Applied Ethics

Under what conditions is an abortion morally permissible?  Does a citizen have a moral obligation to actively participate (perhaps by voting) in the democratic process of one’s nation (assuming one is living in a democracy)?  What obligations, if any, does one have to the global poor?  Under what conditions is female genital excision morally permissible?  If there are conditions under which it is morally wrong, what measures, if any, should be taken against the practice?  These are just some of the thousands of questions that applied ethicists consider. Applied ethics is often referred to as a component study of the wider sub-discipline of ethics within the discipline of philosophy. This does not mean that only philosophers are applied ethicists, or that fruitful applied ethics is only done within academic philosophy departments. In fact, there are those who believe that a more informed approach is best gotten outside of the academy, or at least certainly outside of philosophy. This article, though, will mostly focus on how applied ethics is approached by trained academic philosophers, or by those trained in very closely related disciplines.

This article first locates applied ethics as distinct from, but nevertheless related to, two other branches of ethics. Since the content of what is studied by applied ethicists is so varied, and since working knowledge of the field requires considerable empirical knowledge, and since historically the pursuit of applied ethics has been done by looking at different kinds of human practices, it only makes sense that there will be many different kinds of applied ethical research, such that an expert working in one kind will not have much to say in another. For example, business ethics is a field of applied ethics, and so too is bioethics. There are plenty of experts in one field that have nothing to say in the other. This article discusses each field, highlighting just some of the many issues that fall within each. Throughout the presentation of the different areas of applied ethics, some methodological issues continue to come up. Additionally, the other two branches of ethics are consulted in dealing with many of the issues of almost all the different fields. So, what may be a methodological worry for a business ethics issue may also be a worry for bioethical issues.

One particular kind of applied ethics that raises distinct concerns is bioethics. Whereas with other kinds of applied ethics it is usually implicit that the issue involves those who we already know to have moral standing, bioethical issues, such as abortion, often involve beings whose moral standing is much more contentious. Our treatment of non-human animals is another area of bioethical research that often hinges on what moral standing these animals have. As such, it is important that this article devote a section to the issues that arise concerning moral standing and personhood.

This article ends with a discussion of the role of moral psychology in applied ethics, and in particular how applied ethicists might appropriate social psychological knowledge for the purpose of understanding the role of emotion in the formation of moral judgments. Additionally, to what extent is it important to understand the role of culture in not only what is valued but in how practices are to be morally evaluated?

Table of Contents

  1. Applied Ethics as Distinct from Normative Ethics and Metaethics
  2. Business Ethics
    1. Corporate Social Responsibility
    2. Corporations and Moral Agency
    3. Deception in Business
    4. Multinational Enterprises
  3. Bioethics
    1. Beginning of Life Issues, including Abortion
    2. End of Life Issues
    3. Research, Patients, Populations, and Access
  4. Moral Standing and Personhood
    1. Theories of Moral Standing and Personhood
    2. The Moral Status of Non-Human Animals
  5. Professional Ethics
    1. What is a Profession?
    2. Engineering Ethics
  6. Social Ethics, Distributive Justice, and Environmental Ethics
    1. Social Ethics
    2. Distributive Justice, and Famine Relief
    3. Environmental Ethics
  7. Theory and Application
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Applied Ethics as Distinct from Normative Ethics and Metaethics

One way of categorizing the field of ethics (as a study of morality) is by distinguishing between its three branches, one of them being applied ethics. By contrasting applied ethics with the other branches, one can get a better understanding what exactly applied ethics is about. The three branches are metaethics, normative ethics (sometimes referred to as ethical theory), and applied ethics. Metaethics deals with whether morality exists. Normative ethics, usually assuming an affirmative answer to the existence question, deals with the reasoned construction of moral principles, and at its highest level, determines what the fundamental principle of morality is. Applied ethics, also usually assuming an affirmative answer to the existence question, addresses the moral permissibility of specific actions and practices.

Although there are many avenues of research in metaethics, one main avenue starts with the question of whether or not moral judgments are truth-apt. The following will illuminate this question. Consider the following claims:  ‘2+2=4’, ‘The volume of an organic cell expands at a greater rate than its surface area’, ‘AB=BA, for all A,B matrices’, and ‘Joel enjoys white wine.’  All of these claims are either true or false; the first two are true, the latter two are false, and there are ways in which to determine the truth or falsity of them. But how about the claim ‘Natalie’s torturing of Nate’s dog for the mere fun of it is morally wrong’?  A large proportion of people, and perhaps cross-culturally, will say that this claim is true (and hence truth-apt). But it’s not quite as obvious how this claim is truth-apt in the way that the other claims are truth-apt. There are axioms and observations (sometime through scientific instruments) which support the truth-aptness of the claims above, but it’s not so clear that truth-aptness is gotten through these means with respect to the torturing judgment. So, it is the branch of metaethics that deals with this question, and not applied ethics.

Normative ethics is concerned with principles of morality. This branch itself can be divide into various sub-branches (and in various ways):  consequentialist theories, deontological theories, and virtue-based theories. A consequentialist theory says that an action is morally permissible if and only if it maximizes overall goodness (relative to its alternatives). Consequentialist theories are specified according to what they take to be (intrinsically) good. For example, classical utilitarians considered intrinsic goodness to be happiness/pleasure. Modern utilitarians, on the other hand, define goodness in terms of things like preference-satisfaction, or even well-being. Other kinds of consequentialists will consider less subjective criteria for goodness. But, setting aside the issue of what constitutes goodness, there is a rhetorical argument supporting consequentialist theories:  How could it ever be wrong to do what’s best overall?  (I take this straight from Robert N. Johnson.)  Although intuitively the answer is that it couldn’t be wrong to do what’s best overall, there are a plentitude of purported counterexamples to consequentialism on this point – on what might be called “the maximizing component” of consequentialism. For example, consider the Transplant Problem, in which the only way to save five dying people is by killing one person for organ transplantation to the five. Such counterexamples draw upon another kind of normative/ethical theory – namely, deontological theory. Such theories either place rights or duties as fundamental to morality. The idea is that there are certain constraints placed against persons/agents in maximizing overall goodness. One is not morally permitted to save five lives by cutting up another person for organ transplantation because the one person has a right against any person to be treated in this way. Similarly, there is a duty for all people to make sure that they do not treat others in a way that merely makes them a means to the end of maximizing overall goodness, whatever that may be. Finally, we have virtue theories. Such theories are motivated by the idea that what’s fundamental to morality is not what one ought to do, but rather what one ought to be. But given that we live in a world of action, of doing, the question of what one ought to do creeps up. Therefore, according to such theories, what one ought to do is what the ideally virtuous person would do. What should I do?  Well, suppose I’ve become the kind of person I want to be. Then whatever I do from there is what I should do now. This theory is initially appealing, but nevertheless, there are lots of problems with it, and we cannot get into them for an article like this.

Applied ethics, unlike the other two branches, deals with questions that started this article – for example, under what conditions is an abortion morally permissible?  And, what obligations, if any, do we have toward the world’s global poor?  Notice the specificity compared to the other two branches. Already, though, one might wonder whether the way to handle these applied problems is by applying one of the branches. So, if it’s the case that morality doesn’t exist (or: moral judgments are not truth-apt), then we can just say that any claims about the permissibility of abortion or global duties to the poor are not true (in virtue of not being truth-apt), and there is therefore no problem; applied ethics is finished. It’s absolutely crucial that we are able to show that morality exists (that moral judgments are truth-apt) in order for applied ethics to get off the ground.

Actually, this may be wrong. It might be the case that even if we are in error about morality existing, we can nevertheless give reasons which support our illusions in specified cases. More concretely, there really is no truth of the matter about the moral permissibility of abortion, but that does not stop us from considering whether we should have legislation that places constraints on it. Perhaps there are other reasons which would support answers to this issue. The pursuit and discussion of these (purported) reasons would be an exercise in applied ethics. Similarly, suppose that there is no such thing as a fundamental principle of morality; this does not exclude, for one thing, the possibility of actions and practices from being morally permissible and impermissible/wrong. Furthermore, suppose we go with the idea that there is a finite list of principles that comprise a theory (with no principle being fundamental). There are those who think that we can determine, and explain, the rightness/wrongness of actions and practices without this list of non-fundamental principles. (We’ll look at this later in this article)  If this is the case, then we can do applied ethics without an explicit appeal to normative ethics.

In summary, we should consider whether or not the three branches are as distinct as we might think that they are. Of course, the principle questions of each are distinct, and as such, each branch is in fact distinct. But it appears that in doing applied ethics one must (or less strongly, may) endeavor into the other two branches. Suppose that one wants to come to the conclusion that our current treatment of non-human animals, more specifically our treatment of chickens in their mass production in chicken warehouses, is morally impermissible. Then, if one stayed away from consequentialist theories, they would have either a deontological or virtue-based theory to approach this issue. Supposing they dismissed virtue-theory (on normative ethical grounds), they would then approach the issue from deontology. Suppose further, they chose a rights-based theory. Then they would have to defend the existence of rights, or at least appeal to a defense of rights found within the literature. What reasons do we have to think that rights exist?  This then looks like a metaethical question. As such, even before being able to appeal to the issue of whether we’re doing right by chickens in our manufactured slaughtering of them, we have to do some normative ethics and metaethics. Yes, the three branches are distinct, but they are also related.

2. Business Ethics

Some people might think that business ethics is an oxymoron. How can business, with all of its shady dealings, be ethical?  This is a view that can be taken even by well educated people. But in the end, such a position is incorrect. Ethics is a study of morality, and business practices are fundamental to human existence, dating back at least to agrarian society, if not even to pre-agrarian existence. Business ethics then is a study of the moral issues that arise when human beings exchange goods and services, where such exchanges are fundamental to our daily existence. Not only is business ethics not something oxymoronical, it is important.

a. Corporate Social Responsibility

One important issue concerns the social responsibility of corporate executives, in particular those taking on the role of a CEO. In an important sense, it is stockholders, and not corporate executives (via their role as executives), who own a corporation. As such, a CEO is an employee, not an owner, of a corporation. And who is their employer?  The stockholders. Who are they, the CEO and other executives, directly accountable to?  The board of directors, representing the stockholders. As such, there is the view taken by what’s called stockholder theorists, that the sole responsibility of a CEO is to do what the stockholders demand (as expressed by the collective decision of the board of directors), and usually that demand is to maximize profits. Therefore, according to stockholder theory, the sole responsibility of the CEO is to, through their business abilities and knowledge, maximize profit. (Friedman, 1967)

The contesting viewpoint is stakeholder theory. Stakeholders include not just stockholders but also employees, consumers, and communities. In other words, anyone who has a stake in the operations of a corporation is a stakeholder of that corporation. According to stakeholder theory, a corporate executive has moral responsibilities to all stakeholders. Thus, although some corporate ventures and actions might maximize profit, they may conflict with the demands of employees, consumers, or communities. Stakeholder theory very nicely accounts for what some might consider to be a pre-theoretical commitment – namely, that an action should be assessed in terms of how it affects everyone involved by it, not just a select group based on something morally arbitrary. Stakeholder theorists can claim that the stakeholders are everyone affected by a business’s decision, and not just the stockholders. To consider only stockholders is to focus on a select group based on something that is morally arbitrary.

There are at least two problems for stakeholder theory worth discussing. First, as was mentioned above, there are conflicts between stockholders and the rest of stakeholders. A stakeholder account has to handle such conflicts. There are various ways of handling such conflicts. For example, some theorists take a Rawlsian approach, by which corporate decisions are to be made in accordance with what will promote the least well-off.  (Freeman, 2008)  Another kind of Rawlsian approach is to endorse the use of the veil of ignorance without appeal to the Difference Principle, whereby it might result that what is morally correct is actually more in line with the stockholders (Dittmer, 2010). Additionally, there are other decision making principles by which one could appeal in order to resolve conflict. Such stakeholder theories will then be assessed according to the plausibility of their decision making theories (resolving conflict) and their ability to achieve intuitive results in particular cases.

Another challenge of some stakeholder theories will be their ability to make some metaphysical sense of such entities as community, as well as making sense of potentially affecting a group of people. If a corporate decision is criticized in terms of it affecting a community, then we should keep in mind what is meant by community. It is not as if there is an actual person that is a community. As such, it is hard to understand how a community can be morally wronged, like a person can be wronged. Furthermore, if the decisions of a corporate executive are to be measured according to stakeholder theory, then we need to be clearer about who counts as a stakeholder. There are plenty of products and services that could potentially affect a number of people that we might not initially consider. Should such potential people be counted as stakeholders?  This is a question to be considered for stakeholder theorists. Stockholder theorists could even us this question as a rhetorical push for their own theory. 

b. Corporations and Moral Agency

In the media, corporations are portrayed as moral agents: “Microsoft unveiled their latest software”, “Ford morally blundered with their decision to not refit their Pinto with the rubber bladder design”, and “Apple has made strides to be the company to emulate”, are the types of comments heard on a regular basis. Independently of whether or not these claims are true, each of these statements relies on there being such a thing as corporations having some kind of agency. More specifically, given that intuitively corporations do things that result in morally good and bad things, it makes sense to ask whether such corporations are the kind of entities that can be moral agents. For instance, take an individual human being, of normal intelligence. Many of us are comfortable with judging her actions as morally right or wrong, and also holding onto the idea that she is a moral agent, eligible for moral evaluation. The question relative to business ethics is:  Are corporations moral agents?   Are they the kind of thing capable of being evaluated in such a way as to determine if they are either morally good or bad?

There are those who do think so. Peter French has argued that corporations are moral agents. It is not just that we can evaluate such entities as shorthand for the major players involved in corporate practices and policies. Instead, there is a thing over and above the major players which is the corporation, and it is this thing that can be morally evaluated. French postulates what’s called a “Corporate Internal Decision Structure” (CID structure), whereby we can understand a corporation over and above its major players as a moral agent. French astutely observes that any being that is a moral agent has to be capable of intentionality – that is, the being has to have intentions. It is through the CID structure that we can make sense of a corporation as having intentions, and as such as being a moral agent. (French, 1977). One intuitive idea driving CID structures as supporting the intentionality of corporations is that there are rules and regulations within a corporation that drives it to make decisions that no one individual within it can make. Certain decisions might require either majority or unanimous approval of all individuals recognized in the decision-making process. Those decisions then are a result of the rules regulating what is required for decision, and not any particular go ahead of any individual. As such, we have intentionality independent of any particular human agent.

But there are those who oppose this idea of corporate moral agency. Now, there are various reasons one might oppose it. In being a moral agent, it is usually granted that one then gets to have certain rights. (Notice here a metaethical and normative ethical issue concerning the status of rights and whether or not to think of morality in terms of rights respect and violation.)  If corporations are moral agents with rights, then this might allow for too much moral respect for corporations. That is, corporations would be entities that would have to have their rights respected, in so far as we’re concerned with following the standard thoughts of what moral agency entails – that is, having both obligations and rights.

But there are also more metaphysical reasons supporting the idea that corporations are not moral agents. For example, John Danley gives various reasons, many of them metaphysical in nature, against the idea that corporations are moral agents (Danley, 1980). Danley agrees with French that intention is a necessary condition for moral agency. But is it a sufficient condition?  French sympathizers might reply that even if  it is not a sufficient condition, its being a necessary condition gives reason to believe that in the case of corporations it is sufficient. Danley then can be interpreted as responding to this argument. He gives various considerations under which theoretically defined intentional corporations are nevertheless not moral agents. In particular, such corporations fail to meet some other conditions intuitively present with other moral agents, namely most human beings. Danley writes “The corporation cannot be kicked, whipped, imprisoned, or hanged by the neck until dead. Only individuals of the corporation can be punished” (Danley, 1980). Danley then considers financial punishments. But then he reminds us that it is individuals who have to pay the costs. It could be the actual culprits, the major players. Or, it could be the stockholders, in loss of profits, or perhaps the downfall of the company. And furthermore, it could be the loss of jobs of employees; so, innocents may be affected.

In the literature, French does reply to Danley, as well as to the worries of others. Certainly, there is room for disagreement and discussion. Hopefully, it can be seen that this is an important issue, and that room for argumentative maneuver is possible.

c. Deception in Business

Deception is usually considered to be a bad thing, in particular something that is morally bad. Whenever one is being deceptive, one is doing something morally wrong. But this kind of conventional wisdom could be questioned. In fact, it is questioned by Albert Carr in his famous piece “Is Business Bluffing Ethical?”  (Carr, 1968). There are at least three arguments one can take from this piece. In this section, we will explore them.

The most obvious argument is his Poker Analogy Argument. It goes something like this:  (1) Deception in poker is morally permissible, perhaps morally required. (2) Business is like poker. (3) Therefore, deception in business is morally permissible. Now, obviously, this argument is overly simplified, and certain modifications should be made. In poker, there are certain things that are not allowed; you could be in some serious trouble if it were found out what you were doing. So, for example, the introduction of winning cards slid into the mix would not be tolerated. As such, we can grant that such sliding would not be morally permissible. Similarly, any kind of business practice that would be considered sliding according to Carr’s analogy would also not be permissible.

But there are some obvious permitted kinds of deception involved in poker, even if it’s disliked by the losing parties. Similarly, there will be deceptive practices in business that, although disliked, will be permitted. Here is one objection though. Whereas, the loser of deception in poker is the player, the loser of deception in business is a wide group of people. Whether we go with stockholder theory or stakeholder theory, we are going to have losers/victims that had nothing to do with the poker/deceptive playing of the corporative executives. Employees, for example, could lose their jobs because of the deception of either corporate executive of competing companies or the bad deception of the home companies. Here is a response, though:  When one is involved in corporate culture, as employee for example, they take on the gamble that the corporate executives take on. There are other ways to respond to this charge, as well.

The second reason one might side with Carr’s deception thesis is based on a meta-theoretical position. One might take the metaethical position that moral judgments are truth-apt, but that they are categorically false. So, we might think that a certain action is morally wrong when in fact there is no such thing as moral wrongness. When we make claims condemning a moral practice we are saying something false. As such, condemning deception in business is really just saying something false, as all moral judgments are false. The way to reply to this worry is then through a metaethical route, where one argues against such a theory, which is called Error Theory.

The third reason one might side with Carr is via what appears to be a discussion, on his part, of the difference between ordinary morality and business morality. Yes, in ordinary morality, deception is not morally permissible. But with business morality, it is not only permissible but also required. We are misled in judging business practices by the standards of ordinary morality, and so, deception in business is in fact morally permissible. One response is this is:  Following Carr’s lead, one is to divide her life into two significant components. They are to spend their professional life in such a way that involves deception, but then spend the rest of their life, day by day, in a way that is not deceptive with their family and friends, outside of work. This kind of self looks very much like a divisive self, a self that is conflicted and perhaps tyrannical.

d. Multinational Enterprises

Business is now done globally. This does not just mean the trivial statement of global exchange of goods and services between nations. Instead, it means that goods and services are produced by other nations (often underdeveloped) for the exchange between nations that do not partake in the production of such goods and services.

There are various ways to define multiple national enterprises (MNE’s). Let us consider this definition, though: An MNE is a company that produces at least some of its goods or services in a nation that is distinct from (i) where it is located and (ii) its consumer base. Nike would be a good example of a MNE. The existence of MNE’s is motivated by the fact that in other nations, an MNE could produce more at lesser cost, usually due to the fact that in such other nations wage laws are either absent or such that paying employees in such countries is much less than in the host nation. As a hypothetical example, a company could either pay 2000 employees $12/hr for production of their goods in their own country or they could pay 4000 employees $1.20/hr in a foreign country. The cheaper alternative is going with the employment in the foreign country. Suppose an MNE goes this route. What could morally defend such a position?

One way to defend the MNE route is by citing empirical facts concerning the average wages of the producing nation. If, for example, the average way is $.80/hr, then one could say that such jobs are justified in virtue of providing opportunities to make higher wages than otherwise. To be concrete, $1.20 is more than $.80, and so such jobs are justified.

There are at least two ways to respond. First, one might cite the wrongness of relocating jobs from the host nation to the other nation. This is a good response, except that it does not do well in answering to pre-theoretical commitment concerning fairness:  Why should those in a nation receiving $12/hr be privileged over those in a nation receiving $1.20/hr?   Why do the $12/hr people count more than the $1.20/hr people?  Notice that utilitarian responses will have to deal with how the world could be made better (and not necessarily morally better). Second, one might take the route of Richard Miller. He proposes that the $1.20/hr people are being exploited, and it is not because they are doing worse off than they would otherwise. He agrees that they are doing better than they would otherwise ($1.20/hr is better than $.80/hr). It’s just that their cheapness of labor is determined according to what they would get otherwise. They should not be offered such wages because doing so exploits their vulnerability of already having to work for unjust compensation; being compensated for a better wage than the wage they would get under unjust conditions does not mean that the better wage is just (Miller, 2010).

3. Bioethics

Bioethics is a very exciting field of study, filled with issues concerning the most basic concerns of human beings and their close relatives. In some sense, the term bioethics is a bit ridiculous, as almost anything of ethical concern is biological, and certainly anything that is sentient is of ethical concern. (Note that with silicon based sentient beings, what I say is controversial, and perhaps false.)  Bioethics, then, should be understood as a study of morality as it concerns issues dealing with the biological issues and facts concerning ourselves, and our close relatives, for examples, almost any non-human animal that is sentient. This part of the article will be divided into three sections: beginning of life issues, including abortion; end of life issues, for example euthanasia; and finally, ethical concerns doing medical research, as well as availability of medical care.

a. Beginning of Life Issues, including Abortion

All of the beginning of life issue are contentious. There are four for us to consider:  abortion, stem-cell procurement and research, cloning, and future generations. Each of these big issues (they could be considered research fields themselves) are related to each other.

Let us start with abortion. Instead of asking ‘Is abortion morally permissible?’ a better question will be ‘Under what conditions is an abortion morally permissible?’. In looking at the conditions surrounding a particular abortion, we are able to get a better understanding of all of the possibly morally relevant considerations in determining permissibility/impermissibility. Now, this does not exclude the possibility of a position where all abortions are morally wrong. It’s just that we have to start with the conditions, and then proceed from there.

Up until just 40 or so years ago, the conventional wisdom, at least displayed in the academic literature, was that just so long as a fetus is a person (or counts morally), it would be morally wrong to abort it. Judith Thomson challenged the received wisdom by positing a number of cases that would show, at least as she argued, that even with a fetus being a person, with all of the rights we would confer to any other person, it would still be permissible to abort, under certain conditions (Thomson, 1971). So, for example, with her Violinist Case, it’s permissible for a pregnant woman to abort a fetus under the circumstances that she was raped, even with the granting that the aborted fetus is a full-fledged person. Three remarks should be made here. First, there are those who have questioned whether her case actually establishes this very important conclusion. Second, it should be recognized that it’s not completely clear what all of the points Thomson is making with her Violinist Case. Is she saying something fundamentally about the morality of abortion?  Or is she saying something fundamentally about the nature and structure of moral rights?  Or both?  Minimally, we should be sensitive to the fact that Thomson is saying something important, even if false, about the nature of moral rights. Third, and this is very important, Thomson’s Violinist Case, if successful, only shows the permissibility of abortion in cases where the pregnant woman was raped, where conception occurred due to non-consensual sex. But what about consensual sex?

Thomson does have a way to answer this question. She continues in her essay with another case, called Peopleseeds. (Thomson, 1971)  Imagine a woman (or, perhaps a man) who enjoys her days off in her house with the windows open. It just so happens that she lives in a world in which there are these things called peopleseeds, such that if they make their way into a house’s carpet, they will root and eventually develop, unless uprooted, into full-fledged people (perhaps only human infants). Knowing this, she takes precautions and places a mesh screen in her windows. Nevertheless, there are risks, in that it’s possible, and has been documented, that seeds come through the window. She places the screens in, and because she enjoys Saturdays with her windows open, she leaves her windows open (actually just one), thereby eventually allowing a seed to root, and there she has a problematic person growing. She then decides to uproot the seed, thereby killing the peopleseed. Has she done anything wrong?  Intuitively, the answer is no. Therefore, even in cases of pregnancy due to consensual sex, and with the consideration that the fetus is a person, it is morally permissible to abort it. It’s interesting, though, that very little has been said in the literature to this case; or, there has been very little that has caught on in such a way that is reflected in more basic bioethics texts. One way to question Thomson with this case is by noting that she is having us consult our intuitions about a world where its biological laws are different than ours; it is just not the case that we live in a world (universe) where this kind of fetal development can happen. Perhaps in the world in which this can occur, it would be considered morally wrong by such inhabitants of that world to kill such peopleseed fetuses. Or maybe not. It is, minimally, hard to know.

Thomson’s essay is revolutionary, groundbreaking, more-than-important, and perhaps ““true””. What is so important about it is the idea of arguing for the permissibility of abortion, even with fetuses being considered persons, just like us.  There are others who significantly expand on her approach. Frances Kamm, for example, does so in her Creation and Abortion. This is a sophisticated deontological approach to abortion. Kamm notices certain problems with Thomson’s argument, but then offers various reasons which would support the permissibility of aborting. She takes into consideration such things as third party intervention and morally responsible creation (Kamm, 1992).

Note that I have mentioned Kamm’s deontological approach, where the rights and duties of those involved matter. Also note that with a utilitarian approach, such things as rights and duties are going to be missing, and if they are there, it is only in terms of understanding what will maximize overall goodness/utility. According to utilitarianism, abortion is going to be settled according to whether policies for or against maximize overall goodness/utility. There is a third approach, though. This approach draws from the third major kind of ethical theory, namely virtue theory. In general, virtue theory says that an action is morally permissible if and only if it is what an ideally virtuous person would do. Such a theory sounds very intuitive.  Rosalind Hursthouse argues that it is through virtue theory that we can best understand the issues surrounding abortion. She, I think controversially, asks questions about the personal state under which a woman becomes pregnant. It is from her becoming-pregnant state that we are to understand whether her possible abortion is morally permissible. Perhaps a more generous reading of Hursthouse is that we need to understand where a woman is at in her life to best evaluate whether or not an abortion is morally appropriate for her (Hursthouse, 1991).

There are, of course, the downright naysayers to abortion. Almost all take the position that all fetuses are persons, and thereby, aborting a fetus is tantamount to (wrongful) murder. Any successful position should take on Thomson’s essay. Some, though, might bypass her thoughts, and just say that abortion is the killing of an innocent person, and any killing of an innocent person is morally wrong.

Let’s end, though, with a discussion of an approach against abortion that allows for the fetus to not be a person, and to not have any (supposed) moral standing. This is clever, as Thomson’s argument attempts to show that aborting a person is permissible, and this approach shows that aborting a non-person is impermissible. We see very quickly, though, that this argument is different than the potentiality argument against abortion. The potentiality argument says that some x is a potential person, and therefore the aborting of it is wrong because had x not been aborted, it would eventually had been a person.  This argument, on the other hand, does not appeal to potentiality, and furthermore, does not assume that the fetus is a person. Don Marquis argues that aborting a fetus is wrong on the grounds that explains the wrongness of any killing of people. Namely, what is wrong with killing a person?  It is that in killing a person, the person is being deprived of a future life. A future life contains quite a bit of things, including in general joy and suffering. In killing a fetus via abortion one is depriving it of a future life, even if it is not a person. It’s future life is just like ours; it contains joy and suffering. By killing it, you are depriving it of the same things that are deprived of us if we are killed. The same explanation of why it’s wrong to kill us applies to fetuses; therefore, it’s wrong to abort under all cases (with some exceptions) (Marquis, 1989).

Another beginning of life issue is stem cell research. Stem cell research is important because it provides avenues for the development of organs and tissues that can be used to replace those that are diseased for those suffering from certain medical conditions; in theory, an entire cardiac system could be generated through stem cells, as well as through all of the research required on stem cells in order to eventually produce successful organ systems. There are various routes by which stem cell lines can be procured, and this is where things get controversial. First, though, how are stem cells generally produced in general, in the abstract?  Answering this question first requires specifying what is meant by stem cells. Stem cells are undifferentiated cells, ones that are pluripotent, or more colloquially, ones that can divide and eventually become a number of many different kinds of cells – for example, blood cells, nerve cells, and cells specific to kinds of tissues, for example, muscles, heart, stomach, intestine, prostate, and so forth. A differentiated, non-pluripotent cell is no good for producing pluripotent cells; such a cell is not a candidate for stem cell lines.

And so, how are stem cells produced, abstractly?  Stem cells, given that they must come from a human clump of matter that is not no good, are extracted from an embryo – a cluster of cells that are of both the differentiated and undifferentiated (stem cell) sort. The undifferentiated, pluripotent cells are extracted from the embryo in order to then be specialized into a number of different kind of cells – for example, cells developing into cardiac tissue. Such extraction amounts to the destruction of the human clump of matter – that is, the destruction of the human embryo, and some claim that is tantamount to murder. More mildly, one could condemn such stem cell procurement as an unjustified killing of something that morally counts. Now, it is important to note that such opponents of stem cell line procurement, in the way characterized, will note that there are alternative ways to get the stem cell lines. They will point out that we can get stem cells from already existing adult cells which are differentiated, non-pluripotent. There are techniques that can then “non-specialize” them back into a pluripotent,  undifferentiated state, without having to destroy an embryo for procurement of stem cells; basically, we can get the stem cells without having to kill something, an embryo, that counts morally.

There are some very good responses to those who are opponents of stem cell procurement in the typical (embryo destruction) manner. Typically, they will resort to the idea that such destruction is merely a destruction of something that doesn’t morally count. The idea is that embryos, at least of the kind that are used and destroyed in getting stem cells, are not the kind of thing that morally counts. The sophistication of such embryos is such that they are very early stage embryos, comparable to the kinds of embryos one would find in the early stages of the first trimester of a natural pregnancy.

There are other considerations that proponents of typical stem cell procurement will appeal to. For example, they might give a response to certain slippery slope arguments against (typical) stem cell procurement (Holm, 2007). The main kind of slippery slope argument against stem cell research is that if we allow such procurement and research, then this leaves open the door to the practice of the cloning of full-scale human beings. A rather reasonable way of responding to this worry is two-fold:  If the cloning of full-scale human beings is not problematic, then this is not a genuine slippery slope as, in the words of one author, “there is no slope in the first place” (Holm, 2007). The idea is that, all other things equal, human cloning is not morally problematic, and there is therefore no moral worry about stem cell procurement causing human cloning to come about, as human cloning is not a morally bad thing. But suppose that human cloning (on a full scale) is morally problematic. Then proponents of stem cell procurement will then need to give reasons why stem cell procurement and research won’t cause/lead to human cloning, and there are plausible, but still controversial, reasons that can be given to support this defense. To summarize, there is a slope, but it is not slippery (Holm, 2007).

A third beginning of life issue, which follows quite nicely from the previous discussion, is that of human cloning. There are those who argue that human cloning is wrong, and for various reasons. One could first go with the repugnance route. It’s repugnant to create human beings through this route. One way to respond to this is by noting that it certainly would be different, at least for a period of time, but that such difference, perhaps resulting in the feeling of repugnance, is by itself no reason to think that the practice (of human cloning) is morally wrong. Furthermore, one might say that with any kind of moral progress, feelings of repugnance by some of the population does occur, but that such repugnance is just an effect of moral change; if the moral change is actual progress, then such repugnance is merely the reaction to a change which is actually morally good.

Another way in which cloning may be criticized is that it could lead to a Brave New World world. By cloning, we are controlling people’s destinies, in such a way that what we get is a dystopian result. The best response to this is that such a worry relies on a kind of genetic reductionism which is false. Are we merely the product of our genetic composition?  No. There are plenty of early childhood factors, as well as in general cultural/social factors, which explain the kind of people we are by the time we are adults. Of course, a Brave New World world is possible, but it is possibility is best understood in terms of all of the cultural and social factors that would have to be present to have such complacent and brain-dead people characterized in the book; they aren’t born that way – they are socialized that way. The mere genetic replication of people, through cloning, should be less of a worry, given that there are so many other factors, social, that are relevant in explaining adult behavior.

The second way to criticize human cloning is that it closes the open future of the resulting clone. By cloning a person, P1, we are creating P2. Given that P1 has lived perhaps 52 years, P2 then has knowledge of what her life will be like in the next 52 years. Suppose that the 52 year old writes a very self-honest autobiography. Then P2 now can read how her life will unfold. Once again, this objection to cloning relies on a very ridiculous way of looking at the narrative of a human life; it requires a very, very strong kind of genetic reductionism, and it flies in the face of the results of twin studies. (Note that a human clone is biologically a delayed human twin.)  So, the response to the open future objection can be summed up as this:  A human clone might have their future closed, but it would only be in virtue of anyone else’s future being closed, which would require lots of knowledge about social/cultural/economic knowledge of their future life. Given that these things are very unpredictable, as for everyone else, it’s safe to say that such human clones will not have knowledge of how their life will unfold; as such, they, just like anyone else, have an open future.

b. End of Life Issues

This section is primarily devoted to issues concerning euthanasia and physician-assisted suicide. There are of course other issues relevant to the end of life – for example, issues surrounding consent, often through examining the status of such things as advance directives, living wills, and DNR orders, but for space limits, we will only look at euthanasia and physician-assisted suicide. It will be very important to get a clear idea about what is meant with respect to euthanasia, suicide, and all of its various kinds. First, we can think of euthanasia as the intentional killing of another person, where the intention is to benefit that person by ending their life, and that it, in fact, does benefit their life  (McMahan, 2002). Furthermore, we can distinguish between voluntary, involuntary, and non-voluntary euthanasia. Voluntary is where the person killed consents to it. Involuntary is where the person actively expresses that they do not give their consent, or where consent was possible but where they were not asked. Non-voluntary is where consent is not possible – for example, the person is in a vegetative state. Another distinction is active versus passive euthanasia. Active euthanasia involves doing something to the person which then ends their life, for example, shooting them, or injecting them with a lethal does. Passive euthanasia involves denying assistance or treatment to the person that they would need to otherwise live. Here is an example that should illustrate the difference. Smothering a person with a pillow would be active, even if it technically denies them something they need to live – that is, oxygen. Refusing to continue a breathing device, by unplugging the person from the device, would be passive.

Suicide is the act of a person taking their own life. Most ways that we speak and think of suicide are in terms of it being non-assisted. But suppose that you have a friend who wants to end their own life, but doesn’t have the financial and technical means to do it in a way that she believes is as painless and successful as possible. If you give them money and knowledge in how to end their lives in this way, then you have assisted them in their suicide. Physicians are well-placed to assist others in ending their lives. Already, one could see how the distinction between physician-assisted suicide and voluntary active euthanasia can get rather blurred. (Imagine a terminally ill person whose condition is so extreme and debilitating that the only thing they can do to take part in the ending of their life is pressing a button that injects a lethal dose, but where the entire killing device is set up, both in design and construction, by a physician. Is this assisted suicide or euthanasia?)

Although as far as I know, no surveys have been done to support the following claim, one might think that the following is plausible:  Involuntary active euthanasia is the most difficult to justify, with non-voluntary active euthanasia following, and with voluntary active euthanasia following that; then it goes involuntary passive, non-voluntary passive, and then voluntary passive euthanasia in order from most difficult to least difficult to justify. It is difficult to figure out where physician-assisted suicide and non-assisted suicide would fit in, but it’s plausible to think that non-assisted suicide would be the easiest to justify, where this becomes trivially true if the issue is in terms of what a third party may permissibly do.

It appears then that, minimally, it is more difficult to justify active euthanasia than passive. Some authors, however, have contested this. James Rachels gives various reasons, but perhaps the best two are as follows. First, in some cases, active euthanasia is more humane than passive. For example, if the only way to end the life of a terminally ill person is by denying them life-supporting measures, perhaps by unplugging them from a feeding tube, where it will take weeks, if not months for them to die, then this seems less humane, and perhaps outright cruel, in comparison to just injecting them with a lethal dose. Second, Rachels thinks of the distinction between active and passive euthanasia as being based on the distinction between killing and letting die. Now, this way of basing the distinction between active and passive might be placed under scrutiny – recall that we earlier defined the distinction between actively doing something that ends one life and withholding life-assisting measures, as opposed to killing someone and merely letting them die (Rachels, 1975). But suppose that we go with Rachels in allowing the killing versus letting die distinction base the distinction between active and passive euthanasia. Then consider Rachels’ example as challenging the moral power of the distinction between killing and letting die:  Case 1 – A husband decides to kill his wife, and does so by placing a lethal poison in her red wine. Case 2 – A husband decides to kill his wife, and as he is walking into the bathroom to hand her the lethal dosed glass of wine, he notices her drowning in the bathtub. In case 1, the husband kills his wife, and in case 2, he merely lets her die. Does this mean that what he’s done in case 2 is less morally worse?  Perhaps we might even think that in case 2 the husband is even more morally sinister.

Although it appears to be difficult to justify, there are proponents of voluntary active euthanasia. McMahan is one such proponent who gives a rather sophisticated, incremental argument for the permissibility of voluntary active euthanasia. The argument starts with an argument that rational suicide is permissible, where rational suicide is ending one’s life when one believes that one’s life is not worth living, and it is the case that one’s life is not worth living. Then, McMahan takes the next “increment” and discusses conditions under which we would find it permissible that a physician aid someone in their rational suicide, by perhaps assisting them in the removal of their life support system; here, physician-assisted passive suicide is permissible. But then why is assisted passive suicide permissible but assisted active suicide impermissible?  As McMahan argues, there is no overriding reason why this is the case. In fact, there is a good reason to think assisted active suicide is permissible. First, consider that often people commit suicide actively, not passively, and the idea is that they want to be able to exercise control in how their life ends. Second, because one does not want to risk a failed suicide attempt, which could result in pain, humiliation, and disfigurement, one might find that they can meet their goal of death best by the assistance of another, in particular a physician. Finally, with physician-assisted active suicide being permissible, McMahan takes the next step to the permissibility of voluntary active euthanasia. So, suppose that it is permissible for a physician to design and construct an entire system where the person ending their life needs only to press a button. If the physician presses the button, then this is no longer assisted suicide and instead active euthanasia. As McMahan urges, how can it be morally relevant who presses the button (just so long as consent and intention are the same)?  Secondly, McMahan points out that some people will be so disabled by a terminal illness that they will not be able to press the button. Because they cannot physically end their life by physician-assisted active suicide, their only remaining option would then be deemed impermissible if voluntary active euthanasia is deemed impermissible, and yet those who could end their own lives still have a “permissible option” left open and available to them. On grounds of something like fairness, there is a further feature which speaks to the permissibility of voluntary active euthanasia just so long as physician-assisted active suicide is permissible (McMahan, 2002, 458-460).

c. Research, Patients, Populations, and Access

Access to, and quality of, health care is a very real concern. A good health care system is based on a number of things, one being medicine and delivery systems based on research. But research requires, at least to some extent, the use of subjects that are human beings. As such, one can see that ethical concerns arise here. Furthermore, certain populations of people may be more vulnerable to risky research than others. As such, there is another category of moral concern. There is also a basic question concerning how to finance such health care systems. This concern will be addressed in the sixth main section of this article, social ethics and issues of justice.

First, let’s start with randomized clinical trials (RCT’s). RCT’s are such that the participants of such studies don’t know whether they are obtaining the promising (but not yet certified) treatment for their condition. Informed consent is usually obtained and assumed in addressing the ethicality of RCT’s. Notice, though, that if the promising treatment is life-saving, and the standard treatment received by the control group is inadequate, then there is a basis for criticism of RCT’s. The idea here is that those who are in the control group could have been given the experimental, promising, and successful treatment, thereby most likely successfully treating their condition, and in the case of terminal diseases, saving their lives. Opponents of RCT’s can characterize RCT’s in these cases as condemning someone to death, arbitrarily, as those in the experimental group had a much higher likelihood of living/being treated. Proponents of RCT’s have at least two ways of responding. They could first appeal to the modified kind of RCT’s designed by Zelen. Here, those in the control group have knowledge of being in the group; they can opt out, given their knowledge of being assigned to the control group. A second, and more addressing, way of responding is by acknowledging that there is an apparent unfairness in RCT’s, but then one would say that in order to garner scientifically valid results, RCT’s must be used. Given that scientifically valid results here have large social benefits, the practice of using them is justified. Furthermore, those who are in control groups are not made worse off than they would be otherwise. If the only way to even have access to such “beneficial” promising, experimental treatments is through RCT’s, then those assigned to control groups have not been made worse off – they haven’t been harmed (For interesting discussions see Hellman and Hellman, 1991 and Marquis, 1999).

Another case (affecting large numbers of people) is this:  Certain medications can be tested on a certain population of people and yet benefit those outside the population used for testing. So, take a certain medication that can reverse HIV transmission to fetuses from mothers. This medication needs to be tested. If you go to an underdeveloped country in Africa to test it, then what kinds of obligations does the pharmaceutical company have to those participating in the study and those at large in the country upon making it available to those in developed nations like the U.S?  If availability to those in the research country is not feasible, is it permissible in the first place to conduct the study?  These are just some of the questions that arise in the production of pharmaceutical and medical services in a global context. (See Glantz, et. al., 1998 and Brody, 2002)

4. Moral Standing and Personhood

a. Theories of Moral Standing and Personhood

Take two beings, a rock and a human being. What is it about each such that it’s morally okay to destroy the rock in the process of procuring minerals but not okay to destroy a human being in the process of procuring an organ for transplantation?  This question delves into the issue of moral standing. To give an answer to this question is to give a theory of moral standing/personhood. First, some technical things should be said. Any given entity/being has a moral status. Those beings that can’t be morally wronged have the moral status of having no (that is, zero) moral standing. Those beings that can be morally wronged have the moral status of having some moral standing. And those beings that have the fullest moral standing are persons. Intuitively, most, if not all human beings, are persons. And intuitively, an alien species of a kind of intelligence as great as ours are persons. This leaves open the possibility that certain beings, which we would not currently know exist, could be greater in moral standing than persons. For example, if there were a god, then it seems that such a being would have greater moral standing than us, than persons; this would have us reexamine the idea that persons have the fullest moral standing. Perhaps, we could say that a god or gods were super-persons, with super moral standing.

Why is the question of moral standing important?  Primarily, the question is important in the case of non-human animals and in the case of fetuses. For this article, we will only focus on human animals directly. But before considering animals, let’s take a look at some various theories of what constitutes moral standing for a being. A first shot is the idea that being a human being is necessary and sufficient for being something with moral standing. Notice that according to this theory/definition, rocks are excluded, which is a good thing. But then this runs into the problem of excluding all non-human animals, even for example, primates like chimps and bonobos. As such, the next theory motivated would be this:  A being/entity has moral standing (moral counts/can be morally wronged) if and only if it is living. But according to this theory, things like plants and viruses can be morally wronged. A virus has to be considered in our moral deliberations in considering whether or not to treat a disease, and because the viral entities have moral standing; well, this is counterintuitive, and indicates that with this theory, there is a problem of being too inclusive. So, another theory to consider is one which excludes plants, viruses, and bacteria. This theory would be rationality. According to this theory, those who morally count would have rationality. But there are problems. Does a mouse possess rationality?  But even if one is comfortable with mice not having rationality, and thereby not counting morally, one might then have a problem with certain human beings who lack genuinely rational capacities. As such, another way to go is the theory of souls. One might say that what morally counts is what has a soul; certain human beings might lack rationality, but they at least have a soul. What’s problematic with this theory of moral standing is that it posits an untestable/unobservable entity – namely, a soul. What prohibits a virus, or even a rock, from having a soul?  Notice that this objection to the soul theory of moral standing does not deny the existence of souls. Instead, it is that such a theory posits the existence of an entity that is not observable, and which there cannot be a test for its existence.

Another theory, which is not necessarily true and which is not unanimously accepted as true, is the sentience theory of moral standing. According to this theory, what gives something moral standing is that it is something that is sentient – that is, it is something that has experiences, and more specifically has experiences of pain and pleasure. With this theory, rocks and plants don’t have moral standing; mice and men do. One problem, though, is that many of us think that there is a moral difference between mice and men. According to this theory, there is no way to explain how although mice have moral standing, human beings are persons (Andrews, 1996). It appears that to do this, one would have to appeal to rationality/intelligence. But as discussed, there are problems with this. Finally, there is another theory, intimately tied with sentience theory. We can safely say that most beings who experience pain and pleasure have an interest in the kinds of experiences that they have. There is, however, the possibility that there are beings who experience pain and pleasure but who don’t care about their experiences. So what should we say about those who care about their experiences?  Perhaps it is not their experiences that matter, but the fact that they care about their experiences. In that case, it looks like what matters morally is their caring about their experiences. As such, we should call this new theory “interest theory.”  A being/entity has moral standing if and only if it has interests (in virtue of caring about the experiences it has).

b. The Moral Status of Non-Human Animals

In the literature, though, how are non-human animals considered?  Are they considered as having moral standing?  Peter Singer is probably one of the first to advocate, in the academic literature, for animals as having moral standing. Very importantly, he documented how current agrarian practices treated animals, from chimps to cows to chickens (Singer, 1975). The findings were astonishing. Many people would find the conditions under which these animals are treated despicable and morally wrong. A question arises, though, concerning what the basis is for moral condemnation of the treatment of such animals. Singer, being a utilitarian, could be characterized as saying that treating such animals in the documented ways does not maximize overall goodness/utility. It appears, though, that he appeals to another principle, which can be called the principle of equitable treatment. It goes:  It is morally permissible to treat two different beings differently only if there is some moral difference between the two which justifies the differential treatment (Singer, 1975). So, is there a moral difference between human beings and cows such that the killing of human beings for food is wrong but the killing of cows is not?  According to Singer, there is not. However, we could imagine a difference between the two, and perhaps there is.

Another theorist in favor of non-human animals is Tom Regan. He argues that non-human animals, at least of a certain kind, have moral rights just as human animals do. As such, there are no utilitarian grounds which could justify using non-human animals in a way different than human animals. To be more careful, though, we could imagine a situation in which treating a human a certain way violates her rights but the same treatment does not violate a non-human’s rights. Regan supports this possibility (Regan, 1983). This does not change the fact that non-humans and humans equally have rights, but just that the content of rights will depend on their nature. Finally, we should note that there are certain rights-theorists who, in virtue of their adherence to rights theory, will say that non-human animals do not have rights. As such, they do not have moral standing, or at least a robust enough moral standing in which we should consider them in our moral deliberations as beings that morally count (Cohen, 1986).

5. Professional Ethics

a. What is a Profession?

Certain things like law, medicine, and engineering are considered to be professions. Other things like unskilled labor and art are not. There are various ways to try to understand what constitutes something as a profession. For the purposes of this article, there will be no discussion of necessary and jointly sufficient conditions proposed for something constituting a profession. With that said, some proposed general characteristics will be discussed. We will discuss these characteristics in terms of a controversial case, the case of journalism. Is journalism a profession?  Generally, there are certain financial benefits enjoyed by professions such as law, medicine, and engineering. As such, we can see that there may be a financial motivation on the part of some journalists to consider it to be a profession. Additionally, one can be insulated from criticism by being part of a profession; one could appeal to some kind of professional authority against the layperson (or someone outside that profession) (Merrill, 1974). One could point out, though, that just because some group desires to be some x does not mean that they are x (a basic philosophical point). One way to respond to this is that the law, medicine, and engineering have a certain esteem attached to them. If journalists could create that same esteem, then perhaps they could be regarded as professions.

But as Merrill points out, journalism seems to lack certain important characteristics shared by the professions. With the professional exemplars already mentioned, one has to usually take a series of professional exams. These exams test a number of things, one of them being the jargon of the profession. Usually, one is educated specifically for a certain profession, often with terminal degrees for that profession. Although there are journalism schools, entry into the practice of journalism does not require education in a journalism school, nor does it require anything like the testing involved in, say, the law. Furthermore, there is usually a codified set of principles or rules, even if rather vague and ambiguous, which apply to professionals. Perhaps journalists can appeal to such mottos as tell the truth, cite your sources, protect your sources, and be objective. But in addition to the almost emptiness of these motto’s, there is the problem that under interpretation, there is plenty of disagreement about whether they are valid principles in the first place. For example, if one wants to go with a more literal appeal to truth telling, then how are we to think of the gonzo journalism of Hunter Thomson?  Or with documentary making, there are some who believe that the documentarian should stay objective by not placing themselves in the documentary or by not assisting subjects. Notice here that although journalism may not be a profession, there are still ethical issues involved, ones that journalists should be mindful of. Therefore, even if journalism cannot be codified and organized into something that counts as a profession, this does not mean that there are not important ethical issues involved in doing one’s work. This should be no surprise, as ethical issues are abundant in life and work. 

b. Engineering Ethics

In this section, we will discuss engineering ethics for two purposes. One purpose is to use engineering ethics as a case study in professional ethics. More importantly, the second purpose is to give the reader some idea of some of the ethical issues involved in engineering as a practice.

One way to approach engineering ethics is by first thinking of it as a profession, and then given its features as a profession, examine ethical issues according to those features. So, for example, given that professions usually have a codified set of principles or rules for their professionals, one could try to articulate, expand, and flesh out such principles. Another way to approach engineering ethics is by starting with particular cases, usually of the historical as opposed to the hypothetical kind, and then draw out any moral lessons and perhaps principles from there. Accordingly, one would start with such cases as the Hyatt-Regency Walkway Collapse, the Challenger Space Shuttle Accident, and the Chernobyl and Bhopal Plant Accidents, just to name a few(Martin and Schinzinger, 2005).

The Challenger Space Shuttle Accident brings up a number of ethical issues, but one worth discussing is the role of engineer/manager. When one is both an engineer and also in upper or middle-level management, and when one has the responsibility as an engineer to report safety problems with a design but also has the pressure of project completion being a manager, (i) does one role trump the other in determining appropriate courses of action, and if so which one?; (ii) or are the two reconcilable in such a way that there really is no conflict?; (iii) or are the two irreconcilable such that inevitably assigning people to an engineer/manager role will lead to moral problems?

One philosophically interesting issue that is brought up by engineering is the assessment of safety and risk. What constitutes something being safe?  And what constitutes something being a risk?  Tversky and Kahneman (Tversky and Kahneman, 1981) famously showed that in certain cases, where risk-assessment is made, most people will prefer one option over another even when the expected value of both options are identical. What could explain this?  One explanation appeals to the idea that people are able to appropriately think about risk in a way that is not capturable by standard risk-cost-benefit analyses. Another explanation is that most people are in error and that their basing one preference over another is founded on an illusion concerning risk. With either interpretation/explanation determining risk is important, and understanding risk is then important in determining the safety of a product/design option. It is of great ethical concern that engineers be concerned with producing safe products, and thereby identifying and assessing properly the risks of such products.

There are also concerns with respect to what kinds of projects engineers should participate in. Should they participate in the development of weaponry?  If so, what kind of weapon production is morally permissible?  Furthermore, to what extent should engineers be concerned with the environment in proposing products and their designs?  Should engineers as professionals work to make products that are demanded by the market?  If there are competing claims to a service/product that cannot be explained in terms of market demand, then to what extent do engineers have a responsibility to their corporate employers, if their corporate employers require production design for things that run counter to what’s demanded by those “outside of” the market?  Let us be concrete with an unfortunately hypothetical example. Suppose you have a corporation called GlobalCyber Initiatives, with the motto: making the world globally connected from the ground up. And suppose that your company has a contract in a country with limited cell towers. Wealthy business owners of that country complain that their middle-level manager would like a processing upgrade to their hand-held devices so that they can access more quickly the cell towers (which are conveniently placed next to factories). Your company could provide that upgrade. But you, as lead in R&D, have been working on instead providing upgrades to PC’s, so that these PC’s can be used in remote, rural areas that have no/limited access to cell towers. With your upgrade, PC’s could be sold to the country in question for use in local libraries. The contract with the business owners would be more lucrative (slightly) but a contract with that country’s government, which is willing to participate, would do much more good for that country, at both the overall level, and also specifically for the very many people throughout the very rural country. What should you do as lead of the R&D?  How far should you be concerned?  How far should you be pushy in making the government contract come about?  Or should you not be concerned at all?

These questions are supposed to highlight how engineering ethics thought of merely as an ethic of how to be a good employee is perhaps too limiting, and how engineering as a profession might have a responsibility to grapple with what the purposes of it, as a profession, are supposed to be. As such, this then highlights how framing the purposes of a profession is inherently ethical, insofar as professions are to be responsive to the values of those that they serve.

6. Social Ethics, Distributive Justice, and Environmental Ethics

This section is an oddity, but due to space limitations, is the best way to structure an article like this. First of all, take something like “social ethics”. In some sense, all ethics is social, as it deals with human beings and other social creatures. Nevertheless, some people think that certain moral issues apply only to our private lives while we are behind closed doors. For example, is masturbation morally wrong?  Or, is homosexual sex morally wrong?   One way such questions are viewed is that, in a sense, they are not simple private questions, but inherently social. For example with homosexual sex, since sex is also a public phenomenon in some way, and sense the expression of sexual orientation is certainly public, there is definitely a way of understanding even this issue as public and therefore social. Perhaps the main point that needs to be emphasized is that when I say social I mean those issues that need to be understood obviously in a public, social way, and which cannot be easily subsumed under one of the other sub-disciplines discussed above.

Another reason this section is an oddity is that the topic of distributive justice is often thought of as one properly falling within the discipline of political philosophy, and not applied ethics. One of various reasons for including a section on it is that often distributive justice is talked about directly and indirectly in business ethics courses, as well as in courses discussing the allocation of health care resources (which may be included in a bioethics course). Another reason for inclusion is that famine relief is an applied ethical topic, and distributive justice, in a global context, obviously relates to famine relief. Finally, this section is an oddity because here environmental ethics only gets a subsection of this encyclopedia article and not an entire section, like equally important fields like bioethics or business ethics. The justification, though, for this is (i) space limitations and (ii) that various important moral considerations involving the environment are discussed within the context of bioethics, business ethics, and moral standing.

a. Social Ethics

To start with, perhaps some not-as-controversial (compared to earlier times) topics that fall within social ethics are affirmative action and smoking bans. The discussions involved with these topics are rich in discussion of such moral notions as fairness, benefits, appropriation of scarce resources, liberty, property rights, paternalism, and consent.

Other issues have to do with appropriating the still very real gender differences in wealth, responsibilities, social roles, and employment opportunities. How are these differences to be understood?  Obviously not because such differences are deserved. Given this, such differences need to either be morally justified (doubtful) or morally rectified, and so, if they can’t be justified, then such differences should be morally eliminated/rectified. Very good work can be done on understanding how to do this in a way that does not create further moral problems. Additionally, work on the visibility of transgendered persons is important, and how transgendered persons can be incorporated into the modern life of working in corporations, government, education, or industry, living in predominantly non-transgendered communities and networks of families with more typical gender narratives, and doing this all in a way that respects the personhood of transgendered persons.

b. Distributive Justice, and Famine Relief

The term distributive justice is misleading in so far as justice is usually thought in terms of punitive justice. Punitive justice deals with determining the guilt or innocence of actions on the part of defendants, as well as just punishments of those found guilty of crimes. Distributive justice on the other hand deals with something related but yet much different. Take a society, or group of societies, and consider a limited number of resources, goods, and services. The question arises about how those resources, goods, and services should be distributed across individuals of such societies. Furthermore, there is the question about what kind of organization, or centralizing power, should be set up to deal with distribution of such goods (short for goods, resources, and services); let’s call such organizations which centralize power governments.

In this subsection, we will examine some very simplified characterizations to the question of distribution of goods, and subsequent questions of government. We will first cover a rather generic list of positions on distributive justice and government, and then proceed to a discussion of distributive justice and famine relief. Finally, we will discuss a number of more contemporary approaches to distributive justice, leaving it open to how each of these approaches would handle the issue of famine relief.

Anarchism is a position in which no such government is justified. As such, there is no centralizing power that distributes goods. Libertarianism is the position that says that government is justified in so far as it is a centralizing power used to enforce taxation for the purpose of enforcing person’s property rights. This kind of theory of distributive justice emphasizes a minimal form of government for the purpose of protecting and enforcing the rights of individuals to their property. Any kind of theory that advocates any further kind of government for purposes other than enforcement of property rights might be called socialist, but to be more informative, it will help to distinguish between at least three theories of distributive justice that might be called socialist. First, we might have those who care about equality. Egalitarian theories will emphasize that government exists to enforce taxation to redistribute wealth to make things as equal as possible between people in terms of their well-being. Bare-minimum theories will instead specify some bare minimum needed for any citizen/individual to minimally do well (perhaps have a life worth living). Government is then to specify policies, usually through taxation, in order to make sure that the bare minimum is met for all. Finally, we have meritocracy theories, and in theory, these may not count as socialist. The reason for this is that we could imagine a society in which there are people that do not merit the help which would be given to them through redistributive taxation. In another sense, however, it is socialist in that we can easily imagine societies where there are people who merit a certain amount of goods, and yet do not have them, and such people, according to the theory of merit, would be entitled to goods through taxation on others.

The debate concerning theories of distributive justice is easily in the 10′s of thousands of pages.  Instead of going into the debates, we should, for the purpose of applied ethics, go on to how distributive justice applies to famine relief, easily something within applied ethics. Peter Singer takes a position on famine relief in which it is morally required of those in developed nations to assist those experiencing famine (usually in underdeveloped nations)  (Singer, 1999). If we take such theories of distributive justice as applying across borders, then it is rather apparent that Singer rejects the libertarian paradigm, whereby taxation is not justified for anything other than protection of property rights. Singer instead is a utilitarian, where his justification has to do with producing overall goodness. Libertarians on the other hand will allow for the justice of actions and polices which do not produce the most overall goodness. It is not quite clear what socialist position Singer takes, but no matter.. It is obvious that he argues from a perspective that is not libertarian. In fact, he uses an example from Peter Unger to make his point, which is obviously not libertarian. The example (modified):  Imagine someone who has invested some of her wealth in some object (a car, for example) that is then the only thing that can prevent some innocent person from dying; the object will be destroyed in saving their life. Suppose that the person decides not to allow her object from being destroyed, thereby allowing the other (innocent) person to die. Has the object (car) owner done something wrong?  Intuitively, yes. Well, as Singer points out, so has anyone in the developed world, with enough money, in not giving to those experiencing famine relief; they have let those suffering people die. One such response is libertarian, Jan Narveson being an exemplar here (Narveson, 1993). Here, we have to make a difference between charity and justice. According to Narveson, it would charitable (and a morally good thing) for one to give up some of their wealth or the saving object, but doing so is not required by justice. Libertarians in general have even more sophisticated responses to Singer, but that will not concern us here, as it can be seen how there is a disagreement on something important like famine relief, based on differences in political principles, or theories of distributive justice.

As discussed earlier in this subsection, libertarian theories were contrasted with socialist positions, where socialist is not to be confused with how it is used in the rhetoric of most media. The earliest of the influential socialist theories is proposed by John Rawls (Rawls, 1971).  Rawls is more properly an egalitarian theorist, who does allow for inequalities just so far as they improve the least-advantaged in the best possible way, and in a way that does not compromise basic civil liberties. There have been reactions to his views, though. For example, his Harvard colleague, Robert Nozick, takes a libertarian perspective, where he argues that the kinds of distributive policies endorsed by Rawls infringe on basic rights (and entitlements) of persons – basically, equality, as Rawls visions, encroaches on liberty (Nozick, 1974). On the other end of the spectrum, there are those like Kai Nielson who argue that Rawls does not go far enough. Basically, the equality Rawls argues for, according to Nielson, will still allow for too much inequality, where many perhaps will be left without the basic things needed to be treated equally and to have basic equal opportunities. For other post-Rawlsian critiques and general theories, consult the works of Michael Sandel, Martha Nussbaum (a student of Rawls), Thomas Pogge (a student of Rawls), and Michael Boylan. 

c. Environmental Ethics

This subsection will be very brief, as some of the issues have already been discussed. Some things, however, should be said about how environmental ethics can be understood in a way that is foundational, independent of business ethics, bioethics, and engineering ethics.

First of all, there is the question of what status the environment has independent of human beings. Does the environment have value if human beings do not exist, and would never exist?   There are actually some who give the answer yes, and not just because there would be other sentient beings. Suppose, then, that we have an environment with no sentient beings, and which will never progress into having sentient beings. Does such an environment still matter?  Yes, according to some. But even if an environment matters in the context of either actual or potential sentient beings, there are those who defend such an idea, but do so without thinking that primarily what matters is sentient beings.

Another way to categorize positions concerning the status of the environment is by differentiating those who advocate anthropocentrism from those who advocate a non-anthropocentric position. This debate is not merely semantic, nor is it merely academic, nor is it something trivial. It’s a question of value, and the role of human beings in helping or destroying things of (perhaps) value, independent of the status of human beings having value. To be more concrete, suppose that the environment of the Earth had intrinsic value, and value independently of human beings. Suppose then that human beings, as a collective, destroyed not only themselves but the Earth. Then, by almost definition, they have destroyed something of intrinsic value. Those who care about things with value, especially intrinsic value, should be rather concerned about this possibility (Here, consult: Keller, 2010; Elliot, 1996; Rolston, 2012; Callicot, 1994).

Many moral issues concerning the environment, though, can be seriously considered going with the two above options – that is, whether or not the environment (under which humans exist) matter if human beings do not exist. Even if one does not consider one of the two above options, it is hard to deny that the environment morally matters in a serious way. Perhaps such ways to consider the importance is through the study of how business and engineering affects the environment.

7. Theory and Application

One might still worry about the status of applied ethics for the reason that it is not quite clear what the methodology/formula is for determining the permissibility of any given action/practice. Such a worry is justified, indeed. The reason for the justification of skepticism here is that there are multiple approaches to determining the permissibility of actions/practices.

One such approach is very much top-down. The approach starts with a normative theory, where actions are determined by a single principle dictating the permissibility/impermissibility (rightness/wrongness) of actions/practices. The idea is that you start with something like utilitarianism (permissible just in case it maximizes overall goodness), Kantianism (permissible just in case it does not violate imperatives of rationality or respecting persons), or virtue theory (permissible just in case it abides with what the ideally virtuous person would do). From there, you get results of permissibility or impermissibility (rightness/wrongness).

Although each of these theories have important things to say about applied ethical issues, one might complain about them due to various reasons. Take utilitarianism, for example. It, as a theory, implies certain things morally required that many take to be wrong, or not required (for example, lynching an innocent person to please a mob, or spending ten years after medical school in a 3rd world country). There are also problems for the other two main kinds of theories, as well, such that one might be skeptical about a top-down approach that uses such theories to apply to applied ethical cases.

Another approach is to use a pluralist kind of ethical theory. Such a pluralist theory is comprised of various moral principles. Each of the principles might be justified by utilitarian, Kantian, or virtue theories. Or they may not. The idea here is that there are multiple principles to draw from to determine to the rightness/wrongness of any given action/practice within the applied ethical world. Such an approach sounds more than reasonable until another approach is considered, which will be discussed below.

What if, though, it was the case that some moral feature, of a purported moral principle, worked in such a way that it counted for the permissibility of an action in one case, case1, but counted against the permissibility of the same action in another case, case 2?  What should we say here?  An example would be helpful. Suppose that Jon has to hit Candy to get candy. Suppose that this counts as a morally good thing. Then the very same Jon hitting of Candy to get candy in a different contest could be a morally bad thing. This example is supposed to highlight the third theoretical possibility of moral particularism (Dancy, 1993).

To sum things up for applied ethics, it very much matters what theoretical approach one takes. Does one take the top-down approach of going with a normative/ethical theory to apply to specific actions/practices?  Or does one go with a pluralist approach?  Or does one go with a particularistic approach that requires, essentially, examining things case by case?

Finally, some things concerning moral psychology should be discussed. Moral psychology deals with understanding how we should appropriate actual moral judgments, of actual moral agents, in light of the very real contexts under which are made. Additionally, moral psychology tries to understand the limits of actions of human beings in relation to their environment, the context under which they act and live. (Notice that according to this definition, multicultural relativity of practices and actions has to be accounted for, as the differences in actions/practices might be due to differences in environments.)  Experiments from social psychology confirm the idea that how people behave is determined by their environment; for example, we have the Milgrim Experiment and the Stanford Prison Experiment. We might not expect people to act in such gruesome ways, but according to such experiments, if you place them in certain conditions, this will provoke ugly responses. Two reasons that these findings are important for applied ethics is:  (i) if you place persons in these conditions, you get non-ideal moral results, and (ii) our judgments about what to morally avoid/prevent are misguided because we don’t keep in mind the findings of such experiments. If we kept in mind the fragility of human behavior relative to conditions/environment, we might try get closer to eradicating such conditions/environments, and subsequent bad results.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Allhoff, Fritz, and Vaidya, Anand J. “Business in Ethical Focus”. (2008), Broadview.
  • Andrews, Kristei. “The First Step in Case for Great Ape Equality: The Argument for Other Minds.”  (1996), Etica and Animali.
  • Beauchamp, Tom, and Bowie, Norman. “Ethical Theory and Business.”  (1983), Prentice-Hall.
  • Boylan, Michael. “A Just Society.” (2004), Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Boylan, Michael. “Morality and Global Justice: Justifications and Applications.”  (2011), Westview.
  • Boylan, Michael   “Morality and Global Justice:  Reader.”  (2011), Westview.
  • Brody, Baruch. “Ethical Issues in Clinical Trials in Developing Countries.”  (2002) (vol. 2), Statistics in Medicine. (2002), John Wiley & Sons.
  • Callahan, Joan. “Ethical Issues in Professional Life.”  (1988), Oxford.
  • Callicott, J. Baird. “Earth’s Insights.”  (1994), University of California Press.
  • Carr, Albert Z. “Is Business Bluffing Ethical?” (1968), Harvard Business Review.
  • Chadwick, Ruth; Kuhse, Helga; Landman, Willem; Schuklenk, Udo; Singer, Peter. “The Bioethics Reader: Editor’s Choice.”  (2007), Blackwell.
  • Cohen, Carl. “The Case for the Use of Animals in Biomedical Research.”  (1986), New England Journal of Medicine.
  • Danley, John. “Corporate Moral Agency: The Case for Anthropological Bigotry”. (1980), Action and Responsibility: Bowling Green Studies in Applied Philosophy, vol. 2.
  • Elliot, Robert. “Environmental Ethics.”  (1996), Oxford.
  • Freeman, R. Edward. “A Stakeholder Theory of the Modern Corporation.”  (1994)
  • French, Peter. “Corporations as a Moral Person.”  (1979), American Philosophical Quarterly.
  • Friedman, Milton. “The Social Responsibility of Corporations is to Increase its Profits.”  (1970), New York Times Magazine.
  • Glantz, Leonard; Annas, George J;  Grodin, Michael A; “Mariner, Wendy K. Research in Developing Countries: Taking Benefit Seriously.”  (1998), Hastings Center Report.
  • Hellman, Samuel; Hellman, Deborah S. “Of Mice But Not Men:  Problems of the Randomized Clinical Trial.”  (1991), The New England Journal of Medicine.
  • Holm, Soren. “Going to the Roots of the Stem Cell Controversy.”  In The Bioethics Reader, Chawick, et. al. (2007), Blackwell.
  • Hursthouse, Rosalind. “Virtue Theory and Abortion.”  (1991), Philosophy & Public Affairs.
  • LaFollte, Hugh. “The Oxford Handbood of Practical Ethics.” (2003), Oxford.
  • Kamm, Francis M. “Creation and Abortion.” (1996), Oxford.
  • Keller, David R. “Environmental Ethics: The Big Questions.”  (2010), Wiley-Blackwell.
  • Mappes, Thomas, and Degrazzia, David. “Biomedical Ethics.”  6Th ed. (2006), McGraw-Hill.
  • Marquis, Don. “How to Resolve an Ethical Dilemma Concerning Randomized Clinical Trials”. (1999), New England Journal of Medicine.
  • Martin, Mike W; Schinzinger, Roland. “Ethics in Engineering.”  4Th ed. (2005), McGraw-Hill.
  • McMahan, Jeff. “The Ethics of Killing.”  (2002), Oxford.
  • Narveson, Jan. “Moral Matters.”  (1993), Broadview Press.
  • Nielsen, Kai. “Radical Egalitarian Justice: Justice as Equality.”  Social Theory and Practice, (1979).
  • Nozick, Robert. “Anarchy, State, and Utopia.”  (1974), Basic Books.
  • Nussbaum, Martha C. “Sex and Social Justice.”  (1999), New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Pogge, Thomas W. “An Egalitarian Law of Peoples.” Philosophy and Public Affairs, (1994)
  • Pojman, Louis P; Pojman, Paul. “Environmental Ethics.”  6Th ed. (2011), Cengage.
  • Prinz, Jesse. “The Emotional Construction of Morals.”  (2007), Oxford.
  • Rachels, James. “Ethical Theory 1: The Question of Objectivity.”  (1998), Oxford.
  • Rachels, James. Ethical Theory 2:  “Theories about How We Should Live”. (1998) , Oxford.
  • Rachels, James. “The Elements of Moral Philosophy.”  McGraw Hill.
  • Rachels, James. “The Right Thing to Do.”  McGraw Hill.
  • Rachels, James. “Passive and Active Euthanasia.”  1975, Journal of New England Medicine.
  • Rawls, John. “A Theory of Justice.”  (1971), Harvard.
  • Roston III, Holmes. “A New Environmental Ethics.”  (2012), Routledge.
  • Sandel, Michael J. “Liberalism and the Limits of Justice.”  (1982), New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Singer, Peter. “Practical Ethics.”  (1979), Oxford.
  • Singer, Peter. “Animal Liberation.”  (1975), Oxford.
  • Shaw, William H. “Business Ethics: A Textbook with Cases.”  (2011), Wadsworth.
  • Thomson, J.J. “In Defense of Abortion.” (1971), Philosophy & Public Affairs.
  • Unger, Peter. “Living High and Letting Die.”  (1996), Oxford.


Author Information

Joel Dittmer
Missouri University of Science and Technology
U. S. A.

Categories: Ethics