Thomas Aquinas (1224/6—1274)
St. Thomas Aquinas was a Dominican priest and Scriptural theologian. He took seriously the medieval maxim that “grace perfects and builds on nature; it does not set it aside or destroy it.” Therefore, insofar as Thomas thought about philosophy as the discipline that investigates what we can know naturally about God and human beings, he thought that good Scriptural theology, since it treats those same topics, presupposes good philosophical analysis and argumentation. Although Thomas authored some works of pure philosophy, most of his philosophizing is found in the context of his doing Scriptural theology. Indeed, one finds Thomas engaging in the work of philosophy even in his Biblical commentaries and sermons.
Within his large body of work, Thomas treats most of the major sub-disciplines of philosophy, including logic, philosophy of nature, metaphysics, epistemology, philosophical psychology, philosophy of mind, philosophical theology, the philosophy of language, ethics, and political philosophy. As far as his philosophy is concerned, Thomas is perhaps most famous for his so-called five ways of attempting to demonstrate the existence of God. These five short arguments constitute only an introduction to a rigorous project in natural theology—theology that is properly philosophical and so does not make use of appeals to religious authority—that runs through thousands of tightly argued pages. Thomas also offers one of the earliest systematic discussions of the nature and kinds of law, including a famous treatment of natural law. Despite his interest in law, Thomas’ writings on ethical theory are actually virtue-centered and include extended discussions of the relevance of happiness, pleasure, the passions, habit, and the faculty of will for the moral life, as well as detailed treatments of each one of the theological, intellectual, and cardinal virtues. Arguably, Thomas’ most influential contribution to theology and philosophy, however, is his model for the correct relationship between these two disciplines, a model which has it that neither theology nor philosophy is reduced one to the other, where each of these two disciplines is allowed its own proper scope, and each discipline is allowed to perfect the other, if not in content, then at least by inspiring those who practice that discipline to reach ever new intellectual heights.
In his lifetime, Thomas’ expert opinion on theological and philosophical topics was sought by many, including at different times a king, a pope, and a countess. It is fair to say that, as a theologian, Thomas is one of the most important in the history of Western civilization, given the extent of his influence on the development of Roman Catholic theology since the 14th century. However, it also seems right to say—if only from the sheer influence of his work on countless philosophers and intellectuals in every century since the 13th, as well as on persons in countries as culturally diverse as Argentina, Canada, England, France, Germany, India, Italy, Japan, Poland, Spain, and the United States—that, globally, Thomas is one of the 10 most influential philosophers in the Western philosophical tradition.
Table of Contents
- Life and Works
- Faith and Reason
- Philosophy of Language: Analogy
- Natural Theology
- Philosophical Anthropology: The Nature of Human Beings
- The End or Goal of Human Life: Happiness
- Morally Virtuous Action as the Way to Happiness
- Human Virtues as Perfections of Characteristically Human Powers
- The Logical Relations between the Human Virtues
- Moral Knowledge
- The Proximate and Ultimate Standards of Moral Truth
- Political Philosophy
- References and Further Reading
St. Thomas Aquinas was born sometime between 1224 and 1226 in Roccasecca, Italy, near Naples. Thomas’ family was fairly well-to-do, owning a castle that had been in the Aquino family for over a century. One of nine children, Thomas was the youngest of four boys, and, given the customs of the time, his parents considered him destined for a religious vocation.
In his early years, from approximately 5 to 15 years of age, Thomas lived and served at the nearby Benedictine abbey of Monte Cassino, founded by St. Benedict of Nursia himself in the 6th century. It is here that Thomas received his early education. Thomas’ parents probably had great political plans for him, envisioning that one day he would become abbot of Monte Cassino, a position that, at the time, would have brought even greater political power to the Aquino family.
Thomas began his theological studies at the University of Naples in the fall of 1239. In the 13th century, training in theology at the medieval university started with additional study of the seven liberal arts, namely, the three subjects of the trivium (grammar, logic, and rhetoric) and the four subjects of the quadrivium (arithmetic, geometry, music, and astronomy), as well study in philosophy. As part of his philosophical studies at Naples, Thomas was reading in translation the newly discovered writings of Aristotle, perhaps introduced to him by Peter of Ireland. Although Aristotle’s Categories and On Interpretation (with Porphyry’s Isagoge, known as the ‘old logic’) constituted a part of early medieval education, and the remaining works in Aristotle’s Organon, namely, Prior Analytics, Posterior Analytics, Topics, and Sophismata (together known as the ‘new logic’) were known in Europe as early as the middle of the 12th century, most of Aristotle’s corpus had been lost to the Latin West for nearly a millennium. By contrast, Arab philosophers such as Ibn Sina or Avicenna (c. 980-1087) and Ibn Rushd or Averroes (1126-1198) not only had access to works such as Aristotle’s De Anima, Nicomachean Ethics, Physics, and Metaphyiscs, they produced sophisticated commentaries on those works. The Latin West’s increased contact with the Arabic world in the 12th and 13th centuries led to the gradual introduction of these lost Aristotelian works—as well as the writings of the Arabic commentaries mentioned above—into medieval European universities such as Naples. Philosophers such as Peter of Ireland had not seen anything like these Aristotelian works before; they were capacious and methodical but never strayed far from common sense. However, there was controversy too, since Aristotle seemed to teach things that contradicted the Christian faith, most notably that God was not provident over human affairs, that the universe had always existed, and that the human soul was mortal. Thomas would later try to show that such theses either represented misinterpretations of Aristotle’s works or else were founded on probabilistic rather than demonstrative arguments and so could be rejected in light of the surer teaching of the Catholic faith.
It was in the midst of his university studies at Naples that Thomas was stirred to join a new (and not altogether uncontroversial) religious order known as the Order of Preachers or the Dominicans, after their founder, St. Dominic de Guzman (c. 1170-1221), an order which placed an emphasis on preaching and teaching. Although Thomas received the Dominican habit in April of 1244, Thomas’ parents were none too pleased with his decision to join this new evangelical movement. In order to talk some sense into him, Thomas’ mother sent his brothers to bring him to the family castle sometime in late 1244 or early 1245. Back at the family compound, Thomas continued in his resolve to remain with the Dominicans. Having resisted his family’s wishes, he was placed under house arrest. A famous story has it that one day his family members sent a prostitute up to the room where Thomas was being held prisoner. Apparently, they were thinking that Thomas would, like any typical young man, satisfy the desires of his flesh and thereby “come back down to earth” and see to his familial duties. Instead, Thomas supposedly chased the prostitute out of the room with a hot poker, and as the door slammed shut behind her, traced a black cross on the door. Eventually, Thomas’ mother relented and he returned to the Dominicans in the fall of 1245. Despite these family troubles, Thomas remained dedicated to his family for the rest of his life, sometimes staying in family castles during his many travels and even acting late in his life as executor of his brother-in-law’s will.
Recognizing his talent early on, the Dominican authorities sent Thomas to study with St. Albert the Great at the University of Paris for three years, from 1245-1248. Thomas made such an impression on Albert that, having been transferred to the University of Cologne, Albert took Thomas along with him as his personal assistant.
From 1252-1256, Thomas was back at the University of Paris, teaching as a Bachelor of the Sentences. We might think of Thomas’ position at Paris at this time as roughly equivalent to an advanced graduate student teaching a class of his or her own. In addition to his teaching duties, Thomas was also required, in accord with university standards of the time, to work on a commentary on Peter the Lombard’s Sentences. We might think of Thomas’ commentary on the Sentences as roughly equivalent to his doctoral dissertation in theology.
At 32 years of age (1256), Thomas was teaching at the University of Paris as a Master of Theology, the medieval equivalent of a university professorship. After teaching at Paris for three years, the Dominicans moved Thomas back to Italy, where he taught in Naples (from 1259-1261), Orvietto (1261-1265), and Rome (1265-1268). It was during this period, perhaps in Rome, that Thomas began work on his magisterial Summa theologiae.
Thomas was ordered by his superiors to return to the University of Paris in 1268, perhaps to defend the mendicant way of life of the Dominicans and their presence at the university. (Like the Franciscans, the Dominicans depended upon the charity of others in order to continue their work and survive. This sometimes meant they had to beg for their food. In doing so, the members of the mendicant orders consciously saw themselves as living after the pattern of Jesus Christ, who, as the Gospels depict, also depended upon the charity of others for things to eat and places to rest during his public ministry.) Thomas ended up teaching at the University of Paris again as a regent Master from 1268-1272. While he was at the University of Paris, Thomas also famously disputed with philosophers who contended on Aristotelian grounds—wrongly in Thomas’ view—that all human beings shared one intellect, a doctrine that Thomas argued was incompatible with personal immortality and moral responsibility, not to mention our experience of ourselves as individual knowers.
In 1272, the Dominicans moved Thomas back to Naples, where he taught for a year. In the middle of composing his treatise on the sacraments for the Summa theologiae around December of 1273, Thomas had a particularly powerful religious experience. After the experience, despite constant urging from his confessor and assistant Reginald of Piperno, Thomas refused any longer to write. Called to be a theological consultant at the Second Council of Lyon, Thomas died in Fossanova, Italy, on March 7, 1274, while making his way to the council.
Canonized in 1323, Thomas was later proclaimed a Doctor of the Church by Pope St. Pius V in 1567. In 1879, Pope Leo XIII published the encyclical Aeterni Patris, which, among other things, holds up Thomas as the supreme model of the Christian philosopher. Through his voluminous, insightful, and tightly argued writings, Thomas continues to this day to attract numerous intellectual disciples, not only among Catholics, but among Protestants and non-Christians as well.
Thomas is famous for being extremely productive as an author in his relatively short life. For example, he authored four encyclopedic theological works, commented on all of the major works of Aristotle, authored commentaries on all of St. Paul’s letters in the New Testament, and put together a verse by verse collection of exegetical comments by the Church Fathers on all four Gospels called the Catena aurea. Such examples constitute only the beginning of a comprehensive list of Thomas’ works. His literary output is as diverse as it is large. Thomas’ body of work can be usefully split up into nine different literary genera: (1) theological syntheses, for example, Summa theologiae and Summa contra gentiles; (2) commentaries on important philosophical works, for example, Commentary on Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics and Commentary on Pseudo-Dionysius’ De divinis nominibus; (3) Biblical commentaries, for example, Literal Commentary on Job and Commentary and Lectures on the Epistles of Paul the Apostle; (4) disputed questions, for example, On Evil and On Truth; (5) works of religious devotion, for example, the Liturgy of Corpus Christi and the hymn Adoro te devote; (6) academic sermons, for example, Beata gens, sermon for All Saints; (7) short philosophical treatises, for example, On Being and Essence and On the Principles of Nature; (8) polemical works, for example, On the Eternity of the World against Murmurers, and (9) letters in answer to requests for an expert opinion, for example, On Kingship. For present purposes, this article focuses on the first four of these literary genera. This should be enough to demonstrate the capaciousness of Thomas’ thought.
Thomas’ most famous works are his so-called theological syntheses. Thomas composed four of these during his lifetime: his commentary on Peter Lombard’s Sentences, Summa contra gentiles, Compendium theologiae, and Summa theologiae. Although each of these works was composed for different reasons, they are nonetheless similar insofar as each of them attempts to communicate clearly and defend the substance of the Catholic faith in a manner that can be understood by someone who has the requisite education, that is, training in the liberal arts and Aristotle’s philosophy of science. Although Thomas aims at both clarity and brevity in the works, because Thomas also aims to speak about all the issues integral to the teaching the Catholic faith, the works are quite long (for example, Summa theologiae, although unfinished, numbers 2,592 pages in the English translation of the Fathers of the English Dominican Province).
Thomas’ Summa contra gentiles (SCG), his second great theological synthesis, is split up into four books: book I treats God; book II treats creatures; book III treats divine providence; book IV treats matters pertaining to salvation. Whereas the last book treats subjects the truth of which cannot be demonstrated philosophically, the first three books are intended by Thomas as what we might call works of natural theology, that is, theology that from first to last does not defend its conclusions by citing religious authorities but rather contains only arguments that begin from premises that are or can be made evident to human reason apart from divine revelation and end by drawing logically valid conclusions from such premises. SCG is thus Thomas’ longest and most ambitious attempt at doing what he is probably most famous for—arguing philosophically for various theses concerning the existence of God, the nature of God, and the nature of creatures insofar as they are creatures of God. Although Thomas cites Scripture in these first three books in SCG, such citations always come on the heels of Thomas’ attempt to establish a point philosophically. In citing Scripture in the SCG, Thomas thus aims to demonstrate that faith and reason are not in conflict, that those conclusions reached by way of philosophy coincide with the teachings of Scripture.
Summa theologiae (ST) is Thomas’ most well-known work, and rightly so, for it displays all of Thomas’ intellectual virtues: the integration of a strong faith with great learning; acute organization of thought; judicious use of a wide range of sources, including pagan and other non-Christian sources; an awareness of the complexity of language; linguistic economy; and rigorous argumentation. However, ST is not a piece of scholarship as we often think of scholarship in the early 21st century, that is, a professor showing forth everything that she knows about a subject. Rather, it is the work of a gifted teacher, one intended by its author, as Thomas himself makes clear in the prologue, to aid the spiritual and intellectual formation of his students. It was once thought that Thomas meant ST to replace Lombard’s Sentences as a university textbook in theology, which, incidentally, did begin to happen as early as one hundred and fifty years after Thomas’ death. Recent scholarship has suggested that Thomas rather composed the work for Dominican students preparing for priestly ministry. This thesis is consistent with what Thomas actually does in ST, which may surprise people who have not examined the work as a whole.
What of the method and content of ST? Like Lombard’s Sentences, Thomas’ ST is organized according to the neo-Platonic schema of exit from and return to God. This is no accident. Thomas thinks it is fitting that divine science should imitate reality not only in content but in form. ST is split into three parts. Part one (often abbreviated “Ia.”) treats God and the nature of spiritual creatures, that is, angels and human beings. Part two treats the return of human beings to God by way of their exercising the virtues, knowing and acting in accord with law, and the reception of divine grace. Given the Fall of human beings, part three (often abbreviated “IIIa.”) treats the means by which human beings come to embody the virtues, know the law, and receive grace: (a) the Incarnation, life, passion, death, resurrection, and ascension of Christ, as well as (b) the manner in which Christ’s life and work is made efficacious for human beings, through the sacraments and life of the Church.
Of the three parts of ST, the second part on ethical matters is by far the longest, which is one reason recent scholarship has suggested that Thomas’ interest in composing ST is more practical than theoretical. We might think of ST as a work in Christian ethics, designed specifically to teach those Dominican priests whose primary duties were preaching and hearing confessions. In fact, part two of ST is so long that Thomas splits it into two parts, where the length of each one of these parts is approximately 600 pages in English translation. The first part of the second part is often abbreviated “IaIIae”; the second part of the second part is often abbreviated “IIaIIae.”
The fundamental unit of ST is known as the article. It is in the article that Thomas works through some particular theological or philosophical issue in considerable detail, although not in too much detail. (Recall Thomas is training priests for ministry, not scholars. For Thomas’ most detailed discussions of a topic, readers should turn to his treatment in his disputed questions, his commentary on the Sentences, SCG, and the Biblical commentaries.) Thomas treats a very specific “yes” or “no” question in each article in accord with the method of the medieval disputatio. That is to say, each article within the ST is, as it were, a mini-dialogue. Each article within ST has five parts. First, Thomas raises a very specific question, for example, “whether law needs to be promulgated.” Second, Thomas entertains some objections to the position that he himself defends on the specific question raised in the article. In other words, Thomas is here fielding objections to his own considered position. Third, Thomas cites some authority (in a section that begins, on the contrary) that gives the reader the strong impression that the position defended in the objections is, in fact, untenable. Oftentimes the authority Thomas cites is a passage from the Old or New Testament; otherwise, it is some authoritative interpreter of Scripture or science such as St. Augustine or Aristotle, respectively. It should be noted the authority cited is in no way, shape, or form Thomas’ final word on the subject at hand. Thomas is well aware that authorities need to be interpreted. Fourth, Thomas develops his own position on the specific topic addressed in the article. This part of the article is oftentimes referred to as the body or the respondeo, literally, I respond. Here, Thomas offers arguments in defense of his own considered position on the matter at issue. Sometimes Thomas examines various possible positions on the question at hand, showing why some are untenable whereas others are defensible. At other times, Thomas shows that much of the problem is terminological; if we appreciate the various senses of a term crucial to the science in question, we can show that authorities that seem to be in conflict are simply using an expression with different intended meanings and so do not disagree after all. Fifth, Thomas returns to the objections and answers each of them in light of the work he has done in the body of the article. It should be noted that Thomas often adds interesting details in these answers to the objections to the position he has defended in the body of the article.
In addition to his theological syntheses, Thomas composed numerous commentaries on the works of Aristotle and other neo-Platonic philosophers. For example, Thomas commented on all of Aristotle’s major works, including Metaphysics, Physics, De Anima, and Nichomachean Ethics. These are line-by-line commentaries, and contemporary Aristotle scholars have remarked on their insightfulness, despite the fact that Thomas himself did not know Greek (although he was working from Latin translations of Greek editions of Aristotle’s text). The focus in Thomas’ commentaries is certainly explaining the mind of Aristotle. That being said, given that Thomas sometimes corrects Aristotle in these works (see, for example, his commentary on Physics, book 8, chapter 1), it seems right to say that Thomas’ commentaries on Aristotle are usefully consulted to elucidate Thomas’ own views on philosophical topics as well.
Thomas is often spoken of as an Aristotelian. This is particularly so when speaking of Thomas’ philosophy of language, metaphysics of material objects, and philosophy of science. When it comes to Thomas’ metaphysics and moral philosophy, though, Thomas is equally influenced by the neo-Platonism of Church Fathers and other classical thinkers such as St. Augustine of Hippo, Pope St. Gregory the Great, Proclus, and the Pseudo-Dionysius. One way to see the importance of neo-Platonic thought for Thomas’ own thinking is by noting the fact that Thomas authored commentaries on a number of important neo-Platonic works. These include commentaries on Boethius’ On the Hebdomads, Boethius’ De trinitate, Pseudo-Dionysius’ On the Divine Names, and the anonymous Book of Causes. (The last work Thomas correctly identified as the work of an Arab philosopher who borrowed greatly from Proclus’ Elementatio Theologica and the work of Dionysius; previously it had been thought to be a work of Aristotle’s).
Although Thomas commented on a number of philosophical works, Thomas probably saw his commentaries on Scripture as his most important. (Thomas commented on Job, Isaiah, Jeremiah, Lamentations, Psalms 1-51 (this commentary was interrupted by his death), Matthew, John, Romans, 1 and 2 Corinthians, Galatians, Ephesians, Philippians, Colossians, 1 and 2 Thessalonians, 1 and 2 Timothy, Titus, Philemon, and Hebrews. Thomas also composed a running gloss on the four gospels, the Catena aurea, which consists of a collection of what various Church Fathers have to say about each verse in each of the four gospels.) Thomas understood himself to be, first and foremost, a Catholic Christian theologian. Indeed, theology professors at the University of Paris in Thomas’ time were known as Masters of the Sacred Page. In addition, Thomas was a member of the Dominican order, and the Dominicans have a special regard for teaching the meaning of Scripture.
A reader might wonder why one would mention Thomas’ commentaries on Scripture in an article focused on his contributions to the discipline of philosophy. It is important to mention Thomas’ Scripture commentaries since Thomas often does his philosophizing in the midst of doing theology, and this is no less true in his commentaries on Scripture. To give just one example of the importance of Thomas’ Scripture commentaries for understanding a philosophical topic in his thought, he has interesting things to say about the communal nature of perfect happiness in his commentaries on St. Paul’s letters to the Corinthians and to the Ephesians. A reader who focused merely on Thomas’ treatment of perfect happiness in, for example, the Summa theologiae, would get an incomplete picture of his views on human happiness.
Where talk of Thomas’ philosophy is concerned, there is a final literary genus worth mentioning, the so-called disputed question. Like ST, the articles in Thomas’ disputed questions are organized according to the method of the medieval disputatio. However, whereas a typical article in ST fields three or four objections, it is not uncommon for an article in a disputed question to field 20 objections to the position the master wants to defend. Consider, for example, the question of whether there is power in God. Whereas the article in ST that treats this question fields four objections, the corresponding article in Thomas’ Disputed Questions on the Power of God fields 18 objections. Nonetheless, it would be a mistake to think that Thomas’ disputed questions necessarily represent his most mature discussions of a topic. Although the disputed questions can be regarded as Thomas’ most detailed treatments of a subject, he sometimes changed his mind about issues over the course of his writing career, and the disputed questions do not necessarily represent his last word on a given subject.
Thomas’ views on the relationship between faith and reason can be contrasted with a number of contemporary views. Consider first an influential position we can label evidentialism. For our purposes, the advocate of evidentialism believes that one should proportion the strength of one’s belief B to the amount of evidence one has for the truth of B, where evidence for a belief is construed either (a) as that belief’s correspondence with a proposition that is self-evident, indubitable, or immediately evident from sense experience, or (b) as that belief’s being supported by a good argument, where such an argument begins from premises that are self-evident, indubitable, or immediately evident from sense experience (see Plantinga [2000, pp. 67-79] and Rota ). Evidentialism, so construed, is incompatible with a traditional religious view that Thomas holds about divine faith: if Susan has divine faith that p, then Susan has faith that p as a gift from God, and Susan reasonably believes that p with a strong conviction, not on the basis of Susan’s personally understanding why p is true, but on the basis of Susan’s reasonably believing that God has divinely revealed that p is true. In other words, divine faith is a kind of certain knowledge by way of testimony for Thomas.
Fideism is another position with which we can contrast Thomas’ views on faith and reason. For our purposes, consider fideism to be the view that states that faith is the only way to apprehend truths about God. Put negatively, the fideist thinks that human reason is incapable of demonstrating truths about God philosophically.
Finally, consider the position on faith and reason known as separatism. According to separatism, philosophy and natural science, on the one hand, and revealed theology, on the other, are incommensurate activities or habits. Any talk of conflict between faith and reason always involves some sort of confusion about the nature of faith, philosophy, or science.
In contrast to the views mentioned above, Thomas not only sees a significant role for both faith and reason in the best kind of human life (contra evidentialism), but he thinks reason apart from faith can discern some truths about God (contra fideism), as epitomized by the work of a pagan philosopher such as Aristotle (see, for example, SCG I, chapter 3). Thomas also recognizes that revealed theology and philosophy are concerned with some of the same topics (contra separatism). Although treating some of the same topics, Thomas thinks it is not possible in principle for there to be a real and significant conflict between the truths discovered by divine faith and theology on the one hand and the truths discerned by reason and philosophy on the other. In fact, Thomas thinks it is a special part of the theologian’s task to explain just why any perceived conflicts between faith and reason are merely apparent and not real and significant conflicts (see, for example, ST Ia. q. 1, a. 8). Indeed, showing that faith and reason are compatible is one of the things Thomas attempts to do in his own works of theology. A diverse group of subsequent religious thinkers have looked to Thomas’ modeling the marriage of faith and reason as one of his most important contributions.
One place where Thomas discusses the relationship between faith and reason is SCG, book I, chapters 3-9. Thomas notes there that there are two kinds of truths about God: those truths that can be apprehended by reason apart from divine revelation, for example, that God exists and that there is one God (in the Summa theologiae, Thomas calls such truths about God the preambles to the faith) and those truths about God the apprehension of which requires a gift of divine grace, for example, the doctrine of the Trinity (Thomas calls these the articles of faith). Although the truth of the preambles to the faith can be apprehended without faith, Thomas thinks human beings are not rationally required to do so. In fact, Thomas argues that three awkward consequences would follow if God required that all human beings need to apprehend the preambles to the faith by way of philosophical argumentation.
First, very few people would come to know truths about God and, since human flourishing requires certain knowledge of God, God wants to be known by as many people as possible. Not everyone has the native intelligence to do the kind of work in philosophy required to understand an argument for the existence of God. Among those who have the requisite intelligence for such work, many do not have the time it takes to apprehend such truths by philosophy, being engaged as they are in other important tasks such as taking care of children, manual labor, feeding the poor, and so forth. Finally, among those who have the natural intelligence and time required for serious philosophical work, many do not have the passion for philosophy that is also required to arrive at an understanding of the arguments for the existence of God.
Second, of the very few who could come to know truths about God philosophically, these would apprehend these truths with anything close to certainty only late in their life, and Thomas thinks that people need to apprehend truths such as the existence of God as soon as possible. (Compare here with a child learning that it is wrong to lie; parents wisely want their children to learn this truth as soon as possible.) In order to understand why Thomas thinks that the existence of God is a truth discernible by way of philosophy only late in life, we need to appreciate his view of philosophy, metaphysics, and natural theology. Philosophy is a discipline we rightly come to only after we have gained some confidence in other disciplines such as arithmetic, grammar, and logic. Among the philosophical disciplines, metaphysics is the most difficult and presupposes competence in other philosophical disciplines such as physics (as it is practiced, for example, in Aristotle’s Physics, that is, what we might call philosophical physics, that is, reflections on the nature of change, matter, motion, and time). Finally, demonstrating the existence of God is the hardest part of metaphysics. If we are to apprehend with confidence the existence of God by way of philosophy, this will happen only after years of intense study and certainly not during childhood, when we might think that Thomas believes it is important, if not necessary, for it to happen.
Third, let us suppose Susan has the native intelligence, time, passion, and experience requisite for apprehending the existence of God philosophically and that she does, in fact, come to know that God exists by way of a philosophical argument. Thomas maintains that such an apprehension is nonetheless going to be deficient for it will not allow Susan to be totally confident that God exists, since Susan is cognizant—being the philosopher she is—that there is a real possibility she has made a mistake in her philosophical reasoning. However, the good life, for example, living like a martyr, requires that we possess an unshakeable confidence that God exists. Since God wants as many people as possible to apprehend his existence, and to do so as soon as possible and with the kind of confidence enjoyed by the Apostles, saints, and martyrs, Thomas argues that it is fitting that God divinely reveals to human beings—even to theologians who can philosophically demonstrate the existence of God—the preambles to the faith, that is, those truths that can be apprehended by human reason apart from divine faith, so that people from all walks of life can, with great confidence, believe that God exists as early in life as possible.
However, does it make sense to believe things about God that exceed the natural capacity of human reason? Thomas thinks the answer is “yes,” and he defends this answer in a number of ways. Two are mentioned here. First, Thomas thinks it sensible of God to ask human beings to believe things about God that exceed their natural capacities since to do so reinforces in human beings an important truth about God, namely, that God is such that He cannot be completely understood by way of our natural capacities. If we say we completely understand God by way of our natural capacities, then we do not understand what “God” means. Talk about God, for Thomas, requires that we recognize our limitations with respect to such a project. God’s asking us to believe things about Him that we cannot apprehend philosophically makes sense for Thomas because it alerts human beings to the fact that we cannot know God in the same way we know the objects of other sciences.
Thomas also notes that believing things about God by faith perfects the soul in a manner that nothing else can. Here Thomas draws on the testimony of Aristotle, who thinks that even a little knowledge of the highest and most beautiful things perfects the soul more than a complete knowledge of earthly things. Although we cannot understand the things of God that we apprehend by faith in this life, even a slim knowledge of God greatly perfects the soul. Just as a bit of real knowledge of human beings is better for Susan’s soul than Susan’s knowing everything there is to know about carpenter ants, Susan’s possessing knowledge about God by faith is better for Susan’s soul than Susan’s knowing scientifically everything there is to know about the cosmos.
Still, we might wonder why Thomas thinks it is reasonable to accept the Catholic faith as opposed to some other faith tradition that, like the Catholic faith, asks us to believe things that exceed the capacity of natural reason. One thing Thomas says is that some non-Catholic religious traditions ask us to believe things that are contrary to what we can know by natural reason. Thomas accepts the medieval maxim that “grace does not destroy nature or set it aside; rather grace always perfects nature.” Although the Catholic faith takes us beyond what natural reason by itself can apprehend, according to Thomas, it never contradicts what we know by way of natural reason. Therefore, any real conflicts between faith and reason in non-Catholic religious traditions give us a reason to prefer the Catholic faith to non-Catholic faith traditions.
In addition, Thomas thinks there are good—although non-demonstrative—arguments for the truth of the Catholic faith. Thomas begins with the accounts of healings, the resurrection of the dead, and miraculous changes in the heavenly bodies, as contained in the Old and New Testaments. These accounts of miracles—which Thomas takes to be historically reliable—offer confirmation of the truthfulness of the teaching of those who perform such works by the grace of God. Even more significant, thinks Thomas, is the fact that simple fishermen were transformed overnight into apostles, that is, eloquent and wise men. Thomas takes this to be a miracle that provides confirmation of the truth of the Catholic faith the apostles preached. Most powerful of all, according to Thomas, the Catholic faith spread throughout the world in the midst of great persecutions. As Thomas notes, the Catholic faith was not initially embraced because it was economically advantageous to do so; nor did it spread—as other religious traditions have—by way of the sword; in fact, people flocked to the Catholic faith—as Thomas notes, both the simple and the learned—despite the fact that it teaches things that surpass the natural capacity of the intellect and demands that people curb their desires for the pleasures of the flesh. Given human nature, Thomas thinks that such conversions were miraculous and so testify to the truth of the faith that such people came to adopt.
Any discussion of Thomas’ views concerning what something is, for example, goodness or knowledge or form, requires some stage-setting. Much of contemporary analytic philosophy and modern science operates under the assumption that any discourse D that deserves the honor of being called scientific or disciplined requires that the terms employed within D not be used equivocally. Thomas agrees, but with a very important caveat. Thomas distinguishes two different kinds of equivocation: uncontrolled (or complete) equivocation and controlled equivocation (or analogous predication). While the former is incompatible with a discourse being scientific or disciplined, according to Thomas, the latter is not. Thomas therefore distinguishes three different ways words are used: univocally, equivocally (in a sense that is complete or uncontrolled), and analogously, that is, equivocally but in a manner that is controlled. When we use a word univocally, we predicate of two things (x and y) one and the same name n, where n has precisely the same meaning when predicated of x and y. For example, think of the locutions, “the cat is an animal” and “the dog is an animal.” Here, the same word “animal” is predicated of two different things, but the meaning of “animal” is precisely the same in both instances. By contrast, when we use a word equivocally, two things (x and y) are given one and the same name n, where n has one meaning when predicated of x and a different meaning when predicated of y. For example, we use the very same word “bank” to refer to a place where we save money and that part of the land that touches the edge of a river.
Importantly, Thomas notices that some instances of equivocation are controlled, or instances of analogous predication, whereas other instances of equivocal naming are complete or uncontrolled. In a case of complete or uncontrolled equivocation, we predicate of two things (x and y) one and the same name n, where n has one meaning when predicated of x and n has a completely different meaning when predicated of y. English usage of the word “bank” is a good example of complete or uncontrolled equivocation; here the use of the same name is totally an accident of language. It is a matter of linguistic chance that “bank” has these two totally different and unrelated meanings in English.
By contrast, in a case of controlled equivocation or analogous predication, we predicate of two things (x and y) one and the same name n, where n has one meaning when predicated of x, n has a different but not unrelated meaning when predicated of y, where one of these meanings is primary whereas the other meaning derives its meaning from the primary meaning. For example, consider the manner in which we use the word “good.” We sometimes speak of “good dogs,” and sometimes we say things such as “Doug is a good man.” The meanings of “good” in these two locutions obviously differ one from another since in the first sense no moral commendation is implied where there is moral commendation implied in the latter. However, it also seems right to say that “good” is not being used in completely different and unrelated ways in these locutions. Rather, our speaking of “good dogs” derives its meaning from the primary meaning of “good” as a way to offer moral commendation of human beings. We thus use the word “good” as an analogous expression in Thomas’ sense. To take an example Aristotle uses, “healthy” is used in the primary sense in a locution such as “Joe is healthy.” We might also say “Joe’s urine is healthy,” which uses “healthy” to pick out a sign of Joe’s health (in the primary sense of that term), or “exercise is healthy,” which uses “healthy” to pick out a cause of health (again, in the primary sense).
Thomas takes analogous predication or controlled equivocation to be sufficient for good science and philosophy, assuming, of course, that the other relevant conditions for good science or philosophy are met. Although the most famous use to which Thomas puts his theory of analogous naming is his attempt to make sense of a science of God, analogous naming is relevant where many other aspects of philosophy are concerned, Thomas thinks. For example, we also use words analogously when we talk about being, knowledge, causation, and even science itself. Thomas therefore sees a significant difference between complete equivocation and controlled equivocation or analogous naming. Whereas the scientist qua scientist must avoid the former, a discipline that uses words in the latter sense can properly be understood to be scientific or disciplined.
Thomas is aware of the fact that there are different forms of knowledge. One form of knowledge that is particularly important to a 13th-century professor such as Thomas is scientific knowledge (scientia). However, Thomas recognizes that scientific knowledge itself depends upon there being non-scientific kinds of knowledge, for example, sense knowledge and knowledge of self-evident propositions (about each of which, there is more below). We can begin to get a sense of what Thomas means by scientia by way of his discussion of faith, which is a form of knowledge he often contrasts with scientia (see, for example, ST IIaIIae. q. 1, aa. 4-5; q. 2, a. 1). According to Thomas, faith and scientia are alike in being subjectively certain. If I believe that p by faith, then I am confident that p is true. It is likewise with scientific knowledge. However, the reason for one’s being confident that p differs in the cases of faith and scientia. If I know that p by way of science, then I not only have compelling reasons that p, but I understand why those reasons compel me to believe that p. In contrast to scientia, the certainty of faith that p is grounded for Thomas in a rational belief that someone else has scientia or intellectual vision with respect to p. Thus, the certainty of faith is grounded in someone else’s testimony—in the case of divine faith, the testimony of God. For Thomas, faith can and, at least for those who have the time and talent, should be supported by reasons. However, if Susan believes p by faith, Susan may see that p is true, but she does not see why p is true. Susan’s belief that p is ultimately grounded in confidence concerning some other person, for example, Jane’s epistemic competence, where Jane’s competence involves seeing why p is true, either by way of Jane’s having scientia of p, because Jane knows that p is self-evidently true, or because Jane has sense knowledge that p.
We should note that, for Thomas, scientia itself is a term that we rightly use analogously. For example, in speaking of science, we could be talking about an act of inquiry whereby we draw certain conclusions, not previously known, from things we already know, that is, starting from first principles, where these principles are themselves known by way of (reflection upon our) sense experiences, we draw out the logical implications of such principles. We can contrast science as an act of inquiry with another kind of speculative activity that Thomas calls contemplation. Both science (in the sense of engaging in an act of inquiry) and contemplation are acts of speculative intellect according to Thomas, that is, they are uses of intellect that have truth as their immediate object. (In contrast, practical uses of intellect are acts of intellect that aim at the production of something other than what is thought about, for example, thinking at the service of doing the right thing, in the right way, at the right time, and so forth, or thinking at the service of bringing about a work of art.) Thomas thinks that, whereas an act of scientific inquiry aims at discovering a truth not already known, an act of contemplation aims at enjoying a truth already known.
We can speak of science not only as an act of inquiry, but also as a particularly strong sort of argument for the truth of a proposition that Thomas calls a scientific demonstration. If a person possesses a scientific demonstration of some proposition p, then he or she understands an argument that p such that the argument is logically valid and he or she knows with certainty that the premises of the argument are true.
In addition to the senses of science mentioned above, Thomas also recognizes the Aristotelian sense of scientia as a particular kind of intellectual habit or disposition or virtue, which habit is the fruit of scientia as scientific inquiry and requires the possession of scientific demonstrations. But science in the sense of a habit is more than the fruit of inquiry and the possession of arguments. Science as a habit is a person’s possession of an organized body of knowledge of and demonstrative argumentation about some subject matter S, where possessing an organized body of knowledge of and demonstrative argumentation about some subject matter is a function of knowing (a) the basic facts about S, that is, the characteristic properties or powers of things belonging to S, as well as (b) the principles, causes, or explanations of these properties or powers of S, and (c) the logical connections between (a) and (b). For example, according to this model of science, I have a scientific knowledge of living things qua living things only if I know the basic facts about all living things, for example, that living things grow and diminish in size over time, nourish themselves, and reproduce, and I know why living things have these characteristic powers and properties. According to Thomas, a science as habit is a kind of intellectual virtue, that is, a habit of knowledge about a subject matter, acquired from experience, hard work, and discipline, where the acquisition of that habit usually involves having a teacher or teachers. A person who possesses a science s knows the right kind of starting points for thinking about s, that is, the first principles or indemonstrable truths about s, and the scientist can draw correct conclusions from these first principles. In other words, if one has a science of s, one’s knowledge of s is systematic and controlled by experience, and so one can speak about s with ease, coherence, clarity, and profundity.
Thomas notes that the first principles of a science are sometimes naturally known by the scientist, for example in the cases of arithmetic and geometry (ST Ia. q. 1, a. 2). According to Thomas, the science of sacred theology does not fit this characterization of science since the first principles of sacred theology are articles of faith and so are not known by the natural light of reason but rather by the grace of God revealing the truth of such principles to human beings. Of course, contemporary philosophers of science would not find sacred theology’s inability to fit neatly into a well-defined univocal conception of science to be a problem for the scientific status of sacred theology. Think of the demarcation problem, that is, the problem of identifying necessary and sufficient conditions for some discourse counting as science. The demarcation problem suggests that science is a term we use analogously. This is what Thomas thinks. For example, Thomas recognizes that, even among those sciences whose first premises are known to some human beings by the natural light of reason, there are some sciences (call them “the xs”) such that scientists practicing the xs, at least where knowledge of some of the first principles of the xs is concerned, depend upon the testimony of scientists in disciplines other than their own. For example, optics makes use of principles treated in geometry, and music makes use of principles treated in mathematics. If, for example, all musicians had to be experts at mathematics, most musicians would never get to practice the science of music itself. Thus, musicians take the principles and findings of mathematics as a starting point for the practice of their own science. Like optics and music, therefore, sacred theology draws on principles known by those with a higher science, in this case, the science possessed by God and the blessed (see, for example, ST Ia. q. 1, a. 2, respondeo). Unlike optics, music, and other disciplines studied at the university, the principles of sacred theology are not known by the natural light of reason. However, sacred theology is nonetheless a science, since those who possess such a science can, for example, draw logical conclusions from the articles of faith, argue that one article of faith is logically consistent with the other articles of faith, and answer objections to the articles of faith, doing all of these things systematically, clearly, and with ease by drawing on the teachings of other sciences, including philosophy (ST Ia. q. 1, a. 8).
Given his notion of science (whether taken as activity, demonstrative argument or intellectual virtue), we might think that Thomas understands the extension of science to be wider than what most of our contemporaries would allow. There is a sense in which this is true. Although there is certainly disagreement among our contemporaries over the scientific status of some disciplines studied at modern universities, for example, psychology and sociology, all agree that disciplines such as physics, chemistry, and biology are to be counted among the sciences. The demarcation problem notwithstanding, we tend to think of science as natural science, where a natural science constitutes a discipline that studies the natural world by way of looking for spatio-temporal patterns in that world, where “the way of looking” tends to involve controlled experiments (Artigas 2000, p. 8). Thomas would have known something of science in this sense from his teacher St. Albert the Great (c. 1206-1280). However, for Thomas, (for whom science is understood as a discipline or intellectual virtue) disciplines such as mathematics, music, philosophy, and theology count as sciences too since those who practice such disciplines can talk about the subjects studied in those disciplines in a way that is systematic, orderly, capacious, and controlled by common human experience (and, in some cases, in the light of the findings of other sciences).
On the other hand, there is a sense in which Thomas’ understanding of science is more restrictive than the contemporary notion. Thomas follows Aristotle in thinking that we know something x scientifically only if our knowledge of x is certain. That is to say, we have demonstrative knowledge of x, that is, our knowledge begins from premises that we know with certainty by way of reflection upon sense experience, for example, all animals are mortal or there cannot be more in the effect than in its cause or causes, and ends by drawing logically valid conclusions from those premises. However, it seems to be a hallmark of the modern notion of science that the claims of science are, in fact, fallible, and so, by definition, uncertain.
No account of Thomas’ philosophy of science would be complete without mentioning the doctrine of the four causes. Following Aristotle, Thomas thinks the most capacious scientific account of a physical object or event involves mentioning its four causes, that is, its efficient, material, formal, and final causes. Of course, some things (of which we could possibly have a science of some sort) do not have four causes for Thomas. For example, immaterial substances will not have a material cause. However, Thomas thinks that material objects—whether natural or artificial—do have four causes. For example, for any material object O, O has four causes, the material cause (what O is made of), the formal cause (what O is), the final cause (what the end, goal, purpose, or function of O is), and the efficient cause (what brings—or conserves—O in(to) being). One has a scientific knowledge of O (or O’s kind) only if one knows all four causes of O or the kind to which O belongs. Here follows a more detailed account of each of the four causes as Thomas understands them.
An efficient cause of x is a being that acts to bring x into existence, preserve x in existence, perfect x in existence, or otherwise bring about some feature F in x. For example, Michelangelo was the efficient cause of the David. Thomas thinks that there are different kinds of efficient causes, which kinds of efficient causes may all be at work in one and the same object or event, albeit in different ways. For example, Thomas thinks that God is the primary efficient cause of any created being, at every moment in which that created being exists. That is, if it were not for God’s timelessly and efficiently causing a creature to exist at some time t, that creature would not exist at t. God’s act of creation and conservation with respect to some creature C does not rule out that C also simultaneously has creatures as secondary efficient causes of C. This is because God and creatures are efficient causes in different and yet analogous senses. God is the primary efficient cause as creator ex nihilo, timelessly conserving the very existence of any created efficient cause at every moment that it exists, whereas creatures are secondary efficient causes in the sense that they go to work on pre-existing matter such that matter that is merely potentially F actually becomes F. For example, we might say that a sperm cell and female gamete work on one another at fertilization and thereby function as secondary efficient causes of a human being H coming into existence. To continue with this example, Thomas thinks that God, too, is at work as the primary efficient cause of H’s coming into existence, since, for example, (a) God is the creating and conserving cause of (i) any sperm cell as long as it exists, (ii) any female gamete as long as it exists, and (iii) all aspects of the environment necessary for successful fertilization. In addition, Thomas thinks (b) God is the creating and conserving cause of the existence of H itself as long as H exists.
Thomas thinks that “material cause” (or simply “matter”) is an expression that has a number of different but related meanings. Perhaps the most obvious sense of “matter” is what “garden-variety” objects and their “garden-variety” parts are made of. In this sense of “matter,” the material cause of an axe is some iron and some wood.
There is one sense of “matter” that is very important for an analysis of change, thinks Thomas. Matter in this sense explains why x is capable of being transformed into something that x currently is not. The material cause in this sense is the subject of change—that which explains how something can lose the property not-F and gain the property F. For example, the material cause for an accidental change is some substance. Socrates himself is the material cause of the change that consists in Socrates’ losing the property of not-standing and gaining the property of standing. Such a change is accidental since the substance we name Socrates does not in this case go out of existence in virtue of losing the property of not-standing and gaining the property of standing.
The material cause for a substantial change is what medieval interpreters of Aristotle such as Thomas call prima materia (prime or first matter). Prime matter is that cause of x that is intrinsic to x (we might say, is a part of x) that explains why x is subject to substantial change. For Thomas, substances are unified objects of the highest order. Substances, for example, living things, are thus to be directly contrasted with heaps or collections of objects, for example, a pile of garbage or an army. Thomas thinks that if substantial changes had actual substances functioning as the ultimate subjects for those substantial changes, then it would be reasonable to call into question the substantial existence of those so-called substances that are (supposedly) composed of such substances. If Socrates were composed, say, of Democritean atoms that were substances in their own right, then Socrates, at best, would be nothing more than an arrangement of atoms. He would merely be an accidental being—an accidental relation between a number of substances—instead of a substance. At worst, Socrates would not exist at all (if we think the only substances are fundamental entities such as atoms, and Socrates is not an atom). Since Thomas thinks of Socrates as a paradigm case of a substance, he thus thinks that the matter of a substantial change must be something that is in and of itself not actually a substance but is merely the ultimate material cause of some substance. Thomas calls this ultimate material cause of a substance that can undergo substantial change prime matter. For example, consider that a bear eats a bug at t, so that the bug exists in space s, that is, the bear’s stomach, at t. Some prime matter therefore is configured by the substantial form of a bug in s at t such that there is a bug in s at t. At time t+1, when the bug dies in the bear’s stomach, the prime matter in s loses the substantial form of a bug and that prime matter comes to be configured by a myriad of substantial forms such that the bug no longer exists at t+1. What exists in s at t+1 is a collection of substances, for example, living cells arranged bug-wise, where the cells themselves will soon undergo substantial changes so that what will exist is a collection of non-living substances, for example, the kinds and numbers of atoms and molecules that compose the living cells of a living bug.
That being said, Thomas thinks prime matter never exists without being configured by some form. First of all, matter always exists under dimensions, and so this prime matter (rather than that prime matter) is configured by the accidental form of quantity, and more specifically, the accidental quantity of existing in three dimensions (see, for example, Commentary on Boethius’ De trinitate q. 4, a. 2, respondeo). In addition, it is never the case that some prime matter exists without being configured by some substantial form. For example, some quantity of prime matter m might be configured by the substantial form of an insect at t, be configured by the substantial forms of a collection of living cells at t+1 (for example, some moments after the insect has been eaten by a frog), be configured by the substantial forms of a collection of chemical compounds at t+2, and be incorporated into the body of a frog as an integral part of the frog such that it is configured by the frog’s substantial form at t+3. A portion of prime matter is always configured by a substantial form, though not necessarily this or that substantial form.
Note the theoretical significance of the view that material substances are composed of prime matter as a part. Prime matter is the material causal explanation of the fact that a material substance S’s generation and (potential) corruption are changes that are real (contra Parmenides of Elea), substantial (contra atomists such as Democritus), natural (contra those who might say that all substantial changes are miraculous), and intelligible (contra Heraclitus of Ephesus and Plato of Athens).
Like the material cause of an object, the expression formal cause is said in many ways. There are at least three for Thomas. First, formal cause might mean “the nature or definition of a thing,” that is, what-it-is-to-be S. The formal cause of a primary substance x in this sense is the substance-sortal that picks out what x is most fundamentally or the definition of that substance-sortal. For example, for Socrates this would be human being, or, what-it-is-to-be-a-human being, and, given that human beings can be defined as rational animals, rational animal. Although Socrates certainly belongs to other substance-sortals, for example, animal, living thing, rational substance, and substance, such substance-sortals only count as genera to which Socrates belongs; they do not count as Socrates’ infima species, that is, the substance-sortal that picks out what Socrates is most fundamentally. Of course, Socrates can be classified in many other ways, too, for example, as a philosopher or someone who chose not to flee his Athenian prison. However, such classifications are not substantial for Thomas, but merely accidental, for Socrates need not be (or have been) a philosopher—for example, Socrates was not a philosopher when he was two years old, nor someone who chose not to flee his Athenian prison, for even Socrates might have failed to live up to his principles on a given day.
A second sense that formal cause can have for Thomas is that which is intrinsic to or inheres in x and explains that x is actually F. There are two kinds of formal cause in this sense for Thomas. First, there are accidental forms (or simply, accidents). Accidental forms inhere in a substance and explain that a substance x actually is F, where F is a feature that x can gain or lose without x’s ceasing to exist, for example, Socrates’ being tan, Socrates’ weighing 180 lbs, and so forth. Second, there are substantial forms. According to Thomas, substantial forms are particulars—each individual substance has its own individual substantial form—and the substantial form of a substance is the intrinsic formal cause of (a) that substance’s being and (b) that substance’s belonging to the species that it does. A substantial form is a form intrinsic to x that explains the fact that x is actually F, where F is a feature that x cannot gain or lose without ceasing to exist, for example, Socrates’ property being an animal.
A third sense of formal cause for Thomas is the pattern or definition of a thing insofar as it exists in the mind of the maker. Thomas calls this the exemplar formal cause. For example, the form of a house can exist insofar as it is instantiated in matter, for example, in a house. However, the form of (or plan for) a house can also exist in the mind of the architect, even before an actual house is built. This latter sense of formal cause is what we might call the exemplar formal cause. For Thomas, following St. Augustine, some of the ideas of God are exemplar formal causes in this sense, for example, God’s idea of the universe in general, God’s idea of what-it-is-to-be a human being, and so forth, function, as it were, as plans or archetypes in the mind of the Creator for created substances.
The final cause of an object O is the end, goal, purpose, or function of O. Some material objects have functions as their final causes, namely, that is, artifacts and the parts of organic wholes. For example, the function of a knife is to cut, and the purpose of the heart is to pump blood. Therefore, the final cause of the knife is to cut; the final cause of the heart is to pump blood. Thomas thinks that all substances have final causes. However, Thomas (like Aristotle) thinks of the final cause in a manner that is broader than what we typically mean by function. It is a mistake, therefore, to think that all substances for Thomas have functions in the sense that artifacts or the parts of organic wholes have functions as final causes (we might say that all functions are final causes, but not all final causes are functions). For example, Thomas does not think that clouds have functions in the sense that artifacts or the parts of organic wholes do, but clouds do have final causes. In the broadest sense, that is, in a sense that would apply to all final causes, the final cause of an object is an inclination or tendency to act in a certain way, where such a way of acting tends to bring about a certain range of effects. For example, a knife is something that tends to cut. A cloud is a substance that tends to interact with other substances in the atmosphere in certain ways, ways that are not identical to the ways that either oxygen per se or nitrogen per se tends to interact with other substances.
For Thomas, the final cause is “the cause of all causes” (On the Principles of Nature, ch. 4) and so the final, formal, efficient, and material causes go “hand in hand.” If an object has a tendency to act in a certain way, for example, frogs tend to jump and swim, that tendency—final causality—requires that the frog has a certain formal cause, that is, it is a thing of a certain kind. In addition, things that jump and swim must be composed of certain sorts of stuffs and certain sorts of organs. Frogs, since they are by nature things that flourish by way of jumping and swimming, are composed of bone, blood, and flesh, as well as limbs that are good for jumping and swimming. Finally, a frog’s jumping is something the frog does insofar as it is a frog, given the frog’s form and final cause. That is to say, it is clear that the frog acts as an efficient cause when it jumps, since a frog is the sort of thing that tends to jump (rather than fly or do summersaults). Contrast the frog that is unconscious and pushed such that it falls down a hill. In so falling, the frog is not acting as an efficient cause.
As we have seen, some final causes are functions, whereas it makes better sense to say that some final causes are not functions but rather ends or goals or purposes of the characteristic efficient causality of the substances that have such final causes. In closing this section, we can note that some final causes are intrinsic whereas others are extrinsic. According to Thomas, each and every substance tends to act in a certain way rather than other ways, given the sort of thing it is; such goal-directedness in a substance is its intrinsic final causality. However, sometimes an object O acts as an efficient cause of an effect E (partly) because of the final causality of an object extrinsic to O. Call such final causality extrinsic. For example, John finds Jane attractive, and thereby John decides to go over to Jane and talk to her. John’s own desire for happiness, happiness that John currently believes is linked to Jane, is part of the explanation for why John moves closer to Jane and is a good example of intrinsic formal causality, but Jane’s beauty is also a final cause of John’s action and is a good example of extrinsic final causality.
Thomas thinks there are different kinds of knowledge, for example, sense knowledge, knowledge of individuals, scientia, and faith, each of which is interesting in its own right and deserving of extended treatment where its sources are concerned. For present purposes, we shall focus on what Thomas takes to be the sources of knowledge requisite for knowledge as scientia, and, since Thomas recognizes different senses of scientia, what Thomas takes to be the sources for knowledge as a scientific demonstration of a proposition in particular.
As we have seen, if a person possesses scientia with respect to some proposition p for Thomas, then he or she understands an argument that p such that the argument is logically valid and he or she knows the premises of the argument with certainty. Therefore, one of the sources of scientia for Thomas is the operation of the intellect that Thomas calls reasoning (ratiocinatio), that is, the act of drawing a logically valid conclusion from other propositions (see, for example, ST Ia. q. 79, a. 8). Reasoning is sometimes called by Thomists, the third act of the intellect.
How do we come to know the premises of a demonstration with certainty? Our coming to know with certainty the truth of a proposition, Thomas thinks, potentially involves a number of different powers and operations, each of which is rightly considered a source of scientia. Before we speak of the intellectual powers and operations (in addition to ratiocination) that are at play when we come to have scientia, we must first say something about the non-intellectual cognitive powers that are sources of scientia for Thomas.
Thomas agrees with Aristotle that the intellectual powers differ in kind from the sensitive powers such as the five senses and imagination. Nonetheless, Thomas also thinks that all human knowledge in this life begins with sensation. Even our knowledge of God begins, according to Thomas, with what we know of the material world. Since God, for Thomas, is immaterial, the claim that “knowledge… begins in sense” (Disputed Questions on Truth, q. 1, a. 11, respondeo) should not be thought to mean that knowledge of x requires that we can form an accurate image of x. Thomas’ claim rather means that knowledge of any object x presupposes some (perhaps prior) activity on the part of the senses. Indeed, Thomas thinks that sensation is so tightly connected with human knowing that we invariably imagine something when we are thinking about anything at all. Of course, if God exists, that means that what we imagine when we think about God bears little or no relation to the reality, since God is not something sensible. Given the importance of sense experience for knowledge for Thomas, we must mention certain sense powers that are preambles to any operation of the human intellect.
In addition to the five exterior senses (see, for example, ST Ia. q. 78, a. 3), Thomas argues that a capacious account of human cognition requires that we mention various interior senses as preambles to proper intellectual activity (see, for example, ST Ia. q. 78, a. 4). For in order for perfect animals (that is, animals that move themselves, such as horses, oxen, and human beings [see, for example, Commentary on Aristotle’s De Anima, n. 255]) to make practical use of what they cognize by way of the exterior senses, they must have a faculty that senses whether or not they are, in fact, sensing, for the faculties of sight, hearing, and so forth themselves do not confer this ability. In addition, none of the exterior senses enables their possessor to distinguish between the various objects of sense, for example, the sense of sight does not cognize taste, and so forth. Therefore, the animal must have a faculty in addition to the exterior senses by which the animal can identify different kinds of sensations, for example, of color, smell, and so forth with one particular object of experience. We might think that it is some sort of intellectual faculty that coordinates different sensations, but not all animals have reason. Therefore, animals must have an interior sense faculty whereby they sense that they are sensing, and that unifies the distinct sensations of the various sense faculties. Thomas calls this faculty, following Avicenna, the common sense (not to be confused, of course, with common sense as that which most ordinary people know and professors are often accused of not possessing). Since, for Thomas, human beings are animals too, they also possess the faculty of common sense.
In addition to the common sense, Thomas argues that we also need what philosophers have called phantasy or imagination to explain our experience of the cognitive life of animals (including human beings). For, clearly, perfect animals sometimes move themselves to a food source that is currently absent. Therefore, such animals need to be able to imagine things that are not currently present to the senses but have been cognized previously in order to explain their movement to a potential food source. On the assumption that, in corporeal things, to receive and retain are reduced to diverse principles, Thomas argues the faculty of imagination is thus distinct from the exterior senses and the common sense. He also notes that imagination in human beings is interestingly different from that of other animals insofar as human beings, but not other animals, are capable of imagining objects they have never cognized by way of the exterior senses, or objects that do not in fact exist, for example, a golden mountain.
In Thomas’ view, we cannot explain the behavior of perfect animals simply by speaking of the pleasures and pains that such creatures have experienced. Thus, we need to posit two additional powers in those animals. The estimative power is that power by which an animal perceives certain cognitions instinctively, for example, the sheep’s cognition that the wolf is an enemy or the bird’s cognition that straw is useful for building a nest (for neither the sheep nor the bird knows this simply by way of what it cognizes by way of the exterior senses). The memorative power is that power that retains cognitions produced by the estimative power. Since (a) the estimative sense and common sense are different kinds of powers, (b) the common sense and the imagination are different kinds of powers, and (c) the estimative power can be compared to the common sense whereas the memorative power can be compared to the imagination, it stands to reason that the estimative power and the memorative power are different powers.
Just as intellect in human beings makes a difference in the functioning of the faculty of imagination for Thomas, so also does the presence of intellect in human beings transform the nature of the estimative and memorative powers in human beings. As Thomas notes, this is why the estimative and memorative powers have been given special names by philosophers: the estimative power in human beings is called the cogitative power and the memorative power is called the reminiscitive power. The cogitative power in human beings is that power that enables human beings to make an individual thing, event, or phenomena, qua individual thing, event, or phenomena, an object of thought. For example, if Joe comes to believe “this man is wearing red,” he does so partly in virtue of an operation of the cogitative power, since Joe is thinking about this man and his properties (and not simply man in general and redness in general, both of which, for Thomas, are cognized by way of an intellectual and not a sensitive power; see below). Similarly, if I come to think, “I should not steal,” I do so partly by way of my cogitative power according to Thomas insofar as I am ascribing a property to an individual thing, in this case, myself. As for the reminiscitive power, it enables its possessor to remember cognitions produced by the cogitative power. In other words, it helps us to remember intellectual cognitions about individual objects. For example, say that I am trying to remember the name of a particular musician. I employ the reminiscitive power when I think about the names of other musicians who play on recordings with the musician whose name I cannot now remember but want to remember.
Having said something about the non-intellectual, cognitive sources of scientia for Thomas, we can return to speaking of the properly intellectual powers and activities of human beings necessary for scientia. According to Thomas, there are two powers of the intellect, powers Thomas calls the active intellect and the passive intellect, respectively. Thomas thinks that the intellect has what he calls a passive power since human beings come to know things they did not know previously (see, for example, ST Ia. q. 79, a. 2). In being able to do this, human beings are unlike the angels, Thomas thinks, since, according to Thomas, the angels are created actually knowing everything they will naturally know. (According to Thomas, the blessed angels do come to have supernatural knowledge, namely, knowledge of the essence of God in the beatific vision.) Following Aristotle, Thomas believes that the intellect of a human being, in contrast to that of an angel, is a tabula rasa at the beginning of its existence. The passive intellect of a human being is that which receives what a person comes to know; it is also the power by which a human being retains, intellectually, what is received. For Thomas, therefore, the passive intellect plays the role of memory where knowledge of the nature of things is concerned [see, for example, ST Ia. q. 79, a. 7). For example, say John does not know what a star is at time t. He reads about stars at t+1 and in doing so comes to know the nature of a star. Since John’s intellect has been altered such that he knows something he did not know before, there must be a power that explains this ability to receive knowledge; for Thomas, it is John’s passive intellect, that is, the intellect insofar as John can come to know something he did not know before.
Whereas the passive intellect is that which receives and retains an intelligible form, what Thomas calls the active intellect is the efficient cause intrinsic to the knowing agent that makes what is potentially knowable actually so. In Thomas’ view, anything that is understood is understood in virtue of its form. However, the forms of material things, although potentially intelligible, are not actually intelligible insofar as they configure matter, but human beings can understand material things. Therefore, since that which is brought from potency to act is done so only by that which is appropriately actual, we do not know things innately, and we sometimes experience ourselves actually understanding things, there must be a power in human beings that can cause the forms of material objects to become actually intelligible. That power is what Thomas calls the active intellect.
We can round out our discussion of Thomas’ account of the sources of scientia by speaking of the three activities of the powers of the intellect. The first act of the intellect is what Thomists call the act of simple apprehension; this is the intellect’s act of coming to understand the essence of a thing (see, for example, Commentary on Aristotle’s On Interpretation, Proeemium, n. 1). The intellectual act of simple apprehension is simple in the sense that it does not yet imply a judgment on the part of an intellect about the truth or falsity of a proposition. For example, it is by the intellect’s act of simple apprehension that a person cognizes what a thing is, that is, its quiddity, without forming true or false propositions about that quiddity such as, it exists, or it is F rather than not-F.
According to Thomas, the intellect’s simple act of apprehension is the termination of a process that involves not only the activities of intellectual powers but sensory powers, too, both exterior and interior. As we have seen, Thomas thinks that all intellection begins with sensation. Therefore, when we come to understand the essence of a material object, say a bird, the form of the bird is first received spiritually in a material organ, for example, the eye. To say that the form of the bird is received spiritually is simply to say that what is received is received as a form, where the form in question does not exist in the sense organ as it exists extra-mentally. As Stump (2003, p. 253) notes, we might think of this form, as it exists in the sense organ, as encoded information. Thomas calls this immaterial reception of the bird in the eye “the sensible species” of the object cognized. We do not, as of yet, have enough to explain an animal’s conscious awareness of what is sensed. In order for this to occur, Thomas speaks of the need of the sensible species being worked on by the power of phantasia. At that point, the agent has a phantasm of the bird; she is at least conscious of a blue, smallish object with wings. From the phantasm, including experiences of similar phantasms stored in phantasia or the reminiscitive power, the power of active intellect abstracts what Thomas calls the intelligible species from the phantasm(s), that is, leaves to one side those features the agent recognizes are accidental to the object being cognized in order to focus on the quiddity, nature, or essence of what is being cognized. The resulting quiddity is received in the possible intellect. Finally, the intelligible species is transformed into an “inner word” or “concept,” that is, there is conscious awareness of the quiddity of what has been cognized such that the quiddity is recognized as corresponding to a word such as “bird.”
So far we have spoken of the third and first acts of the intellect. The second activity of the intellect is what Thomists call judgment, but Thomas himself typically speaks of the intellect’s composing and dividing (see, for example, Commentary on Aristotle’s On Interpretation, Proeemium, n. 1, and ST Ia. q. 85, a. 5). In this act of the intellect, the intellect compares quiddities and judges whether or not this property or accident should be attributed to this quiddity. For example, Joe comes to know the quiddity of mammality and animality through the first act of intellect and judges (correctly) that all mammals are animals by way of the second act of understanding.
Since scientia for Thomas involves possessing arguments that are logically valid and whose premises are obviously true, one of the sources of scientia for Thomas is the intellect’s second act of intellect, composing and dividing, whereby the scientist forms true premises, or propositions, or judgments about reality. Since such judgments have the intellect’s first act of understanding as a prerequisite—one cannot truly judge that all mammals are animals until one apprehends animality and mammality—acts of simple apprehension are also a source of scientific knowledge for Thomas. This brings us back to where we started, with the third act of intellect, namely, ratiocination, the intellect’s ability to derive a logically valid conclusion from some other proposition or propositions, for example, judging that all mammals are animals and all animals are living things, we reason to the conclusion that all mammals are living things. To take a more interesting example, if we judge that all human beings have intellectual souls and all intellectual souls are by nature incorruptible, it follows that any human being has a part that survives the biological death of that human being.
We would be remiss not to mention God as a source of all forms of knowledge for Thomas. For all human intellection involves many instances of change, of going from a state of not-knowing that p to knowing that p, and each and every change, Thomas thinks, requires as part of its sufficient explanation the action of one being that is itself absolutely immutable (see, for example, Thomas’ so-called first way of demonstrating the existence of God at ST Ia. q. 2, a. 3, respondeo). Thomas believes (by faith) that the God of Abraham, Isaac, and Jacob is this one immutable being. Therefore, in Thomas’ view God is the primary uncaused cause of each and every act of human intellection. However, all of this is consistent, Thomas thinks, with human intellects also being real and active secondary causes of their own acts of knowing. Unlike some of his forerunners in philosophical psychology, Thomas thinks that each and every human being has his or her own agent intellect by which he or she can “light up” the phantasms in order to actually understand a thing. (Here we can contrast Thomas’ views with those of St. Augustine of Hippo, Ibn Sina [Avicenna], and Ibn Rushd [Averroes], all of whom think God or some non-human intellect plays the role of agent intellect). Although God’s act of creating and sustaining any intellectual activity is a necessary condition and the primary efficient cause for any human act of coming to know something not previously known, it is neither a sufficient condition nor the sole cause of such activity, Thomas thinks. For a human being, too, is a secondary, efficient cause of his or her coming to know something.
In Thomas’ Aristotelian understanding of science, a science S has a subject matter, and a scientist with respect to S knows the basic facts about the subject matter of S, the principles or starting points for thinking about the subject matter of S, the causes of the subject matter of S, and the proper accidents of the subject matter of S. Following Aristotle, Thomas thinks of metaphysics as a science in this sense. For Thomas, the subject matter of the science of metaphysics is being qua being or being in common, that is, being insofar as it can be said of anything that is a being. (Contrast, for example, the narrower subject matters of philosophical physics, which studies physical being insofar as it can be investigated philosophically, and natural theology, which studies immaterial being insofar as it can be studied by the power of natural reason alone.) Thomas also thinks intelligent discussion of the subject matter of metaphysics requires that one recognize that “being is said in many ways,” that is, that there are a number of different but non-arbitrarily related meanings for being, for example, being as substance, quality, quantity, or relation, being qua actual, being qua potential, and so forth. The metaphysician, minimally, can speak intelligently about the proper relationships between these many different but related meanings of “being.”
The principles of being qua being include those principles that are ever and always employed but are never themselves considered carefully in all disciplines, for example, the principle of identity and the principle of non-contradiction. The causes of being qua being are the efficient, formal, and final causes of being qua being, namely, God. Finally, the proper accidents of being qua being are “one,” “good,” “beautiful,” “same,” “whole,” “part,” and so forth. For Thomas, metaphysics involves not only disciplined discussion of the different senses of being but rational discourse about these principles, causes, and proper accidents of being.
Note that Thomas therefore thinks about the subject matter of metaphysics in a manner that differs from that of contemporary analytic philosophers. Contemporary analytic philosophers tend to think about metaphysics as the philosophical discipline that treats a collection of questions about ultimate reality (see, for example, Van Inwagen 2015, p. 3). However, this contemporary understanding of the subject matter of metaphysics is too broad for Thomas since he thinks there are philosophical disciplines distinct from metaphysics that treat matters of ultimate reality, for example, the ultimate causes of being qua movable are treated in philosophical physics or natural philosophy, the ultimate principles of human being are treated in philosophical anthropology.
For Thomas, when we think about the meaning of being wisely, we recognize that we use it analogously and not univocally. Thus, one of the things the metaphysician does, thinks Thomas, is identify, describe, and articulate the relationship between the different senses of being. Let us catalogue some of the ways Thomas uses “being,” which ways of using the expression “being” are best understood by way of emphasizing Thomas’ examples.
In one place Thomas distinguishes four different senses of being (Disputed Questions on Truth q. 21, a. 4, ad4). Being in the primary sense is substantial being, for example, Socrates, or a particular tree. However, there are also extended senses of being; there is being in the sense of the principles of substances, that is, form and matter, being in the sense of the dispositions or accidents of a substance, for example, a quality of a substance, and being in the sense of a privation of a disposition of a substance, for example, a man’s blindness. Again, although the same word is used to speak of these four realities, the term being does not have precisely the same meaning in these four cases, although all four meanings are related to the primary meaning of being as substance.
Another distinction Thomas makes where being is concerned is the distinction between being in act and being in potency. Being in potency does not actually exist now but is such that it can exist at some point in the future, given the species to which that being in potency belongs. In contrast, being in act exists now. For example, say Socrates is not tan right now but can be tan in the future, given that he is a rational animal, and rational animals are such that they can be tan. Socrates is therefore not tan in act, but rather tan in potency (see, for example, On the Principles of Nature, ch. 1). The distinction between being in act and being in potency is important because it helps solve a puzzle raised by Parmenides, namely, how something can change. If “being” can only refer to what exists in act, then there can be no change. However, if being is said in many ways, not only of what actually is but also what can be in the sense of what can become what it is not, then change can be understood as something intelligible (see, for example, Commentary on Aristotle’s Physics, lec. 6, n. 39). The viability of the distinction between being in act and being in potency can be confirmed by thinking about the way we commonly speak and think. For example, compare a rock and a very young person who is not yet old enough to see. Both of them do not actually see, but not in the same sense. For we rightly negate the ability to see of a rock; it does not actually have the ability to see, nor does it potentially have such an ability, given the sort of thing that it is. However, although a very young human person, like the rock, does not actually have the ability to see, that young person is nonetheless potentially something that sees.
If a being were fully actual, then it would be incapable of change. If a being were purely potential, then it would not, by itself, actually exist. Thus, actually existent beings capable of change are composites of act and potency. The principle of actuality in a composite being explains that the being in question actually exists or actually has certain properties whereas the principle of potentiality in a composite being explains that the being in question either need not exist—it is not in the nature of that thing to exist—or is a thing capable of substantial change such that its matter can become part of some numerically distinct substance.
Where act and potency are concerned, Thomas also distinguishes, with Aristotle, between first and second act on the one hand and active and passive potency on the other. A substance s is in first act or actuality insofar as s, with respect to some power P, actually has P. For example, the newborn Socrates, although actually a human being, only potentially has the power to philosophize and so is not in first act with respect to the power to philosophize. On the other hand, Socrates, when awaiting his trial, and being such that he is quite capable of defending the philosophical way of life, is in first act with respect to the habit of philosophy, that is, he actually has the power to philosophize. A substance s is in second act insofar as, with respect to some power P, s not only actually has P but is currently making use of P. For example, imagine that Socrates is sleeping, say, the night before he makes his famous defense of the philosophical way of life. When he is sleeping, although Socrates is in first act with respect to the power to philosophize, he is not in second act with respect to that power (although he is in potency to the second act of philosophizing). Socrates, when he is actually philosophizing at his trial, is not only in first act with respect to the power to philosophize, but also in second act.
Consider now the difference between active and passive potency. Imagine Socrates is not now philosophizing. He is resting. Nonetheless, he is potentially philosophizing. However, his potency with respect to philosophizing is an active potency, for philosophizing is something one does; it is an activity. Insofar as Socrates is not now philosophizing, but is potentially philosophizing, he has an active potency.
Now imagine Socrates is hit by a tomato at time t at his trial. Socrates can be hit by a tomato at t because he has, among other passive potencies, the ability to be hit by an object. Having the ability to be hit by an object is not an ability (or potentiality) Socrates has to F, but rather an ability (or potentiality) to have F done to him; hence, being able to be hit by an object is a passive potentiality of Socrates.
Where being is concerned, Thomas also distinguishes between beings in nature and intentional beings or beings of reason (see, for example, Commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics IV, lec. 4, n. 574). Thomas thinks that nothing can be understood, save insofar as it has being. Natural being is what philosophers (and empirical scientists) study, for example, non-living things, plants, animals, human beings, colors, virtues, and so forth. However, some beings that we think about follow upon the consideration of thinking about beings of nature, notions such as genus, species, and difference. These are the sorts of beings studied in logic, Thomas thinks. In additional to logical beings, we could also mention fictional beings such as Hamlet as an example of a being of reason.
Where the meanings of being are concerned, Thomas also recognizes the distinction between being in the sense of the essentia (essence or nature or form) or quod est (what-it-is) of a thing on the one hand and being in the sense of the esse or actus essendi or quo est (that-by-which-it-is) of a thing on the other hand (see, for example, SCG II, ch. 54). To say that a being B’s essentia differs from its esse is to say that B is composed of essentia and esse, which is just to say that B’s esse is limited or contracted by a finite essentia, which is also to say that B’s esse is participated esse, which itself is to say that B receives its esse from another. If esse and essentia do not differ in a being B1, then B1’s esse is not limited by a finite essentia, B1’s esse is not participated and so uncreated, and B1’s esse is unreceived. For Thomas, only in God are God’s esse and essentia identical.
According to Thomas, all created substances are composed of essentia and esse. The case where there is the clearest need to speak of a composition of essentia and esse is that of the angels. In speaking of act and potency in the angels, Thomas does not speak in terms of form and matter, since for Thomas matter as a principle of potentiality is always associated with an individual thing existing in three dimensions. Thomas’ Franciscan colleague at the University of Paris, St. Bonaventure, did indeed argue that angels were composed of form and spiritual matter. However, Thomas thinks the notion of spiritual matter is a contradiction in terms, for to be material is to be spread out in three dimensions, and the angels are not spread out in three dimensions. Angels are essentially immaterial beings, thinks Thomas. (This is not to say that angels cannot on occasion make use of a body by the power of God; this is how Thomas would make sense of the account of the angel Gabriel talking with the Blessed Virgin Mary in the Gospel according to Luke; whatever Mary saw when she claimed to talk to the angel Gabriel, according to Thomas, it was not a part of Gabriel. Compare the notion that angels are purely immaterial beings that nonetheless make use of bodies as instruments with Plato’s view (at least in the Phaedo) that the human body is not a part of a human being but only an instrument that the soul uses in this life.) However, because angels are not pure act—this description is reserved for the first uncaused efficient cause alone for Thomas—there is need to make sense of the fact that an angel is a composite of act and potency. Thus, Thomas speaks of a composition of essentia (being in the sense of what something is) and esse (being in the sense that a thing is) in the angels, for it does not follow from what an angel is that it exists. In other words, where we can distinguish essentia and esse in a thing, that thing is a creature, that is, it exists ever and always because God creates and conserves it in being. Of course, substances composed of form and matter, for example, human beings, non-rational animal, plants, minerals, are creatures too and so they are also composed of essentia and esse. In general, talk of essence/esse composition in created substances is Thomas’ way of making sense, for him, of the fact that such substances do not necessarily exist but depend for their existence, at every moment that they exist, upon God’s primary causal activity.
Thomas thinks there are two kinds of truths about God: (a) those truths that can be demonstrated philosophically and (b) those truths that human beings can come to know only by the grace of divine revelation. Although Thomas has much of great interest to say about (b)—see, for example, SCG, book IV, ST Ia. qq. 27-43, and ST IIIa.—this article focuses on (a): those truths that according to Thomas can be established about God by philosophical reasoning.
Thomas thinks there are at least three mutually reinforcing approaches to establishing truths about God philosophically: the way of causation; the way of negation, and the way of perfection (or transcendence). Thomas makes use of each one of these methods, for example, in his treatment of what can be said truly about God by the natural light of reason in ST.
Thomas offers what he takes to be demonstrations of the existence of God in a number of places in his corpus. (On the meaning of the term “demonstration,” see the section on Thomas’ epistemology). His most complete argument is found in SCG, book I, chapter 13. There is also an argument that Brian Davies (1992, p. 31) calls “the existence argument,” which can be found at, for example, ST Ia. q. 65, a. 1, respondeo. The most famous of Thomas’ arguments for the existence of God, however, are the so-called “five ways,” found relatively early in ST.
There are a number of things to keep in mind about the five ways. First, the five ways are not complete arguments, for example, we should expect to find some suppressed premises in these arguments. To see this, we can compare the first way of demonstrating the existence of God in ST Ia. q. 2, a. 3, which is an argument from motion, with Thomas’ complete presentation of the argument from motion in SCG, book I, chapter 13. Whereas the former is offered in one paragraph, the latter is given in 32 paragraphs.
Second, Thomas’ arguments do not try to show that God is the first mover, first efficient cause, and so forth in a temporal sense, but rather in what we might call an ontological sense, that is, in the sense that things other than God depend ultimately upon God causing them to exist at every moment that they exist. Indeed, as we shall see, Thomas does not think that God could be first in a temporal sense because God exists outside of time.
Third, as Thomas makes clear in SCG I, 13, 30, his arguments do not assume or presuppose that there was a first moment in time. As he notes there, given that the universe has a beginning, it is easier to show there is a God: “the most efficacious way to prove that God exists is on the supposition that the world is eternal. Granted this supposition, that God exists is less manifest” (Anton Pegis, trans.). Nor do the five ways attempt to prove that there was a first moment of time. Although Thomas believes there was a first moment of time, he is very clear that he thinks such a thing cannot be demonstrated philosophically; he thinks that the temporal beginning of the universe is a mystery of the faith (see, for example, ST Ia. q. 46, a. 2). Thus, if we should assume anything, for the sake of argument, about time or the duration of the world where Thomas’ arguments for the existence of God are concerned, we should assume that there is no first moment of time, that is, that the universe has always existed. Interestingly, even on such a supposition, Thomas thinks he can demonstrate philosophically that there is a God.
Fourth, as will be seen, the five ways are simply five ways of beginning to demonstrate God’s existence. For example, in ST the demonstrations of God’s existence continue beyond Ia. q. 2, a. 3, as Thomas attempts to show that a first mover, first efficient cause, first necessary being, first being, and first intelligence is also ontologically simple (q. 3), perfect (q. 4), good (qq. 5-6), infinite (q. 7), ontologically separate from finite being (q. 8), immutable (q. 9), eternal (q. 10), one (q. 11), knowable by us to some extent (q. 12), nameable by us (q. 13), knowledgeable (q. 14), such that there are ideas in that being’s mind (q. 15), such that life is properly attributed to that being (q. 18), such that will is properly attributed to that being (q. 19), and such that love is properly attributed to that being (q. 19). However, as Thomas says at the end of each of the five ways, such a being is what everyone calls “God.”
For our purposes, let us focus on one of Thomas’ five ways (ST Ia. q. 2, a. 3), the second way. Here is Thomas’ text (note that numbers have been inserted in the following text, corresponding to premises in the detailed formulation of the second way that follows):
The second way is from the nature of the efficient cause. [(1)] In the world of sense we find there is an order of efficient causes. [(3)] There is no case known (neither is it, indeed, possible) in which a thing is found to be the efficient cause of itself; for so it would be prior to itself, which is impossible. Now [(12)] in efficient causes it is not possible to go on to infinity, because [(6)] in all efficient causes following in order, the first is the cause of the intermediate cause, and the intermediate is the cause of the ultimate cause, whether the intermediate cause be several, or only one. Now [(7)] to take away the cause is to take away the effect. Therefore, [(8)] if there be no first cause among efficient causes, there will be no ultimate, nor any intermediate cause. But [(9)] if in efficient causes it is possible to go on to infinity, there will be no first efficient cause, [(10)] neither will there be an ultimate effect, nor any intermediate efficient causes; [(11)] all of which is plainly false. Therefore, [(13)] it is necessary to admit a first efficient cause, [(14)] to which everyone gives the name of God (Fathers of the English Dominican Province, trans.).
This argument might be formulated as follows:
- In the world that can be perceived by the senses, there is an order of efficient causes, for example, there is something E that is an effect of an efficient cause or causes at a time t, for example, there is an animal whose existence at t is an effect of a number of efficient causes, for example, the warmth of the earth’s atmosphere at t, there being oxygen in the atmosphere for the animal to breath at t, and the proper functioning of biological systems within the animal at t, and so forth, and some of those efficient causes of E are themselves effects of other efficient causes at t, for example, the warmth of the earth’s atmosphere at t is an effect of the sun’s warming the atmosphere of the earth at t and the proper functioning of biological systems within the animal at t is an effect of the action of certain bio-chemicals within those biological systems at t, and so forth [assumption].
- If there is an order of efficient causes, for example, there is some effect E that has x as an efficient cause at t, and x itself has y as an efficient cause at t, and y itself has z as an efficient cause at t, and so forth, then (a) there is an order of efficient causes of E at t that is infinite, (b) there exists something (E or a cause of E) that is the efficient cause of itself at t, or (c) there is an absolutely first efficient cause of E’s existence at t, that is, E’s existence has an efficient cause at t where that efficient cause itself does not itself have an efficient cause [assumption].
- Nothing can be the efficient cause of itself, all by itself, otherwise it would be metaphysically prior to itself, which is impossible [assumption].
- Therefore, if there is an order of efficient causes, for example, there is some effect E that has x as an efficient cause of its existence at t, and x itself has y as an efficient cause at t, and so forth, then (a) there is an order of efficient causes of E at t that is infinite or (c) there is an absolutely first efficient cause of E’s existence at t [from (2) and (3), conditional introduction].
- (a) There is an order of efficient causes of E at t that is infinite or (c) there is an absolutely first efficient cause of E’s existence at t [from (1) and (4), MP].
- In an order of efficient causes such that a is an efficient cause of b and b is an efficient cause of an effect c, a is a first cause of b and c and b is an intermediate cause of the effect c [assumption].
- To take away the cause is to take away the effect [assumption].
- Therefore, if it is not the case that there is an absolutely first efficient cause of an effect E’s existence at t, then there are no intermediate causes and so no effect E at t [from (6) and (7)].
- If there is an order of efficient causes of E at t that is infinite, then it is not the case that there is an absolutely first efficient cause of E’s existence at t [assumption].
- Therefore, if there is an order of efficient causes of E at t that is infinite, then there are no intermediate causes and no effect E [from (8) and (9), HS].
- It is not the case that there are no intermediate causes and no effect E [from (1)].
- Therefore, it is not the case that there is an order of efficient causes of E at t that is infinite [from (10) and (11), MT].
- Therefore, there is an absolutely first efficient cause of E’s existence at t [from (5) and (12), DS].
- An absolutely first efficient cause of E’s existence at t is what everyone calls “God” [assumption].
- Therefore, there is a God [from (13) and (14)].
The second premise, third premise, seventh premise, the inference to the eighth premise, and the fourteenth premise likely require further explanation. As for premise (2), we should note that Thomas assumes the truth of a principle often called the principle of causality. The principle of causality states that every effect has a cause. The principle of causality is a piece of common sense that arguably also plays a pivotal role in all scientific inquiry. If, for example, Susan was eating Wheaties for breakfast and suddenly a blueberry appeared on the top of her cereal, it would be reasonable for Susan to ask, “What caused the blueberry to be there?” We would not accept the following answer as a legitimate response to that question: “Nothing caused it to be there.” Of course, we might not be able to find out precisely what caused the blueberry to be there. However, we should not therefore conclude that the blueberry’s coming to be on the top of Susan’s cereal bowl does not have a cause. The principle of causality is also being invoked when scientists ask a question such as, “What causes plants to grow?” A scientist assumes the principle of causality when he or she assumes there is an answer to this question that involves causes. Of course, when it comes to our understanding of the nature of ultimate causes, it may be that we run into certain limits to human understanding. This is something Thomas admits, as will be seen below. However, we get premise two of the formulation of Thomas’ second way by applying the principle of causality to the case of the existence of some effect. Given the importance of the principle of causality in everyday life and scientific work, to deny the principle of causality in the context of doing metaphysics would seem to be ad hoc (see Feser 2009, p. 51ff. for more discussion of this point).
Premise (3) is a metaphysical principle. Consider a scenario that would constitute a denial of premise (3): there is an x such that, absolutely speaking, x causes itself to exist. However, this is not possible. Although x can be the efficient cause of itself in one respect, for example, an organism is an efficient cause of its own continued existence insofar as it nourishes itself, it cannot be the efficient cause of itself in every respect. This is easiest to see in the case of something bringing itself into existence. In order for x to perform the act of bringing x into existence at time t, x must already exist at t in order to perform such an act. However, if x already exists at t to perform the act of bringing x into existence at t, then x does not bring itself into existence at t, for x already exists at t. However, the same kind of reasoning works if x is a timelessly eternal being. To say that x is timelessly the efficient cause of its own existence is to offer an explanatory circle as an efficient causal explanation for x’s existence, which for Thomas is not to offer a good explanation of x’s existence, since circular arguments or explanations are not good arguments or explanations.
Premise (7) shows that Thomas is not in this argument offering an ultimate efficient causal explanation of what is sometimes called a per accidens series of efficient causes, that is, a series of efficient causes that stretches (perhaps infinitely) backward in time, for example, Rex the dog was efficiently caused by Lassie the dog, and Lassie the dog was efficiently cause by Fido the dog, and so forth. If he did have such a per accidens causal series in mind, then premise (7) would be subject to obvious counter-examples, for example, a sculptor is the efficient cause of a sculpture. However, it routinely happens that a sculpture outlives its sculptor. In such a case, we can take away the efficient cause (the sculptor) without taking away the effect of its efficient causation (the sculpture). Unless we are comfortable assigning to Thomas a view that is obviously mistaken, we will look for a different interpretation of premise (7).
A typical and more charitable interpretation of premise (7) is that Thomas is talking here about concurrent efficient causes and their effects, for example, in a case where a singer’s song exists only as long as the singer sings that song. This interpretation of premise (7) fits well with what we saw Thomas say about the arguments for the existence of God in SCG, namely, that it is better to assume (at least for the sake of argument) that there is no beginning to time when arguing for the existence of God, for, in that case, it is harder to prove that God exists.
With such an interpretation of premise (7) in the background, we are in a position to make sense of the inference from premises (6) and (7) to premise (8). If there were no absolutely first cause in the order of efficient causes of any effect E, then there would be nothing that ultimately existentially “holds up” E, since none of the supposed intermediate causes of E would themselves exist without an efficient cause that is not itself an effect of some efficient cause.
Finally, premise (14) simply records the intuition that if there is an x that is an uncaused cause, then there is a God. Of course, Thomas does not think he has proved here the existence of the Triune God of Christianity (something, in any case, he does not think it possible to demonstrate). Rather, Thomas believes by faith that the absolutely first efficient cause is the Triune God of Christianity. However, to show philosophically that there is a first uncaused efficient cause is enough to show that atheism is false. To put this point another way, Thomas thinks Jews, Muslims, Christians, and pagans such as Aristotle can agree upon the truth of premise (14). As will be seen, Thomas thinks it possible, upon reflection, to draw out interesting implications about the nature of an absolutely first efficient cause from a few additional plausible metaphysical principles. The more inferences Thomas draws out regarding the nature of the absolutely first efficient cause, the easier it will be to say with him (whether or not we think his arguments sound), “But this is what people call ‘God’.”
As we saw in discussing his philosophical psychology, Thomas thinks that when human beings come to know what a material object is, for example, a donkey, they do so by way of an intelligible species of the donkey, which intelligible species is abstracted from a phantasm by a person’s agent intellect, where the phantasm itself is produced from a sensible species that human beings receive through sense faculties that cognize the object of perception. Thomas thinks I can know what a thing is, for example, a donkey, since the form of a donkey and my intelligible species of a donkey are identical in species (see, for example, SCG III, ch. 49, 5). However, in Thomas’ view, we cannot possess an idea of the first cause, that is, God, in this life that is isomorphic with God’s essence, for he thinks any likeness of God that we have in our minds in this life is derived from what we know of material objects, and such a likeness is not the same in species as the form or essence of God Himself (for reasons that will become clear in what follows). Therefore, we cannot naturally know what God is. (Thomas thinks this is true even of the person who is graced by the theological virtues of faith, hope, and charity in this life; knowing the essence of God is possible for human beings, Thomas thinks, but it is reserved for the blessed in heaven, the intellects of whom have been given a special grace called the light of glory [see, for example, ST Ia. q. 12, a. 11, respondeo].) Although we cannot know what God is in this life, by deducing propositions from the conclusions of the arguments for the existence of God, Thomas thinks we can, by natural reason, come to know what God is not. For our purposes, let us focus on three pieces of negative theology in Thomas’ natural theology: that God is not composed of parts; that God is not changeable; that God does not exist in time.
To say that God is not composed of parts is to say that God is metaphysically simple (see, for example, ST Ia. q. 3), for whatever has parts has a cause of its existence, that is, is the sort of thing that is put together or caused to exist by something else. Since nothing can cause itself to exist all by itself, whatever is composed of parts has its existence caused by another. However, God, the first uncaused cause, does not have God’s existence caused by another. Therefore, God does not have parts.
As Thomas notes, the denial that God the Creator has parts shows how much God is unlike those things God creates, for all the things with which we are most familiar are composed of parts of various kinds. However, there are a number of ways in which something might be composed of parts. The most obvious sense is being composed of quantitative parts, for example, there is the top inch of me, the rest of me, and so forth. Since God is not composed of parts, God is not composed of quantitative parts.
Thomas thinks that material objects, at any given time, are also composed of a substance and various accidental forms. The substance of an object explains why that object remains numerically one and the same through time and change. For example, Thomas would say that a human being, say, Sarah, is numerically the same yesterday and today because she is numerically the same substance today as she was yesterday. However, Sarah is not absolutely the same today compared to yesterday, for today she is cheerful, whereas yesterday she was glum. Thomas calls such characteristics—forms a substance can gain or lose while remaining numerically the same substance—accidental forms or accidents. At any given time, Sarah is a composite of her substance and some set of accidental forms. Now, we have shown that God is not composed of parts. Therefore, God also is not a composite of substance and accidental forms.
God’s not being composed of substance and accidental forms shows that God does not change, for if a being changes, it has a feature at one time that it does not possess at another. However, features that a being has at one time that it does not have at another are accidental forms. Thus, beings that change are composed of substance and accidental forms. However, God is not composed of substance and accidents. Therefore, God does not change (see, for example, ST Ia. q. 9).
Indeed, the fact that God is not composed of parts shows that God is not only unchanging, but also immutable (unchangeable), for if God can change, then God has properties or features that he can gain or lose without going out of existence. However, properties or features that a being can gain or lose without going out of existence are accidental forms. Therefore, if God can change, then God is composed of substance and accidental forms. However, God is not composed of parts, including the metaphysical parts that we call substance and accidental forms. Therefore, God cannot change, that is, God is immutable.
Thomas contends that God does not exist in time (see, for example, ST Ia. q. 10). To see why he thinks so, consider what he thinks time is: a measurement of change with respect to before and after. (Thomas thinks time is neither a wholly mind-independent reality—hence it is a measurement—nor is it a purely subjective reality—it exists only if there are substances that change.) Therefore, if something does not change, it is not measured by time, that is, it does not exist in time. However, as has been seen, God is unchanging. Therefore, God does not exist in time.
Thomas thinks that we can not only know that God exists and what God is not by way of philosophy, but we can also know—insofar as we know God is the first efficient cause of creatures, exemplar formal cause of creatures, and final cause of creatures—that it is reasonable and meaningful to predicate of God certain positive perfections such as being, goodness, power, knowledge, life, will, and love. Nonetheless, in knowing that, for example, God is good is a correct and meaningful thing to say, we still do not know the essence of God, Thomas thinks, and so we do not know what God is good means with the clarity by which we know things such as triangles have three sides, mammals are animals, or this tree is flowering right now. Why this is the case will become clear in what follows.
In Thomas’ view, words are signs of concepts and concepts are likenesses of things. (For Thomas, concepts are not [usually] the objects of understanding; they are rather that by which we understand things [see, for example, ST Ia. q. 85, a. 2], like a window in a house is that by which we see what is outside the house.) Therefore, words relate to things through the medium of intellectual conception. We can therefore meaningfully name a thing insofar as we can intellectually conceive it. Although we cannot know the essence of God in this life, we can know that God exists as the absolutely first efficient cause of creatures, we can know what God is not, and, insofar as we know God as the absolutely first efficient cause of creatures and what God is not, we can know God by way of excellence. It is this last way of knowing God that allows us to meaningfully predicate positive perfections of God, thinks Thomas. Knowing God by way of excellence requires some explanation.
First, whatever perfection P exists in an effect must in some way exist in its cause or causes, otherwise P would come from absolutely nothing, and ex nihilo nihil fit (from nothing, nothing comes). (Note that the traditional theological doctrine of creation ex nihilo, which Thomas accepts, does not contradict the Greek axiom, ex nihilo nihil fit. Whereas the latter means that nothing can come from absolutely nothing, the former does not mean that creatures come from absolutely nothing. Rather, creation ex nihilo is shorthand for the view that creatures do not have a first material cause; according to the traditional doctrine of creation ex nihilo, creatures do, of course, have a first efficient, exemplar formal, and extrinsic final cause, that is, God.) Some perfections are pure and others are impure. A pure perfection is a perfection the possession of which does not imply an imperfection on the part of the one to which it is attributed; an impure perfection is a perfection that does imply an imperfection in its possessor, for example, being able to hit a home run is an impure perfection; it is a perfection, but it implies imperfection on the part of the one who possesses it, for example, something that can hit a home run is not an absolutely perfect being since being able to hit a homerun entails being mutable, and an absolutely perfect being is not mutable since a mutable being has a cause of its existence.
Second, creatures possess perfections such as justice, wisdom, goodness, mercy, power, and love. However, justice, wisdom, goodness, mercy, power, and love are pure perfections.
Third, God is the absolutely first efficient cause, which cause is simple, immutable, and timeless. Therefore, whatever pure perfections exist in creatures must pre-exist in God in a more eminent way (ST Ia. q. 4, a. 2, respondeo). Therefore, we can apply positive predicates to God, for example, just, wise, good, merciful, powerful, and loving, although not in such a way that defines the essence of God and not in a manner that we can totally understand in this life (ST Ia. q. 13, a. 1).
Not only can we meaningfully apply positive predicates to God, some such predicates can be applied to God substantially, Thomas thinks (see, for example, ST Ia. q. 13, a. 2, respondeo). One applies a name substantially to x if that name refers to x in and of itself and not merely because of a relation that things other than x bear to x. For example, the terms “Creator” and “Lord” are not said substantially of God, Thomas thinks, since such locutions imply a relation between creatures and God, and, for Thomas, it is not necessary that God bring about creatures (God need not have created and so need not have been a Creator, a Lord, and so forth). Although we come to know God’s perfection, goodness, and wisdom through reflecting upon the existence of creatures, Thomas thinks we can know that predicates such as perfect, good, and wise apply to God substantially and do not simply denote a relation between God and creatures since, as we saw above, God is the absolutely first efficient cause of the perfection, goodness, and wisdom in creatures, and there cannot be more in the effect than in the cause.
However, given the radical metaphysical differences between God and creatures, what is the real significance of substantially applying words such as good, wise, and powerful to God? Thomas knows of some philosophers, for example, Moses Maimonides (1138-1204), who take positive predications with respect to God to be meaningful only insofar as they are interpreted simply as statements of negative theology. For example, on Thomas’ reading, Maimonides thinks “God is good” should be understood simply as “God is not evil.” Thomas notes that other theologians take statements such as “God is good” to simply mean “God is the first efficient cause of creaturely goodness.” Thomas thinks there are a number of problems with these reductive theories of God-talk, but one problem that both of them share, he thinks, is that neither of them do justice to the intentions of people when they speak about God. Thomas states, “For in saying that God lives, [people who speak about God] assuredly mean more than to say that He is the cause of our life, or that He differs from inanimate bodies” (ST Ia. q. 13, a. 2, respondeo; English Dominican Fathers, trans.). According to Thomas, positive predicates such as God is good “are predicated substantially of God, although they fall short of a full representation of Him. . . So when we say, God is good, the meaning is not God is the cause of goodness, or, God is not evil, but the meaning is, Whatever good we attribute to creatures, pre-exists in God, and in a more excellent and higher way” (ST Ia. q. 13, a. 2, respondeo; English Dominican Fathers, trans.). Although it is correct to say that goodness applies to God substantially and that God is good “in a more excellent and higher way” than the way in which we attribute goodness to creatures, given that we do not know the essence of God in this life, we do not comprehend the precise meaning of “good” as applied substantially to God.
As has been seen, Thomas thinks that even within the created order, terms such as “being” and “goodness” are “said in many ways” or used analogously. Thus, we should not be surprised that Thomas thinks that a proper use of positive predications when it comes to God, for example, in the phrase, “God is wise,” involves predicating the term wise of God and human beings analogously and not univocally or equivocally (ST Ia. q. 13, a. 5). Why can we not properly predicate the term wise of God and human beings univocally? When we attribute perfections to creatures, the perfection in question is not to be identified with the creature to which we are attributing it. For example, when we say, John is wise, we do not mean to imply John is wisdom. However, given the divine simplicity, the perfections of God are to be identified with God’s very existence so that when we say God is wise, we should also say God is wisdom itself. In fact it is important to say both God is wise and God is wisdom itself when speaking of the wisdom of God, Thomas thinks. For if we say only the latter, then we may fall into the trap of thinking that God is an abstract entity such as a number (which is false, as the ways of causality, negation, and excellence imply). If we say only the former, we run the risk of thinking about God’s wisdom as though it were like our own, namely, imperfect, acquired, and so forth (which the ways of causality, negation, and excellence also show is false). Thus, when we use the word wise of John and God, we are not speaking univocally, that is, with the precisely same meaning in each instance.
On the other hand, if we merely equivocate on wise when we speak of John and God, then it would not be possible to know anything about God, which, as Thomas points out, is against the views of both Aristotle and the Apostle Paul, that is, both reason and faith. Rather, Thomas thinks we predicate wise of God and creatures in a manner between these two extremes; the term wise is not completely different in meaning when predicated of God and creatures, and this is enough for us to say we know something about the wisdom of God. Although we do name God from creatures, we know God’s manner of being wise super-exceeds the manner in which creatures are wise. It is correct to say, for example, God is wise, but because it is also correct to say God is wisdom itself, the wisdom of God is greater than human wisdom; in fact, it is greater than human beings can grasp in this life. That being said, we can grasp why it is that God’s wisdom is greater than we can grasp in this life, namely, because God is the simple, immutable, and timelessly eternal uncaused cause of creaturely perfections, including creaturely wisdom, and that is to know something very significant about God, Thomas thinks.
Thomas attributes to Plato of Athens the following view:
(P) A human being, for example, Socrates, is identical to his soul, that is, an immaterial substance; the body of Socrates is no part of him.
Thomas thinks (P) is false. In fact, in his view there are good reasons to think a human being is not identical to his or her soul. To take just one of his arguments, Thomas thinks the Platonic view of human beings does not do justice to our experience of ourselves as bodily beings. For Thomas, Plato is right that we human beings do things that do not require a material organ, namely, understanding and willing (for his arguments that acts of understanding do not make use of a material organ per se, see, for example, ST Ia. q. 75, aa. 2, 5, and 6). However, anything that sees, hears, touches, tastes, and smells is clearly also a bodily substance. We experience ourselves as something that sees, hears, touches, tastes, and smells. In short, I smell things, therefore, I am not an immaterial substance (see, for example, ST Ia. q. 76, a. 1, respondeo).
Although Thomas does not agree with Plato that we are identical to immaterial substances, it would be a mistake—or at least potentially misleading—to describe Thomas as a materialist. Like Aristotle, Thomas rejects the atomistic materialism of Democritus. In other words, Thomas would also reject the following view:
(M) Human beings are composed merely of matter.
For Thomas, (M) is false since human beings, like all material substances, are composed of prime matter and substantial form, and forms are immaterial. In fact, even non-living things such as instances of water and bronze are composed of matter and form for Thomas, since matter without form has no actual existence.
However, Thomas thinks (M) is false in the case of human beings for another reason: the substantial form of a human being—what he calls an intellect or intellectual soul—is a kind of substantial form specially created by God, one that for a time continues to exist without being united to matter after the death of the human being whose substantial form it is. To make some sense of Thomas’ views here, note that Thomas thinks a kind of substantial form is the more perfect insofar as the features, powers, and operations it confers on a substance are, to use a contemporary idiom, “emergent,” that is, features of a substance that cannot be said to belong to any of the integral parts of the substance that is configured by that substantial form, whether those integral parts are considered one at a time or as a mere collection. Here is Thomas:
It must be considered that the more noble a form is, the more it rises above (dominatur) corporeal matter, the less it is merged in matter, and the more it exceeds matter by its operation or power. Hence, we see that the form of a mixed body has a certain operation that is not caused by [its] elemental qualities (ST Ia. q. 76, a. 1, respondeo; English Dominican Fathers, trans.).
In other words, a substance’s substantial form is something above and beyond the properties of that substance’s integral parts. Why think a thing like that? Substances have powers and operations that are not identical to any of the powers and operations of that substance’s integral parts taken individually, nor are the powers conferred by a substantial form of a substance x identical to a mere summation of the powers of the integral parts of x. Thus, a mixed body such as a piece of bronze has certain powers that none of its elemental parts have by themselves nor when those elemental parts are considered as a mere sum.
Consider that Thomas thinks substantial forms fall into the following sort of hierarchy of perfection. The least perfect kind of substantial form corresponds with the least perfect kind of material substance, namely, the elements (for Thomas, elemental substances are individual instances of the kinds water, air, earth, and fire; for us they might be fundamental particles such as quarks and electrons). Thomas says that the substantial forms of the elements are wholly immersed in matter, since the only features that elements have are those that are most basic to matter. In contrast, the substantial forms of compounds, that is, instances of those non-living substance-kinds composed of different kinds of elements, for example, blood, bone, and bronze, have operations that are not caused by their elemental parts. Above the substantial forms of compounds, the substantial forms of living things, including plants, reach a level of perfection such that they get a new name: “soul” (see, for example: Disputed Question on the Soul [QDA] a. 1; ST Ia. q. 75, a.1; and ST Ia. q. 76, a.1.). For those of the 21st century, soul almost always means “immortal substance.” Thomas rather uses soul (anima) in Aristotle’s deflationary sense of “a substantial form which is the explanation for why a substance is alive rather than dead.” To see this, consider the English word “animate.” Soul (anima), for Thomas, is the principle or explanation for life or animation in a living substance. Souls are therefore substantial forms that enable plants and animals to do what all living things do: move, nourish, and reproduce themselves, things non-living substances cannot do. Next in line comes the souls or substantial forms of non-human animals, which have emergent properties to an even greater degree than the souls of plants, since in virtue of these substantial forms non-human animals not only live, move, nourish themselves, and reproduce, but also sense the world. Finally, the substantial forms of human beings have operations (namely, understanding and willing) that do not require bodily organs at all in order to operate, although such operations are designed to work in tandem with bodily organs (see, for example, SCG II, ch. 68). Since human souls do not require matter for their characteristic operations, given the principle that something’s activity is a reflection of its mode of existence (for example, if something acts as a material thing, it must be a material thing; if something acts as an immaterial thing, it must be an immaterial thing), human souls can exist apart from matter, for example, after biological death. In contrast, the substantial forms of non-human material substances are immersed in matter such that they go out of existence whenever they are separated from it (see, for example, ST Ia. q. 75, a. 3).
Since the human soul is able to exist apart from the matter it configures, the soul is a subsistent thing for Thomas, not simply a principle of being as are material substantial forms (see, for example: QDA a. 1; QDA a. 14; and ST Ia. q. 75, a. 2). However, even when it is separated from matter, a human soul remains the substantial form of a human being. As Thomas states (see, for example, ST Ia. q. 75, a. 4), a human being such as Socrates is not identical to his soul (for human beings are individual members of the species rational animal). Nonetheless, the individual soul can preserve the being and identity of the human being whose soul it is. In other words, although the soul is not identical to the human person, a human person can be composed of his or her soul alone. Thomas explains the point as follows: God creates the human soul such that it shares its existence with matter when a human being comes to exist (see, for example, SCG II, ch. 68, 3). Because the being of the human soul is numerically the same as that of the composite—again, the soul shares its being with the matter it configures whenever the soul configures matter—when the soul exists apart from matter between death and the general resurrection, the being of the composite is preserved insofar as the soul remains in existence (see, for example: SCG IV, ch. 81, 11; ST Ia. q. 76, a. 1, ad5; and ST IaIIae. q. 4, a. 5, ad2).
Consider an analogy: say Ted loses his arms and legs in a traffic accident but survives the accident. After the accident, Ted is not identical to the parts that compose him. Otherwise, we would have to say, by the law of the transitivity of identity, that Ted’s arms and legs (or the simples that composed them) were not parts of Ted before the accident. Composition is not identity. Something analogous can be said about Thomas’ views on the human soul and the human person. Although the human soul is never identical to the human person for Thomas, it is the case that after death and before the general resurrection, some human persons are composed merely of their soul.
Although the human soul can exist apart from matter between death and the general resurrection, existing separately from matter is unnatural for the human soul. The human soul, by its very nature, is a substantial form of a material substance (see, for example, SCG II, chs. 68 and 83). Given Thomas’ belief in a good and loving God, he thinks such a state can only be temporary (see, for example, SCG IV, ch. 79). Indeed, as a Catholic Christian, Thomas believes by faith that it will be only temporary, since the Catholic faith teaches there will one day be a general resurrection of the dead in which all human beings rise from the dead, that is, all intellectual souls will reconfigure matter. At that time not only will all separated souls configure matter again, by a miracle the separated soul of each human being will come to configure matter such that each human being will have numerically the same human body that he or she did in this life (see, for example: ST Suppl. q. 79, a. 1; and SCG IV, chs. 80 and 81). Human beings will then be restored to their natural state as embodied beings that know, will, and love.
Finally, since human souls are immaterial, subsistent entities, they cannot have their origin in matter (see, for example, SCG II, ch. 86). Thus, unlike material substantial forms, human souls only come to exist by way of a special act of creation on the part of God (see, for example, SCG II, ch. 87). Therefore, for Thomas, the beginning of the existence of every human person is both natural (insofar as the human parents of that person supply the matter of the person) and supernatural (insofar as God creates a person’s substantial form or intellectual soul ex nihilo).
Thomas has one of the most well-developed and capacious ethical systems of any Western philosopher, drawing as he does on Jewish, Christian, Greek, and Roman sources, and treating topics such as axiology, action-theory, the passions, virtue theory, normative ethics, applied ethics, law, and grace. His ST alone devotes some 1,000 pages in English translation to ethical issues. Where many philosophers have been content to treat topics in meta-ethics and ethical theory, Thomas also devotes the largest part of his efforts in ST, for example, to articulate the nature and relations between the particular virtues and vices. In this summary of his ethical thought, we treat, only in very general terms, what Thomas has to say about the ultimate end of human life, the means for achieving the ultimate end, the human virtues as perfections of the characteristic human powers, the logical relationship between the virtues, moral knowledge, and the ultimate and proximate standards for moral truth.
Thomas argues that in order to make sense of any genuine action in the universe we must distinguish its end or goal from the various means that a being employs in order to achieve such an end, for if a being does not act for an end, then that being’s acting in this or that way would be a matter of chance. In that case there would be no reason why the being acted as it did. In other words, the act would be unintelligible. However, for any act A in the universe, A is intelligible. Therefore, every being acts for an end (see, for example, SCG III, ch. 2). An end of an action is something (call it x) such that a being is inclined to x for its own sake and not simply as a means to achieving something other than x. A means to an end refers to something (call it y) such that a being is inclined to y for the sake of something other than y. However, some ends are what Thomas calls “ultimate.” An ultimate end is an end of action such that a being is inclined to it merely for its own sake, not also as a means to some further end.
Thomas thinks we can apply this general theory of action to human action. For example, although wealth might be treated as an end by a person relative to the means that a person employs to achieve it, for example, working, Thomas thinks it is obvious that wealth is not an ultimate end, and even more clearly, wealth is not the ultimate end. This distinction between an ultimate end and the ultimate end is important and does not go unnoticed by Thomas. He is willing to take seriously the possibility that human life might have several ultimate ends (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 1, a. 5). For example, we might think that knowledge, virtue, and pleasure are each ultimate ends of human life, that is, things we desire for their own sake and not also as means to some further end. However, Thomas thinks it is clear that a human being really has only one ultimate end. This is because the ultimate end—as Thomas understands the term—is more than simply something we seek merely for its own sake; it is something such that all by itself it entirely satisfies one’s desire. Say that John desires pleasure and virtue as ends in themselves, and pleasure and virtue do not necessarily come and go together in this life (some things that are pleasant are not compatible with a life of virtue; sometimes the virtuous life entails doing what is unpleasant). Thus, neither of these could be equivalent to the ultimate end for John; for John’s having one without the other, there would still be something that John desires, and possession of the ultimate end sates all of one’s desires. In that case, if pleasure and virtue are both ends in themselves, then at most they must be component parts of an ultimate end construed as a complex whole.
Thus, for Thomas, each and every human being (like all beings) has one ultimate end. However, do all human beings have the same ultimate end? Thomas thinks so, and he believes that, in one sense, this should not be controversial. All human beings think of happiness as the ultimate end of human beings. Of course, Thomas recognizes that to speak about the ultimate end as “happiness” is still to speak about the ultimate end in very abstract terms, or, as Thomas puts it, to speak merely of the “notion of the ultimate end” (rationem ultimi finis) (ST IaIIae. q. 1, a. 7). Four people might agree that their goal in life is to be happy but disagree with one another (greatly) about that in which a happy life consists. For Thomas, this claim is not the same as the claim that human beings choose different means to achieving happiness. Although this is undoubtedly true, what Thomas means to say here is that people disagree about the nature of the happy life itself, for example, some think the ultimate end itself is the acquisition of wealth, others enjoying certain pleasures, whereas others think the happy life is equivalent to a life of virtuous activity. To see Thomas’ point, compare John and Jane, both of whom plan to rob a bank. John (unthinkingly) takes the acquisition of a great sum of wealth to be his ultimate end. Jane realizes that wealth is really merely an instrumental good and has already planned to retire to a vacation resort, which she (still shortsightedly) takes to be the object of human happiness.
Although people certainly disagree about what happiness is in the concrete, Thomas maintains that there are objective truths about the nature of happiness. (It is important to emphasize here that if one thinks that there are ways in which all of us must live if we are to be counted as genuinely happy, for example, by displaying and acting in accord with the moral virtues, then one can also think there are nearly an infinite number of ways that we can manifest those virtues, for example, as doctors, lawyers, teachers, artists, mechanics, engineers, priests, lay persons, and so forth.) If we take Thomas’ manner of speaking about human happiness in ST as demonstrative of his own position—what we have here, after all, is one long chain of arguments—Thomas also thinks that it is possible to offer a convincing argument for what it is that, objectively, fulfills a human being qua human being. However, Thomas also shows sensitivity to the role that our moral habits play in forming our beliefs—and so which arguments we will find convincing—regarding the nature of the good life for human beings (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 1, a. 7).
Before leaving the subject of the ultimate end of human action, we should note two other respects in which Thomas thinks the expression “ultimate end” (or “happiness”) is ambiguous. First, it is one thing to speak about the happiness that human beings can possess in this life, what Thomas sometimes calls “imperfect human happiness,” and another to speak about the happiness possessed by God, the angels, and the blessed, which Thomas considers to be perfect (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 4, a. 5). Thomas calls this worldly human happiness imperfect not only because he thinks it pales by comparison with the perfect happiness enjoyed by the saints in heaven, but also because he reads Aristotle—whose discussion of happiness is very important for Thomas’ own—as thinking about this worldly human happiness as imperfect. Thomas notes that, after Aristotle identifies the general characteristics of human happiness in NE, book I, ch. 7, Aristotle goes on to note in chapter 10 that human beings cannot be happy in this life, absolutely speaking, or perfectly, since human beings in this life can lose their happiness, and not being able to lose their happiness is something human beings desire. Thus, Aristotle himself thinks of human happiness in this life as imperfect in comparison to the conditions he lays out in NE, book I, ch. 7. Aristotle thinks humans are happy in this life merely as human beings, that is, as beings whose nature is mutable.
Second, Thomas recognizes two different kinds of questions we might wish to raise when we think about the nature of human happiness (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 1, a. 8 and q. 2, a. 7). When asking about the nature of human happiness, we might be asking what is true about the person who is happy. As Thomas puts it, this is to focus our attention on the use, possession, or attainment of happiness by the one who we are describing as (at least hypothetically) happy. To speak about happiness in this sense is to make claims about what has to be true about the soul of the person who is happy, for example, that happiness is an activity of the soul and not merely a state of the soul or an emotion, that it is a speculative rather than a practical activity, that this activity does not require a body, and so forth. However, in asking about the happiness of human beings, we might rather be asking about the object of happiness, or as Thomas puts it, “the thing itself in which is found the aspect of good” (ST IaIIae q. 1, a. 8). For example, the end of a hungry man in the sense of the object of his desire is food; the end of the hungry man in the sense of attainment is eating.
What constitutes happiness for Thomas? Thomas agrees with Aristotle that the attainment of happiness consists in the soul’s activity expressing virtue and, particularly, the best virtue of contemplation where the object of such contemplation is the best possible object, that is, God. Thus, the object of human happiness, whether perfect or imperfect, is the cause of all things, namely, God, for human beings desire to know all things and desire the perfect good. However, this is just another way to talk about God. Therefore, whether they consciously know it or not, all human beings desire contemplative union with God. Thomas thinks that human beings in this life—even those who possess the infused virtues, whether theological or moral (about which more is said below)—at best attain happiness only imperfectly since their contemplation and love of God is, at best, imperfect. For Thomas, only human happiness in heaven is perfect insofar as God brings it about that persons in heaven enjoy a perfect intellectual and volitional union with God. Thomas calls such a union the beatific vision.
Thomas thinks that happiness is the goal of all human activity. That suggests that human beings normally achieve happiness by means of human actions, that is, embodied acts of intellect and will (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 6, prologue). However, Thomas also thinks there are certain kinds of human actions that conduce to happiness. One complication, however, arises from the fact that Thomas thinks that we can speak about both imperfect and perfect happiness, the latter which is a happiness that human beings can only possess by God’s grace helping us transcend (but not setting aside) human nature. This latter happiness culminates for the saints in the beatitudo (blessedness) of heaven. Thus, according to Thomas, there are, in reality, two mutually reinforcing stories to tell about those human actions that lead to happiness. Since our focus here is on Thomas’ philosophy, we shall focus on what follows on what Thomas has to say about the relation between virtuous actions and imperfect happiness in this life. (We will nonetheless have occasion to discuss a few things about Thomas’ views on perfect happiness.)
Thomas’ primary concern in the place where he provides his most detailed outline of the good human life—ST IaIIae.—is explaining how human beings achieve happiness by means of virtuous human actions, especially morally virtuous actions (for more on the difference between intellectual virtue and moral virtue, see the section below on Human Virtues as Perfections of Characteristically Human Powers). Thomas, like Aristotle and Jesus of Nazareth (see, for example, Matthew 5:48), is a moral perfectionist in the sense that the means to human happiness comes not by way of merely good human actions, but by way of perfect or virtuous moral actions. Thus, in order to understand Thomas’ understanding of morality and the good life, we have to say something about his understanding of virtuous moral activity. However, what are morally virtuous human actions? In general terms, Thomas thinks virtuous human actions are actions that perfect the human agent that performs them, that is, good human actions are actions that conduce to happiness for the agent that performs them. An act is perfective of an agent relative to the kind to which the agent belongs. Since human beings are rational animals by nature, then virtuous human actions are actions that perfect the rationality and animality of human beings. Of course, this is still to speak about actions that conduce to happiness in very abstract terms. Thomas has much to say about the specific characteristics of virtuous human action, especially morally virtuous action.
First of all, good or happiness conducive human actions are pleasant for Thomas. Thomas goes so far as to say that intellectual pleasure (or delight) is even a necessary or proper accident of human activity in heaven (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 4, a. 1; and ST IaIIae. q. 34, a. 3). Thomas also sees pleasure as a necessary feature of the kind of happiness humans can have in this life, if only because virtuous activity—at the center of the good life for Thomas—involves taking pleasure in those virtuous actions (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 31, a. 4; ST IaIIae. q. 31, a. 5, ad1; and ST IaIIae. q. 35, a. 5). Both intellectually and morally virtuous actions are pleasant in themselves, thinks Thomas; in fact, he thinks they are the most pleasant of activities in themselves (ST IaIIae. q. 31, a. 5).
However, it is not just intellectual pleasure that belongs to virtuous human action in this life for Thomas, but bodily pleasure, too. For we are bodily creatures and not simply souls, and so human perfection (happiness) must make reference to the body (ST IaIIae. q. 59, a. 3). Thomas rejects the view, held by some Stoics, that all bodily pleasures are evil. As Thomas notes, it is natural for human beings to experience bodily and sensitive pleasures in this life (ST IaIIae. q. 34, a. 1). Therefore, the perfection of a bodily nature such as ours will involve not only intellectual pleasures, but bodily and sensitive pleasures, too.
Nonetheless, Thomas thinks it is true that bodily pleasure tends to hinder the use of reason, and this for three reasons (ST IaIIae. q. 33, a. 3). First, bodily pleasures, as powerful as they are, can distract us from the work of reason. Second, bodily pleasures can be contrary to reason, particularly those that are enjoyed in excess. Third, bodily pleasures can weaken or fetter the reason in a way analogous to how the drunkard’s use of reason is weakened. However, despite all of this, Thomas does not think that bodily pleasure is something evil by definition, and this for two reasons. First, pleasure is taking repose in an apparent good; but if we take repose in a manner that is consistent with reason, such pleasure is good, otherwise, it is not. Second, taking pleasure in an action is more akin to that action than a desire to act since the desire to act precedes the act whereas the pleasure in acting does not. However, desiring to do good is something good, whereas desiring to do evil is itself evil. A fortiori, taking pleasure in doing good is itself something good whereas taking pleasure in evil is something evil.
However, perhaps some bodily pleasures are evil by definition. For example, there have been philosophers and religious teachers that teach that sexual pleasure is evil insofar as it hinders reason. Although Thomas agrees that sexual pleasure hinders reason, he disagrees that sexual pleasure is bad per se. Recall that a bodily pleasure hinders reason for one of three reasons: it distracts us from using reason, it is inconsistent with reason, or it weakens reason. Thomas does not think that sexual pleasure per se is inconsistent with reason, for it is natural to feel pleasure in the sexual act (indeed, Thomas says that, before the Fall, the sexual act would have been even more pleasurable [see, for example, ST Ia. q. 98, a. 2, ad3]), and performing the sexual act within marriage is, all other things being equal, something natural and good. Thus, sexual pleasure must hinder reason insofar as it distracts us from using reason or weakens reason. However, this need not be morally evil, even a venial sin, as long as it is not inconsistent with reason, just as sleep, which hinders reason, is not necessarily evil, for as Thomas notes, “Reason itself demands that the use of reason be interrupted at times” (ST IaIIae. q. 34, a. 1, ad1).
Although virtuous actions are pleasant for Thomas, they are, more importantly, morally good as well. What does this mean for Thomas? We can begin with the fact that, according to Thomas, morally good actions are moral rather than amoral. However, moral actions have being voluntary as a necessary condition. Voluntary acts are acts that arise (a) from a principle intrinsic to the agent and (b) from some sort of knowledge of the end of the act on the part of the agent (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 6, a. 1). For example, the movements of a plant do not meet the necessary condition of being voluntary, according to Thomas. This is because plants do not have cognitive powers and so have no apprehension of the end of their actions. To take another example, insofar as a squirrel moves towards an object on the basis of apprehending that object by way of its sense faculties, the squirrel’s act is, in a sense, a voluntary one (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 6, a. 2).
However, an action’s being voluntary is not a sufficient condition for that action counting as a moral action according to Thomas. More than being voluntary, moral actions must be perfectly voluntary in order to count as moral actions. A perfectly voluntary action is an action that arises (a) from knowledge of the end of an action, understood as an end of action, and (b) from knowledge that the act is a means to the end apprehended (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 6, a. 2). This is just to say that perfectly voluntary actions are caused by rational appetite, or will, for Thomas. Therefore, although irrational animals (such as squirrels) can be said, in a sense, to act voluntarily, they cannot be understood to be acting morally, since they do not cognize the end as an end and do not understand their actions to be a means to such an end. Indeed, insofar as an act of a human being does not arise from an act of will, for example, when someone moves his or her arm while he or she is asleep, that action is not perfectly voluntary and so is not a moral action for Thomas (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 1, a. 1).
Morally virtuous action is moral (rather than amoral) action, and so it is perfectly voluntary. However, morally virtuous activity is also intentional and deliberate. Here we see a connection between the virtue of prudence and the other moral virtues. Prudence is that virtue that enables one to make a virtuous decision about what, for example, courage calls for in a given situation, which is often (but not always) acting in a mean between extremes. In other words, prudence is the virtue of rational choice (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 57, a. 5). Without prudence, human action may be good but not virtuous since virtuous activity is a function of rational choice about what to do in a given set of circumstances; although, as we shall see, virtuous action arises from a virtuous habit, and virtuous action is not habitual in the sense that we “do it without even thinking about it.”
Although morally virtuous action is more than simply morally good action, it is at least that. However, how does Thomas distinguish morally good actions from bad or indifferent ones? First of all, Thomas thinks that some kinds of actions are bad by definition. As Thomas would put it, such actions are bad according to their genus or species, no matter the circumstances in which those actions are performed. For example, an act of adultery is a species of action that is immoral in and of itself insofar as such acts necessarily have the agent acting immoderately with respect to sexual passion as well as putting preexisting or potential children at great risk of being harmed (ST IIaIIae. q. 154, a. 8, respondeo). An action, therefore, that counts as morally good—and so is conducive to living what we might call a good life—cannot be an action that is morally bad according to its genus or species.
Second, there are circumstances surrounding an action that affect the moral goodness or badness of an action. For example, Thomas thinks that it is morally permissible for a community to put a criminal to death on the authority of the one who governs that community. However, if those in authority in a community have set a timetable for an execution, say, that it should occur no sooner than Wednesday at 5 PM, and John the executioner, on his own authority, kills the prisoner on Wednesday at 10 AM (where John is not also an authority in the community), then the circumstances of John’s act of killing make what might otherwise have been a morally permissible act to be an immoral act. Sometimes circumstances make an action that is bad according to its species even worse. For example, it is morally wrong to murder. However, if someone murders his father, he commits patricide, which is a more grievous act than the act of murdering a stranger.
Third, motivations count as another form of circumstance that make an action bad, good, better, or worse than another. If Jane obeys her parents because of her love for God while Joan does so because she is afraid of being punished, although Joan’s act can still be morally praiseworthy, it is not as praiseworthy as Jane’s, since Jane’s motivation for moral action is better than Joan’s.
In putting these three “sources” for offering a moral evaluation of a particular human action together—kind of action, circumstances surrounding an action, and motivation for action——Thomas thinks we can go some distance in determining whether a particular action is morally good or bad, as well as how good or bad that action is. For example, Thomas thinks lying by definition is morally bad (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 110, a. 3). However, not all lies are equally bad. If someone lies in order to get an innocent person killed, one commits a mortal sin (the effect of which is, if one dies without repenting of such a sin, one will go to hell). However, if one tells a lie in order to save a person’s innocent life, one does something morally wrong, but such moral wrongdoing counts only as a venial sin, where venial sins harm the soul but do not kill charity or grace in the soul (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 110, a. 4).
Morally virtuous action, therefore, is minimally morally good action—morally good or neutral with respect to the kind of action, good in the circumstances, and well-motivated. However, it is also action that arises from a good moral habit, that is, a moral virtue, which good moral habits make it possible easily and gracefully to act with moral excellence. To be sure, in many cases, moral virtues are acquired by way of good actions. However, one morally good action is not necessarily a morally virtuous act. This is because virtuous actions arise from a habit such that one wills to do what is virtuous with ease. The person who does what the virtuous person does, but with great difficulty, is at best continent or imperfectly virtuous—a good state of character compared to being incontinent or vicious to be sure—but not perfectly virtuous.
One way that Thomas often sums up the conditions for morally virtuous action we have been discussing is to say that morally virtuous action consists in a mean between extremes (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 60, a. 4). In acting temperately, for example, one must eat the right amount of food in a given circumstance, for the right reason, in the right manner, and from a temperate state of moral character. If, for example, John eats the right amount of food on a day of feasting (where John rightly eats more on such days than he ordinarily does), but does so for the sake of vain glory, his eating would nonetheless count as excessive. If, on the other hand, John eats the right amount of food on a day of mourning (where John rightly eats less on such days than he ordinarily does) for the sake of vain glory, this would be deficient (compare ST IaIIae. q. 64, a. 1, ad 3). Of course, John might also eat too much on a given day, or too little, for example, on a day marked for feasting and celebration. Such actions would also be excessive and deficient, respectively, and not morally virtuous.
So far we have discussed Thomas’ account of the nature of the means to happiness as moral virtue bearing fruit in morally virtuous action. One might wonder how we acquire the virtues. Although we have a natural desire for some of the virtues, the actual possession of the virtues is not in us by nature. How do we come to possess the virtues according to Thomas? Here, it is again worth pointing out that there are two stories to tell, since Thomas thinks there are really two different kinds of virtue, one which disposes us to act perfectly in accord with human nature and one which disposes us to perform acts which transcend human nature (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 54, a. 3). These two kinds of virtues correspond with the two different ends of human beings for Thomas, one that is natural, that is, the imperfect happiness attainable by human beings in this life by the natural light of reason and the natural inclination of the will, and one that is supernatural and comes to us only by grace, that is, the perfect happiness of the saints in heaven, in which happiness Christians can begin to participate even in this life, Thomas thinks.
According to Thomas, human beings can acquire virtues that perfect human beings according to their natural end by repeatedly performing the kinds of acts a virtuous person performs, that is, by habituation. Thomas calls such virtues human (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 54, a. 3; ST IaIIae. q. 55, aa. 1-3; and ST IaIIae. q. 61, a. 1, ad2) in order to distinguish such virtues from “infused” (or, to use concepts Thomas finds in Aristotle, “god-like,” “heroic” or “super-human”) virtues, which are virtues we have only by way of a gift from God, not by habituation. For example, we can imagine that, apart from any special gift of the God, Socrates was courageous in the sense that Socrates acquired the ability to habitually say “yes” to pains that are in accord with right reason in much the same way that an athlete or a musician voluntarily becomes more skilled or proficient in what they do through practice, that is by doing (or at least approximating) what good athletes and virtuosi do. Before saying more about human virtue, which is our focus here, it will be good to say a few things about infused virtue since this is an important topic for Thomas, and Thomas’ views on infused virtue are historically very important.
Like human virtues, infused virtues are perfections of our natural powers that enable us to do something well and to do it easily. For example, the virtue of faith enables its possessor, on a given occasion, to believe that “God exists and rewards those who seek Him” (Hebrews 11:6) and to do so confidently and without also thinking it false that God exists, and so forth. In addition, as in the case of human virtues, we are not born with the infused virtues; virtues, for Thomas, are acquired.
However, infused virtues differ from human virtues in a number of interesting ways. First, unlike human virtues, which enable us to perfect our powers such that we can perform acts that lead to a good earthly life, infused virtues enable us to perfect our powers such that we can perform acts in this life commensurate with—and/or as a means to—eternal life in heaven (ST IaIIae. q. 62, a. 1).
Second, whereas a human virtue, for example, human temperance, is acquired by habituation, that is, by repeatedly performing the kinds of actions that are performed by the temperate person, infused virtues are wholly gifts from God. Thomas cites St. Augustine in this regard: “Virtue is a good quality of the mind, by which we live righteously, of which no one can make a bad use, which God works in us, without us (ST IaIIae. q. 55, a. 4, obj. 1; emphasis mine). To see clearly this difference between human and infused virtue according to Thomas, note that Thomas thinks that neither infused nor human virtue makes a human being impervious to committing mortal sin. (For Thomas, a mortal sin is a sin that kills supernatural life in the soul, where such supernatural life makes one fit for the supernatural reward of heaven. Mortal sins require intentionally and deliberately doing what is grievously morally wrong. Contrast a mortal sin with a venial sin. Although venial sin can lead to mortal sin, and so ought to be avoided, a venial sin does not destroy supernatural life in the human soul.) Does Socrates lose his human virtue, for example, his courage, if he commits a mortal sin? Thomas thinks the answer is “no.” This is because naturally acquired virtues are virtues acquired through habituation, and one sinful act does not destroy a habit acquired by way of the repetition of many acts of one kind (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 63, a. 2, ad2). However, since infused virtues are not acquired through habituation but are rather a function of being in a state of grace as a free gift from God, and sinning mortally causes one to no longer be in a state of grace, just one mortal sin eliminates the infused virtues in the soul (although imperfect forms of them can remain, for example, unformed faith and hope [see below]). Of course, such mortal sins can be forgiven, Thomas thinks, by God’s grace through the sacrament of penance, thereby restoring a soul to the state of grace (see, for example, ST IIIa. q. 86, a. 1, respondeo).
Thomas speaks of at least two different kinds of infused virtue. First, there are the well-known theological virtues of faith, hope, and charity (see, for example, St. Paul’s First Letter to the Corinthians, ch. 13). In general, the theological virtues direct human beings toward their supernatural end, specifically in relation to God himself. In other words, they are gifts of God that enable human beings to look to God himself as the object of a happiness that transcends the natural powers of human beings. Faith is the infused virtue that enables its possessor to believe what God has supernaturally revealed. Hope is the infused virtue that enables its possessor to look forward to God Himself—and not some created image of God—being the object of his or her perfect bliss. Finally, the virtue of charity creates a union of friendship between the soul of its possessor and God—a union that is not natural to human beings but requires that God raise up the nature of its possessor to God. In comparison to charity, faith and hope are imperfect infused virtues, since, unlike charity, faith and hope connote the lack of complete possession of God (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 66, a. 6, respondeo). As has been seen, perfect human happiness (qua possession) consists of the beatific vision. However, if we have faith, we do not have vision. If we have hope, we do not yet possess that for which we hope. Therefore, among the theological virtues, only charity remains in the saints in heaven. Thomas thinks this is one reason why St. Paul says, “The greatest of these [three virtues, that is, faith, hope, and charity] is charity.”
Unlike the intellectual and moral virtues—whether infused or human—the theological virtues do not observe the mean where their proper object, that is, God, is concerned, for Thomas thinks it is not possible to put faith in God too much, to hope too much in God, or to love God more than one should (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 64, a. 4).
Second, in addition to the theological virtues, there are also the infused versions of the intellectual and moral virtues (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 63, a. 3; on the distinction between intellectual and moral virtue, see below). Why infused virtues of this type? Whereas the theological virtues direct human beings to God Himself as object of supernatural happiness, the infused intellectual and moral virtues are those virtues that are commensurate with the theological virtues—and thus direct us to a supernatural perfection—where things other than God are concerned. Just as human beings are naturally directed to both God and creatures through their natural desires and through virtues that can be acquired naturally, so human beings, by the grace of God, can be supernaturally directed both to God and creatures through the theological and the infused intellectual and moral virtues, respectively. As Thomas says in one place, where the human moral virtues, for example, enable human beings to live well in a human community, the infused moral virtues make human beings fit for life in the kingdom of God (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 63, a. 4).
Thomas thinks there are a number of human virtues, and so in order to offer an account of what he has to say about humanly virtuous activity (and its relationship to the imperfect human happiness we can have in this life), we need to mention the different kinds of human virtues. In order to do this, we have to examine the various powers that human beings possess, since, for Thomas, mature human beings possess various powers, and virtues in human beings are perfections of the characteristically human powers (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 55, a. 1).
First, there are the rational powers of intellect and will. Although Thomas thinks that intellect enables human beings to do a number of different things, most important for the moral life is intellect’s ability to allow a human being to think about actions in universal terms, that is, to think about an action as a certain kind of action, for example, a voluntary action, or as a murder, or as one done for the sake of loving God. Our ability to do this—which separates us from irrational animals, Thomas thinks—is a requisite condition for being able to act morally. Since a gorilla, we might suppose, cannot think about actions in universal terms, it cannot perform moral actions.
Second, Thomas also distinguishes between the apprehensive powers of the soul, that is, powers such as sense and intellect that are productive of knowledge of some sort, and the appetitive powers of the soul, which are powers that incline creatures to a certain goal or end in light of how objects are apprehended by the senses and/or intellect as desirable or undesirable. The will, according to Thomas, is an appetitive power always linked with the operation of intellect. For Thomas, intellect and will always act in tandem. Since the object of will—that is, what it is about—is being insofar as the intellect presents it as desirable, Thomas thinks of will as rational appetite. The will is therefore an inclination in rational beings towards an object or act because of what the intellect of that being presents of that object or act as something desirable or good in some way.
In addition to the appetitive power of the will, there are appetitive powers in the soul that produce acts that by nature require bodily organs and therefore involve bodily changes, namely, the acts of the soul that Thomas calls passions or affections. These include not only emotions such as love and anger, but pleasure and pain, as well (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 31, a. 1).
Thomas thinks there are two different kinds of appetitive powers that produce passions in us, namely, the concupiscible power and the irascible power. The object of the concupiscible power is sensible good and evil insofar as a creature desires/wants to avoid such sensible goods/evils in- and-of-themselves. Thus, the concupiscible power produces in us the passions of love, hate, pleasure, and pain or sorrow. By contrast, the object of the irascible power is sensible good and evil insofar as such good/evil is difficult to acquire/avoid. Thomas therefore associates the passions of anger, fear, and hope with the irascible power.
In contrast to Socrates of Athens, who, according to Thomas, thinks all human virtues are intellectual virtues (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 58, a. 2), Thomas distinguishes intellectual and moral virtues since he thinks human beings are both intellectual and appetitive beings. Since virtues are dispositions to make a good use of one’s powers, Thomas distinguishes virtues perfecting the intellect—called the intellectual virtues—from those that perfect the appetitive powers, that is, the moral virtues. Unlike the moral virtues, which automatically confer the right use of a habit, intellectual virtues merely confer an aptness to do something excellently (ST IaIIae. q. 57, a. 1). For example, John might have an intellectual virtue such that he can easily solve mathematical problems. However, John might use such a habit for evil purposes. On the other hand, if John is courageous, he cannot make use of his habit of courage to do what is wrong. If John were to do what is morally wrong, it would be in spite of his moral virtues, not because of them.
Following Aristotle, Thomas mentions five intellectual virtues: wisdom (sapientia), understanding (intellectus), science (scientia), art (ars), and prudence (prudentia). First, there are the purely speculative intellectual virtues. These intellectual virtues do not essentially aim at some practical effect but rather aim simply at the consideration of truth. Understanding is the speculative intellectual virtue concerning the consideration of first principles, that is, those propositions that are known through themselves and not by way of deduction from other propositions, for example, the principle of non-contradiction, and propositions such as all mammals are animals and it is morally wrong to kill an innocent person intentionally. Wisdom is the intellectual virtue that involves the ability to think truly about the highest causes, for example, God and other matters treated in metaphysics. As we saw in the section on the nature of knowledge and science above, science (considered as a virtue) is the intellectual ability to draw correct conclusions from first principles within a particular subject domain, for example, there is the science of physics, which is the ability to draw correct conclusions from the first principles of being qua material being.
Second, there are two intellectual virtues, namely, art and prudence, to which it belongs essentially to bring about some practical effect. Thomas defines art as “right reason about certain works to be made” (ST IaIIae. q. 57, a. 3, respondeo). Art is therefore unlike the first three of the intellectual virtues mentioned—which virtues are purely speculative—since art necessarily involves the practical effect of bringing about the work of art (if I simply think about a work of art without making a work of art, I am not employing the intellectual virtue of ars). Thomas considers art nonetheless to be an intellectual virtue because the goodness or badness of the will is irrelevant where the exercise of art itself is concerned. (Beethoven may or may not have been a morally bad man all the while he composed the 9th symphony, but we need not consider the moral status of Beethoven’s appetites when we consider the excellence of his 9th symphony qua work of art).
Finally, there is prudence. Prudence is the habit that enables its possessor to recognize and choose the morally right action in any given set of circumstances. As Thomas puts it: “Prudence is right reason of things to be done” (ST IaIIae. q. 57, a. 4, respondeo). Prudence is not a speculative intellectual virtue for the same reason ars is not: the human being exercising the virtue of prudence is not simply thinking about an object but engaged in bringing about some practical effect (so, for example, the philosopher who is simply thinking about the right thing to do without actually doing the morally right thing is not exercising the virtue of prudence, even if said philosopher is, in fact, prudent). Prudence also differs from ars in a crucial way: whereas one can exercise the virtue of ars without rectitude in the will, for example, one can bring about a good work of art by way of a morally bad action, one cannot exercise the virtue of prudence without rectitude in the will. Indeed, we do not find prudence in a person without also finding in that person the moral virtues of justice, courage, and temperance. Thus, not only is prudence necessarily practical, its exercise necessarily involves someone (a) habitually acting with a good will and (b) possessing appetites for food, drink, and sex that are habitually measured by right reason.
Why, then, is prudence an intellectual virtue for Thomas? Recall that Thomas thinks that virtue is the perfection of some power of the soul. Thomas therefore thinks the essential difference between the intellectual and moral virtues concerns the kinds of powers they perfect. Intellectual virtues perfect the intellect while moral virtues are perfections of the appetitive powers. However, prudence is essentially a perfection of intellect, and so it is an intellectual virtue. Nonetheless, it “has something in common with the moral virtues,” (ST IaIIae. q. 58, a. 3, ad1) Thomas says, insofar as it is concerned with things to be done. This is why, Thomas thinks, prudence is also reckoned among the moral virtues by authors such as Cicero and St. Augustine. Indeed, some philosophers call prudence a “mixed” virtue, partly intellectual and partly moral.
According to Thomas, moral virtue “perfects the appetitive part of the soul by directing it to good as defined by reason” (ST IaIIae. q. 59, a. 4, respondeo). Since the moral virtues are perfections of human appetitive powers, there is a cardinal or hinge moral virtue for each one of the appetitive powers (recall that prudence is the cardinal moral virtue that perfects the intellect thinking about what is to be done in particular circumstances). As has been seen, Thomas thinks there are three appetitive powers: the will, the concupiscible power, and the irascible power. Thus, there are three cardinal moral virtues: justice (which perfects the faculty of will); temperance (perfecting the concupiscible power), and fortitude (perfecting the irascible power). Where prudence perfects intellect itself thinking about what is to be done, justice is intellect disposing the will such that a person is “set in order not only in himself, but also in regard to another” (ST IaIIae. q. 66, a. 4). According to Thomas, temperance is the virtue whereby the passions of touch participate in reason so that one is habitually able to say “no” to desires of the flesh that are not in accord with right reason (ST IaIIae. q. 61, a. 3). Finally, fortitude is the virtue whereby the desire to avoid suffering participates in reason such that one is habitually able to say “yes” to suffering insofar as right reason summons us to do so (ST IaIIae q. 61, a. 3).
This is just the tip of the iceberg of what Thomas has to say by way of characterizing the human virtues and their importance for the good life. In addition, Thomas has a lot to say about the parts of the cardinal virtues and the virtues connected to the cardinal virtues, not to mention the vices that correspond with these virtues (see, for example, his treatment of these issues in ST IIaIIae).
Virtue ethicists have traditionally been interested in defending a position on the logical relations between the human virtues. For example, we might wonder whether one can really be courageous without also being temperate. Thomas is no exception to this rule. As has been seen, there are two kinds of human virtues, intellectual and moral. Where specifying the relations between the human moral virtues are concerned, Thomas thinks it important to distinguish two senses of human moral virtue, namely, perfect human moral virtue and imperfect human moral virtue (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 65, a. 1). An imperfect human moral virtue, for example, imperfect courage, is a disposition such that one simply has a strong inclination or desire to do good deeds, in this case, courageous deeds. Perfect human moral virtues, by contrast, are dispositions such that one is inclined to do good deeds well, that is, in the right way, at the right time, for the proper motive, and so forth. Where imperfect human moral virtues are concerned, these can be possessed independently of the others. For example, Joe is inclined (by nature or by acquired habit) to perform deeds that would be rightly (if loosely) described as just, but Joe is not inclined to virtuous activity where his desires for eating, drinking, and sex are concerned. By contrast, perfect human moral virtues cannot be possessed apart from one another. If Joe is perfectly just, then he also is perfectly temperate. Thomas has two reasons for accepting this “unity of the virtues” thesis. As he notes, these two reasons correspond with two different ways we can distinguish the cardinal virtues from one another (ST IaIIae. q. 65, a.1, respondeo).
First, we might distinguish the virtues “according to certain general properties of the virtues: for instance, by saying that discretion belongs to prudence, rectitude to justice, moderation to temperance, and strength of mind to courage” (ST IaIIae. q. 65, a. 1, respondeo). Given this way of distinguishing the virtues, discretion is not perfectly virtuous without strength of mind, strength of mind is not virtuous without moderation, and so forth. Thomas notes that it is for this sort of reason that, for example, Pope St. Gregory the Great and St. Augustine believe the unity of the virtues thesis.
Second, we might distinguish the cardinal virtues as Thomas himself prefers to do, after the example of Aristotle, namely, insofar as the different virtues perfect different powers. Given this way of distinguishing the virtues, it still follows that one cannot have any one of the perfect cardinal virtues without also possessing the others. This is because one cannot have courage, temperance, or justice without prudence, since part of the definition of a perfect virtue is acting in accord with rational choice, where rational choice is a function of being prudent. For example, if I am able to act courageously in a given situation, not only does my irascible power need to be perfected, that is, I have to perfectly desire to act rationally when experiencing the emotion of fear, but I need to know just what courageous action calls for in that given situation. For example, it may be that the prudent thing to do in that situation is to “run away in order to fight another day.” However, knowing just what to do in a given situation where one feels afraid is a function of the virtue of prudence. Thus, one cannot be perfectly courageous without having perfect prudence (ST IaIIae. q. 65, a. 1; see also ST IaIIae. q. 58, a. 4).
However, according to Thomas, it is also the case that one cannot be perfectly prudent unless one is also perfectly temperate, just, and courageous. This is because the prudent person has a perfected intellect where deciding on the virtuous thing to do in any given situation. However, such knowledge requires a perfected knowledge about the rational ends or principles of human action, for one cannot perfectly know how to apply the principles of action in a given situation if one does not perfectly know the principles of action. However, a perfect knowledge of the ends or principles of human action requires the possession of those virtues that perfect the irascible appetite, the concupiscible appetite, and the will, otherwise, one will have a less than perfect, that is, a distorted, picture of what ought to be pursued or avoided. For example, if John is a coward, then he will be inclined to think that one always ought to avoid what causes pain. However, if John is inclined to believe such a thing, then he will not be able to think rightly, that is, prudently, about just what he should do in a particular situation that potentially involves him suffering pain. However, what goes for courage goes for temperance and justice, too. Therefore, the perfectly prudent person has the perfect virtues of courage, temperance, and justice.
Finally, we can also note that, for Thomas, Joe cannot be perfectly temperate if he is not also perfectly courageous and just (where we are speaking about perfect human virtue). This is because Joe cannot be temperate if he is not also prudent. However, for Thomas, Joe cannot be prudent if he is not also temperate, courageous, and just. Therefore, Joe cannot be temperate if he is not also courageous and just. For the same kinds of reasons, it follows, according to Thomas, that all of the human cardinal virtues come with one another. It is for these sorts of reasons that Thomas affirms the truth of the “unity of the virtues” thesis.
Where perfect human virtue is at issue, what of the relation between the human intellectual virtues and the human moral virtues for Thomas? Since prudence is a mixed virtue—at once moral and intellectual—there is at least one human intellectual virtue that requires possession of the moral virtues and one intellectual virtue that is required for possession of the moral virtues. In addition, since the possession of prudence requires a knowledge of the principles of human action that are naturally known, that is, natural law precepts (see the section on moral knowledge below), and understanding is the virtue whose possessor has knowledge of, among other things, the principles of human action that are naturally known, possession of the moral virtues requires possession of the intellectual virtue of understanding (although one may have understanding without possessing the moral virtues, if only because one can have understanding without prudence).
As for the other intellectual virtues—art, wisdom, and science—none of these virtues can be possessed without the virtue of understanding. To give Thomas’ example, if one does not know a whole is greater than one of its parts—knowledge of which is a function of having the intellectual virtue of understanding—then one will not be able to possess the science of geometry. Aside from its dependence on understanding, the possession of the virtue of art does not require the moral virtues or any of the other intellectual virtues. The possession of science with respect to a particular subject matter seems to be similar to the virtue of art in this regard, that is, although it requires possessing the virtue of understanding, it does not require the possession of moral virtues or any other intellectual virtues.
The possession of the intellectual virtue of wisdom—habitual knowledge of the highest causes—seems to differ for Thomas from science and art insofar as possession of wisdom presupposes the possession of other forms of scientific knowledge (see, for example, SCG I, ch. 4, sec. 3). Nonetheless, like art and the other sciences, one can possess the virtue of wisdom without possessing prudence and the other moral virtues. That being said, Thomas seems to suggest that possession of the virtue of wisdom is less likely if one lacks the moral virtues (SCG I, ch. 4, sec. 3).
In order to make sense of Thomas’ views on moral knowledge, it is important to distinguish between different kinds of moral knowledge, which different kinds of moral knowledge are produced by the (virtuous) working of different kinds of powers.
Thomas thinks that all human beings who have reached the age of reason and received at least an elementary moral education have a kind of moral knowledge, namely, a knowledge of universal moral principles. One place he says something like this is in his famous discussion of law in ST. In that place he argues that there are at least three different kinds of universal principles of the natural law, that is, principles that apply in all times, places, and circumstances, which principles can be learned by reflecting on one’s experiences by way of the natural light of human reason, apart from faith (although Thomas notes that knowledge of these principles often is inculcated in human beings immediately through divinely infused faith [see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 100, a. 3, respondeo]).
First, there are those universal principles of the natural law that function as the first principles of the natural law, for example, one should do good and avoid evil (ST IaIIae. q. 100, a. 3, respondeo). Such universal principles are known to be true by every human person who has reached the age of reason without fail. Of course, most people—unless they are doing theology or philosophy—will not make such principles of practical action explicit. In being usually implicit in our moral reasoning, Thomas compares the first principles of the natural law with the first principles of all reasoning, for example, the principle of identity and the principle of non-contradiction.
Second, there are those universal principles of the natural law that, with just a bit of reflection, can be derived from the first principle of the natural law (ST IaIIae. q. 100, a. 3, respondeo). We can call these the secondary universal precepts of the natural law. For example, we all know we should do good and avoid evil. We also know, when we reflect upon it, that failing to honor those who have given us extremely valuable gifts we cannot repay would be to do evil. However, we all know that our father and mother have given us extremely valuable gifts we cannot repay, for example, life and a moral education. Therefore, we can naturally know that we ought to honor our mother and our father. Of course, most of us do not need to make such reasoning explicit in order to accept such moral principles as absolute prescriptions or prohibitions. Like the first universal principles of the natural law, the truthfulness of these secondary universal precepts of the natural law is immediately obvious to us—whether we know this by the natural light of reason insofar as the truth of such propositions is obvious to us as soon as we understand the meaning of the terms in those propositions or we immediately know them to be true by the light of faith (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 100, a. 1 respondeo). Thomas thinks that (at least abstract formulations of) the commandments of the Decalogue constitute good examples of the secondary, universal principles of the natural law [see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 100, a. 3, respondeo). To know the primary and secondary universal precepts of the natural law is to have what Thomas calls the human virtue of understanding with respect to the principles of moral action. Moral knowledge of other sorts is built on the back of having the virtue of understanding with respect to moral action. As we have seen, it is possible to have the virtue of understanding (say, with respect to principles of action) without otherwise being morally virtuous, for example, prudent, courageous, and so forth (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 58, a. 5).
Third, Thomas thinks there are also universal principles of the natural law that are not immediately obvious to all but which can be inculcated in students by a wise teacher (see, for example ST IaIIae. q. 58, a. 5; ST IaIIae. q. 100, a. 1, respondeo; and ST IaIIae. q. 100, a. 3, respondeo). We might call this third of universal principle of the natural law the tertiary precepts of the natural law. Thomas gives as an example of such a principle a precept from Leviticus 19: 32: “Rise up before the hoary head, and honor the person of the aged man,” that is, respect your elders (ST IaIIae. q. 100, a. 1, respondeo). Other examples Thomas would give of tertiary precepts of the natural law are one ought to give alms to those in need (ST IIaIIae. q. 32, a. 5, respondeo), one must not intentionally spill one’s seed in the sex act (ST IIaIIae. q. 154, a. 11, respondeo), and one should not lay with a person of the same sex (ST IIaIIae. q. 154, a. 11, respondeo).
It is easy to be confused by what Thomas says here about natural law as conferring moral knowledge if we think Thomas means that all people have good arguments for their moral beliefs. People sometimes say that they “just see” that something is morally wrong or right. Thomas thinks it is possible to know the general precepts of the moral law without possessing a scientific kind of moral knowledge (which, as has been seen, does require having arguments for a thesis). One way to talk about this “just seeing” that some moral propositions are true is by making reference to what Thomas calls natural law. People do not typically argue their way to believing the general norms of morality, for example, it is wrong to murder, one should not lie. Rather, the truth of these norms is “self-evident” (per se nota) to us, that is, we understand such norms to be true as soon as we understand the terms in the propositions that correspond to such norms (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 94, a. 2). Of course, that does not mean that arguments cannot be given for the truth of such norms, at least in the case of the secondary and tertiary precepts of the natural law, if only for the sake of possessing a science of morals. The truth of such basic moral norms is thus analogous to the truth of the proposition “God exists” for Thomas, which for most people is not a proposition one (needs to) argue(s) for, although the theologian or philosopher does argue for the truth of such a proposition for the sake of scientific completeness (see, for example, ST Ia. q. 2, a. 2, ad2).
So far we have simply talked about the fact that, in Thomas’ view, human beings have some knowledge of universal moral principles. However, unless such knowledge is joined to knowledge of particular cases in the moral agent or there is a knowledge of particular moral principles in the agent, then the moral agent will not know what he or she ought to do in a particular circumstance. For example, all human beings know they should seek happiness, that is, they should do for themselves what will help them to flourish. However, in a particular case, Joe really wants to go to bed with Mike’s wife. In fact, given his passions and lack of temperance, it seems to Joe that going to bed with Mike’s wife will help him to flourish as an individual human being. That is, it seems good to Joe to commit adultery. Thomas thinks that ordinarily a person such as Joe knows by the universal principles of the natural law, that is, he understands not only that he should not commit adultery but that committing adultery will not help him flourish. In addition, Joe knows that going to bed with Mike’s wife would be an example of an adulterous act. However, such knowledge can be destroyed or rendered ineffective (and perhaps partly due to Joe’s willingness that it be so) in a particular case by his passion, which reflects a lack of a virtuous moral disposition in Joe, that is, temperance, which would support the judgment of Joe’s reason that adultery is not happiness-conducive. Thus, it may seem genuinely good to Joe to go to bed with Mike’s wife. In this particular case, (we are supposing) Joe lacks effective moral knowledge of the wrongness of going to bed with Mike’s wife. (Again, Joe could be morally responsible for his lack of temperance, and so for his lack of resolve to act in accord with what he knows about the morality of going to bed with Mike’s wife; in that case, his passion would simply render him vincibly ignorant of the principles of this particular case and so would not excuse his moral wrongdoing, although it would make intelligible why he wills as he does.) In order for knowledge of the universal principles of the natural law to be effective, the agent must have knowledge of moral particulars, and such knowledge, Thomas thinks, requires possessing the moral virtues. Without the virtues, a person will have at best a deficient, shallow, or distorted picture of what is really good for one’s self, let alone others (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 58, a. 5, respondeo).
Finally, we should mention another kind of knowledge of moral particulars that is important for Thomas, namely, knowing just what to do in a particular situation such that one does the right thing, for the right reason, in the right way, to the proper extent, and so forth. This is knowledge had by way of the possession of prudence. As we noted above, the knowledge that comes by prudence has the agent’s possession of the other moral virtues as a necessary condition, for the knowledge we are speaking of here is knowing just how to act courageously in this situation; to know this, one must have one’s passions ordered such that, whatever one chooses to do, one knows one always ought to act courageously. However, the prudent person is also able to decide to act in a particular way in a given situation. Such deciding, of course, involves a sort of knowing just what the situation in question calls for, morally speaking. In order for one’s temperance, for example, to be effective, one needs not only to have a habit of desiring food, drink, and sex in a manner consistent with right reason, but one needs to decide how to use that power in a particular situation. For example, the prudent person knows what temperate eating will look like on this given day, at this given time, and so forth. The moral knowledge that comes by prudence is another kind of moral knowledge, Thomas thinks, one necessary for living a good human life.
According to Thomas, the proximate measure for the goodness and badness of human actions is human reason insofar as it is functioning properly, or to put it in Thomas’ words, right reason (recta ratio) (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 34, a. 1). Thomas sometimes speaks of this proximate measure of what is good in terms of that in which the virtuous person takes pleasure (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 1, a. 7; and ST IaIIae. q. 34, a. 4).
However, since right reason in human beings is a kind of participation in God’s mind (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 91, a. 2, respondeo), we can also speak of the mind of God as the ultimate standard for whether a human action is morally good or bad. In fact, given Thomas’ doctrine of divine simplicity, we can say simply that God is the ultimate measure or standard of moral goodness.
One way Thomas speaks about God being the measure of morally good acts is by using the language of law. According to Thomas, God’s idea regarding His providential plan for the universe has the nature of a law (ST Ia. q. 91, a. 1; see the section below on political philosophy for more on Thomas on law). This idea of how the universe ought to go, like any other of God’s ideas, is not, in reality, distinct from God Himself, for by the divine simplicity God’s intellect and will are in reality the same as God himself. God’s own infinite and perfect being—we might even say “God’s character,” if we keep in mind that applying such terms to God is done only analogously in comparison to the way we use them of human moral agents—is the ultimate rule or measure for all creaturely activity, including normative activity. This is why Thomas can say that none of the precepts of the Decalogue are dispensable (ST IaIIae. q. 100, a. 8), for each one of the Ten Commandments is a fundamental precept of the natural law, thinks Thomas. However, it would be a contradiction in terms for God to will that a fundamental precept of the natural law be violated, since the fundamental precepts of the natural law are necessary truths (we could say that they are true in all possible worlds) that reflect God’s own necessary, infinite, and perfect being. For God to will to dispense with any of the Ten Commandments, for example, for God to will that someone murder, would be tantamount to God’s willing in opposition to His own perfection. Since God’s will and God’s perfection (being) are the same, for God to will in opposition to His own perfect being would be a contradiction in terms.
For Thomas, law is (a) a rational command (b) promulgated (c) by the one or ones who have care of a perfect community (d) for the sake of the common good of that community (ST IaIIae. q. 90, a. 4). First, a law is a rational command. It is not simply a suggestion or an act of counsel. If John merely suggests a course of action A to Mike, or Mike asks John what to do about some moral decision D, and Mike merely offers counsel to John about what to do where D is concerned, all other things being equal, John is not morally obligated to perform A or follow John’s advice where D is concerned, even if John is related to Mike as John’s moral or political superior. Mike may indeed be likely to perform A or follow John’s advice about D out of fear or out of respect for John, but Mike would not necessarily do something morally wrong if he did not perform A or follow John’s counsel about D. On the other hand, if John commands Mike to do something (and all the other conditions for a law are met), then John does something morally wrong if he fails to act in accord with John’s command. According to Thomas, law morally obligates those to whom it is directed. That being said, not all moral acts are equally morally wrong for Thomas. It may be that Susan’s breaking a law in a given situation merely counts as a venial sin. (For the distinction between venial and mortal sin, see the section on infused virtue above.)
A law is also a rational command. That means that, minimally, John’s command must be coherent. In addition, for John’s command to have the force of law, it must not contradict any pre-existing law that has the force of law. Such a pre-existing law could be a higher law. For example, if John (a mere human being) commands that all citizens sacrifice to him as an act of divine worship once a year, Thomas would say that such a command does not have the force of law insofar as (Thomas thinks) such a command is in conflict with a natural law precept that ordains that only divine beings deserve to be worshiped by way of an act of sacrifice. One is not obliged to obey a human being’s ordinance that is in conflict with the commands of a higher power (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 104, a. 5.). In his Letter from the Birmingham Jail, Martin Luther King Jr. invokes precisely this aspect of Thomas’ understanding of law in defense of the injustice of segregation ordinances when he notes that, according to Thomas, “an unjust law is a human law that is not rooted in eternal law and natural law” (1963, p. 82).
A command C of a human being could also be in conflict with a pre-existing human law. C would not, in such a case, have the force of law. Take an example: John’s mother commands him to run some errands for her. As John is about to do so, John’s father says to him: “Stop what you’re doing right now and do your homework!” Assuming that John’s mother and father have equal authority in John’s home, and that both of these commands meet all of the other relevant conditions for a law, the command issued by John’s father does not have the force of law for John, since it contradicts a pre-existing law.
Second, commands that get to count as laws must have as their purpose the preservation and promotion of the common good of a particular community. When Thomas speaks about the common good of a community, he means to treat the community itself as something that has conditions for its survival and its flourishing. For example, if a tyrant issues an edict that involves taxing its citizens so heavily that the workers in that community would not be able to feed themselves or their families, such an edict would violate the very purpose of law, since the edict would, in short order, lead to the destruction of the community.
Third, in addition to being a rational command that promotes the common good of a community, a law must be issued by those who have true political authority in that community. There is no need to think that the authority figures in question here have to be political authorities in the sense that we take elected officials or kings to be. Within the confines of a household, for example, parents have the authority to make laws, that is, rational commands that morally obligate those to whom the laws are addressed. It is worth stressing that a command’s being issued by the requisite authority is a necessary but not sufficient condition for that command’s having the force of law. The political authorities in Birmingham, Alabama may have been genuine authorities and enjoyed real power to make laws. However, if Martin Luther King Jr. was right that segregation ordinances were unjust—and so irrational—then such ordinances, despite the fact that they were issued by authorities that were legitimate, did not have the force of law and so did not morally obligate those who, in their conscience, recognized that such segregation ordinances were unjust.
Finally, a command must be promulgated in order to have the force of law, that is, to morally bind in conscience those to whom it is directed. Thomas accepts the principle that ignorance of the law excuses, but not just any kind of ignorance does so. For ignorance comes in at least two varieties, invincible and vincible. If I am invincibly ignorant of p, it is not reasonable to expect me to know p, given my circumstances. For example, say John has been extremely ill for a year, and in that time a law was passed of which, under normal circumstances, John should have made himself aware. Because of John’s circumstances, however, it would be correct to say he remains invincibly ignorant of the law. For John, then, the law does not bind in conscience (at least as long as John remains invincibly ignorant of it). If John were to transgress the law, John would not be morally culpable for such a transgression. On the other hand, someone might really be ignorant of a law but still be culpable for transgressing it. Such a person would be vincibly ignorant of that law. Someone is vincibly ignorant of a law just in case that person does not know about the law but should have taken actions so as to know about it.
In his famous discussion of law in ST, Thomas distinguishes four different kinds of law: eternal, natural, human, and divine. The eternal law is “God’s idea of the government of things in the universe” (ST IaIIae. q. 91, a. 1, respondeo). This description of the eternal law follows Thomas’ definition of law in general, which definition mentions the four causes of law. Recall that, according to Thomas, a law is a rational command (this is a law’s formal cause) made by the legitimate authority of a community (a law’s efficient cause) for the common good of that community (the final cause) and promulgated (the material cause). The community in question here is the whole universe of creatures, the legitimate authority of which is God the creator. In Thomas’ view, God the creator is provident over, that is, governs, his creation (see, for example, ST Ia. q. 22, aa. 1-2). Since God is perfect Being and Goodness itself (see, for example, ST Ia. q. 4, a. 2; and ST Ia. q. 13, a. 2, respondeo), God’s governing of the universe is perfectly good, and so God’s idea of how the universe should be is a rational command for the sake of the common good of the universe.
How does God promulgate the eternal law? God communicates the eternal law to creatures in accord with their capacity to receive it. Now, God’s eternal law is not distinct from God, but God is perfection itself. Therefore, God communicates Himself, that is, perfection itself, to creatures insofar as this is possible, that is, insofar as God creates things as certain reflections of God’s own perfection.
For example, God communicates His perfection to non-rational, non-living creatures insofar as God creates each of these beings with a nature that is inclined to perfect itself simply by exhibiting those properties that are characteristic of its kind. For example, a carbon atom reflects the divine perfection—and so has God’s eternal law communicated to it—insofar as God gives a carbon atom a nature such that it tends to exhibit the properties characteristic of a carbon atom, for example, being such that it can form such and such bonds with such and such atoms, and so forth. God communicates the eternal law to plants insofar as God creates plants with a nature such that they not only tend to exhibit certain properties, each of which is a certain limited reflection of the Creator, but also insofar as plants are inclined by nature to perfect themselves by nourishing themselves, growing, and maturing so as to contribute to the perpetuation of their species through reproduction. Non-rational animals, of course, have all of these perfections plus the added perfection of being conscious of other things, thereby having the eternal law communicated to them in an even more perfect sense than in the case of non-living things and plants. Finally, rational creatures—whether human beings or angels—have the eternal law communicated to them in the most perfect way available to a creature, that is, in a manner analogous to how human beings promulgate the law to other human beings, that is, insofar as they are self-consciously aware of being obligated by said law. In other words, God gives rational creatures a nature such that they can naturally come to understand that they are obligated to act in some ways and refrain from acting in other ways. This reception of the law by rational creatures is what Thomas calls the natural (moral) law (see, for example, ST Ia. q. 91, a. 2, respondeo).
More specifically, by natural law Thomas understands that aspect of the eternal law that has to do with the flourishing of rational creatures insofar as it can be naturally known by rational creatures—in contrast to that aspect of the eternal law insofar as it is communicated by way of a divine revelation. (In this section, we are interested in natural law only insofar as it is relevant for the development of a political philosophy; for the importance of natural law where moral knowledge is concerned, see the discussion of that topic in the ethics section above.) To put this another way, the natural law implies a rational creature’s natural understanding of himself or herself as a being that is obligated to do or refrain from doing certain things, where he or she recognizes that these obligations do not derive their force from any human legislator. As we saw Martin Luther King Jr. say above, there are some moral laws that constitute the foundation of any just human society; if such laws are transgressed, or legislated against, we act or legislate unjustly. This set of moral laws that transcends the particularities of any given human culture is what Thomas and King call the natural law.
There is another way to think about natural law in the context of politics that is commensurate with what was said above. As in the case of all creatures, the nature possessed by human beings represents a certain way of participating in God, a certain finite degree of perfection that is therefore limited and imperfect in comparison to God’s absolute, infinite perfection. As Thomas famously says in one place, “The natural law is nothing else than the rational creature's participation of the eternal law” (ST IaIIae. q. 91, a. 2, respondeo). Now, like all created beings, human beings are naturally inclined to perfect themselves, since their nature is an image of the eternal law, which is absolutely perfect. One way in which all creatures show that they are creatures, that is, created by Perfection itself, is in their natural inclination toward perfecting themselves as members of their species. However, human beings are rational creatures and rational creatures participate in the eternal law in a characteristic way, that is, rationally; since the perfection of a rational creature involves knowing and choosing, rational creatures are naturally inclined to know and to choose, and to do so well. In addition, like other animals, human beings must move themselves (with the help of others) from merely potentially having certain perfections to actually having perfections that are characteristic of flourishing members of their species. Although everything is perfect to some extent insofar as it exists—since existence itself is a perfection that reflects Being itself—actually possessing a perfection P is a greater form of perfection than merely potentially possessing P. Therefore, the natural law is a human being’s natural understanding of its inclination to perfect himself or herself according to the kind of thing he or she naturally is, that is, a rational, free, social, and physical being. Thus, we know naturally that we should act rationally, protect life, educate our children, increase liberty for ourselves and others, work for the common good of the community, and, given the precept act rationally, apply all these principles in a rational manner, a manner that reflects a natural understanding that we are animals of a certain sort. We therefore are naturally inclined to pursue those goods that are consistent with human flourishing, as we understand it, that is, the flourishing of a rational, free, social, and animal being. Insofar as we conclude that such an activity or apparent good is a real good for us, we conclude that it is a good we can—or ought to—seek. Insofar as we see that a particular activity or apparent good undermines human flourishing, we conclude that such an activity or apparent good is something bad and so should not be sought, but rather avoided.
The chief reason the natural law is called natural is because it is that aspect of the eternal law that rational creatures can (given the right sort of circumstances) discern to be true by unaided human reason, that is, apart from a special divine revelation. What human beings can know of God’s eternal law only by way of a special divine revelation from God is what Thomas calls divine law (ST IaIIae. q. 91, a. 4, respondeo and ad2). Thomas also contrasts the divine law with the natural law by noting that the natural law directs us to perform those actions we must habitually perform if we are to flourish in this life as human beings (what Thomas calls our natural end, that is, our end qua created). The divine law, on the other hand, directs us to perform actions that are proportionate with living an eternal life with God (what Thomas calls our supernatural end, that is, our end qua grace and glory). It is not as though the natural law is irrelevant where our supernatural end is concerned since, as Thomas often says, “grace perfects nature; it does not destroy it” (see, for example, ST Ia. q. 1, a. 8, ad2). Therefore, living in a manner that violates the natural law is inconsistent with a human being’s achieving his or her supernatural end too. That being said, to live merely in accord with the natural law is not proportionate to the life that human beings live in heaven, which life, by the grace of God, human beings can, in a limited sense, begin to live even in this life. Thus, one reason God gives the divine law is to instruct human beings about which acts are proportionate to a supernatural life, that is, flourishing in heaven, so as to make human beings fit for heaven (see, for example, ST IaIIae. q. 91, a. 4, respondeo).
Thomas develops his account of human law by way of an analogy (see ST IaIIae. q. 91, a. 3). He posits that the human law is to the natural law what the conclusions of the speculative sciences (for example, metaphysics and mathematics) are to the indemonstrable principles of that science. Just as all science begins from premises the truth of which cannot themselves be demonstrated, for example, the law of non-contradiction, and proceeds by the work of reason to particular conclusions, so, in practical matters (such as politics), authorities begin with the knowledge of indemonstrable precepts, for example, good should be rewarded and evil punished and the punishment must fit the crime, and proceed to apply those precepts in light of the particular circumstances, needs, and realities of the communities of which they are the rightful leaders. These particular practical applications of the natural law, as long as they meet the conditions of law, have the force of law. Such laws Thomas calls, human laws. For example, the relevant authorities in community A might decide to enact a law that theft should be punished as follows: the convicted thief must return all that was stolen and refrain from going to sea for one day for each ducat that was stolen. On the other hand, community B enacts the following law: the thief will be imprisoned for up to one day for each dollar stolen.
Thomas would want us to notice a couple of things about these human laws. First, neither of these laws follow logically from the precepts of the natural law. Just as one cannot deduce empirical truths from the law of non-contradiction alone, one cannot deduce human laws simply from the precepts of the natural law. That being said, the natural law functions as a kind of control on what can count as a legitimate (morally and legally binding) law. Just as any scientific theory that contradicts itself is not a good theory, although a number of proposed theories meet this minimal condition of rationality, so no binding law contradicts the precepts of the natural law, although there may be any number of proposed human laws that are consistent with the natural law.
Second, notice that the human laws addressing the appropriate punishment of thievery mentioned above reflect the circumstances in which the members of those communities find themselves. For example, say the members of community A belong to a society where sea-faring is important, and so restriction of such sea-faring is appropriately painful. On the other hand, the members of community B, say, do not live in circumstances where it is so important to travel at sea, and so the punishment for thievery reflects that. Some human laws, Thomas thinks, will be different in different times and places, if only because they are enacted in times and places where there are different geographical, moral, political, and religious circumstances and needs.
Unlike some political philosophers, who see the need for human authority as, at best, a consequence of some moral weakness on the part of human beings, Thomas thinks human authority is logically connected with the natural end of human beings as rational, social animals. Thomas, therefore, rejects anarchism in all of its forms, and he does so for philosophical reasons. Human authority is in itself good and is necessary for the good life, given the kind of thing human beings are. One place where we can see clearly that Thomas holds this position is in his discussion of what human life would have been like in the Garden of Eden had Adam and Eve (and their progeny) not fallen into sin.
In a section of ST where he is discussing what life was (and in some cases would have been) like for the first human beings in the state of innocence, that is, before the Fall, Thomas entertains questions about human beings as authorities over various things in that state of innocence (Ia. q. 96). Particularly relevant for our purposes are articles three and four.
In article three, Thomas asks whether all human beings would have been equal in the state of innocence. Thomas answers this question by saying, “In some senses, human beings would have been equal in the state of innocence, but in other senses, they would not have been equal.” Thomas thinks human beings would have been equal, that is, the same, in the state of innocence in two significant senses: (a) all human beings would have been free of defects in the soul, for example, all human beings would have been equal in the state of innocence insofar as none would have had sinned, and (b) all human beings would have been free of defects in the body, that is, no human beings would have experienced bodily pain, suffered disease, and so forth in the state of innocence. It is worth mentioning that Thomas believes that the state of innocence was an actual state of affairs, even if it probably did not last very long. However, it certainly could have lasted a long time. In fact, assuming Adam and Eve and their progeny chose not to sin, the state of innocence could have been perpetual or could have lasted until God translated the whole human race into heaven (see, for example, ST Ia. q. 102, a. 4, respondeo).
Interestingly, Thomas thinks that there are a number of different ways in which human beings would have been unequal (by which he simply means, not the same) in the state of innocence. First of all, since God intended there to be families in the state of innocence, some would have been male and others female, since human sexual reproduction, which was intended by God in the state of innocence, requires diversity of the sexes. In addition, some people would have been older than others, since children would have born to their parents in the state of innocence.
Second, there would have been inequalities having to do with the souls of those in the state of innocence. For example, although none would have a defect in the soul, some would have had more knowledge or virtue than others. Thomas mentions the following sort of reason: those in the state of innocence had free choice of the will. Thus, some would have freely chosen to make a greater advance in knowledge in virtue than others. In addition, although the first human persons were created with knowledge and all the virtues, at least in habit (see ST Ia. q. 95, a. 3), those born as children in paradise would not have had knowledge and the virtues, being too young (ST Ia. q. 101, aa. 1 and 2). Therefore, adult human persons in the state of innocence would have had more knowledge and virtue than children born in paradise.
Third, since human bodies would not have been exempt from the influence of the laws of nature, the bodies of those in paradise would have been unequal, for example, some would have been stronger or more beautiful than others, although, again, all would have been without bodily defect. Since those in the state of innocence have the virtues—or at the very least, have no defects in the soul—such disparity in knowledge, virtue, bodily strength, and beauty among those in paradise would not have necessarily occasioned jealousy and envy.
In the fourth article in this question on authority in the state of innocence, Thomas asks whether some human beings would be master of other human beings in the state of innocence. In answering this question, Thomas distinguishes two senses of “mastership.” First, there is the sense of “mastership” that is involved in the master/slave relationship. Second, there is a broader sense of “mastership” where one person is in authority over another, for example, a father in relation to his child.
Thomas argues that “mastership” in the first sense would not exist in the state of innocence. According to Thomas, a slave is contrasted with a politically free person insofar as the slave, but not the free person, is compelled to yield to another something he or she naturally desires, and ought, to possess himself or herself, namely, the liberty to order his or her life according to his or her own desires, insofar as those desires are in accord with reason. This provides Thomas with two reasons for thinking there would be no slavery in the state of innocence. First, since all persons naturally desire political freedom, not having it would be painful. However, there is no pain in the state of innocence. Second, all persons ought to enjoy political freedom. Slaves do not have it. However, there is no sin in the state of innocence. Therefore, there is no “mastership” in the state of innocence that implies the existence of slavery.
Nonetheless, Thomas argues there would have been human authorities, that is, some human beings governing others, in the state of innocence. Why? Thomas offers two reasons. He begins from the belief that human beings are by nature rational and social creatures, and so would have led a social life with other human beings, ordered by reason, in the state of innocence. This means that, in the state of innocence, human beings would seek not just their own good but the common good of the society of which those individuals are a part. However, where there are many reasonable individuals, there will be many reasonable but irreconcilable ideas about how to proceed on a variety of different practical matters. For the sake of the common good, there must therefore be those who have the authority to decide which of many reasonable and irreconcilable ideas will have the force of law in the state of innocence. Therefore, there would have been some human beings in authority over other human beings in the state of innocence.
Thomas’ second reason that there would have been human authorities in the state of innocence has him drawing on positions he established in ST Ia. q. 96, a. 3. Recall that he argues there that human beings would have been unequal in the state of innocence insofar as some would have been wiser and more virtuous than others. However, it would be unfitting if the wiser and more virtuous did not share their gifts with others for the sake of the common good, namely, as those who have political authority. Given that (as Thomas believes) human beings are not born with knowledge and virtue, it seems obvious that this would have been true in the case of the relation between parents and their children. However, Thomas sees that human authorities would have been necessary and fitting at all levels of society.
Since law is bound up with authority for Thomas, what has been said about authority has an interesting consequence for Thomas’ views on law too. It is not essential to law that there be evil-doers. Given that human beings are rational and social creatures, that is, they were not created to live independently and autonomously with respect to other human beings, even in a perfect society a human society will have human laws. (This also assumes that God has willed to share His authority with others; this is precisely what Thomas thinks; in fact, Thomas thinks that having authority over others is part of what it means to be created in the image of God.) Recall the definition of law—it says nothing about curbing appetites or protecting the innocent. In a world where the strong try to take advantage of the weak, law, of course, does do these things. However, the fact that law protects the weak from the strong is accidental to law for Thomas.
Thomas thinks that a just government is one in which the ruler or rulers work(s) for the common good and not simply for the good of one class of citizens. In his view, there are a number of un-mixed forms of government that are, in principle, legitimate or just, for example, kingship (regnum), that is, rule by one virtuous man, aristocracy, that is, rule by a few virtuous men, and polity, rule by a large number of citizens. Following Aristotle in Politics, book III, chapter 7, Thomas identifies three unjust forms of unmixed government that are opposed to these just forms: for example, tyranny, that is, rule by one man who looks after his own benefit rather than the common good, oligarchy, that is, rule by a few wealthy men who look after their own good rather than the common good, and democracy, rule by the many poor people for their own good rather than the common good (see, for example, De regno ad regem Cypri, I, ch. 2 [chapter 1 in some editions]).
Of the various just unmixed forms of government, Thomas thinks that a kingship is, in principle, the best form of government. He offers a number of arguments for this thesis. Consider just one of these. Thomas thinks the chief concern of a good ruler is to secure the unity and peace of the community. Therefore, the more a form of government is better able to secure unity and peace in the community, the better is that form of government, all other things being equal. What itself has the nature of unity and peace is better able to secure unity and peace than what is many. However, kingship has the nature of unity and peace more so than rule by many men (whether or not these men are virtuous; recall from our discussion of authority above that Thomas does not think that a group of virtuous people will necessarily agree on a course of action). Therefore, all other things being equal, kingship is better able to secure unity and peace than rule by many. Therefore, kingship is the best unmixed form of government (De regno, book I, ch. 3 [ch. 2]; compare this argument with Thomas’ argument at SCG IV, ch. 76 that there needs to be one bishop, that is, the Pope, functioning as the visible head of the Church in order to secure the unity and peace of the Church.)
Thomas is aware of the possibility that a good man can become a tyrant (De regno, book I, ch. 7 [ch. 6 in some editions]). Furthermore, since the contrary of the best is the worst, and tyranny is the contrary of kingship, tyranny is the worst form of government (De regno, ch. 4 [ch. 3 in some editions]). Thomas therefore thinks kingship should be limited in a number of ways in order to ensure a ruler will not be(come) a tyrant.
First, in a limited kingship the king is selected by others who have the authority to do so (De regno, book I, ch. 7 [ch. 6], where such authorities should choose a king with a moral character such that it is unlikely he will become a tyrant. In one place Thomas speaks of an ideal situation where the king is selected from among the people—presumably for his virtue—and by the people (ST IaIIae q. 105, a. 1, respondeo). Second, in order to ensure the king does not become a tyrant, the government (and its constitution) should be written so as to limit the power of the king (De regno, book I, ch. 7 [ch. 6]). Finally, Thomas thinks kingship ideally should be limited in that the community has a right to depose or restrict the power of the king if he becomes a tyrant (De regno I, ch. 7 [ch. 6]). Although early in his career he seems to sanction tyrannicide (In Sent. Book II, d. 44, qu. 2, ad5), by the time he writes De regno (book I, ch. 7 [ch. 6]) Thomas rejects that view not only as imprudent, but also as inconsistent with the teaching of the Apostles (compare 1 Peter 2:19). Rather, those who have the authority to appoint the king have the authority and responsibility to depose him if need be (De regno book I, ch. 7 [ch. 6]). If no human authorities can or are willing to help a community ruled by a tyrant, Thomas counsels that the people should have recourse to God. However, in doing so, they should first look to expiating their own sins, since God sometimes allows a people to be ruled by the impious as a punishment for sin (De regno book I, ch. 7 [ch. 6]).
Notably, in a place in ST, Thomas argues that a certain kind of mixed government is really the best form of government (ST IaIIae. q. 105, a. 1, respondeo). Thomas notes there that both Aristotle (Politics, book iii) and divine revelation (Deuteronomy 1:15; Exodus 18:21; and Deuteronomy 1:13) agree that the ideal form of government combines kingship, aristocracy, and democracy insofar as one virtuous man rules as king, the king has a few virtuous men under him as advisors, and, not only all are eligible to govern (the virtuous can come from the populace and not simply from the wealthy class), but also all participate in governance insofar as all participate in choosing who will be the king.
Thomas argues that this form of mixed government—part kingship, part aristocracy, and part democracy—is the best form of government as follows. As Aristotle states in Politics ii, 6, a form of government where all take some part in the government ensures peace among the people, commends itself to all, and is most enduring. However, a form of government that ensures peace among the people, commends itself to all, and is most enduring is, all other things being equal, the best form of government. Therefore,
(G1) A form of government where all take some part in the government is, all other things being equal, the best form of government.
However, given the soundness of the kind of argument for the superiority of kingship as a form of government we noted above, and the importance of virtuous politicians for a good government, we have the following:
(G2) The best non-mixed form of government is kingship.
(G3) The second-best form of non-mixed government is an aristocracy.
However, there is a mixed form of government (call it a limited kingship or limited democracy) that is part kingship, since a virtuous man presides over all, part aristocracy, since the king takes to himself a set of virtuous advisors and governors, and part democracy, since the rulers can be chosen from among the people and the people have a right to choose their rulers.
However, there is no form of government other than a limited kingship or limited democracy that takes the truths of (G1), (G2), and (G3) into account. Therefore, the best form of government is a limited kingship or limited democracy. Thus, interestingly, we have in Thomas a 13th-century theologian advocating for a limited form of democracy as the best form of government.
Thomas authored an astonishing number of works during his short life. Other than the first entry below, which cites the ongoing project of providing a critical edition of Thomas’ Opera Omnia (entire body of work), the entries mentioned here are those works of Thomas’ cited in the body of this article. For a complete list of Thomas’ works, see Torrell 2005, Stump 2003, or Kretzmann and Stump 1998.
- Opera Omnia (Complete Works), 1248-1273. Ed. Leonine Commission, S. Thomae Aquinatis Doctoris Angelici. Opera Omnia. Iussu Leonis XIII, P.M. edita, Rome: Vatican Polyglot Press, 1882- (on-going).
- De principiis naturae, ad fratrem Sylvestrum (On the Principles of Nature, for Brother Sylvester), 1248-1252 or 1252-1256.
- English translation: Eleonore Stump and Stephen Chanderbhan, trans. In The Hackett Aquinas: Basic Works. Jeffrey Hause and Robert Pasnau, eds. (Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 2014), pp. 2-13.
- De ente et essentia, ad fratres et socios suos (On Being and Essence, for His Brothers and Companions), 1252-1253.
- English translation: Peter King, trans. In The Hackett Aquinas: Basic Works. Jeffrey Hause and Robert Pasnau, eds. (Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 2014), pp. 14-35.
- Scriptum super libros Sententiarum (Commentary on [Lombard’s] Sentences), 1252-1256.
- Questiones disputatae de veritate (Disputed Questions on Truth), 1256-1259.
- English translation: Mulligan, Robert W., James V. McGlynn, and Robert W. Schmidt, trans. Truth. 3 vols. Library of Living Catholic Thought (Chicago: Regnery, 1952-1954; reprint, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1994).
- Beata gens (Sermon on the Feast of All Saints, the First of November), ca. 1256-1259 or1268-1272?
- English translation: Mark-Robin Hoogland, trans. In The Fathers of the Church: Medieval Continuation. Vol. II. Thomas Aquinas: The Academic Sermons (Washington, DC: The Catholic University of America Press, 2010), pp. 295-312.
- Expositio super librum Boethii De trinitate (Commentary on Boethius’ De trinitate), 1257-1258 or 1259 (incomplete).
- English translation: Maurer, Armand, trans. Faith, Reason and Theology: Questions I-IV of his Commentary on the De Trinitate of Boethius. Mediaeval Sources in Translation, 32 (Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 1987). Maurer, Armand, trans. The Division and Methods of the Sciences: Questions V and VI of his Commentary on the De Trinitate of Boethius. 4th rev. ed. Mediaeval Sources in Translation, 3 (Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 1986).
- Summa contra gentiles (Synopsis [of Christian Doctrine] Directed against Unbelievers) [SCG], 1259-1265.
- English translation: Pegis, Anton C., James F. Anderson, Vernon J. Bourke, and Charles J. O’Neil, trans. Summa contra gentiles (1955; reprint, Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 1975).
- Glossa continua super Evangelia (Catena aurea) (A Continuous Gloss on the Evangelists [collected from the writings of the Church Fathers]), 1262-1265 (Matthew); 1265-1268 (Mark, Luke, and John).
- English translation: M. Pattison, J. D. Dalgairns, and T. D. Ryder, trans. John Henry Newman, ed. 4 vols. (1841-1845; reprint, Boonville, NY: Preserving Christian Publications, 2009).
- Expositio super Iob ad litteram (Literal Commentary on Job), 1263-1265.
- English translation: Yaffe, Martin D., and Anthony Damico, trans. The Literal Exposition on Job: A Scriptural Commentary Concerning Providence. Classics in Religious Studies, 7 (Atlanta, GA: Scholars Press, 1989).
- Expositio et lectura super Epistolas Pauli Apostoli (Commentary and lectures on the Epistles of Paul the Apostle), 1263-1265 (1 Cor. 11—Philemon); 1271-1272 (Romans), and 1272- 1273 (Hebrews).
- English translations: multiple.
- Officium de festo Corporis Christi ad mandatum Urbani Papae (The Office of the Feast of the Body of Christ, Commissioned by Pope Urban), 1264.
- English translation: The Aquinas Prayer Book: The Prayers and Hymns of St. Thomas Aquinas, R. Anderson and J. Moser, trans. (Manchester, NH: Sophia Institute Press, 2000).
- Adoro te devote (Hymn) (Humbly I Adore Thee), 1264 or 1274.
- English translation: The Aquinas Prayer Book: The Prayers and Hymns of St. Thomas Aquinas, R. Anderson and J. Moser, trans. (Manchester: NH: Sophia Institute Press, 2000).
- Quaestiones disputatae de potentia (Disputed Questions on [the] Power [of God]), 1265-1266.
- English translation: The English Dominican Fathers, trans. (1932; reprint, Eugene, OR: Wipf and Stock, 2004).
- Compendium theologiae, ad fratrem Reginaldum socium suum (A Compendium of Theology, for Brother Reginald, his Companion), 1265-1267 (incomplete).
- English translation: Vollert, Cyril, trans. Light of Faith: The Compendium of Theology (1947; reprint, Manchester, NH: Sophia Institute, 1993).
- Expositio super librum Dionysii De divinis nominibus (Commentary on Pseudo-Dionysius’ De divinis nominibus), 1265-1268.
- English translation: Marsh, Harry C., trans. “A Translation of Thomas Aquinas’ In Librum beati Dionysii de divinis nominibus expositio.” In his “Cosmic Structure and the Knowledge of God: Thomas Aquinas’ In Librum beati Dionysii de divinis nominibus expositio,” 265–549. Ph.D. diss. (Vanderbilt University, 1994).
- Summa theologiae (Synopsis of Theology) [ST], 1265-1268 (Prima Pars); 1271 (Prima Secundae); 1271-1272 (Secunda Secundae), and 1271-1273 (Tertia Pars) (incomplete).
- English translation: Fathers of the English Dominican Province, trans. (1911; reprint, Allen, TX: Christian Classics, 1981).
- Quaestiones disputatae de anima (Disputed Questions on the Soul), 1266-1267.
- English translation: Robb, James H., trans. Questions on the Soul. Mediaeval Philosophical Texts in Translation, 27 (Milwaukee: Marquette University Press, 1984).
- De regno [or De regimine principum], ad regem Cypri (On Kingship [or On the Governance of Rulers], for the King of Cyprus), 1266-1267.
- English translation: Phelan, Gerald B., and I.T. Eschmann, trans. On Kingship to the King of Cyprus. Mediaeval Sources in Translation, 2 (Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 1949).
- Sententia super De anima (Commentary on Aristotle’s De anima), 1267-1268.
- English translation: Pasnau, Robert C., trans. Commentary on Aristotle’s De anima (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1999).
- Expositio Libri Physicorum (Commentary on Aristotle’s Physics), 1268-1270.
- English translation: Blackwell, Richard J., Richard J. Spath, and W. Edmund Thirlkel, trans. Commentary on Aristotle’s Physics. Rare Masterpieces of Philosophy and Science (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1963; reprint, Aristotelian Commentary Series. Notre Dame, IN: Dumb Ox Books, 1999).
- Questiones disputatae de malo (Disputed Questions on Evil), 1269-1271.
- English translation: Trans. Jean Oesterle (Notre Dame, IN: The University of Notre Dame Press, 1995).
- Expositio Libri Peryermenias (Commentary on Aristotle’s De interpretatione), 1270-1271.
- English translation: Oesterle, Jean, trans. Aristotle on Interpretation: Commentary by St. Thomas and Cajetan. Mediaeval Philosophical Texts in Translation, 11 (Milwaukee: Marquette University Press, 1962. Reprinted, with a new introduction, as Commentary on Aristotle’s On Interpretation, Notre Dame, IN: Dumb Ox Books, 2004).
- Sententia super Metaphysicam (Commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics), 1270-1273.
- English translation: Rowan, John P., trans. Commentary on the Metaphysics of Aristotle. 2 vols (Chicago: Regnery, 1964; reprinted in one volume with revisions as Commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics, Aristotelian Commentary Series, Notre Dame, IN: Dumb Ox Books, 1995).
- De aeternitate mundi, contra murmurantes (On the Eternity of the World against Murmerers), 1271.
- English translation: In St. Thomas, Siger de Brabant, and St. Bonaventure, On the Eternity of the World, Cyril Vollert, Lottie Kenzierski, and Paul M. Byrne, trans. Mediaeval Philosophical Texts in Translation, 16 (Milwaukee: Marquette University Press, 1964).
- Sententia libri Ethicorum (Commentary on Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics), 1271-1272.
- English translation: Litzinger, C.I., trans. Commentary on the Nicomachean Ethics. 2 vols. Library of Living Catholic Thought (Chicago: Regnery, 1964; reprinted in 1 vol. with revisions as Commentary on Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotelian Commentary Series, Notre Dame, IN: Dumb Ox Books, 1993).
- Expositio super librum Boethii De hebdomadibus (Commentary on Boethius’ De hebdomadibus), 1271-1272?
- English translation: Schultz, Janice L., and Edward A. Synan, trans. An Exposition of the ‘On the Hebdomads’ of Boethius. Thomas Aquinas in Translation (Washington, DC: The Catholic University of America Press, 2001).
- Expositio super librum De causis (Commentary on Liber de causis), 1272-1273.
- English translation: Guagliardo, Vincent A., Charles R. Hess, and Richard C. Taylor, trans. Commentary on the Book of Causes. Thomas Aquinas in Translation (Washington, DC: The Catholic University of America Press, 1996).
The secondary literature on Thomas is vast. Here follows just a few important studies of Thomas’ thought in English that will be particularly helpful to someone who wants to learn more about Thomas’ philosophical thought as a whole. Also included in this section are works cited within the article (other than Thomas’ own).
- Artigas, Mariano. The Mind of the Universe: Understanding Science and Religion (Philadelphia: Templeton Foundation Press, 2000).
- Chesterton, G. K. The Dumb Ox (New York: Image Books, 1956).
- Originally published in 1933, this is a wryly written study by the famous English journalist that attempts to convey the spirit and significance of Thomas’ thought. The eminent 20th-century Thomas scholar Etienne Gilson once called it “the best book ever written on St. Thomas.” The book is readily available in many different editions.
- Clarke, W. Norris. The One and the Many: A Contemporary Thomistic Metaphysics (Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 2001).
- An excellent attempt to articulate Thomas’ metaphysical views in light of the phenomenological and personalist traditions of 20th-century philosophy.
- Copleston, F.C. Aquinas. (London: Penguin Books, 1955).
- A still classic study that attempts to explain Thomas’ views with an eye toward analytic philosophical idioms.
- Davies, Brian. The Thought of Thomas Aquinas (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1992).
- A clear and philosophically interesting summary of Thomas’ theological and philosophical thought, one that follows the structure of Thomas’ Summa theologiae.
- Davies, Brian and Eleonore Stump, eds. The Oxford Handbook of Aquinas (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2012).
- A recent and excellent collection of scholarly articles on all aspects of Thomas’ thought.
- Eberl, Jason. The Routledge Guidebook to Aquinas’ Summa Theologiae (London: Routledge, 2015).
- A close reading and explanation of the philosophical views contained in Thomas’ greatest work.
- Feser, Edward. Aquinas: A Beginner’s Guide (Oxford: Oneworld, 2009).
- Despite the title, this is a sophisticated, very readable, articulation and defense of ideas central to Thomas’ thought.
- Gilson, Etienne. The Christian Philosophy of St. Thomas Aquinas. Trans. L. K Shook (1956; reprint, Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 1994).
- A classic study by the famous 20th-century Thomist and scholar of medieval philosophy. Among other things, Gilson argues that Thomas’ concept of actus essendi is the key to understanding his thought and its unique contribution to the history of Western philosophy.
- King, Jr., Martin Luther. “Letter from the Birmingham Jail,” in Why We Can’t Wait (New York: Signet Books, 1963).
- Kretzmann, Norman and Eleonore Stump, eds. The Cambridge Companion to Aquinas (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1993).
- An excellent collection of scholarly introductions to all the major facets of Thomas’ thought.
- Pieper, Josef. A Guide to Thomas Aquinas. Trans. Richard and Clara Winston (San Francisco: Ignatius, 1991).
- Gives a helpful introduction to Thomas’ thought by way of clearly presenting the historical context in which Thomas lived and taught.
- Plantinga, Alvin. Warranted Christian Belief (New York: Oxford University Press, 2000).
- Rota, Michael W. “What Aristotelian and Thomistic philosophy can contribute to Christian theology,” in Theology and Philosophy: Faith and Reason, eds. O. Crisp, G. D’Costa, M. Davies, and P. Hampson (London: T & T Clark, 2012), pp. 102-115.
- Stump, Eleonore. Aquinas. Arguments of the Philosophers (London: Routledge, 2003).
- A detailed presentation of Thomas’ philosophical thought, one that articulates and defends Thomas’ views in light of contemporary analytic philosophical discussions in metaphysics, epistemology, the philosophy of religion, the philosophy of mind, and ethics.
- Torrell, Jean-Pierre. Aquinas’s Summa: Background, Structure, and Reception. Trans. Benedict M. Guevin (Washington, DC: The Catholic University of America Press, 2005).
- Helpfully explains the context, content, and the history of the reaction to Thomas’ greatest work.
- Van Inwagen, Peter. Metaphysics. 4th ed. (Boulder, CO: Westview Press, 2015).
- Ingardia, Richard. Thomas Aquinas: International Bibliography 1977-1990 (Bowling Green, KY: The Philosophical Documentation Center).
- Kretzmann, Norman and Eleonore Stump. “Aquinas, Thomas,” in The Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy. Vol. 1. Edward Craig, ed. (London: Routledge, 1998), pp. 326-350.
- A scholarly, concise, and very informative account of Thomas’ life and works. Also contains a good bibliography.
- Miethe, T. L. and Vernon Bourke. Thomistic Bibliography 1940-1978 (Westport, CT: Greenwood Press, 1980).
- Torrell, Jean-Pierre. Saint Thomas Aquinas: The Person and His Work. Trans. Robert Royal. Revised Edition (Washington, DC: The Catholic University of America Press, 2005).
- The most up-to-date, scholarly, book-length treatment of Thomas’ life and works.
- Tugwell, Simon. Albert and Thomas: Selected Writings. The Classics of Western Spirituality (Mahwah, NJ: Paulist Press, 1988).
- The introduction to this work contains a concise and helpful account of Thomas’ life and works.
- Weisheipl, J. Friar Thomas D’Aquino: His Life, Thought, and Works (Washington, DC: The Catholic University of America Press, 1983).
- A classic study, which is nonetheless superseded by (Torrell 2005).
Christopher M. Brown
University of Tennessee at Martin
U. S. A.