical figure, the explication of his thought is facilitated by the contextual knowledge available about the times, the cultural and geographical milieu, and the religious tradition related to him. Conversely, the study of Veṅkaṭanātha and of his sources allows one to undertake a study of Indian philosophy as known to him and of the changes he implemented in its interpretation.
Veṅkaṭanātha’s works are also an invaluable mine of information concerning his predecessors within what was later labelled Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta since Veṅkaṭanātha’s intellectual openness led him to frequent confrontations with previous authors and, thus, to quotes from them. In this way, thanks to Veṅkaṭanātha numerous quotes (otherwise lost works) have come to us from Nāthamuni’s Nyāyatattva (quoted largely in the Nyāyasiddhāñjana, for example, Vīrarāghavācārya 1976, p. 519) to Nārāyaṇārya (quoted, for example, in the Nyāyasiddhāñjana ad 8, Vīrarāghavācārya 1976, p. 39, about whom see Trikha 1999); from Parāśara Bhaṭṭa’s Tattvaratnākara (quoted in the Nyāyasiddhāñjana, for example, Vīrarāghavācārya 1976, p. 111, 408) to the Vṛttikāra (quoted, for example, in the introduction of the SM); from Rāmamiśra’s Ṣaḍarthasaṅkṣepa (quoted in the Nyāyasiddhāñjana) to Dramiḍācārya (quoted in the Nyāyasiddhāñjana, Vīrarāghavācārya 1976, p. 437) and to Yādavaprakāśa (about whom see Oberhammer 1997 and about whose presence in Veṅkaṭanātha’s works see Freschi 2016 b).
The Vedāntic school of Indian philosophy we refer to as Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta has been largely influenced by the shape Veṅkaṭanātha gave to it. For instance, the traditional lineage of teachers of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta includes the Āḻvārs (an elusive Vṛttikāra), Nāthamuni, Yāmunācārya, Rāmānuja, and Parāśara Bhaṭṭa. All bear just some vague family resemblance with each other but all are directly linkable to Veṅkaṭanātha’s view of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta, which includes the Āḷvārs devotionalism, the Pāñcarātra’s ritualism together with a robust commitment to the scholarly tradition of Indian philosophy in general (as already found in Nāthamuni and, from a different point of view, Yāmuna), and Vedānta in particular (as explicit in Rāmānuja).
Veṅkaṭanātha’s contributions reconfigured his predecessor’s contributions by giving them a new meaning. This is true for Veṅkaṭanātha’s closer engagement with the philosophical debate (even with the opponents of Vedānta) for Veṅkaṭanātha’s reformulation of what is included in “Vedānta,” for Veṅkaṭanātha’s reexamination of some key issues in Rāmānuja’s thought, for the fixation of Rāmānuja as the key reference point for Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta, and for Veṅkaṭanātha’s redefinition of the supreme Deity (see Freschi 2015a, 2015c and 2016a and b).
The main philosophical outlines of Veṅkaṭanātha’s Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta are:
- the Vedāntic viewpoint
- the emphasis on Pūrva Mīmāṃsā and Uttara Mīmāṃsā (or Vedānta) as a single system
- the incorporation of Pāñcarātra
- the incorporation of the Āḻvārs’ theology
All these points are shared with one or the other among the predecessors of Veṅkaṭanātha: 1 and—to a much lesser extent—2 with Rāmānuja (see Freschi 2016a), 3 with Yāmuna, and 4 with the Āḻvārs, and perhaps also with some other predecessors. What remains distinctively unique of Veṅkaṭanātha is the smooth synthesis of these various elements and the usage of Mīmāṃsā as a synthesizing key. For instance, the aikaśāstrya “unity of the teaching” which Veṅkaṭanātha shows to hold between Pūrva and Uttara Mīmāṃsā offers the model for further extensions of the Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta system. Similarly, Veṅkaṭanātha uses the model of the Mīmāṃsā’s approach to the various Vedic śākhās “recensions” in order to deal with the different views highlighted in the various Pāñcarātra Saṃhitās.
The development of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta as a Vedāntic school becomes clear as one looks back at Veṅkaṭanātha’s predecessors, but it is important to note that what seems a posteriori to be a Vedāntic school would probably not have appeared such to the school’s contemporaries. In fact, Yāmuna’s relation to Vedānta is complex. He quoted from the Upaniṣads in his Ātmasiddhi “Establishment of the Self” (henceforth ĀtS), where he started by listing the Vedānta teachers he wanted to refute (including Bhartṛhari and Śaṅkara), so that one might think that he is keener to “purify” Vedānta than he is to “purify” Nyāya. At the same time, at least in the ĀtS (see Mesquita 1971, p. 4–13), Yāmuna accepted an anti-Vedāntic proof for the existence of God, namely the inference, whereas Pūrva and Uttara Mīmāṃsā would rather agree that God can only be known through the Sacred Texts. Moreover, Yāmuna’s Āgamaprāmāṇya “On the Validity of the [Vaiṣṇava] Sacred Texts” (henceforth ĀP) seems to have a completely different focus as it stresses the epistemic validity of the Pāñcarātra texts as works of a reliable author, namely God Himself. Rāmānuja is more straightforwardly part of a Vedāntic approach and this is probably also the reason why he has often been considered the “founder” of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta—a term which he and Yāmuna still ignore. The term seems to have indeed been used first by Rāmānuja’s commentator Sudarśanasūri, and it did not become established as the name of a school until much later, namely in “the latter half of the 16th century” (Varadachari 1962). As for Nāthamuni, his relation to Vedānta can only be presupposed from what we know of him through his successors, given that his works have been lost. Their titles focus, however, on Nyāya and Yoga (and not on Vedānta).
We know nothing about Nāthamuni’s relation to Pūrva Mīmāṃsā (Mīmāṃsā for short), but we do know that at least one trend within Vedānta (as testified by Śaṅkara’s commentary on the Brahmasūtra, see Freschi 2016a) claimed that the study of Pūrva Mīmāṃsā was not necessary and this trend possibly remained influential for a long time, given the energy Veṅkaṭanātha still needed to dedicate to the issue well after Rāmānuja’s nominal acceptance of Mīmāṃsā. In fact, as will be shown immediately below, Rāmānuja accepted Mīmāṃsā as a preliminary discipline of Vedānta, possibly in order to situate Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta well within the Vedic orthodoxy (readers will remember that the Mīmāṃsā focuses on the exegesis of a portion of the Veda) and as part of his polemics against Śaṅkara’s Advaita Vedānta. Nonetheless, it is only with Veṅkaṭanātha that this acceptance becomes an inclusion of Mīmāṃsā on the same level as Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta.
Before Rāmānuja, Yāmuna’s relation to Pūrva Mīmāṃsā is two-faced, insofar as Pūrva Mīmāṃsā authors seem to be his targeted objectors whom he wanted to convince of the legitimacy of the Pāñcarātra transmission but often by recurring to their arguments; additionally, he by and large adopted Nyāya strategies, such as the reference to God as the authoritative source of the epistemological validity of the Pāñcarātra or the use of inference to establish God’s existence (a procedure which is criticized by Veṅkaṭanātha in the chapter on God of the Nyāyasiddhāñjana, see Clooney 2000, p. 108-109). The situation changes perhaps during Yāmuna’s own life, certainly with Rāmānuja, who steered in the direction of Vedānta and, thus, came closer to the Pūrva Mīmāṃsā. He came so close that he programmatically stated at the beginning of his commentary on the Brahmasūtra that not only the Brāhmaṇa part of the Veda (the one Mīmāṃsā authors focus on) needs to be studied, but that its study is part of the same teaching as the Vedānta. Veṅkaṭanātha took advantage of this remark and spelt out its deep implications: he could thus state that the whole of Pūrva Mīmāṃsā and the whole of Uttara Mīmāṃsā constitute a single teaching (ekaśāstra). To that he added a distinctive role to the Saṅkarṣakāṇḍa, a less well-known Mīmāṃsā text which had little fortune within Pūrva Mīmāṃsā but which rose with Veṅkaṭanātha (or perhaps already in the lost predecessors who inspired him) to the role of a bridge between the Pūrva and Uttara Mīmāṃsā since it is interpreted as focusing on veneration and on God.
As for the incorporation of Pāñcarātra and of the Āḻvārs (see Nos. 3 and 4 above), Veṅkaṭanātha used the same model he elaborated to establish 2 in order to incorporate these further elements into the system. He reached back to the Pāñcarātra, which had been defended by Yāmuna but rather neglected by Rāmānuja, and, more strikingly, to the hymns of the Āḻvārs. It is in this sense more than telling that Veṅkaṭanātha (as the first among the early teachers of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta) decided to write in Tamil and to write theology in poetical form, as the Āḻvārs had done.
As is evident from the previous sections, Veṅkaṭanātha attempted to bring different voices together in a synthesis without excluding any of them. He examined and selected texts and ideas coming from different backgrounds and reshaped Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta in a distinctive way, one which the 21st reader recognizes at first sight but only because he or she is following Veṅkaṭanātha’s interpretation of the school.
One of the guiding elements of Veṅkaṭanātha’s synthesis was his pro-Vedic attitude, which translated into a pro-Pūrva Mīmāṃsā bias and the attempt to moderate the anti-Vedic tendencies within Śrī Vaiṣṇavism. For instance, Veṅkaṭanātha (at least in his Sanskrit works) did not espouse the Ekāntin current within Śrīvaiṣṇavism (which contended that a Pāñcarātra text, the Ekāyanaveda, was the Ur-Veda, from which all Vedas originated), and his defense of the Pāñcarātra was based predominantly on the fact that they are rather based on the Vedas, like any other smṛti (a group of texts deriving their validity from the fact that they—allegedly—merely re-elaborate Vedic contents) (see Seśvaramīmāṃsā ad PMS 1.1.2), apart from their independent value as autonomous revelation of God.
This pro-Vedic attitude is probably the reason for Veṅkaṭanātha’s personal devotion to Hayagrīva. Before Veṅkaṭanātha, Hayagrīva was considered only a minor avatāra of Viṣṇu, and Veṅkaṭanātha was the first to dedicate to him a stotra “eulogy.” The reason for his choice of Hayagrīva as his favourite form of God is probably Hayagrīva’s link with intellectuality and with the Vedas, as well as being a form of Viṣṇu. In this sense, Hayagrīva was a perfect symbol of the union of Pūrva Mīmāṃsā Vedism and devotionalism.
Veṅkaṭanātha’s figure played a major role also in the so-called split between the so-called Vaṭakalai and Teṅkalai currents within Śrī Vaiṣṇavism even though these two currents became known by these names only much later than Veṅkaṭanātha. In the 21st century, the two currents are distinguished by sociological as well as doctrinal elements, for example, the doctrine of an Ekāyanaveda and the emphasis on God’s Grace vs. free will in the Teṅkalai and vice versa in the Vaṭakalai. Although, as will be shown below, Veṅkaṭanātha tried to find a synthesis within the latter tension, the Vaṭakalai current retrospectively identified Veṅkaṭanātha as its founder and adopted en bloc his theology and philosophy. This also means that the Vaṭakalai identified itself through elements that were typical of Veṅkaṭanātha’s philosophical and religious attitude, even those that had not been necessarily prosecuted after him. The desire to follow Veṅkaṭanātha in each possible aspect is probably the key reason for why Vaṭakalai authors added a short praise to Hayagrīva at the beginning of their works instead of the customary praise to Gaṇeśa (the elephant-God of learning praised at the beginning of each work). Out of the same set of reasons, in 1676 a temple was dedicated to Hayagrīva and is currently run by Vaṭakalais.
Veṅkaṭanātha more or less adopted the Pūrva Mīmāṃsā epistemology but with some differences which will be highlighted below. By contrast, his attitude towards the antagonist of Mīmāṃsā (including also the Uttara Mīmāṃsā, that is, Vedānta), namely Nyāya, is much more critical:
Therefore, according to the rule of the lion hidden in the forest, we will follow the Veda supported by the logical rules (nyāya) according to reality, and the Nyāya when it agrees with the Veda. By contrast, we will not follow the pure Nyāya.
ataḥ siṃhavanaguptinyāyena yathāvasthitanyāyānugṛhītaṃ vedaṃ vedānumataṃ ca nyāyam anusarāmaḥ, na punar nyāyamātram (Nyāyapariśuddhi 1.1.2)
Concerning sense perception, one sensitive topic is that of yogipratyakṣa ‘intellectual intuition,’ a specific kind of direct perception in which the intellect acts as direct access to knowledge, as if it were a sense faculty. Philosophers of the Nyāya and of the Buddhist Pramāṇavāda schools uphold this kind of direct perception as belonging to exceptional individuals. Through intellectual intuition, exceptional individuals (like the Buddha, a ṛṣi “mythical seer,” or God) could have direct access to dharma, thus relativizing the uniqueness of the Vedic Sacred Texts. To support the possibility of yogipratyakṣa is, thus, consistent with the Nyāya’s discussion of the validity of the Veda as dependent on its author and on the Pramāṇavāda view that the Buddha could access dharma. Veṅkaṭanātha, conversely, is in a difficult situation, insofar as he wants to defend both the uniqueness of the Vedas (see above, section 3, for his Vedism) and the authority of God. In order to reconcile these two positions, Veṅkaṭanātha in his SM ad 1.1.4 (the PMS aphorism on direct perception) rigidly negates the possibility for human beings to attain intellectual intuition, so that no single human being could ever question the validity of the Vedas. Nonetheless, consistently with his theism, Veṅkaṭanātha does not negate the possibility for God alone to see the dharma. This entails that it would be theoretically possible for God to reveal a new Sacred Text. He will, nonetheless, not do it because the Veda is already His will made into words, and God does not change whimsically what He wants.
As for the Pāñcarātras, they enjoy the same validity of smṛti texts insofar as they derive their validity from the fact of stating what is already present in the Veda, either in a branch of it that is available, or in a currently lost one.
What, then, is God’s relationship to the Veda and to the world? The Veda is said to be the direct manifestation of His will but not His revelation. The latter option is refused because it would make the Veda subordinate to God’s will and liable to be overcome by a later and possibly more complete revelation. Thus, the Veda is a crystallization of God’s permanent free will. Similarly, the world—including all human beings inhabiting it—is described as God’s body in the sense that God can experience through it, insofar as each body pertains to something conscious (cetana) (Nyāyasiddhāñjana, Vīrarāghavācārya 1976, pp. 162–163).
The claim that the world is the body of God also puts Veṅkaṭanātha’s interest in ontology in the right perspective, which is always subordinate to his interest in theology. Ontology is not conceived as the study of what exists independently from God nor as the study of inert matter—since such inert matter is inconceivable in the Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta worldview.
A further topic that is closely linked to this one regards the definition of body in general in the work of Veṅkaṭanātha. Classical Indian philosophers tend to define śarīra “body” as a tool for experience (bhogasādhana). Thus, most philosophers state that plants only seem to have bodies because of our anthropomorphic tendencies, which make us believe that they function like us, whereas in fact plants cannot experience (Freschi 2015b). By contrast, Veṅkaṭanātha in the Nyāyasiddhāñjana defines śarīra in the following way:
Therefore, this śarīra is of two types: permanent and impermanent. Among them, permanent are God’s body—consisting of auspicious substrates, namely substances with the three qualities, time and [individual] souls—and the intrinsic form of Garuḍa, the snake (Ananta), etc. belonging to permanent [deities]. The impermanent [body] is of two types: not made of karman ‘past actions’ and made of karman. The first one has the form of the primordial natura naturans, etc. of God. In the same way, [an impermanent body not made of karman] assumes this or that form according to the wish of the liberated souls, such as Ananta and Garuḍa. Also the [body] made of karman is of two types: made out of one’s decision and karman and made out of karman alone. The first type belongs to great [souls] like the Muni Saubhari. The other one belongs to the other low [souls] (i.e., all normal human beings and the other conscious living beings). Moreover, the body in general is of two types, movable and unmovable. Wood (i.e., trees) and other [plants] and rocks and other [minerals] are unmovable. […] That there are souls also in rock-bodies is established through stories such as that of Ahalyā. (Nyāyasiddhāñjana, Vīrarāghavācārya 1976, p. 174–176, my translation)
Note that the inclusion of plants and rocks within what is a body could have to do with the fact that the whole world is the body of God and that consequently everything is a śarīra. The first commentary explains the “etc.” after natura naturans as referring to God’s manifestations, called vyūhas, which are a typical mark of Pāñcarātra theology throughout its history (see Schmücker 2007 for their relevance in Veṅkaṭanātha). The various forms assumed by God(s) are the impermanent ones He can assume on top of His permanent one at wish, not depending on karman. Last, the hint at Ahalyā refers to a story told: for example, in the Sanskrit epic Rāmāyaṇa, Ahalyā was transformed into a stone and then back into a woman, a fact which proves that a soul was present also while she was a stone.
The definition of God’s body entails that God is conscious and has as His body, apart from other substances and time, also the conscious souls of living beings. How can free will be possible under these circumstances? According to Veṅkaṭanātha’s Sanskrit works, human free will is granted only insofar as God Himself actively wants humans to be free (see Freschi 2015c). The possibility of human free will is ontologically plausible insofar as Veṅkaṭanātha does not consider karman an all-encompassing causal force, so that its suspension would transgress the normal causation. Rather, karman only bounds low-level souls whereas God and liberated souls do not undergo the karman’s laws and their free will is unrestrained.
In the Nyāyapariśuddhi, Veṅkaṭanātha discussed some fundamental ontological topics in order to distinguish his positions from the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika position. The Nyāyasūtra proposes a fundamental division of realities into dravya “substances,” guṇa “qualities,” and karman “actions” (for a full list, including further categories included later, see Franco and Preisendanz 1998), with the former as the substrate of the latter two. This leads to two difficulties for Veṅkaṭanātha’s agenda. On the one hand, the radical distinction between substance and attribute means that Nyāya authors imagine liberation to be the end of the connection of the ātman “self” (of each individual being) to all attributes, from sufferance to consciousness. By contrast, Veṅkaṭanātha would never accept consciousness to be separated from the individual soul and even less from God, who, being a substance, would also (from the point of view of Nyāya) be at least in principle separable from His attributes, including from consciousness. The other difficulty regards the theology of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta. Since the beginnings of Pāñcarātra, one of its chief doctrines has been that of the manifestations (vibhūti) of Viṣṇu, which are dependent on Him but co-eternal with Him, and, in this sense, are unexplainable according to the division of substances into eternal and transient.
To that, Veṅkaṭanātha opposed more than one classification, so that it is clear that Veṅkaṭanātha’s main point is addressing the above-mentioned problems with the Nyāya ontology rather than establishing in full detail a distinct ontology.
The first proposal found in the Nyāyapariśuddhi (1.1.2) is based on the idea of a two-fold division into dravya “substance” and adravya “non-substance” where it defines substance as the “substrate of possible accidental characteristics” (āgantukadharmāśraya). The attribute “accidental” hints at the fact that characteristics are ephemeral, whereas substances are permanent (nitya). The sub-classifications go further as depicted in Figure 1, with substance being divided into inert and alive. The former category includes the prakṛti “natura naturans” of Sāṅkhya and time, which is thus no longer a quality (guṇa) as in Nyāya. The latter category (alive substance) includes separate and heteronomous substances. Within the former are individual souls and God, distinguished insofar as individual souls are conscious but dependent on someone else (namely God), whereas God is autonomous (paratantracetano jīvaḥ, svatantra iśvaraḥ). The heteronomous category includes cognition as essential to God (see the paragraph immediately above) and the permanent manifestations of God, which are logically dependent on Him but have not been created by Him. Thus, there are ultimately six types of substances: the prakṛti, time, God, individual souls, God’s knowledge, and God’s manifestations.
The final result is an ontology that shares several elements with the other Vedāntic schools, such as the embedment of the Sāṅkhya structure whereas the genealogy of the ajaḍa part of the classification appears to be distinctive. It is opposed to the Vedāntic pariṇāmavāda “theory of the evolution [of the Absolute (brahman) into the world],”—according to which the brahman is the material cause of the world—and also to the māyāvāda “theory of the illusory [evolution of the brahman in the world]”—according to which only the brahman exists and everything else is just an illusion. Veṅkaṭanātha’s ontology, in this sense, is not monistic insofar as it has God as its pivotal point but not as its only component:
For, the other things rely only on the brahman, which is self-established (itareṣāṃ svaniṣṭhabrahmaikaniṣṭhatvāt, Nyāyapariśuddhi 1.1.2).
The ajaḍa part of the classification is, instead, directly connected to Yāmuna’s stress on dharmabhūtajñāna “knowledge as an inseparable characteristic [of God]” (see Mesquita 1971 and Neevel 1977) and to Veṅkaṭanātha’s dissociation of the personal aspect of God from any material ontology. Noteworthy in this connection is the fact that God’s vibhūtis “manifestations” are substances but devoid of any materiality. It is in this light that the concept of God’s body (see above) assumes its significance.
Furthermore it is noteworthy that God’s essential relation to the world should not be understood as that of a substance and its qualities, since if it were so the souls and so forth as a quality of the Lord, could not be bearers of further qualities (since Veṅkaṭanātha shares the notion common to all classical Indian philosophers that there are no qualities of qualities). Instead, God is linked to the material world through the prakṛti and to the individual souls insofar as He is their inner ruler.
Qualities are of two kinds. Ordinary qualities (avasthā) are defined by Veṅkaṭanātha as āgantuko ’pṛthaksiddho dharmo ’vasthā “A quality is an accidental characteristic which cannot be established separately [of the substance in which it inheres]” (NSi 3 ad v. 77, Vīrarāghavācārya 1976, p. 357). In the same text he lists the ordinary qualities, starting with the three guṇas of the prakṛti (sattva, rajas, tamas) [see Prakṛti and the three guṇa-s], then the five sensibilia (rūpa, rasa, gandha, sparśa, śabda), saṃyoga “contact,” śakti “power,” and then gurutva “heaviness,”, dravatva “fluidity,” snehatva “viscidity,” saṃskāra “(mnestic) trace,” saṅkhyā “number,” pariṇāma “measure,” pṛthaktva “distinction,” vibhāga “separation,” aparatva “distance,” paratva “proximity,” karman “action,” sāmānya “universal,” sādṛśya “similarity,” viśeṣa “individuality,” samavāya “inherence,” abhāva “absence,” and vaiśiṣṭya “qualified-ness” (NSi, beginning of 3, Vīrarāghavācārya 1976, p. 443). Noteworthy here is that out of these twenty-seven qualities, sixteen are shared with the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika school (the five sensibilia, saṅkhyā, parimāṇa, pṛthaktva, paratva, aparatva, saṃyoga, vibhāga, gurutva, snehatva, dravatva, saṃskāra), and the three guṇas derive from the Sāṅkhya school. Further, four qualities offer a new way to systematize distinct categories of the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika (karman, sāmānya, viśeṣa, samavāya). Two are of Mīmāṃsā origin (śakti and abhāva). Last, sādṛśya and, even more clearly, vaiśiṣṭya are most probably connected with specific theologemes of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta, which indeed presents itself as upholding a qualified monism, that is, the possibility that a single God really exists exactly insofar as He is ultimately qualified by all His qualifications.
Apart from the accidental qualities, there are the svarūpanirūpakadharmas “qualities which define the own nature [of a given substance].” These allow Veṅkaṭanātha to explain that the six substances mentioned above (prakṛti, time, God, individual souls, God’s knowledge, and God’s manifestations) are nitya “permanent” although they can only be grasped through a quality (which would amount to a paradox if the qualities were only accidental and ephemeral).
Further discussions about ontologically relevant topics are not altogether absent in Veṅkaṭanātha’s texts. On the contrary, they are largely dealt with whenever the topic has some impact on his theology.
Veṅkaṭanātha was fiercely adverse to the Buddhist theory of momentariness ("Whatever exists is momentary,” compare Ratnakīrti, Kṣaṇabhaṅgasiddhi, third sentence), opposing it through the Mīmāṃsā-developed argument of recognition (pratyabhijñā), that is we do recognize things, which means that they did not pass away (Nyāyasiddhāñjana ad 6, Vīrarāghavācārya 1976, p. 16–37). The topic is of central theological significance because if everything were momentary, then there would be neither a lasting self nor a lasting God.
A topic at the centre of centuries of Nyāya-Mīmāṃsā controversies is the status of śabda “word.” Nyāya authors understand it as synonymous with the audible sounds composing the phones and thus declare it impermanent. Mīmāṃsā authors, by contrast, understand śabda as the linguistic unit capable of communicating a meaning and only manifested by phones but existing independently of them. In this sense, śabda is nitya “permanent.” Veṅkaṭanātha dealt with the issue in slightly modified terms according to whether he is speaking from a Nyāya or a Mīmāṃsā perspective. Still, even in the former case (Nyāyapariśuddhi, 1.1.3) he looked for a solution to the controversy by saying that the phones composing the Veda recur (āvṛt-) at each new creation of the world and that in this sense they are permanent. In the background is the Mīmāṃsā definition of permanence as two types, kūṭastha- and pravāhanityatva. The first is the unchanging permanence of (for example ether) whereas the second is the permanence-in-flux of (for example, a stream water—if this can be assumed to be permanent), the single elements of which are always renewed.
This same doctrine of recurrence is present also in Veṅkaṭanātha’s account of cosmology. According to him, God has not created the world e nihilo. By contrast, since the world is God’s body, it is necessarily co-eternal with Him. The idea of recurrent destructions (vilaya) and recreations is dealt with by saying that even at the state of destruction everything is present in subtle (sūkṣma) form and neither the karman of the individuals nor the Veda nor any other aspect of the world is lost. Given the fact that the creation e nihilo appears to be chiefly a Judaeo-Christian concept, Veṅkaṭanātha did not need to address the possible objection that a body coeternal with God might be a limitation to His omnipotence (on Time and God see also Schmücker’s work).
Among the volumes dedicated to Śrī Vaiṣṇavism, Raman (2007) focuses on the Vaṭakalai-Teṅkalai debate (see above, section 3) and dedicates several pages to Veṅkaṭanātha. Mumme (1988) focuses on the same debate from the point of view of its two champions, that is,, Maṇavāḷamāmuni and Veṅkaṭanātha.
Among the works focusing on Veṅkaṭanātha, after the pioneer study Tātāchārya (1911), Satyavrata Singh’s 1958 study is noteworthy. Notwithstanding its faults (for example, partisanship), this study is of particular significance since it discusses the syncretism of Nyāya and Vedānta by Veṅkaṭanātha and, perhaps even more importantly, it analyzes in depth (p. 106‒136) the sources of Veṅkaṭanātha, especially within Vaiṣṇavism.
As part of the same generation of scholars, K.C. Varadachari (respectfully mentioned in Singh 1958, p. xvii) has been of fundamental importance to the studies on Śrīvaiṣṇavism. He edited, translated and studied several works by Veṅkaṭanātha (among other studies, one might mention Varadachari 1943 and Varadachari 1969). His Varadachari (1940) focuses on Veṅkaṭanātha’s only commentary on an Upaniṣad, the Īśāvāsyopaniṣad. His work tries to join respect towards Veṅkaṭanātha’s thought with a philosophical insight that makes the arguments clear also for a contemporary reader. V. Varadachari further worked on the relationship between Pāñcarātras and Vaiṣṇavism and on Veṅkaṭanātha (see Varadachari 1982 and Varadachari 1983). A “friend" of K.C. Varadachari (as he calls himself in his preface to Varadachari 1943), P.N. Srinivasachari is the author of Srinivasachari (1946), which has set some of the fundamental parameters of interpretation for Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta (defined as “a philosophy of religion”). The text very often refers to Veṅkaṭanātha.
Born in 1918, S.M. Srinivasa Chari has written (apart from several volumes on South Indian Vaiṣṇavism) several insightful volumes, each on a distinct work of Veṅkaṭanātha, examined from a philosophical and theological perspective (Srinivasa Chari 1961; Srinivasa Chari 1988; Srinivasa Chari 2007; and Srinivasa Chari 2011). Unlike Carman, Hardy, and Hopkins (about whom see a few lines below), Srinivasa Chari programmatically focuses on philosophical topics (see Srinivasa Chari 1988, pp. ix-x):
The emphasis placed by Rāmānuja on the acceptance of saviśeṣa Brahman or the personal Supreme Being endowed with attributes […] has led some scholars to feel that Rāmānuja’s system is essentially theological. […] But the Viśiṣṭādvaita system has both a philosophical as well as theological aspect, and the former is of greater importance for the reason that it gives meaning and value to the latter. […] The main objective of this task [i.e., Srinivasa Chari 1988, E.F.] is to remove a prevalent impression that Viśiṣṭādvaita is primarily theology and establish that it is essentially a system of philosophy. It is a system which has been developed, apart from an appeal to scriptural authority, on the basis of well-formulated epistemological, ontological, cosmological and religious doctrines. (Srinivasa Chari 1988, pp. ix-x)
Srinivasa Chari also explains why key works of Viśiṣṭādvaita have hardly been studied nor have been translated yet despite the system being of major significance in India, well-known and studied:
The metaphysical doctrines, developed by the Viśiṣṭādvaitin on the basis of which the system is founded, cannot be understood easily unless one has made a deep study of ancient treatises in the original. Next to the Śrī-bhāṣya of Rāmānuja, there are two outstanding philosophical classics, Tattva-muktā-kalāpa and Śatadūṣaṇī, written by Veṅkaṭanātha. A study of these texts is an essential prerequisite for getting a deeper insight into Viśiṣṭādvaita tenets. But […] these are highly technical works written in terse Sanskrit and presented in the classical style replete with subtleties of dialectical arguments. The […] texts have therefore remained beyond the approach of ordinary scholars and modern students of philosophy. […] Even among the existing scholars, brought up strictly in the traditional disciplines of scholarship, there are very few who can claim to have studied them fully. (Srinivasa Chari 1988, pp. ix-x)
The same argument could be repeated in regard to the epistemology of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta and the SM would play a major role in this case, possibly highlighting the fact that (against the first quote above) also the appeal to the authority of Sacred Texts can become part of one’s philosophical enterprise and be epistemologically well-grounded.
Three scholars working in close connection or linked as teacher and student, John Carman, Friedhelm Hardy and Steven Paul Hopkins have dedicated insightful and thought-provoking essays to Veṅkaṭanātha and to Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta. Most of these studies are characterized by an unusual attention to the contemporary Śrīvaiṣṇava tradition and try to be sensitive to an insider view of their subject (this attitude is particularly evident in Hardy 1977). Hardy and Hopkins focus on the artistic production of Veṅkaṭanātha and show how it is of intrinsic aesthetic value and of deep philosophical significance. They also show how the two aspects are deeply connected in Veṅkaṭanātha’s theology. Selected examples of the production of these scholars are Carman (1981), on Rāmānuja but explicitly relying on Veṅkaṭanātha’s commentaries; Hardy (1979), on Veṅkaṭanātha’s Dehalīśastuti; and Hopkins (2007) on Veṅkaṭanātha’s devotional songs.
Also dedicated to the philosophical works of Veṅkaṭanātha is Narayanan (2008), which focuses on the Nyāyapariśuddhi, one of Veṅkaṭanātha’s most important works dedicated to epistemology and with Nyāya and Mīmāṃsā authors as chief discussants. Narayanan (2008) closely follows the order of Veṅkaṭanātha’s work and is in this sense precious for closer studies of this text.
Toshihiro Mikami (Mikami n.y.) translated Nyāyasiddhāñjana, but unfortunately this scholar died before being able to write a complete study on it. Clooney (2000) analyzes a chapter of the same text, the one on rational theology (Īśvarapariccheda).
Furthermore, several studies have been dedicated to Veṅkaṭanātha in particular, such as the short and hagiographical Narasimhachary (2004) and Clooney (2008) on his theology of devotion attitude. Other studies focus on Veṅkaṭanātha’s Tamil works and will not be analysed here (apart from Hopkins’ studies mentioned above, Colas 2002 is also noteworthy).
Last, the IKGA in Vienna has hosted and still hosts a group of scholars who started working intensively on Veṅkaṭanātha after having focused on Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta and on the Pāñcarātra tradition: Gerhard Oberhammer, Sylvia Stark, Marion Rastelli, and Marcus Schmücker. Particularly noteworthy in this connection is the series dedicated to the “Rāmānuja school” and edited by Oberhammer together with Rastelli and Schmücker, which constitutes a regular platform for scholars working on this topic. Gerhard Oberhammer’s list of works on this topic is impressive (1971, 1998, 2000, 2002, 2004, 2006, 2007, 2008) as is the zeal with which he created an international network of scholars working on Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta and enabled them to discuss with scholars researching on similar topics within parallel religious traditions (Oberhammer and Rastelli 2002; Oberhammer and Schmücker 2003; Oberhammer and Rastelli 2007; Oberhammer and Schmücker 2008). Schmücker (2009), dedicated to the epistemology of sense and super-sensuous perception (yogipratyakṣa), discusses Veṅkaṭanātha’s views on epistemology. Schmücker (2011) focuses on subjectivity in Veṅkaṭanātha and shows how Veṅkaṭanātha equates the ātman with the aham “I,” most probably (and this is not Schmücker’s conclusion) following Kumārila’s idea that one might prove the existence of an ātman through one’s cognition of an “I” (ahampratyaya) (on ahampratyaya in Kumārila, see Watson 2006, chapter 3 and more briefly Freschi 2014).
ĀtS Ātmasiddhi by Yāmuna
ĀP Āgamaprāmāṇya by Yāmuna
BṬ Bṛhaṭṭīkā by Kumārila Bhaṭṭa
NK Nyāyakuliśa by Veṅkaṭanātha
NP Nyāyapariśuddhi by Veṅkaṭanātha
NSi Nyāyasiddhāñjana by Veṅkaṭanātha
PMS Pūrva Mīmāṃsā Sūtra
ŚrīBh Śrībhāṣya by Rāmānuja
ŚV Ślokavārttika by Kumārila Bhaṭṭa
SM Seśvaramīmāṃsā by Veṅkaṭanātha
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