Aesthetics in Continental Philosophy
Although aesthetics is a significant area of research in its own right in the analytic philosophical tradition, aesthetics frequently seems to be accorded less value than philosophy of language, logic, epistemology, metaphysics, and other areas of value theory such as ethics and political philosophy. Many of the most prominent analytic philosophers have not written on aesthetics at all. Matters stand very differently in continental philosophy, where aesthetics has been given an important place by nearly every major thinker and tradition. There are undoubtedly important extra-philosophical reasons for this—such as the importance of art in European education and tradition and the French model of the philosophe as philosopher-writer—but there are also clearly philosophical reasons. In the analytic tradition, meaning and truth are frequently thought to be exemplified by logic, science, and the formal structures of language, whereas in continental philosophy, art has often taken this role of exemplifying meaning and truth. As such, art becomes akin to a philosophical activity insofar as it is thought to produce meaning and truth, and aesthetics takes an important place because it is seen as a branch of philosophy which gives access to some of philosophy’s perennially central concerns. Moreover, while the analytic tradition tends to abstract aesthetic questions from other concerns, the continental tradition tends to think about its role in relation to epistemology and metaphysics, to emphasise art’s historical and social situatedness, and to ask questions concerning its role and value in culture, politics, and everyday life. However, and in further contrast to analytic aesthetics, there is no general consensus concerning central topics of debate in continental aesthetics. Instead, and following a method of organisation typical of continental philosophy, this area of aesthetics may be approached according to major traditions and thinkers. This article gives a synoptic overview of such in the twentieth and twenty-first centuries. The ideas developed by each often remain highly unique, yet they have also influenced and reacted against each other (and these points of contact are marked within the article). Most of these developments have taken place in critical relation with modern and nineteenth-century aesthetics, especially as exemplified by the works of Immanuel Kant, G.W.F. Hegel, and Friedrich Nietzsche. Kant’s Critique of the Power of Judgement (1790) has been particularly important in shaping debates in later continental aesthetics, since on the one hand it stakes out aesthetics as a domain autonomous in relation to other areas of philosophical concern, such as epistemology and practical philosophy, and on the other it shows how this domain has relevance for other areas, (In Kant’s system, aesthetics provides a model for how judgement acts as a power that can unify the other branches of philosophical interest.)
Table of Contents
- The Position of Aesthetics in Continental Philosophy
- Phenomenology and Existentialism
- Critical Theory
- Developments in the Early 21st Centrury
The importance and scope of aesthetics in continental philosophy may be indicated at the outset by taking the relatively ‘canonical’ example of Heidegger’s reading of Nietzsche on art. While the specific views about art and aesthetics expressed in this reading do not extend their influence to all traditions and thinkers within continental philosophy, the example gives a good indication of the dominant role aesthetics frequently takes in such traditions. During his first lecture course on Nietzsche, ‘The Will to Power as Art’, Heidegger sets out five statements on art:
- Art is the most perspicuous and familiar configuration of will to power;
- Art must be grasped in terms of the artist;
- According to the expanded concept of artist, art is the basic occurrence of all beings; to the extent that they are, beings are self-creating, created;
- Art is the distinctive countermovement to nihilism;
- Art is worth more than ’the truth’.
In addition to the above, and taking preeminent place as an expression of Nietzsche’s entire thinking on art, Heidegger adds the following major statement on art: art is the greatest stimulant of life.
These theses indicate that for (Heidegger’s) Nietzsche, art is far more than a pleasant diversion; it has profound ontological, cultural, political, and existential significance, and is even worth more than truth itself. Heidegger expands these theses as follows. Nietzsche’s ontology is that of the ‘will to power’, in which Being as a whole is understood in terms of shifting relations of confluent and conflictual forces, producing the creation and destruction of particular beings. Art is privileged both as an expression of will to power, and as a being which gives us special insight into the nature of Being as a whole as will to power. The first statement suggests that of all types of being, art is that which is most clearly accessible to us in its essence. Moreover, art does not simply illuminate itself as a particular type of being, but illuminates Being as a whole. The second statement shifts the significance of art from its reception to its creation, and this shift opens up the ontological scope of aesthetics. Art, considered from the perspective of the artist, is then understood in terms of the creative act itself, which illuminates the way that beings in general are ‘brought forth’. Aesthetics, as meditation on art, may then be understood not simply as a consideration of beautiful things, but as ontology, the thinking of the essence of Being as a whole. The third statement tells us that, according to Nietzsche’s ontology, the will to power becomes visible as and with art, understood as paradigmatic for all creation, or productive ‘bringing forth’.
The fourth and fifth statements give art a practical dimension in Nietzsche’s philosophy. Heidegger insists that ‘truth’ in the fifth statement (and in all of Nietzsche’s philosophy) must be understood in a specifically Platonic sense as referring to the supposedly true supersensuous world of the Ideas, in contrast with the untrue sensuous world of mere appearances. For Nietzsche, the old values he associates with nihilism—the decadence of culture and the devaluation of life—are essentially grounded in this Platonic conception of truth through its dominance in the religion, morality, and philosophy of the Western tradition. Art then operates as a countermovement to nihilism on two essential points: first, as a sensuous thing, its very nature is to affirm the value of the sensuous world that nihilism denies; and second, as a paragon expression of will to power it helps us to understand what Nietzsche posits as the necessary grounding principle for the creation of new, non-nihilistic values (the will to power itself). Heidegger develops this reading of Nietzsche’s philosophy of art in order to critique it (see section 2. b. below). Nevertheless, in its clear emphasis on the ontological and practical roles of art, this reading indicates well the significance and scope that aesthetics (understood as philosophical reflection on art in general) has had for twentieth and twenty-first century continental philosophers.
Phenomenology is a philosophical method which focuses on the close examination of phenomena, that which appears. In its contemporary sense, it was founded by Edmund Husserl in the early part of the twentieth century. Many philosophers influenced by Husserl’s work developed phenomenology in ways which contributed significantly to aesthetics, including Martin Heidegger, Roman Ingarden, Jean-Paul Sartre, Mikel Dufrenne, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, and Michel Henry. While developed in varying ways by each of these thinkers, in general phenomenology has offered an approach which displaces the traditional aesthetic categories of subject and object. Instead, phenomenology has focused on the examination of aesthetic experience and the work of art in terms of appearance and the conditions of appearance, thought as prior to the categorisation of ourselves and the world into subject and object. Moreover, phenomenological aesthetics has examined the ontology of the work of art as a special kind of thing which appears, with a distinctive character marking it out from the rest of appearances. Art has frequently been given a privileged status as affording us special insight into the way in which things in general come to appear, and how meaning as such is constituted. In this way, for many phenomenologists aesthetics has been closely connected with ontology, epistemology, and value theory.
Existentialism, while stemming from nineteenth century thinkers such as Søren Kierkegaard and Nietzsche, intersects with phenomenology in the thought of many of its prominent twentieth century exponents (for example, Heidegger, Sartre, de Beauvoir, and Merleau-Ponty). Existentialism focuses on the concrete existence of human life. It rejects the adequacy of traditional philosophical thought, which proceeds by way of abstract essences and general categories, to do justice to the lived experience of the individual. For existentialists, art—and, in particular, literature (many existentialist philosophers were also literary authors)—has an advantage over philosophy insofar as it is able to dramatise concrete experience through singular imaginary examples and ‘indirectly communicate’ existential truths. Art is also better able to evoke the irrational—such as sensation, affect, feeling, mood, and everyday, non-theoretical modes of thinking—which existentialists believe is necessary to do justice to the full range of human experience. Existentialism has typically emphasised human freedom, especially the freedom to create values, and art has been taken as a testament to, and an exemplary model for, such creative activity. I will develop some of these themes in further detail here by focusing on two of the most well-known and influential contributors to aesthetics in the tradition of existential phenomenology: Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty.
Edmund Husserl’s most prominent student, Martin Heidegger, combined the method of phenomenology with a deep attention to the history of philosophy, especially that of ancient Greece, to forge one of the most influential philosophical bodies of work of the twentieth century. Heidegger turns his attention to art and aesthetics as part of his wider philosophical project, which seeks to uncover the meaning and truth of Being. Heidegger contends that the history of philosophy, and of western culture generally, has seen a decline with respect to Being, such that today Being has practically become nothing. (This is how he interprets Nietzsche’s thesis of nihilism, the negation of meaning and value as such.) Heidegger understands Being as the way particular beings (or ‘entities’) come to appear as what they are, with the meaning that they have, within particular historical epochs. For Heidegger, Being is a historical process, such that beings appear differently in different epochs. He specifies three main epochs, the ancient, medieval, and modern, to each of which corresponds a leading meaning of Being; that is, a main way in which beings are revealed. Heidegger’s reflections on art and aesthetics appear within his critique of the modern epoch and his attempts to retrieve a deeper understanding of Being from the near-oblivion into which he believes it has fallen.
Heidegger specifies that ‘aesthetics’ is itself a part of this modern tradition: a particular way of viewing art which first became explicit with Alexander Baumgarten’s Aesthetica (1750), then was quickly taken up in successive influential formulations, in particular by Kant (Critique of the Power of Judgement, 1790) and Hegel (Lectures on Fine Art, c. 1818–29). For Heidegger, the distinctive feature of the modern way of revealing beings is to give them the character of subject and object, as per Descartes’ philosophy. The aesthetic view of art follows suit by positioning the artwork as an object, ‘experienced’ by the one who takes in and appreciates it, positioned as subject. Heidegger wants to critique aesthetics as one aspect of modern philosophy, which he critiques in general, in order to allow a different view of art to emerge. According to Heidegger, the modern worldview covers over a more primordial relation of being-in-the-world in which we are immersed in and alongside other beings in the world. Heidegger’s own form of phenomenological philosophy aims to be attentive to beings as they appear in order to overcome the modern presupposition of thinking, which distributes things according to the subject/object divide before we truly encounter them, and to reveal the more primordial character of things which such presuppositions hide. For Heidegger, the modern tendency is particularly pernicious because it views beings according to a framework he calls Gestell, which determines them as resources available to be put to use (Bestand). Such a view distracts us from being attentive to the many other ways beings can be revealed and impoverishes the meaningfulness of the world we inhabit by reducing everything—including human beings themselves—to this narrow scope.
‘The Origin of the Work of Art’ is the most significant and well-know of Heidegger’s essays in which he tries to draw attention to the enigma of art and to sketch an alternative ontology of the artwork. Here, the artwork is described as the setting-to-work of truth. Truth must be understood not in its usual meaning as thought corresponding to facts in the world, but in Heidegger’s specific determination as aletheia, meaning disclosure, uncovering, or revealing. For Heidegger, truth means the way in which beings come to light as what they are and with the meaning they have. Art for him, therefore, has a privileged relation to truth because great art can be an occurrence of truth; that is, it has the power to reveal not just itself, but other beings in a particular way. He expresses this by saying that art ‘sets up a world’ and ‘sets forth the earth’, and that the artwork enacts the ‘strife’ which is the turbulent relation between world and earth. As in much of Heidegger’s writings, these terms are more suggestive than determinate, and remain open to contesting interpretations. They may, however, be roughly glossed as follows. ‘World’ is the network or system of interpretations in which beings appear as what they are and form an open but interrelated whole. The world, in short, is the set of shared meanings of a historical culture. It is the meaning of the artwork as interpreted in that culture, and the effect on cultural meaning in general that the work has. ‘Earth’, on the other hand, refers to the material and sensory thing that the work necessarily must be, and to its capacity to hold dimensions of potential meaning currently concealed but which might, in the future, come to be revealed. The earth is the inexhaustibility of the work, its irreducibility to interpretation by a critic or a culture. For Heidegger, every artwork, at least if it is ‘great’, contains both these dimensions, which exist in a state of tension or strife: world opening up to reveal meaning, earth drawing back to keep meaning opaque. While these terms themselves may seem opaque, arguably they do successfully describe something of the mysterious character of artworks in their ability to simultaneously reward and thwart our desire to understand them. Heidegger also asserts in this essay that the essence of all art is poetry. ‘Poetry’ needs to be understood here in a specific sense, not simply as the pleasing combination of words, but insofar as Heidegger understands poetry as the essence of language, which again has a significant relation to truth. ‘Poetry’ in this sense designates the capacity of language to reveal beings and determine them as what they are in their specific character by naming them, and he asserts here that poetry has a privileged place in the system of the arts by virtue of being that art which most exemplifies the ontological power of all art to reveal. In sum, Heidegger’s phenomenological approach to art aims to subvert the aesthetic tradition’s determination of art as the object of aesthetic experience, and to uncover a deeper meaning in which art may be understood as a site of ontological revealing. This is consonant with his wider project of overcoming the metaphysical tradition, and modern philosophy more specifically, in order to rethink the meaning and truth of Being.
Albeit in a different way, Merleau-Ponty also seeks to understand art in the context of an ontology which moves beyond the subject/object division characteristic of modern philosophy. This is most evident in his late essay ‘Eye and Mind’ (1960), while the earlier essay ‘Cézanne’s Doubt’ (1945) presents a more existentialist perspective. For Merleau-Ponty, it is as if painting were phenomenological research pursued by other means. In fact—and this contra Sartre—he holds art in a privileged position over philosophy and literature, and accords to painting a higher position at least than music, which for him remains too amorphous to properly render phenomenological insight. The most distinctive feature of Merleau-Ponty’s own brand of phenomenology is the emphasis he puts on the embodied nature of human existence only noted in passing by Heidegger. The body takes on primary importance for Merleau-Ponty as he sees it as the fundamental condition for the appearing of a world. Such appearing takes place through the body’s perceptual system. For Merleau-Ponty, science and philosophy have distorted both our idea of the body and the way perception works by freezing them in idealised third-person representations. The aim of his phenomenological ontology is to return us to a more primordial understanding of our first-person experience of the body as it is lived by us, and of perception as it reveals the world. He gives painting a privilege over science and philosophy because he sees the painter as performing a kind of natural epoche, the phenomenological ‘reduction’ which suspends our commonsense beliefs about things, while he or she tries to see how things genuinely appear to vision and to render what they see on canvas. Moreover, Merleau-Ponty emphasises the necessarily bodily activity of painting, claiming that it would be impossible for a pure mind to paint. This is because painting revels in the bodily conditions that abstract thought tends to idealise and cover, such as the position of the body in space from which any sight is necessarily seen (the viewpoint), the movement of the eye, prevailing lighting conditions affecting the quality of visual perception, and so on.
As well as science and philosophy in general, Merleau-Ponty’s critical targets are Descartes’ theory of vision in his Dioptics (1637), and the ‘linear perspective’ method of constructing the space of painting developed in the Italian Renaissance, which employs precise geometric rules for creating the illusion of three-dimensional space on the two-dimensional surface of the painting. Neither is condemned outright by Merleau-Ponty. Rather, what he criticises in both is a partial truth which abstracts certain elements from our perceptual experience, and elevates them to the pretension of sole and exhaustive truth. Descartes’ theory of vision treats space as a homogenous expanse equally accessible at all points; an abstraction useful for thought, but impossible for any actual body to experience. Linear perspective, for its part, has for centuries been treated as the formula of realism, and has been supposed to present things as they actually appear to the eye. Merleau-Ponty contests this, citing various abstractions and exclusions which operate on real perception in order to construct linear perspective. Two distinctive features on which he concentrates are depth and movement.
First, perspective presents the illusion of depth by varying the sizes of objects relative to ‘parallel’ lines which converge at a vanishing point. Because this method was presented as rendering the true nature of visual space, the theoreticians of the Renaissance had to deny the theorem of Euclid’s Geometry which states that parallel lines never converge. Second, Merleau-Ponty notes that static art such as photography, painting, and sculpture, no matter how supposedly realistic, falsifies reality by excluding time, and hence, motion. Following a suggestion made by Auguste Rodin, he asserts that the phenomenology of movement is best expressed by a paradoxical arrangement in which different aspects of the figure in motion, which would be visible at different times in real life, are presented simultaneously in the artwork. According to his analysis, the truth of movement is better expressed by (for example) Théodore Géricault’s anatomically incorrect painting of racing horses Epsom Derby (1821) than by the gaits of horses photographically captured by Étienne-Jules Marey. What the painter is able to capture, Merleau-Ponty asserts, is not the outside of the object of motion, but motion’s ‘secret cipher’: time rendered visible in an indirect, stylistic manner.
In general for Merleau-Ponty, it is a focus on the primary qualities (those which can be specified with exactness: quantified and rationally calculated, such as extension and form) which is responsible for the intellectual abstractions that distort our understanding of the body’s perception. The supposedly secondary qualities, especially colour, are what reveal more primordial truths about perception in painting. For him, painting is capable of rendering visible the birth of perception, the way that fully-formed, recognisable objects emerge from a deeper, more primordial, inchoate visual field. This is evident in Paul Cézanne’s painting in the way that rather than beginning with lines which give form to objects and then adding colour, the reverse procedure is evident—dashes of graduated colour build up and give shape to forms. In this way, Merleau-Ponty sees Cézanne and artists in general as performing phenomenological work: they are able to reveal the conditions and processes of perception, which are usually covered over by our focus on the end product, or what is perceived.
Merleau-Ponty’s essay ‘Cézanne’s Doubt’ displays aspects of an existentialist aesthetic by giving attention to the relationship between the life of the artist and the meaning of the artist’s work. This takes place in conversation with Sigmund Freud’s psychoanalytic treatment of Leonardo da Vinci (see section 4. b. below), which is often taken to excessively reduce the meaning of the work to the artist’s psychopathology. Echoing positions worked out in The Phenomenology of Perception (1945) in response to Sartre’s views on radical human freedom, Merleau-Ponty develops a nuanced view of the relationship between freedom and concrete situation in human existence. He asserts that the meaning of the work takes its bearings from the artist’s life but cannot be wholly reduced to it, just as the free transcendence of the subject must take its bearings from the facts of the life which it is born into but to which it is not reducible. For Merleau-Ponty, the individual’s freedom is necessarily determined in relation to facts over which we have no choice (for example, Leonardo’s being abandoned by his father in early childhood), but how we respond to such facts retains an element of choice. At the same time, the artwork produced by an individual will be informed by facts about the artist’s life, yet the meaning of such works will nevertheless defy any attempt to reduce it to such facts. Thus, Merleau-Ponty develops a qualified defence of the psycho-biographical approach to art characteristic of psychoanalytical criticism. According to him, the doubt which plagued Cézanne’s life and work stems from a general feature of situated human existence (albeit one which he felt more keenly than most): our freedom to create meaning is attended by no guarantee that it will become meaningful in the fullest sense of which it is capable; that is, to be accepted in the eyes of others, to transform the world that others inhabit, and to contribute to the store of human culture. In these various ways, then, Merleau-Ponty’s reading of Cézanne exemplifies the concerns of an existentialist aesthetic: to see the meaning of the artwork in relation to the life of the individual artist and to see art itself as exemplifying general features of human existence.
Merleau-Ponty’s essay ‘Eye and Mind’ develops many of the themes above in the context of his late ontology of ‘the visible and the invisible’, which attempts to overcome the subject/object division by invoking new concepts such as ‘flesh’. Against the transparent lucidity of Cartesian consciousness, flesh invokes the thickness and density of the perceptual field: the ambiguous region of the mutual imbrication of the perceiving self and the perceived world in a space in which both overlap without clear dividing line or boundary, but also without either being able to be reduced to the other. The perceiver and perceived cross over and inhabit the same ambiguous space, but this space is non-homogenous, and includes breaks, gaps, and undersides where the two fail to meet, or at least to do so in mutual accord. Merleau-Ponty gives the helpful example of seeing the world from the bottom of a pool of water. In this case, the water itself is like flesh, and the ‘distortions’ of our perception it introduces appear to be between subject and object insofar as they condition how we see objects beyond the pool. For Merleau-Ponty, our whole perceptual field and our body’s being-in-the-world, has this in-between character in all cases, even when this is less evident. Although in this later work he abandons much of the language of ‘classical’ phenomenology, Merleau-Ponty continues the phenomenological project of bringing to light the conditions of appearances which themselves are usually not apparent. Art holds for him a privileged status in its capacity to do this. Merleau-Ponty’s ontology of painting differs markedly from Heidegger’s aesthetics by disputing the latter’s location of the essence of all art in poetry, and insisting that there is a difference between the kind of meaning apparent in language and that which emerges with the visual. (This difference is taken up and developed by Jean-François Lyotard—see section 6. c.)
Hermeneutics is a theory of interpretation and understanding which has roots in Biblical exegesis and developments in German romanticism, but which emerged as a significant branch of contemporary continental philosophy primarily through the work of one of Heidegger’s most prominent students: Hans-Georg Gadamer. Under Gadamer’s influence, hermeneutics has been developed in differing ways by various other leading proponents, such as Paul Ricoeur in France and Gianni Vattimo in Italy. However, it is Gadamer’s work which remains at the core of this tradition, and continues to be most influential in aesthetics.
As a philosophical heir to Heidegger, Gadamer took up aspects of the phenomenological tradition but focused on further developing reflections on interpretation and understanding found in Heidegger’s Being and Time. The relevance of Gadamer’s hermeneutics for aesthetics can be understood to have two parts. First, in his 1960 magnum opus Truth and Method, art and aesthetic experience are used as an example to defend the kind of understanding appropriate to the human sciences from methodological scientism and to develop a general theory of hermeneutics. Second, in various later essays, Gadamer wrote more explicitly about the hermeneutic character of the experience of artwork and of specific literary and artistic works. Of these later essays, the most significant for developing a hermeneutic philosophy of art is ‘The Relevance of the Beautiful’ (1964).
Gadamer’s general approach to hermeneutics developed in Truth and Method seeks to defend the human sciences from reduction to the kind of methodology appropriate for the natural sciences. Rather than trying to gain objective knowledge about reality in the way natural sciences do, Gadamer argues that the human sciences aim at understanding works (theoretical or literary texts, artworks, and other cultural products), which themselves cannot be understood to be entirely separate from the one who seeks to understand. Rather, both are inscribed within a common horizon of tradition. Tradition (Überlieferung), he insists, must not be understood in the static sense of conserving what already exists but rather as a transmission through which works from a world different to the one we inhabit are passed down to us. Understanding then becomes something like a translation, in which the aim is a ‘fusion of horizons’ of the world of the work and the world we inhabit. Both ourselves, as interpreters, and the work interpreted are transformed by these acts of interpretation, so that we cannot speak of understanding in the human sciences on the model of a subject correctly representing external natural objects to itself. Tradition, for Gadamer, is a matter of constant change and transformation of understanding through acts of interpretation within a continuous overarching horizon. In the first section of Truth and Method, aesthetic experience and the artwork stand as paradigm examples to show why understanding in the human sciences differs from explanation in the natural sciences, as propaedeutic to working out a general theory of hermeneutics.
Turning to the later essays and Gadamer’s more explicit ‘aesthetics’, we continue to see Heidegger’s influence as well as a number of significant differences. Like Heidegger, Gadamer seeks to challenge and overcome what has been called aesthetics in modern philosophy but for different reasons and with a different aim in mind. While Heidegger concerns himself primarily with the kind of monumental art that can open and sustain a world, Gadamer is interested in any and all kinds of aesthetic experiences, including more mundane ones. Gadamer objects to Kant’s thesis of the disinterested nature of aesthetic experience, insisting instead that such experience brings a cognitive content which connects artworks with our understanding of other features of the world, and other types of experience, including our ‘interests’. Artworks are encountered and understood as part and parcel of the general fabric of interpretations we weave as we encounter the wider world. It is this supposedly disinterested nature of aesthetic experience which Gadamer believes needs to be overcome in modern aesthetics in order to make way for a more genuine understanding of, and possibility for, encountering artworks. In this way, he asserts, modern philosophical aesthetics should be overcome by being absorbed into hermeneutics.
In ‘The Relevance of the Beautiful’, Gadamer applies his hermeneutic approach to illuminate the nature of the work of art. The problem he sets himself to understand is the nature of the artwork considered trans-historically, so that we may understand what ‘art’ means such that the same word refers to the works of the ancient world and to contemporary experimental arts, such as non-objective painting. He proposes that we may do this with reference to the anthropological basis of our experience of art, which he develops through three key ideas: play, symbol, and festival. Like Freud (see section 4. b. below), though without any direct reference, Gadamer links the phenomenon of art as a human activity to that of play. What is significant about play for Gadamer is that it is an intentional activity involving a mere repetition without any real purpose or goal. Applied to the work of art, the concept of play implies that there is no real separation between the work itself and the one who receives it: the work is constituted through a kind of playful activity of the receiver with the work. This activity constitutes the work; it brings the work’s different aspects together through the synthetic activity of interpretation and constitutes the unity of the work. (This understanding of the work again challenges the modern aesthetic tradition, which maintains a distinction between the subject and object in aesthetic experience.)
Gadamer uses the notion of the symbol to explain the way in which an artwork should be thought to be meaningful. As we have seen, Gadamer wants to underline the cognitive dimension of artworks: what they are about and the connections to our interests and involvements that they imply. At the same time, he objects to Hegel’s idealist account of artworks, which reduces them entirely to conceptual content. For Hegel, art has ‘ended’ because the conceptual content artworks were best able to express in sensuous form in classical times has been superseded by philosophy’s more perspicuous conceptual articulation. Here Gadamer again takes inspiration from Heidegger, and reiterates the latter’s idea that every revealing is also a concealing; every setting up of a world also sets forth an earth, so that every artwork always maintains something concealed within it which resists the current interpretation. Gadamer translates this into every encounter with a work of art, so that the artwork is imputed with an inexhaustible excess of meaning, gradually revealed through repeated engagements with the work (like a conversation), without the prospect that such meaning might ever be wholly revealed or exhausted.
The symbol, for Gadamer, then expresses the way that an artwork can have a meaning which is cognitive and quasi-linguistic yet excessive and inexhaustible. For Gadamer, language stands as a paragon for all experience of meaning, so that even apparently non-linguistic experiences such as encounters with artworks must be understood according to a linguistic model. Art speaks to us, it says something to us, and understanding a work of art is all about working out what it has to say. This means learning to listen to or read a work of art, which in turn means learning to understand the kind of language it speaks. He notes how both ancient and contemporary works can challenge us by appearing to speak a language we do not understand and how interpreting them requires a process of learning the appropriate language in order to approach a meaning which will, however, never be able to be summed up in a simple conceptual determination or linguistic formulation. In this manner, understanding a work of art will be an interminable affair involving repeated encounters and acts of interpretation.
Finally, the festival reveals something about the temporal character of the artwork and its affinity with human community. Like the experience of a festival or holiday, the artwork invites us into an experience of time which differs from the quantitative, calculative experience of time we have when we are engaged in work (and similar everyday activities). Gadamer calls this ‘fulfilled’ or ‘autonomous’ time; it is time which has a certain unity and cannot be dissolved into separate moments, and which stands apart—and stands us apart, as we experience it—from everyday concerns. It is here that we see the phenomenological character of Gadamer’s aesthetics: like Heidegger, he is concerned with the way that art invites us to ‘let things be’, to be open to the way they reveal themselves. It is also through festive experiences that community is formed by dissolving the usual hierarchical distances which divide citizens according to social roles. Art, Gadamer proposes, can also be experienced in a way which does not appeal to any particular social class, but unites people in sharing the same kind of experience. While hermeneutics has sometimes been characterised as conservative because of its emphasis on tradition and community, it must be emphasised that Gadamer sees both in terms of openness and transformation. And while he reminds us of the trans-historical importance of great works such as Ancient Greek tragedy, it is notable that Gadamer also asserts the legitimacy and importance of contemporary experimental arts, of happenings and anti-art, and even of pop music.
Psychoanalysis, which received more mainstream acceptance in continental Europe than in English-speaking countries, produced a body of theory which has become a major current feeding into continental philosophy, including its aesthetic reflections. Sigmund Freud, the father of psychoanalysis, extended his theoretical model of the human psyche beyond the clinical setting to develop many aspects of a general philosophical anthropology. One area he treated in a number of essays was art. In his writings, we find both some general reflections on the psychological significance of creative activity in general and the interpretation of a number of specific painters and writers, including Leonardo, Michelangelo, Fyodor Dostoevsky, and E.T.A Hoffmann. Following Freud, other psychoanalysts, notably C.J. Jung, Melanie Klein, and Jacques Lacan, have included ruminations on art in their distinctive developments of psychoanalytic theory. Psychoanalysis has inspired many art critics to adopt its ideas and methods, and artists themselves have also been subject to its influence (most notably in the Surrealist movement). Aspects of psychoanalytic theory have been taken up by some continental philosophers, such as Julia Kristeva, Jean-François Lyotard, and Slavoj Zizek, in their own aesthetics and philosophies of art. Such philosophers have engaged deeply with the writings of psychoanalysts themselves, treating their ideas as philosophical theories, and we will do the same here, outlining some of the prominent contributions to aesthetics we find in the works of Freud and Lacan.
Freud develops the outlines of a general approach to aesthetics that he calls variously ‘pathography’ or ‘psychobiography’. He finds the origins of the artist’s creative activity in children’s play, in which the child imaginatively creates a world of his or her own. He suggests that this creative activity then takes the form of phantasies in adulthood, where phantasies are understood as imaginative fulfilments of desires which remain unfulfilled in reality. Artists, he contends, are particularly neurotic people who are especially incapable of fulfilling their desires in reality and find a substitute sense of fulfilment by externalising their fantasies in works of art. However, artists are also especially gifted: their talents allow them to represent such desires in a way which makes them acceptable to others when the desires confronted directly in themselves would be repulsive (because of their brute, animalistic character—which is why they are often repressed). Artists’ own activities have a therapeutic value for them because artistic expression acts as a release for the pressures of desires which are unfulfilled and/or repressed. Moreover, Freud contends that the real reason we enjoy art is that it serves the same function for the aesthetic spectator. The formal or properly aesthetic qualities, he suggests, merely have an initial ‘incentive value’ to draw us to the work, while the real enjoyment comes from the release we feel by sharing with the artist the phantasy of fulfilling unfulfilled or repressed desires.
In general, the desires which artists represent are of two main kinds: ambitious (the desire for power, achievement, and security) and erotic (the desire for love and sexual pleasure). However, according to Freud, artists express their own unique phantasies with enough specificity that, with the help of biographical knowledge of the artist’s life, we may interpret artworks like symptoms (hence, ‘pathography’, meaning ‘marks of illness’) in order to reconstruct a picture of the artist’s psychological life (hence ‘psychobiography’.) Freud’s most famous example here comes from Leonardo. He sees in Leonardo’s painting The Virgin and Child with St. Anne (c. 1503) the outlined figure of a vulture in the Virgin’s clothing and uses this as a clue to a psychoanalytic interpretation which also draws on Leonardo’s diaries and on biographical accounts. He notes a passage in the diaries which seems to underline the significance of the vulture where Leonardo writes of a memory from early childhood in which a vulture repeatedly struck him on his open mouth with its tail. Interpreting this as a fellatio fantasy, and drawing it together with a number of other interpretive elements, Freud diagnoses Leonardo as a passive homosexual who did not actively pursue his homosexual desires but sublimated them into his work. This case his proven infamous because of Freud’s misinterpretation of the key word in Leonardo’s writings—he in fact refers to a kite, not a vulture—but the psychoanalytic approach does not stand or fall with a single example. The general approach illustrated here, that of psychobiography, has since been taken up and developed by numerous other writers in relation to many other examples. More significantly, and aside from the many criticisms to which psychoanalysis in general has been subject, this form of psychoanalytic aesthetics has been criticised for reducing the value of the work to the life of the artist (see section 2. c.) and attempting psychoanalysis without the benefit of a living and present analysand.
Jacques Lacan is arguably the second most influential psychoanalyst, both in general and in aesthetics and art theory, after Freud. Lacan’s contribution to aesthetics is at once less and more ambitious than Freud’s: less insofar as he did not produce any lengthy psycho=biographical studies of artists yet more insofar as he moved beyond Freud’s hesitant tone where art was concerned to confidently pronounce on the motive of artistic creation and the power of visual art to fascinate. Moreover, his writings and seminars are peppered with examples from the arts used to explain psychoanalytic concepts, an approach which has proven influential on many other art writers and cultural theorists, who (questionably) assume that the reverse also holds true: that such psychoanalytic concepts tell us something about the arts that may be used to illustrate them. Lacan’s distinctive approach to psychoanalysis may be glossed as an attempt to update and formalise Freud’s teachings by applying the concepts and methods of structural linguistics (see section 6. a.). Freud’s own works lend themselves to this because of their extensive references to the importance of language in psychic functioning. Lacan’s approach is well indicated by his famous dictum: ‘the unconscious is structured like a language’.
While retaining Freud’s categories (the unconscious, id, ego, and so forth), Lacan added three ‘registers’ of psychological functioning to his model of the mind: the imaginary, the symbolic, and the real. The imaginary concerns thinking in images, the symbolic is the register of language and formal symbolisation but is also associated with the law and social custom, while the real designates what falls outside the limits of the imaginary and the symbolic. Together, the imaginary and symbolic constitute what we think of as ‘reality’, which contrasts with ‘the real’. The real has its origins in the experience of infantile life, before the imaginary and symbolic mental functions have developed, but it returns as a kind of surplus energy to make its presence felt in those registers throughout life. Two further key ideas are necessary to understand Lacan’s specific contributions to aesthetics: the famous ‘mirror stage’ and symbolic castration. Lacan postulates that at around 6–18 months of age, the child develops an awareness of their separation from the mother’s body, but experiences their own body as disorganised, lacking unity. This unity is provided by identification with other people (as in a mirror image) but at the cost of a fundamental split and lack: contra Descartes, the thinking subject is not a self-sufficient unity but gains an identity only through a fundamental identification with an other. This identification with an other structures our own desire, as we learn to desire what the other desires (by imitation) but also in relation to what the other desires (we ask ourselves: what does the other want from me, or want me to be?).
Lacan transforms Freud’s theories of the Oedipus complex and castration anxiety by suggesting that the Oedipus complex is in fact resolved through the accomplishment of a symbolic castration. This occurs as the child learns language and also learns to attenuate their desires in relation to the law and social custom. This is attended by a further alienation and feeling of lack as the unconscious idea of a pleasurable plenitude prior to both the alienation of the mirror stage and symbolic castration develops. Lacan postulates that things or objects can take on the role of what he calls the ‘object petit a’ (the object designated with a little ‘a’, for autre, the French word for ‘other’). Human beings are principally motivated by a ‘fundamental fantasy’ which is the fantasy of fulfilling our lack through the object petit a, which we unconsciously see as a lost object (symbolically, the phallus which is lost through castration), the regaining of which would make us whole. The central aim of Lacanian psychoanalysis is to help the analysand ‘traverse the fantasy’—to realise the fundamental fantasy for what it is (precisely that, an impossible fantasy), and to accept the inevitable necessity of symbolic castration.
With these basic points in place, we are in a position to understand some of the key ideas Lacan outlines in the text which has been his most influential in aesthetics, the section called ‘Of the Gaze as object petit a’ in the transcript of his Seminar Book XI: The Four Fundamental Concepts of Psychoanalysis (delivered in 1964). Coincidentally, the first of these seminars was given in the same week that Merleau-Ponty’s posthumous work The Visible and the Invisible appeared, and Lacan takes the phenomenologist’s work as the basis from which he develops a psychoanalytic theory of art (see the section on Phenomenology and Existentialism above). At the same time, it must be understood that Lacan develops these ideas in a direction which, by focusing on the unconscious and a structuralist approach, seeks to provide an alternative account of the visual to that of existential phenomenology. The latter, for Lacan, does not adequately account for the decentred and split nature of subjectivity because it identifies it too strongly with the conscious ego. Lacan begins from Merleau-Ponty’s contention that the seeing subject is not the most primordial aspect of the visual, as such, and develops a deeper conception of the visible, and the invisible which conditions it, in terms of a distinction between ‘the eye’ and ‘the gaze’. ‘The eye’ designates the seeing subject, associated with the Cartesian analysis of vision, and the ideal point of the observer in single-point perspective painting. By contrast, ‘the gaze’ designates something in the visual field which escapes the eye’s ability to see it clearly and, in so doing, is the presence in the visual of something which escapes the Cartesian subject’s supposedly transparent self-consciousness and mastery of the objects it surveys. The skewed perspective in the visual field that the gaze suggests is famously exemplified by Lacan with Hans Holbein’s anamorphic painting The Ambassadors (1533). The skull at the bottom of the picture can only be seen clearly by viewing the rest of the painting from an extreme angle, illustrating both the lack of a single perspective which can master the visual field and the lack at the heart of the subject (exemplified by the skull as the symbol of death, the memento mori of the painting’s traditional interpretation).
The primordial model of this ‘gaze’ is the gaze of the mother, which evokes in the child questions that persist in our unconscious and shape our experience of vision: what does the (m)other want from me? What does she want me to be? As a seeing subject (‘the eye’), Lacan argues, my visual field is haunted by something which looks back at me, but which I cannot clearly see. This haunting of the visual field by an other which decentres my own point of vision is what Lacan understands by ‘the gaze’. As patterned on our mother’s look, the gaze is an example of the object petit a, and it evokes in us the sense of a lack which might be filled by regaining the appropriate lost object. Lacan answers the question ‘What is a picture?’ by suggesting that a picture is something the artist produces in the hope of appeasing or pacifying the gaze: it is an attempt to give the mother what she wants in the hope of regaining the fantasised, lost, utopian, perfect relationship with her, and thus fulfilling our own lack. This then leads to Lacan’s pronouncements on the meaning of all painting (and by extension, all visual art): it is ‘a trap for the gaze’.
For Lacan, visual art has a particular psychological function which works specifically in the register of the imaginary: it acts as a ‘lure’ for desire, inviting us to fantasise about the overcoming of alienation and the regaining of the lost object. This is because it is not only the painter who seeks to fulfil his or her desire by giving the other what it wants with the picture but the picture itself, as an image of self-enclosed completeness, which satisfies the spectator’s desire to fulfil the fundamental fantasy. It is in this way, Lacan suggests, that the picture can have a taming, civilizing, and fascinating power. Some interpreters (such as Lyotard; see section 6. c.) have taken this to be Lacan’s last word on art, which leaves it at a level inferior to the symbolic and the possibility of traversing the fantasy. Others, however, have suggested that Lacan’s work is open to the reading that some visual art can work at the symbolic level by deconstructing the illusion of painting from within, showing how the supposed realism of the painting is a product of artifice. Desire is then prevented from fantasising about its own fulfilment in the supposed unity and wholeness of the image and is forced to confront the arbitrary constructions of the symbolic order. This seems to be suggested, for example, by Lacan’s reading of Diego Velázquez’s Las Meninas (1656) in his May 1966 seminar. Notably, this was a response to Michel Foucault’s examination of the same painting in his immediately popular and now classic 1966 work The Order of Things, where it is examined as a representation of how representation itself was understood in what the French call the Classical period. However it is interpreted, Lacan’s idea of the gaze makes a fascinating contribution to aesthetics by suggesting that our experience of the visual is not a simple given, reducible to geometric analysis, but is conditioned by our split subjectivity and the intrigues of our desire. His ideas have been particularly influential in film theory, where through various formulations they have dominated the field for several decades. A key development for film theory, and beyond it, is the way that Lacan’s ideas were taken up by Louis Althusser to develop a structuralist theory of ideology according to which our subjectivity is structured through its capture in the gaze of the big Other, the symbolic authority figure which conditions social reality in any given society.
The tradition known as critical theory is associated with the Frankfurt School, more formally known as the Institute for Social Research (Institut für Sozialforschung), which was founded in Frankfurt in 1923, moved its base of operations to New York in 1934, then returned to Frankfurt in 1951. With its unique combination of sociology and philosophy, Critical Theory is arguably the most prominent strand of Western Marxism. A number of philosophers and cultural critics working in this tradition have made contributions to aesthetics that have been highly influential throughout continental philosophy and in wider aesthetic and art-critical contexts. These thinkers have been concerned with both the fate of art under the conditions of industrial capitalism and the potential of art to critique such conditions. These themes were treated by Walter Benjamin in his highly influential essay ‘The Work of Art in the Age of Mechanical Reproduction’ (1936), and by Theodor W. Adorno in his Aesthetic Theory (1970) and numerous shorter works.
Benjamin’s essay hypothesises that the function of the artwork has changed as the conditions of production under industrial capitalism have changed. Following Marx but seeking to update his analyses, he suggests that it has taken some time for the changes at the superstructural (cultural) level to manifest the implications of the changes at the substructural (economic) level, which Marx analysed in the nineteenth century. The key factor in this change is the technique of mechanical reproduction. Benjamin concedes that reproducibility as such has always been a concern with art since antiquity and points to developments in the history of reproducibility such as the printing press and lithography. However, he classifies these techniques as forms of manual reproduction and asserts that with mechanical reproduction we see the development of something significantly new. The main artforms he has in mind, and discusses at length in the essay, are photography and film. With these, the process of the production of images itself is largely mechanical and reproduction can no longer be said to simply copy an original. Benjamin famously claims that what artworks previously had, which they lose through mechanical reproduction, is what he calls aura. The aura of a work is the unique ‘presence’ which the original exudes in occupying a distinct time and place. It is what gives a work its authenticity and makes it possible to distinguish between an authentic original and a forgery: the authentic original has occupied a unique series of times and places, which constitutes its history. Benjamin rightly notes that with arts such as photography and film, it no longer makes sense to draw such distinctions: one reproduction from a photographic negative, for example, is no more or less authentic than another. Instead of existing as a unique object, the work of art in the age of mechanical reproduction now exists as a multiplicity of copies.
According to Benjamin, this change also has the effect of extracting the artwork from tradition. For him, the uniqueness of a work means that it is imbedded in a fabric of tradition. This traditional uniqueness is associated with the anthropological basis of artworks in ritual, and Benjamin uses Marx’s categories of use value and exchange value to suggest that ritual or cult value is the original use value of an artwork. While such value becomes secularised in the ‘cult of beauty’ that is modern aesthetics and the art world, something of the use value of the work persists in the emphasis on its authenticity. However, Benjamin argues that with the advent of mechanical reproduction, artworks are finally liberated from this cult value and instead take on an ‘exhibition value’. Copies are put into mass circulation, exhibited far more widely than would be possible with an authentic original. For Benjamin, this accords with a broader social and cultural phenomenon of ‘the mass’, a sense of the universal equivalence and exchangeability of all things in the social domain. Mechanical reproduction feeds the desire of the masses for things to be brought close, as distinct from the unique work of art which is always at a distance (even when one is ‘present’ to it in a gallery or other setting). According to Benjamin, the quantitative transformation of artworks demanded by the masses also leads to a qualitative transformation, as the nature and function of art comes to be understood according to the model of the arts of mechanical reproduction. Thus, art is transformed by its loss of aura.
Moreover, Benjamin asserts that human modes of perception are historically transformable, and the arts of mechanical reproduction are altering our perceptions of the world. Techniques in photography and film such as the close-up and slow motion are not simply reproducing what we previously know of the world but introducing new perceptions and knowledges as they capture things entirely unknown to the naked eye. Benjamin suggests that as art loses its ritual or cult value it takes on a political value, and while the essay lacks a clear political programme or set of prescriptions, he asserts that the concepts it develops are useful for a revolutionary communist politics of art. For him, older aesthetic traditions based around the aura can be seen as culpable in their co-optation by fascist regimes, while the transformations wrought in the arts by industrial technologies opens more promising possibilities for the politicization of art through the democratic communication of ideas.
While Adorno’s reflections on art and culture developed to some extent from a critical disagreement with Benjamin over the democratizing potentials of radio and film, this developed into a highly productive engagement. Adorno agrees with Benjamin that contemporary developments in society and the arts radically challenge modern and romantic aesthetics but has a far more pessimistic view of the mass media ‘culture industry’. For Adorno, popular culture (including most radio and film) is complicit with the contemporary social system of capitalist exploitation, which he analyses as a culmination of the logic of ‘instrumental rationality’ devolving from the Enlightenment. In this system, human beings are radically alienated from nature through the project of manipulation and control of the natural world, which has not resulted in the hoped-for emancipation of human beings, but a ‘new barbarism’ in which we are psychologically dominated by the very system which was supposed to set us free. This system is one which determines everything according to a logic of rational specification and calculation, leaving little of any other way of understanding ourselves or relating to the world than what we understand to be instrumentally useful or productive.
The culture industry acts as an ideological support of this system, keeping people blind to the real conditions of their existence. However, Adorno saw more positive potentials in ‘genuine’ art, in particular experimental modernism. Through extensive writings on musicology, literature, and the visual arts, Adorno contributed one of the most important bodies of work in continental aesthetics. These reflections culminated in Adorno’s last book, Aesthetic Theory, completed but not finally edited by him.
Aesthetic Theory deliberately employs strategies which resist any easy summation of the work into simply stated concepts and theses. Adorno developed a paratactic style of writing on the model of atonal music, in which sentences clash with each other to dissonant effect, rather than developing a clear line of argument. Moreover, Adorno deploys his own ‘negative’ dialectical style of thinking, in which pairs of contrasting concepts ‘constellate’ around topics of discussion without resolving into static propositions and conclusions. These difficulties are far from arbitrary and are, in fact, highly motivated by Adorno’s own views on how critical thought can best resist the system in which it operates. This includes a demand that thought take time and be difficult, in contrast to the expectations of quick and easy consumption which dominate in the culture industry. Nevertheless, there are several key themes the work develops which are readily appreciable in the context of the broader tradition of aesthetics in continental philosophy we are outlining here.
First, Aesthetic Theory is a critical interrogation of the tradition of philosophical aesthetics itself, especially as exemplified by the works of Kant and Hegel. Adorno’s view is that many of the categories of traditional aesthetics are outmoded because of developments in both society and the arts. Nevertheless, he seeks to rethink such categories critically rather than simply abandon the legacy of the aesthetic tradition. To take one easily appreciable example, Adorno draws attention to the limitations of the aesthetic tradition’s focus on the beautiful in the face of the apparent ugliness and dissonance characteristic of much modernist art. Second, Adorno (somewhat infamously) asserts the autonomy of the artwork. (Here he follows Kant on the autonomy of aesthetic judgement but insists that this autonomy should also be ascribed to the art object itself.) This is an insistence that the aesthetic value of an artwork is independent of other values which might be ascribed to it, such as epistemological or ethical value. Unfortunately, this claim has often been (mis)interpreted to mean that artworks should be understood to be entirely unrelated to their social context or political value. Adorno’s view is more complex and, in fact, strongly asserts the relevance of cultural context and the political import of art.
As a third major point, then, for Adorno, artworks may be understood as ‘monads’ (a concept drawn from Gottfried Leibniz): while they are independent, self-enclosed entities, they are products of the social conditions in which they are created and mirror these social conditions within them. Following on from Marx’s framework of analysis, Adorno sees the conditions of contemporary capitalist society as fundamentally contradictory, and it is these contradictions which the artwork embodies. Adorno argues that the most politically relevant artworks are not ones with explicit political content, but those which best reflect the deeply conflicted conditions of contemporary culture (such as the atonal compositions of Arnold Schoenberg or the absurdist literature of Samuel Beckett). Such works have a ‘truth content’ but not one which could be stated in clear propositions with cognitive value. Moreover, the autonomy of art in fact gives it a function of political resistance: while the artwork, like everything else under the conditions of contemporary capitalism, has a commodity form, it also resists incorporation into the instrumentally rationalised system of production and consumption through its very uselessness. For Adorno, modernist experimental art is a privileged site of politics in the contemporary world, as it can both reflect and resist the difficulties and contradictions of contemporary existence better than explicit political discourse. Nevertheless, due to its opacity, art still needs a philosophical aesthetics to aid in its comprehension, and the complex arguments of Aesthetic Theory attempt to rework the concepts of the aesthetic tradition so that they become adequate to the task. While there was no outright dialogue between them, there are palpable and interesting resonances between Adorno’s aesthetic theory and the dominant modernist school of art theory which was developed in America by Clement Greenberg, Michael Fried, and others in the twentieth century. As we find in Adorno’s writings, this brand of aesthetic modernism also combined a concern with formalism, autonomy, and experimentation in the arts with a belief in the socially and politically critical relevance of such works.
Poststructuralism is the name given in the English-speaking world for a loose collection of influential French philosophers and theorists working in the wake of structuralism, a movement which itself deserves some mention for its impact on aesthetics in continental philosophy. Structuralism came to prominence in France in the nineteen-fifties and -sixties, rivalling and, to some extent, succeeding phenomenology and existentialism as a leading methodological approach in the human sciences. It applies some basic tenets of Ferdinand de Saussure’s structural linguistics to phenomena other than language, such as the unconscious (Lacan, as we have seen above in section 4. c.), myth and ritual (Claude Lévi-Strauss), and history (Michel Foucault). Most significantly for aesthetics, Roland Barthes applied structuralist principles to literary criticism, and developed Saussure’s suggestion of a ‘semiology’, a study of signs in general (broader than the study of linguistic signs alone), applying such an approach to various forms of art and culture. Simply put, structuralism views the meaningful content of any phenomena as given in the structured relations between basic units (signs). This structure is taken to be hidden (or deep), and interpretation of an artwork or cultural product then becomes a matter of making the structure which informs it explicit. Because of its formalism and methodological rigour, structuralism was touted by its supporters as a more ‘scientific’ method for studying the phenomena of the human sciences (that is, ‘meaningful’ phenomena), and it swept through the French academy like a revolution.
To some extent, poststructuralism can be understood as a philosophical reaction to the excessive zeal for formal method that structuralism exhibited. Most poststructuralists continued to draw on the phenomenological tradition, as well as psychoanalytic theory, and adopted aspects of structuralism while critiquing others. In short, poststructuralists tend to argue that meaning is not reducible to static structures and cannot be uncovered using a formal method. Generalising greatly, we might say that poststructuralists insist upon the necessity of some element of indeterminacy (which accounts for the genesis of the structure) that operates within the structure to generate meaning, and that constitutes an instability which threatens the coherence of the structure and may disrupt it and cause it to change. Understood as an interplay between structure and the element of indeterminacy (often called ‘the event’), meaning cannot be uncovered using a formal method, and poststructuralists have had recourse to highly unorthodox, experimental modes of thinking and writing in theorising and demonstrating those aspects of meaning or effect they believe structuralism misses. Art and aesthetics have been significant topics for all poststructuralists because, as the philosophical tradition attests, aesthetic meaning or effect seems to be a paradigm case of a kind of meaning which is not ‘scientific’. I will summarise here some of the key ideas of the two poststructuralists who have been most influential in aesthetics (Jacques Derrida and Gilles Deleuze) as well as those of the philosopher in this tradition who has engaged most extensively with art, Jean-François Lyotard.
Derrida and his philosophy of deconstruction have had an enormous influence on literary criticism and some influence as well in the wider arts and aesthetic theory. Notoriously difficult to summarise, Derrida’s works may be approached for our purposes through the observation that he develops a quasi-transcendental theory of meaning, which has implications for how meaning is understood to operate in philosophy, literature, and the arts. In post-Kantian, contemporary continental philosophy, ‘transcendental’ refers to the ‘conditions of possibility’ for a thing. The ‘quasi’ in Derrida’s case notes that while traditional transcendental thinking posits a priori structures that are taken to be universal and necessary, Derrida follows Heidegger in positing that the way things become meaningful is a function of time and subject to temporal and historical change. Derrida’s ‘principle’ of meaning, which claims to capture something of these conditions for anything whatsoever being meaningful, is ‘arche-writing’. This term indicates that it is some of the key features or properties of writing, as it has been understood in the metaphysical tradition, which are quasi-transcendental conditions of the possibility of meaning, rather than writing as such. These features are indicated by Derrida’s well-known term différance, which indicates spatial differing and temporal deferring.
This idea of différance contests the principle of meaning which has, according to Derrida, dominated throughout the Western tradition, which he calls the ‘metaphysics of presence’. This theory proposes an origin or full presence of ‘pure’ meaning in an idea held in the mind, which is then progressively corrupted by being put into spoken, then written, discourse. This supposed corruption of meaning corresponds with the spatial and temporal differing and deferring which, Derrida contends, are in fact the conditions of anything being meaningful in the first place. According to Derrida, there is no possibility of a pure, simple, original meaningful presentation, and every apparently original presentation is always already a repetition or a re-presentation. His arguments are extremely complex but may be treated summarily by noting how they draw on the traditions of phenomenology and structural linguistics. In the Husserlean phenomenological tradition, which takes consciousness as the transcendental condition of meaning, Derrida reads Husserl to show that conscious experience requires a synthesis of different temporal moments, such that any ‘presence’ of something to consciousness is already subject to the passing of time, that is, temporal difference. From the structural linguistics of de Saussure, Derrida draws the idea that every linguistic meaning only functions because of the possibility of its reiteration, or what Derrida calls its ‘iterability’. Every linguistic usage draws from an already-existing store of linguistic meaning (the virtual structure of language as a whole), and in that sense is already a reiteration. Moreover, every use presupposes the possibility of the listener or reader reiterating the use in another context, because the very nature of linguistic competence—and thus, the capacity to understand—depends upon the ability to use language in this appropriative and citational manner.
While Derrida has often been seen as collapsing the distinction between philosophy and literature, he is in fact drawn to the latter and deploys it to contaminate and complicate the former because of the differences he sees between them. While he seeks to deconstruct any simple opposition between philosophy and literature, such a deconstruction would not be possible without also insisting on the differences between them. Philosophy has traditionally set itself up in opposition to the ‘merely’ literary, claiming truth to be its own exclusive competence and categorising literature as belonging to the fictional or untrue. Philosophical texts have typically been tightly structured according to the metaphysics of presence, deployed in structures of binary oppositions which set up hierarchies of meaning, such as truth/falsity, essence/appearance, form/matter, presence/absence, and so on. By contrast, although Derrida sees all meaning and all texts as to some degree structured by the metaphysics of presence, he sees the virtue of literature (and especially the works of experimental writers such as Stéphane Mallarmé, James Joyce, or Antonin Artaud) as asserting and developing the ambiguities, contradictions, aporias, and playfulness of meaning that philosophical texts and modes of writing strive to suppress. Deconstruction, for Derrida, is a strategy of reading and writing which aims to identify and subvert the binary oppositions structuring a text, showing how the privileged term is in fact parasitic on the underprivileged one, and opening up the space for a play of meaning beyond simple oppositions by inventing concepts (such as the trace, différance, the hymen, and so on) which are ‘undecidable’ from the point of view of such oppositions. What Derrida finds in literature are such undecidables already in play to a much greater extent than in philosophical texts, and he affirms and reinscribes these in his own writings. Derrida strove to emulate literary modes of writing in his philosophical texts precisely in order to open them to a freer play of meaning. Through Derrida’s influential association with prominent literary critics such as Paul de Man and J. Hillis Miller, deconstruction became enormously popular in literary criticism from the nineteen-seventies to -nineties, often taking the form of a reductive methodology for exposing contradictions internal to a text, which Derrida himself would never have approved of.
When Derrida turns his attention to the visual arts, in texts such as The Truth in Painting, he develops concepts (such as the trait, the parergon, and the subjectile) which essentially follow the same differential logic as arche-writing. Derrida suspects any supposition of a pure presence of meaning in an image and works in various ways to complicate this, showing that images depend on an ambiguous play between concepts and categories such as the inside and outside of the frame, the visible and the invisible, word and image, single artwork and entire oeuvre, and so on. These playful movements are processes of spatial differing and temporal deferring, which work against the metaphysics of presence and underline a differential form of meaning in the visual which is similar to that which he sees operating in the written text. Moreover, Derrida also seeks to complicate any simple opposition between visual and textual meaning, seeing such an opposition as itself implying a metaphysics of presence. This complication is notably played out in his text on the Italian artist Valerio Adami in The Truth in Painting, where attention is given to the communication and interplay of meaning between Adami’s images and the text he places within, outside, and in transgression of the frame of his visual works.
Lyotard’s Discourse, Figure (1971) stages a significant encounter between phenomenology, structuralism, and psychoanalysis, with the aim of doing justice to the aesthetic event, and in particular the visual. Lyotard insists—against structuralism, hermeneutics, and indeed much of the literature of art history and visual culture—that the visual has its own kind of meaning, which differs from and cannot be reduced to linguistic meaning. For him, it is wrong to say that a picture can be ‘read’. Instead, he tries to account for how art can leave us with the feeling of being ‘lost for words’. The first part of Discourse, Figure carefully compares the kind of meaning proper to perception, as developed in Merleau-Ponty’s phenomenology (see section 2. c.), with the kind of meaning operative in language according to structuralism. While it is clear that Lyotard thinks Merleau-Ponty gives a more adequate account of the kind of meaning specific to the visual, he also finds phenomenology ultimately inadequate. He argues that Merleau-Ponty’s notion of the ‘flesh’ remains a too-harmonious interface with the world at the level of conscious perception, and has recourse to psychoanalysis to try to find in the unconscious the source of radical creativity and sheer unexpectedness characteristic of avant-garde art.
Lyotard objects to Lacan’s structuralist reading of the unconscious, however, and believes that the latter’s interpretation of art as lodged in the register of the imaginary, acting as a lure for desire, is an affront to the grandeur of art (see section 4. c.). Employing a close reading of Freud, he develops an alternative view of the unconscious, which emphasises plastic transformations (rather than linguistic operations) of its contents. Lyotard also objects to much of Freud’s own explicit aesthetics, however, and argues that the meaning of an artwork is not to be found in the pathology of the artist. Instead, he develops Freud’s theory of the unconscious and desire, along with Merleau-Ponty’s phenomenology, to give a complex account of the artwork: it is neither simply the impression of conscious perceptions, nor the expression of unconscious desires (fantasies), but a mutual deconstruction of one by the other, which produces a new and unrecognisable form. He refers to this deconstructive element as the figural.
In Lyotard’s later work, he reconfigures the traditional aesthetic category of the sublime to account for and defend avant-garde art and the significance of the aesthetic in the contemporary world. Lyotard now follows Adorno in postulating a crisis of traditional aesthetics, both in relation to the conditions of (post)industrial capitalism and developments in the arts, and tries to update aesthetics in response (see section 5. c.). For Lyotard, there is a crisis of meaning on the level of perception in the contemporary world, because—following the analyses of Heidegger, Benjamin, Adorno, and others—scientific and technological developments, operating in tandem with capitalism, have mutated the perceptual bearings by which we coordinated ourselves in the world. Sciences and technologies have both extended our sensory capacities (seeing and hearing at a distance, through television and telephones, for example), and revealed a reality beyond our body’s capacities for sensory awareness (atoms, microbes, nebulae, and so on). According to Lyotard, these changes have meant that the basic forms of sensory experience—time and space—have been thrown into uncertainty.
Lyotard sees avant-garde art of the twentieth-century as having pursued an analogous exploration of this crisis of perception. Traditionally, aesthetics has been concerned with the beautiful, understood in the arts as an ideal fit between the form and matter of a work. Lyotard sees avant-garde art, especially minimalism and abstraction, as moving away from a concern with ‘good form’ and towards an exploration of matter. Following Kant, ‘matter’ is something which defies rational calculation and specification: for example, colour in painting and timbre in music. While Kant himself only saw the sublime in art in depictions of sublime scenes in nature (mountains, storms at sea, and so forth), Lyotard suggests that the sublime is the aesthetic category appropriate to art which is less interested in exploring formal structure than in experimenting with matter, precisely because the sublime concerns feeling in relation to something ‘formless’. Lyotard characterises the sublime stake of art as ‘presenting the unpresentable’, because for him the aesthetic event is something which cannot be reduced to a ‘presentation’, understood in the Kantian sense as a ‘good form’ given to a sensation. Rather, art-events evoke thoughts and feelings in relation to works which surprise us and we cannot make sense of on the level of perception as well as concept: works that leave us feeling moved but lost for words. In his later works, the sublime is the aesthetic which Lyotard thinks best names this feeling. However, he also seeks to update this category in relation to the way it was understood in romantic or modern aesthetics. While in such aesthetics it had invoked the Idea of the absolute through a nostalgic feeling of loss for something transcendent which is missing, Lyotard posits a postmodern, immanent sublime in which the absolute is nothing other than the formless work itself.
Both in his writings with Félix Guattari and on his own, Gilles Deleuze made important and influential contributions to the philosophy of film, painting, literature, and music. Many of his reflections on aesthetic issues are summarised in his last book with Guattari, What Is Philosophy?, where they are accompanied by a criticism of the phenomenological approach to aesthetics and Merleau-Ponty’s notion of the ‘flesh’ in particular. Characteristic of all of Deleuze’s work, he sees the level of perception with which phenomenologists are preoccupied as insufficiently deep to provide a full account of reality. It is on this level that he and Guattari situate, for example, Mikel Dufrenne’s a priori of aesthetic experience, and Merleau-Ponty’s flesh (see section 2. c.). Deleuze and Guattari delve deeper to give an account of art and aesthetic experience grounded in a metaphysical description of reality, where ‘sensation’ becomes the key aesthetic issue. Sensation is posited in a register prior to the distinction between subject and object, and consists of two main types: percepts and affects. Understood in this specific sense, they are perceptions and feelings considered independently of the lived experience which reveals them and raised to the level of independent metaphysical existence. For Deleuze and Guattari, a work of art is a ‘being of sensation’, a compound of percepts and affects, which is a ‘monument’ that preserves the sensation in and as the material from which the work is made. While for them the artist undoubtedly has a role in creating the work and the spectator or auditor a role in appreciating it, the emphasis is on the independent ontological status of the work as embodying that aspect of being which is sensation. They associate Merleau-Ponty’s flesh with the lived experience which reveals sensation, but insist on two further, deeper, and necessary conditions for sensation: the ‘house’, and ‘cosmic forces’. (While terms such as these may appear strange in the context of philosophical discourse, these and others are inspired by the writings of artists and other non-philosophers, and their use indicates a characteristic poststructuralist desire to think art with artists and art itself, rather than construct an independent theory about it, on the model of traditional aesthetics.)
Briefly glossed, the ‘house’ is the structure that gives sensations some consistency, such as the frames of paintings or the walls of architectural constructions but also more abstract principles of composition. ‘Cosmic forces’ are the basic physical and metaphysical forces constituting the real. Deleuze and Guattari list gravity, heaviness, rotation, the vortex, explosion, expansion, germination, and time. The main point here is that Deleuze and Guattari want to connect the activity of art with things usually considered extraneous to art and, indeed, with the universe as a whole. One notable way this placement of art within a broad metaphysical view plays out is the claim that animals can be artists through their exploitation of the expressive qualities of materials in marking territory, attracting mates, and so on. However, Deleuze and Guattari also insist that art must be considered to be a form of thinking which thinks with sensations, just as philosophy thinks with concepts and science thinks with functions. Art thinks against the common opinions, doxa, or clichés of our perceptions and feelings and adds new varieties of sensation to the world. This insistence gives art a legitimacy equal to that of philosophy and science, again indicating the importance accorded to the aesthetic which is characteristic of continental philosophy.
Contemporary continental philosophy continues to see contributions to aesthetics which develop on all of the previous traditions discussed. Some twentieth century contributions to continental aesthetics, such as Adorno’s Aesthetic Theory or Lyotard’s extensive writings on the arts, still await much needed interpretation and discussion before the potential of their influence can be made manifest. In addition, contributing to the broad, pluralist landscape of aesthetics in continental philosophy, most of the more prominent continental philosophers in the early 21st century have written on the arts, including figures such as Slavoj Zizek, Alain Badiou, Giorgio Agamben, Jean-Luc Nancy, Michel Serres, Peter Sloterdijk, and Bernard Stiegler. Perhaps the most notable of these, however, is Jacques Rancière, whose distinctive works in aesthetics during the first fifteen years of the 21st century has revivified thinking on the relations between art and politics. We may therefore take Rancière’s work as an indicative example of early 21st century developments in continental aesthetics, while keeping in mind that this is just one of many important developments.
Rancière has become known for the idea of the ‘distribution of the sensible’, which suggests that systems of inclusion and exclusion, and of political relationships generally, don’t only operate on the conceptual or cognitive level, but on the sensory level. The idea of the distribution of the sensible captures the way the world is divided up according to sensations and the political implications of this. Rancière suggests that within communities there is a dimension of the sensible that is held in common by all members, allowing a common participation in the community as such, but that this is subdivided into parts, dividing members according to different areas of participation and non-participation. The distribution of the sensible concerns the circulation of words and images, the demarcation of spaces and times, and the forms of activity. It concerns the way that certain things are held to be meaningful or even self-evident to sense perception, while others are dismissed as meaningless noise. The different ways that what is held to be meaningful on a sensorial level in various contexts then affects what can meaningfully be thought, said, made, or done in those contexts. According to Rancière, social inequalities are in large part a result of this sensible distribution. A key implication of this idea is that art can be understood to be directly political on the level of the sensible (rather than indirectly, as simply representing ideas about social and political issues). Rancière’s politics is one of a non-utopian ideal of democratic emancipation, understood as the constant process of intervening in the current order to broaden spaces of participation and to open potentials of inclusion and participation where these are closed to parts of the community through the existing distribution of the sensible. Art can play an important political role by intervening in the existing order of distributions and helping to redistribute the sensible.
Rancière has also made a notable contribution to aesthetics in contesting the category of ‘modernism’, which has dominated much of the discourse around art history and aesthetic theory in the early 21st century. According to Rancière, modernism attempts to impose a single meaning and a single historical narrative on the course of developments in the arts, a course which he sees as more complex, involving multiple meanings and temporalities. Moreover, modernism abstracts developments in the arts from other social and cultural forms of collective experience, which, on the contrary, Rancière sees as co-determining them. In place of categories which organise artistic developments according to a simple linear historical progression, Rancière proposes three ‘regimes’ of the arts. These regimes operate to some degree in a historically periodising fashion—as different regimes have predominated in different historical periods—but they also complicate and cut across such periodization. This is because they are not most fundamentally historical categories but, rather, ways that art is thought to operate or be significant, which can function in any historical period. Significantly, more than one regime of art can be operative at a single time. These regimes of art are 1. the ethical regime of images; 2. the representative (or poetic) regime of art; and 3. the aesthetic regime of art.
The ethical regime of images predominated in Ancient Greece and is exemplified with Plato’s discussion of images. Art does not emerge as a category here. Images are understood in relation to their effect on the ethos, or mode of behaviour, of members of the community, and they are interrogated according to their origin and their end, function, or purpose. In this regime, there are images which are thought to be truer or falser and to have a beneficial or detrimental effect on the ethical community. The representative regime of art predominated from the Renaissance to the nineteenth century. Here the idea of not just art but of a system of the arts emerged. Arts were thought of in terms of poetics; that is, sets of rules which determine the different forms of expression and arrange them in a hierarchy, and which also determine which forms of expression (arts, genres) are suitable for particular types of content. It is called the representative regime because this system of categorisation of the arts is organised around the key idea of representation, or mimesis, understood as a fit between form of expression and type of content. Finally, the aesthetic regime of the arts roughly corresponds with the experimentations more usually categorised with terms such as ‘modernism’ or ‘the avant-garde’. With this regime, the idea of art as something truly unique and singular emerges. However, this singularity is involved in a paradox, insofar as the rules for governing the arts characteristic of the representative regime also break down. In the aesthetic regime, art is asserted as a special kind of activity but, since anything can now count as art, there are no longer any criteria for distinguishing it from other forms of activity or production. While the aesthetic regime predominates in the contemporary world with its highly pluralist art scene, Rancière insists that all three regimes are still operative today to some degree.
- Adorno, Theodor W. Aesthetic Theory. Edited by Gretel Adorno and Rolf Tiedemann, translated by Robert Hullot-Kentor. London and New York: Continuum, 1997.
- Adorno’s major work on aesthetics.
- Benjamin, Walter. ‘The Work of Art in the Age of Mechanical Reproduction’. In Illuminations, edited by Hannah Arendt, translated by Harry Zorn, 211–44. London: Pimlico, 1999.
- The best known of the several versions of this highly influential essay, in which Benjamin develops the concept of artistic ‘aura’.
- Cazeaux, Clive, ed. The Continental Aesthetics Reader, 2nd ed. London and New York: Routledge, 2011.
- A collection of classic readings in aesthetics across the major traditions in continental philosophy, accompanied by insightful introductory essays.
- Deleuze, Gilles, and Félix Guattari. What Is Philosophy? Translated by Hugh Tomlinson and Graham Burchell. London: Verso, 1994.
- The chapter ‘Percept, Affect, and Concept’ condenses many aspects of Deleuze’s more extensive treatments of painting, film, and literature, and positions art in relation to philosophy and science.
- Derrida, Jacques. Acts of Literature. Edited by Derek Attridge. London and New York: Routledge, 1992.
- An edited collection of some of Derrida’s most important writings on literary topics, including essays on Mallarmé, Joyce, Kafka, Ponge, and Celan, and an interview with Derrida on literature.
- Derrida, Jacques. The Truth in Painting. Translated by Geoff Bennington and Ian McLeod. Chicago and London: University of Chicago Press, 1987.
- Derrida’s most well-known application of deconstructive strategies to aesthetic topics beyond literature. Contains the essay on Valerio Adami, ‘+R (Into the Bargain)’.
- Freud, Sigmund. Writings on Art and Literature. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1997.
- A selection of Freud’s writings on aesthetic topics collected from James Strachey’s Standard Edition, which however does not include the two important texts listed below.
- Freud, Sigmund. ‘Creative Writers and Day-Dreaming’. In Jensen’s ‘Gradiva’ and Other Works. Vol. 9 of The Standard Edition of the Complete Psychological Works of Sigmund Freud, edited by James Strachey, 141–54. London: Hogarth Press, 1959.
- Freud, Sigmund. ‘Leonardo da Vinci and a Memory of His Childhood’. In Five Lectures on Psycho-Analysis, Leonardo da Vinci, and Other Works. Vol. 11 of The Standard Edition of the Complete Psychological Works of Sigmund Freud, edited by James Strachey, 63–138. London: Hogarth Press, 1957.
- Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Truth and Method, 2nd revised ed. Translated by Joel Weinsheimer and Donald G. Marshall. London: Bloomsbury, 2013.
- Gadamer, Hans-Georg. The Relevance of the Beautiful and Other Essays. Edited by Robert Bernasconi, translated by Nicholas Walker. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1986.
- Heidegger, Martin. Nietzsche: Volumes One and Two. Translated by David Farrell Krell. San Francisco: Harper Collins, 1991.
- Volume one, ‘The Will to Power as Art’, presents Nietzsche’s view of art as holding a privileged ontological status and a value higher than truth.
- Heidegger, Martin. ‘The Origin of the Work of Art’. In Off the Beaten Track, edited and translated by Julian Young and Kenneth Haynes, 1–56. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002.
- Heidegger’s most extensive, significant, and well-known contribution to aesthetics.
- Kearney, Richard and David Rasmussen, eds. Continental Aesthetics: Romanticism to Postmodernism: An Anthology. London: Wiley-Blackwell, 2001.
- A useful collection of classic readings, though unaccompanied by any guiding text.
- Lacan, Jacques. The Seminar of Jacques Lacan, Book XI: The Four Fundamental Concepts of Psychoanalysis. Edited by Jacques-Alain Miller, translated by Alan Sheridan. New York and London: W.W. Norton & Company, 1978.
- Transcripts of Lacan’s seminar delivered in 1964 and first published in French in 1973. Contains the most influential of Lacan’s work relating to aesthetics, ‘Of the Gaze as Object petit a.’ A problematic translation, but still the only one available.
- Lyotard, Jean-François. Discourse, Figure. Translated by Antony Hudek and Mary Lyton. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 2011.
- The definitive statement of Lyotard’s early aesthetics, which stages an encounter between structuralist, phenomenological, and psychoanalytic approaches.
- Lyotard, Jean-François. Writings on Contemporary Art and Artists. Edited by Herman Parret. Leuven: Leuven University Press, 2013.
- Extensive, though still not exhaustive, bilingual (French and English) collection of Lyotard’s writings on aesthetic topics.
- Merleau-Ponty, Maurice. The Merleau-Ponty Aesthetics Reader. Edited by Michael B. Smith. Evanston, Illinois: Northwestern University Press, 1993.
- Contains the essays ‘Cézanne’s Doubt’, ‘Indirect Language and the Voices of Silence’, and ‘Eye and Mind’, along with introductory essays on each and a collection of critical essays on Merleau-Ponty’s philosophy of art.
- Merleau-Ponty, Maurice. The Visible and the Invisible. Edited by Claude Lefort, translated by Alphonso Lingis. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1968.
- Merleau-Ponty’s final, unfinished book. Contains the chapter ‘The Intertwining—The Chiasm’, which outlines the ontology developed in relation to painting in ‘Eye and Mind.’
- Rancière, Jacques. Dissensus: On Politics and Aesthetics. Edited and translated by Steven Corcoran. London: Bloomsbury, 2010.
- A collection of some of Rancière’s most important essays on the relationship of politics and aesthetics.
- Rancière, Jacques. The Politics of Aesthetics. Edited and translated by Gabriel Rockhill. London: Bloomsbury, 2013.
- A brief, accessible introduction to some of Rancière’s most important ideas in aesthetics, such as the distribution of the sensible, the critique of ‘modernism’ as an aesthetic category, and the three regimes of art.
- Rancière, Jacques. Aisthesis: Scenes from the Aesthetic Regime of Art. Translated by Zakir Paul. London: Verso, 2013.
- Rancière’s most complete and definitive work on aesthetics to date.
University of Dundee