Animals and Ethics

What place should non-human animals have in an acceptable moral system? These animals exist on the borderline of our moral concepts; the result is that we sometimes find ourselves according them a strong moral status, while at other times denying them any kind of moral status at all. For example, public outrage is strong when knowledge of “puppy mills” is made available; the thought here is that dogs deserve much more consideration than the operators of such places give them. However, when it is pointed out that the conditions in a factory farm are as bad as, if not much worse than, the conditions in a puppy mill, the usual response is that those affected are “just animals” after all, and do not merit our concern.  Philosophical thinking on the moral standing of animals is diverse and can be generally grouped into three general categories: Indirect theories, direct but unequal theories, and moral equality theories.

Indirect theories deny animals moral status or equal consideration with humans due to a lack of consciousness, reason, or autonomy.  Ultimately denying moral  status to animals, these theories may still require not harming animals, but only because doing so causes harm to a human being’s morality.  Arguments in this category have been formulated by philosophers such as Immanuel Kant, René Descartes, Thomas Aquinas, Peter Carruthers, and various religious theories.

Direct but unequal theories accord some moral consideration to animals, but deny them a fuller moral status due to their inability to respect another agent’s rights or display moral reciprocity within a community of equal agents. Arguments in this category consider the sentience of the animal as sufficient reason not to cause direct harm to animals.  However, where the interests of animals and humans conflict, the special properties of being human such as rationality, autonomy, and self-consciousness accord higher consideration to the interests of human beings.

Moral equality theories extend equal consideration and moral status to animals by refuting the supposed moral relevance of the aforementioned special properties of human beings.  Arguing by analogy, moral equality theories often extend the concept of rights to animals on the grounds that they have similar physiological and mental capacities as infants or disabled human beings.  Arguments in this category have been formulated by philosophers such as Peter Singer and Tom Regan.

Table of Contents

  1. Indirect Theories
    1. Worldview/Religious Theories
    2. Kantian Theories
    3. Cartesian Theories
    4. Contractualist Theories
    5. Implications for the Treatment of Animals
    6. Two Common Arguments Against Indirect Theories
      1. The Argument From Marginal Cases
      2. Problems with Indirect Duties to Animals
  2. Direct but Unequal Theories
    1. Why Animals have Direct Moral Status
    2. Why Animals are not Equal to Human Beings
      1. Only Human Beings Have Rights
      2. Only Human Beings are Rational, Autonomous, and Self-Conscious
      3. Only Human Beings Can Act Morally
      4. Only Human Beings are Part of the Moral Community
  3. Moral Equality Theories
    1. Singer and the Principle of Equal Consideration of Interests
      1. The Argument from Marginal Cases (Again)
      2. The Sophisticated Inegalitarian Argument
      3. Practical Implications
    2. Regan and Animal Rights
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Anthologies
    2. Monographs
    3. Articles

1. Indirect Theories

On indirect theories, animals do not warrant our moral concern on their own, but may warrant concern only in so far as they are appropriately related to human beings. The various kinds of indirect theories to be discussed are Worldview/Religious Theories, Kantian Theories, Cartesian Theories, and Contractualist Theories. The implications these sorts of theories have for the proper treatment of animals will be explored after that. Finally, two common methods of arguing against indirect theories will be discussed.

a. Worldview/Religious Theories

Some philosophers deny that animals warrant direct moral concern due to religious or philosophical theories of the nature of the world and the proper place of its inhabitants. One of the earliest and clearest expressions of this kind of view comes to us from Aristotle (384-322 B.C.E.). According to Aristotle, there is a natural hierarchy of living beings. The different levels are determined by the abilities present in the beings due to their natures. While plants, animals, and human beings are all capable of taking in nutrition and growing, only animals and human beings are capable of conscious experience. This means that plants, being inferior to animals and human beings, have the function of serving the needs of animals and human beings. Likewise, human beings are superior to animals because human beings have the capacity for using reason to guide their conduct, while animals lack this ability and must instead rely on instinct. It follows, therefore, that the function of animals is to serve the needs of human beings. This, according to Aristotle, is “natural and expedient” (Regan and Singer, 1989: 4-5).

Following Aristotle, the Christian philosopher St. Thomas Aquinas (1225-1274) argues that since only beings that are rational are capable of determining their actions, they are the only beings towards which we should extend concern “for their own sakes” (Regan and Singer, 1989: 6-12). Aquinas believes that if a being cannot direct its own actions then others must do so; these sorts of beings are merely instruments. Instruments exist for the sake of people that use them, not for their own sake. Since animals cannot direct their own actions, they are merely instruments and exist for the sake of the human beings that direct their actions. Aquinas believes that his view follows from the fact that God is the last end of the universe, and that it is only by using the human intellect that one can gain knowledge and understanding of God. Since only human beings are capable of achieving this final end, all other beings exist for the sake of human beings and their achievement of this final end of the universe.

Remnants of these sorts of views remain in justifications for discounting the interests of animals on the basis of the food chain. On this line of thought, if one kind of being regularly eats another kind of being, then the first is said to be higher on the food chain. If one being is higher than another on the food chain, then it is natural for that being to use the other in the furtherance of its interests. Since this sort of behavior is natural, it does not require any further moral justification.

b. Kantian Theories

Closely related to Worldview/Religious theories are theories such as Immanuel Kant’s (1724-1804). Kant developed a highly influential moral theory according to which autonomy is a necessary property to be the kind of being whose interests are to count direclty in the moral assessment of actions (Kant, 1983, 1956). According to Kant, morally permissible actions are those actions that could be willed by all rational individuals in the circumstances. The important part of his conception for the moral status of animals is his reliance on the notion of willing. While both animals and human beings have desires that can compel them to action, only human beings are capable of standing back from their desires and choosing which course of action to take. This ability is manifested by our wills. Since animals lack this ability, they lack a will, and therefore are not autonomous. According to Kant, the only thing with any intrinsic value is a good will. Since animals have no wills at all, they cannot have good wills; they therefore do not have any intrinsic value.

Kant’s theory goes beyond the Worldview/Religious theories by relying on more general philosophical arguments about the nature of morality. Rather than simply relying on the fact that it is “natural” for rational and autonomous beings to use non-rational beings as they see fit, Kant instead provides an argument for the relevance of rationality and autonomy. A theory is a Kantian theory, then, if it provides an account of the properties that human beings have and animals lack that warrants our according human beings a very strong moral status while denying animals any kind of moral status at all. Kant’s own theory focused on the value of autonomy; other Kantian theories focus on such properties as being a moral agent, being able to exist in a reciprocal relation with other human beings, being able to speak, or being self-aware.

c. Cartesian Theories

Another reason to deny that animals deserve direct concern arises from the belief that animals are not conscious, and therefore have no interests or well-being to take into consideration when considering the effects of our actions. Someone that holds this position might agree that if animals were conscious then we would be required to consider their interests to be directly relevant to the assessment of actions that affect them. However, since they lack a welfare, there is nothing to take directly into account when acting.

One of the clearest and most forceful denials of animal consciousness is developed by Rene Descartes (1596-1650), who argues that animals are automata that might act as if they are conscious, but really are not so (Regan and Singer, 1989: 13-19). Writing during the time when a mechanistic view of the natural world was replacing the Aristotelian conception, Descartes believed that all of animal behavior could be explained in purely mechanistic terms, and that no reference to conscious episodes was required for such an explanation. Relying on the principle of parsimony in scientific explanation (commonly referred to as Occam’s Razor) Descartes preferred to explain animal behavior by relying on the simplest possible explanation of their behavior. Since it is possible to explain animal behavior without reference to inner episodes of awareness, doing so is simpler than relying on the assumption that animals are conscious, and is therefore the preferred explanation.

Descartes anticipates the response that his reasoning, if applicable to animal behavior, should apply equally well to human behavior. The mechanistic explanation of behavior does not apply to human beings, according to Descartes, for two reasons. First, human beings are capable of complex and novel behavior. This behavior is not the result of simple responses to stimuli, but is instead the result of our reasoning about the world as we perceive it. Second, human beings are capable of the kind of speech that expresses thoughts. Descartes was aware that some animals make sounds that might be thought to constitute speech, such as a parrot’s “request” for food, but argued that these utterances are mere mechanically induced behaviors. Only human beings can engage in the kind of speech that is spontaneous and expresses thoughts.

Descartes’ position on these matters was largely influenced by his philosophy of mind and ontology. According to Descartes, there are two mutually exclusive and jointly exhaustive kinds of entities or properties: material or physical entities on the one hand, and mental entities on the other. Although all people are closely associated with physical bodies, they are not identical with their bodies. Rather, they are identical with their souls, or the immaterial, mental substance that constitutes their consciousness. Descartes believed that both the complexity of human behavior and human speech requires the positing of such an immaterial substance in order to be explained. However, animal behavior does not require this kind of assumption; besides, Descartes argued, “it is more probable that worms and flies and caterpillars move mechanically than that they all have immortal souls” (Regan and Singer, 1989: 18).

More recently, arguments against animal consciousness have been resurfacing. One method of arguing against the claim that animals are conscious is to point to the flaws of arguments purporting to claim that animals are conscious. For example, Peter Harrison has recently argued that the Argument from Analogy, one of the most common arguments for the claim that animals are conscious, is hopelessly flawed (Harrison, 1991). The Argument from Analogy relies on the similarities between animals and human beings in order to support the claim that animals are conscious. The similarities usually cited by proponents of this argument are similarities in behavior, similarities in physical structures, and similarities in relative positions on the evolutionary scale. In other words, both human beings and animals respond in the same way when confronted with “pain stimuli”; both animals and human beings have brains, nerves, neurons, endorphins, and other structures; and both human beings and animals are relatively close to each other on the evolutionary scale. Since they are similar to each other in these ways, we have good reason to believe that animals are conscious, just as are human beings.

Harrison attacks these points one by one. He points out that so-called pain-behavior is neither necessary nor sufficient for the experience of pain. It is not necessary because the best policy in some instances might be to not show that you are in pain. It is not sufficient since amoebas engage in pain behavior, but we do not believe that they can feel pain. Likewise, we could easily program robots to engage in pain-behavior, but we would not conclude that they feel pain. The similarity of animal and human physical structures is inconclusive because we have no idea how, or even if, the physical structure of human beings gives rise to experiences in the first place. Evolutionary considerations are not conclusive either, because it is only pain behavior, and not the experience of pain itself, that would be advantageous in the struggle for survival. Harrison concludes that since the strongest argument for the claim that animals are conscious fails, we should not believe that they are conscious.

Peter Carruthers has suggested that there is another reason to doubt that animals are conscious Carruthers, 1989, 1992). Carruthers begins by noting that not all human experiences are conscious experiences. For example, I may be thinking of an upcoming conference while driving and not ever consciously “see” the truck in the road that I swerve to avoid. Likewise, patients that suffer from “blindsight” in part of their visual field have no conscious experience of seeing anything in that part of the field. However, there must be some kind of experience in both of these cases since I did swerve to avoid the truck, and must have “seen” it, and because blindsight patients can catch objects that are thrown at them in the blindsighted area with a relatively high frequency. Carruthers then notes that the difference between conscious and non-conscious experiences is that conscious experiences are available to higher-order thoughts while non-conscious experiences are not. (A higher-order thought is a thought that can take as its object another thought.) He thus concludes that in order to have conscious experiences one must be able to have higher-order thoughts. However, we have no reason to believe that animals have higher-order thoughts, and thus no reason to believe that they are conscious.

d. Contractualist Theories

Contractualist Theories of morality construe morality to be the set of rules that rational individuals would choose under certain specified conditions to govern their behavior in society. These theories have had a long and varied history; however, the relationship between contractualism and animals was not really explored until after John Rawls published his A Theory of Justice. In that work, Rawls argues for a conception of justice as fairness. Arguing against Utilitarian theories of justice, Rawls believes that the best conception of a just society is one in which the rules governing that society are rules that would be chosen by individuals from behind a veil of ignorance. The veil of ignorance is a hypothetical situation in which individuals do not know any particular details about themselves, such as their sex, age, race, intelligence, abilities, etc. However, these individuals do know general facts about human society, such as facts about psychology, economics, human motivation, etc. Rawls has his imagined contractors be largely self-interested; each person’s goal is to select the rules that will benefit them the most. Since they do not know who exactly they are, they will not choose rules that benefit any one individual, or segment of society, over another (since they may find themselves to be in the harmed group). Instead, they will choose rules that protect, first and foremost, rational, autonomous individuals.

Although Rawls argues for this conception as a conception of justice, others have tried to extend it to cover all of morality. For example, in The Animals Issue, Peter Carruthers argues for a conception of morality that is based largely on Rawls’s work. Carruthers notes that if we do so extend Rawls’s conception, animals will have no direct moral standing. Since the contractors are self-interested, but do not know who they are, they will accept rules that protect rational individuals. However, the contractors know enough about themselves to know that they are not animals. They will not adopt rules that give special protection to animals, therefore, since this would not further their self-interest. The result is that rational human beings will be directly protected, while animals will not.

e. Implications for the Treatment of Animals

If indirect theories are correct, then we are not required to take the interests of animals to be directly relevant to the assessment of our actions when we are deciding how to act. This does not mean, however, that we are not required to consider how our actions will affect animals at all. Just because something is not directly morally considerable does not imply that we can do whatever we want to it. For example, there are two straightforward ways in which restrictions regarding the proper treatment of animals can come into existence. Consider the duties we have towards private property. I cannot destroy your car if I desire to do so because it is your property, and by harming it I will thereby harm you. Also, I cannot go to the town square and destroy an old tree for fun since this may upset many people that care for the tree.

Likewise, duties with regard to animals can exist for these reasons. I cannot harm your pets because they belong to you, and by harming them I will thereby harm you. I also cannot harm animals in public simply for fun since doing so will upset many people, and I have a duty to not cause people undue distress. These are two straightforward ways in which indirect theories will generate duties with regard to animals.

There are two other ways that even stronger restrictions regarding the proper treatment of animals might be generated from indirect theories. First, both Immanuel Kant and Peter Carruthers argue that there can be more extensive indirect duties to animals. These duties extend not simply to the duty to refrain from harming the property of others and the duty to not offend animal lovers. Rather, we also have a duty to refrain from being cruel to them. Kant argues:

Our duties towards animals are merely indirect duties towards humanity. Animal nature has analogies to human nature, and by doing our duties to animals in respect of manifestations of human nature, we indirectly do our duty to humanity…. We can judge the heart of a man by his treatment of animals (Regan and Singer, 1989: 23-24).

Likewise, Carruthers writes:

Such acts [as torturing a cat for fun] are wrong because they are cruel. They betray an indifference to suffering that may manifest itself…with that person’s dealings with other rational agents. So although the action may not infringe any rights…it remains wrong independently of its effect on any animal lover (Carruthers, 1992: 153-54).

So although we need not consider how our actions affect animals themselves, we do need to consider how our treatment of animals will affect our treatment of other human beings. If being cruel to an animal will make us more likely to be cruel to other human beings, we ought not be cruel to animals; if being grateful to animal will help us in being grateful to human beings then we ought to be grateful to animals.

Second, there may be an argument for vegetarianism that does not rely on considerations of the welfare of animals at all. Consider that for every pound of protein that we get from an animal source, we must feed the animals, on average, twenty-three pounds of vegetable protein. Many people on the planet today are dying of easily treatable diseases largely due to a diet that is below starvation levels. If it is possible to demonstrate that we have a duty to help alleviate the suffering of these human beings, then one possible way of achieving this duty is by refraining from eating meat. The vegetable protein that is used to feed the animals that wealthy countries eat could instead be used to feed the human beings that live in such deplorable conditions.

Of course, not all indirect theorists accept these results. However, the point to be stressed here is that even granting that animals have no direct moral status, we may have (possibly demanding) duties regarding their treatment.

f. Two Common Arguments Against Indirect Theories

Two common arguments against indirect theories have seemed compelling to many people. The first argument is The Argument from Marginal Cases; the second is an argument against the Kantian account of indirect duties to animals.

i. The Argument From Marginal Cases

The Argument from Marginal Cases is an argument that attempts to demonstrate that if animals do not have direct moral status, then neither do such human beings as infants, the senile, the severely cognitively disabled, and other such “marginal cases” of humanity. Since we believe that these sorts of human beings do have direct moral status, there must be something wrong with any theory that claims they do not. More formally, the argument is structured as follows:

  1. If we are justified in denying direct moral status to animals then we are justified in denying direct moral status to the marginal cases.
  2. We are not justified in denying direct moral status to the marginal cases.
  3. Therefore we are not justified denying direct moral status to animals.

The defense of premise (1) usually goes something like this. If being rational (or autonomous, or able to speak) is what permits us to deny direct moral status to animals, then we can likewise deny that status to any human that is not rational (or autonomous, able to speak, etc.). This line of reasoning works for almost every property that has been thought to warrant our denying direct moral status to animals. Since the marginal cases are beings whose abilities are equal to, if not less than, the abilities of animals, any reason to keep animals out of the class of beings with direct moral status will keep the marginal cases out as well.

There is one property that is immune to this line of argument, namely, the property of being human. Some who adhere to Worldview/Religious Views might reject this argument and maintain instead that it is simply “natural” for human beings to be above animals on any moral scale. However, if someone does so they must give up the claim that human beings are above animals due to the fact that human beings are more intelligent or rational than animals. It must be claimed instead that being human is, in itself, a morally relevant property. Few in recent times are willing to make that kind of a claim.

Another way to escape this line of argument is to deny the second premise (Cf. Frey, 1980; Francis and Norman, 1978). This may be done in a series of steps. First, it may be noted that there are very few human beings that are truly marginal. For example, infants, although not currently rational, have the potential to become rational. Perhaps they should not be counted as marginal for that reason. Likewise, the senile may have a direct moral status due to the desires they had when they were younger and rational. Once the actual number of marginal cases is appreciated, it is then claimed that it is not counter-intuitive to conclude that the remaining individuals do not have a direct moral status after all. Once again, however, few are willing to accept that conclusion. The fact that a severely cognitively disabled infant can feel pain seems to most to be a reason to refrain from harming the infant.

ii. Problems with Indirect Duties to Animals

Another argument against indirect theories begins with the intuition that there are some things that simply cannot be done to animals. For example, I am not permitted to torture my own cat for fun, even if no one else finds out about it. This intuition is one that any acceptable moral theory must be able to accommodate. The argument against indirect theories is that they cannot accommodate this intuition in a satisfying way.

Both Kant and Carruthers agree that my torturing my own cat for fun would be wrong. However, they believe it is wrong not because of the harm to the cat, but rather because of the effect this act will have on me. Many people have found this to be a very unsatisfying account of the duty. Robert Nozick labels the bad effects of such an act moral spillover, and asks:

Why should there be such a spillover? If it is, in itself, perfectly all right to do anything at all to animals for any reason whatsoever, then provided a person realizes the clear line between animals and persons and keeps it in mind as he acts, why should killing animals brutalize him and make him more likely to harm or kill persons (Nozick, 1974: 36)?

In other words, unless it is wrong in itself to harm the animal, it is hard to see why such an act would lead people to do other acts that are likewise wrong. If the indirect theorist does not have a better explanation for why it is wrong to torture a cat for fun, and as long as we firmly believe such actions are wrong, then we will be forced to admit that indirect theories are not acceptable.

Indirect theorists can, and have, responded to this line of argument in three ways. First, they could reject the claim that the indirect theorist’s explanation of the duty is unsatisfactory. Second, they could offer an alternative explanation for why such actions as torturing a cat are wrong. Third, they could reject the claim that those sorts of acts are necessarily wrong.

2. Direct but Unequal Theories

Most people accept an account of the proper moral status of animals according to which the interests of animals count directly in the assessment of actions that affect them, but do not count for as much as the interests of human beings. Their defense requires two parts: a defense of the claim that the interests of animals count directly in the assessment of actions that affect them, and a defense of the claim that the interests of animals do not count for as much as the interests of human beings.

a. Why Animals have Direct Moral Status

The argument in support of the claim that animals have direct moral status is rather simple. It goes as follows:

  1. If a being is sentient then it has direct moral status.
  2. (Most) animals are sentient
  3. Therefore (most) animals have direct moral status.

“Sentience” refers to the capacity to experience episodes of positively or negatively valenced awareness. Examples of positively valenced episodes of awareness are pleasure, joy, elation, and contentment. Examples of negatively valenced episodes of awareness are pain, suffering, depression, and anxiety.

In support of premise (1), many argue that pain and pleasure are directly morally relevant, and that there is no reason to discount completely the pleasure or pain of any being. The argument from analogy is often used in support of premise (2) (see the discussion of this argument in section I, part C above). The argument from analogy is also used in answering the difficult question of exactly which animals are sentient. The general idea is that the justification for attributing sentience to a being grows stronger the more analogous it is to human beings.

People also commonly use the flaws of indirect theories as a reason to support the claim that animals have direct moral status. Those that believe both that the marginal cases have direct moral status and that indirect theories cannot answer the challenge of the Argument from Marginal Cases are led to support direct theories; those that believe both that such actions as the torture of one’s own cat for fun are wrong and that indirect theories cannot explain why they are wrong are also led to direct theories.

b. Why Animals are not Equal to Human Beings

The usual manner of justifying the claim that animals are not equal to human beings is to point out that only humans have some property, and then argue that that property is what confers a full and equal moral status to human beings. Some philosophers have used the following claims on this strategy: (1) only human beings have rights; (2) only human beings are rational, autonomous, and self-conscious; (3) only human beings are able to act morally; and (4) only human beings are part of the moral community.

i. Only Human Beings Have Rights

On one common understanding of rights, only human beings have rights. On this conception of rights, if a being has a right then others have a duty to refrain from infringing that right; rights entail duties. An individual that has a right to something must be able to claim that thing for himself, where this entails being able to represent himself in his pursuit of the thing as a being that is legitimately pursuing the furtherance of his interests (Cf. McCloskey, 1979). Since animals are not capable of representing themselves in this way, they cannot have rights.

However, lacking rights does not entail lacking direct moral status; although rights entail duties it does not follow that duties entail rights. So although animals may have no rights, we may still have duties to them. The significance of having a right, however, is that rights act as “trumps” against the pursuit of utility. In other words, if an individual has a right to something, we are not permitted to infringe on that right simply because doing so will have better overall results. Our duties to those without rights can be trumped by considerations of the overall good. Although I have a duty to refrain from destroying your property, that duty can be trumped if I must destroy the property in order to save a life. Likewise, I am not permitted to harm animals without good reason; however, if greater overall results will come about from such harm, then it is justified to harm animals. This sort of reasoning has been used to justify such practices as experimentation that uses animals, raising animals for food, and using animals for our entertainment in such places as rodeos and zoos.

There are two points of contention with the above account of rights. First, it has been claimed that if human beings have rights, then animals will likewise have rights. For example, Joel Feinberg has argued that all is required in order for a being to have a right is that the being be capable of being represented as legitimately pursuing the furtherance of its interests (Feinberg, 1974). The claim that the being must be able to represent itself is too strong, thinks Feinberg, for such a requirement will exclude infants, the senile, and other marginal cases from the class of beings with rights. In other words, Feinberg invokes yet another instance of the Argument from Marginal Cases in order to support his position.

Second, it has been claimed that the very idea of rights needs to be jettisoned. There are two reasons for this. First, philosophers such as R. G. Frey have questioned the legitimacy of the very idea of rights, echoing Bentham’s famous claim that rights are “nonsense on stilts” (Frey, 1980). Second, philosophers have argued that whether or not a being will have rights will depend essentially on whether or not it has some other lower-order property. For example, on the above conception of rights, whether a being will have a right or not will depend on whether it is able to represent itself as a being that is legitimately pursuing the furtherance of its interests. If that is what grounds rights, then what is needed is a discussion of the moral importance of that ability, along with a defense of the claim that it is an ability that animals lack. More generally, it has been argued that if we wish to deny animals rights and claim that only human beings have them, then we must focus not so much on rights, but rather on what grounds them. For this reason, much of the recent literature concerning animals and ethics focuses not so much on rights, but rather on whether or not animals have certain other properties, and whether the possession of those properties is a necessary condition for equal consideration (Cf. DeGrazia, 1999).

ii. Only Human Beings are Rational, Autonomous, and Self-Conscious

Some people argue that only rational, autonomous, and self-conscious beings deserve full and equal moral status; since only human beings are rational, autonomous, and self-conscious, it follows that only human beings deserve full and equal moral status. Once again, it is not claimed that we can do whatever we like to animals; rather, the fact that animals are sentient gives us reason to avoid causing them unnecessary pain and suffering. However, when the interests of animals and human beings conflict we are required to give greater weight to the interests of human beings. This also has been used to justify such practices as experimentation on animals, raising animals for food, and using animals in such places as zoos and rodeos.

The attributes of rationality, autonomy, and self-consciousness confer a full and equal moral status to those that possess them because these beings are the only ones capable of attaining certain values and goods; these values and goods are of a kind that outweigh the kinds of values and goods that non-rational, non-autonomous, and non-self-conscious beings are capable of attaining. For example, in order to achieve the kind of dignity and self-respect that human beings have, a being must be able to conceive of itself as one among many, and must be able to choose his actions rather than be led by blind instinct (Cf. Francis and Norman, 1978; Steinbock, 1978). Furthermore, the values of appreciating art, literature, and the goods that come with deep personal relationships all require one to be rational, autonomous, and self-conscious. These values, and others like them, are the highest values to us; they are what make our lives worth living. As John Stuart Mill wrote, “Few human creatures would consent to be changed into any of the lower animals for a promise of the fullest allowance of a beast’s pleasures” (Mill, 1979). We find the lives of beings that can experience these goods to be more valuable, and hence deserving of more protection, than the lives of beings that cannot.

iii. Only Human Beings Can Act Morally

Another reason for giving stronger preference to the interests of human beings is that only human beings can act morally. This is considered to be important because beings that can act morally are required to sacrifice their interests for the sake of others. It follows that those that do sacrifice their good for the sake of others are owed greater concern from those that benefit from such sacrifices. Since animals cannot act morally, they will not sacrifice their own good for the sake of others, but will rather pursue their good even at the expense of others. That is why human beings should give the interests of other human beings greater weight than they do the interests of animals.

iv. Only Human Beings are Part of the Moral Community

Finally, some claim that membership in the moral community is necessary for full and equal moral status. The moral community is not defined in terms of the intrinsic properties that beings have, but is defined rather in terms of the important social relations that exist between beings. For example, human beings can communicate with each other in meaningful ways, can engage in economic, political, and familial relationships with each other, and can also develop deep personal relationships with each other. These kinds of relationships require the members of such relationships to extend greater concern to other members of these relationships than they do to others in order for the relationships to continue. Since these relationships are what constitute our lives and the value contained in them, we are required to give greater weight to the interests of human beings than we do to animals.

3. Moral Equality Theories

The final theories to discuss are the moral equality theories. On these theories, not only do animals have direct moral status, but they also have the same moral status as human beings. According to theorists of this kind, there can be no legitimate reason to place human beings and animals in different moral categories, and so whatever grounds our duties to human beings will likewise ground duties to animals.

a. Singer and the Principle of Equal Consideration of Interests

Peter Singer has been very influential in the debate concerning animals and ethics. The publication of his Animal Liberation marked the beginning of a growing and increasingly powerful movement in both the United States and Europe.

Singer attacks the views of those who wish to give the interests of animals less weight than the interests of human beings. He argues that if we attempt to extend such unequal consideration to the interests of animals, we will be forced to give unequal consideration to the interests of different human beings. However, doing this goes against the intuitively plausible and commonly accepted claim that all human beings are equal. Singer concludes that we must instead extend a principle of equal consideration of interests to animals as well. Singer describes that principle as follows:

The essence of the Principle of Equal Consideration of Interests is that we give equal weight in our moral deliberations to the like interests of all those affected by our actions (Singer, 1993: 21).

Singer defends this principle with two arguments. The first is a version of the Argument from Marginal Cases; the second is the Sophisticated Inegalitarian Argument.

i. The Argument from Marginal Cases (Again)

Singer’s version of the Argument from Marginal Cases is slightly different from the version listed above. It runs as follows:

  1. In order to conclude that all and only human beings deserve a full and equal moral status (and therefore that no animals deserve a full and equal moral status), there must be some property P that all and only human beings have that can ground such a claim.
  2. Any P that only human beings have is a property that (some) human beings lack (e.g., the marginal cases).
  3. Any P that all human beings have is a property that (most) animals have as well.
  4. Therefore, there is no way to defend the claim that all and only human beings deserve a full and equal moral status.

Singer does not defend his first premise, but does not need to; the proponents of the view that all and only humans deserve a full and equal moral status rely on it themselves (see the discussion of Direct but Unequal Theories above). In support of the second premise, Singer asks us to consider exactly what properties only humans have that can ground such a strong moral status. Certain properties, such as being human, having human DNA, or walking upright do not seem to be the kind of properties that can ground this kind of status. For example, if we were to encounter alien life forms that did not have human DNA, but lived lives much like our own, we would not be justified in according these beings a weaker moral status simply because they were not human.

However, there are some properties which only human beings have which have seemed to many to be able to ground a full and equal moral status; for example, being rational, autonomous, or able to act morally have all been used to justify giving a stronger status to human beings than we do to animals. The problem with such a suggestion is that not all human beings have these properties. So if this is what grounds a full and equal moral status, it follows that not all human beings are equal after all.

If we try to ensure that we choose a property that all human beings do have that will be sufficient to ground a full and equal moral status, we seemed to be pushed towards choosing something such as being sentient, or being capable of experiencing pleasure and pain. Since the marginal cases have this property, they would be granted a full and equal moral status on this suggestion. However, if we choose a property of this kind, animals will likewise have a full and equal moral status since they too are sentient.

The attempt to grant all and only human beings a full and equal moral status does not work according to Singer. We must either conclude that not all human beings are equal, or we must conclude that not only human beings are equal. Singer suggests that the first option is too counter-intuitive to be acceptable; so we are forced to conclude that all animals are equal, human or otherwise.

ii. The Sophisticated Inegalitarian Argument

Another argument Singer employs to refute the claim that all and only human beings deserve a full and equal moral status focuses on the supposed moral relevance of such properties as rationality, autonomy, the ability to act morally, etc. Singer argues that if we were to rely on these sorts of properties as the basis of determining moral status, then we would justify a kind of discrimination against certain human beings that is structurally analogous to such practices as racism and sexism.

For example, the racist believes that all members of his race are more intelligent and rational than all of the members of other races, and thus assigns a greater moral status to the members of his race than he does do the members of other races. However, the racist is wrong in this factual judgment; it is not true that all members of any one race are smarter than all members of any other. Notice, however, that the mistake the racist is making is merely a factual mistake. His moral principle that assigns moral status on the basis of intelligence or rationality is not what has led him astray. Rather, it is simply his assessment of how intelligence or rationality is distributed among human beings that is mistaken.

If that were all that is wrong with racism and sexism, then a moral theory according to which we give extra consideration to the very smart and rational would be justified. In other words, we would be justified in becoming, not racists, but sophisticated inegalitarians. However, the sophisticated inegalitarian is just as morally suspect as the racist is. Therefore, it follows that the racist is not morally objectionable merely because of his views on how rationality and intelligence are distributed among human beings; rather he is morally objectionable because of the basis he uses to weigh the interests of different individuals. How intelligent, rational, etc., a being is cannot be the basis of his moral status; if it were, then the sophisticated inegalitarian would be on secure ground.

Notice that in order for this argument to succeed, it must target properties that admit of degrees. If someone argued that the basis of human equality rested on the possession of a property that did not admit of degrees, it would not follow that some human beings have that property to a stronger degree than others, and the sophisticated inegalitarian would not be justified. However, most of the properties that are used in order to support the claim that all and only human beings deserve a full and equal moral status are properties that do admit of degrees. Such properties as being human or having human DNA do not admit of degrees, but, as already mentioned, these properties do not seem to be capable of supporting such a moral status.

iii. Practical Implications

In order to implement the Principle of Equal Consideration of Interests in the practical sphere, we must be able to determine the interests of the beings that will be affected by our actions, and we must give similar interests similar weight. Singer concludes that animals can experience pain and suffering by relying on the argument from analogy (see the discussion of Cartesian Theories above). Since animals can experience pain and suffering, they have an interest in avoiding pain.

These facts require the immediate end to many of our practices according to Singer. For example, animals that are raised for food in factory farms live lives that are full of unimaginable pain and suffering (Singer devotes an entire chapter of his book to documenting these facts. He relies mainly on magazines published by the factory farm business for these facts). Although human beings do satisfy their interests by eating meat, Singer argues that the interests the animals have in avoiding this unimaginable pain and suffering is greater than the interests we have in eating food that tastes good. If we are to apply the Principle of Equal Consideration of Interests, we will be forced to cease raising animals in factory farms for food. A failure to do so is nothing other than speciesism, or giving preference to the interests of our own species merely because of they are of our species.

Singer does not unequivocally claim that we must not eat animals if we are to correctly apply the Principle of Equal Consideration of Interests. Whether we are required to refrain from painlessly killing animals will depend on whether animals have an interest in continuing to exist in the future. In order to have this interest, Singer believes that a being must be able to conceive of itself as existing into the future, and this requires a being to be self-conscious. Non-self-conscious beings are not harmed by their deaths, according to Singer, for they do not have an interest in continuing to exist into the future.

Singer argues that we might be able to justify killing these sorts of beings with The Replaceability Argument. On this line of thought, if we kill a non-self-conscious being that was living a good life, then we have lessened the overall amount of good in the world. This can be made up, however, by bringing another being into existence that can experience similar goods. In other words, non-self-conscious beings are replaceable: killing one can be justified if doing so is necessary to bring about the existence of another. Since the animals we rear for food would not exist if we did not eat them, it follows that killing these animals can be justified if the animals we rear for food live good lives. However, in order for this line of argumentation to justify killing animals, the animals must not only be non-self-conscious, but they must also live lives that are worth living, and their deaths must be painless. Singer expresses doubts that all of these conditions could be met, and unequivocally claims that they are not met by such places as factory farms.

Singer also condemns most experimentation in which animals are used. He first points out that many of the experiments performed using animal subjects do not have benefits for human beings that would outweigh the pain caused to the animals. For example, experiments used to test cosmetics or other non-necessary products for human beings cannot be justified if we use the Principle of Equal Consideration of Interests. Singer also condemns experiments that are aimed at preventing or curing human diseases. If we are prepared to use animal subjects for such experiments, then it would actually be better from a scientific point of view to use human subjects instead, for there would be no question of cross-species comparisons when interpreting the data. If we believe the benefits outweigh the harms, then instead of using animals we should instead use orphaned infants that are severely cognitively disabled. If we believe that such a suggestion is morally repugnant when human beings are to be used, but morally innocuous when animals are to be used, then we are guilty of speciesism.

Likewise, hunting for sport, using animals in rodeos, keeping animals confined in zoos wherein they are not able to engage in their natural activities are all condemned by the use of the Principle of the Equal Consideration of Interests.

b. Regan and Animal Rights

Tom Regan’s seminal work, The Case for Animal Rights, is one of the most influential works on the topic of animals and ethics. Regan argues for the claim that animals have rights in just the same way that human beings do. Regan believes it is a mistake to claim that animals have an indirect moral status or an unequal status, and to then infer that animals cannot have any rights. He also thinks it is a mistake to ground an equal moral status on Utilitarian grounds, as Singer attempts to do. According to Regan, we must conclude that animals have the same moral status as human beings; furthermore, that moral status is grounded on rights, not on Utilitarian principles.

Regan argues for his case by relying on the concept of inherent value. According to Regan, any being that is a subject-of-a-life is a being that has inherent value. A being that has inherent value is a being towards which we must show respect; in order to show respect to such a being, we cannot use it merely as a means to our ends. Instead, each such being must be treated as an end in itself. In other words, a being with inherent value has rights, and these rights act as trumps against the promotion of the overall good.

Regan relies on a version of the Argument from Marginal Cases in arguing for this conclusion. He begins by asking what grounds human rights. He rejects robust views that claim that a being must be capable of representing itself as legitimately pursuing the furtherance of its interests on the grounds that this conception of rights implies that the marginal cases of humanity do not have rights. However, since we think that these beings do have moral rights there must be some other property that grounds these rights. According to Regan, the only property that is common to both normal adult human beings and the marginal cases is the property of being a subject-of-a-life. A being that is a subject-of-a-life will:

have beliefs and desires; perception, memory, and a sense of the future, including their own future; an emotional life together with feelings of pleasure and pain; preference- and welfare-interests; the ability to initiate action in pursuit of their desires and goals; a psychological identity over time; and an individual welfare in the sense that their experiential life fares well or ill for them, logically independently of their utility for others, and logically independently of their being the object of anyone else’s interests (Regan, 1983: 243).

This property is one that all of the human beings that we think deserve rights have; however, it is a property that many animals (especially mammals) have as well. So if these marginal cases of humanity deserve rights, then so do these animals.

Although this position may seem quite similar to Singer’s position (see section III, part A above), Regan is careful to point to what he perceives to be the flaws of Singer’s Utilitarian theory. According to Singer, we are required to count every similar interest equally in our deliberation. However, by doing this we are focusing on the wrong thing, Regan claims. What matters is the individual that has the interest, not the interest itself. By focusing on interests themselves, Utilitarianism will license the most horrendous actions. For example, if it were possible to satisfy more interests by performing experiments on human beings, then that is what we should do on Utilitarian grounds. However, Regan believes this is clearly unacceptable: any being with inherent value cannot be used merely as a means.

This does not mean that Regan takes rights to be absolute. When the rights of different individuals conflict, then someone’s rights must be overriden. Regan argues that in these sorts of cases we must try to minimize the rights that are overriden. However, we are not permitted to override someone’s rights just because doing so will make everyone better off; in this kind of case we are sacrificing rights for utility, which is never permissible on Regan’s view.

Given these considerations, Regan concludes that we must radically alter the ways in which we treat animals. When we raise animals for food, regardless of how they are treated and how they are killed, we are using them as a means to our ends and not treating them as ends in themselves. Thus, we may not raise animals for food. Likewise, when we experiment on animals in order to advance human science, we are using animals merely as a means to our ends. Similar thoughts apply to the use of animals in rodeos and the hunting of animals.

See also Animal Ethics.

4. References and Further Reading.

a. Anthologies

  • Miller, H. and W. Miller, eds. Ethics and Animals (Clifton, NJ: Humana Press, 1983).
  • Regan, T. and P. Singer, eds. Animal Rights and Human Obligations 2/e (Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice Hall, 1989).
  • Walters, K and Lisa Portmess, eds. Ethical Vegetarianism: From Pythagoras to Peter Singer(Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1999).

b. Monographs

  • Carruthers, Peter. The Animals Issue: Morality in Practice (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992).
  • Clark, Stephen. The Moral Status of Animals (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1977).
  • DeGrazia, David. Taking Animals Seriously: Mental Life and Moral Status (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996).
  • Dombrowski, Daniel. Babies and Beasts: The Argument from Marginal Cases. (Urbana: The University of Illinois Press, 1997).
  • Fox, Michael A. The Case for Animal Experimentation: An Evolutionary and Ethical Perspective (Berkeley: The University of California Press, 1986).
  • Frey, R. G. Interests and Rights: The Case Against Animals (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1980).
  • Kant, Immanuel. Critique of Practical Reason (Upper Saddle River, NJ: Prentice Hall, 1993), originally published 1788.
  • Kant, Immanuel. Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals (New York: Harper Torchbooks, 1956), originally published 1785.
  • Midgley, Mary. Animals and Why They Matter (Athens, GA: The University of Georgia Press, 1983).
  • Mill, John Stuart. Utilitarianism (Indianapolis: Hackett Publishers, 1979), originally published 1861.
  • Noddings, Nell. Caring: A Feminist Approach to Ethics and Moral Education (Berkeley: The University of California Press, 1984).
  • Nozick, Robert. Anarchy, State, and Utopia (New York: Basic Books, 1974).
  • Pluhar, Evelyn. Beyond Prejudice: The Moral Significance of Human and Nonhuman Animals(Durham: Duke University Press, 1995).
  • Rachels, James. Created from Animals: The Moral Implications of Darwinism (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1990).
  • Regan, Tom. The Case for Animal Rights (Berkeley: The University of California Press, 1983).
  • Rodd, Rosemary. Biology, Ethics, and Animals (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1990).
  • Rollin, Bernard. The Unheeded Cry: Animal Consciousness, Animal Pain, and Science(Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1989).
  • Sapontzis, S. F. Morals, Reasons, and Animals (Philadelphia: Temple University Press, 1987).
  • Singer, Peter. Animal Liberation, 2/e (New York: Avon Books, 1990).
  • Singer, Peter. Practical Ethics, 2/e (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1993).
  • Warren, Mary Anne. Moral Status: Obligations to Persons and Other Living Things (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1997).

c. Articles

  • Carruthers, Peter. “Brute Experience”, The Journal of Philosophy 86 (1989): 258-69.
  • Cigman, Ruth. “Death, Misfortune, and Species Inequality”, Philosophy and Public Affairs 10 (1981): 47-64.
  • Cohen, Carl. “The Case for the Use of Animals in Biomedical Research”, The New England Journal of Medicine 315 (1986): 865-70.
  • DeGrazia, David. “Animal Ethics Around the Turn of the Twenty-First Century”, Journal of Agricultural and Environmental Ethics 11 (1999): 111-29.
  • Diamond, Cora. “Eating Meat and Eating People”, Philosophy 53 (1978): 465-79.
  • Feinberg, Joel. “The Rights of Animals and Unborn Generations”, in W. T. Blackstone, ed.,Philosophy and Environmental Crisis (Athens, GA: The University of Georgia Press, 1974).
  • Fox, Michael A. “Animal Experimentation: A Philosopher’s Changing Views”, Between the Species 3 (1987): 55-82.
  • Francis, Leslie Pickering and Richard Norman. “Some Animals are More Equal than Others”, Philosophy 53 (1978): 507-27.
  • Goodpaster, Kenneth. “On Being Morally Considerable”, The Journal of Philosophy 75 (1978): 308-25.
  • Harrison, Peter. “Do Animals Feel Pain?”, Philosophy 66 (1991): 25-40.
  • McCloskey, H. J. “Moral Rights and Animals”, Inquiry 22 (1979): 23-54.
  • Miller, Peter. “Do Animals Have Interests Worthy of Our Moral Interest?”, Environmental Ethics 5 (1983): 319-33.
  • Narveson, Jan. “Animal Rights”, Canadian Journal of Philosophy 7 (1977): 161-78.
  • Steinbock, Bonnie. “Speciesism and the Idea of Equality”, Philosophy 53 (1978): 247-56.
  • Warren, Mary Anne. “Difficulties with the Strong Animal Rights Position”, Between the Species 2 (1987): 161-73.
  • Williams, Meredith. “Rights, Interests, and Moral Equality”, Environmental Ethics 2 (1980): 149-61.
  • Wilson, Scott. “Carruthers and the Argument From Marginal Cases”, The Journal of Applied Philosophy 18 (2001): 135-47.
  • Wilson, Scott. “Indirect Duties to Animals”, The Journal of Value Inquiry, 36 (2002): 17-27.

Author Information

Scott D. Wilson
Email: scott.wilson@wright.edu
Wright State University
U. S. A.

Categories: Bioethics