Cornelius Castoriadis (1922—1997)

Cornelius Castoriadis was an important intellectual figure in France for many decades, beginning in the late-1940s. Trained in philosophy, Castoriadis also worked as a practicing economist and psychologist while authoring over twenty major works and numerous articles spanning many traditional philosophical subjects, including politics, economics, psychology, anthropology, and ontology. His oeuvre can be understood broadly as a reflection on the concept of creativity and its implications in various fields. Perhaps most importantly he warned of the dangerous political and ethical consequences of a contemporary world that has lost sight of autonomy, i.e. of the need to set limits or laws for oneself.

Influenced by his understanding and criticism of traditional philosophical figures such as the Ancient Greeks, German Idealists, Marx, and Heidegger, Castoriadis was also influenced by thinkers as diverse as Sigmund Freud, Max Weber, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, and Georg Cantor. He engaged in dynamic intellectual relationships with his fellow members of Socialisme ou Barbarie (including Claude Lefort and Jean-François Lyotard, among others) and later in life with leading figures in mathematics, biology, and other fields. He is remembered largely for his initial support for and subsequent break from Marxism, for his call for Western thought to embrace the reality of creativity, and finally for his defense of an ethics and politics based on “lucid” deliberation and social and individual autonomy. For Castoriadis the central question of philosophy and the source of philosophy’s importance is its capacity to break through society’s closure and ask what the relevant questions for humans ought to be.

Table of Contents

  1. Beginnings
    1. Youth in Greece and Arrival in France
    2. The Concept of Self-Management in the Early Writings
  2. The Break From Marxism
  3. Theoretical Developments
    1. The Creative Imagination
      1. Philosophical Background: Aristotle
      2. Philosophical Background: Kant
      3. Philosophical Background: Post-Kantian Philosophy
      4. Creation ex Nihilo
    2. Related Theoretical Concepts
      1. The Monad and the Social-Historical
      2. The Living Being and Its Proper World
      3. Magmas and Ensembles
  4. The Project of Autonomy
    1. Heteronomy and Autonomy
    2. Democracy in Ancient Greece
    3. Public, Private, and Agora
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Book-Length Collections of Castoriadis’s Work in English
    2. Secondary Readings (French and English)

1. Beginnings

a. Youth in Greece and Arrival in France

Cornelius Castoriadis was born to an ethnically Greek family living in Constantinople (Istanbul) in 1922. The year was one of the most tumultuous in modern Greek history. Following the First World War, lands granted to Greece at the expense of the Ottoman Empire by the victorious Entente powers were being claimed militarily by Turkish nationalists. As the defeat of the Greek army in the formerly Ottoman territories seemed imminent, Castoriadis’s father relocated the family to Athens, the home of Castoriadis’s mother, when Cornelius was a few months old. As a result, Castoriadis spent his youth in Athens where he discovered philosophy at the age of twelve or thirteen. He engaged in communist youth activities while in high school and later studied economics, political science, and law while resisting the Axis occupation of Greece during Second World War. His Trotskyist opposition group distanced itself from the pro-Stalinist opposition. During this time Castoriadis published his first academic writings on Max Weber’s methodology and led seminars on philosophers including Kant and Hegel. In 1945 he won and accepted a scholarship to write a philosophy dissertation at the Sorbonne in Paris, thus starting a wholly new stage in his life.

In Paris Castoriadis planned to write his dissertation on the impossibility of a closed, rationalist philosophical system. This plan took second stage, however, to his critical-political activities. He became active in the French branch of the Trotskyist party though he quickly criticized the group’s failure to take a stronger stance against Stalin. By 1947 Castoriadis developed his own criticism of the Soviets who, he argued, had only created a new brand of exploitation in Russia, i.e. bureaucratic exploitation (Castoriadis Reader 3). Discovering he shared similar views with recent acquaintance Claude Lefort, the two began to distance themselves altogether from the Trotskyist goal of party rule.

Castoriadis began two major vocations in 1948. First, he and Lefort co-founded the journal and political group Socialisme ou Barbarie (Socialism or Barbarism). They focused on criticizing both Soviet bureaucracy and capitalism and on developing ideas for other possible organizations of society. The group’s founding statement expressed an interest in a non-dogmatic yet still Marxist social critique. On the one hand, the traditional questions Marx raised about workers and social organization would remain important, while on the other hand any commitment to specific Marxist positions would remain conditional. Despite internal dissent and membership changes, the group remained partially intact from 1948 to 1966 with a peak involvement of a few dozen members and approximately 1,000 copies produced per issue of the group’s journal. Castoriadis’s leadership and writings helped establish him as an important figure in the political-intellectual field in Paris.

Second, in 1948 Castoriadis began working as an economist with the international Organization for European Economic Cooperation (OEEC). He would remain there until 1970, analyzing the short- and medium-term economic status of developed nations. His work with OEEC not only allowed him an income and the possibility of remaining in France until his eventual nationalization, but it also permitted him great insights into the economies of capitalist countries and into the functioning of a major bureaucratic organization. Following his employment with OEEC, Castoriadis worked during the 1970s as a psychoanalyst. He finally received an academic position at the École des Hautes Études en Sciences Sociales (EHESS) in Paris in 1979. He remained with EHESS until his death following heart surgery in 1997.

b. The Concept of Self-Management in the Early Writings

Reflecting on the Socialisme ou Barbarie group, Castoriadis considered one of his and the journal’s most important contributions to be the concept of workers’ self-management (Castoriadis Reader 1-17). While in his later writings the concept would develop into a theory of autonomy standing independently of the Marxist framework, during the journal years the theory of self-management served as a modification of or an alternative to Marx’s theory of class struggle.

In 1955's “On the Content of Socialism” (Castoriadis Reader 40-105) Castoriadis, writing under a pseudonym in order to protect himself from deportation as an alien, defined the central conflict of society not in terms of the classical dichotomy between owners and workers but in terms of a conflict between directors and executants. (Notably, this distinction coincides with Aristotle’s definitions of master and slave in the Politics and with philosopher Simone Weil’s economic analysis from as early as 1933). Contemporary society, he argued, is split between a stratum of managers who direct workers, and a stratum of workers obedient to managers. Workers pass real-world information up to the managers; but they must then carry out the often nonsensical orders that are passed back down. For Castoriadis, in both Western and so-called "communist" countries (i.e. countries Castoriadis would have said embodied only a semblance of communism) managers are often uninformed about subordinate tasks, know little about interrelated fields of work, and nevertheless they still direct the immediate production process. Such a managerial apparatus, argued Castoriadis, leads to inefficiency, waste, and unnecessary conflict between aloof managers and servile workers.

The domination of society by the managerial apparatus can only be surpassed, argued Castoriadis, when workers take responsibility for organizing themselves. Workers must assume effective management of their own work situation in “full knowledge of the relevant facts.” This emphasis on the importance of knowledge implies that individuals should work cooperatively. They should form workers councils consisting of conditionally elected members. Those members, in a strict reversal of the bureaucratic managerial model, should convene frequently not in order to make decisions for workers but in order to express the decisions of the workers. They should then convey important information back to the workers for the purpose of helping workers make their own decisions. In this way, the workers’ council is not a managerial stratum. Rather, it helps convey information to workers for their purposes. While Castoriadis did support a centralized institution, or assembly of councils, capable of making rapid decisions when needed, such decisions, he argued, would be at all times reversible by the workers and their councils.

In the end, Castoriadis contrasted self-management with individualistic, negative libertarian, or anarchic ideals, i.e. the ideals idolized in capitalist countries. Such countries reject the role of workers councils but they then become heavily bureaucratized anyway. Castoriadis also contrasted self-management with the explicitly centralized, exploitative bureaucracies of the so-called communist countries. In both cases what currently blocks the emergence of self-management is the division between directors and executants. While some specialization of labor will always be necessary, what is damaging today is specifically the dominance of a class that is devoted only to the management of other people’s work.

2. The Break From Marxism

Like many anti-totalitarian leftists, Castoriadis initially tried to divorce the bad features of twentieth-century communism from the “true meaning” of Marxism. However, by the mid- to late-1950s he came to argue that a profound critique of existing communist countries also requires a critique of Marx’s philosophy. Capitalism, Marxism, and the Soviet experiment were all based in a common set of presuppositions.

Castoriadis’s analysis of the institutional structure of the Soviet Union, collected later in La Société Bureaucratique (Bureaucratic Society), suggested that the Soviet Union is dominated by a militaristic, bureaucratic institution that Castoriadis called total bureaucratic capitalism (TBC). This name implies that the principle of the social order in the USSR is truly an analogue—albeit a more centralized analogue—of the Western capitalist order, which Castoriadis called fragmented bureaucratic capitalism (FBC) (Castoriadis Reader 218-238). Castoriadis then argued that both TBC and FBC were rooted in a common “social imaginary.”

This social imaginary, common to TBC and FBC, was expressed as a desire for rational mastery over self and nature. Both capitalist thought and Marx assumed that capital has enormous, even total power over humanity. This assumption led to an excessive desire on both sides to control its supposed force. For this reason Marx’s followers aimed to create a totalitarian bureaucratic system that could theoretically gain “mastery over the master” (World in Fragments 32-43). Yet, according to Castoriadis’s analysis, the exploitation found in Western society was not solved by this system of control; it was instead rendered more total and crushing. The managerial, bureaucratic class became a unified, oppressive force in itself, pursuing its own interests against the people. Hence, Castoriadis concluded that the eventual efforts of the communist countries to gain rational mastery were not truly separable from Marx’s own, earlier philosophy. That philosophy itself had emerged from the common social imaginary that FBC and TBC share, namely the desire to gain total control of nature and history through controlling capital.

Castoriadis also developed more specific criticisms of Marx’s economic assumptions. Indeed, as early as 1959’s “Modern Capitalism and Revolution” (Political and Social Writings II 226-315) he attacked Marx’s method of treating workers as though they were cogs in the machine of capitalism. Marx, he argued, failed to consider the importance of the unplanned, contingent actions of the proletariat, actions powerful enough to save a company from mismanagement or to lead it into disaster. In other words, Marx’s analysis of capitalism was too deterministic. The creative decisions of workers are not strictly subject to capital’s laws. Rather, workers sustain or destroy capitalism itself through their own actions. As such, workers' actions—singularly and collectively—can lead to changes in the very laws of the system.

As a result, Castoriadis found that Marx’s view of history was based in flawed assumptions. The actions of workers cannot be sufficiently explained by supposed laws of historical dialectic. Workers themselves could determine the law of history rather than being merely determined by history's law. As such, the classical theory of capitalism’s inevitable collapse into socialism and then communism could not be sustained. While Castoriadis agreed with Marx (and praised Marx’s far-reaching analysis) that the history of capitalism is ridden with crises and so-called contradictions, he disagreed with Marx’s deduction of future historical developments from out of those events. The outcome of a capitalist crisis is in truth determined by how individuals and society take up those crises, not by any necessary, internal self-development of capitalism “itself.”

From out of this engagement with Marx, Castoriadis began to develop his own view of how autonomous society could arise. Autonomous society, he argued, is a creation of the singular individual and the collectivity. It cannot be sufficiently deduced or developed from tendencies, potentialities, impossibilities, or necessities contained within the current system. Whereas Marx interpreted the workers’ struggles for autonomy as part of the rational self-development of capitalism itself, Castoriadis, by contrast, emphasized the real contingency of the historical successes of democratic-emancipatory struggles. These struggles had preceded capitalism, were subdued within capitalism and the modern era of rational mastery, and are still present but also largely subdued in the contemporary age of FBC and TBC (World in Fragments 32-43). Castoriadis’s break with Marx is therefore his break with the desire to gain mastery over the supposedly all-powerful forces controlling humanity and history.

3. Theoretical Developments

Between the end of Socialisme ou Barbarie in 1966 and the publication of L'institution imaginaire de la société (The Imaginary Institution of Society) in 1975 the tenor and explicit subject matter of Castoriadis’s work changed noticeably. For the remainder of his life he engaged with a broader variety of disciplines, including psychoanalysis, biology, sociology, ecology, and mathematics. His specific views in each field were almost always linked to his general theory of the creative imagination—operating at both singular and collective levels—and to its implications for each discipline. Philosophy’s role, he argued, is to break through the closure of any instituted social imaginary in order to make possible a deliberative attitude about what humans ought actively to institute, i.e. about the very goals, ends, and capacities of society and individuals themselves. In this sense, Castoriadis’ ontology of creation makes possible his ethics and politics of autonomy (Section 4). In developing his theoretical concepts, Castoriadis never worked in a vacuum, as he contributed to several intellectual groups during this time, including the École Freudienne de Paris led by Jacques Lacan, the journal Textures (primarily philosophical), and the journal Libre (primarily political) with Claude Lefort.

a. The Creative Imagination

While the first division of L'institution imaginaire de la société offered a modified version of Castoriadis’ critique of Marx, the second division contained his full-scale theory of the creative imagination. He argued there that the imagination is not primarily a capacity to create visual images. Rather, it is the singular or collective capacity to create forms, i.e. the capacity to create the presentation or self-presentation of being itself. The theory of the creative imagination developed over many years through essays conversant with the Western intellectual tradition. In this section I will present his views as a dialogue with the figures to whom Castoriadis acknowledged a debt.

i. Philosophical Background: Aristotle

In 1978’s “The Discovery of the Imagination” (World in Fragments 213-245) Castoriadis distinguished what he called the radical imagination from the “traditional” view of the imagination. Aristotle’s traditional view, depicted in De Anima, treated the imagination as a faculty generating an image that accompanies sensations but typically distorts them. Since sensations themselves are always true according to Aristotle, the extra imaginary capacity (primarily serving to reproduce what the senses provided, to recombine past sensations into new images, or to supplement sensation confusingly) was treated mainly as an obfuscator of truth. Castoriadis argued that philosophy usually considered this account of imagination to reveal its basic power. Regardless of whether they attacked or praised it, philosophers tended to treat the imagination in this way as something that creates a kind of fantastical non-reality.

Despite this picture of the imagination as “negative,” Castoriadis argued that hidden deeper within the philosophical tradition was a discovery of a primary imagination that is not simply negative. Indeed, in De Anima 3.7-3.9 Aristotle argued that the primary imagination is a “condition for all thought.” For Castoriadis, this claim implies that there can be no grasp of reality without the primary imagination. It should be interpreted, Castoriadis argued, as a capacity for the very presentation of reality as such, a presentation required for any further understanding. In this way, the primary imagination precedes any re-presentation of reality.

Even so, Aristotle remained an ambiguous figure for Castoriadis. He had raised difficult problems for any account of imagination as strictly negative or re-presentational; but he also failed to draw out the full consequences of his discovery of the primary imagination. Most of his writings and most of traditional philosophy portray the imagination as mainly reproductive, negative, or obfuscatory.

ii. Philosophical Background: Kant

According to Castoriadis, Immanuel Kant rediscovered the importance of the imagination and gave philosophy a new awareness of its role (World in Fragments 246-272). In Critique of Pure Reason, Kant had allowed that the imagination is the capacity to present an object even without the presence of that object in sensible intuition. As such, he freed the imagination from the traditional role of merely following or accompanying the senses in an a posteriori function. For Kant, the imagination was already involved in the initial presentation of whatever may appear to the senses.

Like Aristotle, however, Kant was an ambiguous figure for Castoriadis. While Kant was aware of the imagination’s creativity and its vital role in presenting whatever can appear, he was also too quick to re-subordinate the imagination to the task of offering presentations that remain within the a priori, necessary, and stable structures (i.e. the categories and pure forms of intuition) inherent in the knowing mind. For example, while Kant allowed the imagination a role in a priori mathematical construction in intuition, he allowed that it works in this way only within the framework of the pre-established forms of intuitions themselves (that is, within the pre-set structures of space and of time). In short, the imagination remained bound to functioning in a pre-established field in Kant’s theoretical work (Castoriadis Reader 319-337). The same tendency, argued Castoriadis, found expression in Kant’s later work on the imagination in the Critique of Judgment (Philosophy, Politics, Autonomy 81-123).

Nevertheless, Castoriadis in some sense followed the Kantian view that an unknown X, other than the knowing subject, can “occasion” imaginary presentations. Castoriadis preferred, however, to invoke Fichte’s term Anstoß (shock) for the “encounter” with whatever occasions imaginary activity. With this shock, the imagination goes into operation generates a presentation for itself. It thereby brings something “other” into a relation with itself, forming the presentation of the other as what it is. While Fichte had suggested that the imagination in some sense gives itself this shock, Castoriadis denied that the question of the internality or externality of the shock was decidable. Thus he maintained that the imagination forms either itself or another something into a presentation by “leaning on” (Freud’s term is anaclasis) what is formable in whatever it forms. Something in what the imagination forms thus lends itself to formation by the imagination. While there can be no account of the nature of this formability without the imagination’s actual formation of the formable X, Castoriadis argued that his fact does not prove that there is nothing formable in itself, i.e. that there is nothing at all apart from the imagination’s activity.

Finally, Castoriadis took his Kant-inspired account even further. He argued that the imagination can in some cases create a presentation of reality by starting without any shock whatsoever. The imagination can create a presentation or form of reality without any conditioning shock (Castoriadis Reader 323-6). Thus, while there are inevitably some shocks for any psyche, the shock is not a necessary condition for the operation of the imagination.

Castoriadis argued that Kant had implicitly recognized the creativity of the imagination. Kant, however, tried hard to chain down the imagination to stable structures of thought and intuition. But Kant’s efforts in this direction merely indicated that he was deeply aware of a creativity that is not necessarily stable or bound to an a priori rule of operation. He recognized the primary imagination. Hence Kant, like Aristotle, is an ambiguous friend for Castoriadis.

iii. Philosophical Background: Post-Kantian Philosophy

Castoriadis’s response to Kant’s philosophy, at least in its negative aspects, is not entirely dissimilar to the responses given by post-Kantians such as the German Idealists, Nietzsche, and Heidegger. However, it differs in that it does not involve the monism implicit or explicit in modern idealism (Hegel) and materialism (Nietzsche, Marx). Indeed, perhaps more than any other thinker since Kant, and in opposition to the monistic tendencies of most of the post-Kantians, Castoriadis embraced the inevitability of the encounter with an “other.” There is no such thing as a singular substance existing radically alone; for each substance interacts with others. While Castoriadis’s views do at times overlap with the phenomenological tradition, his theory of radical creativity puts him at odds with the Heideggerian tradition. Castoriadis also diverged from the twentieth century “turn to language” in analytic philosophy (though he did develop a theory of signification in The Imaginary Institution of Society). More broadly, in contrast to prevalent cultural relativism of the twentieth century West, he instead expressed an absolute support for the project of moral and political autonomy (Section 4).

What is perhaps most vital for understanding Castoriadis’s creative imagination—what makes his project unique in contemporary philosophy—is that his analysis of creativity is not supposed to entail, by itself, a normative claim. Castoriadis does not assign a positive value to creativity as such. In fact, Castoriadis explicitly rejected the positive valuation of “the new for the sake of the new” (Post-Script on Insignificance 93-107). The endless search for the next thing or the newest idea in contemporary thought leads to a lack of understanding of the already established norms, and therefore to an unconscious redeployment of those norms. Even so, the radical creativity of the imagination does, in a different way, lead to value-theoretic considerations and, in particular, to a kind of politics. While value cannot be derived from being or creation, the very fact that being is creation leads to another question: What ought we create (or re-create), institute (or perpetuate), or set for ourselves as a project? How can we provide limits and institutions for ourselves so that we may effectively achieve and call into question what we understand to be good? As such, Castoriadis’s radical imagination might be said to “clear the way” for his politics and ethics (Section 4).

iv. Creation ex Nihilo

As the above dialogue with the philosophical tradition has already suggested, Castoriadis argued that being is creation. He described creation as an emergence of newness that, whether deliberate or unconscious, is itself not sufficiently determined by preceding historical conditions. He thus described creation as ex nihilo, or as stemming from nothing. Even so, he also insisted that creation is neither in nihilo nor cum nihilo (Castoriadis Reader 321, 404). In other words, while creation must be understood to emerge out of nothing, this creation always emerges within a set of historical or natural conditions. However, these conditions are not sufficient to account for the being of the new creation. Thus, even if there were (per impossible) a complete and exhaustive account of the conditions contextualizing any occasion of creation, neither the existence nor the specificity of the new creation could be fully understood as derived from those conditions. For example, we miss the radical, historical newness of the Greek social creation of “democracy” if we attempt to explain it simply in terms of what already existed in Athens at the time. The creation of democracy broke through the conditioning constraints of the existing social state of affairs. In this sense, Greek democracy was radically new.

Castoriadis repeatedly contrasted ex nihilo creation with production or deduction of consequences. First, production entails that a set of elements or materials is given, which givens are then molded or modified into a new product. Even notions of self-differentiation are really just notions of productivity in this sense, for they envision the new creation (call it X-prime) as emerging from the original X merely as a self-modification of that original X. Thus, the new “product” is treated not as an original itself but rather as a modified “version” of an original. This is not what Castoriadis means by a new creation. Second, in the case of deduction, he argued that a deductive theory of newness would mean only that there is some new conclusion that follows sufficiently from a set of factors as a result of there being a determinate rule or law of the deduction process itself (laws of inference, and so forth). Yet such deduction does not create or reveal something new qua new; rather, it involves an inference from premises to something different that is supposed to already exist because its existence follows from the premises. Thus, he argued, both production and deduction are beholden to theories of “difference” that really only explain the new as a derivative, a modified sameness, or an already-existing thing. Castoriadis contrasted these concepts sharply with creation ex nihilo.

Importantly, Castoriadis’s notion of creation is not equivalent to the epistemic notion of unpredictability, as he clarified in 1983's “Time and Creation” (World in Fragments 374-401). A continuous emergence of something out of something else can still be fully unpredictable. Unpredictability might, for example, mean simply that not all of the relevant producers, factors, or laws of inference are known or knowable: An unpredictable event or phenomenon could still be determined by unknown factors. Unpredictability could be a function of the limitations of knowledge. Thus unpredictability is not equivalent to creation. While Castoriadis agreed that knowers are not, as far as we know, omniscient, he argued that with each creation there emerges something ontologically new, something that is not merely seemingly new "for us" due to some subjective lack of knowledge. Separating radical creation from the merely epistemic notion of unpredictability, Castoriadis defends the notion that creation brings about something genuinely new.

Further, Castoriadis argued that creation does not prevent deterministic accounts from, so to speak, sticking. Creation cannot be simply opposed to determinism; rather creation only excludes the idea that there could be a total inclusion of the various strata of beings (and creations) within “a single ultimate and elementary level” of determination (World in Fragments 393). Thus, Castoriadis did not deny that creations lend themselves to being understood in terms of continuous difference (production, deduction) or determination. Rather, a stratum of explicable difference always emerges as a result of the relationship of a creation to those conditions in and with (but not from) which it occurs. For example, while Greek democracy was a radically new social creation in history, this creation also at once re-instituted many of the conditions with and in which it emerged. Thus, resultant continuities and (mere) differences are evident between Greek democracy and the world existing prior to its emergence. This stratum of continuity and (mere) difference is somewhat explicable in terms of what is producible or deducible from already existing conditions or elements; but democracy is also something wholly original, something lacking complete continuity with what precedes.

Finally, Castoriadis’s terminology of the ex nihilo should not be confused with the theological sense of creation ex nihilo. Theological creation, he argued, is usually treated as “production” by God according to ideas or pre-existing potentialities, such as the nature or mind of God (Fenêtre sur le Chaos 160-164). A God who looks to ideas that always exist, whether those ideas are God’s own (Augustine) or eternal models not identical to god (Plato), is not thought of as genuinely creative in Castoriadis’s sense. Further, theology usually says the world’s creation is a completed affair. It might play itself out in interesting ways; but this “playing out” does not include the possibility of any radical newness. Thus, traditional solutions to the theodicy problem—whether they involve a God who continually creates the world according to general laws (Malebranche) or a God who creates pre-packaged monads (Leibniz)—always posit that God has a plan established in advance when he creates the world "once and for all." At its most extreme point, therefore, theological creation is in fact coincident with the most radical necessitarianism (Spinoza). They both deny the radically new. Thus, Castoriadis joked that “spiritualists are the worst materialists” (Fenêtre sur le Chaos 161).

b. Related Theoretical Concepts

i. The Monad and the Social-Historical

In addition to the influence of philosophers, Castoriadis’s account of the imagination was most deeply influenced by his reading of Freud and his engagement with psychoanalysis. This interest became more marked during the years following the end of Socialisme ou Barbarie. At that time he became involved with the L’Ecole Freudienne de Paris (EFP) of Jacques Lacan and was also married for a time to psychoanalyst Piera Aulagnier.

In his interpretation of Freud, Castoriadis focused on the concept of Vorstellungen (representations), especially in the writings from 1915 (World in Fragments 253). He believed Freud’s search for the origins of representations led him closer to the idea of the primary imagination (Section 3.a.1) than did his explorations of the more famous concept of Phantasie (imagination). Castoriadis argued that Freud’s investigations led (implicitly but not explicitly) to the conclusion that for the human psyche there is no strictly mechanical apparatus converting bodily drives into psychical representations. In Castoriadis’s view Vorstellungen are created originally and cannot be accounted for strictly in terms of physical drives or states. Rather, there is an irreducible source of representations, which Castoriadis came to call the monad or the “monadic pole of the psyche.”

Castoriadis’s invocation of the term monad stems, first of all, from the Greek term for unity or aloneness. The term was most famously re-employed by Leibniz to describe the simple, invisible, and sole kind of metaphysical constituent of reality. Leibniz argued that nothing enters or leaves a monad, and yet monads have seemingly interactive experiences due to their pre-established coordination, created by God (i.e. the best possible world). For Leibniz, each monad reflects the state of the other monads and harmonizes with them while remaining independent. Invoking Leibniz’s metaphysics, Castoriadis retained the term but gave it a different sense and value. The monad, for Castoriadis, is not the sole kind of metaphysical constituent but neither is it unreal; rather, the monad is that aspect of the psyche that is incapable of accepting that it itself is not the sole kind of metaphysical constituent. As such, no monad actually remains entirely immanent to itself. All monads are inevitably fractured when the psyche encounters a radical otherness. Following the fragmentation the remnants of the monad desire to recover themselves into a now-impossible state of total aloneness. This “monadical” desire for aloneness has two effects. On the one hand, the monad’s desire for total self-enclosure leads the psyche to disregard the non-psychical sources of human function. The psyche begins to hate and despise the body, sometimes detrimentally. On the other hand, the monad’s desire for unity is not simply a negative thing since it leads the psyche to find unique ways to individuate itself. This individuation often occurs through the psyche’s adoption of social norms and identities. Adoption of norms or identities is not necessarily a bad thing, especially insofar as it can bring a certain measure of stability to the psyche. Castoriadis’s main point was rather that while the monadic pole of the psyche always tends toward radical aloneness, the broader psyche—of which the monad is only an aspect—is in fact capable of socialization, of adopting shared identities, and of having productive relations to others. The monadic pole, however, always fights against subsumption into social or physical norms or identities.

Ultimately Castoriadis felt a need to account for the monadic aspect of the psyche due to his experiences as an analyst interacting with patients. The monad, he suggests, is a necessary hypothesis we must posit if we are to describe the observable history of the patient subsequent to his or her fragmentation (Figures of the Thinkable 168). What follows fragmentation is a phase of life in which the psyche creates itself in relation to a specific social-historical situation and the collective conditions it faces. These collective conditions, or institutions, essentially “fabricate” the individual from out of the psyche as the psyche adopts them into its own identity.

For this reason Castoriadis’s psychoanalytic work leads directly into his political philosophy. For in the same way that psychical creativity as such is broader than, and precedes, the social-historical individuation of the psyche, so too is there a ground of any social formation. This ground, irreducible to individual psychic creativity, Castoriadis calls the anonymous collective. This trans-individual creativity yields as its effects the imaginary formations falling into our typical, narrower categories of “culture” or “society.” A psyche always forms itself through these instituted social offerings; but the social instituting power itself is what accounts in the first place for this instituted state of affairs. The instituted can always be rewritten by the instituting power, and thus a truly autonomous society explicitly acknowledges this instituting power and seeks lucidly to share in it (Section 4).

In this sense, Castoriadis insisted that various strata of creativity—for example, the psyche and the anonymous collective—are irreducible to each other and yet they are importantly interactive. He thus understood that psychoanalysis has a broader social role than is typically believed. In particular it can help the psyche break consciously and lucidly with the monadical desire for total self-enclosure. Castoriadis felt this task could help bring about a world where the singular psyche and the collectivity begin to acknowledge the duty to share in the deliberative activities of distinctively autonomous self-creation (Section 4).

ii. The Living Being and Its Proper World

In addition to his reflection on social and individual human creativity, Castoriadis’s view of “being as creation” led him to develop theories about non-human living beings. In “The State of the Subject Today” (World in Fragments 137-171) he considered in turn the living being, the psyche, the social individual, and finally human society, arguing that each is a distinct but interactive “stratum” of being. While a living being (for example, a human) is conditioned by its interaction with and dependency on other living beings such as cells, nevertheless no stratum of living beings (such as humanity) is reducible to any other stratum. Human life cannot be conceived accurately as merely an “expression” of cell life, for example. Each stratum involves a unique, original kind of living being, or “being for itself,” which leans on but is by no means determined by the other strata with which it interacts.

Beginning at the cellular level then, Castoriadis described the living being as creative of its own proper world as it leans on other beings and worlds which lend themselves. Castoriadis suggested, for example, that an individual dog is a participant in the species dog, in the sense that this dog creates for itself a world in common with other dogs. Nevertheless, while the “proper worlds” of the cells of this dog (or of other beings in its environment) are a condition of this dog and of this dog’s creation of a proper world shared with other dogs, these cells are not something out of which this dog sufficiently emerges or with which this dog’s life is always entirely consistent. Dog cells do not determine the proper world of a dog although they are conditions leaned upon by this dog as it creates its own proper world. While dog-life thus depends on cell-life, the stratum of life proper to dogs is a creation of dogs as they live with their conditioning cells. And, of course, cell life is also creative of a proper world for itself, i.e. a world only partially analogical with the life of the dog. As a result, each stratum of life is unique yet interactive.

On this level, Castoriadis conversed with Chilean biologist and proponent of the theory of autopoiesis Francisco Varela (for example, see “Life and Creation” in Post-Script on Insignificance). For Varela, and also for Humberto Maturana, auto-creation means that each living being creates for itself a world of closure. The living being is essentially dependent upon the living beings which condition it. Higher beings are expressions of the potentialities inherent in the lower constituents. Castoriadis followed Varela with respect to the self-creation of the living being and its proper world, arguing that nothing enters into the proper world of a living being without being transformed by it. However, for Castoriadis, auto-creation did not have to entail a kind of organizational closure. Some living beings are both radically creative of new, irreducible strata of life and merely lean on others for their creations; they are not simply expressions of those other strata. The creativity of a dog, for example, is thus irreducible to being the expression of the constituents of itself (e.g. cells) or the expression of its environment. Even the most basic stratum of natural life (which Castoriadis called the “first natural stratum”) is merely a condition for the emergence of other living beings; it is not something that decides, determines, or produces what those other strata are.

Thus, Castoriadis did not treat the creativity of the living being as simply a larger or smaller scale version of other living beings. The human creation of a proper world, for example, creatively breaks out of a closure relative to its supporting conditions (internal or environmental) and breaks continuity even with itself at times. Humans create a new stratum of being irreducible to the others. We are always intra- and inter-active with other strata; but the human psyche creates in ways that are not contained potentially in anterior states of other living beings or in its inherited conditions. Humans create a new, common, distinct stratum of life. Thus, Castoriadis argued from a biological standpoint that it is quite possible to affirm truly that “everything is interactive.” Yet he insisted that we cannot for that reason “simply say that everything interacts with everything […]” (Post-Script on Insignificance 67). All of what is proper to the human world interacts with some other strata, but only some of what is proper to the human world shares something in common with all other strata.

iii. Magmas and Ensembles

Castoriadis’s project has many aspects that allow it to be interpreted as a “theory of being” in the traditional sense. He developed two important theoretical concepts that underpin much of his ontological work beginning in the 1970s: magmas and ensembles. The former term was Castoriadis’s preferred name for indeterminate, or mixed, being. The latter, the French term for “sets,” is his term for determinate being (where being refers to either the singular or plural).

Castoriadis faced his greatest difficulties in describing magmas since he argued magmas exist and yet they are not comprehensible by traditional ontology because traditional ontology thinks that true being is strictly determinate. Traditional ontology says that what is indeterminate (Greek apeiron) is a more or less deficient being or a kind of non-being. That is, indeterminate being is at best conceived as existing only insofar as it is related to determinate being (Greek peras). Castoriadis’s task was to envision indeterminate being without thinking of it as merely existing relative to, or as a negation of, determinate being. As such, Castoriadis made a very cautious effort to “define” magmas (although he did not consider his task to be possible in this definitional form) in a way that did not define them as deficient modes of determinate being. In the 1983 text, “The Logic of Magmas and the Question of Autonomy” (Castoriadis Reader 290-318), he suggested several propositions:

M1: If M is a magma, one can mark, in M, an indefinite number of ensembles.

M2: If M is a magma, one can mark, in M, magmas other than M.

M3: If M is a magma, M cannot be partitioned into magmas.

M4: If M is a magma, every decomposition of M into ensembles leaves a magma as residue.

M5: What is not a magma is an ensemble or is nothing.

Here the central problem in thinking about magmas is the way that they appear as a great nexus wherein any magma is inseparable from any other magma. Magmas are thus something like mixtures of beings that involve no totally separate or discrete elements. Even so, other magmas, different from any particular magma that is being researched, can be “indicated” as existing within the magma being researched. For this reason, magmas are also not simply one sole entity. Yet they have no parts and always resist being confined to sets. In short, magmas are inherently indeterminate; while they are determinable in some ways, they are never wholly determinate.

As for his account of ensembles, or determinate being, Castoriadis argued that all traditional ontology—including Platonic forms, Aristotelian substance, Kantian categories, the Hegelian absolute, for example—assumes that being is essentially determinate. Such an ontology is, in Castoriadis’s terms, an ensemblist-identitarian, or ensidic, ontology. These ontologies always rely on certain operators of thinking, including traditional logical and mathematical principles such as the principle of identity, non-contradiction, the excluded third, and so forth. They assume that being consists of entirely discrete or separate elements neatly conforming to these principles. Ensidic thought therefore cannot grasp the notion that there would be anything genuinely other than determinate being.

As an example of ensidic thought, Castoriadis referred to set theory and its development. Cantor’s naïve set theory described a set as “any collection into a whole M of definite and separate objects m of our intuition or our thought.” He thus expressed explicitly what all later (non-naive or axiomatic) versions of set theory would maintain implicitly: the assumption that being is wholly determinate or consists of wholly determinate elements. When Cantor’s original set theory was shown to lead to paradoxes (such as Russell’s paradox), later axiomatic set theory did not call into question Cantor’s core pre-assumption that all being is determinate. Instead, it attempted to salvage Cantor’s determinacy assumption by wagering on being’s “conformability” to the determinacy assumption, all while searching for better ways to make that assumption consistent. Axiomatic set theory thus unquestioningly accepted Cantor’s original presupposition, even as it attempted to salvage set theory through axiomatics. Thus, set theory is a paradigmatic case of ensidic thought. Yet it is not unique in its assumption that being must be determinate. Everyday language, for example, already implicitly posits the separation and distinctness of beings. Set-theoretical ontology just re-confirms this bias of everyday language when it presumes that all being is determinate.

The problem with the assumption that all being must be determinate, or ensidic, Castoriadis argued, is not that there is in truth no stratum of determinate being whatsoever. Rather, there is such a stratum of wholly determinate being. The problem is that while this stratum is a condition for the emergence of other beings, it is merely a condition and not the sole constitutive principle of the other strata of being. The assumption that all being must be determinate leads ensidic logic to present some stratum of being (the first natural stratum of sheer determinacy) as if it were solely constitutive of each and every stratum of being (or each and every being). As such, a wholly ensidic ontology wrongly assumes that this de facto condition of determinacy is itself universally constitutive in principle of all possible beings. It falsely assumes that other strata simply conform to the ensidic strata (or stratum) of being. In reality, ensidic thought itself posits this stratum of being as primary, without the attendant awareness that this hypothesis is a hypothesis. Thus, traditional ontology, like everyday language, gravely mistakes the ensidic stratum itself for what being must be.

4. The Project of Autonomy

For Castoriadis, the psyche of each human is inevitably fragmented and cannot remain in a strictly monadic state. Further, as the ground of social-historical constellations of meaning, the creativity of the anonymous collective—i.e. the social instituting power—is irreducible to individual psychic creativity (Section 3.b.i). Thus, the question of genuine politics arises necessarily for humans because humans must create themselves as they exist in relation to others and in relation to society’s institutions (which often mediate relations with others). Therefore, the question of true political action is intimately linked to the question of which institutions we shall institute, internalize, and lean on in our creations. Hence, we must engage in lucid deliberation about what is good for humans and about which institutions help us achieve the good. This lucid deliberation separates genuine politics from demagoguery or cynical politics.

Importantly, genuine deliberation does not merely concern the means to achieving a goal we assume we already know (as Aristotle had supposed in Ethics that our goal of “happiness” is a given and we only need to deliberate about the means to happiness). Rather, we must deliberate about the ends themselves as well as the means. As such, political existence can never arrive at a total, final conclusion. Since no set model of action is given to us (for example, politics cannot be modeled on what is natural or ecological, in accordance with evolution, and so forth), genuine politics cannot assume that any given condition or state of life determines which laws it should lay down for itself and which practices it should support or sanction. Rather, for Castoriadis, genuine politics is a way of life in which humans give the laws to themselves as they constantly re-engage in deliberation about what is good. In short, genuine politics coincides with the question, and the ability of individuals and society to pose the question, What is a good society? Societies and individuals who can genuinely pose this question are capable of autonomy, transcending the closure of the traditions and social conditioning in which they emerge. This capacity for autonomy depends not only on the individuals and society who actually give limits and laws to themselves, but also on those institutions on which individuals and society lean when creating those laws.

a. Heteronomy and Autonomy

In 1989’s “Done and To Be Done,” (Castoriadis Reader 361-417) Castoriadis restated some of the political arguments he had developed since his tenure with Socialisme ou Barbarie. He argued that the problem of traditions covering over the reality of creation (Section 3) is not merely a theoretical error; it also immediately coincides with closure in political and moral reality. All societies are self-creative and yet most, he argued, are utterly incapable of calling into question their own established norms. In such societies, the instituted situation immediately coincides without remainder with what is good and valid in the minds of the people. Such a society, which does not or cannot question its own norms or considers its norms to be given by God, gods, nature, history, ancestors, and so forth, is heteronomous in opposition to autonomous societies.

Castoriadis argued that heteronomy results when nature, essence, or existence are understood to produce the law for the creative living being, for individuals, or for society. On the one hand, Castoriadis’s definition of heteronomy was not limited to, nor did it target, religious beliefs in any special sense. Castoriadis’s examples were at times examples of religious beliefs and at other times examples of closed, but not necessarily religious, societies. In this way, the distinction cuts across any supposed divide between sacred and secular, such that even the most seemingly enlightened and anti-religious materialism could be a dominant instituted imaginary in a largely heteronomous society. In such a society, humans are continuously regenerated in a systematic state of closure. The necessary condition for the project of autonomy is, thus, the breaking of such instituted radical closure, i.e. the rupture of heteronomy.

On the other hand, what is essential for Castoriadis’s positive account of autonomy is that there is no law of nature that is pre-set for the human. That is, there is no substance or rule determining what a human qua human must be or can be. However, this is not to say that the human is nothing at all: The creativity of the human means that humans “cannot not posit norms” (Castoriadis Reader 375). As such, humans can always pose and repose the question of norms and of what they are to be; we can always in principle break away from a heteronomous condition. The radical creativity of the psyche and collectivity is never obliterated by a society or a set of social institutions, even if autonomy is de facto absent. Nevertheless, it is possible for heteronomous societies and individuals to largely cover over this creativity of the human, to institute norms that cannot, in a de facto sense, be called into question.

As a result, Castoriadis did not identify creation (or self-creation) with the moral and political project of autonomy. Rather, even heteronomous societies create themselves and are self-constituting. Autonomy exists only when we create “the institutions which, by being internalized by individuals, must facilitate their accession to their individual autonomy and their effective participation in all forms of explicit power existing in society” (Castoriadis Reader 405). Autonomy thus means not only that tradition can be questioned—i.e. that the question of the good can be posed—but also that we continue to make it de facto possible for ourselves to continue to ask, What is good? The latter requires that we establish institutional supports for autonomy.

For Castoriadis there is therefore an exigency to embrace autonomy in a sense not limited to the liberal ideal of non-coercive, negative freedom wherein coercion as such is depicted as evil (albeit, a necessary evil). Castoriadis argued that the object of genuine politics is to build a people who are capable of positive self-limitation. This self-limitation is not limited to weak suggestiveness; rather, autonomy “can be more than and different from mere exhortation if it is embodied in the creation of free and responsible individuals” (Castoriadis Reader 405). Castoriadis argued, against the liberal ideal, that the elimination of coercion cannot be a sufficient political goal, even if it is often a good thing. Rather, autonomous societies go beyond the negative-liberty project of un-limiting people. Autonomous communities create ways of explicitly, lucidly, and deliberately limiting themselves by establishing institutions through which individuals form their own laws for themselves and will therefore be formed as critical, self-critical, and autonomous. Only such institutions can make autonomy “effective” in a de facto way.

Finally, in defining what he meant by “effective” autonomy, Castoriadis distinguished his view of autonomy from Kant’s. In the Kantian perspective, he argued, the possibility of autonomy involves the possibility of acting freely in accordance with the universal law, itself established once and for all, apart from the influence of any other heteronomous incentives. Castoriadis argued that Kantianism treats autonomy itself as a goal or as something that we want simply for itself. Echoing Hegel, Castoriadis argued that Kantian autonomy ends up as a purely formal issue or a desire for autonomy for itself alone. Castoriadis, like Kant, did not deny the importance of the pursuit of autonomy for itself, with the full knowledge that the law of one’s action is not given from elsewhere. However, he added that we do not desire autonomy only for itself but also in order to be able to make, to do, and to institute. The formal, Kantian autonomy must also be made factual. “The task of philosophy,” he argued, “is not only to raise the question quid juris; that is just the beginning. Its task is to elucidate how right becomes fact and fact right—which is the condition for its existence, and is itself one of the first manifestations thereof” (Castoriadis Reader 404). As such, effective autonomy means that the will for autonomy itself as an “end” must also be a will for the de facto “means” to autonomy, namely the will to establish the institutions on which autonomy leans.

b. Democracy in Ancient Greece

In 1983’s “The Greek Polis and the Creation of Democracy” (Philosophy, Politics, Autonomy 81-123) Castoriadis argued that institutions of autonomy have appeared twice in history: in Athens in the fifth century B.C.E. and in Western Europe during the Enlightenment. Neither example serves as a model for emulation today in institutions. If we recall that the existence of autonomous institutions is never a sufficient condition for autonomy, we realize that there can be no question of treating historical cases as models to emulate. Rather, what makes these cases important, for Castoriadis, is that they are examples where, within societies that have instituted a strict closure, the closure is nevertheless ruptured, opened, and the people reflectively and deliberatively institute a radically new nomos, or law, for themselves.

Societies, argued Castoriadis, tend to institute strict closure: “In nearly all of the cultures that we know of, it is not merely that what is valid for each one is its institutions and its own tradition, but, in addition, for each, the others are not valid” (Post-Script on Insignificance 93). However, Castoriadis argued that Greece—in grasping that other societies do not mirror a nature found everywhere, but are radically creative of their own, unique institutions—also thereby grasped themselves as self-creative of their own institutions. The Greeks broke with their own established social closure and instituted “lucid self-legislation.” The Greek discovery of social self-creation (i.e. the social instituting power) led to the partial realization (institution) of autonomy precisely because they both effectively imagined their potential universality with others as an end (formal autonomy) and yet also established some particular institutions as supports for autonomy’s effective realization. Even so, the Greek creation remained partial and its institutions were limited and narrow (for example, they excluded women). Castoriadis’s point was that the potential universality of their creation (radical criticism and self-criticism), which they understood to be their own creation, coincided with the democratic institutions established as supports for rendering autonomy effective. In the end, the Greeks inaugurated a tradition of radical criticism that is, for Castoriadis, always something with which autonomy—and philosophy—begins.

c. Public, Private, and Agora

Castoriadis did not shy from suggesting some specific institutional characteristics that autonomous societies embrace. While he cautioned that there can be no a priori or final decision about what autonomous society should be, he proposed in “Done and To Be Done” (Castoriadis Reader 361-417) a classical, three-pronged institutional arrangement of society's strata. These strata are:

ekklésia—the public/public

oikos—the private/private

agora—the public/private

In defining these terms, Castoriadis insisted that the first necessary condition of an autonomous society is the rendering open of the public/public sphere, or ekklésia. The task is to make self-institution by individuals and society explicit through the public consideration of the works and projects that commit the collectivity and the individual. The ekklésia is not a sphere of bureaucratic management of individuals by social architects; quite the opposite, it entails the establishment of institutions for public knowledge production and lawmaking, thus making possible an intellectual space for individuals to know and question laws in an informed way. Such considerations that affect individuals cannot, however, be left to the private/private or the public/private spheres; they must be undertaken by the collectivity together in public. There seems to be no requirement that the ekklésia occupy what we commonly call a physical place; rather, the site for knowing, deliberating about, and questioning the law is any space that “belongs to all (ta koina).” What is important is that the ekklésia involves the collectivity in a public deliberation about the goals and means of society and individuals.

Second, Castoriadis argued that an autonomous society will render the private/private sphere, or oikos, inviolable and independent of the other spheres. Individuals, families, and homes create themselves with institutions. That is, private life, as it creates itself, leans on an instituted fabric of society, a fabric the very continuation of which must be the subject of deliberation in the ekklésia. This fabric includes the institutions for education, basic criminal law, and other society-wide conditions. Bureaucratic communism or socialism, insofar as they destroy individual personality and private life, are to be abolished through the ekklésia’s efforts to support the independence and distinctness of the private/private sphere.

Third, Castoriadis defended the independence of the public/private, mixed sphere, i.e. the agora. His defense of the term the Greeks used for their marketplace has nothing to do with any defense of so-called free enterprise (i.e. merely negative liberty to exploit workers). Rather, the agora is where individuals (and not a particular set of individuals, as was the case in Athens, where citizen males alone participated) can group themselves in relation to others for purposes that are not explicitly questions pertaining to the public/public sphere. The independence of the agora as a mixed sphere would eliminate the possibility of forced collectivization of goods or the need for the abolition of money forms, which are still useful in the agoric sphere. The agoric sphere provides a kind of buffer between the tyrannies of the wholly public or wholly private set of interests, thus supporting the ongoing institution of autonomy as a whole.

For Castoriadis, each of the three institutional strata should be treated as a proper sphere of its own. They should not be collapsed into one sphere. “Autonomous society,” he wrote, “can only be composed of autonomous individuals” (World in Fragments 416). The preservation of each stratum is vital. Yet, on the one hand, the statist and bureaucratic societies of the twentieth century, despite their intentions of establishing a genuine public sphere, constantly collapsed the potential universality of the public/public sphere into a massive, all-inclusive private/private stratum, i.e. into a manipulative, bureaucratic society. On the other hand, the Western liberal democracies were more properly oligarchic, totalitarian-capitalist societies that happen to exist in a somewhat more fragmented and less total form than their statist counterparts. They too tend to collapse the public/public into private, bureaucratic, capitalist corporations. They thereby generate people who do not know the law and therefore cannot question it or effectively institute new laws. Thus, autonomy—while always in principle possible for us—is nevertheless factually foreclosed across most of the world, even to this day.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Book-Length Collections of Castoriadis’s Work in English

  • Castoriadis, Cornelius. A Society Adrift: Interviews and Debates, 1974–1997. Trans. Helen Arnold. New York: Fordham University Press, 2010.
    • This text contains full articles of a largely political tenor as well as occasional writings and interviews.
  • Castoriadis, Cornelius. Crossroads in the Labyrinth. Trans. Martin H. Ryle and Kate Soper. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984.
    • This text contains several important essays; however, it includes only a few of the essays to be found in the six-volume French title.
  • Castoriadis, Cornelius. Figures of the Thinkable. Trans. Helen Arnold. Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 2007.
    • This text contains a variety of important articles, including important theoretical pieces, such as “Remarks on Space and Number.”
  • Castoriadis, Cornelius. On Plato’s Statesman. Trans. David Ames Curtis. Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 2002.
    • Castoriadis provides a close and critical reading of the Plato dialogue while engaging with other Greek thinkers and sources. (Also, these lectures are only part of a larger collection of Castoriadis’s course materials, which are slowly being published in French).
  • Castoriadis, Cornelius. Philosophy, Politics, Autonomy. Essays in Political Philosophy. Trans. and Ed. David Ames Curtis. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1991.
    • This text is the best single collection of Castoriadis’s political works.
  • Castoriadis, Cornelius. Political and Social Writings, Volume 1: 1946–1955. From the Critique of Bureaucracy to the Positive Content of Socialism. Trans. and Ed. David Ames Curtis. Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press, 1988.
    • These volumes collect many of Castoriadis’s political writings, from occasional pieces to the full-scale, multi-part articles from Socialisme ou Barbarie.
  • Castoriadis, Cornelius. Political and Social Writings, Volume 2: 1955–1960. From the Workers’ Struggle against Bureaucracy to Revolution in the Age of Modern Capitalism. Trans. and Ed. David Ames Curtis. Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press, 1988.
    • This text contains “Modern Capitalism and Revolution,” and, along with Vol. 3, tracks the break with Marxism.
  • Castoriadis, Cornelius. Political and Social Writings, Volume 3: 1961–1979. Recommencing the Revolution: From Socialism to the Autonomous Society. Trans. and Ed. David Ames Curtis. Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press, 1993.
    • This text, along with Vol. 2, tracks Castoriadis during his break with Marxism.
  • Castoriadis, Cornelius. Post-Script on Insignificance: Dialogues with Cornelius Castoriadis. Trans. Gabriel Rockhill and John V. Garner. New York: Continuum Press, 2011.
    • This text contains dialogues with Octavio Paz, Alain Connes, Francisco Varela, and others. A helpful introduction by Rockhill clarifies many concepts and offers criticism of some of Castoriadis’s historiographical assumptions.
  • Castoriadis, Cornelius. The Castoriadis Reader. Trans. and Ed. David Ames Curtis. New York: Blackwell Publishing, 1997.
    • This text is the most comprehensive single collection of Castoriadis’s work.
  • Castoriadis, Cornelius. The Imaginary Institution of Society. Trans. Kathleen Blamey. Cambridge: MIT Press, 1987.
    • This text is Castoriadis’s most famous single work and the second half contains Castoriadis’s most sustained single piece of writing.
  • Castoriadis, Cornelius. World in Fragments. Writings on Politics, Society, Psychoanalysis, and the Imagination. Trans. David Ames Curtis. Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 1997.
    • This text contains a helpful introduction by Curtis focusing on Castoriadis’s engagement with the history of science. It is the most comprehensive collection other than the Castoriadis Reader.

b. Secondary Readings (French and English)

  • Adams, S. Castoriadis’s Ontology: Being and Creation. New York: Fordham University Press, 2011.
    • In addition to this full-scale study of Castoriadis that situates his work in the context of continental philosophy and twentieth-century social thought, Adams has published several strong articles, focusing especially on Castoriadis’s notion of physis and trans-human creativity.
  • Bachofen, B., Elbaz, S., and Poirier, N. Ed. Cornelius Castoriadis: Réinventer l’autonomie. Paris: Éditions du Sandre, 2008.
    • This French-language text contains essays by several thinkers, including Edgar Morin, that focus on autonomy and ontology.
  • Bernstein, J. Recovering the Ethical Life: Jürgen Habermas and the Future of Critical Theory. London: Psychology Press, 1995.
    • Bernstein’s text includes a thoughtful chapter on Habermas’ criticism of Castoriadis.
  • Busino, G. Ed. Autonomie et Autotransformation de la Société. La Philosophie Militante de Cornelius Castoriadis. Geneva: Droz, 1989.
    • This text is a multilingual collection of essays on Castoriadis.
  • Callinicos, A. Trotskyism. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1990.
    • In one chapter Callinicos argues that Castoriadis initiates volunteerism in order to save revolutionary possibilities.
  • Elliott, A. Critical Visions: New Directions in Social Theory. Oxford: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc., 2003.
    • Elliott’s work, this text and several others, contains frequent references to Castoriadis.
  • Habermas, J. The Philosophical Discourse of Modernity: Twelve Lectures. Trans. Thomas McCarthy. Oxford and Cambridge: Polity and Blackwell Press, 1987.
    • Habermas makes a normative critique, challenging Castoriadis’s ability to value one imaginary over another. He also famously charges that Castoriadis posits a kind of self-producing social demiurge.
  • Honneth, A. “Rescuing the Revolution with an Ontology: On Cornelius Castoriadis’s Theory of Society” Thesis Eleven. Trans. Gary Robinson, Vol. 14. 1986. 62-78.
    • Honneth more or less follows Habermas’ criticism.
  • Joas, H. “Institutionalization as a Creative Process: The Sociological Importance of Cornelius Castoriadis’ss Political Philosophy,” Pragmatism and Social Theory. Trans. Raymond Meyer. Chicago and London: University of Chicago Press, 1993. 154-171.
    • This article provides a helpful review of Castoriadis’s work on language and articulation.
  • Kalyvas, A. “The Politics of Autonomy and the Challenge of Deliberation: Castoriadis contra Habermas.” Thesis Eleven. Vol. 64. Feb. 2001. 1-19.
    • Kalyvas defends Castoriadis against Habermas-style criticism.
  • Kavoulakos, K. “The Relationship of Realism and Utopianism in the Theories of Democracy of Jurgen Habermas and Cornelius Castoriadis.” Society and Nature. Vol. 6. Aug. 1994. 69-97.
    • Kavoulakos has published several essays on Castoriadis’s work.
  • Klooger, J., Castoriadis: Psyche, Society, Autonomy, Boston: Brill, 2009.
    • Klooger provides a critical, informed, and thoughtful review of all aspects of Castoriadis’s work, focusing on the later material, including the implications of Castoriadis’s work for physics and ontology. Especially helpful is his critical discussion of Castoriadis’s too-relativistic comments on physics, which, he argues, make it seem as if Newtonian mechanics corresponds to a stratum of being that it describes better than relativity does.
  • Klymis, S. and Van Eynde, L. L’Imaginaire selon Castoriadis. Thèmes et Enjeux. Brussels: Facultés Universitaire Sain-Louis et Bruxelles, 2006.
    • This text is a collection of essays in French on a variety of themes in Castoriadis’s work.
  • Leibowitz, M. Beyond Capital. New York: St. Martin’s Press, 1992.
    • This text contains a full-scale defense of Marx, as opposed to Castoriadis-style objections, by suggesting that Capital is one side of a larger dialectical picture: Marx intended to write a companion work from the standpoint of workers, rather than merely from the perspective of capitalists.
  • Poirier, N. L'ontologie Politique de Castoriadis: Création et Institution. Paris: Éditions Payot et Rivage, 2011.
    • Poirier interrogates Castoriadis’s theory of democratic institutions with a view to their openness to creativity. The work also contains helpful discussions of Castoriadis in relation to Marx's view of praxis and Lefort's critique of totalitarianism.
  • Rorty, R. “Unger, Castoriadis, and the Romance of a National Future” Critique and Construction: A Symposium on Roberto Unger’s Politics. Eds. Robin W. Lovin and Michael J. Perry. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1990. 29-45.
    • Rorty positively assesses the break with Marxism and briefly defends Castoriadis contra Habermas.
  • Stavrakakis, Y. The Lacanian Left: Psychoanalysis, Theory, Politics. Albany: SUNY Press, 2007.
    • Stavrakakis reads Castoriadis from a Lacanian perspective and attempts to mediate their differences.
  • Thesis Eleven. “Cornelius Castoriadis” Special Issue. Vol. 49. May 1997.
    • This issue of the Australian journal contains several helpful assessments of Castoriadis’s work by a variety of thinkers.

Author Information

John V. Garner
The University of West Georgia
U. S. A.

G. E. M. Anscombe (1919—2001)

G.E.M. AnscombeElizabeth Anscombe, or Miss Anscombe as she was known, was an important twentieth century philosopher and one of the most important women philosophers of all time.  A committed Catholic, and translator of some of Ludwig Wittgenstein’s most important work, she was an influential and original thinker in the Catholic tradition and the Wittgensteinian manner. Although she worked in almost every area of philosophy, she is best known to philosophers today for her work on ethics and the philosophy of action. Outside of philosophy she is best known for her conservative views on sexual ethics, which have inspired a number of student organizations, calling themselves the Anscombe Society, promoting chastity and traditional marriage. She is also well known for her opposition to the use of atomic weapons at the end of World War II.

In ethics, her most important work is the paper “Modern Moral Philosophy.” Contemporary interest in virtue theory can be traced directly to this paper, which put forward three theses: that all the major British moral philosophers from Henry Sidgwick on were essentially the same (that is, consequentialists); that the concepts of moral obligation, the use of the word ought with a special moral sense, and related notions, are harmful and should be dropped; and that we should stop doing moral philosophy until we have an adequate philosophy of psychology.

Her work on action, found mostly in her short book Intention, was a step in the direction of such a philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. The First Person
  3. Causation
  4. Intention
  5. Consequentialism
  6. Moral Obligation
  7. Military Ethics
  8. Sexual Ethics
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Works
    2. Secondary Works

1. Life

Gertrude Elizabeth Margaret Ancombe was born on March 18, 1919, in Limerick, Ireland. Her parents, Allen Wells Anscombe and Gertrude Elizabeth Anscombe (née Thomas), were British but living in Ireland because her father was serving there as an officer in the British Army. When they returned to Britain he was a schoolteacher, teaching science at Dulwich College in London. Anscombe herself went to Sydenham High School, graduating in 1937. While there she became interested in Catholicism and converted while still a teenager.

She studied classics and philosophy at St. Hugh's College, Oxford, graduating with a First Class Honors degree in 1941. Later that year she married the philosopher Peter Geach, whom she had met in her first year at Oxford after a mass at Blackfriars. They went on to have seven children.

After another year at St. Hugh's as a research student she moved to Newnham College, Cambridge, where she had a Research Fellowship. At Cambridge she met Ludwig Wittgenstein and attended his lectures, continuing to do so even after she had moved back to Oxford, to take up a Research Fellowship at Somerville College in 1946. She later had a Teaching Fellowship there until 1970, when she became the Professor of Philosophy at Cambridge University. She remained there until she retired from teaching in 1986.

Wittgenstein died in 1951, having named Anscombe as one of three literary executors of his estate. Her English translation of his Philosophical Investigations was published in 1953.

In 1956, because of President Truman’s having authorized the bombings of Hiroshima and Nagasaki, she publicly, but unsuccessfully, opposed Oxford University’s granting him an honorary degree. This was the beginning of the most fruitful period of her career, perhaps because she was driven by a sense of outrage that a man who had deliberately authorized the bombing of non-combatants could be so honored. Her book-length study of the nature of intentional action was published the following year, followed by the critical “Modern Moral Philosophy” the year after that.

Her inaugural lecture at Cambridge University in 1971 on “Causality and Determination” is now also regarded as something of a classic, and refers back to some points made in Intention.

She died in Cambridge on  January 5, 2001.

2. The First Person

In a typically Wittgensteinian way, Anscombe argued that some metaphysical theses are the result of our being misled by grammar. Her work on the first person singular is a good example of this way of dealing with philosophical problems. In her essay “The First Person,” Anscombe argues that the word I is not typically used to refer to an object, and so it does not refer to a non-physical soul or mind, but neither does it refer to a physical body. The word I is not a name I call myself. It is not a name at all, even though it can appear to be one.

If there is some question about who broke a vase then it is possible to make a mistake about who it was, and to be mistaken even about oneself having done it. For instance, you might think that you nudged it, but come to realize (perhaps after watching a video recording) that, although you came close, it was actually someone else who knocked it over. When we refer to a person we can, then, misidentify the person in question. But if I think to myself “I wonder what’s happening?” then no such misidentification is possible. This cannot be because I refers to my body and my body is always easy for me to identify, because one can misidentify whose body it was that did this or that. Anscombe points out that one could be in state of sensory deprivation and so quite unaware of one’s body (not of the fact that one has a body, of course, but of the body itself—ex hypothesi one’s awareness of one’s body, in this case, is temporarily non-existent). If I refers to anything that cannot be misidentified, in such a way that no mistake or failure of reference is possible, then it seems that René Descartes was right and I can only refer to a non-physical thinking thing, the “thinking that thinks this thought” (Anscombe 1981b, p. 31), which might not be the same thinking as thought any previous thoughts. According to Anscombe this is an absurdity that shows that I cannot be a referring expression at all.

The reason why David Hume sought unsuccessfully for his self (finding instead only a bundle of impressions and ideas) is that there is indeed no self, no thing to which I refers, because I does not refer to anything (not even a bundle). This is why there can be no misidentification: there is no identification at all, so it cannot go wrong. In order to say whether I am standing or not, I do not need (in normal circumstances) to look. According to Anscombe this is because I does not refer to anything I might see (or sense in any other way). Knowledge of what one is doing, like knowledge of one’s opinions, is non-observational. If it referred to an object, therefore, the object in question would have to be one that could be identified without being observed by means of the senses. The only way to avoid Cartesian absurdity, therefore, as Anscombe sees it, is to deny that the first person singular refers to anything at all. It is a word with a use but no reference. Failure to appreciate this grammatical feature, she holds, is what leads into the metaphysical mire of Descartes, Hume, and others who have speculated about the identity of the self.

3. Causation

Like Wittgenstein, Anscombe was concerned about the culture around her. Her work on causation is an attack on a conception of causality that, she says, “helps to form a cast of mind which is characteristic of our whole culture,” (Anscombe, p. 133). In this essay she rejects the then (and perhaps still) dominant view, which comes from Hume, that the cause of some effect must either necessitate it or else be connected to it by some law.  She does not deny that events are caused, but she does want to insist that it is usually possible for things to go awry.  An arsonist might use enough gasoline to burn down a house without the house’s burning down being necessitated by this act.  Something might happen to spoil his plans. And what this something might be cannot be specified in advance or in general, because it might be all kinds of things.  This means that any causal law linking a cause C with an effect E will have to be of the form: If C then E, other things being equal.  Very often other things are not equal, which is why the movement of the planets is relatively easy to predict but the movements of animals, for instance, are impossible to predict.  It is impossible in practice because we never have enough information about the animal’s environment (a squirrel might run by, throwing the animal off its course), brain chemistry (we simply do not know exactly how brains work yet), and so on, but it might also be impossible even in theory, given the effects of events at the quantum level.  These can, after all, spill over into the level of visible objects, since, to give one of Anscombe’s own examples, a Geiger counter could be connected to a bomb so that the bomb went off at some impossible-to-determine time, depending on ionizing radiation.  The explosion would then be caused but not in a way that could, even in principle, be predicted.

Similarly, Anscombe argues, if I contract a disease after having been exposed to it, then it is easy to see what caused my getting sick. But if all I knew was that I had been exposed to the disease then quite possibly no one would be able to tell whether I would become sick. It is much easier to trace an effect back to its cause than it is to read off the supposedly inevitable effects of any potential cause. We can therefore know that one thing caused another without knowing any true law involving a necessary connection between events of one general type and events of another.

It is sometimes said that one cannot observe causation, because we observe events but not the necessity with which we believe them to be connected. Anscombe objects that we do observe drinking, vocalizing, cutting, and breaking, and that these all appear to be kinds of causation. If a cat drinks some milk then the cat’s action caused the milk to leave the saucer. If a tailor cuts some cloth then it seems entirely possible to see the causing of the cloth’s being divided. Anyone who denies this, Anscombe suggests, does so on the basis of a prejudice or philosophical theory about observation and causality. They do not, as they might think, believe in the theory because unbiased reflection on experience tells us that this kind of theory is true.

4. Intention

If every bit of human behavior were determined by causal laws, then it might seem that the difference between intended and unintended results of action could not possibly matter. For if determinism is true, some people think, then we are not free to act one way or another and assigning responsibility for actions makes no sense. In that case, it looks as though only consequences could matter. Anscombe rejects both determinism and consequentialism. Her book Intention aims to shed light on the concept of intention, and hence on (intentional) action, and the difference between intentional, rational action and non-rational behavior. Although not easy to understand, it has been enormously influential. Donald Davidson, for instance, has called it the most important philosophical work on action since Aristotle.

All manner of movements occur in the world, but only some are counted as the behavior of agents.  In turn, only some of this behavior is counted as action.  For instance, I might toss and turn in my sleep, and this would normally be reckoned as human behavior, but no one would think to ask me why I rolled over at some particular time or twitched my leg just so. In a sense these are not things that I did. My leg twitched, my body moved, but I really had no say in the matter and so would have no answer to a question about my reason for moving in these ways. I might be able to explain the cause, but I would be in no better a position than anyone else to do so, unless I happen to be some sort of expert on human physiology. Action is not like this: it does make sense to ask someone why they did what they did.  In asking such a question we are typically asking about their intention, that is, what did they take themselves to be doing and what was their purpose in doing it.  In a sense, then, questions about intention are questions about the meaning of actions.  This sets them apart from questions about causes, since I might not know what caused me to sleep so restlessly but I cannot be so ignorant of my intentions.  I could hypothesize that dehydration caused me to sleep badly, but if I get up to drink some water then it is no hypothesis on my part that I am heading to the kitchen to get something to drink.  Nor is it a prediction about what I expect to happen once I reach the kitchen.  It is a statement of fact about what I am doing right now: going to the kitchen to drink some water.  Other descriptions of my behavior might be equally true.  For instance, that I am putting one foot in front of the other, making the floorboards creak, and so on.  But the statement of my intention, of what I take myself to be doing, is likely to be the most illuminating for anyone who wants to understand what I am doing (which is closely related to the question of why I am doing it).  If I am failing to achieve my goal it might be even more helpful to know what that goal was, since it will not be so clearly visible as it is in the cases in which I do achieve it.

The “class of intentional actions is a sub-class,” according to Anscombe, of “the class of things known without observation,” (Anscombe 2000, p. 14). Intentional actions are ones done for some reason, actions about which it makes sense to ask “Why?” and expect an answer that is not merely causal but explains what significance the action was taken to have for the agent. The intention is not itself a cause because causes (for example, a brick’s striking a window) are distinct from their effects (for example, the window’s breaking), whereas intentional actions are not distinct from the intentions they embody. To see this point more clearly, imagine a climber who loses the will to live and so lets go of the rock and falls to his death. This was intentional, an act of suicide. Now imagine that he simply loses his grip and falls. This is unintentional and not suicide but a tragic accident. Now imagine that he has a momentary suicidal impulse. Shocked by this thought he loses concentration and lets go, falling to his death. This fall was caused by a thought of suicide, perhaps even by an intention to commit suicide, but it was an accident still, caused by a shock rather than carried out deliberately. So intentional actions are not behavior caused by intentions. The intention is a part or an aspect of the act, not a prior event that causes it.

An accidental fall will not be judged morally by anyone, but some people regard suicide as a sin. Similarly, in general, we tend to think of unintentional behavior as largely irrelevant to ethics, while intentional actions are precisely what ethics is often taken to be about. This is one reason why it matters what intention is and how intentional actions are understood. Another is that, since intentional actions are so closely linked to the question “Why?”, understanding intention helps us to understand what goes on around us. Generally people act for reasons, and these reasons have to do with what seems good to the agents in question. Not everything that seems good really is good, of course, but not just anything can even seem good. If someone’s reason for acting is to get all his green books up on a roof then, in knowing this reason, we gain no understanding of why he is behaving as he does. His behavior is as unintelligible as it would have been if we had not been told his reason. So the behavior of our fellow human beings is only intelligible if we can and do relate it to a certain limited range of ideas about what might be regarded as good. We can see here some of the connection that Anscombe believes to exist between metaphysical questions and ethical ones.

Perhaps this explains why intentions matter, but what are intentions? We might think of them as mental objects, states, or events that give rise to certain types of behavior, but Anscombe rejects this view. If an intention were a mental object or event that caused actions in roughly the way that a falling domino causes another domino to fall then it would appear to be quite possible to be ignorant of one’s own intentions. I might try to guess at or hypothesize about the intention that caused me to do this or that, but perhaps only some kind of brain scan would ever settle the matter. And perhaps we are wrong sometimes about our intentions, especially if we forget or have subconscious motivations. Nevertheless it seems implausible to suggest that we do not normally know exactly what our intentions are. We intend to go to the grocery store and, sure enough, that is precisely what we do.

Another problem with the idea that intentions are causes is that there seems to be no reason in theory why what acts as a cause in one person could not do so in another, but this does not appear to be the case with intentions. One cannot intend to do something of which one has no conception, but one could (at least in principle) be caused to do such a thing. An infant cannot intend to open the New York Stock Exchange but, if the opening is done by ringing a bell, then it can be caused to do it, either by moving the baby’s hand or by some chain of events within its brain. It might just on its own intend to ring the bell, but it would not be intending to open the day’s financial dealings. It has no idea that there are such things as financial dealings.

If we want to understand other people’s behavior, then, not only can we not look at the causes of their behavior (since, for one thing, we cannot see inside their brains) but trying to do so would be a mistake. We need to know what they take themselves to be doing, how they understand their actions. And this knowledge does not come from observation of their own behavior. We know without looking what it is that we take ourselves to be doing, what we are trying to achieve, and so on. In this sense we know what we are doing even if in fact something is going wrong and we are not getting done what we mean to be getting done. For instance, someone might intend to write Anscombe’s name on a chalkboard. Imagine that, unbeknownst to her, the board has recently been washed and no chalk will adhere to it. Without looking at what she is writing, she goes ahead and writes “Anscombe” on the board. Or so she thinks. In fact, nothing is being written. In a sense, then, she is not writing at all and if she thinks she is then she is wrong. On the other hand, she is doing something. And the best way to understand what this is would be to ask her and have her answer sincerely, “I am writing Anscombe on the board.” We would then understand why she is holding a piece of chalk and moving her hand in just that way. (If she were to say that she was trying to write Anscombe on the board this might be more accurate, but it would also be misleading. It would suggest that she knew the task would not be easy and was perhaps pushing the chalk harder than normal in order to try to get the chalk to stick to it. But she is not trying in this sense, any more than we ordinarily try to do the things we do. We just do them.) In this sense, then, we know what we are doing because we know our intentions, and we do not have to look and see what we are doing to have this knowledge.

It is possible to act badly because of having a bad intention, of course, but it is also possible, as the example of writing on a wet chalkboard shows, for action to go wrong because of errors in execution. This is part of the point of Anscombe’s famous shopping list example (see Anscombe 2000, p. 56).  A shopping list acts as a kind of expression of what I intend to buy, or of what someone else has asked me to buy. The only kind of mistake I can make in using it (assuming that the list itself is correct) is if I overlook or misread something on the list and thus fail to buy it. This is a mistake in execution. If there is a mismatch between what I buy and what is on the list, in other words, then I have done my shopping badly. It is not that there is some flaw in the list. On the other hand, if someone else follows me and writes down everything I buy, but his list does not match what I buy, then there is a flaw in his list. So his list can be wrong in a way that mine cannot be. If now instead of a list written on paper we think of a list in my head, then we can see that my knowledge of what I am to buy cannot be falsified by how the facts turn out (for example, that I forget to buy tomatoes). That was a mistake in execution, not in intention. Unlike the man following me, I know what I intend to do, know what I am doing, without having to observe my behavior.

5. Consequentialism

Because, as she sees it, actions can be bad and can be known to be bad without observing them or their results, Anscombe rejects a large class of theories about ethics. One of her main contributions to ethics is the introduction of the word consequentialism as a label for these theories, along with an account of their alleged shortcomings. Consequentialism is the denial that there is any significant moral difference between results of action that are brought about intentionally and those that are foreseen but not intended. It might be thought of as the theory that intention is unimportant in ethics. Anscombe seems to have opposed this kind of theory for several reasons, which we will explore below. The word consequentialism is often used as a kind of technical synonym for utilitarianism, but it was coined by Anscombe (in “Modern Moral Philosophy”) precisely to distinguish a certain kind of moral theory from utilitarianism.  She apparently believed that neither Jeremy Bentham nor John Stuart Mill had a coherent moral philosophy, since each relied heavily on what she regarded as a hopelessly simplistic notion of happiness or pleasure.

Her main objection to consequentialism is a moral one. If all that matters is results, then there is no limit to what we might do in order to achieve the best results possible. In order to save the lives of many of our soldiers we might, for instance, murder a bunch of children. This is basically what she believed had been done in Hiroshima and Nagasaki, and it is unthinkable from her moral perspective. Indeed, it would have been unthinkable from the point of view of all major moral philosophers, including utilitarian ones, before Sidgwick. At least so she believes. Why she thinks this is not entirely clear, but Mill has certainly appeared to be a rule-utilitarian to some people, and rule-utilitarians typically defend rules forbidding murder. Perhaps Anscombe read Mill in this kind of way (she does not say). Another possibility is that she regards consequentialism as so unacceptable that it would be uncharitable to read anyone as holding it if their views are at all ambiguous. Mill’s views are certainly open to a variety of interpretations. What is clear is that Anscombe regarded the utilitarianism of Bentham and Mill as fatally flawed because it advocates the greatest happiness of the greatest number without (in her view) adequately specifying what is meant by happiness and without realizing (in her view) that “the greatest happiness of the greatest number” makes no sense (see Anscombe 1981a, p. 129).  She does not fully explain why she thinks this to be the case, but people have wondered whether the concern is, or should be, with the best happiness or the most, and of living people or all living sentient creatures or all future sentient creatures or what, and how one might measure happiness at all. So she might have thought that utilitarianism simply does not name an identifiable theory at all.

Another problem with consequentialism is its ignoring of intention, without which we seemingly cannot make sense of human behavior. This means that, while we can indeed pass judgment on actions in a consequentialist way, we cannot consistently live as if consequentialism were true. We cannot, that is, live our whole lives as if intentions do not matter, even though we can pretend that they do not when deciding what to do or expressing approval or disapproval of actions. Consequentialists then are almost inevitably in bad faith. They pretend to believe what they cannot and do not in fact believe.

6. Moral Obligation

Before “Modern Moral Philosophy” was published, the main kind of ethical theory other than utilitarianism to which philosophers adhered was Kantian deontology, which, in its purest form, says that certain acts are forbidden or permissible, regardless of their consequences. Anscombe questions who or what might be supposed to do the forbidding or permitting in question.  Traditionally (as she sees it) the answer was God.  But many philosophers, even religious ones, do not want to import faith in God into their theories.  So what could be meant by a theory, conceived as independent of faith in God, according to which some acts are allowed or right or even obligatory while others are forbidden or wrong?  One cannot meaningfully obligate oneself, Anscombe believes, and the idea that something like society or the government is doing the allowing here is not what is wanted by people who theorize in this way.  Anscombe’s conclusion is that talk of moral obligation, moral duty, a special moral sense of the word ought, and so on, are in fact meaningless.

This is not to say that all talk of obligation and the rest should be dropped. Indeed, Anscombe writes that we ought not to try to drop such talk.  By this, of course, she means that it would be a bad idea to try to do so.  But by bad here she means that it would not be prudent or sensible.  She does not mean bad in some allegedly special or uniquely moral sense.

It is sometimes thought that Anscombe is saying that only religious believers are entitled to talk or think about moral obligation or what one morally ought to do. This is not the case. Her claim is rather that philosophers often use words such as morally ought in a way that makes no sense. She is not forbidding anything. She quite explicitly is not forbidding the use of the word ought. Nor would she forbid the use of the words morally ought in some situations. For instance, if a vegetarian tells you that you ought not to eat an underdone piece of chicken it might be unclear whether she is speaking about ethics or about food safety, and you might quite reasonably (in Anscombe’s view) ask whether she means ought in a moral sense or just the normal, prudential sense.

What Anscombe objects to is a secular use of religious concepts (not mere words). There is a religious tradition according to which certain kinds of action are commanded and others are forbidden by God. Within this tradition, the human race has an historical relationship with God, in which various promises have been made, covenants agreed to, and so on. It makes sense, therefore, to talk within this tradition of being bound or obliged to do this or that. It makes no sense, however, to think that one is equally bound in just the same way if this tradition is rejected or bracketed, set aside, for philosophical purposes. It is at best misleading, therefore, if anyone means to do philosophy in a religiously non-committal way but still asks what acts are forbidden, sinful, permissible, and so on. One problem with such language is that it seems to imply the very religious framework that is explicitly disavowed by the philosophers in question who use it.

Another is that it is so imprecise. For instance, if an atheist philosopher argues that abortion is permissible not only are we likely to be thrown by her religious-sounding choice of words, but we also do not know whether by permissible she means just, or likely to promote utility, or rational, or what. Anscombe’s argument is that such philosophers ought instead to use words such as just. This way we will have a much better idea what is being said. Judith Jarvis Thomson’s famous defense of abortion, for example, makes clear that she is talking about the justice of abortion, whether it violates the rights of the fetus, not whether it is callous or indecent, say. This is the kind of clarification that Anscombe recommends.

Sometimes, she adds, it will be immediately clear whether what is being said is true or false if we use more precise terms of moral evaluation such as just and unjust. Whether abortion is just is not immediately clear to many people, but the injustice of the judicial execution of those known to be innocent is clear. This is the example that Anscombe uses most often. The suggestion that deliberately killing tens of thousands of innocent non-combatants, including children, would be permissible is a vague one. The suggestion that it would be just is clearly false. The suggestion that it would be useful might be clearly true. If we used the more precise terms just and useful then we could at least see that the debate was between the relative importance of justice and utility. If we insist on using words such as permissible and wrong then we might fail to understand what is at issue. It is largely clarity that Anscombe urges philosophers to strive for.

Her rejection of both consequentialism and obligation-centered deontological ethical theories has been a major reason for the rise of virtue ethics. That being said, it is worth repeating that Anscombe does not reject all talk of moral obligation. For instance, if I make a promise or sign a contract then this brings certain obligations with it. In the case of promising, we might call this a moral obligation, to distinguish it from the kind of legal obligation that a contract might create. This kind of obligation is not absolute in the way that some people think the obligation not to commit murder is, however. Only the person who happens to have made a promise is obligated by it, for one thing. For another, promises can reasonably be ignored in exceptional circumstances. Thirdly, promising itself is a useful but not necessarily essential human practice. It is, Anscombe thinks, only against the background, or within the context, of this kind of practice that saying “I promise to do x” binds the speaker to do x. (In contrast, she regards murder as forbidden to all people in all circumstances.)

This relates to the easily misunderstood notion of what Anscombe calls brute facts. In her essay “On Brute Facts” she writes: “In relation to many descriptions of events or states of affairs which are asserted to hold, we can ask what the ‘brute facts’ were; and this will mean the facts which held, and in virtue of which, in a proper context, such-and-such a description is true or false, and which are more ‘brute’ than the alleged facts answering to that description” (Anscombe 1981a, p. 24). Take the state of affairs that, I assert, you owe me money. The brute facts in such a case would be the ones that make it true (if it is true) that you owe me money. For instance, my having given you money last week and your having promised to pay me back would be brute facts in this case. Anscombe is explicit that the context is relevant and that exceptional circumstances can always make a difference. It looks straightforward that if I loaned you money and you promised to pay it back then you owe me money, but you might not owe me anything if we were both clearly joking when the loan was made, or if I have died and left no family behind, or if the planet is about the be destroyed by meteors, or ….

So brute facts are, by definition, always brute relative to some description of an event or state of affairs. Brute here does not mean absolute as opposed to relative. Furthermore, while brute facts make descriptions true, they do so only other things being equal. Other things can fail to be equal in innumerable, unforeseeable ways, and so obligations of this kind can never be said to be absolute in the sense of being without exception. Nevertheless, in normal circumstances, if you have promised to do something then you really are obliged to do it, just as in chess bishops really do have to move diagonally (if at all) and, in the United States, cars really do have to drive on the right hand side of the road. These obligations are real and important even though the rules might be different (for example, in Great Britain cars drive on the left) and even though, in certain circumstances, they might be ignored (for example, you are rushing to a hospital and no other vehicles are on the road so no one cares what side you drive on, or the world is coming to an end so no one cares about anything much at all). Certain practices have rules and these rules oblige us to behave in certain ways, but a) exceptions can be made within the practices themselves, and b) there is no obligation (although there may be good reason) to engage in these practices in the first place. In this sense the obligation to keep a promise is not an absolute obligation.

This is not to say, however, that there are no absolutes in ethics. Certainly Anscombe believes that murder is never justified. If there is an obligation not to commit murder then it does not stem from our having chosen to engage in some human practice that forbids it. Anscombe might say that we must not murder because God has forbidden it. Or she might regard it as ruled out by considerations of justice. Or by a mystical perception of the value of human life. In “Murder and the Morality of Euthanasia” she writes that, “The prohibition [on murder] is so basic that it is difficult to answer the question as to why murder is intrinsically wrongful” (Anscombe 2005, p. 266). Her use of the word prohibition, however, suggests that she is thinking of murder as something forbidden by God. Given her thoughts on the notion of moral obligation, after all, we might surely ask who else might prohibit it? Whether this speculation about her meaning is right or not, she clearly does regard the intentional killing of the innocent as prohibited, and this is hugely relevant to her thinking about both the ethics of warfare and sexual ethics.

7. Military Ethics

Anscombe’s first philosophical publication was a pamphlet of which she was joint author (with Norman Daniel) protesting at the prospect of the Second World War in 1939. In her view this war was likely to be fought for unjust reasons and with unjust means.  According to her interpretation of the rules and of the statements of the relevant politicians, traditional rules of war would be broken by the British Government if it went to war with Germany.  This was not, of course, a reflection of Anscombe’s attitude toward Nazi Germany.  Some war against that country might have been justified, but not the war that she saw coming, with, for instance, its attacks on civilians.

She continued her support for traditional Christian thinking about military ethics after the war was over. Most notably, she led the protest against Oxford University’s decision to award an honorary degree to the man who ordered the use of atomic weapons against Japan, President Harry S. Truman. In her essay on “War and Murder,” she defends the so-called Doctrine of Double Effect and rejects pacifism.  Despite having such high standards that she opposed even the British fight against the Nazis, Anscombe stops short of all out pacifism because she thinks that one’s moral standards should be high but not too high.  Pacifism calls for no use of violence ever, no matter what, which is an ideal that many people can claim to respect but that very few can live with.  The result, as she sees it, is that they pay lip service to the ideal of pacifism, go to war anyway, and then see no reason to observe any restrictions whatever on how the war is fought.  In this way pacifism actually does harm.

The Doctrine of Double Effect points out that actions can be regarded as having two kinds of foreseen effects: the intended and the not intended (merely foreseen).  It allows actions that have bad foreseen effects so long as these are not intended, so long as the actions themselves are not forbidden, and so long as the likely good consequences of the action outweigh its likely bad consequences.  In any war we can foresee that innocent people will be killed in cases of friendly fire and collateral damage, for example.  And killing the innocent is often regarded as forbidden.  It does not follow, Anscombe argues, that we must be pacifists.  Causing some collateral damage does not make one a murderer as long as one is engaged in a just war, fighting justly, (intentionally) targeting only legitimate military targets, and not launching attacks whose effects are likely to be more bad than good.

Critics of the doctrine sometimes object that one can make an otherwise forbidden act all right by simply redescribing it in one’s mind. For instance, one might claim to be intending to lower enemy morale by destroying a city and merely to foresee that innocent people in the city would be killed. One thing that this ignores, however, is that an intention is not a mental act, like a kind of whispering under one’s breath. In normal circumstances, one does what one intends, so the intention is observable in the physical world. Referees can call intentional fouls without having to be mind-readers. Saying “oops” or “I think I’ll just stretch my leg” in one’s head as one trips an opponent does not make the foul less intentional. So this criticism seems to be misguided. (It is true, though, Anscombe notes, that some people do try to abuse the doctrine by treating intention in this misguided kind of way.)

Perhaps more serious is Jonathan Glover’s objection that blowing up a passenger ferry bound for Nazi-occupied territory with both innocent people and the means for making an atomic bomb on it would have to count as intentional murder, and therefore forbidden, even though the consequences of allowing the ferry to reach its destination might be disastrous (see his Humanity: A Moral History of the Twentieth Century, Yale University Press, 2001, p. 108). The temptation to think like a consequentialist in such cases is rather strong. Anscombe might reply, however, that the actual goal in this case is preventing the Nazis from acquiring atomic weapons. So the deaths of the passengers, though certainly foreseen, are really not what is intended. Hence the sinking of the ferry might well turn out to be permissible after all. Unlike the case of terror bombing, where the desired terror would not have been created without innocent deaths, the ferry could have been sunk without the loss of innocent life (if no one had been on it).

8. Sexual Ethics

Anscombe was a devout Catholic.  She opposed abortion, contraception, gay sex, and gay marriage.  Her view of abortion was not that it was murder but that it was either murder or something very nearly as bad as murder. (Whether it actually is murder depends on whether a fetus is a person or has a soul and, if so, at what stage, which Anscombe regarded as a technical question of little but academic interest.)  It is, she believed, the deliberate destruction of the beginning of a human life. Sex, the means of this beginning, is something that she regarded as naturally associated with shame. Not in the sense that people who have sex ought to be ashamed of themselves or feel guilty, but in the sense that it is the kind of thing that belongs to one’s private life. We would no more have sex casually than we would leave home naked casually. This is because we recognize, however dimly, that sex is, to put it bluntly, a big deal. And this is connected with the fact that sex is how babies are made, and the fact that the life of a baby is a big deal. These connections should not be taken as steps in a logical argument, however, as if we can know by reasoning straightforwardly from the value of human life that casual sex is wrong. In her essay “Contraception and Chastity,” Anscombe says that our knowledge that casual sex dishonors the body is a “mystical perception,” much like the perception that a dead human body is not something one should leave out with the trash (Anscombe 2008, p. 187). She says in this essay also that there is no such thing as casual sex and that everyone knows this. That is, there are no sexual acts that are not significant, and those who pretend otherwise become shallow. She does not claim to be able to prove this though.

Contraception is not quite the same as abortion, but it is bad in a related way, she thinks.  She distinguishes between two kinds of sexual intercourse: the kind that is intended to be non-procreative and the kind that is not so intended.  Any sexual act that never could lead to procreation, such as masturbation, is in the former category, and so is sex using contraception.  Sexual acts that could lead to procreation but that will not because at least one partner is naturally infertile fall in the latter category.  Acts of the first type are abuses of our generative organs, treating as mere vehicles of pleasure the very means to bring new life into the world.  Acts of the second type, on the other hand, are perfectly all right, so long as one does not make a point of only having sex when one knows that pregnancy is impossible, one does not get too addicted to sexual pleasure, and one has sex only within marriage as traditionally defined, so that any children will likely have a father and a mother to take care of them.

In her opinion, gay sex is wrong then in exactly the same way, and for the same reason, that masturbation is wrong.  It is a use of the sexual organs that can never lead to procreation, and thus a kind of insult to life itself.  Gay marriage is a union founded on an agreement to engage in this kind of activity, and is hence unacceptable.

Anscombe suggests that masturbators and gay people are bound to be unhappy, and critics have responded with examples of gay people who seem, on the contrary, to have flourished. This might be a point worth making, but it misses the central claim in her argument. This is that unnatural kinds of sex, those that embody an intention to have sex without the possibility of conception, fail to show the proper regard for life. The real problem this argument faces, whether one supports it or not, is the seemingly inescapable vagueness of the notion of proper regard. This vagueness exists within Anscombe’s beliefs about how much sex married couples should have. They should, she thinks, have some, but not too much. And she struggles to specify how much is too much. They should not be addicted to sex, she apparently thinks, but should “render the marriage debt” to one another (Anscombe 1981a, p. 92). One need not doubt that there is such a thing as proper respect for life, or for sex, in order to doubt how precisely one can make out what exactly falls within the limits of such regard and what does not.

As for gay marriage, similarly, Anscombe argues that only if a marriage is of the kind that could lead to children being brought into the world (that is, if it is a heterosexual marriage, even if one or both partners is known to be infertile) is its beginning an event worthy of ceremony. And, she implies, if its beginning is not an event worthy of ceremony then it is not a proper marriage. It is hard to see exactly how this kind of view can avoid regarding infertile marriages as somehow belonging to a second class. It is also hard to see how one could ever work out exactly which events are worthy of ceremony (and how much, and of what kind) in the first place. Some critics have argued that if Anscombe is right then this or that bad consequence would follow. The problem appears to be more that nothing at all follows with any clarity from her premises, whether one accepts them or not. This is not to say that Anscombe is wrong to believe that ceremony is in order at a wedding. What it is to say is that the perception that ceremony is in order is not the kind of perception that is readily testable or precisely measurable. In a word it is subjective or, as Anscombe sometimes puts it, mystical. When mystical perception is not universal it is hard to use it as the basis for arguments over controversial subjects.

9. References and Further Reading

Anscombe’s translations of, and commentaries on, works by Wittgenstein are certainly important, but will not be listed here. The same goes for her other work in the history of philosophy. The following bibliography is not intended to be comprehensive but rather is meant as an introductory guide.

a. Primary Works

  • Anscombe, G. E. M. Ethics, Religion and Politics: Collected Philosophical Papers Volume III. Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1981a
    • Includes “Modern Moral Philosophy,” “On Brute Facts,” “War and Murder,” and “Mr Truman’s Degree.”
  • Anscombe, G. E. M. Faith in a Hard Ground: Essays on Religion, Philosophy and Ethics by G. E. M. Anscombe, edited by Mary Geach and Luke Gormally. Exeter, UK: Imprint Academic, 2008.
    • Includes the well known essay “Contraception and Chastity.”
  • Anscombe, G. E. M. Human Life, Action and Ethics: Essays by G. E. M. Anscombe, edited by Mary Geach and Luke Gormally. Exeter, UK: Imprint Academic, 2005.
    • Includes the essay “Does Oxford Moral Philosophy Corrupt Youth?”
  • Anscombe, G. E. M. Intention. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2000.
    • Extremely important for understanding contemporary philosophy of action and much of Anscombe’s work generally.
  • Anscombe, G. E. M. Metaphysics and the Philosophy of Mind: Collected Philosophical Papers Volume II. Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1981b.
    • A good place to start with Anscombe’s work in metaphysics. Includes “The First Person,” “Causality and Determination,” and a short essay on “Intention.”

b. Secondary Works

Some of Anscombe’s work, especially the essays dealing with sexual and military ethics, was written for a general audience. The rest of it, however, can be very hard going, even for professional philosophers. Useful secondary sources include:

  • Diamond, Cora and Jenny Teichman, eds. Intention and Intentionality: Essays in Honour of G. E. M. Anscombe. Brighton, UK: The Harvester Press, 1979.
    • Includes essays on the first person, intention, ethics (including both military and sexual ethics), and other issues addressed by Anscombe.
  • Ford, Anton, Jennifer Hornsby, and Frederick Stoutland, eds. Essays on Anscombe’s Intention. Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press, 2011.
  • O’Hear, Anthony, ed. Modern Moral Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004.
    • A collection of essays relating, sometimes indirectly, to Anscombe’s famous essay.
  • Richter, Duncan Anscombe’s Moral Philosophy Lanham, Maryland: Lexington Books, 2011.
    • An introduction to Anscombe’s theoretical and practical work in ethics.
  • Teichmann, Roger, ed. Logic, Cause and Action: Essays in Honour of Elizabeth Anscombe. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
    • A short collection of essays on various aspects of Anscombe’s work.
  • Teichmann, Roger The Philosophy of Elizabeth Anscombe. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2008.
    • The only book length study of the whole of Anscombe’s work.


Author Information

Duncan Richter
Virginia Military Institute
U. S. A.

The Sophists (Ancient Greek)

The sophists were itinerant professional teachers and intellectuals who frequented Athens and other Greek cities in the second half of the fifth century B.C.E. In return for a fee, the sophists offered young wealthy Greek men an education in aretē (virtue or excellence), thereby attaining wealth and fame while also arousing significant antipathy. Prior to the fifth century B.C.E., aretē was predominately associated with aristocratic warrior virtues such as courage and physical strength. In democratic Athens of the latter fifth century B.C.E., however, aretē was increasingly understood in terms of the ability to influence one’s fellow citizens in political gatherings through rhetorical persuasion; the sophistic education both grew out of and exploited this shift. The most famous representatives of the sophistic movement are Protagoras, Gorgias, Antiphon, Hippias, Prodicus and Thrasymachus.

The historical and philological difficulties confronting an interpretation of the sophists are significant. Only a handful of sophistic texts have survived and most of what we know of the sophists is drawn from second-hand testimony, fragments and the generally hostile depiction of them in Plato’s dialogues.

The philosophical problem of the nature of sophistry is arguably even more formidable. Due in large part to the influence of Plato and Aristotle, the term sophistry has come to signify the deliberate use of fallacious reasoning, intellectual charlatanism and moral unscrupulousness. It is, as the article explains, an oversimplification to think of the historical sophists in these terms because they made genuine and original contributions to Western thought. Plato and Aristotle nonetheless established their view of what constitutes legitimate philosophy in part by distinguishing their own activity – and that of Socrates – from the sophists. If one is so inclined, sophistry can thus be regarded, in a conceptual as well as historical sense, as the ‘other’ of philosophy.

Perhaps because of the interpretative difficulties mentioned above, the sophists have been many things to many people. For Hegel (1995/1840) the sophists were subjectivists whose sceptical reaction to the objective dogmatism of the presocratics was synthesised in the work of Plato and Aristotle. For the utilitarian English classicist George Grote (1904), the sophists were progressive thinkers who placed in question the prevailing morality of their time. More recent work by French theorists such as Jacques Derrida (1981) and Jean Francois-Lyotard (1985) suggests affinities between the sophists and postmodernism.

This article provides a broad overview of the sophists, and indicates some of the central philosophical issues raised by their work. Section 1 discusses the meaning of the term sophist. Section 2 surveys the individual contributions of the most famous sophists. Section 3 examines three themes that have often been taken as characteristic of sophistic thought: the distinction between nature and convention, relativism about knowledge and truth and the power of speech. Finally, section 4 analyses attempts by Plato and others to establish a clear demarcation between philosophy and sophistry.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. The Sophists
    1. Protagoras
    2. Gorgias
    3. Antiphon
    4. Hippias
    5. Prodicus
    6. Thrasymachus
  3. Major Themes of Sophistic Thought
    1. Nature and Convention
    2. Relativism
    3. Language and Reality
  4. The Distinction Between Philosophy and Sophistry
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources
    3. Other Reading

1. Introduction

The term sophist (sophistēs) derives from the Greek words for wisdom (sophia) and wise (sophos). Since Homer at least, these terms had a wide range of application, extending from practical know-how and prudence in public affairs to poetic ability and theoretical knowledge. Notably, the term sophia could be used to describe disingenuous cleverness long before the rise of the sophistic movement. Theognis, for example, writing in the sixth century B.C.E., counsels Cyrnos to accommodate his discourse to different companions, because such cleverness (sophiē) is superior to even a great excellence (Elegiac Poems, 1072, 213).

In the fifth century B.C.E. the term sophistēs was still broadly applied to ‘wise men’, including poets such as Homer and Hesiod, the Seven Sages, the Ionian ‘physicists’ and a variety of seers and prophets. The narrower use of the term to refer to professional teachers of virtue or excellence (aretē) became prevalent in the second half of the fifth century B.C.E., although this should not be taken to imply the presence of a clear distinction between philosophers, such as Socrates, and sophists, such as Protagoras, Gorgias and Prodicus. This much is evident from Aristophanes’ play The Clouds (423 B.C.E.), in which Socrates is depicted as a sophist and Prodicus praised for his wisdom.

Aristophanes’ play is a good starting point for understanding Athenian attitudes towards sophists. The Clouds depicts the tribulations of Strepsiades, an elderly Athenian citizen with significant debts. Deciding that the best way to discharge his debts is to defeat his creditors in court, he attends The Thinkery, an institute of higher education headed up by the sophist Socrates. When he fails to learn the art of speaking in The Thinkery, Strepsiades persuades his initially reluctant son, Pheidippides, to accompany him. Here they encounter two associates of Socrates, the Stronger and the Weaker Arguments, who represent lives of justice and self-discipline and injustice and self-indulgence respectively. On the basis of a popular vote, the Weaker Argument prevails and leads Pheidippides into The Thinkery for an education in how to make the weaker argument defeat the stronger. Strepsiades later revisits The Thinkery and finds that Socrates has turned his son into a pale and useless intellectual. When Pheidippides graduates, he subsequently prevails not only over Strepsiades’ creditors, but also beats his father and offers a persuasive rhetorical justification for the act. As Pheidippides prepares to beat his mother, Strepsiades’ indignation motivates him to lead a violent mob attack on The Thinkery.

Aristophanes’ depiction of Socrates the sophist is revealing on at least three levels. In the first instance, it demonstrates that the distinction between Socrates and his sophistic counterparts was far from clear to their contemporaries. Although Socrates did not charge fees and frequently asserted that all he knew was that he was ignorant of most matters, his association with the sophists reflects both the indeterminacy of the term sophist and the difficulty, at least for the everyday Athenian citizen, of distinguishing his methods from theirs. Secondly, Aristophanes’ depiction suggests that the sophistic education reflected a decline from the heroic Athens of earlier generations. Thirdly, the attribution to the sophists of intellectual deviousness and moral dubiousness predates Plato and Aristotle.

Hostility towards sophists was a significant factor in the decision of the Athenian dēmos to condemn Socrates to the death penalty for impiety. Anytus, who was one of Socrates’ accusers at his trial, was clearly unconcerned with details such as that the man he accused did not claim to teach aretē or extract fees for so doing. He is depicted by Plato as suggesting that sophists are the ruin of all those who come into contact with them and as advocating their expulsion from the city (Meno, 91c-92c). Equally as revealing, in terms of attitudes towards the sophists, is Socrates’ discussion with Hippocrates, a wealthy young Athenian keen to become a pupil of Protagoras (Protagoras, 312a). Hippocrates is so eager to meet Protagoras that he wakes Socrates in the early hours of the morning, yet later concedes that he himself would be ashamed to be known as a sophist by his fellow citizens.

Plato depicts Protagoras as well aware of the hostility and resentment engendered by his profession (Protagoras, 316c-e). It is not surprising, Protagoras suggests, that foreigners who profess to be wise and persuade the wealthy youth of powerful cities to forsake their family and friends and consort with them would arouse suspicion. Indeed, Protagoras claims that the sophistic art is an ancient one, but that sophists of old, including poets such as Homer, Hesiod and Simonides, prophets, seers and even physical trainers, deliberately did not adopt the name for fear of persecution. Protagoras says that while he has adopted a strategy of openly professing to be a sophist, he has taken other precautions – perhaps including his association with the Athenian general Pericles – in order to secure his safety.

The low standing of the sophists in Athenian public opinion does not stem from a single source. No doubt suspicion of intellectuals among the many was a factor. New money and democratic decision-making, however, also constituted a threat to the conservative Athenian aristocratic establishment. This threatening social change is reflected in the attitudes towards the concept of excellence or virtue (aretē) alluded to in the summary above. Whereas in the Homeric epics aretē generally denotes the strength and courage of a real man, in the second half of the fifth century B.C.E. it increasingly became associated with success in public affairs through rhetorical persuasion.

In the context of Athenian political life of the late fifth century B.C.E. the importance of skill in persuasive speech, or rhetoric, cannot be underestimated. The development of democracy made mastery of the spoken word not only a precondition of political success but also indispensable as a form of self-defence in the event that one was subject to a lawsuit. The sophists accordingly answered a growing need among the young and ambitious. Meno, an ambitious pupil of Gorgias, says that the aretē – and hence function – of a man is to rule over people, that is, manage his public affairs so as to benefit his friends and harm his enemies (73c-d). This is a long-standing ideal, but one best realised in democratic Athens through rhetoric. Rhetoric was thus the core of the sophistic education (Protagoras, 318e), even if most sophists professed to teach a broader range of subjects.

Suspicion towards the sophists was also informed by their departure from the aristocratic model of education (paideia). Since Homeric Greece, paideia had been the preoccupation of the ruling nobles and was based around a set of moral precepts befitting an aristocratic warrior class. The business model of the sophists presupposed that aretē could be taught to all free citizens, a claim that Protagoras implicitly defends in his great speech regarding the origins of justice. The sophists were thus a threat to the status quo because they made an indiscriminate promise – assuming capacity to pay fees – to provide the young and ambitious with the power to prevail in public life.

One could therefore loosely define sophists as paid teachers of aretē, where the latter is understood in terms of the capacity to attain and exercise political power through persuasive speech. This is only a starting point, however, and the broad and significant intellectual achievement of the sophists, which we will consider in the following two sections, has led some to ask whether it is possible or desirable to attribute them with a unique method or outlook that would serve as a unifying characteristic while also differentiating them from philosophers.

Scholarship in the nineteenth century and beyond has often fastened on method as a way of differentiating Socrates from the sophists. For Henry Sidgwick (1872, 288-307), for example, whereas Socrates employed a question-and-answer method in search of the truth, the sophists gave long epideictic or display speeches for the purposes of persuasion. It seems difficult to maintain a clear methodical differentiation on this basis, given that Gorgias and Protagoras both claimed proficiency in short speeches and that Socrates engages in long eloquent speeches – many in mythical form – throughout the Platonic dialogues. It is moreover simply misleading to say that the sophists were in all cases unconcerned with truth, as to assert the relativity of truth is itself to make a truth claim. A further consideration is that Socrates is guilty of fallacious reasoning in many of the Platonic dialogues, although this point is less relevant if we assume that Socrates’ logical errors are unintentional.

G.B. Kerferd (1981a) has proposed a more nuanced set of methodological criteria to differentiate Socrates from the sophists. According to Kerferd, the sophists employed eristic and antilogical methods of argument, whereas Socrates disdained the former and saw the latter as a necessary but incomplete step on the way towards dialectic. Plato uses the term eristic to denote the practice – it is not strictly speaking a method – of seeking victory in argument without regard for the truth. We find a representation of eristic techniques in Plato’s dialogue Euthydemus, where the brothers Euthydemus and Dionysiodorous deliberately use egregiously fallacious arguments for the purpose of contradicting and prevailing over their opponent. Antilogic is the method of proceeding from a given argument, usually that offered by an opponent, towards the establishment of a contrary or contradictory argument in such a way that the opponent must either abandon his first position or accept both positions. This method of argumentation was employed by most of the sophists, and examples are found in the works of Protagoras and Antiphon.

Kerferd’s claim that we can distinguish between philosophy and sophistry by appealing to dialectic remains problematic, however. In what are usually taken to be the “early” Platonic dialogues, we find Socrates’ employing a dialectical method of refutation referred to as the elenchus. As Nehamas has argued (1990), while the elenchus is distinguishable from eristic because of its concern with the truth, it is harder to differentiate from antilogic because its success is always dependent upon the capacity of interlocutors to defend themselves against refutation in a particular case. In Plato’s “middle” and “later” dialogues, on the other hand, according to Nehamas’ interpretation, Plato associates dialectic with knowledge of the forms, but this seemingly involves an epistemological and metaphysical commitment to a transcendent ontology that most philosophers, then and now, would be reluctant to uphold.

More recent attempts to explain what differentiates philosophy from sophistry have accordingly tended to focus on a difference in moral purpose or in terms of choices for different ways way of life, as Aristotle elegantly puts it (Metaphysics IV, 2, 1004b24-5). Section 4 will return to the question of whether this is the best way to think about the distinction between philosophy and sophistry. Before this, however, it is useful to sketch the biographies and interests of the most prominent sophists and also consider some common themes in their thought.

2. The Sophists

a. Protagoras

Protagoras of Abdera (c. 490-420 B.C.E.) was the most prominent member of the sophistic movement and Plato reports he was the first to charge fees using that title (Protagoras, 349a). Despite his animus towards the sophists, Plato depicts Protagoras as quite a sympathetic and dignified figure.

One of the more intriguing aspects of Protagoras’ life and work is his association with the great Athenian general and statesman Pericles (c. 495-429 B.C.E.). Pericles, who was the most influential statesman in Athens for more than 30 years, including the first two years of the Peloponnesian War, seems to have held a high regard for philosophers and sophists, and Protagoras in particular, entrusting him with the role of drafting laws for the Athenian foundation city of Thurii in 444 B.C.E.

From a philosophical perspective, Protagoras is most famous for his relativistic account of truth – in particular the claim that ‘man is the measure of all things’ – and his agnosticism concerning the Gods. The first topic will be discussed in section 3b. Protagoras’ agnosticism is famously articulated in the claim that ‘concerning the gods I am not in a position to know either that (or how) they are or that (or how) they are not, or what they are like in appearance; for there are many things that prevent knowledge, the obscurity of the matter and the brevity of human life’ (DK, 80B4). This seems to express a form of religious agnosticism not completely foreign to educated Athenian opinion. Despite this, according to tradition, Protagoras was convicted of impiety towards the end of his life. As a consequence, so the story goes, his books were burnt and he drowned at sea while departing Athens. It is perhaps significant in this context that Protagoras seems to have been the source of the sophistic claim to ‘make the weaker argument defeat the stronger’ parodied by Aristophanes.

Plato suggests that Protagoras sought to differ his educational offering from that of other sophists, such as Hippias, by concentrating upon instruction in aretē in the sense of political virtue rather than specialised studies such as astronomy and mathematics (Protagoras, 318e).

Apart from his works Truth and On the Gods, which deal with his relativistic account of truth and agnosticism respectively, Diogenes Laertius says that Protagoras wrote the following books: Antilogies, Art of Eristics, Imperative, On Ambition, On Incorrect Human Actions, On those in Hades, On Sciences, On Virtues, On Wrestling, On the Original State of Things and Trial over a Fee.

b. Gorgias

Gorgias of Leontini (c.485 - c.390 B.C.E.) is generally considered as a member of the sophistic movement, despite his disavowal of the capacity to teach aretē (Meno, 96c). The major focus of Gorgias was rhetoric and given the importance of persuasive speaking to the sophistic education, and his acceptance of fees, it is appropriate to consider him alongside other famous sophists for present purposes.

Gorgias visited Athens in 427 B.C.E. as the leader of an embassy from Leontini with the successful intention of persuading the Athenians to make an alliance against Syracuse. He travelled extensively around Greece, earning large sums of money by giving lessons in rhetoric and epideictic speeches.

Plato’s Gorgias depicts the rhetorician as something of a celebrity, who either does not have well thought out views on the implications of his expertise, or is reluctant to share them, and who denies his responsibility for the unjust use of rhetorical skill by errant students. Although Gorgias presents himself as moderately upstanding, the dramatic structure of Plato’s dialogue suggests that the defence of injustice by Polus and the appeal to the natural right of the stronger by Callicles are partly grounded in the conceptual presuppositions of Gorgianic rhetoric.

Gorgias’ original contribution to philosophy is sometimes disputed, but the fragments of his works On Not Being or Nature and Helen – discussed in detail in section 3c – feature intriguing claims concerning the power of rhetorical speech and a style of argumentation reminiscent of Parmenides and Zeno. Gorgias is also credited with other orations and encomia and a technical treatise on rhetoric titled At the Right Moment in Time.

c. Antiphon

The biographical details surrounding Antiphon the sophist (c. 470-411 B.C.) are unclear – one unresolved issue is whether he should be identified with Antiphon of Rhamnus (a statesman and teacher of rhetoric who was a member of the oligarchy which held power in Athens briefly in 411 B.C.E.). However, since the publication of fragments from his On Truth in the early twentieth century he has been regarded as a major representative of the sophistic movement.

On Truth, which features a range of positions and counterpositions on the relationship between nature and convention (see section 3a below), is sometimes considered an important text in the history of political thought because of its alleged advocacy of egalitarianism:

Those born of illustrious fathers we respect and honour, whereas those who come from an undistinguished house we neither respect nor honour. In this we behave like barbarians towards one another. For by nature we all equally, both barbarians and Greeks, have an entirely similar origin: for it is fitting to fulfil the natural satisfactions which are necessary to all men: all have the ability to fulfil these in the same way, and in all this none of us is different either as barbarian or as Greek; for we all breathe into the air with mouth and nostrils and we all eat with the hands (quoted in Untersteiner, 1954).

Whether this statement should be taken as expressing the actual views of Antiphon, or rather as part of an antilogical presentation of opposing views on justice remains an open question, as does whether such a position rules out the identification of Antiphon the sophist with the oligarchical Antiphon of Rhamnus.

d. Hippias

The exact dates for Hippias of Elis are unknown, but scholars generally assume that he lived during the same period as Protagoras. Whereas Plato’s depictions of Protagoras – and to a lesser extent Gorgias – indicate a modicum of respect, he presents Hippias as a comic figure who is obsessed with money, pompous and confused.

Hippias is best known for his polymathy (DK 86A14). His areas of expertise seem to have included astronomy, grammar, history, mathematics, music, poetry, prose, rhetoric, painting and sculpture. Like Gorgias and Prodicus, he served as an ambassador for his home city. His work as a historian, which included compiling lists of Olympic victors, was invaluable to Thucydides and subsequent historians as it allowed for a more precise dating of past events. In mathematics he is attributed with the discovery of a curve – the quadratrix – used to trisect an angle.

In terms of his philosophical contribution, Kerferd has suggested, on the basis of Plato’s Hippias Major (301d-302b), that Hippias advocated a theory that classes or kinds of thing are dependent on a being that traverses them. It is hard to make much sense of this alleged doctrine on the basis of available evidence. As suggested above, Plato depicts Hippias as philosophically shallow and unable to keep up with Socrates in dialectical discussion.

e. Prodicus

Prodicus of Ceos, who lived during roughly the same period as Protagoras and Hippias, is best known for his subtle distinctions between the meanings of words. He is thought to have written a treatise titled On the Correctness of Names.

Plato gives an amusing account of Prodicus’ method in the following passage of the Protagoras:

Prodicus spoke up next: … ‘those who attend discussions such as this ought to listen impartially, but not equally, to both interlocutors. There is a distinction here. We ought to listen impartially but not divide our attention equally: More should go to the wiser speaker and less to the more unlearned … In this way our meeting would take a most attractive turn, for you, the speakers, would then most surely earn the respect, rather than the praise, of those listening to you. For respect is guilelessly inherent in the souls of listeners, but praise is all too often merely a deceitful verbal expression. And then, too, we, your audience, would be most cheered, but not pleased, for to be cheered is to learn something, to participate in some intellectual activity; but to be pleased has to do with eating or experiencing some other pleasure in the body’ (337a-c).

Prodicus’ epideictic speech, The Choice of Heracles, was singled out for praise by Xenophon (Memorabilia, II.1.21-34) and in addition to his private teaching he seems to have served as an ambassador for Ceos (the birthplace of Simonides) on several occasions.

Socrates, although perhaps with some degree of irony, was fond of calling himself a pupil of Prodicus (Protagoras, 341a; Meno, 96d).

f. Thrasymachus

Thrasymachus was a well-known rhetorician in Athens in the latter part of the fifth century B.C.E., but our only surviving record of his views is contained in Plato’s Cleitophon and Book One of The Republic. He is depicted as brash and aggressive, with views on the nature of justice that will be examined in section 3a.

3. Major Themes of Sophistic Thought

a. Nature and Convention

The distinction between physis (nature) and nomos (custom, law, convention) was a central theme in Greek thought in the second half of the fifth century B.C.E. and is especially important for understanding the work of the sophists. Before turning to sophistic considerations of these concepts and the distinction between them, it is worth sketching the meaning of the Greek terms.

Aristotle defines physis as ‘the substance of things which have in themselves as such a source of movement’ (Metaphysics, 1015a13-15). The term physis is closely connected with the Greek verb to grow (phuō) and the dynamic aspect of physis reflects the view that the nature of things is found in their origins and internal principles of change. Some of the Ionian thinkers now referred to as presocratics, including Thales and Heraclitus, used the term physis for reality as a whole, or at least its underlying material constituents, referring to the investigation of nature in this context as historia (inquiry) rather than philosophy.

The term nomos refers to a wide range of normative concepts extending from customs and conventions to positive law. It would be misleading to regard the term as referring only to arbitrary human conventions, as Heraclitus’ appeal to the distinction between human nomoi and the one divine nomos (DK 22B2 and 114) makes clear. Nonetheless, increased travel, as exemplified by the histories of Herodotus, led to a greater understanding of the wide array of customs, conventions and laws among communities in the ancient world. This recognition sets up the possibility of a dichotomy between what is unchanging and according to nature and what is merely a product of arbitrary human convention.

The dichotomy between physis and nomos seems to have been something of a commonplace of sophistic thought and was appealed to by Protagoras and Hippias among others. Perhaps the most instructive sophistic account of the distinction, however, is found in Antiphon’s fragment On Truth.

Antiphon applies the distinction to notions of justice and injustice, arguing that the majority of things which are considered just according to nomos are in direct conflict with nature and hence not truly or naturally just (DK 87 A44). The basic thrust of Antiphon’s argument is that laws and conventions are designed as a constraint upon our natural pursuit of pleasure. In a passage suggestive of the discussion on justice early in Plato’s Republic, Antiphon also asserts that one should employ justice to one’s advantage by regarding the laws as important when witnesses are present, but disregarding them when one can get away with it. Although these arguments may be construed as part of an antilogical exercise on nature and convention rather than prescriptions for a life of prudent immorality, they are consistent with views on the relation between human nature and justice suggested by Plato’s depiction of Callicles and Thrasymachus in the Gorgias and Republic respectively.

Callicles, a young Athenian aristocrat who may be a real historical figure or a creation of Plato’s imagination, was not a sophist; indeed he expresses disdain for them (Gorgias, 520a). His account of the relation between physis and nomos nonetheless owes a debt to sophistic thought. According to Callicles, Socrates’ arguments in favour of the claim that it is better to suffer injustice than to commit injustice trade on a deliberate ambiguity in the term justice. Callicles argues that conventional justice is a kind of slave morality imposed by the many to constrain the desires of the superior few. What is just according to nature, by contrast, is seen by observing animals in nature and relations between political communities where it can be seen that the strong prevail over the weak. Callicles himself takes this argument in the direction of a vulgar sensual hedonism motivated by the desire to have more than others (pleonexia), but sensual hedonism as such does not seem to be a necessary consequence of his account of natural justice.

Although the sophist Thrasymachus does not employ the physis/nomos distinction in Book One of the Republic, his account of justice (338d-354c) belongs within a similar conceptual framework. Like Callicles, Thrasymachus accuses Socrates of deliberate deception in his arguments, particularly in the claim the art of justice consists in a ruler looking after their subjects. According to Thrasymachus, we do better to think of the ruler/ruled relation in terms of a shepherd looking after his flock with a view to its eventual demise. Justice in conventional terms is simply a naive concern for the advantage of another. From another more natural perspective, justice is the rule of the stronger, insofar as rulers establish laws which persuade the multitude that it is just for them to obey what is to the advantage of the ruling few

An alternative, and more edifying, account of the relation between physis and nomos is found in Protagoras’ great speech (Protagoras, 320c-328d). According to Protagoras’ myth, man was originally set forth by the gods into a violent state of nature reminiscent of that later described by Hobbes. Our condition improved when Zeus bestowed us with shame and justice; these enabled us to develop the skill of politics and hence civilized communal relations and virtue. Apart from supporting his argument that aretē can be taught, this account suggests a defence of nomos on the grounds that nature by itself is insufficient for the flourishing of man considered as a political animal.

b. Relativism

The primary source on sophistic relativism about knowledge and/or truth is Protagoras’ famous ‘man is the measure’ statement. Interpretation of Protagoras’ thesis has always been a matter of controversy. Caution is needed in particular against the temptation to read modern epistemological concerns into Protagoras’ account and sophistic teaching on the relativity of truth more generally.

Protagoras measure thesis is as follows:

A human being is the measure of all things, of those things that are, that they are, and of those things that are not, that they are not (DK, 80B1).

There is near scholarly consensus that Protagoras is referring here to each human being as the measure of what is rather than ‘humankind’ as such, although the Greek term for ‘human’ –hōanthrōpos– certainly does not rule out the second interpretation. Plato’s Theaetetus (152a), however, suggests the first reading and I will assume its correctness here. On this reading we can regard Protagoras as asserting that if the wind, for example, feels (or seems) cold to me and feels (or seems) warm to you, then the wind is cold for me and is warm for you.

Another interpretative issue concerns whether we should construe Protagoras’ statement as primarily ontological or epistemological in intent. Scholarship by Kahn, Owen and Kerferd among others suggests that, while the Greeks lacked a clear distinction between existential and predicative uses of ‘to be’, they tended to treat existential uses as short for predicative uses.

Having sketched some of the interpretative difficulties surrounding Protagoras’ statement, we are still left with at least three possible readings (Kerferd, 1981a, 86). Protagoras could be asserting that (i) there is no mind-independent wind at all, but merely private subjective winds (ii) there is a wind that exists independently of my perception of it, but it is in itself neither cold nor warm as these qualities are private (iii) there is a wind that exists independently of my perception of it and this is both cold and warm insofar as two qualities can inhere in the same mind-independent ‘entity’.

All three interpretations are live options, with (i) perhaps the least plausible. Whatever the exact import of Protagoras’ relativism, however, the following passage from the Theaetetus suggests that it was also extended to the political and ethical realm:

Whatever in any particular city is considered just and admirable is just and admirable in that city, for so long as the convention remains in place (167c).

One difficulty this passage raises is that while Protagoras asserted that all beliefs are equally true, he also maintained that some are superior to others because they are more subjectively fulfilling for those who hold them. Protagoras thus seems to want it both ways, insofar as he removes an objective criterion of truth while also asserting that some subjective states are better than others. His appeal to better and worse beliefs could, however, be taken to refer to the persuasiveness and pleasure induced by certain beliefs and speeches rather than their objective truth.

The other major source for sophistic relativism is the Dissoi Logoi, an undated and anonymous example of Protagorean antilogic. In the Dissoi Logoi we find competing arguments on five theses, including whether the good and the bad are the same or different, and a series of examples of the relativity of different cultural practices and laws. Overall the Dissoi Logoi can be taken to uphold not only the relativity of truth but also what Barney (2006, 89) has called the variability thesis: whatever is good in some qualified way is also bad in another respect and the same is the case for a wide range of contrary predicates.

c. Language and Reality

Understandably given their educational program, the sophists placed great emphasis upon the power of speech (logos). Logos is a notoriously difficult term to translate and can refer to thought and that about which we speak and think as well as rational speech or language. The sophists were interested in particular with the role of human discourse in the shaping of reality. Rhetoric was the centrepiece of the curriculum, but literary interpretation of the work of poets was also a staple of sophistic education. Some philosophical implications of the sophistic concern with speech are considered in section 4, but in the current section it is instructive to concentrate on Gorgias’ account of the power of rhetorical logos.

The extant fragments attributed to the historical Gorgias indicate not only scepticism towards essential being and our epistemic access to this putative realm, but an assertion of the omnipotence of persuasive logos to make the natural and practical world conform to human desires. Reporting upon Gorgias’ speech About the Nonexistent or on Nature, Sextus says that the rhetorician, while adopting a different approach from that of Protagoras, also eliminated the criterion (DK, 82B3). The elimination of the criterion refers to the rejection of a standard that would enable us to distinguish clearly between knowledge and opinion about being and nature. Whereas Protagoras asserted that man is the measure of all things, Gorgias concentrated upon the status of truth about being and nature as a discursive construction.

About the Nonexistent or on Nature transgresses the injunction of Parmenides that one cannot say of what is that it is not. Employing a series of conditional arguments in the manner of Zeno, Gorgias asserts that nothing exists, that if it did exist it could not be apprehended, and if it was apprehended it could not be articulated in logos. The elaborate parody displays the paradoxical character of attempts to disclose the true nature of beings through logos:

For that by which we reveal is logos, but logos is not substances and existing things. Therefore we do not reveal existing things to our comrades, but logos, which is something other than substances (DK, 82B3)

Even if knowledge of beings was possible, its transmission in logos would always be distorted by the rift between substances and our apprehension and communication of them. Gorgias also suggests, even more provocatively, that insofar as speech is the medium by which humans articulate their experience of the world, logos is not evocative of the external, but rather the external is what reveals logos. An understanding of logos about nature as constitutive rather than descriptive here supports the assertion of the omnipotence of rhetorical expertise. Gorgias’ account suggests there is no knowledge of nature sub specie aeternitatis and our grasp of reality is always mediated by discursive interpretations, which, in turn, implies that truth cannot be separated from human interests and power claims.

In the Encomium to Helen Gorgias refers to logos as a powerful master (DK, 82B11). If humans had knowledge of the past, present or future they would not be compelled to adopt unpredictable opinion as their counsellor. The endless contention of astronomers, politicians and philosophers is taken to demonstrate that no logos is definitive. Human ignorance about non-existent truth can thus be exploited by rhetorical persuasion insofar as humans desire the illusion of certainty imparted by the spoken word:

The effect of logos upon the condition of the soul is comparable to the power of drugs over the nature of bodies. For just as different drugs dispel different secretions from the body, and some bring an end to disease and others to life, so also in the case of logoi, some distress, others delight, some cause fear, others make hearers bold, and some drug and bewitch the soul with a kind of evil persuasion (DK, 82B11).

All who have persuaded people, Gorgias says, do so by moulding a false logos. While other forms of power require force, logos makes all its willing slave.

This account of the relation between persuasive speech, knowledge, opinion and reality is broadly consistent with Plato’s depiction of the rhetorician in the Gorgias. Both Protagoras’ relativism and Gorgias’ account of the omnipotence of logos are suggestive of what we moderns might call a deflationary epistemic anti-realism.

4. The Distinction Between Philosophy and Sophistry

The distinction between philosophy and sophistry is in itself a difficult philosophical problem. This closing section examines the attempt of Plato to establish a clear line of demarcation between philosophy and sophistry.

As alluded to above, the terms ‘philosopher’ and ‘sophist’ were disputed in the fifth and fourth century B.C.E., the subject of contention between rival schools of thought. Histories of philosophy tend to begin with the Ionian ‘physicist’ Thales, but the presocratics referred to the activity they were engaged in as historia (inquiry) rather than philosophia and although it may have some validity as a historical projection, the notion that philosophy begins with Thales derives from the mid nineteenth century. It was Plato who first clearly and consistently refers to the activity of philosophia and much of what he has to say is best understood in terms of an explicit or implicit contrast with the rival schools of the sophists and Isocrates (who also claimed the title philosophia for his rhetorical educational program).

The related questions as to what a sophist is and how we can distinguish the philosopher from the sophist were taken very seriously by Plato. He also acknowledges the difficulty inherent in the pursuit of these questions and it is perhaps revealing that the dialogue dedicated to the task, Sophist, culminates in a discussion about the being of non-being. Socrates converses with sophists in Euthydemus, Hippias Major, Hippias Minor, Gorgias, Protagoras and the Republic and discusses sophists at length in the Apology, Sophist, Statesman and Theaetetus. It can thus be argued that the search for the sophist and distinction between philosophy and sophistry are not only central themes in the Platonic dialogues, but constitutive of the very idea and practice of philosophy, at least in its original sense as articulated by Plato.

This point has been recognised by recent poststructuralist thinkers such as Jacques Derrida and Jean Francois-Lyotard in the context of their project to place in question central presuppositions of the Western philosophical tradition deriving from Plato. Derrida attacks the interminable trial prosecuted by Plato against the sophists with a view to exhuming ‘the conceptual monuments marking out the battle lines between philosophy and sophistry’ (1981, 106). Lyotard views the sophists as in possession of unique insight into the sense in which discourses about what is just cannot transcend the realm of opinion and pragmatic language games (1985, 73-83).

The prospects for establishing a clear methodological divide between philosophy and sophistry are poor. Apart from the considerations mentioned in section 1, it would be misleading to say that the sophists were unconcerned with truth or genuine theoretical investigation and Socrates is clearly guilty of fallacious reasoning in many of the Platonic dialogues. In the Sophist, in fact, Plato implies that the Socratic technique of dialectical refutation represents a kind of ‘noble sophistry’ (Sophist, 231b).

This in large part explains why contemporary scholarship on the distinction between philosophy and sophistry has tended to focus on a difference in moral character. Nehamas, for example, has argued that ‘Socrates did not differ from the sophists in method but in overall purpose’ (1990, 13).  Nehamas relates this overall purpose to the Socratic elenchus, suggesting that Socrates’ disavowal of knowledge and of the capacity to teach aretē distances him from the sophists. However, this way of demarcating Socrates’ practice from that of his sophistic counterparts, Nehamas argues, cannot justify the later Platonic distinction between philosophy and sophistry, insofar as Plato forfeited the right to uphold the distinction once he developed a substantive philosophical teaching, that is, the theory of forms.

There is no doubt much truth in the claim that Plato and Aristotle depict the philosopher as pursuing a different way of life than the sophist, but to say that Plato defines the philosopher either through a difference in moral purpose, as in the case of Socrates, or a metaphysical presumption regarding the existence of transcendent forms, as in his later work, does not in itself adequately characterise Plato’s critique of his sophistic contemporaries. Once we attend to Plato’s own treatment of the distinction between philosophy and sophistry two themes quickly become clear: the mercenary character of the sophists and their overestimation of the power of speech. For Plato, at least, these two aspects of the sophistic education tell us something about the persona of the sophist as the embodiment of a distinctive attitude towards knowledge.

The fact that the sophists taught for profit may not seem objectionable to modern readers; most present-day university professors would be reluctant to teach pro bono. It is clearly a major issue for Plato, however. Plato can barely mention the sophists without contemptuous reference to the mercenary aspect of their trade: particularly revealing examples of Plato’s disdain for sophistic money-making and avarice are found at Apology 19d, Euthydemus 304b-c, Hippias Major 282b-e, Protagoras 312c-d and Sophist 222d-224d, and this is not an exhaustive list. Part of the issue here is no doubt Plato’s commitment to a way of life dedicated to knowledge and contemplation. It is significant that students in the Academy, arguably the first higher education institution, were not required to pay fees. This is only part of the story, however.

A good starting point is to consider the etymology of the term philosophia as suggested by the Phaedrus and Symposium. After completing his palinode in the Phaedrus, Socrates expresses the hope that he never be deprived of his ‘erotic’ art. Whereas the speechwriter Lysias presents erōs (desire, love) as an unseemly waste of expenditure (Phaedrus, 257a), in his later speech Socrates demonstrates how erōs impels the soul to rise towards the forms. The followers of Zeus, or philosophy, Socrates suggests, educate the object of their erōs to imitate and partake in the ways of the God. Similarly, in the Symposium, Socrates refers to an exception to his ignorance. Approving of the suggestion by Phaedrus that the drinking party eulogise erōs, Socrates states that ta erōtika (the erotic things) are the only subject concerning which he would claim to possess rigorous knowledge (Symposium, 177 d-e). When it is his turn to deliver a speech, Socrates laments his incapacity to compete with the Gorgias-influenced rhetoric of Agathon before delivering Diotima’s lessons on erōs, represented as a daimonion or semi-divine intermediary between the mortal and the divine. Erōs is thus presented as analogous to philosophy in its etymological sense, a striving after wisdom or completion that can only be temporarily fulfilled in this life by contemplation of the forms of the beautiful and the good (204a-b). The philosopher is someone who strives after wisdom – a friend or lover of wisdom – not someone who possesses wisdom as a finished product, as the sophists claimed to do and as their name suggests.

Plato’s emphasis upon philosophy as an ‘erotic’ activity of striving for wisdom, rather than as a finished state of completed wisdom, largely explains his distaste for sophistic money-making. The sophists, according to Plato, considered knowledge to be a ready-made product that could be sold without discrimination to all comers. The Theages, a Socratic dialogue whose authorship some scholars have disputed, but which expresses sentiments consistent with other Platonic dialogues, makes this point with particular clarity. The farmer Demodokos has brought his son, Theages, who is desirous of wisdom, to Socrates. As Socrates questions his potential pupil regarding what sort of wisdom he seeks, it becomes evident that Theages seeks power in the city and influence over other men. Since Theages is looking for political wisdom, Socrates refers him to the statesmen and the sophists. Disavowing his ability to compete with the expertise of Gorgias and Prodicus in this respect, Socrates nonetheless admits his knowledge of the erotic things, a subject about which he claims to know more than any man who has come before or indeed any of those to come (Theages, 128b). In response to the suggestion that he study with a sophist, Theages reveals his intention to become a pupil of Socrates. Perhaps reluctant to take on an unpromising pupil, Socrates insists that he must follow the commands of his daimonion, which will determine whether those associating with him are capable of making any progress (Theages, 129c). The dialogue ends with an agreement that all parties make trial of the daimonion to see whether it permits of the association.

One need only follow the suggestion of the Symposium that erōs is a daimonion to see that Socratic education, as presented by Plato, is concomitant with a kind of ‘erotic’ concern with the beautiful and the good, considered as natural in contrast to the purely conventional. Whereas the sophists accept pupils indiscriminately, provided they have the money to pay, Socrates is oriented by his desire to cultivate the beautiful and the good in promising natures. In short, the difference between Socrates and his sophistic contemporaries, as Xenophon suggests, is the difference between a lover and a prostitute. The sophists, for Xenophon’s Socrates, are prostitutes of wisdom because they sell their wares to anyone with the capacity to pay (Memorabilia, I.6.13). This – somewhat paradoxically – accounts for Socrates’ shamelessness in comparison with his sophistic contemporaries, his preparedness to follow the argument wherever it leads. By contrast, Protagoras and Gorgias are shown, in the dialogues that bear their names, as vulnerable to the conventional opinions of the paying fathers of their pupils, a weakness contributing to their refutation. The sophists are thus characterised by Plato as subordinating the pursuit of truth to worldly success, in a way that perhaps calls to mind the activities of contemporary advertising executives or management consultants.

The overestimation of the power of human speech is the other theme that emerges clearly from Plato’s (and Aristotle’s) critique of the sophists. In the Sophist, Plato says that dialectic – division and collection according to kinds – is the knowledge possessed by the free man or philosopher (Sophist, 253c). Here Plato reintroduces the difference between true and false rhetoric, alluded to in the Phaedrus, according to which the former presupposes the capacity to see the one in the many (Phaedrus, 266b). Plato’s claim is that the capacity to divide and synthesise in accordance with one form is required for the true expertise of logos. Whatever else one makes of Plato’s account of our knowledge of the forms, it clearly involves the apprehension of a higher level of being than sensory perception and speech. The philosopher, then, considers rational speech as oriented by a genuine understanding of being or nature. The sophist, by contrast, is said by Plato to occupy the realm of falsity, exploiting the difficulty of dialectic by producing discursive semblances, or phantasms, of true being (Sophist, 234c). The sophist uses the power of persuasive speech to construct or create images of the world and is thus a kind of ‘enchanter’ and imitator.

This aspect of Plato’s critique of sophistry seems particularly apposite in regard to Gorgias’ rhetoric, both as found in the Platonic dialogue and the extant fragments attributed to the historical Gorgias. In response to Socratic questioning, Gorgias asserts that rhetoric is an all-comprehending power that holds under itself all of the other activities and occupations (Gorgias, 456a). He later claims that it is concerned with the greatest good for man, namely those speeches that allow one to attain freedom and rule over others, especially, but not exclusively, in political settings (452d). As suggested above, in the context of Athenian public life the capacity to persuade was a precondition of political success. For present purposes, however, the key point is that freedom and rule over others are both forms of power: respectively power in the sense of liberty or capacity to do something, which suggests the absence of relevant constraints, and power in the sense of dominion over others. Gorgias is suggesting that rhetoric, as the expertise of persuasive speech, is the source of power in a quite comprehensive sense and that power is ‘the good’. What we have here is an assertion of the omnipotence of speech, at the very least in relation to the determination of human affairs.

The Socratic position, as becomes clear later in the discussion with Polus (466d-e), and is also suggested in Meno (88c-d) and Euthydemus (281d-e), is that power without knowledge of the good is not genuinely good. Without such knowledge not only ‘external’ goods, such as wealth and health, not only the areas of expertise that enable one to attain such so-called goods, but the very capacity to attain them is either of no value or harmful. This in large part explains the so-called Socratic paradox that virtue is knowledge.

Plato’s critique of the sophists’ overestimation of the power of speech should not be conflated with his commitment to the theory of the forms. For Plato, the sophist reduces thinking to a kind of making: by asserting the omnipotence of human speech the sophist pays insufficient regard to the natural limits upon human knowledge and our status as seekers rather than possessors of knowledge (Sophist, 233d). This critique of the sophists does perhaps require a minimal commitment to a distinction between appearance and reality, but it is an oversimplification to suggest that Plato’s distinction between philosophy and sophistry rests upon a substantive metaphysical theory, in large part because our knowledge of the forms for Plato is itself inherently ethical. Plato, like his Socrates, differentiates the philosopher from the sophist primarily through the virtues of the philosopher’s soul (McKoy, 2008). Socrates is an embodiment of the moral virtues, but love of the forms also has consequences for the philosopher’s character.

There is a further ethical and political aspect to the Platonic and Aristotelian critique of the sophists’ overestimation of the power of speech. In Book Ten of Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle suggests that the sophists tended to reduce politics to rhetoric (1181a12-15) and overemphasised the role that could be played by rational persuasion in the political realm. Part of Aristotle’s point is that there is an element to living well that transcends speech. As Hadot eloquently puts it, citing Greek and Roman sources, ‘traditionally people who developed an apparently philosophical discourse without trying to live their lives in accordance with their discourse, and without their discourse emanating from their life experience, were called sophists’ (2004, 174).

The testimony of Xenophon, a Greek general and man of action, is instructive here. In his treatise on hunting, (Cynēgeticus, 13.1-9), Xenophon commends Socratic over sophistic education in aretē, not only on the grounds that the sophists hunt the young and rich and are deceptive, but also because they are men of words rather than action. The importance of consistency between one’s words and actions if one is to be truly virtuous is a commonplace of Greek thought, and this is one important respect in which the sophists, at least from the Platonic-Aristotelian perspective, fell short.

One might think that a denial of Plato’s demarcation between philosophy and sophistry remains well-motivated simply because the historical sophists made genuine contributions to philosophy. But this does not entail the illegitimacy of Plato’s distinction. Once we recognise that Plato is pointing primarily to a fundamental ethical orientation relating to the respective personas of the philosopher and sophist, rather than a methodological or purely theoretical distinction, the tension dissolves. This is not to deny that the ethical orientation of the sophist is likely to lead to a certain kind of philosophising, namely one which attempts to master nature, human and external, rather than understand it as it is.

Sophistry for Socrates, Plato and Aristotle represents a choice for a certain way of life, embodied in a particular attitude towards knowledge which views it as a finished product to be transmitted to all comers. Plato’s distinction between philosophy and sophistry is not simply an arbitrary viewpoint in a dispute over naming rights, but is rather based upon a fundamental difference in ethical orientation. Neither is this orientation reducible to concern with truth or the cogency of one’s theoretical constructs, although it is not unrelated to these. Where the philosopher differs from the sophist is in terms of the choice for a way of life that is oriented by the pursuit of knowledge as a good in itself while remaining cognisant of the necessarily provisional nature of this pursuit.

5. References and Further Reading

Translations are from the Cooper collected works edition of Plato and the Sprague edition of the sophists unless otherwise indicated. The reference list below is restricted to a few basic sources; readers interested to learn more about the sophists are advised to consult the excellent overviews by Barney (2006) and Kerferd (1981a) for a more comprehensive list of secondary literature.

a. Primary Sources

  • Aristophanes, Clouds, K.J. Dover (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press. 1970.
  • Barnes, J. (ed.). 1984. The Complete Works of Aristotle, New Jersey: Princeton University Press.
  • Diels, H. 1951. Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker. Berlin: Weidman.
  • Cooper, J.M. (ed.). 1997. Plato: Complete Works. Indianopolis: Hackett.
  • Hudson-Williams. T. 1910. Theognis: Elegies and other elegies included in the Theognideansylloge. London: G.Bell.
  • Phillips, A.A. and Willcock, M.M (eds.). 1999. Xenophon &Arrian, On hunting (Kynēgetikos). Warminster: Aris& Phillips.
  • Sprague, R. 1972. The Older Sophists. South Carolina: University of South Carolina Press.
  • Xenophon, Memorabilia, trans. A.L. Bonnette, Ithaca: Cornell University Press. 1994.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Barney, R. 2006. ‘The Sophistic Movement’, in M.L. Gill and P. Pellegrin (eds.), A Companion to Ancient Philosophy, 77-97. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Gibert, J. 2003. ‘The Sophists.’ In C. Shields (ed.), The Blackwell Guide to Ancient Philosophy, 27-50. Oxford, Blackwell.
  • Guthrie, W.K.C. 1971. The Sophists. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kerferd, G.B. 1981a. The Sophistic Movement. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kerferd, G.B. 1981b. The Sophists and their Legacy. Wiesbaden: Steiner.
  • Sidgwick, H. 1872. ‘The Sophists’.Journal of Philology 4, 289.
  • Untersteiner, M. 1954. The Sophists.trans. K. Freeman. Oxford: Basil Blackwell.

c. Other Reading

  • Adkins, A. 1960.Merit and Responsibility. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Benardete, S. 1991. The Rhetoric of Morality and Philosophy. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Bett, R. 1989. 'The Sophists and Relativism.’Phronesis 34, 139-69.
  • Bett, R. 2002. ‘Is There a Sophistic Ethics?’ Ancient Philosophy, 22, 235-62.
  • Derrida, J. 1981. Dissemination, trans. B. Johnson. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Grote, G. 1904. A History of Greece vol.7. London: John Murray.
  • Hadot, P. 2004. What is Ancient Philosophy? Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Harrison, E.L. 1964. 'Was Gorgias a Sophist?' Phoenix vol. 18.3.
  • Hegel, G.W.F. 1995. Lectures on the History of Philosophy, trans. E.S. Haldane, Lincoln: University of Nebraska Press (original work published 1840).
  • Irwin, T.H. 1995. ‘Plato’s Objections to the Sophists’. In C.A. Powell (ed.), The Greek World, 568-87. London: Routledge.
  • Jarratt, S. 1991. Rereading the Sophists. Carbondale: Southern Illinois Press.
  • Kahn, Charles. 1983. 'Drama and Dialectic in Plato's Gorgias' in Julia Annas (ed.) Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy vol. 1. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Kennedy, G. 1963. The Art of Persuasion in Ancient Greece, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
  • Lyotard, J.F. and Thébaud, J-L. 1985.  Just Gaming, trans. W. Godzich. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • McCoy, M. 2008. Plato on the Rhetoric of Philosophers and Sophists.Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Nehamas, A. 1990. ‘Eristic, Antilogic, Sophistic, Dialectic: Plato’s Demarcation of Philosophy from Sophistry’. History of Philosophy Quarterly, 7, 3-16.
  • Wardy, Robert. 1996. The Birth of Rhetoric: Gorgias, Plato and their successors. London: Routledge.


Author Information

George Duke
Deakin University

Wang Chong (Wang Ch’ung) (25—100 C.E.)

Wang Chong (Wang Ch’ung) was an early Chinese philosopher who wrote during the Eastern Han dynasty. He is often interpreted as offering a materialist and skeptical philosophical system.  Wang’s essays on physics, astronomy, ethics, methodology, and criticism are collected in the Lunheng (“Balanced Discussions”), the work for which he is mainly known.  Largely self-taught, Wang demonstrates an encyclopedic knowledge of history and science in his work, and it was primarily as an encyclopedic resource that Wang’s Lunheng was read and preserved in later Chinese history.  The essays of the Lunheng focus on criticism of common views on all areas of philosophy and physics, and on appraisal of traditional philosophical texts.  Although much of Wang’s work is critical, he also develops positive views on a number of important topics, including methodology, the spontaneous workings of heaven and earth, and the concepts of qi (vital essence), ming (destiny), and xing (behavioral characteristics).  Although Wang’s influence was minimal during and immediately after his lifetime and for many years afterward (until a brief period of interest in the late 11th and 12th centuries), there was a resurgence of interest in his work in the 19th and 20th centuries both in China and the West, following the ascendance of scientific materialism in modern thought.  Interest in Wang was generated in this period by (in the West) studies in early Chinese science by figures such as Joseph Needham and Alfred Forke, and (in China) first by the critical movements in the late Qing and later the rise to dominance of the materialist Marxist thought of the Communist Party, which praised and elevated Wang’s thought for its opposition to superstition, materialism, and skepticism.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Textual Issues and Literary Style
  3. Purpose and Method
    1. On “Creation and Transmission”
    2. Truth/Reality (shi)
  4. Critical Thought
    1. Specific Criticisms of Philosophers
      1. Confucius
      2. Han Feizi
    2. Ghosts, the Supernatural, and Other Superstitions
      1. Ghosts
      2. Talent and Success
  5. Physics and Metaphysics
    1. Qi (Vital Essence/Fluid)
    2. Tian (Heaven)
    3. Astronomy and Physics
      1. Celestial Objects
      2. Heaven and Earth
  6. Ethics
    1. Ming (Destiny)
    2. Xing (Characteristics)
  7. Influence
    1. Influences and Place in Han Dynasty Thought
    2. Later Influence
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Works

Wang Chong was born in the year 27 C.E. (according to his autobiography), in the village of Shangyu in Kuaiji Commandery (modern day Shaoxing, Zhejiang province) along the eastern coast of China.  His birth came in the third year of the reign of the first Eastern Han emperor Guangwu, who restored the Han Dynasty after defeating Wang Mang, the man who had seized power from the Western (or Early) Han and established the short lived “Xin” (New) Dynasty (9-23 C.E.). According to Wang in his autobiographical essay (contained in Lunheng), his family, reaching back to his grandfather Wang Fan (whose son Wang Song was Wang Chong's father), was comprised of lower class troublemakers, even though it had more respectable origins, with Wang Fan's father having been a landowner.  Because of their status and behavior, Wang Chong's family moved a number of times, finally settling in Kuaiji.

In his autobiographical chapter, Wang speaks of his youth being one of straitened circumstances.  He was, however, still able to get an education by reading books while sitting around the stalls of booksellers, and in this way gained an encyclopedic knowledge of history, philosophy, and religion, as evidenced in Lunheng.  Based on the breadth of his knowledge, Wang Chong was (if his claims are taken seriously) one of the greatest autodidacts of early Chinese history.  His self-taught style is evidenced by the uncommon (some might claim awkward) literary style of his writings, which Wang defends in the autobiographical essay contained in Lunheng.

Wang rose to the position of Officer of Merit (gong shi) in Kuaiji, but held this position only briefly, his contrarian spirit no doubt making important enemies for him which led to the demise of his career.  This experience further disenchanted Wang with “common morals and beliefs,” and he went into retirement to write a number of works challenging these common views.  According to Wang, he was inspired to write “On Government” (Zhengwu) to remedy the perceived inadequacy of the imperial government (likely that of Emperor Ming but possibly that of Emperor Zhang), reinvigorating those engaged in governing.  His “Censures on Common Morals” (Jisu jieyi) was written in response to a number of “friends” who supported him while he had position quickly abandoning him once he lost his post.  Wang briefly held another position after this period, as an officer to Dong Qin, the inspector of Yang province, which he eventually resigned.

Also written during this period was “Macrobiotics” (Yangxing shu).  The work for which Wang Chong is known today (and his only extant work), Lunheng (“Balanced Discourses”) is likely a compilation of Wang's works from this period, composed between 70 and 80 B.C.E., including parts of the above-mentioned works.  Timoteus Pokora and Michael Loewe suggest that Lunheng may initially have been a distinct work containing specifically critical philosophical essays (numbers 16-30 of the present Lunheng) that was later expanded to include Wang's other extant writings to form a compilation under the same name.  They also suggest the biographical essay of Lunheng (Zi ji) may have been written by someone other than Wang (as its style and reference to Wang suggest).  The received version of Lunheng is based on Yang Wenchang’s 1045 C.E. edition.

In the later part of his life, again reclusive, Wang was requested at the court of the Emperor Zhang (Liu Da, 5th son of the Emperor Ming), on the recommendation of Wang's friend Xie Yiwu, but declined the invitation on grounds of illness.  This (which must have happened before Zhang's death in 88 C.E.) is the last account of the events of Wang Chong's life before his death around 100 C.E.  A memorial was erected to Wang Chong (claiming to mark his tomb) in 1855 and again in 1981 after the original memorial's destruction, that stands today in Shangyu.

2. Textual Issues and Literary Style

To a reader of Lunheng, it can appear that Wang sometimes contradicts himself, claiming one thing about a certain concept (such as qi, tian, or xing) in one essay that he rejects in another essay.  It should not be assumed on this basis, however, that Wang is inconsistent in his usage of key terms or confused about the concepts he discusses.  Lunheng should be seen as a kind of “collected works” of Wang Chong.  The various essays of the Lunheng are not ordered according to date of construction (it seems to be instead organized by theme), nor is any date noted anywhere in the text.  As a result, there is no way of knowing which essays were written at which points in Wang’s life, which essays were revised from earlier versions, based on alternative copies, and so forth.  Intellectual development and change, however, can be assumed throughout Wang’s career, and that some of the essays of Lunheng are more representative of Wang’s mature thought, and some of them his early thought.  This assumption cannot, of course, undermine or explain away all apparent inconsistency in Wang’s discussions (there is the possibility that he did in fact contradict himself or offer unclear or in some sense confused ideas), nor can it be certain which of the essays in the Lunheng represent which stage of Wang’s intellectual development. But it can be safely assumed that at least some of the inconsistency is due to the nature of the composition of Lunheng.
According to Wang himself, his style is deliberately simple and avoids “flowery language” which often perpetuates “empty” sayings (xu yan).  He argues at length in his essay Dui zuo that simple language and style (like his own) is essential for the project of searching for truth (shi), and that he purposefully says things in a simple and straightforward manner.

3. Purpose and Method

a. On “Creation and Transmission”

Wang is concerned to defend himself against charges of innovation, which was a major controversy in the Han dynasty, arising from the claims of Confucius (almost universally regarded as a sage or the highest sage) that he does not create (zuo), but merely transmits (shu) the ideas of the ancient sages.  This was taken as normative, such that it was read as an injunction for people not to create and instead merely to transmit.  To create was seen as arrogant and taken as tantamount to likening oneself to the sages or claiming superiority over them, which was seen as an unforgivable intellectual error.  A common criticism of literary works in Wang's own time was to dismiss them on the grounds that they were “creations” (zuo), and thus arrogant and false attempts at innovation and self-aggrandizement by their authors.  Doubtlessly this charge was brought against Wang's own work, because he feels the need to counter these charges in various essays in Lunheng, most directly and extensively in the essay Dui zuo (“Responses Concerning Creation”)

There, he argues that his work is not a creation, but is rather a “discussion” (lun), in which he considers the claims and arguments of other literary works and subjects them to questions and challenges in order to discover what in them is true, useful, or otherwise acceptable.  A creation, he argues, is something wholly new, and as such there are very few creations.  Almost no literary text counts as a creation, except for the very first invention of written language, as no literary work can wholly be independent and free from influence of the linguistic forms and thought of previous generations.  He further argues that even if his work could be considered a “creation”, it would still not be problematic.  Literary works ought to be appraised not on their faithfulness or lack thereof to the tradition or the views of the ancients, but instead on their truthfulness, usefulness, and correspondence to reality.  If a literary work is full of empty words and falsehoods, it should be rejected, even if conforming to tradition.  Likewise, if a literary work offers truths, it should be accepted, whether it is an innovation or not.  The ancients were not perfect—they were human, were ignorant of a great many things, and had the same tendencies to make mistakes and accept falsehoods that contemporaries do.  If things are merely accepted on the basis of their arising from tradition and the beliefs of the ancients (and conversely reject things not conforming with this standard), posterity is bound to simply perpetuate the mistakes inevitably made by the ancients, and accept the same falsehoods they did.

Wang is not, however, simply a contrarian or iconoclast.  He does think that there are a great many truths that can be learned from the ancients, and that  their teachings should not be rejected completely.  They should, however, be appraised using the methods he suggests of questioning and challenging (wen nan), in order to discover what is acceptable in these teachings.

Much of Wang's critical material is devoted to various questions to and challenges of the writings and teachings of received and traditional works, as well as common (su) views and folk beliefs.  It is this aspect of Wang's thought that has received most attention since the resurgence of interest in his work in the late 19th century in China and the west.  Because of this emphasis, Wang has often been labeled a “skeptic” (more common in early work on him than today).  This label, however, is somewhat misleading, given that Wang, as shown in below sections, had quite robust positive positions in metaphysics, ethics, and physical thought.  Wang saw his critical project as in the service of his positive project of obtaining the truth in general.

b. Truth/Reality (shi)

According to Wang his work aims at what he sees as the proper pursuit of literary and philosophical work in general, attainment of or discovery of truth, or reality (shi), and avoidance of falsity/empty words (xu, xu yan).  His method for discovery of truth largely consists in appraising the existing teachings and arguments of other philosophers, scholars, and schools, subjecting them to tests he describes as “questioning” (nan) and “challenging” (wen), standards that Wang in some places seems to take as interchangeable and other places he takes as distinct tools that operate differently.
One of the central features of true (shi) words, according to Wang, is that they are not flowery or ornate (hua), but direct and to the point.  Among other things, the term shi connotes the quality of concreteness.  Flowery or ornate words, on the other hand, are always to some extent empty.  Truth is only captured in simple and efficient language.  Thus, anything overly stylized is in some way an exaggeration, whether a major exaggeration (like words expressing the existence of supernatural beings such as ghosts) or a relatively minor one (attributing sagehood to a person who has merely done some good act).  The express purpose of Wang’s writing is based in appraisal.  Wang says, in the Dui zuo chapter:

“The Lunheng uses precise language and detailed discussion, to reveal and explain the doubts of this generation of common people, to bring to light through debate right and wrong patterns (shi fei zhi li), and to help those who come later clearly see the difference between what is the case and what is not the case.” (Lunheng, Dui zuo pian 84.364.10-11)

4. Critical Thought

a. Specific Criticisms of Philosophers

Although Wang subjects the writings of various philosophers to his questions and challenges in various parts of the Lunheng, his criticisms of two particular philosophers, Confucius and Han Feizi, are representative of his general critical view and method concerning received texts and teachings.

i. Confucius

Wang challenges Confucius on a number of points in the essay Wen kong (“Questioning Confucius”), most of these surrounding various inconsistencies and eccentricities in the Analects.  Although he accepts Confucius as a sage, Wang argues that Confucius did not always know what he was talking about, could be rash, cryptic, irritable, and uncharitable.  All of these features affected Confucius' teachings, and thus what he says cannot be automatically trusted since they are the words of a sage.  For Wang, there is much in the Analects – for example, passages that reflect the influence of Mengzi or Mencius, which Wang saw as having corrupted the transmission of Confucius’ thought – and ought to be rejected.

ii. Han Feizi

Wang is far less positive about Han Feizi.  In the beginning of his essay Fei han (“Against Han Fei”), he says that he completely rejects Han Feizi's views, on the basis of what he sees as a basic contradiction between his political theory and his action.  Han Feizi argues that scholars (specifically ru or Confucian scholars) are useless, that they drain the resources of the state while contributing nothing to the maintenance of state power.  For this reason, Han Feizi concludes they ought not to be employed by the state.  Wang points out in this essay that Han Feizi himself is a scholar, and certainly takes his own advice and views to be of benefit to the state.  If so, his claim of the uselessness of scholars is incorrect.  Alternatively, if he is right about the uselessness of scholars, it follows that his own teachings must be useless, and therefore false.  In the rest of the essay, Wang constructs an argument against Han Feizi in defense of the place of virtue and imitation of the sages, which the ru scholars are employed to teach.

b. Ghosts, the Supernatural, and Other Superstitions

In addition to his challenges to specific philosophers and texts, Wang criticizes a number of things he calls “common” or “vulgar” (su) beliefs, traditions, and superstitions, often concerning things such as the existence and agency of supernatural entities such as ghosts, deities, mythical creatures such as dragons, and Heaven itself as a sentient agent.  Among the views he is concerned to dispatch is the view that these supernatural entities have the power to reward and punish people for their actions, which is entrenched in Han society.
Wang attacks a great number of “common” beliefs throughout the Lunheng, including (but not limited to): the view that Heaven rewards and punishes people for their behavior, the view that natural and weather events such as thunder and lightning or earthquakes represent the anger (or other emotion) of Heaven or some other supernatural agent; the view the that the mental states of the ruler (happiness, anger, beneficence and so forth) have some physical effect on the land or weather (such that it is warm outside when the ruler is happy and cold when he's angry); the view that people in the days of the ancients (not only the sages) were of greater moral ability and had more robust physical statures than contemporary people; and the view that a person's virtue and talent is linked to (has a causal role in) his professional success and personal fortune.  Wang's positions against ghosts and against the causal link between talent and success serve as good examples of this aspect of his critical thought.

i. Ghosts

Wang offers a number of arguments against what he sees as the “common” and superstitious belief in ghosts and other paranormal entities.  Perhaps his most sustained (and humorous) consideration of the difficulties with common beliefs about the existence and activities of ghosts comes in his essay Lun si (“Discussion Concerning Death”), in which he presents a number of fatal objections to the ghost hypothesis.
The following are three examples of arguments Wang gives against the common belief in ghosts and their ability to interact with living persons in Lun si:

(1) Argument from physical shape:  The death of a person is the result of the body losing the animating qi (vital essence), and once the qi is separated from the body, the body decays.  All will admit to this.  If this is so, however, and the person's qi is still existent, how can this qi itself manifest in the form of a physical shape?  It is not a body, it is qi.  But when one sees a ghost, one sees a body.  But if the person has died, they no longer have a body, so where could they get another one?  They cannot take over another living body, which will already possess its own qi.  Thus, the view that people when they die become ghosts is nonsensical.

(2) Argument from population:  If people become ghosts when they die, there should be more ghost sightings than living people, as the number of people who have lived in the past and died is far greater than the number of people now living.  This is not true — ghost “sightings” are rare.  Thus it cannot be that people when they die become ghosts.

(3) Argument from ghostly efficacy:  If a living person is harmed, this person will immediately go to a magistrate and bring a case against the party who harmed them.  If it were the case that people become ghosts when they die and can interact with living humans, every ghostly murder victim would be seen going to a magistrate, telling him the name of the killer and the means of murder, leading him to the body, and so forth.  This is never witnessed (ever).

ii. Talent and Success

Wang is concerned with arguing against the generally accepted view that success is proportionate to talent or virtue and that long life is proportionate to goodness.  Instead, Wang argues, a person’s success and fortune is tied to his destiny (ming), and the length of one’s life is tied to the amount and quality of qi one receives (spontaneously) at birth.  The common view, Wang claims, concerning success is that talent and virtue are determining factors for success, and that one can thus know whether a person is talented and/or virtuous by observing the person’s fortunes.  The high-ranking and powerful are clearly talented and virtuous, while the poor and rejected must lack talent and virtue.
Wang takes aim at this view in a number of essays in Lunheng (one gets the feeling that the special vitriol directed at this particular view is not unrelated to Wang’s own failure to achieve high office and the attendant perceptions or claims about his level of talent).  There are plenty of examples from history, Wang argues, that demonstrate a disconnect between talent and success.  The example of the sage himself, Confucius, suggests a problem with the common view.  No one was more talented than Confucius, Wang argues, yet his career was the very definition of failure.  It often happens that the vicious, duplicitous, and scheming person can rise to great heights in political (or other) power, while a person of genius or moral excellence fails to obtain position at all.  Luck is a greater factor in one’s success than talent.  The possible reasons for the rise of a vicious or untalented person are many.  Sometimes rulers are incompetent, lack time to reflect on their appointments, and are attracted to some irrelevant quality in a person, and so on.

5. Physics and Metaphysics

a. Qi (Vital Essence/Fluid)

Wang’s views of nature and events in the world are grounded in an explanatory system in which all changes are due to the spontaneous movement of qi (vital essence/fluid).  This qi is given forth by tian (heaven), and gives things their unique character.  Wang discusses many different types of qi, and the term is used to discuss such a wide-ranging number of phenomena that it becomes problematic to try to define just what the concept of qi is such that it is narrow enough to capture all of the phenomena Wang discusses.
He attributes all motion, causation, and even human character to qi, with different types of qi responsible for different kinds of event or character.  Tian creates qi, but not in an active and willful manner.  Rather, it is better to think of qi as emanating from tian.  In a number of places, Wang talks of the creation of things by tian as analogous to the creation of new persons through the mixing of sperm and egg (the male and female physical qi), in order to emphasize its spontaneity, or generation without intent or will.
Qi is at the center of Wang’s understanding of creative activity in the world.  He refers to qi to explain every non-agent based phenomenon he considers--such diverse events as the generation of a human, seasonal and temperature changes, physical health and length of life (although he ties this to ming in a way discussed below), and the creation and destruction or transformation of objects in general.  Qi, for Wang, seems to have a general as well as specific meanings, in general referring to a causally efficacious agent of change in entities in the world, and in specific referring to a particular causal qi, such as the (presumably physical) qi of the male and female that results in procreation when mixed together (Alfred Forke intuitively translates this as ‘fluid’), or the psychic qi causing behavioral dispositions (xing).
Qi emanates from or is created by tian (Heaven), although this creation should not be seen as agent creation.  Tian, as described below, creates spontaneously (ziran), and without intention.  Such creation is the paradigm of natural action, creation, destruction, and change, according to Wang.  Even humans, in some sense (described below) are determined in their physical and mental states and behaviors by causal features which happen spontaneously.  Wang is not altogether comfortable with the picture of the cosmos that seems to subsume human action fully in mechanistic nature, and in his account of human character and behavior he attempts to make room for human will or intention in his mechanistic scheme.  In his Ziran essay, he claims that what distinguishes humans from mere mechanistic puppets (ou ren) is the human possession of spontaneous nature/characteristics (xing ziran).  This seems to show Wang thinks of human agency as, in itself, spontaneous.  At the same time, the spontaneous nature of human agency cannot be the same spontaneity evident in the activity of heaven (tian), which should not, according to Wang, be thought of in terms of agency.

b. Tian (Heaven)

Wang argues against a number of “common” views concerning natural events that take such events to be directed by tian, as a divine agent, in response to human actions.  Wang rejects the agency of tian, instead seeing it naturalistically, as a principle generating qi spontaneously and without intention.  Causal efficacy is involved here without will or intention.  Tian has neither eyes nor mouth, hands nor feet (and presumably without a mind).
As is common of concepts in the Lunheng, there is more concentration on what tian is not than what exactly it is.  It is not exactly clear whether Wang thinks of tian as a constructive principle, the cosmos itself, the physical and distant source of qi, or something else completely.  All that he is explicit about is that tian is naturalistic, works spontaneously, and is unlike humans.
Since tian is not a divine agent, and cannot act intentionally, it cannot be the case, contrary the “common” view, that tian can reward people for virtuous action and punish them for vice.  The view of tian as rewarding and punishing agent is the one Wang is most concerned with overturning, and thus most of his explicit discussion of tian in Lunheng is focused on developing arguments against this view.  His specific arguments tend to fall into two categories:  argument from lack of efficacy and argument from lack of tools.
Regarding lack of efficacy, if tian can reward and punish as the common view claims, why can’t tian simply install proper or excellent rulers who will ensure things are done correctly, rather than allowing bad rulers to come to power who then have to be subsequently punished?  In addition, the claim that tian punishes people through seemingly natural events such as striking them by lightning and leaving etchings resembling words describing crimes they are guilty of on their forehead must be false.  Why would tian not be more efficient in its punishment?  And why would it not etch the character on the punished person’s head such that it was clearly legible, and thus could serve as a clear example for others?
Regarding lack of tools, tian has neither mouth nor eyes, neither arms nor legs.  How can tian thus create things willfully, constructing them along human lines?  A sign of things that are created spontaneously (ziran) and without willful intent is that they happen without construction, like a human created in the womb upon a mixture of the physical fluids (qi) of a male and female.  In nature, things are created thus, rather than constructed with arms and tools, so how can it be said that  tian willfully creates?  Wang argues that tian is identifiable neither with a body nor with air (both of which are advanced by some). If tian does have a body, it must be very distant from humans, there are no signs for it (Wang offers the seemingly arbitrary “enormous” number of 60,000 li distant).  Surely, if it is this distant, it cannot interact with mankind or be aware of even mankind’s most explicit actions, let alone secret desires and motivations.
In addition to arguing for the implausibility of the divine agency reading of tian, Wang offers an explanation of the psychology which seems all too willing to see agency as rampant in the natural world.  He argues that because people engaged in corrupting action, it was necessary (for rulers) to institute laws, punishments, incitements to proper action, and rewards.  This was attributed to tian rather than to the ruler, who presumably had an interest in fostering a general belief that an omniscient and completely unconquerable divine entity is responsible for enforcing what amounts to the ruler’s laws, rather than the all too human, and thus vulnerable, ruler himself.

c. Astronomy and Physics

Wang’s positions on astronomy and physics were, following his metaphysical positions, naturalistic (with respect to the dominant views of his day), and Wang rejected a number of popular positions on the workings of the sun, planets, and stars.  The following are some representative examples of his views in this area.

i. Celestial Objects

Wang challenges the views he attributes to the ru scholars concerning the origin and movements of the sun.  They claim, according to Wang, that the sun emerges from and descends into the darkness of the yin physical qi, so that the sun literally “goes out” when it sets, subsumed in the yin.  Wang argues that it is not the case that the sun goes out or becomes dark, just as a fire does not become obscured by the darkness when night falls.
Wang argues that the movements of the sun and the moon are connected to the movements of the stars and planets in general, noticing the regularities in the motions of the sun and moon, and their correlation with other movements and placements in the heavens (movement through the zodiac, the planets along the ecliptic, and so forth).  This makes the sun and moon different from the clouds, for example, which move completely independently from the motions of the stars and planets.
The sun, according to Wang, is of the nature of fire, and also has the principle of motion, due to its qi, which is similar to that of the moon and the planets, which are also in motion, while Earth is stationary.  Concerning solar eclipses, Wang’s position is that the sun eclipses spontaneously, arguing against the view that such eclipses are caused by the moon.
While a number of Wang’s views on celestial objects and motion are opposed to our current understandings, his position on the geometry of celestial objects sounds much more modern.  Wang argues that the sun, moon, planets, and stars are not circular even though they appear to be so.  That they appear so is due to their distance.

ii. Heaven and Earth

Heaven (tian) and Earth (di), according to Wang, began small and through time expanded to their current size, via spontaneous growth.  Because of this, Heaven must be far distant from humans (Wang offers a distance of 60,000 li), and for this reason, among others, cannot be said to interact with human beings.
Concerning climate, Wang’s view is that the elements influence the temperature in different areas, and that in the southern regions fire is dominant, while in the northern regions water is dominant.  Heat is caused by proximity to fire, which explains why the southern regions are warmer than the northern, while proximity to water causes things to become cold, which accounts for the lower temperatures in the north.
Wang’s views concerning the source of rain is surprisingly close to our contemporary understanding, and Wang seems to have had some understanding of the water cycle.

6. Ethics

a. Ming (Destiny)

Ming, according to Wang, is the primary determinant of the outcome of a person’s life.  Whether one is successful in one’s career, one has a difficult or easy life full of catastrophes or fortunate turns, whether one is ill or in good health, dies young or in ripe old age--all of this is due to the quality and type of one’s ming.  There are different ming, according to Wang, concerning different aspects of human life.  Thus, there is a ming governing one’s fortunes, a ming governing the length of one’s life, and a ming concerning the welfare of the state, for example.  Wang sees ming not as a metaphysical entity in itself or a power, but as something like a higher-level concept, based on lower-level individuating features ensuring a certain destiny, most often qi.  The fact that there can be different ming might be understood then as flagging the fact that there are different lower-level properties contributing to or somehow responsible for the ming of the entity in question with respect to the property in question (fortune, length of life, talent, and so forth).
This allows Wang to construe ming in a naturalistically respectable way while countenancing its existence and disagreeing with the “common” view of ming as decreed by a divine heavenly agent.  Examples can be seen in the essay Ming yi.  One’s destiny (concerning all aspects) is given by Heaven (spontaneously, rather than consciously), and insofar as this is a natural quality, the destiny of a person regarding different aspects can be revealed in features of their bodies and actions.  The ming concerning length of life, for example, can be seen by examining the physical features of a person.  Some people are sallow, weakly, and frail, and this is an indication that their ming commits them to a (relatively) short life.  Alternatively, those who appear fit and strong can be seen to have a ming allowing them long and healthy lives.
The obvious problem arises here, of course, that it is often the case that the frail live deep into old age and the strong die young.  In fact, in cases of deaths in war, it will generally only be the strong and fit who are killed, and the frail (who stay home rather than fighting) who are spared.  How can this be squared with Wang’s conception of ming?  Wang argues that there are often competing ming, and that one ming might overcome another.  A key example this is the ming of the state.  The ming of the state trumps the ming of the individual, for reasons Wang is not completely clear about.  Some things he says suggests that the view is that the state is a larger, more important, and integrated entity of which the individual is simply a part, and its ming therefore overcomes that of the individual.  A state at war or in chaos, for example, will be one in which young, robust, and strong individuals will often meet their deaths earlier than their individual ming (the one governing their length of life) would otherwise determine.  The ming of the state, or other ming, that is, can interfere with or make irrelevant the individual ming.
To further explain this, in addition to discussing the different entities and aspects ming can attach to, Wang discusses three different types of ming in Ming yi: zheng (regular), sui (contingent), and zao (incidental).  Although he first seems to define these types of ming in such a way as to suggest that they are essentially modal, later in the essay he connects them to specific qualities of outcome, such that one with a regular ming will enjoy a long life and fortune, while one with incidental ming will have a short and likely miserable life, encountering a multitude of misfortunes.  The different types of ming can overcome one another, just as the ming of the state overcomes that of the individual.  Thus, a contingent ming can cancel an incidental ming and vice versa.  Wang is less than fully clear on how this works.  Although he does leave room for willful human activity to change outcomes in one’s life (contingent ming), sometimes the natural features of a situation are so strong that they cannot be overcome by effort or incident.  One example Wang uses is of the doctor being unable to save a person whose allotted life span is up, no matter how hard he may try or how skilled a doctor he may be.

b. Xing (Characteristics)

While Wang’s use of the term xing is broader than the specifically ethical use (he uses it to refer to physical as well as behavioral characteristics), his interesting and more philosophically relevant use of this term is an ethical one.  When he discusses xing as a concept, Wang seems concerned with its ethical aspects.  Wang explains character, like all other phenomena, as being based on the quantity and quality of qi possessed by the individual.  The individual’s destiny (ming) is also a relevant factor in determining character.  In some places, Wang connects these concepts by holding ming to be the determining factor of what kind and how much qi one receives from Heaven, while in other places he seems to make qi the more fundamental concept in connection with character, and takes one’s type of ming to be based in the type or amount of qi one is born with, and completely independent of characteristics (xing). Thus, one born with abundant and strong qi thereby is destined to live a long life, barring circumstantial events that might cut this life short (such as natural disasters, wars, and so forth. connected to the destiny [ming] of the state or the earth, which can supersede individual destiny).  In a number of chapters, Wang argues that one can have a lofty character and at the same time an unfortunate or calamitous destiny.  Observable facts prove this, Wang claims, as there are many talented and virtuous scholars who live lives of suffering and failure and reach early deaths, while untalented and vicious scholars achieve the heights of fame, fortune, and prosperity.  The same is true of rulers and states--there is no causal connection between virtuous rule and ordered or harmonious society, despite the claims of ru scholars.  This is due in part to the lack of connection between the character of a ruler and his destiny.  If a virtuous king has a calamitous destiny, he will be ignored and non-influential, thus his virtue will not translate to the harmonious functioning of society.  Because, according to Wang, destiny is accorded spontaneously, virtue is impotent to transform it. (Zhi chao)
Human action is only in part due to agency, according to Wang, and behavior is determined to a large extent by the situation in society and the world in general.  Moral conduct, for example, is not (fully) attributable to a person’s substantial characteristics (zhi xing), according to Wang, but is mostly dependent on whether or not there is sufficient food, which in turn depends on whether or not there is drought or flooding, and the general state of the climate and land.  Wang claims that when food is sufficient, people will act consistently with ritual and appropriateness (li yi), and the society will be peaceful and orderly.

7. Influence

a. Influences and Place in Han Dynasty Thought

Rafe de Crespigny argues that Wang may have been influenced by Huan Tan, and thereby the Old Text school, thus making sense of his attack on New Text Confucians (although this is mainly speculative).  Wang’s views on qi, tian, ming, and so forth. are clearly influenced by earlier Han and pre-Han thinkers.  Wang claims influence by Confucius, Mencius, Yang Xiong, Dong Zhongshu, as well as Daoist figures such Laozi, although all of these figures are targets of Wang’s criticisms in various places in Lunheng as well.  Interestingly, some of the same stories and accounts of these thinkers Wang uses in some essays to prove their sagehood are used in other essays to undermine their authority or criticize their views more generally.  If Lunheng is taken as unitary and generally representative (assuming that Wang’s views of these philosophers did not change over time), it has to be concluded that he had an ambivalent reaction to these philosophers, seeing them as in some ways exemplary and praiseworthy, while still having (in some cases fatally undermining) flaws.  Indeed, one of Wang’s positions is that later generations should not make the mistake he sees ru scholars making concerning the sages of the past, in assuming that everything they said or taught can be taken as true or even useful, or assuming that everything they did was virtuous or otherwise proper.  Probably for this reason, among others, Wang’s own influence in the Han itself was negligible.

b. Later Influence

Although Wang’s influence in his own time and directly after was almost negligible, and his Lunheng survived mainly because of its perceived interest as an almost encyclopedic collection of historical, mythological, and literary material from early China, Wang’s work did undergo a surge of interest in the modern period, beginning with Qing scholars in the 19th century, who wrote a number of commentaries on the Lunheng, including Yu Yue, Sun Yirang, Yang Shoujing, Liu Bansui, and later Huang Hui.  The resurgence of interest in Wang Chong’s work was likely due to the critical spirit bubbling in the late Qing and into the Republican period, and was maintained through the period of the rise of Marxist materialism.  The critical and seemingly anti-traditional character of Wang’s thought proved amenable to modern thinkers from the late Qing through today.  Since the late 19th century, there have been a number of commentaries and interpretive studies on Wang Chong’s work, mainly in Chinese, Japanese, and Korean scholarship.  Wang’s work was basically unknown in the West until the late 19th century, and since then there has been some level of interest in and scholarship on Wang’s work, mainly historical and philological, and (to a lesser extent) philosophical.

8. References and Further Reading

The amount of work on Wang Chong in English is limited, and much of what does exist is either translation (Forke), or secondary work dealing with Han thought more generally (Loewe, Czikszentmihalyi).  The following list focuses mainly on English language scholarship, but also includes important Chinese works.  Those with facility in the Chinese language are encouraged to start with the more extensive Chinese sources (Zhou, Liu).

  • Chan, Wing-tsit. A Sourcebook in Chinese Philosophy. Princeton University Press, 1969.
  • Czikszentmihalyi, Mark. Readings in Han Chinese Thought. Indianapolis: Hackett, 2006.
  • De Crespigny, Rafe. A Biographical Dictionary of Later Han to the Three Kingdoms (23-220 AD). Brill, 2007.
  • Forke, Alfred. Lun Heng: Philosophical and Miscellaneous Essays of Wang Ch’ung (Part I and II). Second Edition.  New York: Paragon Book Gallery, 1962.
  • Lin Lixue, Wang Chong.  Taipei: Sanmin Shuju, 1991.
  • Liu Jinming, Wang Chong zhexue de zai faxian (The Rediscovery of Wang Chong’s Philosophy).  Taipei: Wenjin Chubanshe, 2006.
  • Loewe, Michael. Early Chinese Texts: A Biographical Guide. Berkeley: Institute of East Asian Studies, 1994.
  • Loewe, Michael. Faith, Myth, and Reason in Han China. Indianapolis: Hackett, 2005
  • Makeham, John. Name and Actuality in Early Chinese Thought. Albany: SUNY Press, 1994.
  • McLeod, Alexus. “A Reappraisal of Wang Chong’s Critical Method Through the Wenkong Chapter.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 34:4 (2007).
  • McLeod, Alexus . “Pluralism About Truth in Early Chinese Philosophy: A Reflection on Wang Chong’s Approach.” Comparative Philosophy, 2:1 (2011).
  • Needham, Joseph. Science and Civilization in Early China, Vol. 3.  Cambridge University Press, 1959.
  • Nylan, Michael. “Han Classicists Writing About Their Own Tradition.” Philosophy East and West, 47:2 (1997).
  • Puett, Michael.  “Listening to Sages: Divinations, Omens, and the Rhetoric of Antiquity in Wang Chong’s Lunheng.” Oriens Extremis, 45 (2005-2006): 271-281.
  • Zhou Guidian, Xu shi zhi bian: Wang Chong Zhexue de zong zhi (The Distinction Between Truth and Falsity: The Purpose of Wang Chong’s Philosophy).  Beijing: Renmin Chubanshe, 1994
  • Zufferey, Nicolas, Wang Chong (27-97?): Connaissance, politique et verite en Chine ancienne. Bern: Peter Lang, 1995.


Author Information

Alexus McLeod
University of Dayton
U. S. A.

Gaudapada (c. 500 C.E.)ḍapāda is one of the early and most reputed philosophers of the Vedānta school in the Indian system of thought, who is believed to have lived roughly during 500 C.E. In the spiritual lineage, Gauḍapāda is regarded as the grand preceptor of Śaṅkaracarya [8th c. C.E.], the systematizer of Advaita Vedānta. Gauḍapāda is best known for his analytical exposition on the tenets of Advaita Vedānta that provided a firm ontological grounding to Vedānta philosophy. Gauḍapāda’s expository interpretation of the Upaniṣadic literature in the light of logical reasoning is a critical apparatus of epistemological exposition in the Advaita tradition.

According to Gauḍapāda’s thesis, the ultimate ontological reality is the pure consciousness, which is bereft of attributes and intentionality. The world of duality is nothing but a vibration of the mind (manodṛśya or manaspandita). The pluralistic world is imagined by the mind (saṁkalpa) and this false projection is sponsored by the illusory factor called māyā. The origination of the individual soul, which experiences the world of duality, is figurative. The finitude of the individuality of the soul is caused due to nescience (avidyā), while in reality its nature is identical with the ultimate soul – pure consciousness. The knowledge of non-difference between the individual and the supreme soul alone leads to liberation.

Gauḍapāda’s influence has probably been most far-reaching in the development of Advaita Vedānta through the ages. He is well-known for his conception of ‘contact-less contemplation' (asparśa yoga) a key soteriological notion of Advaita Vedānta. More famous is his doctrine of non-origination (ajāti-vāda), with which he establishes the eternality and non-duality of consciousness. The philosophy of Gauḍapāda may be characterized as absolute non-dualism and establishes this doctrine both by the method of affirmation and negation (adhyāropa and apavāda). He explains the doctrine of advaita-vāda using illustrations such as “quenching of fire-brand” (alātaśānti) and the phantasmagoric city (gandharva-nagara) to systematically expound the falsity of the world.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works of Gauḍapāda
  2. An Overview of Gauḍapāda’s Māṇdūkya kārikā
  3. Gauḍapāda’s Onto-theology
  4. Metaphysics
    1. Theory of Non-origination (ajāti vāda)
    2. Contact-less Contemplation (asparśa yoga)
  5. Phenomenology of Consciousness - Quenching of Fire-brand alāta śānti
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary References
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life and Works of Gauḍapāda


Within the Advaita tradition, Gauḍapāda is regarded as the disciple of the legendary sage śukha and is the teacher of Govinda bhagavadpāda, who is śaṅkarācārya’s direct preceptor. śaṅkara, in his works, exhibits extreme reverence to Gauḍapāda. Gauḍapāda is referred to by the terms sampradāyavit – knower of the tradition, paramaguru – grand preceptor, ‘vddha ācārya’ – ancient preceptor, and so on. All that is known about Gauḍapāda is mostly derived from his name. The term ‘Gauḍa’, according to some scholars, indicates his geographical origin, which is the region of Bengal. Alternatively, we find some references to Gauḍapāda by the term ‘Gauācārya’ – a compound word which means the ‘teacher of the Gauḍa’. Here again the term ‘Gauḍa’ clearly denotes a place and is not a proper name. Also, Sureśvarācārya (a direct disciple of śaṅkara), in his work Naikarmya Siddhi IV.44, refers him as ‘Gaua. From a 13th century prolific glossator, ānandagiri, we gather that Gauḍapāda spent some time in Badrikāśrama absorbed in deep meditation. Another legend about Gauḍapāda, narrated by a 17th c. advaitin, informs us that there was a place near a river Hīraravati in Kurukshetra (the northern region of today’s Bengal), a place where some Gauḍa people lived. According to this note, the term ‘Gaua’ connotes a specific ethnic group belonging to a particular geographical origin. It was in this place the ācārya was absorbed in meditation and hence the name Gauḍapādācārya. Apart from these abstract conjectures on the life of Gauḍapāda, his dates are also not clearly established. From the references from the Buddhist writers who cite Gauḍapāda as the source of substantial evidence, some scholars attempt to give a rough idea on Gauḍapāda’s date. Vidhushekhara Bhattacarya and T. M. P. Mahadevan bring to our notice that three Buddhist writers, namely, Bhavaviveka, Santaraksita and Kamalasila have cited Gauḍapada’s kārikā-s in their works. Karl Potter suggests that Bhavaviveka is the younger contemporary of Dharmapala, who according to early Chinese travel accounts seems to have flourished during 5th c. C.E From this information we may fix Gauḍapada’s date not later than 5th c. C.E. A few other scholars fix Gauḍapāda’s date in accordance to śaṅkara’s date, which then would push his date further to 6th c. C.E. Some other scholars bring to our notice that Gauḍapāda himself cites some Buddhist views of Nāgārjuna and Asanga, with which we could fix the upper limit to 4th c. C.E.

All the scholars agree that Gauḍapāda’s most prominent work, is his metrical commentary on the Mādūkya Upaniad called the Mādūkya kārikā. It is otherwise called Gauḍapādīya or Gauḍapāda kārika. Thanga Swamy and Tandalam Narayana Swamy Iyer indicate that there is a commentary on the Nsimha Uttara Tāpini Upaniad authored by Gauḍapāda. A commentary (bhāya) on the Sāmkhya kārikā of īśvara Krsna is attributed to Gauḍapāda. There is yet another commentary – a vtti on the Uttara gīta is also attributed to Gauḍapāda. In the tantric tradition, works like the Durgāsaptasati, Subhagodaya stuti and śri Vidyāratna Sūtra’s authorship is ascribed to Gauḍapāda. These works are supposedly on the śri Vidyā tradition.  Some scholars maintain that there are multiple Gauḍapāda-s who belong to different times and places while the Mādūkya kārikā is the only work of Gauḍapāda who is śaṅkara’s grand preceptor.

2. An Overview of Gauḍapāda’s Māṇdūkya kārikā


A kārikā is usually a crisp condensation of a subject matter or an explication of a specific doctrinal position. The Mādūkya kārikā is a metrical commentary on the Mādūkya Upaniad, which belongs to the Atharva Veda.  The Gauḍapāda kārikā seems to be a collection of terse aphorisms consolidated under different topics of Advaita Vedānta. The kārikā is pedagogically instructive in its tone. Traditionally, the Mādūkya kārikā is regarded as an exhaustive manual for the fundamentals of Advaita Vedānta and hence called Upadeśa grantha. Gauḍapāda’s kārikā has 215 verses distributed in four chapters. The relation between the Mādūkya Upaniad and the kārikā-s remains abstract. The four chapters are namely, a. āgama prakaraa – the chapter regarding the scriptures consisting of 29 verses b. Vaitathya prakaraa – the chapter regarding illusion consisting of 38 verses c. advaita prakaraa – the chapter on non-duality constituting 48 verses and d. alātaśanti prakaraa – the chapter on the fire-brand comprising of 100 verses. There are some traditional views, which consider the 29 verses in the first chapter of the kārikā as the Upanisad itself. The main purport of these four chapters of the kārikā is to delineate the quintessence of Vedāntic content as commenced in the Upanisad. The first chapter is an exposition of the Upanisadic content mainly to describe the nature of the absolute ontological being. Expounding upon the states of psycho-physical experiences (waking, dream and profound sleep) as primary constituents of metempsychic existence, the kārikā discusses various positions on the theories of creation. Based on the Upanisadic cohort, the kārikā, in this chapter, attempts to initiate the Advaitic position that the template of creation is temporally apparent and ultimately unreal. The second chapter of the kārikā proposes to logically establish the theory of illusion. The rationality of the third chapter of the kārikā is to firmly establish the position of non-duality (advaita) by the method of methodical assertion and negation (adhyāropa and apavāda). Finally, the objective of the fourth chapter mainly seeks to explicate the notion of the ‘contactless yoga’ (asparśa) to assert the theory of non-origination (ajāti) of the eternal soul as expounded in the third chapter. The refutation of the creation theories remains to be the prime focus of all the four chapters.

There is an intense controversy in modern scholarship over the correct interpretation of the philosophy and the structure of Mādūkya kārikā. Vidhushekhara Bhattacarya advocates that the four chapters do not constitute a unitary text of the Mādūkya kārikā. According to Bhattacarya, the four chapters of the Mādūkya kārikā are four independent treatises and were later consolidated into one title called āgamaśāstra. He also observes that the first chapter of the Mādūkya kārikā does not systematically expound the prose content of the Mādūkya Upaniad and this led Bhattacarya to conclude that the first chapter of the kārikā predates the  Upaniadic content.  Owing to copious references to ‘Buddha’ in the fourth chapter (IV.19, 42,80, 88, 98, 99) and for the claim that the term ‘alātaśānti’ is a peculiar to Buddhists, Bhattacarya advocates that Mādūkya kārikā is more inclined to Buddhist philosophy than to Vedānta. However, Richard King in his detailed analysis on the date and authorship of the text rejects the Bhattacarya’s hypothesis, while he arrives at a conclusion that the final or the fourth chapter (the alātaśanti prakaraa) is a later text composed perhaps for a different audience by some other author who is heavily influenced by Gauḍapāda. According to King, the fourth chapter profusely adopts Buddhist terminologies especially from the Mādhyamaka and the Yogācāra philosophical traditions. Richard King also shows that the prominent Advaitins (beginning from 8th to 17th C.E) completely omit any reference to the fourth chapter in their respective works. King also contends that the first three chapters of the Mādūkya kārikā were linked by the śaṅkarite tradition by the 8th century of the Common Era and was eventually attributed to the author who bore the title ‘Gaua’.

3. Gauḍapāda’s Onto-theology


The sacred syllable OM, also known as praava is regarded as the absolute being. Gauḍapāda suggests that the structure of the sacred syllable has linguistic connections to, and homologically implies, onto-theological connotations. The kārikā of the āgama prakaraa begins with the appraisal of the method of contemplation of the praava. Gauḍapāda regards OM as the sound from which the entire creation springs forth. OM is the root for all speech. Gauḍapāda suggests that the sonic praava is discerned with its four fold linguistic measures (mātra-s) representing the gradational states of consciousness. The four mātra-s are  a, u, m & the OM. According to the phonetic rules of Sanksrit, the first two mātra-s, ‘a’ & ‘u’ combine to render a diphthong ‘o’ resulting in the sonic OM. Each of these phonetic elements is homologous to the states of experience of the individual soul. The sound ‘a’ of the praava represents the waking state (jāgrat), which Gauḍapāda calls the all pervasive, external, universal consciousness known by the term ‘āpti’. In this state, the individual soul bears the name viśva – who is the enjoyer of the gross objects (sthūla bhuk). Secondly, the phonetic element ‘u’ represents the dream state in which the individual soul becomes the enjoyer of the internal objects (antaprajña) and is called the sūkma bhuk. In this state the soul bears the name ‘taijasa’. Gauḍapāda refers to the nature state of the internal consciousness by the term ‘utkara’ meaning ecstasy. The third state is of profound sleep (suupti) and is represented by the sound ‘m’. The individual soul in profound sleep is the enjoyer of bliss (ānanda bhuk). The profound sleep, as Gauḍapāda describes, is a state of intense consciousness in its causal state in which the gross and subtle state of objective experiences get dissolved (laya). Finally, the fourth state is known as the turīya and is absolutely transcendental to all the phenomenal states of apparent realities. The fourth state  is measureless (amātra) and is devoid of all attributes whatsoever. This turīya, as Gauḍapāda conveys, is non-dual (advaita), the reality of Lord-hood (īśāna), the seer of everything (sarva dk). It is in this state, as Gauḍapāda in kārikā I.17 points out, all the phenomenal realities of the world would cease (prapañcopaśamam) to have any existence. All the dualities are merely sponsored by the indiscernible factor of māyā and in reality they do not exist at all.

Gauḍapāda identifies this fourth state of the absolute attributeless Being - the praṇava and the phonetic components of praṇava with the state of individual experience relegated in different gradations of consciousness. The realization of turīya as the attributeless consciousness is the real awakening from the state of profound sleep. The awakening is accomplished by contemplating on the praṇava and this is called the praṇava yoga. Apophatically, the praṇava  yoga is the final salvific process and Gauḍapāda considers it to be an onto-soteriological guarantee for the emancipation of the individual soul.

4. Metaphysics

a. Theory of Non-origination (ajāti vāda)

The fulcrum of Gauḍapāda’s philosophy of non-duality is the theory of non-origination known as the  ajāti vāda in Sanskrit. The theory of non-origination is constructed on the fundamental premise that ‘nothing is ever born, nothing is created whatsoever and there is no transactional reality at any rate’. The phenomenal reality is figurative and is imagined upon the Self  by its own magical power called māyā. In the second and the third chapter of the kārikā, Gauḍapāda discusses this theory in detail. Gauḍapāda primarily adopts the logical method of superimposition and subsequent negation (adyāropa-apavāda) to establish the concept of non-origination of the Self. The Self is the only non-dual reality and whatever exists apart from that reality is logically reduced as unreal and is subsequently negated to absolute non-existence.

The doctrine of ajāti vāda – the theory of non-origination aims at dismantling all the theories of creation in order to suggest that there is no creation that has ever occurred. Gauḍapāda’s logical postulation is that when the Self is the only reality that remains eternal, whatever it is that seems to exist apart from the non-dual self must be unreal and hence non-existent. Gauḍapāda in the kārikā I.17 maintains the premise that ‘if the world ever existed then it would at some point cease to exist. But since the Self alone is the eternal existence, the phenomenal world is known to be absolute non-existence only’. Gauḍapāda also points out that the creation has no purpose in any metaphysical sense. Creation cannot serve the purpose of any experience to the divine Being since the Upaniṣadic import insists that the ultimate being is ever-accomplished and it transcends all phenomenal relations. Secondly, purpose of creation cannot be taken as the God’s sport or the divine play (līla) since it is an unwelcome position to suppose that the cosmogenically omnipotent God has some desire to be accomplished.

Gauḍapāda introduces the concept of non-origination in the vaitathya prakaraṇa where he aims to prove the falsity of the phenomenal world. He maintains that the existence of conventional mundane reality of the material world is an apparatus or the means (upāya) to apprehend the absolute non-dual being. In kārikā II.31, Gauḍapāda points out that the existence of the world is false; just as a city that exists in the sky (gandharva nagara), so does the whole universe upon the Self. Likewise, the modifications of material reality in terms of creation, subsistence and dissolution are merely imagined upon the Self. Gauḍapāda also uses the illustration of dream to posit that just as the dream vanishes to non-existence once the individual returns to the waking state; so does the world cease to exist once the reality of the absolute is known. Gauḍapāda insists on the point that there exists neither the dream nor the waking and hence the universe never existed at all upon the unborn Self. Gauḍapāda also uses the analogy of rope-snake in this context. The kārikā II.17 states that ‘as a rope whose nature has not been well known is imagined in the dark like a snake, so also is the pattern of duality imagined being manifested from the unborn Self’. The final illustration that Gauḍapāda employs can be noted from the kārikā III.8 that says ‘Just as the sky is seen by the ignorant young boys as being covered by the dust etc., so does the Self in being associated with the impurities of mundane transformations' (yathā bālāna gagana malina malai). Origination (jāti) is a magical projection (vivarta) of the Self and is operative only through māyā (sato hi māyayā janma – GK.III.27.) The Self that is bereft of any transformation in terms of origination and so forth, by its own innate nature is self-established (svastha), tranquil (śānta), self-effulgent (sakd vibhāta), nameless and formless (anāmaka, arūpaka).

b. Contact-less Contemplation (asparśa yoga)


The third chapter of Mādūkya kārikā, introduces the notion of ‘contact-less contemplation’ (asparśa yoga). According to Gauḍapāda, asparśa yoga is a transcendental mental state in which the mind is stripped from all desires and afflictions. Sparśa in Sanskrit means contact. In this context, it is the contact with the sense organs that results in the identification of Self with the non-Self causing bondage. Asparśa is the counter state in which there no contact with the sense organs (sarva abhilāpa vigatah; sarva cintā samutthita III.37) and the function of the mind in material sense is nullified. The ephemeral realities in multitude names and forms, those that are movable and immovable and so on, are perceived only by the mind (manodṛśya) causing desires, disappointments, pleasure, pain and so on. Once the mind is nullified, the duality does not exist. When mind is pure, the Self dwells in the supra-sensible state of tranquillity. Gauḍapāda, in the kārikā IV.2, offers salutations to the transcendental state of asparśa stating that this yogic state is free from all mundane relations in the nature of highest bliss, free from any dispute or doubt and that which is well established in the Vedic scriptures. ‘Those who perceive the contact of the consciousness with the external objects, may as well see footmarks in the open space’ (kārikā IV.28). Control of mind, according to Gauḍapāda, is the key to accomplish this state of asparśa. The mind when under complete control (manonigraha) through the ability to discriminate between the eternal Self and the ephemeral non-Self, in Gauḍapāda’s opinion, is equated with the nature of mind in the state of profound sleep. Gauḍapāda calls this state of non-mind ‘amanībhāva’.

5. Phenomenology of Consciousness - Quenching of Fire-brand alāta śānti


The Advaita philosophy holds the position that the consciousness is attributed with the functionality of perception only with regard to the waking state wherein the objectivity is merely projected and thus appears in various names and forms. This figurative intentionality of consciousness is merely a mental simulation caused by the apparent conjugation of Self and the non-self. The objectivity provided by the mind attributes the intentionality to the consciousness. Thus consciousness acquires varied degrees of functionality in terms of intentional acts such as perception, memory, imagination and the like. In reality, however, suspending the objective world constituting the universals and particulars, the phenomenological residuum is the pure supra-Consciousness that does not stand in any causal relation with the objective entities; nor does it have any intentionality and hence is apodictically transcendental.  Though the consciousness is the substratum for all cognitive experiences that precipitate out of subject-object interactions, it in ‘actuality’ remains untouched by any of these transactions.

Gauḍapāda uses the simile called ‘fire-circle’ (alāta cakra) in order to explain the onto-phenomenology of consciousness. When a stick with a fire tip is waved (alāta spandita) during the night, it forms different appearances in accordance to the movement of the fire-brand and so does the vibration of the consciousness that appears to exist in terms of known, knower and the like, (grahaa-grāhaka) in accordance to the nature of limiting adjuncts (kārikā IV.47). Just as the same fire-brand when not in motion is free from all appearances, the consciousness too when not vibrated remains in its true intrinsic nature is free from all names and forms. Gauḍapāda insists that, even when the fire-brand is in motion the appearances that seem to exist do not come from anywhere and they do not go anywhere. Appearances do not originate from the fire-brand and they do not dissolve into it. There is no causal relation between the resultant products of appearances with the seeming cause. Similarly, the entire universe that exist in pairs of dualities are not products of consciousness and nor is the consciousness a product of the physical universe. The existence of cause-effect result, according to Gauḍapāda , is a mental pre-occupation (phala-āveśa) which is a mere projection (phala-udbhavah). In the domain of ignorance these mental pre-suppositions manifest as multi-fold appearances, which is purely due to concealment (samvtya – samvaraa) of the nature of absolute self as pure consciousness.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary References

  • Gauḍapāda, ‘sagauapāda māūkya kārikā atharvavedīya māūkyopaniad: with śaṅkarācārya’s bhāya & ānandagiri’s tīka’, Ed. by Vinaya Ganesa Apte, Anandasrama Press, 1936.
  • Gauḍapāda, ‘Sākhya kārikā: commentary of Gauḍapāda – Iśvara ka’, Mainkar Tryambak Govind, Poona Oriental Book Agency, 1964.
  • Gauḍapāda, ‘māūkya kārikā’, Swami Gambhirananda Trans., Ramakrishna Mutt, Trichur, 1987.
  • śaṅkarācārya, ‘Prasthāna traya bhāya: māūkya kārikā bhāya’, Vol.II, V.Panoli Trans., Mathrubhumi Grandhavedi Publication, Calicut, 2006.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Mahadevan T.M.P, ‘Gauḍapāda: A study in early Vedānta’, University of Madras, Madras, 1960.
  • Vidhushekhara Bhattacarya, ‘āgamaśāstra of Gauḍapāda’, University of Calcutta, Calcutta, 1943.
  • Douglas Fox, ‘Dispelling Illusion: Gauḍapāda’s Alātaśānti with an introduction’, SUNY, New York, 1993.
  • Colin A. Cole, ‘A Study of Gauḍapāda’s māūkya kārikā’, Motilal Banarsidass, Delhi, 2004.
  • Natalia Isayeva, ‘From Early Vedānta to Kashmir Shaivism: Gauḍapāda, Bhathari & Abhinavagupta’, SUNY, New York, 1995.
  • Richard King, ‘Early Advaita Vedānta and Buddhism’, SUNY, New York, 1995.


Author Information

Devanathan Jagannathan
University of Toronto

Wuxing (Wu-hsing)

The Chinese term wuxing (wu-hsing, “five processes” or “five phases”) refers to a fivefold conceptual scheme that is found throughout traditional Chinese thought.  These five phases are wood (mu), fire (huo), earth (tu), metal (jin), and water (shui); they are regarded as dynamic, interdependent modes or aspects of the universe’s ongoing existence and development.    Although this fivefold scheme resembles ancient Greek discourse about the four elements, these Chinese “phases” are seen as ever-changing material forces, while the Greek elements typically are regarded as unchanging building blocks of matter.  Prior to the Han dynasty, wuxing functioned less as a school of thought and more as a way of describing natural processes hidden from ordinary view.  During the period of the Han dynasty (202 B.C.E.-220 C.E.), wuxing thought became a distinct philosophical tradition (jia, “family” or “school”).  Since that time, the wuxing system has been applied to the explanation of natural phenomena and extended to the description of aesthetic principles, historical events, political structures, and social norms, among other things.  Cosmology, morality, and medicine remain the chief arenas of wuxing thought, but virtually every aspect of Chinese life has been touched by it.  As such, wuxing has come to be inseparable from Chineseness itself and belongs to no single stream of classical Chinese philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Meanings of Wuxing
  2. Origins of Wuxing
  3. Wuxing Before the Han Dynasty
  4. Wuxing During the Han Dynasty and After
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Meanings of Wuxing

When seeking to understand the wuxing system, we encounter multiple uses of this term in pre-Han and Han sources that may signal the need for more than one translation from Chinese into any differing target language.  We may ask, are we speaking about five elements, five phases, five movements, five actions, or something altogether different?  The truth is that, depending on the use and context, any one of these might be an appropriate translation.

It has become routine in recent decades to insist that, in its cosmological uses, wuxing should be rendered into English as “five phases” rather than “five elements”, and to make a deliberate distinction between the role of these five in Chinese cosmology and the notion of the four elements in Greek thought, according to which the Greek notions of earth, air, fire, water are generally thought to represent actual fixed material substances.  Sometimes wuxing has been translated into English as “five elements”, but when we actually watch the work that xing does in the Chinese language, it is used to describe movement (e.g. walking), alteration, changing states of being, permutations or metamorphoses.  To back translate, then, the Chinese conception of “element” is quite different from the Western one, in that it does not imply a fixed substantial essence that remains unchanged and constitutes the discrete difference between one object and all others. Whereas the four elements in Western Greek thought were understood as the basic building blocks of matter, the Chinese, by contrast, viewed objects as ever-changing and moving forces or energies of five sorts.  These five phases work interactively and have identifiable correlations that instantiate both objects and natural processes as we know them.

2. Origins of Wuxing

Although not developed into its present form until the Han dynasty, the origins of wuxing extend far back into the earliest records of Chinese intellectual history.  In the Shang dynasty (1600-1046 B.C.E.), oracle bone inscriptions (used in divination rituals to predict and discern outcomes in nature and human affairs) rely on the number five.  Typically, this is the pattern of four around a center, where the four represent the cardinal directions expressed in the territories around the central area in which the ruler resides and from which he governs.  But this pattern of five is not yet any comprehensive theory or cosmology, and there is no evidence of belief that some five phases or elements interpenetrate and mutually influence each other correlatively.  However, there are already, in very rough form, associations of the territories with directions, colors, spirits, and proper rituals that are suggestive of the later correlational developments in Han wuxing thought.  For example, in the West an ox of a certain color must be sacrificed at a specified time of a year in order to insure an auspicious future.  Accordingly, even in the Shang there is fragmentary evidence that the number five is of explanatory significance, and there is some preliminary correlative association between territories, colors, rituals, and deities.

3. Wuxing Before the Han Dynasty

Between the Shang and Han dynasties, a number of texts were compiled that collectively shed light on the development of what became wuxing thought.  Chief among these are some of the “Five Classics” alleged to have been written during the Zhou dynasty (1045-256 B.C.E.) and later enshrined as the earliest Confucian canon, although portions of some or all of these texts may well reflect the concerns and contexts of later rather than earlier periods: Shijing (Classic of Poetry), Shujing (Classic of History), Liji (Record of Ritual), Yijing (Classic of Changes), and Chunqiu (Spring and Autumn Annals) with its commentary, Zuozhuan (Chronicles of Zuo).  Despite the uncertain dating, it can be assumed that these texts contain a substantial amount of material that is traceable to the pre-Qin (pre-221 B.C.E.) period and even reaching back to Confucius’s era or before.

In Zuo Zhuan’s record on the 27th year of the reign of Duke Xiang (590-573 B.C.E.), the text says: “Heaven has produced the five elements which supply humankind’s requirements, and the people use them all.  Not one of them can be dispensed with.”  Although English translations of this passage usually say “five elements” and we would expect the Chinese text to say wuxing, actually the text uses wu cai (“five materials” as in “raw materials”).  Accordingly, we may have here good evidence for the antiquity of this passage, because there is no reformatting of the passage to use the character xing as later scholars (who edited these texts into their final form) interested in fostering the wuxing cosmology might have been presumed to have done.  The text is saying that life depends on the ability of the people to understand and use the five raw materials of reality, but it is probably not drawing any significant distinction between xing and cai.

In the 7th year of the reign of Duke Wen (626-609 B.C.E.), the text says: “Water, fire, metal, wood, earth, and grains are called the six natural resources (or treasures) (liu fu).”  The character fu is used for the treasures of nature; the natural resources for life.  This list of six such resources contains the wuxing as we see them in later works, but with the addition of the grains.  Again, we might infer that the text may record authentically pre-Han material and it may reflect rather accurately the fact that the pattern of five as the number of elements had not yet been firmly established in the time of the Zuo Zhuan.

In its remarks on Duke Zhao, 1st year, the Zuo Zhuan says Heaven generates the five tastes (wu wei - sour, sweet, salty, bitter and acrid), five colors (wu se - green, yellow, black, red, and white), and five sounds (wu sheng – corresponding to the Western musical tones mi, so, do, re, and la).  In the passage on Duke Zhao’s 25th year, tastes, colors, and sounds are a result of the wuxing. The wuxing are understood as expressions of Heaven’s patterns (jing), and the character for patterns is the same one later used for the qi (vital energy) meridian lines in the body traced by practitioners of traditional Chinese medicine, suggesting that the wuxing are to Heaven as the qi meridians are to our bodies.

The Zuo Zhuan does not provide an account of correlation and intermingling of the five elements such as we see in later works.  Instead, it puts forward a teaching about five officials (wu guan) who exercise their will in order to arrange the xing into phenomenal reality.  In the material on the Duke of Zhao’s 29th year, the striking question is posed, “Why are there no more dragons?”  The answer provided for the absence of dragons is that each element is directed by its own official, but if the official neglects his task or the persons on earth distort or mismanage the five elements which are the patterns of earth, animals that depend on the order of these patterns will hide and stop reproducing correctly.  The species will disappear.  These officials are presented as spirits or deities which require veneration and offerings to be made to them.  The text gives the name of each official and the element over which he has charge.

The Shujing is a collection of documentary materials related to the ancient history of China.  The fragments that survive are a mixture of myth and history.  The earliest five chapters reach back to the legendary sage emperors Yao and Shun (c. 2400 B.C.E.?), and the last 32 chapters cover the period of the Zhou dynasty down to Duke Mu of Qin (r. 660-621 B.C.E.).  In this work, the chapter entitled Hong Fan (“Comprehensive Order” or “The Order of Everything”) provides an account of how society should follow the patterns of Earth and Heaven.  The first of the nine sections of this chapter is devoted to the wuxing system, indicating that it must be understood before the remaining eight sections can be grasped.  The chapter is constructed in the style of a dialogue between Wu Wang and a sage.  Wu states that he knows human society and that government and relationships must follow the patterns of Heaven, but he wonders how to fully grasp these patterns.  The sage tells him that whenever the wuxing are in disorder, the constant norms of Heaven will disappear and chaos will follow.

We notice now that human behavior can contribute to the harmonious operation of nature, or disrupt it causing chaos and disorder. The moral patterns for humanity and those of the natural cosmos are all interconnected and correlated.  For the first time, each of the elements has its nature more fully explained: water moistens and descends (run xia); fire burns and ascends (yan shang); wood bends and straightens (qu zhi); metal yields and changes (cong ge); earth receives and gives (jia se), such as through seeds and crops.  While fire and water are presented as opposites, wood and metal are not.  Perhaps more interestingly, we notice the correlational mechanisms of the system becoming more obvious.  The five elements are tied to the five tastes: that which moistens and descends produces saltiness; that which burns and ascends produces bitterness; that which bends and straightens produces sourness; that which yields and changes produces pungency; that which seeds and gives crops produces sweetness.  The five elements are correlated to the five ways or powers of a human being: appearance, speech, sight, hearing, and thinking.

Hong Fan does not spell out how the correlations work, only that they exist.  Likewise, in sections two and eight of this chapter, the five elements and the five conducts (also called wuxing) are related.  The sections say that if humans do not behave in the proper manner, they throw the five elements out of harmonious operation, illness and weakness arise in the body and disorder shows up in nature and the human world of history.  But the chapter does not make a direct correlation to explain how an individual element produces an action, as it does when commenting on the five tastes.  Still, the obvious point of a chapter entitled “The Order of Everything” is that a ruler who is not able to order these processes will throw all things into chaos, and even the rains will not come on time.

In Liji, the number of five-set processes of arrangement and change is sixty-two.  These are used as explanations for matters including not only politics, family, and medicine, but colors, seasons, plants, planets, and rituals for performing various actions.  Consider that in wearing ritual vestments of green and eating from vessels of wood (not metal), the sovereign could promote the powers of spring because the associations of the wuxing with various correlates sometimes make some sense (wood, green, spring; or fire, red, summer).

Later, during the Warring States period (403-221 B.C.E.), there is evidence of intellectual activity that explicitly concerned wuxing thought as a comprehensive system.  According to the Records of the Historian by Sima Qian (145–90 B.C.E.), beginning in the reign of King Wei (358–320 B.C.E.) and continuing during the reign of King Xuan (319–309 B.C.E.), an intellectual exchange was fostered by convening scholars in the capital city of Linzi next to the Ji Gate, which gave its name to what became known as the Jixia Academy.  Figures named as master teachers in this place include Zou Yan (305–240 B.C.E.), who is considered the systematizer of wuxing cosmology; Zhuang Zhou (Zhuangzi, c. 365–290 B.C.E.), an early Daoist thinker; and both Mengzi (“Mencius,” c. 372–289 B.C.E.) and Xunzi (Hsün-tzu, c. 310-220 B.C.E.), who are among the first interpreters of Confucius’s thought.  If all this is taken as accurate, it is possible that the careers of Mengzi, Zhuang Zhou and Zou Yan could have overlapped at Jixia, and Xunzi might have been there at the same time as a young student before later returning as a master himself.  We are likely on safe ground in concluding that wuxing thought was a subject of the exchanges and debates of figures at Jixia.  There are passages even in the so-called “Inner Chapters” of the Zhuangzi which seem to have wuxing cosmological assumptions underlying them (for example, chapters 2, 6, and 7).

Xunzi is very critical of wuxing explanations and the teachers who are using “ancient lore” to “concoct their new theory” called wuxing.  He calls the theory perverse and bizarre and characterizes it as obscure and impenetrable nonsense.  He is particularly critical of the stream of Confucian thought, found in the tradition of Mengzi, which has appropriated these ideas but is oblivious to where it all goes wildly wrong (Xunzi 16/6/10; Ames and Hall, pp. 137-38).  Xunzi is not making a distinction between wuxing as a cosmological theory and wuxing as a moral doctrine, evidence of which may be seen in the Wuxing pian (Five Modes of Proper Conduct), a text discovered in the tomb of “the tutor of the Eastern palace” at Guodian in China’s Hubei province in 1993, which dates to 300 B.C.E..  Despite Xunzi’s criticims, a wuxing system was growing and extending itself from cosmology to morality, aesthetics, medicine, and so forth.

4. Wuxing During the Han Dynasty and After

During the Han dynasty, one of the most fundamental texts containing material on wuxing theory was the Huainanzi (The Masters of Huainan, 139 B.C.E.).  This text says: “The natural qualities of Heaven and Earth do not exceed five.  The sage is able to use wuxing correctly in order to govern without waste.”  The Huainanzi shows the move to standardize the number five.  It continues to draw out the correlations between wuxing in cosmology and morality, and it extends the medical implications of the system.  Sages who know what to do with the wuxing are able to rule the country, heal patients, and manage the transformations of life and longevity.  It seems that this text conflates Daoist notions of immortals (xian) with those who possess the skill necessary to master the five elements.

Han thinkers used the system to account for an ordered sequence or cycle of change.  For example, in the “mutual production” (xiangsheng) series, wood produced fire, fire produced earth, earth produced metal, metal produced water, and water produced wood.  In the “mutual conquest” (xiangke) series, wood conquered earth, metal conquered wood, fire conquered metal, water conquered fire, and earth conquered water.  If a ruling dynasty’s emblem was water, one might anticipate it being overcome by a dynasty whose emblem was earth.  This schema was appropriated as the Han was thought to rule under the red phase of fire, and their most formidable revolutionary challengers employed this ideology in constructing their movement and its symbols, such as the rebel movement known as the Yellow Turbans (184 C.E.), which attempted to exploit the ideas that red would be conquered by yellow and fire by water.

Although most of its ideas are already evident in the Huainanzi,  the Chunqiu fanlu (Luxuriant Dew of the Spring and Autumn Annals) traditionally ascribed to Dong Zhongshu (179-104 B.C.E.), is a sustained effort to incorporate the wuxing system into Confucian thought, even connecting it to the Confucian five relationships of filiality.  This application was continued in the work of Yang Xiong (53 B.C.E.-18 C.E.), whose text Tai Xuan (The Supreme Mystery, c. 2 B.C.E.) represents an example of Confucian syncretism and appropriation of the wuxing cosmology.  In Baihu tongyi (Comprehensive Discussions in White Tiger Hall, c. 80 C.E.), the record of state-sponsored debates held in 58 C.E., the following explanation for the way a mature son should remain with his parents while a daughter should leave home is given:  “The son not leaving his parents models himself on what?  He models himself on fire that does not depart from wood.  The daughter leaving her parents models herself on what?  She models herself on water which by flowing departs from metal.”

Not all Confucian thinkers accepted the wuxing cosmology or its extended explanatory devices, however.  Wang Chong (27-100 C.E.) was a critic of the theory in its broadest forms, and of the application of it in the realms of natural and physical phenomena, morality, and political history.  In his Critical Essays (Lunheng), he used argument, sarcasm, and what we would call empirical evidence, to criticize the work of Dong Zhongshu and attempt to debunk the evidential basis for the wuxing system.

By the first century B.C.E., Huangdi Neijing (The Yellow Emperor’s Inner Classic), arguably the most significant of the classical Chinese documents on wuxing as related to medicine, attained its final form.  It most likely developed in a lineage of teachers associated with what is now called Huang-Lao (“Yellow Emperor-Laozi”) Daoism, which also influenced portions of the Zhuangzi.  The work has two parts.  The first is the Suwen (Basic Questions), devoted to the wuxing foundation of Chinese medicine and the diagnostic methods for ailments, and the second is the Lingshu (Spiritual Pivots), which is largely concerned with very technical and thorough explanations of acupuncture.  Lingshu 24 has the Yellow Emperor say that the qi energy meridians of the body (jing mai) are divided according to the wuxing and these lines convey energy to the five organs (wu zang) of the body.  The Suwen relies largely on the “mutual conquest” series as the preferred explanatory language for medical ailments and their remedies.  In thinking of the wuxing system related to the body, we must always remember that, in traditional Chinese thought, the body is a microcosm of the universe that recapitulates the patterns of the macrocosm (i.e. Heaven and Earth).  A disease considered energetic or fiery could be overcome by a medicine correlated with cooling associated with water.  Likewise, since wood xing suffuses throughout the spleen and also gives rise to sour flavor, then eating sour foods will increase the wood internally and strengthen the spleen.  Wood is also correlated with the color blue-green, the spring season, the direction east, and the musical note jue (Western mi), and can be increased or conquered based on these correlations.

Medical understandings of wuxing have been applied to non-philosophical arenas, such as astrology.  Chinese astrology relies heavily upon wuxing notions.  Each astrological or zodiac sign is ruled by one or more of the five elements and its yin or yang energies.  According to the lore of Chinese astrology, the signs and energies we are born under impact our entire lives and our personalities.  For example, being born under the wood sign means one is influenced by yang energy.  Such a person is said to be strong and self-reliant.  He is associated with the East, the astrological signs of the Tiger, Rabbit, and Dragon, and the spring season; his health is governed by the condition of his liver and gallbladder; and he both favors and prospers under the colors blue and green.  Similar explanations and prognostications are given for the other four of the five xing as well.

Both military and literary texts in traditional China have incorporated the wuxing system.  The Liu Tao (Six Strategies, also known as Tai Gong’s Six Strategies [for conducting war]), is a well-known tactical manual of ancient China.  It asserts that, by knowing the enemy’s posture with respect to wuxing, one can then, through the “mutual conquest” series, know how to select the attacking phase to defeat him.  Novels such as Xiyou ji (Journey to the West, 16th century C.E.) present main characters in five-phase terms, and the structure of Hong Lou Meng (Dream of the Red Chamber, 18th century C.E.) may be described in terms of wuxing, as Andrew Plaks has shown.

Beyond the world of Chinese texts, traditional Chinese visual arts have embraced wuxing, including the style of painting known by that very name.  This style is a synthesis of traditional landscape painting with wuxing cosmology.  Wuxing painting has a total of five brush strokes, five movements, and five types of composition, each corresponding to the five elements.  The goal of such painting is to create an image harmoniously balanced, often depicting a landscape, but even when not doing so, nevertheless playing on the connection between objects or directions and wuxing.

As wuxing thought has continued to become ever more labyrinthine, the five elements have been incorporated into many arenas of Chinese life, from the way space is arranged (fengshui) to the art of cooking (sweets, sours, bitters, etc).  Having become a distinct philosophical tradition (jia, “family” or “school”) during the Han, wuxing gradually developed into a conceptual device that is used to explain not only cosmology, morality, and medicine, but virtually every aspect of Chinese life and thought.  As such, wuxing has come to be inseparable from Chineseness itself and belongs to no single stream of classical Chinese philosophy.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Ames, Roger T. and David L. Hall, trans.  Focusing the Familiar: A Translation and Philosophical Interpretation of the Zhongyong. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 2001.
  • Bodde, Derk.  Chinese Thought, Society, and Science: The Intellectual and Social Background of Science and Technology in Pre-Modern China.  Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 1991.
  • Graham, A.C.  Yin-Yang and the Nature of Correlative Thinking.  IEAP Occasional Paper and Monograph Series, No. 6. Singapore: Institute of East Asian Philosophies, 1986.
  • Henderson, John.  “Wuxing (Wu-hsing): Five Phases” in Antonio S. Cua, ed. Encyclopedia of Chinese Philosophy. New York: Routledge, 2003, 786-88.
  • Major, John S., et. al., trans.  The Huainanzi: A Guide to the Theory and Practice of Government in Early Han China. New York: Columbia University Press, 2010.
  • Needham, Joseph.  Science and Civilisation in China. Vol. 2, History of Scientific Thought. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1956.
  • Plaks, Andrew H.  Archetype and Allegory in the Dream of the Red Chamber. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1976.
  • Porkert, Manfred.  The Theoretical Foundations of Chinese Medicine; Systems of Correspondence. East Asian Science Series, Vol. 3. Cambridge: MIT Press, 1974.
  • Rochat de la Vallee, Elisabeth.  Wuxing: The Five Elements in Classical Chinese Texts.  London: Monkey Press, 2009.


Author Information

Ronnie Littlejohn
Belmont University
U. S. A.

Feminism and Race in the United States

This article traces the history of U.S. mainstream feminist thought from an essentialist notion of womanhood based on the normative model of middle-class white women’s experiences, to a recognition that women are, in fact, quite diverse and see themselves differently. It begins with the question of the social construction of gender and the mainstream feminist assumption that ‘woman’ means middle class white woman. The challenge to this assumption is then posed by women of color, poor women, immigrants, lesbians and women in the ’third world.” Section Three presents the various forms of inclusion of black women within mainstream feminist frameworks. Following that is a discussion on the construction of whiteness, the privileges that race afford white women, and feminist strategies to overcome racism within mainstream feminism. Section Five reviews the struggles of Latina and Asian American women, the specific questions of identity they confront, and how these relate to mainstream feminism. Section Six discusses the challenges posed to U.S. mainstream feminism by third world feminists.

Feminists in the U.S. have worked arduously to address the question of difference among women, together with what unites women in common contexts of struggle.  The focus on difference, as well as identity, however, often overlooks the actual lives of many women of color who struggle not so much with how to disabuse themselves of a certain identity, but with how to establish one in the first place.  Concentrating on identity and difference, either by working to obliterate or represent it, also tends to the neglect of power relations that establish, hold apart, and bring together such differences in the first place.

This article further explores how sexism and racism are structural problems endemic to American culture. As such, they need to be addressed systematically, along with class and all other systems of domination. The structural aspect is evident in the ease by which biological racism morphs into cultural racism, spawning condescending and racist attitudes toward third world women, and a blindness of “first world” complicity in third world oppressions. As Audre Lorde has made clear, “the master’s tools will never dismantle the master’s house.” The conclusion explores how feminists unite to struggle against systems of domination and exploitation, and work to give up privileges bequeathed by these systems, admittedly an uncomfortable proposition for those benefiting from power, to dismantle the “master’s house” and the multitude of oppressions that it sustains.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Are All Women the Same?
  3. Mainstream Feminism and African American Women in the United States
  4. White Privilege and the Question of Racism in U.S. Mainstream Feminism
  5. Chicana/Latina and Asian American Women and U.S. Mainstream Feminism
  6. Third World Feminisms and Mainstream Feminism in the U.S.
  7. Conclusion: “There is No Hierarchy of Oppressions”
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

The question of difference has been central to U.S. feminism since the inception of a women’s movement in the United States.  When Sojourner Truth, a black woman, walked into the predominately white Women’s Convention in Akron, Ohio in 1851, three years after the first Women’s Rights Convention in Seneca Falls, New York, jaws dropped. Not a sound could be heard.  Truth was an imposing woman.  She stood almost 6 feet tall and bore the scars of brutal beatings, the sale of her children, and the loss of her own parents while she was sold off into slavery.  Surrounded by affluent, educated white women and their gentlemen supporters, her presence at first stirred fear, but eventually gave rise to awe. The white women at the conference didn’t want to muddy their struggle and demands for women’s rights with the uncomfortable subject of race and the rights of colored folk, despite their debt to Fredrick Douglass’ efforts to keep the controversial issue of women’s suffrage central at the first Convention in Seneca Falls. Yet, when Truth rose to enter into the conversation, her words, collected under the title “Ain’t I a Woman,” not only drew strong admiration, but presaged what would come to be the fundamental question of Western feminism: What exactly is a woman?

In the speech titled “Ain’t I a Woman,” Truth reveals the contradictions inherent to the use and meaning of the term woman, and exposes the political, economic, and cultural assumptions underlying its use.  Taking the platform at the Convention in Ohio, she spoke out against the declarations of several men. They believed that women were to refrain from strenuous work, both physical and mental, so to better fulfill their "womanly nature." But Truth knew nothing of this so-called nature that they espoused and engendered. What she knew was toil and work as arduous as any man could endure.

That man over there says that women need to be helped into carriages, and lifted over ditches, and to have the best place everywhere. Nobody ever helps me into carriages, or over mud-puddles, or gives me any best place! And ain't I a woman?  Look at me! Look at my arm! I have plowed, and planted, and have gathered into barns, and no man could head me! And ain't I a woman? I could work as much, and eat as much as man - when I could get it - and bear the lash as well! And ain't I a woman? I have borne thirteen children and seen most all sold off to slavery, and when I cried out with a mother's grief, none but Jesus heard me! And ain't I a woman?   (Truth, 2009).

Almost one hundred years later, Truth's questioning can be heard in Simone de Beauvoir’s challenge to claims that the meaning of womanhood is self-evident.  In her groundbreaking and canonical work The Second Sex (1949, 1st English trans., 1953), Beauvoir set the course for the subsequent study of the “woman question” in the West by putting the issue of gender into focus. Responding to male discontentment that French women were losing their femininity and were not as "womanly" as they believed Russian women to be, Beauvoir wondered if one is born a woman or whether, in fact, one must become a woman through various socialization and indoctrination processes. This critical perspective led her to challenge the usefulness of the category of woman altogether and to ask whether it was, in fact, helpful as a term representing all the experiences of the so-called members of the "second sex."  Perhaps nothing better illustrates Beauvoir’s concerns regarding the legitimacy and effectiveness of the category of "woman" than the development of white, U.S. mainstream feminist thought in relation to challenges posed by women of color, the poor, lesbians, immigrants, and women from "third world" nations.   In making their voices heard, these marginalized women expanded feminist thinking by showing that ideologies of womanhood had just as much to do with race, class, and sexuality, as they had to do with sex.

2. Are All Women the Same?

Feminists in the U.S. have set out to identify, expose, and subvert the longstanding gender stereotypes that have been used to dominate and subordinate women.  Central to any theory of feminism, then, is how terms like “woman,” “female,” and “feminine” are construed or misconstrued.  The pioneer women in the U.S. suffragist movement spoke of and fought for women’s rights, using the term woman to signify all women.  What they failed to recognize was that their notion of womanhood was modeled on the experiences and problems of a small percentage of females who, like them, were almost exclusively white, middle-class, and relatively well-educated.  However, the assumption that middle-class white women’s experiences represented all women’s experiences was not only made by the early Suffragists, but continued to shape the ideal of womanhood well into the second wave of the American feminist movement and beyond.

In The Problem That Has No Name, a book that helped usher in the second wave of feminism in the U.S., Betty Friedan exposed the hidden frustrations of women who had bought into the “mystique of feminine fulfillment” (2001:24). Trading in their career ambitions for the promised bliss of marriage, motherhood, and domesticity, many women instead found themselves trapped and isolated behind white picket fences in what Friedan described as the “housewife’s syndrome.”  But, what Friedan also failed to recognize was that this syndrome affected only a certain minority of women— namely, those who were white, middle-class, and often highly educated, like herself.   She did not realize that the binary and complimentary gender divisions she assumed, woman as breadmaker and man as breadwinner, were built upon a racialized patriarchy that excluded women of color, the poor, and immigrants from this “mystique of femininity.”   It was these women who would be called upon to leave their children and homes to care for the children and homes of the white women who had successfully “liberated” themselves from domesticity to voluntarily enter into the work force.

Discounting the lives of women of color by assuming that the experiences of white women were representative of the lives of all women, Friedan imagines a unity among women’s experiences that simply does not exist.  According to bell hooks, this ideal of gender solidarity is built upon an assumption of sameness that is supported by the idea that there exists a common oppression of patriarchy around which women must rally.  “The idea of ‘common oppression’ was a false and corrupt platform disguising and mystifying the true nature of women’s varied and complex social reality” (1984:44). This complexity is especially disclosed in the lives of women of color who must contend with multiple and overlapping forms of oppressions--including oppression by white women, who fail to acknowledge the different struggles confronting women who are not like them.

Mainstream feminist thought continues to grapple with the interrelations between gender and race, as well as class, colonialism, imperialism, and issues of sexual orientation in what might arguably be called a third wave of feminism in the U.S..  More importantly, the critiques of women who have suffered the most from sexist societies -- women of color, the poor, third world women -- are now at the forefront of a contemporary, progressive feminist politics.  Thus, to understand the current contours of mainstream feminist thought in the U.S. and the question of race, one must look at how feminist theory and practice have addressed differences among women, and the specific ways that differences within women’s lives have shaped their relationships to mainstream U.S. feminism.

3. Mainstream Feminism and African American Women in the United States

Feminist theorists have addressed the relationship of race and feminism in at least two different ways. One approach is to view race as integral to gender and explore the ways in which gender identity is constructed in relation to race, and how racial identity is equally constructed in relation to gender.  The other follows a method whereby the voices of women of color are added to the conventional curriculum in a sort of separate but equal manner. This latter approach has been called the “additive” approach. Because it simply adds the voices of those historically excluded from the mainstream feminist canon, but does not examine the constitution of these voices within the contexts of power that have given rise to them, it carries the risk of essentializing gender and race, or assuming these categories to be fixed and timeless.

With respect to the former, Jacquelyn Dowd Hal highlights the interconnections of race and gender in her discussion of lynching. Hal shows that lynching was not only used to enforce labor contracts, maintain racial etiquette and the socio-economic status quo, but was also effective in re-inscribing gender roles among whites. White men cast themselves as protectors of white women, sheltering them from the presumed threat of black male sexual prowess, while simultaneously securing white women’s adherence to ideals of chastity and femininity (Brooks-Higginbootham, 1989: 132).  These ideals were further re-inscribed by white women in their perceptions and accusations regarding black male sexuality.  Ida B. Wells had made the same observation, arguing that white men maintained their ownership over white women’s bodies by using them as the terrain for lynching black males (Carby, 1986: 309). It comes as little surprise, then, that by joining anti-lynching campaigns white women were not only defending black males, but simultaneously reacting against Southern chivalry and their roles as fragile sex objects (Brooks-Higginbootham, 1989: 133).

The more popular approach to the question of race and feminism, however, seems to have been the "additive" approach.  In “Toward a Black Feminist Criticism” (1977), Barbara Smith embarks on a journey that she states no man or woman has gone on before: documenting black women’s experience and culture while providing black women with a resource for reading about their lives. “It is galling that ostensible feminists and acknowledged lesbians have been so blinded to the implications of any womanhood that is not white womanhood and that they have yet to struggle with the deep racism in themselves that is at the source of this blindness” (Carby, 1992: 158).  Smith believes that it is necessary both to retrieve the writings of black women and to place them before black feminist literary critics who are able to interpret these writers experiences.  She argues that black women writers share a singular tradition of styles, themes and aesthetics that are rooted in a shared culture of oppression.  Furthermore, she believes that these themes are expressed in a uniquely black woman’s language that is accessible only to black feminist literary critics who simply need turn inwards, or towards their own lived experiences, in order to decipher the messages told by black women writers (Carby, 1992:164). With her novel idea of an “identity politics,” Smith went on to form the black lesbian feminist Combahee River Collective in Boston.

“The Combahee River Collective Statement” (1986), along with This Bridge Called My Back, Writings by Radical Women of Color, published two years earlier, gave voice to women of color and served as the primary texts from which white women and women of color would draw in discussions of race and gender.  In the Combahee Statement, the Collective explained their need to organize and come together as black women into a movement for black women. “We realize that the only people who care enough about us to work consistently for our liberation is us.  Our politics evolve from a healthy love for ourselves, our sisters, and our community, which allows us to continue our struggle and our work” (1995: 21-22). Black-only movements worked to raise the self-esteem of black women and address specific problems confronting all black people. Angela Davis also describes how, despite the sexist and heterosexist elements of the Black Nationalist Movement, it gave her a framework within which to understand herself as beautiful and valuable. In addition, Black Nationalism also served to counter racist images of African-Americans by providing positive images of Africa.  “I was able to construct a psychological space within which I could ‘feel good about myself.’ I could celebrate my body (especially my nappy hair, which I always attacked with a hot comb in ritualistic seclusion), my musical proclivities and my suppressed speech patterns, among other things…This distanced me from the white people around me while simultaneously rendering controllable the distance I had always felt from them” (1992:319).

Patricia Hill Collins invokes the notion of a shared black women’s language and highlights a common tradition that reaches back to the idea of an "African consciousness." However, she cautions against carving out a uniquely black female voice, or category of experience, for fear of sliding into an essentialist perspective which may, ultimately, be counterproductive. She recognizes that identifying a black feminist thought problematically assumes that "being Black and/or female generates certain experiences that automatically determine the variants of a Black and/or feminist consciousness” (1991:21). Still, Collins maintains that black women have certain perspectives that arise out of a shared experience, along with a different relation to knowledge production that give rise to a uniquely “black feminist standpoint” (1991:21-22).

Collins draws on the mainstream feminist strategy of “standpoint theory” that Nancy Hartsock helped develop out of Karl Marx’s insight that the material conditions of existence structure one's lived experiences,. A standpoint theory argues that the place from which one stands influences the perspective or view that one has of the world; and, further, that those who are most oppressed are able to provide a broader and clearer perspective on the whole of society and societal relations (Hartsock, 1999).  Collins believes that any black feminist standpoint must take into account white domination, the concomitant struggle for self-definition, and the Afrocentric worldview that helps blacks cope with racial domination. This Afrocentricism, Collins claims, existed prior to,and is independent of, racial oppression. Moreover, it has given rise to traditions of storytelling and narrative that value concrete, lived experience, as well as black women’s community and sisterhood (1991:206, 212). Collins’ version of standpoint feminism, therefore, focuses on concrete lived experiences that have their roots in African oral traditions, black families, churches, and other black organizations.

But even the idea of this mitigated account of an essential black female identity does not sit well with many black women. For example, Hazel Carby sees the idea of black feminist criticism, as well as any notion of a specifically black feminist consciousness, as a problem and not a solution. She traces this problem to the processes whereby one finds academic legitimation by aiming to fit into certain allotted slots that are open for discussions of racial and gender identity within mainstream curricula.  Carby advocates the need to examine racism and sexism not as trans-historical and essentialist categories, but as historical practices which are enmeshed with evolving sets of social, political, and economic practices that function to maintain power in a given context and society (1989:18).  Any emphasis on the elaboration of standpoint theory, Carby claims, sanctions the segregation and ghettoization of race and gender, while simultaneously positing white women as a normative standard (1992:193 ).

Moreover, Carby believes that this supplemental approach, which consists simply in adding the experiences and writings of women of color to the established mainstream feminist canon, will not solve the problems of “exclusion” from mainstream feminism, but will instead further reify differences.  Joan Scott echoes these remarks and cautions women against relying on an uncritical deployment of experience to tell their stories.  By assuming experience to be self-evident and transparent, one naturalizes difference and leaves unexamined the constitutive mechanisms according to which people’s experiences have been historically constructed by relational webs of power and multiple oppressions (1991: 25-26).   These mechanisms are structural and institutional. They are therefore more difficult to identify and eradicate. To adequately address the root causes of racism in the feminist movement, women must therefore acknowledge that any attempt to universalize their experiences colludes, not only with ideologies of white womanhood, but also with the dominant and privileged white male norms.  The prominence given to white women’s experience, Carby points out, is no accident. “White women are made visible because they are the women that white men see” (1986: 302). Taking into account the historical and political contexts that define gender reveals the racial constructions that structure both the lives of whites and people of color.

Many black women, especially those excluded from the earlier Suffragist movement, went even further and drew an explicit link between imperialism, racism, and patriarchy. This link was cemented at the 1893 World’s Columbian Exposition in Chicago, where a group of black women who had thought they were there to represent the lives of American women, were instead made part of exhibits featuring “exotic” peoples, which further fed into racist stereotypes and fears (Carby, 1986).  Subsequently, these women came to recognize the need to form their own national organizations.  In 1896, a number of black women’s groups merged into the National Association of Colored Women (NACW), headed by Josephine Ruffin and Mary Church Terrell. Its members included Harriet Tubman, Frances E.W. Harper, and Ida Bell Wells-Barnett. Harper and Anna J Cooper, the fourth African American woman to earn a Doctorate in the U.S., saw an inseparable link between imperialism, domestic racial oppression, and unrestrained patriarchal power. Cooper writes in A Voice from the South: By A Woman from the South (1892):

“Whence came this apotheosis of greed and cruelty? Whence this sneaking admiration we all have for bullies and prizefighters?  Whence the self-congratulation of ‘dominant’ races, as if ‘dominant’ meant ‘righteous’ and carried with it a title to inherit the earth? Whence the scorn of so-called weak or unwarlike races and individuals, and the very comfortable assurance that it is their manifest destiny to be wiped out as vermin before the advancing civilization?” (Carby, 1986:305).

Cooper’s observations came 40 years after Arthur de Gobineau declared in The Inequality of Races, that, indeed, Africans were “incapable of civilization” because they did not have the drive or ambition to conquer their neighbors, but rather lived “side by side in complete independence of each other” (Bernasconi, 2000:47). It was this conquering drive that Gobineau argued marked European civilization as advanced in contrast to the backwardness of Africans, who practiced living in harmonious co-existence with their neighbors.

In recognition of the advantages that race has conferred upon white women, many feminists have embarked upon analyses of race and gender that moves towards an acknowledgment of white privilege and racial injustice. Feminists have also worked to develop strategies for addressing white racism and identifying power differentials between women, between men, and among white women and men of color.

4. White Privilege and the Question of Racism in U.S. Mainstream Feminism

In 1988, inspired by the model of how men gain advantage from women’s disadvantage, Peggy McIntosh began to document some of the ways in which white women have benefited from racism.  Having observed how men were taught not to recognize their male privilege, McIntosh explored some of the unconscious avenues that allow white women not to recognize their “unearned skin privilege” (2008:63). “[W]hites are taught to think of their lives as morally neutral, normative, and average, and also ideal, so that when we work to benefit others, this work is seen as work that will allow ‘them’ to be more like ‘us’” (2008:63). Positioning whites as the norm is seen by Anna Stubblefield as pivotal to securing the superiority of whites. “The ideology of white supremacy is that whiteness sets the standard—whiteness is normative—such that anything that is symbolic of or associated with blackness is therefore deviant”  (2005:74).

McIntosh describes how she was taught to view racism as prejudice or bigotry, and to subscribe discriminatory acts of cruelty to isolated individuals, rather than to acknowledge “invisible systems conferring racial domination on my group from birth” (2008:68). She lists the unearned advantages that come from being a member of the dominant group, such as the comfort that comes from being in situations that reflect the worldview, values, and ideals of whites. White privilege ranges from the confidence white parents have that their children will receive educational materials highlighting the accomplishments and contributions of their race, to not attributing acts of injustice to racial prejudices, and not having to stand as a representative for one’s particular racial group. Marilyn Frye further discusses the privilege that whites have to define or determine how others will see them. More specifically, she contrasts the images and ideals that whites have of themselves with the ways in which they are viewed by men and women of color to underscore the disparity in perceptions (2001:85).  Because whites are taught that they are moral, honest, and fair, they believe that they alone are capable of and responsible for teaching others about what is right and wrong. This confidence is built upon a body of established Western principles, codes, and rules that presume to guarantee the correctness of their moral judgments. However, these self-descriptions of the dominant racial group are not shared by the majority of people of color who view many whites as behaving arbitrarily, or in a self-serving, violent, and often oppressive ways.

In “The Whiteness Question” (2005), Linda Alcoff argues that the key to overcoming racism lies in a confrontation with the “psychic processes of identity formation[.]”  Tracing the origins of whiteness to domination and exploitation, Alcoff asserts that “whiteness” is inseparable from the subjection, denigration, objectification, and repudiation of those who are perceived as non-white. “The very genealogy of whiteness was entwined from the beginning with a racial hierarchy, which can be found in every major cultural narrative from Christopher Columbus to Manifest Destiny to the Space Race and the Computer Revolution”  (2005). Before the concept of race originated in the 16th century, various populations of people identified and structured their communities in varieties of ways that did not include reference to skin color.  The origins of the category of race are, indeed, the origins of European expansion and oppression against Africans, Asians, indigenous peoples in the Americas and Australia, and even Muslims.  According to G.W.F. Hegel, it is only Europeans, or, more precisely, Christians who are able to attain the highest level of reason and spirituality by distancing themselves from the “absolute” through rationality.   Africans are not able to actualize these higher mental and spiritual faculties because they fetishize the absolute by objectifying it in relics that they then toss away when their fetish fails to come to their aid.  Muslims too, while successful at raising God above the level of the sensuous, are nevertheless unable to bring God back down to earth and unite the universal with the concrete, and therefore are unable to attain self-conscious reason (Bernasconi, 2000).

Alcoff, therefore, concludes that white collective self-esteem and identity are rooted in forms of white supremacy. Thus, to break free from racist ideology may not be such an easy task for whites, as it threatens the very foundations of their pride and self-love. This threat arises from the acknowledgement that historical achievements, and the legacy of cultural resources from which a white identity is drawn, are steeped in practices of racial oppression and domination. Consequently, relinquishing racism means not only giving up the actual privileges and benefits that are associated with being white, but may involve shunning one's ties to a cultural history upon which white personal esteem and sense of self are grounded.  Feelings of hysteria, shame, and anxiety often accompany this break.  Yet, belonging to a history is crucial to one’s esteem and identity. Alcoff, therefore, suggests a form of “white double consciousness” that moves from a recognition of practices of domination, exploitation, and discrimination to “a newly awakened memory of the many white traitors to white privilege who have struggled to contribute to the building of an inclusive human community. The Michelangelos stand beside the Christopher Columbuses, and Michael Moores next to the Pat Buchanans” (2005).

The interrelationship between white identity and white supremacy has lead some anti-racist whites, most notably Noel Ignatiev, to go further and to call for the overall abolition of the white race: “Treason to whiteness is loyalty to humanity” (1997). Marilyn Frye similarly advocates a disassociation from “whiteness” by calling for whites to opt out of the club she calls “whiteliness” (2001: 85). The very conditions for disclaiming whiteness, a disclaiming of identity that some women of color point out is possible only for whites, rests in the understanding that race is something socially constructed.  Frye explains that being white “is like being a member of a political party, or a club, or a fraternity—or being a Methodist or a Mormon” (2001:85).

The possibility of relinquishing "whiteliness," therefore, involves a recognition of its contingency, and depends upon the repudiation of practices that arise from enacting, embodying and animating whiteness. Transforming consciousness is one step toward eliminating whiteliness.  However, Frye and McIntosh are clearly aware that reflection and reorientation address only a fraction of the problems associated with race, since most of these are stubbornly structural and institutional. Still, Linda Gordon fears that a failure to begin addressing these difficult problems merely contributes towards legitimating more of the same—whites talking only about themselves (1991).

Sarita Srivastava is similarly unhappy with the direction that discussions of race have taken insofar as they tend toward white self-examination and constructions of whiteness. When analysis of race and racism occurs in feminist organizations, the emphasis, she finds, often falls on white guilt rather than organizational change. This results in self-centered strategies by whites to correct their moral self-image, an image that sustains inequalities, and, Srivastava argues, is rooted in the very foundations of feminism, imperialism, and nationalism that are the target of change.(2005: 36). Rather than work directly to alter the order of racial oppression, white women instead strive to empathize with the victims. Empathy serves to underscore white women’s “goodness,” and transforms the essentially socio-political nature of the problem to a more personal one. This practice further reinforces decades of racist and colonialist practices by validating white women’s moral authority and their belief that they have somehow been entrusted with the responsibility to educate and liberate those less civilized (2005: 44). Thus, Srivastava argues that white women fail to genuinely confront their own racism by focusing on their guilt and, in doing so, maintain power inequities.  She quotes a woman of color’s frustration over white women’s refusal to look at their racism during political discussions on the topic of race.  “The indignant response, anger, the rage that turns to tears, the foot stomping, temper tantrum, which are very typical responses [to being called racist]. Every single organization that I have been in, every single one. So I realized that it wasn’t about me…after awhile [laughter]” (2005: 42-43).

Alcoff further shows how white feminists distance themselves from a serious critique of racism by focusing on behavior modification, rather than challenging oppressive institutional structures and calling for wealth redistribution.  In her analysis of Judith Katz’s White Awareness: Handbook for Anti-Racism Training (Katz 1978), Alcoff describes Katz’s depiction of how she came to terms with the depth of her own racism as a painful, demoralizing process that threatened her self-trust.  While Katz warns against wallowing in white guilt, she nonetheless links anti-racism to psychological liberation while, at the same time, distancing herself from the workings and mechanisms of racist practices that are endemic to the culture. The focus on difference and overcoming of difference, either by obliterating or representing it, tends to neglect the power relations that establish, hold apart, and bring together such differences in the first place. Concentrating on identity and difference also overlooks the actual lives of many women of color who struggle, not so much with how to disabuse themselves of a certain identity, but, to the contrary, with how to establish an identity in the first place.

5. Chicana/Latina and Asian American Women and U.S. Mainstream Feminism

Struggling to negotiate and come to terms with an identity, many women of color are not as eager as white women to give up their racial or ethnic distinctiveness. “To be oppressed,” Norma Alarcon explains, “means to be disenabled not only from grasping an ‘identity’, but also from reclaiming it” (1995:364).  Moreover, specific histories of oppressions have positioned women differently with regard to gender roles and the family.  Cherrie Moraga describes how Latina women’s relationships to ideals of gender and motherhood have been uniquely shaped by colonization. Accompanying European expansion and colonization, was the concomitant threat of genocide. The fear of extinction strengthened the commitment to traditional family ideals and roles, such as encouraging women to be pregnant and assuming males at the head of the household.  “At all costs, la familia must be preserved…We believe the more severely we protect the sex roles with the family, the stronger we will be as a unity in opposition to the anglo threat” (1995:181). Consequently, Moraga explains, Latina feminists’ relation to gender roles and the structure of the family confront a very particular kind of resistance.  While mainstream feminists are challenging traditional sex roles of men and women, some Latina feminists, due to their certain histories of colonization, seek to preserve these roles.  Thus, Latina women’s concerns are often foreign to, and often in direct opposition to, mainstream white feminists who seek to abolish or overcome conventional forms of gender identity, especially within the family.

U.S. immigration policies and discriminatory practices against Asian Americans have also sometimes lead to the embracing of gender ideals among Asian American women that are in opposition to the ideals of many white feminists in the U.S..  Ester Ngan-Ling Chow shows how racism, colonialism, and imperialism have worked to position Asian American women differently toward Asian American men, feminism, and Westernization.  Addressing the apparent lack of feminist consciousness and activism in Asian American women, she attributes this deficit to ethnic pride and solidarity with Asian American men to end racial discrimination against Asians in the U.S..  Asian American men, for example, often view Asian American women’s engagement with mainstream U.S. feminism as a threat to the Asian American community.  Chow also points to specific Asiatic values of obedience, filial duty, loyalty, fatalism, and self-control that encourage forms of submissiveness among Asian American women that are incompatible with American values of individualism and self-assertiveness.  The force of traditional Asian values contributes to the particularity of Asian American women’s struggles, and work to distance their struggle from the concerns of the mainstream, white feminist movement. These differences, among others, are why Chow states: “The development of feminist consciousness for Asian American women cannot be judged or understood through the experience of White women” (1991:266).

Yen Le Espiritu further discusses the complexities surrounding the intersections of race, class, and gender confronting Asian American women.  Regrettably, some Asian American women find themselves victims of the discrimination faced by Asian American men.  Among other things, Espiritu writes, racial ideology defines Asian American men as feminine and weak—a rendering that incidentally works to confirm the notion that manhood is white.  Frustrated also by the higher value placed on Asian American women’s employability, some Asian American men try to assert their power by physically abusing the women and children in their lives.  Breathing humor into these problems of physical abuse, Espiritu draws upon a joke that gets a laugh from both men and women. “When we get on the plane to go back to Laos, the first thing we will do is beat up the women!’” (Espiritu, 1997: 136). Despite the discriminations Asian American women endure within their community, they too often find it difficult to juggle between the desire to expose male privilege, and the desire to unite with men in their shared struggle against prejudice and discrimination.

Gloria Anzaldua describes the particular ways that a feminist consciousness is developed by Latina women who many times find themselves struggling to arrive at a positive image of themselves.  She explains how an internalization of racism and colonialist mentality has given rise to shame, self-hatred, and abuse of other Latina women in various communities. Self-hatred and the hatred one has towards others like oneself are further ignited by jostling for the limited positions of superiority that are open to women of color.  Here is where ethnic and cultural identity begin to be conflated with race and purported biological distinctions.  In the early phases of colonialism, European colonizers flexed their powers overtly in order to destroy the fabric, legal codes, cultural systems, mannerisms, language and habits of the colonized under the guise of civilizing the “savage natives.”  Slowly, local inhabitants internalized Western values, attitudes, and ways of life, including racialized thinking that resulted in a desire for some Latin Americans to become more white and reject their indigenous cultures.  “Like them we try to impose our version of ‘the ways things should be’, we try to impose one’s self on the Other by making her the recipient of one’s negative elements, usually the same elements that the Anglo projected on us” (1995: 143).

More graphically, Anzaldua alludes to how the “forced cultural penetration” of rape has, so to speak, inseminated white values into the bodies of women of color (1995:143). A Latina woman with lighter skin who does not speak the language of her ancestors is often held suspect by other Latina women and cast out of the community.  Anzaldua attributes this exclusionary practice to an “internalized whiteness that desperately wants boundary lines (this part of me is Mexican, this Indian)[.]” (1995: 143). In opposition to the Enlightenment fantasy of a uniform and self-contained subject, Anzaldua introduces the concept of “mestiza consciousness,” a consciousness of the Borderlands that captures the multiplicity and plurality of Latina consciousness. “From this racial, ideological, cultural and biological cross-pollinization, an ‘alien’ consciousness is presently in the making—a new mestiza consciousness, una conciencia de mujer” (2008: 870). Writing primarily in English but peppering her discussion of mestiza consciousness with phrases in Spanish, Anzaldua puts the non-Spanish reader in an uncomfortable position, paralleling the discomfort felt by many immigrants who are confronted with a language they don’t understand.  In this way, Anzaldua describes and invokes an appreciation of the inner conflict that those straddling two or more cultures, languages, and value systems experience.  She provides a provocative illustration of warring cultures that produce in their subjects a “psychic restlessness” (2008).

The notion of a splintered personality brought on by a collision of cultures is also addressed by Alcoff, who proposes a positive reconstruction of mixed race identities whereby one finds comfort in ambiguity and a contentment with living the “gap” (2000:160). “I never reach shore: I never wholly occupy either the Angla or the Latina identity.  Paradoxically, in white society I feel my Latinness, in Latin society I feel my whiteness, as that which is left out, an invisible present, sometimes as intrusive as an elephant in the room and sometimes more as a pulled thread that alters the design of my fabricated self” (2000:160).

Maria Lugones gives a phenomenological description of what it is like to shift between identities as a person of mixed race or a hyphenated identity.  When voluntarily embraced, she calls this practice of shifting identities “world traveling.”  “Those of us who are ‘world’- travelers have the distinct experience of being different in different ‘worlds’ and ourselves in them” (1995: 396). Lugones’ concept of world traveling arose out of her awareness of the different levels of comfort she experiences in embodying different identities in distinct worlds. In some worlds, Lugones observes she is more playful and not overly concerned with how others view her. However, while inhabiting a world in which her identity is constructed negatively, or strictly on the basis of her ethnicity, she finds she is less playful and may even begin to animate self-defeating stereotypes.

Shifting in and out of various worlds, Lugones advocates a strategy whereby women attempt to empathize with each other by trying to stand in one another’s shoes. Laurence Thomas, to the contrary, warns against such a strategy that asks people who are so differently positioned within society to try to identify with each other’s experiences. Instead, he introduces the model of “moral deference”: “the act of listening that is preliminary to bearing witness to another’s moral pain, but without bearing witness to it” (1986: 377). In this stance, the one suffering has the platform and the one listening, who does not inhabit the same socially constituted identity, cedes the platform by recognizing the incommensurability of his or her experience of the other’s pains and struggles. It is this respect – rooted in an acknowledgment of the irreducibility of lived experience—that is at the heart of Third World Women’s appeal to Western Feminists.

6. Third World Feminisms and Mainstream Feminism in the U.S.

Significantly, the concerns raised by women of color in the U.S. are almost identically replayed by third world women, in what might be called a shift from biological to cultural racism.  However, instead of fighting against a cultural norm of white womanhood, third world feminists are fighting to assert their difference in opposition to a monolithic and dominant notion of Western feminism that is increasingly gaining legitimacy by controlling how women in the third world are represented.

Chandra Talpade Mohanty raises awareness of the impact of Western Scholarship on third world women “in a context of a world system dominated by the West[.]” (1991:53).  She encourages Western feminist scholarship to situate itself within the current Western hegemony over the production, publication, distribution, and consumption of information, and to examine its role within this context (1991:55).   In her analysis of the representations of third world women in nine texts in the Zed Press “Women in the Third World” series, Mohanty finds that in almost all these texts women are monolithically represented as victims of an unchanging patriarchy. These representations uproot women from their lived situations and the practices that shape, and are shaped by them. “The crucial point that is forgotten is that women are produced through these very relations as well as being implicated in forming these relations” (1991:59).

When women’s lives and struggles are not historically and locally situated, they are robbed of their political agency.  Those, then, writing about third world women “become the true ‘subjects’ of this counterhistory” (1991:71).  Western scholarship must, therefore, recognize the ethnocentric universalism it assumes in encoding and representing all third world women as victims of an ahistorical and decontextualized notion of patriarchy that results in a homogenous notion of the oppressed third world women. Only when feminist thinkers examine their role within Western dominations can genuine progress be made.

Uma Narayan highlights the facticity of women’s historical situations in her exposition of the particularities that women in the third world confront in participating in a feminist movement.  Because of the histories of colonialism and imperialism, suspicions against feminist movements as possible instruments of colonial domination surround attempts made by women to organize for change. Specifically, Narayan explores how the term Westernization is used to silence critiques by third world feminists regarding the status and treatment of women in their communities.  Ironically, it is Western educated and assimilated men in the third world that are spearheading these attacks against third world feminists by accusing them of disrespecting their culture and embracing Western values and customs. Narayan rejects the implication that feminism is foreign to the third world, noting that historical and political circumstances that raise awareness of women’s oppression give rise to a feminist consciousness that is organic to third world women’s lives.

Minoo Moallem locates a “feminist imperialism” in Western women’s desire to  enlighten third world women to the civilizing project of the West, wherein first world women become the norm and third world women get constructed as a singular, non-Western other (2006).   Elora Shehabuddin identifies a feminist imperialism in Western women’s attempt to position themselves as the saviors of Muslim women, thereby ignoring women’s voices fighting to make change within the Muslim world  “In presenting change in the Muslim world as possible only with the intervention from the United States—either by force through the violent eradication of oppressive Muslim men or the less dramatic support of ‘moderate’ Muslim groups and individuals—these writers foreclose the possibility of change from within Muslim societies” (2011: 121).

Ignoring the racism inherent in colonialist narratives documenting the oppression of Muslim women by Muslim men, Shehabuddin points out, Western feminists are content to draw on stories of abuse by a few vocal “Muslim escapees” as representative of the victimization of all Muslim women.  What seems to be the primary concern of these Western feminists is not the actual lives of women in the Muslim world, but the assertion of their own moral authority, exercised in presumably righting the sexism in the Islamic world.   In this way, Western feminists repeat and redirect their racism and condescension toward Muslim women and third world women in general, while conveniently avoiding the sexism and oppression in their own backyards.  The remedy to cultural racism is an acknowledgement of it and a commitment to displace Eurocentricism by actually listening to women’s experiences, and engaging women in the hopes of opening up a dialogue.  Shehabuddin writes: “In the end, the only way to find out ‘what Muslim women want’ is to listen to them, not by assuming their needs and concerns are self-evident because they identify as Muslims and not by taking a small group of vocal, articulate individuals—whose opinions on issues like Israel and the war on terror are more acceptable—as the representative and authentic voices” (2011: 132).

7. Conclusion: “There is No Hierarchy of Oppressions”

The history of U.S. feminist thought has evolved from an essentialist notion of womanhood based on the normative model of middle-class white women’s experiences to a recognition that women are, in fact, quite diverse and see themselves differently. “The real problem of feminism,” states Elizabeth Spellman, “is how it has confused the condition of one group of women with the condition of all women” (1988:15 ). In assuming that the experiences of middle-class white women represented the lives of all women, a false unity and solidarity among women was presupposed. Taking account of the multiple and overlapping forms of oppression that many women, especially women of color and third world women must negotiate, reveals the complexity and diversity of women’s lives.  Women of color in the U.S., for example, not only define themselves in a struggle against white men and men of color, but also in resistance to white women.  The same holds for third world women who find themselves fighting against the omission of their experiences and the overarching assumptions made by “first world” feminists regarding their needs and the forms of subordination they confront.  Moving away from a monolithic notion of woman, U.S. feminist theory and practice engages difference by focusing on context-specific positionings of women in relation to other constantly changing categories. But some women worry that without a commonality uniting women the power to make changes will be lost.

To address the complexity of the multitude of oppressions confronting women, Mohanty suggests a model based on “imagined communities of women” organized by “the way we think about race, class, and gender—the political links we choose to make among and between struggles” (1991:4). In these communities, political alliances are formed not by a person’s race or sex, but on the basis of “common contexts of struggle against specific exploitative structures[.]” (1991:7) Today, U.S. mainstream feminism is engaged with recognizing diversity and forming cross-cultural coalitions against injustices. The recognition of difference, however, is not complete without a further commitment to making institutional change.

Like sexism, racism is a problem that is structural and endemic to American culture and needs to be addressed systematically, along with class and all other systems of domination.  As Robert Bernasconi notes, “Personal attitudes are not the main source of the problem and they cannot provide the solution” (2005: 20).  The structural aspect is evident in the ease by which biological racism morphs into cultural racism, spawning condescending and racist attitudes toward third world women and a blindness of first world complicity in various forms of third world oppressions.  Indeed, as Audre Lorde has made clear, “the master’s tools will never dismantle the master’s house.”   However, by waging struggles against systems of domination and exploitation and assuming responsibility to actively give up the privileges bequeathed by these systems, admittedly an uncomfortable proposition, U.S. feminists embark upon dismantling the master’s house and the multitude of oppressions that it sustains.

Still, a change in personal attitudes does go a long way. When mainstream feminists recognize the interconnections between gender, race, nationalism and class, Espiritu writes, “then they can better work with, and not for, women (and men) of color” (Espiritu, 1997: 140).  In sum, feminists in the U.S. have worked arduously to address the question of difference among women, as well as what unites women in common contexts of struggle.   In the early twentieth century, Emma Goldman wrote of the significance of recognizing and respecting differences, while at the same time working together in spite of these differences to challenge institutional inequalities that prevent individuals from living together in a free society.  Goldman laid out a vision for a way forward that goes beyond the mere tolerance of difference when she said: “The problem that confronts us today and which the nearest future is to solve, is how to be one’s self and yet in oneness with the others, to feel deeply with all human beings and still retain one’s own characteristic qualities” (1973: 509).

8. References and Further Reading

  • Alarcon, N.,  “The Theoretical Subject(s) of This Bridge Called My Back and Anglo-American Feminism” in Making Face, Making Soul/Haciendo Caras: Creative and Critical Perspectives by Feminists of Color, (ed.) Anzaldua, G., Aunt Lute Books, 1995.
  • Alcoff, L., “Chapter 9: The Whiteness Question”  Linda Martin-Alcoff, 2005.
  • Alcoff, L., The Idea of Race, (eds.) Bernasconi, R. and Lott,T., Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 2000.
  • Anzaldua, G., “La Conciencia de la Mestiza/Towards a New Consciousness,” in The Feminist Philosophy Reader, (eds.) Bailey, A. and Cuomo, C., New York: McGraw Hill, 2008.
  • Anzaldua, G., “En Rapport, In Opposition: Cobrando cuentas a las neustras,” in Making Face, Making Soul/Haciendo Caras: Creative and Critical Perspectives by Feminists of Color, (ed.) Anzaldua, G., Aunt Lute Books, 1995.
  • Bernasconi, R. “Waking up White and in Memphis” in White on White/Black on Black (ed.) Yancy, G., Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc., 2005.
  • Brooks-Higginbotham, E., “The Problem of Race in Women's History,” in Coming to Terms: Feminism, Theory, Politics, (ed.) Weed, E., New York: Routledge, 1989.
  • Carby, H., “On the Threshold of Woman’s Era: Lynching, Empire, and Sexuality in Black Feminist Theory,” in Race, Writing and Difference, (ed) Gates, H.L, University of Chicago Press: Chicago, 1986.
  • Carby, H., “The Multicultural Wars,” in Black Popular Culture, (ed.) Dent, G., Bay Press: Washington, 1992.
  • Carby, H. Reconstructing Womanhood: The Emergence of the Afro-American Woman Novelist, U.S.A: Oxford University Press, 1989
  • Collins, P.H., Black Feminist Thought, New York: Routledge, 1991.
  • Combahee River Collective, “A Black Feminist Statement The Combahee River Collective” in Words of Fire: An Anthology of African-American Feminist Thought, (ed) Guy-Sheftall, B., New Press, 1995.
  • Davis, A., “Black Nationalism: The Sixties and the Nineties,” in Black Popular Culture, (ed.) Dent, G., Bay Press: Washington, 1992.
  • Espiritu, Yen Le, “Race, Class and Gender in Asian America” in Making More Waves: New Writings by Asian American Women, eds. Elaine H. Kim, Lilia V. Villanueva, and Asian Women United of California, Beacon Press Books: Boston, 1997.
  • Friedan, B. The Feminine Mystique, New York: Dell Publishing Inc., 1974.
  • Frye, M., “White Woman Feminist 1983-1992,” in Race and Racism, (ed.), B. Boxill, U.S.A: Oxford University Press, 2001.
  • de Gobineau, A., "The Inequality of Human Races," in The Idea of Race (eds.) Bernasconi, R. and Lott, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 2000.
  • Goldman, E. “The Tragedy of Woman’s Emancipation,” in The Feminist Papers: From Adams to de Beauvoir, (ed.) Ross, A. S., Boston: Northeastern University Press, 1973.
  • Gordon, L., “On Difference,” Genders 10, Spring 1991.
  • Grande, S., “Whitestream Feminism and the Colonialist Project: A Review of Contemporary Feminist Pedagogy and Praxis,” Educational Theory, Summer 2003,Volume 53, Number 3.
  • Hartsock, Nancy, The Feminist Standpoint Revisited, And Other Essays (Basic Books, 1999), pp. 105-133.
  • Hooks, b., Feminist Theory: From Margin to Center, Boston: South End Press, 1984.
  • Ignatiev, N., “The Point Is Not To Interpret Whiteness But To Abolish It” in Race Traitor, ed. Noel Ignatiev, 1997.
  • Lorde, A. “The Master’s Tools Will Never Dismantle the Master’s House,” in This Bridge Called My Back: Writings by Radical Women of Color, (eds.) Moraga, C. and Anzaldua, Kitchen Table- Women of Color Press, 1984.
  • Lorde, A. “There is No Hierarchy of Oppressions,” Illvox, May 12, 2008.
  • Lugones, M. “Playfulness, ‘World’-Travelling, and Loving Perception” in Making Face, Making Soul/Haciendo Caras: Creative and Critical Perspectives by Feminists of Color, (ed.) Anzaldua, G., Aunt Lute Books, 1995.
  • McIntosh, P., “White Privilege and Male Privlege,” in The Feminist Philosophy Reader, (eds.) Bailey, A. and Cuomo, C., New York: McGraw Hill, 2008.
  • Moallem, M., “Feminist Scholarship and the Internationalization of Women’s Studies,” Feminist Studies 32, no. 2 (Summer 2006) 334
  • Mohanty, C. “Introduction: Cartographies of Struggle: Third World Feminism and the Politics of Feminism” in Third World Women and the Politics of Feminism, (eds.) Mohanty, C., Russo, A., Torres, L., Indiana University Press, 1991.
  • Mohanty, C., “Under Western Eyes: Feminist Scholarship and Colonial Discourses” in Third World Women and the Politics of Feminism, (eds.) Mohanty, C., Russo, A., Torres, L. (eds.) Indiana University Press, 1991.
  • Moraga, C., “From a Long Line of Vendidas: Chicanas and Feminism” in Making Face, Making Soul/Haciendo Caras: Creative and Critical Perspectives by Feminists of Color, (ed.) Anzaldua, G., Aunt Lute Books, 1995.
  • Narayan, U., “Contesting Cultures: ‘Westernization,’ Respect for Cultures and Third-World Feminists,” in The Second Wave: A Reader in Feminist Theory, (ed.) Nicholson, L., New York:Routledge,1997.
  • Ngan Ling Chow, E., “The Development of Feminist Consciousness Among Asian American Women,” in The Social Construction of Gender, (eds.) Lorber, J. and Farrel, S. Sage Publications, 1991.
  • Scott, J., “The Evidence of Experience,” Critical Inquiry 17, 4 (Summer 1991)
  • Shehabuddin, E., “Gender and the Figure of the ‘Moderate Muslim’: Feminism in the Twenty-first Century,’ in Judith Butler and Elizabeth Weed, eds. The Question of Gender: Joan W. Scott's Critical Feminism (Indiana University Press, 2011).
  • Spelman, E., Inessential Woman: Problems of Exclusion in Feminist Thought, Beacon Press: Boston, 1988.
  • Srivastava, S., “You’re calling me a racist? The Moral and Emotional Regulation of Antiracism and Feminism," Signs the Journal of Women in Culture and Society, 2005, vol 31, no. 1  (30, 44, 42-43)
  • Stubblefield, A., “Meditations on Postsupremacist Philosophy” in White on White/Black on Black, G. Yancy (ed.), New York: Rowman &Littlefield, 2005.
  • Thomas, L., Moral Deference, 1998.
  • Truth, S., “Ain’t I A Woman? December 1851,” Internet Modern History Sourcebook, (ed.) Paul Halsal (March 2009).


Author Information

Sharin N. Elkholy
University of Houston – Downtown
U. S. A.