F. H. Bradley: Logic

F. H. BradleyAlthough the logical system expounded by F. H. Bradley in The Principles of Logic (1883) is now almost forgotten, it had many virtues. To appreciate them, it is helpful to understand that Bradley had a very different view of logic from that prevalent today.  He is hostile to the idea of a purely formal logic. Today, deductive logic is largely restricted to a study of the rules through which we can legitimately re-arrange our thoughts, permitting the elimination of items no longer required, but not allowing the addition of anything genuinely new.  Bradley had a much wider conception and took logic to be the discipline through which we give an account and explanation of the special function of thought through which we transcend immediate experience.  Bradley believes logic covers topics that would fall today under the heading of theory of knowledge.

For Bradley, the processes of thought through which we transcend immediate experience involve ideas, judgments, and inferences.  He begins with judgment and offers a natural account of both relational judgments with more than one subject and judgments without a special subject, such as: “It is raining.”  His general theory that the ultimate subject of all judgment is reality as such could also accommodate the mass terms that give modern logicians so much trouble.

Although Bradley accepts the credo of empiricism that all our knowledge begins in experience, he does not accept Hume’s view that our immediate experience is composed by a swarm of impressions. He rejects the theory, widespread at the time, that knowledge could be explained through the association of ideas derived from such impressions.  Neither psychological particulars nor any connections among them are the sorts of thing capable of representing anything beyond themselves.  Judgment requires “logical” ideas that are universal, not particular.

What most baffles readers is an esoteric doctrine in which Bradley assimilates judgment and inference as processes in which there is a movement of thought from a ground to a conclusion.  Unless there is a change, nothing has happened, but any change requires justification, if the inference is to be valid or the judgment true.  For the movement of thought to be satisfactory, the ground and justification cannot remain external and must be brought inside.  This is achieved to the extent that we can enlarge our system of thought.  It may seem that Bradley is now heading to a Hegelian solution in which the completion of the system of thought brings about the identity of Thought and Reality, but Bradley is not prepared to go this far.  This is, however, a matter for metaphysics and is beyond the scope of logic.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Bradley’s Conception of Logic
  3. Judgment
  4. Logical Ideas
  5. Categorical Judgments
    1. Universal Judgments
    2. Analytic Judgments of Sense
    3. Synthetic Judgments of Sense
  6. Hypothetical Judgments
  7. The Esoteric Doctrine
  8. Other Types of Judgments
    1. Negative Judgments
    2. Disjunctive Judgments
  9. Other Topics
    1. Logical Principles
    2. Extension and Intension
    3. Modality
  10. Judgment: Concluding Remarks
  11. The Nature of Inference
  12. The Association of Ideas
  13. Inductive Inference
  14. Inference: The Inclusive Theory
  15. Inference and Judgment
  16. Formal Logic
  17. Truth and Validity
  18. The Final Doctrine
    1. Inference
    2. Judgment
    3. The Fundamental Problem of Thought
    4. Immediate Experience and the Absolute
  19. References and Further Reading
    1. Selected works by F. H. Bradley
    2. Further Reading

1. Biography

Francis Herbert Bradley was born in 1846 into a very large family that included the celebrated Shakespearean critic, A.C. Bradley.  Having studied at Oxford University, F. H. Bradley was awarded in 1870 a Fellowship at Merton College, where he remained until his death in 1924.  He was not required to teach and did not do so.  The dominant philosophy in England when he came to Oxford was the (kind of) empiricism, originally due to John Locke, whose champion in the nineteenth century was John Stuart Mill. This theory attempted to explain cognition through the association of mental particulars, impressions and ideas, originally introduced into the mind, it was supposed, by external causes.  Bradley was implacably opposed to this position and determined to demolish it.  He gained assistance in this from his wide reading in German philosophy, but refused to call himself a Hegelian, since he denied the central principle of the identity of Thought and Reality.  Nonetheless, he is generally regarded as the central figure in the group of British Idealists in the late nineteenth century.

2. Bradley’s Conception of Logic

The principal source for Bradley’s thoughts about logic is a substantial two-volume work entitled The Principles of Logic, published in Oxford in 1883.  A second edition appeared in 1922, in which the original text was supplemented by a large number of additional notes and terminal essays through which Bradley expressed his mature position. (Page references in what follows will be to this second edition.)

Bradley had a very different view of logic from that prevalent today.  Today, logic is largely restricted to a study of the rules through which we can legitimately re-arrange our thoughts, permitting the elimination of items no longer required, but not allowing the addition of anything genuinely new.  Bradley had a much wider conception and took logic to be the discipline through which we give an account and explanation of the special function of thought through which we transcend immediate experience.  Logic, for Bradley, therefore covers topics that would fall today under the heading of theory of knowledge.

The processes of thought were traditionally taken to involve ideas, judgments, and inferences.  These topics, however, are very closely connected.  One could begin at any point, but Bradley proposes to begin in the middle with the faculty of judgment.

3. Judgment

Bradley’s central definition is as follows: “Judgment proper is the act which refers an ideal content (recognized as such) to a reality beyond the act.” (10) This definition immediately raises two serious questions: (1) What is this ideal content and how is it acquired? (2) What is reality and how is it accessed?  These are questions that Bradley tackles in considerable detail.  Moreover, the definition commits Bradley to the thesis that the structure of judgment is essentially subject-predicate, “that in every judgment there is a subject of which the ideal content is asserted.” (13)   The subject is what is real, and the predicate is the ideal content referred to it: judgment is essentially predication.

This is, of course, to display the form of the act or function of judgment.  It does not specify the essential structure of the ideal content, nor does it trap Bradley within the traditional logic of the categorical statement, as Russell believed.  Categorical statements involve the combination of two terms—a subject term and a predicate term—with the two terms united by the copula in such a way that the act of combination is the act of judgment.  Bradley resists this account on the ground that the ideal complex expressed is the same whether the proposition is asserted or merely entertained.  “We may say then, if the copula is a connection which couples a pair of ideas, it falls outside judgment; and, if on the other hand it is the sign of judgment, it does not couple.  Or, if it both joined and judged, then judgment at any rate would not be mere joining.” (21)  It is not even true that every judgment contains two ideas: on the contrary, it has but one.  The ideal content may be as complex as you please: it may be “a complex totality of qualities and relations” (11); but even if we distinguish separate ideas within the complex, it is as a unit that it is referred to reality.  When we assert that the wolf eats the lamb, it is the whole complex that is referred beyond the act of judgment, even if we distinguish within it the separate ideas of (at least) the wolf and the lamb.

Because we can distinguish separate objects such as the wolf and the lamb that can function as special subjects, we can draw at the level of logic a distinction between singular judgments that characterize single things and plural judgments in which a number of such things may be related.  But even with non-singular judgments, we must assume a unified reality within which various objects are assigned a place.

Bradley’s theory that relational judgments that appear to refer to a number of identifiable and discriminable individuals actually presuppose a single underlying reality gets confirmation from his logical analysis of a kind of judgment in which this reality is introduced directly.  This is the kind of judgment that denies the existence of things of a certain type, such as sea-serpents.  “Sea-serpents do not exist” has “sea-serpents” as its grammatical subject, but we must distinguish the grammatical subject from the real subject that confers a truth-value upon the statement.  Sea-serpents are not the reality to which we refer when making this judgment, since there are no sea-serpents.  The correct logical analysis is something like: “Reality is such that it contains no sea-serpents.”  This corresponds to: “Reality is such that A and B are simultaneous.”  Bradley can therefore handle this kind of judgment without presupposing the existence of what is denied.  What he presupposes is the reality that is the ultimate subject of every judgment.  The competing analysis offered by modern logic through the negation of existential quantification presupposes a universe of discourse comprising all possible values of the individual variables in the system.

Judgment has a dimension of truth and falsity, and Bradley uses this to confirm his view that judgment necessarily involves a reference to what is real.  “For consider;” he says, “a judgment must be true or false, and its truth or falsehood cannot lie in itself.  They involve a reference to a something beyond.  And this, about which or of which we judge, if it is not fact, what else can it be?” (41)  It may be thought that logical truths, said to be true in all possible worlds, are an exception.  For Bradley, logical truths, or tautologies, are not true in all possible worlds: they are not true in any possible world. “A bare tautology ...is not even so much as a poor truth or a thin truth.  It is not a truth in any way, in any sense, or at all.” (Appearance and Reality, Note A, 501.)

4. Logical Ideas

Bradley’s definition of judgment introduces “ideal content.”  What is “ideal content” and how is it acquired?  Bradley was completely sure that the psychological particulars with which empiricists furnished the mind could not begin to explain judgment, knowledge, and cognition.  If such things existed, they certainly could not function as predicates in judgment, since they could not be moved from their place in the mind.

What Bradley had to explain was how we get from psychological ideas, which are mental particulars, to logical ideas, which are universal ideal contents, while preserving the information that the impressions have no doubt acquired from elsewhere.  He begins by distinguishing two sides that belong to every psychological idea—its existence as a mental particular and its content.  “We perceive both that it is and what it is.” (3)  Unlike existence, content can be loosened from its home in the psychological idea and transferred elsewhere—a loosening of content that takes place within the act of judgment.  It is not, however, the entire content of the psychological idea that is used in judgment.  The original content, he says, is “mutilated.” That the acquisition of ideal content involves abstraction is more clearly appreciated, if we move from the Humean picture of a swarm of distinct impressions arriving together in the mind to the notion of an organic immediate experience with which Bradley is more comfortable.  It is clear that the logical ideas used in judgment require the separation of elements within the “sensuous felt mass” presented in immediate experience.  Even if we begin, however, with an isolated impression or sense-datum, we must recognize that universals are associated at different levels.

Bradley makes an unsuccessful attempt to explain what he has in mind by using the notion of a symbol.  A symbol, such as a particular inscription, has, like everything else, two sides: its existence and its content.  But it has also a third side—its meaning or signification.  This meaning can be identified with the logical idea used in judgment. The symbol RED has as its meaning exactly what we assign to a variety of objects in the act of judgment.  This provides an opening for Frege and those who favor the linguistic turn to slip in an item distinct from any image or psychological idea that may be associated with the word.  (The logical idea is, of course, to be identified with what Frege calls the sense of the sign, not the referent.)  But the attachment of the idea to the symbol through decision or convention does nothing to explain the connection between the abstract universal and the immediate experience which must be its home.  It is only because we can abstract a part of the given content that we obtain the sense that we attach to the sign in the language.

5. Categorical Judgments

a. Universal Judgments

The standard classification of judgments distinguished categorical, hypothetical, and disjunctive.  Bradley reduces the universal form of the categorical judgment to a hypothetical form.  The universal form does not even guarantee the existence of real things to which we refer.  “All trespassers will be prosecuted” is designed to ensure that the subject class remains empty.  Thus, “Animals are mortal” becomes “If anything is an animal, then it is mortal.” (47) Bradley admits that he got this from Herbart, and Russell admits, in turn, that he got it from Bradley.

b. Analytic Judgments of Sense

Singular judgments, however, are different.  Bradley takes as his example: “I have a toothache.”  I and my toothache are both individual, but I describe my condition in general terms as “suffering from toothache.”  This example belongs to the first division of singular judgments that he calls “analytic judgments of sense.”  “The essence of these is to hold only of the now, and not to transcend the given presentation.” (56)  Analytic judgments of sense do not always have a grammatical subject or copula.  We may call the cry “Wolf” a warning, but it is also a statement of fact, or is supposed to be.  The cry of “Wolf” or “Rain” refers to an undifferentiated present reality. The thought is that a wolf is somewhere and that rain is everywhere, at least everywhere that matters.  But there are also singular judgments without grammatical subjects in which we qualify by our idea “but one piece of the present.” (57)  One way to do this is by pointing.  I point to my dog and say “Asleep.”  Bradley rejects the view that the grammatical subject is merely suppressed. Even if a grammatical subject may appear when my judgment is reported.

Bradley identifies a second kind of analytic judgments of sense that do have a grammatical subject. “The ideal content of the predicate is here referred to another idea, which stands as a subject.  But in this case, as above, the ultimate subject is no idea, but is the real in presentation.  It is this to which the content of both ideas, with their relation, is attributed.” (57)  “This bird is yellow” is a typical example.  The ideal content “bird”, perhaps aided by a pointing finger, is used to identify the particular object that is the special subject of the judgment.

In addition to analytic judgments of sense in which a real object is introduced through what we would now call a definite description, there are other cases in which a proper name is used, such as “John is asleep.”  The name “John” is bestowed to help us identify a particular person.  Bradley attacks the view that a proper name has a denotation, but no connotation.  The proper name is a sign connected with what it denotes, but I could not identify what it denotes without some descriptive content to help me recognize it.

c. Synthetic Judgments of Sense

The discussion of proper names allows Bradley to move to a second category of singular judgment-synthetic judgments of sense.  “Proper names,” he says, “have a meaning that always goes beyond the presentation of the moment.” (61) In using the name of a person, we assume an existence that goes beyond what is available in immediate experience, a reality that appears but is distinct from its appearance.  In a synthetic judgment of sense, “we make generally some assertion about that which appears in a space or time that we do not perceive.” (61-2) But how is this possible?  How can we make a judgment about a reality that appeared in the past, will appear in the future, or is now over the horizon, if we encounter reality only through presentation in immediate experience?  No idea can capture the uniqueness of the day that is last Tuesday.  We can form the idea of a certain kind of event: we can form the idea of an extensive history involving as large a sequence of events as you please, but such ideal contents cannot capture the unique past that actually took place, which alone can make the ideas we refer to the past either true or false.

For Bradley, the solution requires a crucial distinction between “this” and “thisness”.  Only this day is today.  Yesterday was today yesterday, but it is no longer today today.  Today is also a particular day distinct from every other day and has its own date.  It has its own position in a series of days within which every day is rigidly ordered through the relation of earlier and later. This series of days does not change, even when it is envisaged at different times.  It is therefore a universal ideal content, and each day within the series has particularity or “thisness”.  After McTaggart, the series has been known as the B-series.  This ideal series can be attached to reality, only through the identification of a particular day within it with the reality given in present experience, which will turn that day into “today.”  Once this is done, days that come after the day with that date are future days that will be real, and days that come before are past days that were real.  This introduces the McTaggart A-series.  To explain Bradley’s theory, the unit “day” has been used, although it does not appear in the text and involves an oversimplification, since we cannot identify an entire day with the present of immediate experience.  On the other hand, it would be a complete mistake to identify the immediate present with an instant or a moment, imagined as either the end product of the infinite division of a period of time or as the interface between adjacent periods.

Since we cannot introduce a reference to what really happened in the past or will really happen in the future, which synthetic judgments of sense seem to demand, through the construction of even the most complex and extensive ideal content constituting a history of a possible world, how is the feat to be accomplished?  Bradley’s solution is that although I can access reality only through a point of contact in immediate present experience, reality is not restricted to its appearance in my experience.  The problem of appearance and reality is metaphysical and requires another book; but even at the level of logic it is clear that the identity of reality and what appears in experience is not mandated.  “If the real must be ‘this’, must encounter us directly, we cannot conclude that the ‘this’ we take is all the real, or that nothing is real beyond the ‘this’.” (70) Being given in experience is not a quality of reality “in such a sense as to shut up reality within that quality.” (70)  An ideal content can be true “because it is predicated of the reality, and unique because it is fixed in relation with immediate perception.” (72) Since immediate perception may involve an experience of change, a fragment of the temporal series may be abstracted and extended indefinitely through an ideal process.

Bradley has one further move to make to introduce the idea of a particular fact. “The idea of particularity implies two elements. We must first have a content qualified by ‘thisness’, and we must add to that content the general idea of reference to the reality.” (77) Without the second element, we have members that are exclusive within the series, “but the whole collection is not unique.” (77) For absolute uniqueness, we require the connection of the series with direct presentation.  To think of tomorrow we may require a universal ideal content to connect it with today, but the day we think about is as unique as is today.

6. Hypothetical Judgments

Bradley handled universal judgments by reducing them to hypothetical form, but how can a hypothetical judgment be taken as true, since its antecedent is supposed, but not categorically affirmed?  Modern logic evades this problem by treating hypothetical statements as truth-functional, but this evasion has consequences. For Bradley, the hypothetical judgment involves an ideal experiment.  “The supposal is treated as if it were real, in order to see how the real behaves when qualified thus in a certain manner.” (86)  The connection of the components is what is asserted in the hypothetical judgment, and it is this that has its ground in reality.

Bradley believes that not only are all universal judgments hypothetical, but also that all hypothetical judgments are universal.  This may be thought doubtful, since there seem to be exceptions.  “If this man has taken that dose, he will be dead in twenty minutes.” (89)  This would not be necessarily true of any man who took the dose; but if the judgment is true, there will be some universal connection, even if restricted to the case of that specific man.

Bradley is assuming that the truth of a hypothetical statement must depend on some (possibly) latent feature of reality.  Singular judgments, however, appear to connect us more directly with solid fact.  The synthetic judgment of sense has its special status as categorical because of its connection with a reality actually given.  It therefore depends on the analytic judgment of sense which assigns an ideal content to that given. Bradley has already argued that all universal statements are hypothetical.  This is now widely accepted.  He now moves to the startling claim that all singular statements are hypothetical, which he recognizes as an “unwelcome conclusion.” (91)   Construed as categorical, analytic judgments of sense are all false, because they do not provide the whole truth about what is given in immediate experience, far less the whole truth about reality.  This follows from his original story that an ideal content used in judgment is limited to part of the content of the given reality.  But to say that the judgment is not the whole truth is not to say that it is not wholly true and hence partly false, even false tout court. Bradley complains that the choice of an ideal content to qualify the immediate given is arbitrary.  Arbitrary is too strong, since the choice may very well have a purpose, but even if it were arbitrary, the assignment of universal content to the given reality would be just as true as the choice of any other content from the selection available.

Bradley is suggesting that the loosening of part of the content of the given reality that he introduced earlier as the very essence of thought is doomed to failure in advance.  This is why he talks about “mutilation”.   But the success or failure of the operation is surely relative to what it is intended to achieve.  It is not designed to provide an ideal content that will be a complete characterization of reality as a whole; it has surely a much more limited aim.   One idea is that loosening a part of the content is associated with separating out a segment of the given reality that conforms to the concept introduced.  Loosening the concept of a dog from what I am given allows me to separate out Fido and perhaps other dogs within my field of view.  The analytic judgment of sense that here is a dog would appear to be categorically true.  This way of explaining the function of the judgments immediately associated with the loosening of ideal contents would allow Bradley, were he so minded, to make peace with logical systems, such as both Aristotelian and modern logic, that give a central position to the individual object. (This is essentially the problem of “special subjects”, discussed in Campbell: 1967.)

7. The Esoteric Doctrine

We have now come to a parting of the ways.  If we accept the truth of analytic judgments of sense, such “judgments that analyze what is given in perception will all be categorical.” (106)  Abstract, universal judgments will all be hypothetical.  Synthetic judgments “about times and spaces beyond perception” (106) are also categorical, although they require inferences that rely on the universal.  Bradley is prepared to allow those who lack the courage to follow him to a more esoteric theory “to remain at a lower point of view.” (106)    Bradley, however, proposes a trip to a region where the “distinction between individual and universal, categorical and hypothetical, has been quite broken through.” (106)  It is at this higher level that Bradley’s logic becomes so difficult, perhaps impossibly difficult.  At the lower point of view, we separate out individual objects that we characterize through universal properties and relations in singular and plural judgments.  Bradley begins the move to what is higher (or deeper) with the point that these individual objects are conditioned by the setting in which they are found.  They are not unconditioned, but are asserted subject to a condition.  What is subject to a condition can be asserted categorically, if the condition is taken as satisfied.  Bradley is well aware that conditional and conditioned are not the same.  “A thing is conditional on account of a supposal, but on the other hand it is conditioned by a fact.” (99)  His argument is that for anything with a setting in space and time, the condition can never be satisfied.  To introduce the series of conditions in space and time is to introduce a chain whose last link hangs unsupported in the air. This is a worrying argument, traditionally used to prove that the world must have a beginning in time (perhaps also a First Cause), or else by Kant to vindicate transcendental idealism.  The assessment of how far it provides a solid support for what Bradley proposes to build on it will be postponed until 18b.

Rejecting the categorical judgment that assigns an ideal content to the segment of reality from which it has been loosened, Bradley is left with no more than hypothetical judgments.  These cannot even be our standard hypothetical judgments that are composites of categorical statements.  They are mere husks, connecting adjectives For example, “If lightning, then thundering.”  Certainly, hypotheticals that connect adjectives are in a way also categorical, since they affirm a ground of connection in reality.  But we have lost our standard hypothetical judgments and are left with mere scraps.  Even more baffling is the replacement we are offered for a singular judgment in the higher point of view.  “Instead of meaning by ‘Here is a wolf,’ or ‘This tree is green’ that ‘wolf’ and ‘green tree’ are real facts, it must affirm the general connection of wolf with elements in the environment, and of ‘green’ with ‘tree.’” (104)

Bradley offers a further explanation of his “unwelcome conclusion” in Terminal Essay II, which I discuss in 18b and offer a way of escape.  In the meantime, he returns from the heights and provides a more mundane account of other kinds of judgment.

8. Other Types of Judgments

a. Negative Judgments

Bradley now turns to negative judgments.  Negative judgments, he believes, are more complicated than affirmative, since they must begin with a suggestion that is rejected in the judgment.  Moreover, this rejection must depend on the assumption of a positive ground of exclusion, even if what this is may not be known. Negative existential judgments are of particular interest. In “Ghosts do not exist,” the grammatical subject cannot be the real subject; the real subject is the nature of things to which we deny the quality of harboring ghosts.  The positive character of reality that excludes ghosts is not, however, determined through the negative judgment.  This entails that the same character of the real may exclude a variety of different suggestions.  The suggestions excluded have their source in an ideal experiment and not in the nature of reality.  The negative judgment affirms that some quality of the real excludes a suggestion, but it does not determine what quality that is.  The truth of a negative judgment depends on a quality of the real incompatible with the quality excluded in the judgment.  The true quality and the quality assigned in the judgment are thus contraries and not contradictories.  The way in which a negative judgment presupposes a quality in what is real that we may not be able to specify may be compared with the way in which a hypothetical judgment presupposes the same kind of quality as grounding its connection.  It follows that the negation of a hypothetical judgment would be the rejection of this sort of ground.  The mere assertion of the antecedent and the negation of the consequent is indeed incompatible with the hypothetical judgment, but it is not its contradictory.  A genuine contradictory would be strong enough to rule out counterfactual conditionals.

b. Disjunctive Judgments

Bradley understands disjunction as providing a list of two or more mutually exclusive alternatives.  He is willing to associate disjunction with a nest of hypothetical judgments, but since neither the hypothetical judgments nor the disjunction are truth-functional, the disjunctive judgment may have a certain categorical aspect. “Disjunctive judgment is the union of hypotheticals on a categoric basis.” (131)

Bradley connects disjunction with choice, where we make a selection from a number of alternatives.  There is a definite list of possibilities; this is its categorical feature.  We cannot use disjunctive addition to add in an arbitrary fashion another disjunct that is not a real possibility.  In the same way, to say that something is colored is associated with a list of possibilities from which we select the actual color.  To produce the disjunctive judgment that lists the varieties of color is to assign to the object categorically the property of being some kind of color, even if we do not know which color it is.

This example conforms to the template that Bradley favors in place of the form “either p or q or…” that is used today. Bradley treats the disjunctive judgment as a kind of singular judgment, with the format “A is either b or c or d....” This analysis will run into difficulties when A does not exist, but Bradley has met this problem before, and deals with it by replacing the grammatical subject with the real subject.  This maneuver can even handle cases that seem most recalcitrant, such as “Either the light bulb is dead or the fuse has blown.”  This would become: “Reality is either characterized by light bulb malfunction or fuse meltdown.”

9. Other Topics

a. Logical Principles

Chapter V examines logical principles.  Bradley dismisses the Law of Identity as an empty tautology. Judgment requires the identity of differences, not provided by “A is A.” This means that the accusation (by Bertrand Russell) of confusing the “is” of predication with the “is” of identity cannot be fair, since for Bradley predication is the essence of judgment, whereas through the “is” of strict identity we do not make a judgment at all.         

The most interesting part of the section on “The Principle of Contradiction” is the discussion of (Hegelian) dialectic.  Bradley’s simple solution is that if the ideas combined in the synthesis are merely different, there is no problem. The ideas of self and other are different ideas, but no one would say that it is a contradiction to assert the existence of the self and other things as well.  The challenge to the principle of contradiction comes, only if the different ideas combined are taken to be discrepant or contrary, since the contrary of a given proposition entails its contradictory. Bradley offers a compromise according to which ideas that appear to be contrary are reconciled when harmonized within a wider reality.  For example, opposite properties can be assigned to the same thing at different times.

The Law of Excluded Middle takes the form of a disjunctive judgment and would be expressed today as “either p or not p.” Bradley, however, has a different form for disjunction, so that his version of the principle will be: “A is either b or not-b.” A is not always a real particular thing, but sometimes reality as such.  Indeed, if Bradley gets his way, the ultimate subject will always be reality.  Excluded middle uses the variety of disjunction in which the number of disjuncts is exactly two.  When the second disjunct is constructed as the negation of the first, there can be no other choice.

b. Extension and Intension

Bradley next tackles the familiar distinction between intension and extension in the chapter on the quantity of judgment, explaining that “in every symbol we separate what it means from that which it stands for.” (168)  (Frege’s distinction between sinn and bedeutung.)  His account of the extensional treatment of universal judgments such as “Dogs are mammals” is disappointing, because he fails to register that a set is a special kind of entity, suggesting that a set of dogs must be a pack of dogs, failing which the only alternative is the ludicrous idea of a collection of dog-images in the mind!  With a proper notion of set in place, “Dogs are mammals” can be taken to assert a relation between two sets, just as many other judgments assert a relation between two objects.

Judgments founded on intension refer to the connection of attributes and meanings, and ignore the denotation of objects.  Universal judgments based on meanings are those Kant considers strictly universal, because they do not permit even the possibility of exceptions. Not all universal judgments are of this type, and singular judgments never are. Our concept of what is real, denoted in a singular judgment, is the concept of the individual, which is both particular, excluding all other individuals, and universal, as unifying various characteristics and constituting an identity in difference.  The real individual is a concrete universal: abstract universals, which can be separated from the individual in thought and applied elsewhere, cannot be real.  In a similar way, what is truly individual is a concrete particular; abstract particulars that are nothing more than their distinction from other particulars are also unreal.  “A reality in space must have spatial diversity, internal to itself.” (188)   A point in space is distinct from all other points, but is a mere abstraction.  A moment in time is also an abstraction; a concrete individual existing in time must have some duration.

c. Modality

Bradley rejects as erroneous the view that modal differences do not affect the actual content of the judgments involved.  Certainly, you can take any judgment and “express any attitude of your mind towards it.” (198)   These propositional attitudes are many and various.  I may say: “I wish to make it” or “I fear to make it” or “I am forced to make it.”  “All these are simple assertorical statements about my condition of mind.” (198) Statements about possibility and necessity do not, however, express my state of mind.  They are assertions that claim objective truth.  “There clearly can be but one kind of judgment, the assertorical.  Modality affects not the affirmation, but what is affirmed.” (197)  This is in line with the logic of Principia Mathematica, in which everything takes place under the aegis of the assertion sign.  In this system, there is not even a corresponding negation sign, just a sign for the negation of a proposition.  This is more extreme than Bradley, who does allow a distinct function of negation.

Thus, judgments of necessity and possibility have a special content not to be found in the corresponding assertoric judgment.  For Bradley, “The possible and the necessary are special forms of the hypothetical.” (198) Necessity consists in a necessary connection between antecedent and consequent in a hypothetical judgment.  To say that a fact is necessary is not to elevate it to a higher status, but merely to say that it is a necessary consequence of some other state of affairs, also taken as fact.  As already explained, the connection through which the antecedent necessitates the consequent must itself depend on a categorical ground.  This includes cases where we assert a necessary connection, because of a regular succession of events.  Not that this ground has to be a necessary causal connection.  “The real connection which seems the counterpart of the logical sequence, is in itself not necessary.” (206)

Bradley also connects the possible with the hypothetical.  To say that something is possible is to say that some of its conditions are satisfied, excluding those specified in the antecedent of the associated hypothetical statement.  “It is possible to see an eclipse of the moon tonight” means “If you get up early enough and the weather co-operates, you will see an eclipse of the moon.”  To assert a potentiality or power or disposition is to commit to a hypothetical judgment stating that if certain other conditions are satisfied, a certain state of affairs will necessarily come to pass.

Bradley has a problem with modality because of his metaphysical vision of a Parmenidean Absolute Reality.  Modal distinctions come to life with the conception of an open future, in which some things are unavoidable and others are possibilities among which we may choose.  What is actual at the present time cannot be properly said to be either possible or necessary (Bradley gets this right!); although some things that have taken place were necessary and others were not.  Without this kind of background, the conceptual scheme Bradley is discussing would not exist.

10. Judgment: Concluding Remarks

In his presidential address to the American Philosophical Association in 1957 “Speaking of Objects,” W.V. Quine presents the manifesto for the position of modern logic.  “We persist in breaking reality down somehow into a multiplicity of identifiable and discriminable objects to be referred to by singular and general terms.  We talk so inveterately of objects that to say we do seems almost to say nothing at all; for how else is there to talk?” The reality to which Quine referred at the beginning disappears under the carpet and is heard from no more.  For Bradley, the reality that is broken down is, and has to be, the reality available in immediate experience.  It is broken down through the faculty of thought and judgment, which introduces distinct individuals characterized through universal logical ideas. This makes possible singular and plural judgments involving qualities and relations.  Not all judgments about what is real conform, however, to this template.  There are genuine judgments about reality that bypass a reference to real individuals.  Some such judgments modern logic may handle in other ways, but there are some that remain troublesome, such as judgments involving mass terms.  Bradley’s system of logic is more flexible and can handle the variety we find.

The strength of Bradley’s theory of judgment is the flexibility through which it accommodates a variety of forms.  Its weakness is that through insisting that the ultimate subject of judgment is reality, he seems to undermine the legitimacy of the singular and plural judgments on which we normally rely. One way to retain Bradley’s logic while rejecting the absolute monism of his metaphysical theory is to recognize that “reality” is itself a mass term.  The later developments in the logic of mass terms that are proving such a headache for modern logic also make more palatable the logic of Bradley.  Concepts, like “gold”, which do not by themselves package reality into units in the same way as count nouns like “dog”, can be used in various ways.  They can be used in a singular judgment to refer to a piece of gold: they can be used in plural judgments to refer to pieces of gold: and there is also a third use, as in “Gold is yellow,” where the concept is associated with a mass term.  (Interestingly, Bradley uses this very example (46) without noticing its special character.)  The possibility of this third use surely does not invalidate the other uses in singular and plural judgments.

This explanation of the process described by Quine is, of course, given at Bradley’s lower point of view, but the use of a mass term to designate the setting for the individual object, in place of a string of other individuals, may well discourage the desire to move to the mysterious higher view.  To isolate within the sensuous felt mass, designated by a mass term, an individual object associated with an ideal content loosened from what is given, seems about as good an account of the process of thought as we can get.

11. The Nature of Inference

Bradley moves on in Books II and III to the important topic of inference.  There is a problem emerging from the distinction between analytic and synthetic judgments of sense introduced in Book I, in that the synthetic judgments move us beyond what is given in immediate experience and must involve some kind of inference.   In a book on the principles of logic, Bradley must also engage with the traditional doctrine of the syllogism, which was taken to be the core of deductive inference.  Bradley proposes in the second book to deal with deductive inferences generally agreed to be valid, without probing too deeply, then moving in a third book to a fundamental theory intended to cover all forms of inference.

He begins by setting out three features of inference with which it is difficult to disagree.  First, the conclusion of an inference depends on a process of thought through which it is reached.  Second, the process rests on a basis.  “In inference, we advance from truth possessed to a further truth.” (245)  Third, there must be a difference between basis and conclusion; otherwise, the supposed inference is a “senseless iteration.” (246)

Bradley makes a list of forms of deductive inference, casting his net more widely to capture specimens that do not usually appear in the textbooks of the day.  The traditional syllogism cannot be taken as fundamental, since it does not cover all the forms that Bradley has listed, such as those empowered by transitive relations.  Bradley describes the process of inference as an operation of synthesis which “takes its data and by ideal construction combines them into a whole.” (256) Logical connection, however, requires the identity of common links, such as the middle term in a syllogism.  The first step is to form the whole: the second step is to extract the conclusion perceived within the whole by omitting parts that are no longer of interest.  Bradley denies that there is any general principle that will serve as a test of the validity of reasoning. The traditional syllogism is not up to the job and no replacement can be found.

The common link required to combine premisses is both the same and different.  “If it were not different it would have nothing to connect, and if it were not the same there could be no connection.” (288)  But how can we have both identity and difference?  The solution is that the common term is an ideal content “appearing in and differenced by two several contexts.” (288)

The process of inference depends entirely on this identity in difference.  There are, however, two radically different kinds of identity that Bradley does not distinguish at this point.  There are universal characters which are identical throughout their various instantiations (abstract universals) and there are individual objects that remain identical throughout their various appearances (concrete universals).  These individuals may even combine characters that are in some sense discrepant, if they are extended in space or enduring in time.  Caesar was in Gaul, and Caesar was in Italy.  Both types of identity in difference can provide a ground for inference, even within traditional syllogistic logic.  By suggesting that inference takes place only through the development of an ideal content and not via reference to an individual object, Bradley undermines the singular judgment and prepares the ground for a logical doctrine that downgrades it.

12. The Association of Ideas

The “association of ideas” is the name for a process that exists as a psychological fact; what Bradley is attacking is the empiricist account of this fact and the use of it to explain judgment and inference.  The empiricist theories of David Hume and John Stuart Mill attempt to explain the life of the mind in terms of the association of ideas that are distinct existences or psychological atoms.  The laws of association usually recognized are contiguity and similarity.  Bradley argues that the empiricists do not have the resources even to state clearly their central position, and offers the following restatement: “Any element tends to reproduce those elements with which it has formed one state of mind.” (304) He calls this law “redintegration”, getting the term from Sir William Hamilton.  The use of the qualification “tends” is standard for laws of association.  Bradley insists that his law “does not exclude any succession of events which comes as a whole before the mind,” (305) which is, of course, vital for the explanation of causal inference.

In spite of a superficial resemblance, there is a chasm that divides Bradley’s redintegration and the association of the empiricists.  Association is cohesion between psychical particulars: redintegration concerns the connection of universals, “which is an ideal identity within the individuals.” (306)  Only an ideal connection in the mind can survive the disappearance of connected individuals.  The impressions originally given in conjunction are gone and cannot be resurrected.  Only the universal ideal content, the “what” as opposed to the “that” is left behind as a memory trace.  Through the universals, we may perhaps be able to produce images that are, as it were, ghosts of the past, but these images will be fresh particulars and distinct existences that can be considered re-incarnations of the past, only in virtue of an ideal identity preserved through the universal.

In the empiricist theory developed, for instance, by John Stuart Mill, the bare contiguity of impressions was not considered to be by itself sufficient to operate the mechanism of association.  Past contiguity can be operative only if the memory thereof is introduced through the similarity between a component in a past experience and a sensation now being enjoyed.  But we still face the problem: “What has been called up has never been contiguous; and what has been contiguous cannot be called up.” (318) Not even similarity can resurrect what is now dead and gone.  Similarity can exist, only if the similar terms both exist. Therefore, reproduction through similarity is not possible, since the similarity requires that what is reproduced is already there.

There are few traces surviving today in either psychology or philosophy of the theory demolished by Bradley.  The violence of the rhetoric, although amusing, might be considered excessive, but in its day the theory was solidly entrenched, and dynamite may have been justified.

13. Inductive Inference

It seems that we often make inferences from particulars to particulars.  We take note that Fido barks when approached by a stranger; we infer that Rover will do the same.  Bradley denies that such inferences tacitly involve the inductive generalization that all dogs bark when approached by strangers, since people quite happy to make the inference from Fido to Rover might be reluctant to issue a general guarantee for all inferences of this type.  This does not mean, however, that universals are not involved.  The inference to the barking of Rover is based on a connection of ideal content, acquired through the encounter with Fido.

Bradley now turns to inductive generalization through which we reach a conclusion about all members of a certain class when only some members have been examined. This arena is the stamping ground of John Stuart Mill against whom Bradley directs his fire. Even if Mill’s Methods may be useful, standard textbooks agree that they are not logically sound. Bradley endorses the usual criticisms, and adds the point that in any case they do not take us from mere particulars to general truths, since the facts from which they begin are already conceptualized as instances of general kinds.

14. Inference: The Inclusive Theory

The story so far is that inference operates by combining premises that contain a ground of identity.  A conclusion is reached by eliminating the middle term.   Bradley now recognizes that this theory will not cover all forms of reasoning and sees the need for a third book in which to put things right. The original theory will handle the syllogism and many other arguments. What it does not cover is arguments where there is no elimination of a middle term, where the conclusion emerges as a structure incorporating A, B, and C on the basis of information relating A to B and B to C.  An example may clarify what Bradley has in mind.  We connect a day to the day before through the identity of the intervening night and the same day to the day after through a similar process.  In this way we construct a succession of days that will constitute a history.  This result will count as the conclusion of an inference in the wide sense.

Mathematics is also important in our cognitive life, and often not covered by the theory in Book II.  Other exceptions are the processes of comparison and distinction.  These are mental operations resulting in judgment, and are therefore inferences. Recognition is also inference, when we make the move from the perception of the man entering the room to the recognition of someone seen before.

Hegelian Dialectic also transcends the pattern permitted in the original theory.  Bradley offers a heretical version that tones down the excesses of the orthodox view.  Instead of supposing that the process begins in contradiction, Bradley suggests that our unrest begins in the recognition that the original datum is incomplete.  The dialectical move is to complete the incomplete through positing a larger whole in which it is a component.  This larger whole is itself seen to be incomplete, and the process is repeated.  The way in which the incomplete is completed has its source in the subject.  Although a dialectical move may have a source in past experience, the inferential move goes directly from the datum to what lies beyond, even if we are able sometimes to uncover a hypothetical judgment expressing the function that controls the inference.

Bradley is now ready to unveil general characteristics of inference.  Because it is intended to cover all cases, this will have to be vague.  In the beginning is a datum or data, followed by a mental operation, producing a result.  For example, in the inference: “A to the right of B, and B of C, and therefore A to the right of C” (432), we begin with “two sets of terms in relations of space” (432) and put them together.  This act of construction makes a difference, “but it does not make such a difference to the terms that they lose their identity.” (432-3)   Nor do A and C change their identity when directly related in the conclusion.   Inference makes a change, but it does not change the world.  Bradley often describes inference as “ideal experiment.” It is a movement of thought that we make, but we are not compelled to take this path.  If we have several premises, we are not compelled to put them together.  The act of combination is arbitrary, in the sense that it is something that we choose, but might not have chosen.  The act of inference is not a revision of the original data, although it introduces a fresh thought.

This makes sense where there is more than one premiss and an act of combination is required that depends upon the will of the agent.  But Bradley discovers many inferences where the conclusion issues through the development of a single premiss. Certainly, there is no inference without mental activity in which we begin with a datum and end with a judgment predicating a fresh characteristic; but does such intellectual activity all count as inference? Standard inference involves “a construction round an identical centre” (457), but there are non-standard inferences in which there seems to be no given identity.  However, the middle process, the operation leading from datum to conclusion, cannot “dispense with all identity.” (457)   The mere co-presence of all my thoughts is not enough, since this does not explain the special identity that enables the inference. Take “recognition” and “dialectic”, where we are given a real thing with a quality and infer another quality.  The inference depends on the connection of these qualities, and we might want to say that the middle term is the given quality.  The problem is that the connection of the qualities is neither explicit nor given. “It is a function of synthesis, which never appears except in its effects.” (458) “It is a construction by means of a hidden centre.” (458)Bradley distinguishes two operations associated with inference: synthesis and analysis.  In synthesis the many become one; in analysis the one becomes many.  Bradley makes a further distinction between analysis and elision.  We may begin with a judgment about a given whole, move by analysis to a plural judgment about its elements, and then by elision reach a conclusion about specific elements.  Central cases of inference in which premises are combined and a middle term eliminated involve both synthesis and analysis, but there are other inferences in which one or other operation is at least predominant.

Although they are different functions, analysis and synthesis have an intimate connection.  In analysis, the elements in the result are separated, but this means that they are also combined in a latent synthetic unity.  In synthesis, elements are combined, but the unity formed will be capable of analysis into the original components.  “Analysis is the synthesis of the whole which it divides, and synthesis the analysis of the whole which it constructs.” (471)  The crucial idea is the idea of the whole that analysis disassembles and synthesis constructs.  In analysis we operate on an explicit whole that falls into the background.  In synthesis we bring out the invisible totality comprehending the elements combined.

15. Inference and Judgment

With this wider conception of inference, it is getting harder to separate inference and judgment.  Certainly, synthetic judgments of sense involve a substantial inferential component, but even a judgment that comes straight from presentation seems to involve the analysis and synthesis that is characteristic of inference.  Judgment involves abstraction from the sensuous felt mass, and hence analysis.  Judgments assigning various characters to reality involve synthesis.  Bradley is certainly anxious to retain the distinction between judgment and inference.  “Inference is an experiment performed on a datum,” whereas in judgments of perception “there is properly no datum.” (479)  They do, indeed, have a basis, but this basis is for the intellect nothing.  “It is a sensuous whole which is merely felt and is not idealized.” (479)  Judgment is required to provide the ideal content from which inference takes its start.  In judgments of perception we have no rational ground to justify our result and “the stuff, upon which the act is directed, is not intellectual.” (480)  We can now, perhaps, make this clearer by explaining that the stuff in question is designated by a mass term.

The distinction between judgment and inference may not, however, be as sharp as one might like, as becomes clear when Bradley discusses the beginnings of our intellectual life.  “The earliest judgment will imply an operation which, although it is not inference, is something like it; and the earliest reasoning will begin with a datum, which though kin to judgment, is not intellectual.” (481) “Experience starts with a stimulation coming in from the periphery [what John McDowell calls ‘a brute impact from the exterior’]; but....the stimulation must be met by a central response.” (481) Sensations do not “simply walk into the mind.”  They are “the product of an active mental reaction.” (482)  The senses may give us sensations, but “the gift contains traces of something like thought.” (482)   The interface between cognition and the sensory input is murky indeed, but two things are clear. The response to the stimulus is not entirely arbitrary, nor is it a simple re-enactment of a given.  Nothing is given until it is received!

16. Formal Logic

Bradley is hostile to the idea of a purely formal logic whose goal is to construct a system of valid patterns of inference, covering all cases through the use of blanks and variables.  Partly, he does not believe that the goal can be achieved.  More basically, his concern is that the attempt to reconstruct inference in terms of the manipulation of counters in accordance with rules breaks the connection between inference and that continued reference to reality that lies at its heart.

Inferences do, indeed, proceed in accordance with principles, and we can reject a principle employed by finding another similar inference in which the premiss is true and the conclusion false.  In a particular inference, we can distinguish the principle from the matter involved, but we should not separate it and turn it into a major premiss in order to exhibit the argument as a syllogism.  The principle is not a premiss, because it is not a datum but a function. There may sometimes be a point in replacing the original argument with such a syllogism, but this option will not always be available. Every inference depends on a principle that is not a premiss, as Lewis Carroll has shown in "What the Tortoise Said to Achilles." Even Principia Mathematica has the Law of Substitution and the Law of Detachment that are not axioms of the system!

17. Truth and Validity

So far the focus has been on the phenomenology of inference.  But inference is important, not because it takes place, but because it is taken to have validity and justification.  The problem is to explain how inference can have validity and justification in the face of the fundamental dilemma that Bradley identifies.  Unless there is a transition from the premiss to a different conclusion, nothing has happened, and there is no inference; but if there is a difference between premiss and conclusion, how can we justify the intellectual move?  Bradley dismisses the extreme claim that since they are different, there is an actual contradiction between premiss and conclusion.  To assert the premisses is not to deny the conclusion: it is merely to fail to assert it until the inference is completed.  But how is the eventual assertion of a different conclusion to be justified?

Logicians who do not challenge the legitimacy of the analytic judgment of sense can form a concept of truth that will allow them to explain that what is crucial for a valid inference is not that there be no change from premiss to conclusion, but  merely that there be no change in the truth value from true to false.  In the case of valid deductive inference this is guaranteed, because we merely re-arrange our information to make a certain element more salient.  What changes is merely our knowledge of the relation implicit in the premisses.  The act of inference requires an intervention by the subject that is arbitrary in the sense that it might not have taken place; but in the case of valid deductive inference, it is not an intervention that tampers with the truth.  There is, perhaps, more interference by the subject when a decision is made to eliminate part of the original ideal content, as when we drop the middle term in the conclusion of a syllogism.  Dropping ideal content even makes it possible that the conclusion is true, when the premisses contain error; but this does not matter, so long as it remains the case that if the premisses are true, the conclusion must also be true.

Perhaps deductive inference can be handled, if we do not probe too deeply, but Bradley now comes to a “rising sea” of non-deductive inferences that are not so easily controlled.  In mathematical construction we may infer the extension of a given straight line to double its size, but this is not the deduction of a conclusion from a premiss.   Comparison and distinction are also acts of the mind that are not deductive inference.  It could be argued, indeed, that these acts are not in fact inferences at all, but rather forms of plural judgment, originally involving more than one object distinguished within immediate experience.  Bradley, however, would not be greatly interested in this, since in his final view the distinction between judgment and inference is to be broken down.

The really serious problem, however, is empirical inference, including the prediction of the future on which we rely so heavily to carry out our purposes.  Bradley took the first step at the beginning of The Principles of Logic when he introduced the loosening from the given experience of an ideal content that can be transferred elsewhere.  This may explain how it is possible to formulate a belief about what will happen, but it does not explain why we choose to adopt the beliefs we do, or how these beliefs are to be justified.  Suppose we abstract from immediate experience a conjunction of ideal elements.  This may tempt us to imagine a similar conjunction in our representation of the future, but this would be justified, only if the connection of the elements were unconditioned and necessary.  Since in abstracting the conjunction from the given experience it has been separated from the context in which it was found, it remains, as Bradley believes, conditioned by that context.   Since this context is never completely known, the successful transfer of an ideal complex abstracted from the given context to a fresh context that may well be different cannot be guaranteed.

The recognition of the context in which the given ideal content is embedded undermines its guaranteed transfer elsewhere.  Does it also undermine the analytic judgment of sense that predicates the content of immediate experience?  This is what we are led to think in the move to the higher point of view, and it would be extremely serious, since it would destroy the very concept of true judgment.  It is ironic that at the beginning of The Principles of Logic Bradley uncovers the source of true judgment in the predication of an ideal content of an immediate experience from which it has been loosened and with which it is necessarily connected.  This explains how it is possible to transfer an ideal content extracted from immediate experience to a segment of reality not immediately experienced.  Such judgments, of course, may be either true or false.

This system is available as a lower point of view for those who are unable to follow Bradley all the way.  (It is also there as a fallback position, in the event that a fatal flaw is discovered in Bradley’s advanced reasoning, although Bradley himself does not seem to fear this possibility.)  The lower point of view is happy enough with the argument that empirical inferences have no logical guarantee, since the given object involved in the premiss is embedded in a context, ultimately unknown.  This argument establishes a conclusion to which everyone would agree.  What cannot be accepted is the use of the same fact to break the tie between ideal content and object that constitutes true judgment.  Without a viable concept of true judgment, even inference as we normally understand it will disappear, since the premisses and conclusion of an inference are all judgments, and a deductive argument is valid, if the conclusion must be true when the premisses are all true.

18. The Final Doctrine

a. Inference

We have been following the argument in the first edition of The Principles of Logic, in which Bradley tries to keep out the influence of his own metaphysical ideas, when operating at the lower level.   This is fortunate, because it makes Bradley’s often insightful discussion available to logicians who would be appalled by his metaphysics.  Bradley, as we know, is not ultimately satisfied with the lower point of view and feels compelled to move to a different position, where the influence of his metaphysical views can be detected. This difficult theory was not well understood, so that in the second edition of The Principles of Logic he included a set of terminal essays, which he hoped would provide a clearer exposition of his final views.

The original book began with judgment; the terminal essays begin with inference which he now moves to the center.   “Every inference is the ideal self-development of a given object taken as real.” (598)  This definition attempts to explicate inference without using the notion of judgment, which will later be explained as a kind of inference.  Even the third member of the logical trinity, the universal idea, is partly concealed under cover as “the given object.”  The given object must be ideal, since this is the only kind of entity capable of ideal self-development.  Bradley’s definition of inference would have been much clearer, if he had explained it as the ideal self-development of a logical idea taken as real.  The concept of ideal self-development, however, contains a problem, encountered before.   If there is no change, there is no inference; but if there is change, then “the inference is destroyed.”(599)   Bradley cannot take the usual line that the transition in inference from judgment to judgment is valid, so long as the preservation of truth is guaranteed.  This would be circular, since he intends to explain judgment in terms of inference. Bradley’s solution relies on the double nature of the datum, considered in itself and as part of a systematic whole. This is what is involved in the reference of the ideal content to reality.  This reference to reality, familiar from Bradley’s initial account of judgment, now turns out to mean “taken to be real, as being in one with Reality, the real Universe.” (598)  This is the point of “taken as real” in the original definition.  To take an ideal content as real is to identify it with Reality, in so far as it belongs to Reality.

We can now perhaps understand why Bradley replaces “logical idea” with “given object” in his initial definition.  A logical idea can only be a part of a system of logical ideas, a system of thought.  A given object, as normally understood and as understood within Bradley’s lower point of view, is a part of the real universe.  It is the act of judgment that connects the domain of thought with the real world.  It is judgment that predicates a logical idea of reality or of an object that belongs to reality.  Without judgment, the only possible movement of thought is a movement along a stream of ideas.  The only thing more real than a logical idea is a complete system of all ideas, and we have fallen into the clutches of Hegel!  To adopt the term “given object” to denote logical ideas makes it difficult to use the same term to introduce concrete individuals constituting the universe.

The movement of inference can be illustrated in the Dialectical Method, in which we expand a given content through recognition of its incompleteness.  The explicit premiss is “some distinguished content set before us.” (601) Implicit is “the entire Reality as an ideal systematic Whole.”  “Every member in this system...develops itself through a series of more and more inclusive totalities until it becomes and contains the entire system.” (601)  When I use this method, everything is necessary except where I begin and when I stop. For Bradley, however, such inferences are never fully satisfactory, since their ground is largely implicit and unknown.

Bradley goes on to consider in some detail other processes such as analysis, abstraction and comparison.  His discussion of arithmetic is of surprising interest, because the construction of the natural number series does seem to make sense of the notion of ideal self-development.  Each natural number develops itself through the successor function to introduce the number that follows it.  The number three is an ideal content, since it is a universal property shared by all triples, so that the transition to four must lie in the domain of ideality.

The representation of space and time is constituted through a similar process involving the ideal self-development of a given space or time.  Although these examples may illuminate the obscure notion of ideal self-development, they will not help to explain inference, if the construction of the successor of a natural number or the space and time that lies beyond what is given is not an inference.  Inference is usually considered a movement of thought from judgment to judgment, from premiss to conclusion.  This is not what happens when we extend a line or form a new number.

b. Judgment

Bradley, however, would not accept this, since he considers judgment itself to be a kind of inference in the wide sense.  It is a kind of inference in which the ground that compels the judgment is not made explicit.  Inference is present, even in the purest case of an analytic judgment of sense.  As we have seen, Bradley recasts the judgment “S is P” in the form: “Reality is such that S is P.”  The word “such” is the placeholder for the ground in reality that compels the conclusion “S is P.”  Since this condition is unspecified and not completely specifiable, the inferential structure is merely implicit.  This is a radical change, under the influence of Bosanquet, from Bradley’s original position, where judgment lies at the interface between the ideal and the actual, between the universal and particular, and is hence distinct from inference which is a movement within thought.

Bradley supports his change of heart by giving an example.  Suppose I immediately experience A to the right of B and therefore form the judgment that A is to the right of B.  There is, presumably, some sort of causal explanation for the relative position of these things.  My objection is that any such condition for the existence of a state of affairs is not a truth condition for the corresponding judgment.  It would be a truth condition only if it were incorporated in the judgment, which it is not.  Even if I am prepared to say that A is to the right of B because John put it there, I am not saying that A is to the right of B, if John put it there.  My statement is categorical, not conditional, and I will insist that A is to the right of B, even if it turns out that John is not responsible.

The objects A and B that are the special subjects of the plural judgment are necessarily selected from and connected with “our whole Universe.” (Presumably, this is our Universe, because it is connected with our immediate experience.)  In a singular judgment the special subject is this reality, which is “some special and emphasized feature in the total mass.” (629)  All such special subjects are conditioned by what lies beyond.  Even without invoking the law of causality, they are all conditioned by their setting in space and time.  Bradley argues that since the special subject of the judgment must be conditioned, even if its conditions are not known, the judgment itself cannot be unconditioned.  “The object therefore remains conditioned by that which is unknown, and only on and subject to this unknown condition is the judgment true.” (631)  This sentence explicitly identifies the existence conditions of the object with the truth conditions of the judgment.  If we refuse to make this jump, we can remain comfortably at Bradley’s “lower point of view” and ignore the obscure and baffling complexities of the esoteric theory.

c. The Fundamental Problem of Thought

Even if we insist on a sharper distinction between judgment and inference than Bradley would allow, there is a general idea of a movement of thought that covers both activities.  There may be some movements of thought we prefer to call judgments and others we call inferences, but Bradley’s purpose is to dig out what all acts of thought have in common.  He believes he can state the fundamental problem without a final distinction between judgment and inference.  Thinking is a process that reaches a result, and this implies the transcending of some initial state.  It is not enough, however, that there be a mere succession of states. The movement of thought requires justification.  The movement of thought must “satisfy the intellect.” In the case of inference, the satisfactory is called “valid”; in the case of judgment, the satisfactory is called “true.”  In both cases the problem of the satisfaction condition is essentially the same.  “Thought demands to go proprio motu…with a ground and reason…. Now to pass from A to B, if the ground remains external, is for thought to pass with no ground at all.”  (Appearance and Reality, Note A, 501)  We might suppose that in the case of deductive inference, there is an internal ground within the domain of ideas, although Bradley would not agree.  But there is clearly no such internal justification for the inferential move in the case of non-deductive or empirical inferences.  The success of empirical inferences or predictions depends on the way the world is or will be.  Our general level of success depends on our living in a reasonably well-ordered world in which we have developed reliable systems for the acquisition of information.

Since the ground that justifies the movement of thought is the nature of reality, this ground can never be brought within thought without the identity of thought and reality.  Nothing less than this will satisfy the intellect.  This is the essentially Hegelian move to identify thought and reality by turning reality into a system of thought.  Not that a finite center can ever reach an unconditioned completion of its thought.  We may try to get as close as we can, and the closer we get to a final completion, the more truth our thought contains.  As we expand our system of thought to make it more comprehensive, the truer it will become, so long as it remains harmonious and coherent.   Although the goal of Thought in Dialectic may be to complete the incomplete, Bradley believes that there is more to reality than even a completed system of thought could provide.  Bradley is not a Hegelian, because he denies that the completion of thought, even if it were possible, would be identical with the Absolute.  He rejects the replacement of reality by “some spectral woof of impalpable abstractions, or unearthly ballet of bloodless categories.” (591)  Although Bradley follows Kant in accepting the transcendental ideality of the series of phenomena, a position that provided a stepping stone for Hegel, Bradley refuses to accept this creation of the mind as the reality encountered in immediate experience.  For Bradley, “it is the whole continuity of the total series which is absolutely based on ideal reconstruction.  By means of this function, and this function alone, we have connected the past in one line with the present.” (587)

d. Immediate Experience and the Absolute

Immediate experience is associated with a cluster of ideas: “this”, “my”, “now”, “here”.  What is immediately experienced is felt.  “Feeling may be either used of the whole mass felt at any one time, or it may again be applied to some element in that whole.” (659)  What I immediately experience is real enough, but this does not mean that everything real must be experienced by me.  As less than reality as a whole, Bradley calls my immediate experience an appearance of reality.  To Bradley, “it seems clear that we not only start from the given ‘this,’ but remain resting on that foundation throughout.  Our whole ordered universe we may call a construction resting on immediate experience.” (661)

Bradley clearly retains the phenomenal realism at the heart of traditional empiricism, while rejecting the idea that immediate experience is a collection of distinct existences, which was responsible for its demise.  Experience, for Bradley, is originally a sensuous, felt mass.  This is particularly acceptable with the re-instatement of mass terms, excluded by the logic of Principia Mathematica.

For Bradley, a collection of distinct existences is not given, but emerges through an analysis carried out by thought.  “I have to turn my experience into a disjunctive totality of elements.” (665) This is uncannily like Quine’s idea that “we persist in breaking reality down somehow into a multiplicity of identifiable and discriminable objects.”  The connection is particularly striking, once we realize that special subjects, as well as Reality as a Whole, may extend beyond what is presented in immediate experience.  The ideal contents, necessary to separate objects within the sensuous felt mass, do not confine these objects to their presentation in immediate experience.  Because the contents are universal, they permit what Hume would call the continued existence of such real things beyond their appearance in my mind.

Bradley’s theory must be taken very seriously because of the detailed account that it offers of a process that Quine leaves shrouded in mystery.  It may be understood as a way of fixing what is wrong with empiricism.  It is harder to sympathize with the arguments that led Bradley to abandon what he calls the “lower point of view” and which may be based on a mistake.

19. References and Further Reading

a. Selected works by F. H. Bradley

  • The Principles of Logic. Oxford University Press, 1883; second revised edition including terminal essays, 1922.
    • (This is the main source for Bradley’s logical theory.)
  • Appearance and Reality. Oxford University Press, 1893; second edition with appendix, 1897.
    • (The metaphysical theory.)
  • Essays on Truth and Reality. Oxford University Press, 1914.
    • (A collection of articles, for the most part originally published in Mind, and many on broadly logical topics.)
  • Collected Works. Thoemmes Press: Bristol, England and Sterling, Va., 1999.
    • (Volume I contains Bradley’s notes for The Principles of Logic.)

b. Further Reading

  • Allard, J. W., 2005, The Logical Foundations of Bradley’s Metaphysics: Judgment, Inference, and Truth. Cambridge University Press.
  • Basile, Pierfrancesco, 1999, Experience and Relations: an Examination of F. H. Bradley’s Conception of Reality.  Chapter 4.
  • Blanshard, Brand, 1939, The Nature of Thought.  Two Volumes.  London: George Allen & Unwin.
    • (Especially, Chapter XIII:  Bradley on Ideas in Logic and in Psychology.)
  • Bosanquet, Bernard, 1885, Knowledge and Reality, A Criticism of Mr. F. H. Bradley’s ‘Principles of Logic’.  London: Kegan Paul, Trench.
  • Bradley, James (ed.), 1996, Philosophy after F. H. Bradley. Bristol: Thoemmes.
  • Bradley Studies, the journal of the Bradley Society, was published from 1995 to 2004.
    • (It has now been succeeded by Collingwood and British Idealist Studies.)
  • Campbell, C. A., 1931, Scepticism and Construction: Bradley’s Sceptical Principle as the Basis of Constructive Philosophy. London: George Allen & Unwin.
  • Campbell, C. A., 1957, On Selfhood and Godhood. London; George Allen & Unwin.
    • (Gifford Lectures delivered at the University of St. Andrews.)
  • Campbell, C. A., 1967, In Defence of Free Will. London: George Allen & Unwin.
    • (Chapter XII.  The Mind‘s Involvement in Objects.  This was originally published in 1962 as a contribution to Theories of the Mind, edited by Jordan M. Scher, published by the Free Press of Glencoe, a division of the Macmillan Company.)
  • Candlish, S., 2007, The Russell/Bradley Dispute and its Significance for Twentieth-Century Philosophy. Basingstoke: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Ferreira, P., 1999, Bradley and the Structure of Knowledge. Albany: SUNY Press.
  • Ferreira P., 2014, ‘Idealist Logic’ in The Oxford Handbook of British Philosophy in the Nineteenth Century, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 111-132.
  • Hylton, Peter, 1990, Russell, Idealism, and the Emergence of Analytic Philosophy.  Oxford University Press.  Chapter 2.
  • Levine, James, 1998, “The What and the That: Theories of Singular Thought in Bradley, Russell and the Early Wittgenstein” in Appearance Versus Reality: New Essays on Bradley’s Metaphysics. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Mander, W. J. (ed.), 1996, Perspectives on the Logic and Metaphysics of F. H. Bradley. Bristol: St. Augustine’s Press.
  • Mander, W.J., 2008, ‘Bradley’s Logic’ in D. Gabbay and J.H. Woods (eds.) Handbook of the History of Logic.  Volume Four: British Logic in the Nineteenth Century, Elsevier, pp. 663-717.
  • Mander, W., 2011, British Idealism. A History.  Oxford University Press.
  • Manser, A., 1983, Bradley’s Logic.  Oxford University Press.
  • Peacocke, C., 1992. A Study of Concepts. Chapter 3.  Cambridge MA and London: MIT Press.
    • (This entry requires explanation, since Bradley is never mentioned in the book.  Chapter 3 introduces scenarios, which are non-conceptual representational contents.  As general, they qualify as ideal contents in Bradley’s sense.  The positioning of scenarios in reality is therefore a special case of an act of judgment that refers an ideal content to a reality beyond the act.  Peacocke is thus presenting the essence of Bradley’s position in an up-to-date form.)
  • Sprigge, T.L.S., 1993, James and Bradley.  Chicago and La Salle, Illinois: Open Court.  Part II.  Chapters 2 and 3.
  • Wollheim, R., 1959, F. H. Bradley. Harmondsworth: Penguin Books.

 

Author Information

D. L. C. Maclachlan
Email: lorne.maclachlan@gmail.com
Queen's University
Canada