Time is what we use a clock to measure. Information about time tells us the durations of events, when they occur, and which events happen before which others. Nevertheless, despite 2,500 years of investigation into the nature of time, there are many unresolved issues. Here is a list of those issues, in no particular order: •What time actually is; •Whether time exists when nothing is changing; •What kinds of time travel are possible; •Why time has an arrow; •Whether the future and past are as real as the present; •How to correctly analyze the metaphor of time’s flow; •Which features of our ordinary sense of the word "time" should be captured by the concept of time in physics; •Whether contingent sentences about the future have truth values now; •When time will end; •Whether there was time before the beginning of our big bang; •Whether tensed facts or tenseless facts are ontologically basic or fundamental; •What the proper formalism or logic is for capturing the special role that time plays in reasoning; •What neural mechanisms account for our experience of time; •Which aspects of time are conventional; •How time is related to mind; •Whether there is a timeless substratum from which time emerges; •Why our universe has time instead of no time; •Whether the concept of time is objective; and •Whether time is an illusion.
Consider this one issue upon which philosophers are deeply divided: What sort of ontological differences are there among the present, the past and the future? There are three competing theories. Presentists argue that necessarily only present objects and present experiences are real, and we conscious beings recognize this in the special vividness of our present experience compared to our dim memories of past experiences and our expectations of future experiences. So, the dinosaurs have slipped out of reality even though our current ideas of them have not. However, according to the growing-past theory, the past and present are both real, but the future is not real because the future is indeterminate or merely potential. Dinosaurs are real, but our future death is not. The third theory is that there are no objective ontological differences among present, past, and future because the differences are merely subjective. This third theory is called “eternalism.”
Table of Contents
- How is Time Related to Mind?
- What is Time?
- The Negative Answer: Time is Not Real
- The Positive Answer: Time is Real
- Why is There Time Instead of No Time?
- Is Time Ever Circular?
- Does Time Have a Beginning or End?
- Does Time Emerge from Something More Fundamental?
- Which Aspects of Time are Conventional?
- What does Science Require of Time?
- What Kinds of Time Travel are Possible?
- Does Time Require Change? (Relational vs. Substantival Theories)
- McTaggart's A-Theory and B-Theory
- Does Time Flow?
- What are the Differences among the Past, Present, and Future?
- What Gives Time Its Arrow?
- What is Temporal Logic?
- References and Further Reading
Philosophers of time would like to resolve as many issues as they can from the list of philosophical issues mentioned in the opening summary. Some issues are intimately related to others so that it is reasonable to expect a resolution of one to have deep implications for another. For example, there is an important subset of related philosophical issues about time that cause many philosophers of time to divide into two broad camps, the A-camp and the B-camp, because they are on the opposite sides of those issues.
Members of the A-camp often say that McTaggart's A-theory is the fundamental way to view time; events are always changing as they move farther away from the distant future, the now is objectively real and so is time's flow; ontologically we should accept either presentism or the growing-past theory; predictions are not true or false at the time they are uttered; tensed facts are ontologically fundamental rather than untensed facts; and the ontologically fundamental objects are 3-dimensional, not 4-dimensional. [All these ideas will be explained in more detail later. A person can be considered a member of the A-camp without adopting every one of the above claims.]
Members of the B-camp often say instead that McTaggart's B-theory is the fundamental way to view time; events never change; the now is not objectively real and neither is time's flow; ontologically we should accept eternalism and the block-universe theory; predictions are true or false at the time they are uttered; untensed facts are more fundamental than tensed facts; and the fundamental objects are not 3-dimensional but rather 4-dimensional events or processes.
This article provides an introduction to the controversy between the A and B camps, as well as an introduction to many other issues about time.
Physical time is public time, the time that clocks are designed to measure. Biological time, by contrast, is indicated by an organism's various internal clocks or cyclic processes such as its heartbeats and repeated breathing and its sleep/wake cycle (circadian rhythm). It is also indicated by signs of aging. Psychological time is different from both physical time and biological time. Psychological time is private time. It is also called phenomenological time, and it is best understood not as a kind of time but rather as awareness of physical time.
We don't need to look at a clock to detect time's existence. We mentally encounter time by seeing a leaf fall, hearing a new word in a conversation, or feeling the impact of the next step as we descend a staircase. We are noticing changes. But if we close our eyes, hear nothing, and sit still, we still can encounter time by imagining a bird landing on a tree branch. What all these encounters with time have in common is that we are having more and more experiences and accumulating more and more memories of those experiences. The leading explanation of why psychological time exists is accumulation of memories.
People who suffer from what psychologists call “anterograde amnesia” are often said not to be able to form new memories. That must be an overstatement because people with the disease can see a leaf flutter to the ground. So, they form new, very short-term memories of the leaf having moved to a new location, even if a few second later they forget that they saw the leaf fall. Nevertheless, the people with this disease have a very odd sense of psychological time, and as a consequence fail to have the kind of personal identity that the rest of us have.
Psychological time's rate of passage is a fascinating phenomenon to study. Our psychological time, our awareness of physical time, slows down when it appears to us that physical time speeds up. Time seems to speed up when we mentally immerse ourselves in some activity, such as watching a very interesting TV program. At the end of the program, we think, “Where did the time go? It sped by.” Physical time did not really speed up; instead, our mental clock slowed down.
Psychological time speeds up when it appears to us that some process is taking too long. We are waiting anxiously for the pot of soup to boil on the stove, or we are hungry and watching the clock waiting for it to finally reach 12:00 when we can leave for lunch, and we think, “Why is everything taking so long?” Our belief in the apparent slowness of the external world is probably due to focusing our attention on short periods of physical time.
Time seems to slow down when we fear imminent danger. Psychologists report that during stressful periods we take in a great deal of new memories, more than we otherwise would. We remember so many details, as if we had extra time for the remembering. This massive accumulation of memories has been suggested as the causes of physical time’s apparent slowing.
Time seems to older people to go faster. You might notice this when your grandmother says, "Oh, it's my birthday again." This may be due to the fact that a younger person's birthday experience is new and more special and so more details get remembered, whereas an older person's birthday experience normally not as special, and so less information is taken into memory about that birthday.
Time seems to run slower or faster depending upon where we are in the spectrum of conscious experience: having heightened awareness, awake normally, involved in a daydream, sleeping normally, drugged with anesthetics, or in a coma.
There is no experimental evidence that the character of physical time is affected in any way by the presence or absence of awareness or the presence or absence of any biological phenomenon. For that reason, physical time is called "objective time."
When a physicist defines speed to be the rate of change of position with respect to time, the term “time” in that definition refers to physical time. Physical time is more fundamental than psychological time for helping us understand our shared experiences in the world, and so it is more useful for doing physical science, but psychological time is vitally important for understanding many mental experiences, as is biological time for understanding biological phenomena.
A major philosophical problem is to explain the origin and character of our temporal experiences. Philosophers and cognitive scientists continue to investigate, but so far do not agree on, either how we experience temporal phenomena or how we are conscious that we do. A pessimistic physicist, Julian Barbour, says, "I do not believe that science (or religion) will ever explain why we experience instants...." (Barbour 1999, p. 255)
With the notable exception of Husserl, most philosophers say our ability to imagine other times is a necessary ingredient in our having any consciousness at all. We make use of our ability to imagine other times when we experience a difference between our present perceptions and our present memories of past perceptions. Somehow the difference between the two gets interpreted by us as evidence that the world we are experiencing is changing through time with some events succeeding other events. Locke said our train of ideas produces our idea that events succeed each other in time, but he offered no details on how this train does the producing.
Although cerebral cortex is usually considered to be the base for our conscious experience, it is surprising that rats distinguish a single time interval from another—such as the difference between a five second interval and a forty second interval—even with their cerebral cortex removed. So, a rat's means of sensing time is probably distributed throughout many places in its brain. And if humans are like rats, then our time sense is probably similarly distributed. However, surely the fact that we know that we know time is specific to our cerebral cortex.
Philosophers also want to know which aspects of time we have direct experience of, and which we have only indirect experience of. Is our direct experience only of the momentary present, the instantaneous present, as Aristotle, Thomas Reid, and Alexius Meinong believed, or instead do we have direct experience of what William James called a "specious present," a short stretch of physical time? Among those accepting the notion of a specious present, there is continuing controversy about whether the individual specious presents can overlap each other and about how the individual specious presents combine to form our stream of consciousness.
The brain takes an active role in building a mental scenario of what is taking place beyond the brain. For one example, the "time dilation effect" in psychology occurs when events involving an object coming toward you last longer in psychological time than an event with the same object being stationary. For another example, try tapping your nose with one hand and your knee with your other hand at the same time. Even though it takes longer for the signal from your knee to reach your brain than the signal from your nose to reach your brain, you will have the experience of the two taps being simultaneous—thanks to the brain's manipulation of the data. Neuroscientists suggest that your brain waits about 80 milliseconds for all the relevant input to come in before you experience a “now.” This is sufficient physical time for the brain to manipulate data arriving from your nose and data arriving from your knee. Craig Callender surveyed the psycho-physics literature on human experience of the present, and concluded that, only if the duration in physical time between two experienced events is less than about a quarter of a second (250 milliseconds) will humans say both events happened simultaneously. This quarter of a second duration is slightly different for different people but is stable within the experience of any single person. Also, "our impression of subjective present-ness...can be manipulated in a variety of ways" such as by what other sights or sounds are present at nearby physical times. See (Callender 2003-4, p. 124) and (Callender 2008).
Within the field of cognitive science, researchers want to know what are the neural mechanisms that account for our experience of time—for our awareness of change, for our ability to anticipate the future, for our sense of time’s flow, for our ability to place events into the correct time order (temporal succession), and for our ability to notice, and often accurately estimate, durations (persistence). Suppose you live otherwise normally within a mine for a while, and are temporarily closed off from the world above. You can keep track of whether it is night or day outside; you can give a good estimate of how long it will be until noon; and you can keep track of how long you've been inside the mine. And you can do all three of these things simultaneously.
The most surprising experimental result about our experience of time is Benjamin Libet’s experiments in the 1970s that apparently show that the brain events involved in initiating our free choice occur approximately one-third of a second before we are aware of our choice. Before Libet’s work, it was universally claimed that a person is aware of deciding to act freely, then later the body initiates the action. Libet's work has been used to challenge this claim. However, Libet's own experiments have been difficult to repeat because he drilled through the skull and inserted electrodes to shock the underlying brain tissue. See (Damasio 2002) for more discussion of Libet's experiments.
Neuroscientists and psychologists have investigated whether they can speed up our minds relative to a duration of physical time. If so, we might become mentally more productive, and get more high quality decision making done per fixed amount of physical time, and learn more per minute. Several avenues have been explored: using cocaine, amphetamines and other drugs; undergoing extreme experiences such as jumping backwards off a tall bridge with bungee cords attached to one's ankles; and trying different forms of meditation. These avenues definitely affective the ease with which pulses of neurotransmitters can be sent from one neuron to a neighboring neuron and thus affect our psychological time, but so far, none of these avenues have led to success productivity-wise.
Philosophers of time and psychologists are interested in both how a person's temporal experiences are affected by deficiencies in their imagination and their memory and what kind of interventions in a healthy person's brain might control that person's temporal experience.
It has been suggested by some philosophers that Einstein’s theory of relativity, when confirmed, showed us that physical time depends on the observer, and thus that physical time is subjective, or dependent on the mind. This error is probably caused by Einstein’s overuse of the term “observer.” Einstein’s theory implies that the duration (the measure of the elapsed time) of a non-instantaneous event depends on the observer’s frame of reference, and so can be different for different observers, but what Einstein means by “observer” is merely a perspective or coordinate system from which measurements could be made. The “observer” need not have a mind. So, Einstein is not making a point about mind-dependence.
To mention one more issue about the relationship between mind and time, if all organisms were to die, there would be events after those deaths. The stars would continue to shine, but would any of these star events be in the future? This is a controversial question because advocates of McTaggart’s A-theory will answer “yes,” whereas advocates of McTaggart’s B-theory will answer “no” and say “Whose future?”
The issue of whether time itself is subjective, a mind-dependent phenomenon, is explored in a later section of this article, and there is more commentary on the relationship between time and mind.
According to René Descartes' dualistic philosophy of mind, the mind is not in space, but it is in time. The current article accepts the more popular philosophy of mind that rejects dualism and claims that our mind is in time because of some proper functioning of our brain over time.
For more on the consciousness of time and related issues, see the article “Phenomenology and Time-Consciousness.” For a video presentation of these issues, see (Carroll 2012).
The remainder of this article is devoted to physical time.
Here are three, brief responses, to the question, "What is time?"
(1) The existence of time is the directionality of the temporal structure of the universe due to later states of the universe being produced from the earlier states.
This response is saying what time is. It is not an attempt to define the word "time" with terminology not involving time.
(2) Physical time is what we intend to measure with a clock.
This answer is not as trivial as it might seem since it is a deep truth about our physical universe that it is capable of having a clock. Also, we are lucky we live in a universe with so many different kinds of clocks: pendulums, oscillating electric circuits, rotations of our planet, candles that burn at a predictable rate, and so forth. Clocks count repetitions of some process that is regular in the sense that each repetition of the process has the same duration. If it were just as likely for any process to go forward as to go backwards (for example, our planet randomly changes its rotational velocity, and pendulums swing randomly), then there could be no clocks. One related philosophical issue is whether a universe can have time without being capable of having a clock. What is required to be a clock, and how we use clocks to establish the standard clock for our civilization, are some of the topics examined in the accompanying supplement to this article.
(3) Time is what the time variable t is denoting in the best theories of fundamental science. The best theories are relativity, quantum field theory, the Standard Model of elementary particles, the big bang theory, the theory of statistical thermodynamics, and so forth.
The three answers just given to the question, "What is time?" are informative. However, when philosophers ask the question, they normally do not want such a succinct answer. They want to be told more about the nature of time. They complain that the full nature of physical time can be revealed only by adding a philosophical theory of time that addresses the many philosophical issues that scientists do not concern themselves with. So, let us continue to explore the nature of time. The exploration will presuppose a realist perspective on the scientific theories to be discussed ahead. It interprets them to mean what they say, and it does not take a fictionalist perspective on them and consider their ontological implications as being merely a useful fiction.
When we measure time we are not measuring an object or substance. If time actually exists, then we are measuring "something" that is pervasive or global. It occurs everywhere. However, it is not universal; it is not the same for each person. This is because of the theory of relativity, as we shall see.
Here are five important characteristics of time. (1) For any event, time fixes when it occurs. (2) For any event, it fixes the event's duration. (3) For any event, it fixes what other events occur simultaneously with it. (4) For any pair of events, it fixes which one happens first. (5) It has an arrow pointing from past events toward future events.
The most significant impact that the special theory of relativity had upon the philosophy of time was to merge time with space. The implication is that the first four of these five characteristics are all relative; they can be different in different reference frames. Nevertheless, within a single reference frame, these are still key characteristics of time. The impact of the general theory was even more spectacular because time had to be entwined with gravity, as will be discussed later.
An Aristotelian approach to the issue of what time is would ask for time's essential characteristics as opposed to its accidental characteristics. This article is content merely to reveal time's important characteristics and to explore the philosophical issues involving time. But before proceeding with the search for the fuller answer to our question "What is time?", let us clarify some terminology.
The term "moment" is ambiguous in English. Moments are short events, but they also are the durations of those events. Speakers are usually not careful to disambiguate for us, so we hearers have to rely on context to tell which sense is intended. In addition, the terms "moment" and "instant" are sometimes used synonymously. We might mean the same thing whether we say, "I'll be back in an instant," or "I'll be back in a moment." In physics, the term "instant" has a more precise sense. That kind of instant is a zero duration (and not has a zero duration).
Relativity theory implies that part of the correct answer to the question "What is time?" is that it is a linear continuum of instants. This implies that time is gap-free, and not discrete or granular.
Being a continuum implies that the times, and thus the instants, have the structure of the real numbers in their natural order rather than merely the structure of the integers. If time were discrete or granular, it would have a smallest, positive duration, and so times would have a structure like that of the integers. Time would be digital rather than analog. There is no evidence that time is not a continuum.
Sometimes ordinary speakers will say instantaneous events are instants. However, physicists will say instants are times, and instantaneous events are not instants; they are events that last only for an instant [in the sense of duration] and only at an instant [in the sense of a single time coordinate].
In 1929, the English philosopher Bertrand Russell offered these precise definitions of instant and of occurring at an instant:
X is an instant iff X is an exhaustive class of mutually overlapping events.
Event E is at instant X iff E is a member of X.
The term "iff" is the philosopher's abbreviation for "if and only if." On Russell's definition, an instant is an event or event class, but not a time.
How about finding a precise definition of the word "time"? Shouldn't that tell us what time really is? The word "time" is the most common noun on the Internet. It might help us understand time if we improved our understanding of the sense of the word. Should philosophers of time pursue a full definition of the word? No—at least not if the definition must be some analysis that provides a simple paraphrase in all its occurrences. There are just too many varied occurrences of the word: time out, behind the times, in the nick of time, and so forth.
But how about narrowing the goal to the main meaning of the word “time," the meaning that is most interesting philosophers and physicists? Well, this project, too, would require some consideration of the grammar of the word “time.” Ordinary-language philosophers have studied time talk, what Wittgenstein called the “language game” of discourse about time. Wittgenstein said in 1953:
For a large class of cases — though not for all — in which we employ the word ‘meaning’ it can be defined thus: the meaning of a word is its use in the language.
If the word "time" were a member of this large class, then by drawing attention to use, to ordinary ways of using the word "time," Wittgenstein expected we will be able to dissolve rather than answer most of our philosophical questions. Unfortunately, the word "time" probably is not a member of the large class that Wittgenstein is speaking of, and even if it were, most philosophers want to know much more than what "time" means. Philosophers of time are usually not interested in precisely defining the word but rather are interested in what time's important characteristics are and in resolving philosophical disputes about time that do not seem to turn on what the word means. When Newton discovered that the fall of an apple and the circular orbit of the moon were both caused by gravity, this was not a discovery about the meaning of "gravity," but rather about what gravity is. Do we not want something like this for time?
We can see a clock, but we cannot see time, so how do we know whether time is real? You might think that time is real because it is what clocks are designed to measure, and because there certainly are clocks. The trouble with this reasoning is that it is analogous to saying that unicorns are real because unicorn hunters intend to find unicorns, and because there certainly are unicorn hunters.
The logical positivist Rudolf Carnap said, "The external questions of the reality of physical space and physical time are pseudo-questions" ("Empiricism, Semantics, and Ontology," 1950). He meant the questions are meaningless because there is no way to empirically verify their answer one way or the other. Subsequent philosophers have generally disagreed with Carnap and have taken the questions seriously.
Nobody doubts that the concept of time has immense practical value, but there are serious reasons to believe time itself is not real. Those reasons are that time is unreal in the sense of being (i) subjective, or (ii) conventional, or (iii) denoted by an inconsistent concept, or (iv) emergent. These are different claims, but let’s consider all of them.
It has been claimed that time is not real because it is merely subjective. Psychological time is subjective, but the focus now is on physical time. Any organism’s sense of time is subjective, but is the time that is sensed also subjective, a mind-dependent phenomenon, something that depends upon being represented by a mind? Throughout history, philosophers of time have disagreed on the answer. Without minds, nothing in the world would be surprising or beautiful or interesting. Can we add that nothing would be in time? In other words, can we say time is not objective? If so, we might for that reason say time is not real because it is not objectively real.
Aristotle raised the issue of the mind-dependence of time when he said, “Whether, if soul (mind) did not exist, time would exist or not, is a question that may fairly be asked; for if there cannot be someone to count there cannot be anything that can be counted…” (Physics, chapter 14). He does not answer his own question because, he says rather profoundly, it depends on whether time is the conscious numbering of movement or instead is just the capability of movements to be numbered were consciousness to exist.
St. Augustine, clearly adopted a subjective view of time, and said time is nothing in reality but exists only in the mind’s apprehension of that reality. The 13th century philosophers Henry of Ghent and Giles of Rome said time exists in reality as a mind-independent continuum, but is distinguished into earlier and later parts only by the mind.
Philosophers generally agree that humans invented the concept of time, but some argue that time itself is invented. It was created as a useful convention, like when we decided to use certain coin-shaped metal objects as money. Money is culturally real but not objectively real because it would disappear if human culture were to disappear, even if the coin-shaped objects were not to disappear.
Although it would be inconvenient to do so, our society could eliminate money and return to barter transactions. Analogously, Callender asks us to consider the question, “Who Needs Time Anyway”?
Time is a way to describe the pace of motion or change, such as the speed of a light wave, how fast a heart beats, or how frequently a planet spins…but these processes could be related directly to one another without making reference to time. Earth: 108,000 beats per rotation. Light: 240,000 kilometers per beat. Thus, some physicists argue that time is a common currency, making the world easier to describe but having no independent existence. (Callender 2010, p. 63)
In 1905, the French physicist Henri Poincaré argued that time is not a feature of reality to be discovered, but rather is something we've invented for our convenience. He said possible empirical tests cannot determine very much about time, so he recommended the convention of adopting whatever concept of time that makes for the simplest laws of physics. Nevertheless, time is conventional, not objective, not a “natural kind” of thing.
Bothered by the contradictions they claimed to find in our concept of time, Parmenides, Zeno, Plato, Spinoza, Hegel, and McTaggart said time is not real. McTaggart believed he had a convincing argument for why a single event is a future event, a present event and also a past event, and that since these are contrary properties, our concept of time is self-contradictory. (For a fuller discussion of their arguments, see LePoidevin and MacBeath 1993.)
The early 20th century absolute-idealist philosopher F. H. Bradley claimed, “Time, like space, has most evidently proved not to be real, but a contradictory appearance…. The problem of change defies solution.”
In the mid-twentieth century, Kurt Gödel argued for the unreality of time because the equations of the general theory of relativity allow for physically possible universes in which all events precede themselves. It shouldn't even be possible for time to be like this, Gödel believed, so if we suppose time is the time of relativity theory, then time is not real.
It has been argued that time is not real because it is emergent. Leibniz argued it emerges from the order relations between pairs of events; Minkowski argued it emerges from spacetime; advocates of the theory of loop quantum gravity argue it emerges from quantum fields.
The English physicist Julian Barbour said, “I now believe that time does not exist at all, and that motion itself is pure illusion" (Barbour 1999, p. 4). "The here and now arises not from a past, but from the totality of things..." (p. 313). He then offered an exotic explanation (which won't be described here) of how nature creates the false impression that time exists. He argued that there does exist objectively an infinity of individual, instantaneous moments, but there is no objective happens-before ordering of them, no objective time order. There is just a vast, jumbled heap of moments (p. 37). Each moment is an instantaneous configuration (relative to one observer's reference frame) of all the objects in space. If the universe is as Barbour describes, then space (the relative spatial relationships within a configuration) is ontologically fundamental, but time is not, and neither is spacetime. In this way, time is removed from the foundations of physics and emerges as some measure of the differences among the existing spatial configurations.
Proponents of the objective reality of time offer responses to the above arguments.
(i) Regarding subjectivity, notice that our clock ticks in synchrony with other clocks even when no one is paying attention to the clocks. Second, notice the ability of the concept of time to help make such good sense of our evidence involving change, persistence, and succession of events. Consider succession. This is the order of events in time. If judgments of time order were subjective in the way judgments of being interesting vs. not-interesting are subjective, then it would be too miraculous that everyone can so easily agree on the temporal ordering of so many pairs of events.
W. V. O. Quine might add the point that the character of the objective world with all its patterns is a theoretical entity in a grand inference to the best explanation of the data of our experiences, and the result of this inference tells us that the world is an entity containing an objective time, a time that gets detected by us mentally as psychological time and gets detected by our clocks as physical time.
(ii) There are several reasons to believe time is not merely conventional: (1) There are so many one-way processes in nature, processes such cold milk mixing into black coffee to produce cooler, brown coffee, and no amount of mixing turn the brown coffee into hotter black coffee with cool milk. The amalgamation of all these one-way processes is time’s arrow, and no human choice affects its existence.
(2) Our universe has so many periodic processes whose periods are constant multiples of each other over time. The different processes bear fairly consistent frequencies relative to each other. For example, the frequency of rotation of the Earth around its axis, relative to the "fixed" stars, is a constant multiple of the frequency of swings of a fixed-length pendulum, which in turn is a constant multiple of the half-life of a specific radioactive uranium isotope, which in turn is a constant multiple of the frequency of a vibrating quartz crystal. The relationships do not change as time goes by (at least not much and not for a long time, and when there is deviation we know how to predict it and compensate for it). The existence of these sorts of constant relationships—which cannot be changed by convention—makes our system of physical laws much simpler than it otherwise would be, and it makes us more confident that there is some convention-free, natural kind of entity that we are referring to with the time-variable in those physical laws.
(iii) Regarding the inconsistencies in our concept of time that Zeno, McTaggart, Bradley, and others claim to have revealed, most philosophers of time will say that there is no inconsistency, and that the complaint can be handled by revising the relevant concepts. For example, Zeno's paradoxes were treated by requiring time to be a linear continuum, very much like a segment of the real number line. Yes, the mathematicians did change Zeno’s concept, but the change was very fruitful and not ad hoc. Gödel's complaint has been treated by saying he should accept that time might possibly be circular; he needs to change his intuitions about what is essential to the concept.
(iv) Suppose time does emerge from events, or spacetime, or the quantum gravitational field, or Barbour’s moments. Does this imply time is not real? Scientists once were very surprised to learn from Ludwig Boltzmann that heat emerges from molecular motion. Yet a single molecule is neither hot nor cold, regardless of its speed. Heat is a macroscopic concept. However, would it be a mistake to say for this reason that Bolztmann has shown us that heat is not real and does not really exist in our world, and so no one has ever been affected by heat? If so, we can draw a similar conclusion for time.
String theory and loop quantum gravity are two leading, but as yet experimentally unconfirmed, theories of how to reconcile relativity theory with quantum theory. Loop quantum gravity describes phenomena occurring at the Planck scale. The Planck scale length is 10-33 centimeters. Relativity theory implies this is the minimum size of a particle below which it falls into its own black hole. The Planck time is the time it takes light to cover the Planck length. The principal equation of loop quantum gravity, the Wheeler-DeWitt equation, does not contain a time variable. If the theory is correct, then the implication will be that our concept of time is not applicable at this extreme scale. We can even say time does not exist at that scale or below. But it will not follow that time does not exist at all, because the concept of time is already known to be so extremely useful for larger scales at the level of quarks and molecules and mountains and galaxies.
Most philosophers agree that time does exist, that it is objective rather than subjective, that it is not primarily conventional, that any inconsistency in its description is merely apparent (or is not essential and can be eliminated), and that time is real regardless of whether it is emergent. Most philosophers just cannot agree on what time is, beyond agreeing to the three very brief answers given at the beginning of section 3.
Let’s explore some noteworthy answers that have been given throughout history to the question, “What is time?”
Aristotle claimed that “time is the measure of change” (Physics, chapter 12). He never said space is the measure of anything. Aristotle emphasized “that time is not change [itself]” because a change “may be faster or slower, but not time….” (Physics, chapter 10). For example, a leaf can fall faster or slower, but time itself cannot be faster or slower. In developing his views about time, Aristotle advocated what is now referred to as the relational theory when he said, “there is no time apart from change….” (Physics, chapter 11). In addition, Aristotle said time is not discrete or atomistic but “is continuous…. In respect of size there is no minimum; for every line is divided ad infinitum. Hence it is so with time” (Physics, chapter 11). The experts to this day are divided about whether to accept relationism and the continuity of time. The issue of relationism, which is intimately related to the issue of whether time requires change, gets more extensive coverage in another section of this article.
René Descartes had a very different answer to, “What is time?” He argued that a material body has the property of spatial extension but no inherent capacity for temporal endurance, and that God by his continual action sustains (or re-creates) the body at each successive instant. Time is a kind of sustenance or re-creation ("Third Meditation" in Meditations on First Philosophy). This Cartesian answer to "What is time?" has always had few proponents.
In the 18th century, Immanuel Kant said time and space are forms that the mind projects upon the external things-in-themselves; they are, to use his terminology, forms of human sensible intuition. He spoke of our mind structuring our perceptions so that space always has a Euclidean geometry, and time has the structure of the mathematical line. Kant’s idea that time is a form of apprehending phenomena is probably best taken as suggesting that we have no direct perception of time but only the ability to experience individual things and events in time. Some historians distinguish perceptual space from physical space and say that Kant was right about perceptual space. It is difficult, though, to get a clear concept of perceptual space.
Kant claimed to know a priori that space obeys the principle of Euclidean geometry. With the discovery of non-Euclidean geometries in the 19th century and Einstein's use of those geometries as descriptive of physical spacetime, the belief that truths about space and time are knowable a priori soon lost favor.
In the general theory of relativity, time is a distinguished aspect or dimension of a more basic entity, spacetime. Gravity is any distortion of spacetime’s geometry, so a gravitational field warps time. Before Einstein, no one suspected there is such a deep connection between time and gravity.
In the early 20th century, Alfred North Whitehead said time is essentially the form of becoming—a cryptic, but interesting philosophical claim.
We mentioned earlier that a physics book will define time as a linear continuum, which is a special continuous packing of point instants. Michael Dummett, in (Dummett 2000), provides an alternative to this definition. He says time is a composition of non-zero periods rather than of instants. His model also is constructive in the sense that it implies there do not exist any times which are not detectable in principle by a physical process.
The above discussion does not exhaust all the claims about what time is, as we shall see.
There is no agreed upon answer to why our universe contains time instead of no time, why it contains physical laws instead of no physical laws, and why it exists instead of does not exist, although there have been interesting speculations on all these issues.
One suggestion from proponents of the Multiverse Theory is that our universe exists, and exists with time and with the laws is has, because every kind of universe exists. Our single universe exists by means of a random selection process, by a process in which any possible universe inevitably arises as an actual universe, in analogy to how continual re-shuffling a deck of cards inevitably produces any possible ordering of the cards. To improve the analogy, one should suppose that there is no Supernatural Shuffler involved. For more details, see (Krauss, 2012, pp. 170 and 206).
Time is linear and not circular. At least there is no evidence to doubt this. But the possibility cannot be ruled out. If the totality of your personal time (what physicists call your proper time) were circular, then in the future you would be born after your death.
If any part of time were circular, then the future—at least this part of it—is also the past, and every event in that part occurs before itself. If your entire personal time were such a part, then the question would arise as to whether you were born an infinite number of times or only once. The argument that you'd be born only once appeals to Leibniz’s Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles. According to this principle, each supposedly repeating state of the world would actually not repeat but would occur just once because each state would not be discernible from the state that recurs. [What is a state of the world? Classically, it is the positions of all the world's objects and the motions of those objects at some particular instant. In field theory,, a state is the values of all the fields everywhere at some particular instant.] One way to support the idea of repeated occurrence of seemingly perfectly identical states would be to presuppose a linear ordering of the states in some "hyper" time so that each cycle is discernible from its predecessor only because it occurs at a different hyper time. That is, the cycles can be counted or ordered in hyper time. But there is no evidence of a hyper time. Another way to support the idea of repeated occurrence is to say that a person's proper time might be circular [more specifically, a closed timelike curve in spacetime] in our universe, but not from the perspective of the multiverse, and so from that perspective the number of times around the circle could be counted. The difficulty here is to make sense of the phrase "perspective of the multiverse." Most multiverse theories do not allow comparison of times between universes.
Long before Einstein made a distinction between proper time and coordinate time, a variety of answers were given to the question of whether time is like a line or a circle. The concept of linear time first appeared in the writings of the Hebrews and the Zoroastrian Iranians. The Roman writer Seneca also advocated linear time. However, Plato and most other Greeks and Romans believed time to be cyclical, but this was not envisioned as requiring the birth of Socrates after his death. The Pythagoreans and some Stoic philosophers such as Chrysippus did adopt this drastic position. Circular time was promoted in the Bible in Ecclesiastes 1:9: "That which has been is what will be, That which is done is what will be done, And there is nothing new under the sun." The idea was picked up again by Nietzsche in 1882. Scholars do not agree on whether Nietzsche meant his idea of circular time to be taken literally or merely as a moral lesson for us about how we should live our lives if each of us knew that we would have to live it over and over.
Many Islamic and Christian theologians adopted the ancient idea that time is linear. Nevertheless, it was not until 1602 that the concept of linear time was more clearly formulated—by the English philosopher Francis Bacon. In 1687, Newton advocated linear time when he represented time mathematically by using a continuous straight line with points being analogous to instants of time. Kant argued that time exists and is linear as a matter of necessity. In the early 19th century in Europe, the idea of linear time had become dominant in both science and philosophy.
Nevertheless, there are many other possible topologies for time. Time could have an end or no end. There could be two disconnected time streams, in two parallel worlds, and perhaps one would be linear and the other circular. There could be branching time, in which time is like the letter "Y". There could be a fusion time in which two different time streams are separate but then merge into one stream. Time might be two-dimensional instead of one-dimensional. For all these topologies, there could be discrete time or, instead, continuous time. For physicists, if time is not a continuum, then their favorite lower limit on a possible duration is the Planck time of about 10-43 seconds. This would be the size of an atom of time.
In ancient Greece, Plato and Aristotle agreed that the past is eternal. Aristotle offered two reasons. Time had no beginning because, for any time, we always can imagine an earlier time. In addition, time had no beginning because, for any present situation, we always can ask for its prior cause. In the fifth century, Augustine said the universe was made with time and not in time, implying that time began with God's creation of the world a finite time ago. In the medieval period, Aquinas' contemporary St. Bonaventure agreed and said there was a first motion and thus a first time, which implies Plato and Aristotle were mistaken in believing the past is eternal.
Martin Luther estimated the world to have begun in 4,000 B.C.E. Then Johannes Kepler estimated it to have begun in 4,004 B.C.E. The Calvinist James Ussher calculated from the Bible that the world began on Friday, October 28, 4,004 B.C.E. Advances in the science of geology eventually refuted all these small estimates, and advances in astronomy eventually refuted the idea that the Earth and the universe were created at about the same time.
Isaac Newton believed future time is infinite and that, although God created the material world some finite time ago, there was an infinite period of past time before that. Physicists generally agreed with Newton until the rise of the big bang theory.
Contemporary physicists say it is most likely the future is potentially infinite, as Newton believed, but it is an open question whether past time is finite or infinite. Many physicists believe time began with the big bang event about 13.8 billion years ago. This is 13,800,000,000 years ago. The world was not created then from nothingness, as if nothingness has causal powers; it simply came into existence then. But many other physicists, a growing number of them, believe that eventually a confirmed theory will explain why the big bang was the result of earlier phenomena, and they believe past time is infinite.
According to the big bang Theory, which is a well-accepted theory in astrophysics, millions of years ago our universe once had an infinitesimal size and an almost infinite temperature and gravitational strength. It also had an infinite expansion rate, and our universe has been expanding and cooling ever since. When it cooled below 1010 degrees, individual particles could form into atomic nuclei. When it cooled below 10,000 degrees, individual electrons and atomic nuclei could form into atoms. Later, as the expansion continued, many atoms clumped into stars and galaxies, eventually producing the universe of today.
The big bang theory does not speak to what happened at or before the initial big bang event. It is a theory only of the aftermath of that event. In fact, for reasons involving quantum mechanics, physicists generally agree that time is not an appropriate concept to use for times from the big bang until approximately 10-43 seconds after the big bang. (Sorry, but the concept of time had to be used in order to say the concept fails there.)
A promising version of the big bang theory called "Eternal Inflation" or the "Multiverse Theory" implies that our particular big bang event is merely one among many other big bang events occurring elsewhere both before and after our big bang. These alternative universes occurred and continue to occur within a large background, expanding space that is filled with energy and that is rapidly inflating and always will. In the most popular version of the Multiverse Theory, time had no beginning. If we add string theory to the big bang theory with eternal inflation, then many of the other universes will have different laws of physics from ours. See (Greene, 2011) for a popular discussion of the different multiverse theories.
Here is a summary of some serious suggestions by cosmologists of possible alternative futures for our particular universe:
- Big Chill (eternal expansion of space)
- Big Crunch (eventual recollapse)
- Big Rip (when the expansion rate increases sufficient, everything will be torn apart)
- Big Snap (the fabric of space suddenly reveals a lethal granular nature when stretched too much)
- Death Bubbles (some regions of space will turn into lethal bubbles that expand at the speed of light, destroying everything else)
The first alternative is the most popular. It also goes by the name of "heat death." It implies a potentially infinite, cooler future, although, because of the faster and faster expansion of the universe, in about 100 billion years all the other galaxies will be moving away from the Milky Way faster than the speed of light, so they will have left our visible universe, and it will look to us Earth-based astronomers as if our Milky Way is alone.
The classical relationists such as Leibniz argued that time emerges from events, and if there were no events then there would be no time. The substantivalists such as Newton said time is basic and not emergent, and this position was the majority position among scientists until the rise of the theory of relativity. Relativity theory suggested to most researchers in the first half of the twentieth century that time emerges from spacetime.
Philosophers use the term “A emerges from B” in different senses: A is fully definable in terms of B, A is reducible in some form to B, and A supervenes upon B. The latter is the weakest sense of emergence. Facts about sound in the air supervene on, or are a product of, facts about changes in the molecules of the air, and that is why molecular change is more basic than sound. Hermann Minkowski argued in 1908 that we should believe spacetime is more basic than time, and this argument is generally well accepted. However, is this spacetime itself basic?
Many physicists working in the field of quantum gravity suspect that resolving the contradiction between quantum theory and gravitational theory will require forcing spacetime and thus time to emerge from some more basic timeless substrate below the level of the Planck length of 10-35 meters and the Planck time of 10-43 seconds. However, there is no empirical evidence of this, nor any agreed-upon theory of what the substrate is, other than that it is some quantum gravitational field.
Earlier it was noted that the physicist Julian Barbour claims space is fundamental, but time is not. Other physicists say time is fundamental but space is not. In 2004, after winning the Nobel Prize in physics, David Gross expressed that viewpoint:
Everyone in string theory is convinced…that spacetime is doomed. But we don’t know what it’s replaced by. We have an enormous amount of evidence that space is doomed. We even have examples, mathematically well-defined examples, where space is an emergent concept…. But in my opinion the tough problem that has not yet been faced up to at all is, “How do we imagine a dynamical theory of physics in which time is emergent?” …All the examples we have do not have an emergent time. They have emergent space but not time. It is very hard for me to imagine a formulation of physics without time as a primary concept because physics is typically thought of as predicting the future given the past. We have unitary time evolution. How could we have a theory of physics where we start with something in which time is never mentioned?
The discussion in this section about whether time is ontologically basic has no implications for whether the word “time” is semantically basic, nor for whether the concept of time is basic to concept formation.
The issue of whether time itself is conventional has already been discussed above, but let’s consider what aspects of time are conventional, and then discuss what aspects of time’s measurement are conventional.
The transitivity of time order is not a convention. If event 1 happens before event 2, and event 2 happens before event 3, then event 1 also happens before event 3.
Simultaneity is conventional because of the relativity of simultaneity in the theory of special relativity. Physicists generally consider statements that are objective and so not conventional to be invariant under change of reference frame, and vice versa. According to the special theory of relativity, two events which are simultaneous in one reference might not be simultaneous in a different reference frame moving with respect to the first frame. It is only by convention that we fix on one specific reference frame and from within it we declare which pairs of events are simultaneous. This relativity of simultaneity shows that simultaneity is conventional.
Because the spacetime of general relativity curves, unlike in special relativity, simultaneity holds in general relativity only locally, in the infinitesimally-sized regions of spacetime where the special theory is true.
Let’s turn now from what aspects of time are conventional to what aspects of time’s measurement are conventional, in special relativity. The duration between two events A and B is conventional in the sense that if neither could have had a causal effect on the other, then physicists can always choose a reference frame in which A and B are simultaneous, so the duration between them is zero. However, once a frame is chosen, this fixes the duration between all pairs of events.
The measure of speed of an object is also conventional. This is because physicists can always choose a reference frame fixed to the object. In this manner we can make any one object have a zero speed.
There is much more that is conventional about time’s measurement. It is merely a matter of convention that what time it is changes by one hour as we cross into a new time-zone. It is an arbitrary convention that there are twenty-four hours in a day instead of twenty-three, that no week fails to contain a Tuesday, and that a second lasts as long as it is defined to last.
Consider the ordinary way we use a clock to measure how long an event lasts. We adopt the following metric or method: Take the time of the instant at which the event ends, and subtract the time of the instant at which the event starts. For example, to find how long an event lasts that starts at 3:00 and ends at 5:00, we subtract and get the answer of two hours. Is the use of this method merely a convention, or in some objective sense is it the only way that a clock should be used? That is, is there an objective metric, or is time "metrically amorphous"? Perhaps the duration between instants x and y could be
instead of the ordinary
|y - x|.
Our civilization designs a clock to count up to higher numbers rather than down to lower numbers as time elapses. Is that a convention? We are forced to accept the procedure if we presuppose that durations are never negative and that we should use our clocks to measure the duration in the ordinary way. If this measure is going to be larger when durations are larger, then our clock must count up and not down.
For a philosophically deeper and thus more controversial point about convention, consider this question. Our society's standard clock tells everyone what time it really is. Can our standard clock be inaccurate? Yes, say the objectivists about the standard clock. No, say the conventionalists who claim the standard clock is accurate by convention; if it acts strangely, then all clocks must act strangely in order to stay in synchrony with the standard clock. A closely related question is whether, when we change our standard clock, we are merely adopting constitutive conventions for our convenience, or in some objective sense we are making a more, or less, correct choice.
There is an ongoing philosophical dispute about the extent to which there is an element of conventionality in Einstein’s notion of two separated events happening at the same time. The philosopher Hans Reichenbach said that to define simultaneity in a single reference frame in special relativity you must adopt a convention about how fast light travels going one way as opposed to coming back (or going any other direction). He recommended adopting the convention that light travels the same speed in all directions (in a vacuum free of the influence of gravity). He claimed it must be a convention because there is no way to measure whether the speed is really the same in opposite directions since any measurement of the two speeds between two locations requires first having synchronized clocks at those two locations, yet the synchronization process will presuppose whether the speed is the same in both directions. The philosophers B. Ellis and P. Bowman in 1967, and D. Malament in 1977, gave different reasons why Reichenbach is mistaken. Once again, this discussion presumes special relativity and not general relativity. For an introduction to this dispute, see the Frequently Asked Questions. For more discussion, see (Callender and Hoefer 2002).
It would be very helpful to physics if there were a convention we could accept that would allow for a cosmic time in which any two events could be said to be connected in the sense that either they are simultaneous or not. In general relativity, simultaneity does not always make sense globally; but it always does make sense in infinitesimally small regions where the special theory of relativity is true. Nevertheless, if we sacrifice the relativity of simultaneity and adopt the convention of using only one very special coordinate system, then sense can be made of simultaneity across the universe. The special coordinate system needs to be very curvilinear and patched. In some models of general relativity, which might apply to our universe, curving spacetime can be exhaustively partitioned into non-intersecting “bumpy” three-dimensional sheets of simultaneous events, where each sheet is locally perpendicular to time-like geodesics. The bumps are due to local curvature associated with the presence of nearby matter. Einstein’s method of operationally defining simultaneity at a distance cannot be applied globally. Nevertheless, by accepting the convention that we will use only this special coordinate system, we can make sense of saying that, all the events in one sheet throughout the universe happen simultaneously.
There is another convention that, if adopted, makes our physics much simpler. Let’s place the origin of our global coordinate frame at a place where the light (which has now turned to heat) generated by the big bang arrives with the same intensity or temperature from all directions. Astrophysicists have found this best place for the origin. (Davies 1995, pp. 128-9) describes this place:
Although the view from Earth is of a slightly skewed cosmic heat bath, there must exist a motion, a frame of reference, which would make the bath appear exactly the same in every direction. It would in fact seem perfectly uniform from an imaginary spacecraft traveling at 350 km per second in a direction away from Leo (towards Pisces, as it happens)…. We can use this special clock to define a cosmic time…. Fortunately, the Earth is moving at only 350 km per second relative to this hypothetical special clock. This is about 0.1 per cent of the speed of light, and the time-dilation factor is only about one part in a million. Thus to an excellent approximation, Earth’s historical time coincides with cosmic time, so we can recount the history of the universe contemporaneously with the history of the Earth, in spite of the relativity of time.
Cosmologists presuppose this reference frame when they make remarks such as, “The big bang began 13.8 billion years ago, but we can’t see the beginning because the first light to escape its plasma left 300,000 years later and is arriving now from all directions.”
At the beginning of the 20th century, the appearance of the theories of relativity and the big bang transformed the investigation of time from a primarily speculative and metaphysical investigation into one that occupied scientists in their professional journals.
The big bang theory places demands on the amount of past time there must be—about 13.8 billion years. Assuming this theory, other astronomical observations suggest future time is probably not finite but rather is potentially infinite (in Aristotle's sense of the term).
The fundamental laws of science do not pick out a present time. Scientists frequently do apply some law of science while assigning, say, t0 to be the temporal coordinate of the present moment, then they go on to calculate this or that. This insertion of the fact that t0 is the present time is an initial condition of the situation to which the law is being applied, and is not part of the law itself. The basic laws themselves treat all times equally.
In a spacetime obeying the theory of relativity, there is always a maximum possible speed, a maximum ratio of distance covered, divided by time elapsed.
Scientists expect that all its theories in the future will have symmetry under time-translation. If a theory has this symmetry, then the laws of the theory do not change as time goes by. It follows that the law of gravitation in the 21st century is the same law that held one thousand centuries ago. So far, there is no evidence to indicate otherwise.
Science places special requirements on the structure of time. For instance, physicists need to speak of one event happening pi seconds after another, and of one event happening the square root of three seconds before another. In ordinary discourse outside of science, we would never need this kind of detail. This need has led to requiring time to be a linear continuum. A linear continuum has the same structure as the real numbers in their natural order. It follows from this that physical theories treat time as being somewhat like another dimension, analogous to a spatial dimension, and it follows that time is one-dimensional and not two-dimensional. Time has this structure even in quantum mechanics, which treats time as a linear continuum that is not quantized.
An instantaneous event at one place is said to be a "point" event. If we add a reference system to the space, we can name the point event. A reference system is just a perspective plus a coordinate system on the space and time. A coordinate system is a continuous labeling of events with real numbers. In this way, we can say a specific point event has just one temporal coordinate t1, with t1 being some real number, and we can say that at this time the event has just one spatial location coordinate <x1, y1, z1>, which is an ordered triple of real numbers, assuming we are assigning coordinates within a Cartesian coordinate system. By saying time has real-valued coordinates, we are implying that time's instants are gap-free and so densely packed that there is no next coordinate after t1, and between any two different temporal coordinates, there is an actual infinite number of other coordinates. The sciences have found no need to model time more densely than this, with, say, the hyperreal or surreal numbers. Nor is there any need to model time with two dimensions instead of one.
With the acceptance of relativity theory, and its implication that there are many valid perspectives or reference frames and so no one is the correct one, scientists have accepted that any objective description of the world can be made only with statements that are invariant under changes of the reference frame. The point is not to confuse features of nature with mere features of our mathematical apparatus.
Isaac Newton assumed that, if you are as tall as two meter sticks in one frame, then you are that tall even if we change the reference frame. And Newton assumed that if event 1 lasts just as long as event 2 in one frame, then this is so even if we switch frames. Einstein undermined these two Newtonian assumptions.
Einstein's theory of relativity is the scientific theory that has had the biggest impact upon our understanding of time. Einstein said time is relative. This means some, but not all, aspects of time are relative to the chosen reference frame. Relative to, in the sense of depending upon. Newton would say that if you are seated in a moving vehicle, then your speed relative to the vehicle is zero, but your speed relative to the road is not zero. Einstein would agree. However, he would surprise Newton by saying the length of your vehicle is slightly different in the two reference frames. Equally surprising to Newton, the duration of your drinking a cup of coffee while in the vehicle is slightly different in those two reference frames. These effects are called space contraction and time dilation. So, length and duration are frame dependent.
Suppose two observers A and B are moving relative to each other. Observer A can truly say, “In a reference frame fixed to me, you are moving, but I am stationary. Your time is dilated, and so your clock is running slow compared to mine.” But observer B can truly say the same about A. How is that possible without them contradicting each other? Can two clocks really run slower than each other? The answer is yes and no, and the 'yes' sense is one of the unintuitive consequences of the theory of relativity. The 'yes' scenario produces the situation of the twin paradox, in which each observer uses a reference frame fixed to themselves. The twin paradox is explained in more detail in the Supplement that accompanies this article. The 'no' sense occurs when both observers agree to use the same reference frame. In that case, their two clocks are not running slower than each other.
With space contraction and time dilation, namely with the relativity of length and of duration, Einstein's special theory is requiring a mixing of space and time. It follows that there is an underlying spacetime which is more fundamental than either time or space alone. Spacetime divides into its space part and its time part differently for two reference frames that move relative to each other. So, to claim that an event lasted three minutes without giving even an implicit indication of the reference frame is to make an ambiguous claim. When we say the event of your drinking a cup of coffee lasted three minutes, the implicit assumption is that the reference frame is fixed to you.
One other philosophical implication of the relativity of time is that it seems to be more difficult to defend McTaggart's A-theory that says temporal properties of events such as "is happening now" or "happened in the past" are frame-free properties of those events.
Another profound implication of relativity theory is that two accurate clocks do not tick the same even if the clocks are initially synchronized. Each clock has its own proper time, and so does each object. Proper time is the time that would be shown by a very small clock if it were attached to the object as the object travels around. In the technical terminology of relativity theory, we say a clock measures the elapsed proper time between events that occur along its own worldline. A clock's correct proper time depends on the clock's history, in particular, its history of speed and gravitational influence. Synchronized clocks will not stay synchronized if they either move relative to each other or undergo different gravitational forces. Relative to clocks that are stationary in the reference frame, clocks in motion in the frame run slower, as do clocks in stronger gravitational fields. So, clocks in cars driving by your apartment building run slower than your apartment’s clock. Ground floor clocks in your apartment building run slower than clocks in the top floor apartment, which is a direct reflection of the warping of time by matter. These effects on time by speed and gravitation are called time dilation effects. They affect all clocks, even biological ones.
Because every person has his or her own proper time, two persons can correctly assign different times to the same event. This difference is not just for events the persons themselves are involved in; it is times that they assign to any event in the universe. For example, if I am walking along the road and you drive by me toward the traffic signal ahead, then we will very nearly agree on the time at which the traffic signal changed color, but if we ask what event on a planet in the Andromeda Galaxy is simultaneous with the traffic signal's color change, we will disagree with each other by several weeks. This is yet another example of how relativistic effects usually do not arise in our everyday experience but only in extreme situations involving very high speeds, high-strength gravitational fields, or, in this example, extreme distances.
This situation with the Andromeda Galaxy is an example of how, for some pairs of events that are extremely distant from each other so that neither event could have had a causal effect upon the other, the theory of relativity does not put any time structure on the pair; one could happen first, the other could happen first, or they could be simultaneous, and only our imposition of a reference frame on the universe will force a decision on their temporal order.
According to special relativity, spacetime does not curve. According to general relativity spacetime does curve; and our spacetime is dynamic in the sense that any change in the amount and distribution of matter-energy will change the curvature; and this change is propagated at the speed of light, not instantaneously. Gravity is nothing but the warping of spacetime, and this warping can be detected in various ways, such as the ways by which we detect time dilation and space contraction.
One noteworthy point here is that, according to general relativity, although the presence of gravity implies spacetime curvature, not all spacetime curvature implies the presence of gravity. This is because a spacetime containing no mass can still have curvature; therefore, the geometry of spacetime is not always determined by the behavior of its matter. This point has been interpreted by many philosophers as a good reason to reject Leibniz's classical relationism.
See also What Else Science Requires of Time.
Most scientists and philosophers of time agree that time travel to the future occurs very frequently, and travel to the past is allowed by Einstein’s general theory of relativity, although so far we have no evidence that travel to the past has occurred. There are many interesting arguments for why it cannot occur.
In order to explain, the term "time travel" needs clarification. We mean physical time travel, not psychological time travel, nor travel by dreaming of living in another time period. Here is David Lewis' well-accepted definition:
In any case of physical time travel, the traveler’s journey as judged by a correct clock attached to the traveler takes a different amount of time than the journey does as judged by a correct clock of someone who does not take the journey.
David Lewis' definition of time travel has no implications about whether, if you travel forward to the year 2276 or backward to 1776, you can suddenly pop into existence then, or instead must have traveled continuously through all the intervening years. If Lewis' definition is acceptable, then any requirement that rules out sudden appearance and demands spatiotemporal continuity will have to be supported by an additional argument. The argument that relativity theory requires this continuity is such an argument. According to relativity theory, if you travel forward to the year 2276, you cannot suddenly jump discontinuously into the future. Instead you must travel continually forward in both your personal time and the Earth’s external time, and you can be continuously observed from Earth’s telescopes during your voyage, although these Earth observers would notice that you are very slow about turning the pages in your monthly calendar.
One point to keep in mind is that even if a certain kind of time travel is logically possible, it does not follow that it is physically possible. Our understanding of what is physically possible about time travel comes primarily from the implications of Einstein’s general theory of relativity. This theory has never failed any of its many experimental tests, so most experts trust its implications for time travel.
However, there are many kinds of universes that are models of the equations of general relativity. For example, the theory of relativity does not say whether the universe is finite or infinite in volume, nor what its overall curvature is, nor whether it has a multi-connected topology (like a doughnut). But it seems clear that our universe is a model of general relativity, and in it time travel is not only physically possible, but occurs frequently.
Einstein’s general theory of relativity permits travel to the past and travel to the future. First, let’s consider future time travel. There are two kinds of future time travel—either by moving at high speed or by taking advantage of the presence of an intense gravitational field.
Regarding time travel due to high speed, any motion produces time travel to the future (relative to the clocks of those who do not travel). That makes every bicycle be a time machine. The higher the speed, the more noticeable the time travel. By going at extremely high speed, you can return to Earth where you left and find that the year is now 2276 C.E. (as measured by a clock fixed to the Earth) while your personal clock measures that merely ten years have elapsed. Both clocks can be giving correct readings of the time.
You can participate in that future, not just view it. A relevant philosophical controversy is whether there can be time travel that changes the future. This is impossible, according to (Lewis 1976, 150). To affect the future, or even to bring the future into existence is not the same thing as to change it.
It is impossible to use high speed to visit the future of the world after your death. And even if you reverse your velocity, it is impossible to travel back to the time that you began your journey even if you can travel back to the place where you began.
As measured by an Earth-based clock, it takes a 100,000 years for light to travel across the Milky Way Galaxy, but if you took the same trip in a spaceship traveling at very near the speed of light, the trip might last only a year, as judged by your own clock. In principle, you have enough time to travel anywhere before you die. But you can never get to a place faster than unobstructed light can get there.
A second kind of future time travel is due to a difference in the strength of the gravitational field between two places. If you left Earth in a spaceship that flew close to a black hole and then returned, you could return to find that you now look as youthful as your grandchildren although you would be much older than them, as judged by their clocks. You will not, however, be more biologically youthful than the you who stepped into the spaceship.
How about travel to the past? The desire to travel back in time is surely the child of remorse. Backward time travel is not allowed by either Newton's physics or Einstein's special theory of relativity, but general theory of relativity offers more hope since that theory does not clearly rule it out. For an easy illustration in a physically possible universe very unlike our own, imagine a Minkowski two-dimensional spacetime diagram written on a square sheet of paper, with one dimension of space going, say, right on the page. Each point represents a two-dimensional event. The time dimension points, say, up the page, at right angles to the space dimension. The origin is at the center of the page. Now bend the page into a cylinder so that the future meets the past. In this universe, any object that persists long enough will arrive into its past. It will participate in that past, but not change the past because there can be no erasing of events from the page, either those in the past or those in the future. If any kind of past time travel occurs, it will never enable the traveler to erase present facts.
In 1949, the logician Kurt Gödel convinced Albert Einstein that in some unusual worlds that obey the equations of general relativity, you the time traveler, if you accelerate sufficiently, can continually travel forward in your personal time but eventually arrive into your own past. [The same point is expressed more techncially by saying the light cones tilt enough to produce a closed time-like curve that includes your past events.]
In our own universe, there is no indication that time travel to the past has ever occurred. However, this does not rule out the possibility that in the future we will successfully create a time machine or time travel situation. (Thorne 1994) shows how a time machine would be created when matter is rearranged to produce a wormhole; but it is currently not technologically feasible to build a wormhole.
When we speak of our time traveling to the future, we travel to someone else's future but not to our own future. However, we seem to be able, in principle, to travel to our own past. Unfortunately, say nearly all philosophers and scientists, even if you do travel to your own past, you will not do anything that has not already been done, or else there would be a logical contradiction. In fact, if you do go back, you would already have been back there. For this reason, if you go back in time and try to kill your grandfather before he conceived a child, you will fail no matter how hard you try. You will fail because you have failed. You may feel you are able to kill your grandfather of your own free will, but you won't be able to.
The metaphysician David Lewis believes you can in one sense kill your grandfather but cannot in another sense. You can, relative to a set of facts that does not include the fact that your grandfather survived to have children. You cannot, relative to a set of facts that does include this fact. The metaphysician Donald C. Williams disagrees, and argues that we always need to make our “can” statement relative to all the available facts. Lewis is saying you can and can’t, and you can but won’t. Williams is saying simply that you can’t, so you won’t. For a discussion of this disagreement, see (Fisher, 2015).
Here are a variety of brief philosophical arguments against past-directed time travel.
- Time travel is impossible because, if it were possible, we should have seen many time travelers by now, but nobody has encountered any time travelers.
- You could go back in time and kill your grandfather, but then you wouldn’t be born and so could not go back in time and kill your grandfather. That’s a logical contradiction.
- If past time travel were possible, then you could be in two different bodies at the same time, which is metaphysically impossible.
- If you were to go back to the past, then you would have been fated to go back because you already did, and this rules out free will. Yet we do have free will, so travel to the past is metaphysically impossible.
- If past time travel were possible, then you could die before you were born, which is metaphysically impossible.
- If you were presently to go back in time, then your present events would cause past events, which violates our concept of causality.
- If there were time travel, then when time travelers go back and attempt to change history, they must always botch their attempts to change anything, and it will appear to anyone watching them at the time as if Nature is conspiring against them. Since observers have never witnessed this apparent conspiracy of Nature, there probably cannot be time travel.
- Travel to the past is impossible because it allows the gaining of information for free. Here is a possible scenario. Buy a copy of Darwin's book The Origin of Species, which was published in 1859. In the 21st century, enter a time machine with it, go back to 1855 and give the book to Darwin himself. He could have used your copy in order to write his manuscript which he sent off to the publisher. If so, who first came up with the knowledge about evolution? Neither you nor Darwin. This is free information. Because this scenario contradicts what we know about where knowledge comes from, past-directed time travel isn't really possible.
- If past time travel is possible, then according to the philosopher John Earman, it should be possible for a rocket ship to carry a time machine capable of launching a probe (perhaps a smaller rocket) into its recent past which eventually reunites with the mother ship. The mother ship is programmed to launch the probe at a certain time unless a safety switch is on at that time. Suppose the safety switch is programmed to be turned on if and only if the “return” or “impending arrival” of the probe is detected by a sensing device on the mother ship. Does the probe get launched? It seems to be launched if and only if it is not launched.
These complaints about travel to the past are a mixture of arguments that past-directed time travel is not logically possible, metaphysically possible, physically possible, technologically possible, and probable, given today's empirical evidence. Counters to all of these arguments have been suggested by advocates of time travel. For example, a counter to the first argument is that perhaps we have seen no time travelers because we live in a boring era of little interest to travelers who have time machines.
If time were two-dimensional, we probably could travel back in time, analogously to how we can get back to the starting point of our run around a two-dimensional, oval race track. But time is not two-dimensional.
For more discussion of time travel, see the encyclopedia article “Time Travel.”
Substantivalism says space and time are like a container in which matter exists and moves independently of the container. Relationism is the thesis that space and time are not like this. If you take away the matter and its motion, you take away the container.
Let’s leave aside the metaphor of the container and the contained, and more carefully describe substantivalism and relationism.
Substantivalism is the thesis that space and time exist independently of physical material and its events.
Relationism is the thesis that space is only a set of relationships among existing physical material, and time is a set of relationships among the events of that physical material.
One implication is that relationism and substantivalism cannot both be true. Another implication of substantivalism is that time exists even if there are no physical events. There can be “empty time.” Relationism does not allow empty time. It says time requires change.
Everyone agrees time cannot be measured without there being changes, because we measure time by observing changes in some property or other such as the physical location of the hands of the clock, but the present issue is whether time exists without changes.
We need to be clearer about what we mean by “changes” when we say the dispute between substantivalists and relationists is over whether time does or doesn’t exist without changes. The word “change” is used in the ordinary sense of an object changing its properties over time. If a house changes its properties over space, by being red here and white there, this is not ordinary change. And it is also not ordinary change when the death of Queen Anne changes by moving farther into the past.
If Ludwig Boltzmann changes his mind from liking Joseph Loschmidt to disliking him, does that count as an ordinary change? No, not if Cartesian dualism is correct, but yes if most philosophers of mind are correct because Boltzmann's mind cannot change without a spatio-temporal change in Boltzmann’s brain.
We also need to be clearer about what the word “properties” means when speaking of an object changing its properties over time. For the relational theory, the term "property" is intended to exclude what Nelson Goodman called grue-like properties. Let us define an object to be grue if and only if it is green before the beginning of the year 1888 but is blue thereafter. With this definition, we can conclude that the world’s chlorophyll underwent a change from grue to non-grue in 1888. We’d naturally react to drawing this conclusion by saying that this change in chlorophyll is not a “real change” or “ordinary change” in the chlorophyll.
Classical substantival theories are also called "absolute theories." Unfortunately, the term "absolute" is used in other ways in philosophy. A second sense of "to be absolute" is to be immutable, or changeless. A third sense is to be independent of observer or reference frame. Although Einstein’s theory implies that time is not absolute in the sense of being independent of reference frame, it is an open question whether relativity theory undermines substantivalism.
Let's turn now to the history of the debate between the proponents and opponents of relationism about time.
The first advocate of a relational theory was Aristotle. He said, “neither does time exist without change” (Physics, book IV, chapter 11, page 218b). Plato had envisioned time as being substance-like, with time being an eternity that is measured by heavenly motion. Aristotle, on the other hand, envisioned time as not being substance-like but rather as being a property of motion, a measure of motion. The difference is between time being measured by motion and motion being measured by time. Plato’s position is a predecessor of Newton’s substantivalism, and Aristotle’s position is a predecessor of Leibniz’s relationism.
The battle lines between substantivalism and relationism were more clearly drawn in the early 18th century when Leibniz argued for the relational position against Newton, who had adopted a substantival theory of time. Newton's actual equations of motion and his law of gravity are consistent with both relationism and substantivalism, although this point was not clear at the time to either Leibniz or Newton.
In the 17th century, the English physicist Isaac Barrow rejected Aristotle’s and Leibniz's linkage between time and change. Barrow said time is something which exists independently of change and which existed even before God created the matter in the universe. Barrow’s student, Isaac Newton, agreed with this substantival theory of time. Although it is not clear what Newton’s own position was, Newton's followers argued very specifically that time and space are like an infinitely large arena or container for all events, and that the container exists with or without the events. He added that time (and space) are not primary substances, but are like primary substances in not being dependent on anything except God. For Newton, God chose some instant at which to create the world of physical objects, each having some velocity. From these initial conditions, the laws took over and guided the objects.
Gottfried Leibniz objected. He was suspicious of Newton's absolute time because it seemed to him to be undetectable. He argued that time is not an entity existing independently of actual events. He insisted that Newton had under-emphasized the fact that time necessarily involves an ordering of events. This is why time “needs” events, so to speak. Leibniz added that this overall order is time. So, he advocated relationism and rejected Newton's substantivalism.
One of Leibniz’s criticisms of Newton’s theory of absolute space and absolute time is that it violates a law of metaphysics that is now called Leibniz’s Law of the Identity of Indiscernibles: If two things or situations cannot be discerned by their different properties, then they are really just one and not two. Newton’s absolute theory violates this law, Leibniz said, because it implies that a world shifted in absolute space to a new location is a new world. Ditto for a time shift. For example, Newton’s theory implies that if God had moved the entire world 5 kilometers east and its history 5 minutes earlier, yet changed no properties of the objects nor relationships among the objects, then this would have been a different world. After all, there is nothing to distinguish one point from another in absolute space. But since there would be no discernible difference in the two worlds, Leibniz charged, there is just one world here, not two, and so Newton’s theory of absolute space and time is faulty.
Leibniz also criticized Newton's theory because it violates Leibniz's Law of Sufficient Reason: that there is a reason why anything is the way it is. Leibniz complained that, if God shifted the world 5 kilometers east or 5 minutes earlier but made no other changes, then He could have no reason to do so.
Newton's response was two-fold. First, he said Leibniz is correct that we cannot directly observe absolute space and time, and he is correct to accept the Principle of Sufficient Reason, yet the Principle does not require there to be sufficient reasons for humans; God might have had His own reason for creating the universe at a given place and time even though mere mortals cannot comprehend His reasons. Maybe God doesn't want to shift the universe five minutes earlier.
Second, regarding Leibniz’s complaint using the Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles, Newton suggested God is able to discern differences in absolute time that mere mortals cannot. Newton later admitted to friends that his two-part theological response was weak. Historians of philosophy generally agree.
If Newton had said no more, he would have lost the debate. However, Newton found a much better argument. Here is how to detect absolute space indirectly, he said. Suppose we tie a bucket’s handle to a rope hanging down from a tree branch. Partially fill the bucket with water, grasp the bucket, and, without spilling any water, rotate it many times until the rope is twisted. Don’t let go of the bucket. When everything quiets down, the water surface is flat and there is no relative motion between the bucket and its water. That is situation 1. Now let go of the bucket, and let it spin until there is once again no relative motion between the bucket and its water. At this time, while the bucket is spinning, there will be a maximum concave curvature of the water surface. That is situation 2.
How can a relational theory explain the difference in the shape of the water's surface in the two situations? It cannot, says Newton. If we ignore our hands, the rope, the tree, and the rest of the universe, says Newton, each situation is simply a bucket with still water; the situations appear to differ only in the shape of the surface. A relationist such as Leibniz cannot account for the difference in shape.
Newton said that even though Leibniz’s theory would fail to explain the difference in shape, his own theory could. He said that when the bucket is not spinning, there is no motion relative to space itself, that is, to absolute space; but, when it is spinning, there is motion relative to space itself, and so space itself exerts a force on the water to make the concave shape. This force is called "centrifugal force," and its presence is a way to detect absolute space.
Leibniz and his allies had no rebuttal. So, for over two centuries after this argument was created, Newton’s absolute theory of space and time was generally accepted by European scientists and philosophers.
One hundred years later, Kant entered the arena on the side of Newton. In a space containing only a single glove, said Kant, Leibniz could not account for its being a right-handed glove versus a left-handed glove because all the internal relationships would be the same in each of the two situations. However, intuitively we all know that there is a real difference between a right and a left glove, so this difference can only be due to the glove’s relationship to space itself. But if there is a “space itself,” then the absolute or substantival theory of space is better than the relational theory. This results suggests that the absolute theory of time is better, too.
Newton’s theory of time was dominant in the 18th and 19th centuries, even though during those centuries Huygens, George Berkeley, and Ernst Mach had entered the arena on the side of Leibniz. Near the end of the 19th century, Mach argued that it must be the remaining matter in the universe, such as the "fixed" stars, which causes the water surface in the bucket to be concave, and that without these stars or other matter, a spinning bucket would have a flat surface. Newton was incorrect, said Mach, to rely so much on his intuition that spinning buckets of water must always have concave surfaces.
In 1969, the philosopher Sydney Shoemaker presented a thought experiment in favor of Newton and substantivalism. It was an original argument attempting to establish, not that time exists without change, but the understandability of time existing without change. With the following scenario, we all can understand how empty time could exist, says Shoemaker. Divide all space into three disjoint regions, called region 3, region 4, and region 5. In region 3, change ceases every third year for one year. People in regions 4 and 5 can verify this and then convince the people in region 3 of it after they come back to life at the end of their frozen year. Similarly, change ceases in region 4 every fourth year for a year; and change ceases in region 5 every fifth year. Every sixty years—that is, every 3 x 4 x 5 years—all three regions freeze simultaneously for a year. In year sixty-one, everyone comes back to life, time having marched on for a year with no change. A year of empty time. Note that even if Shoemaker’s scenario successfully shows that the notion of empty time is understandable, it is not designed to show that empty time actually exists.
In the early 20th century, Einstein and the philosopher Hans Reichenbach declared the special theory of relativity to be a victory for the relational theory. Special relativity, they said, ruled out a space-filling ether, the leading candidate for substantival space, so the substantival theory was incorrect.
The relationist response to Newton’s bucket argument is to note Newton’s error in not considering the distant environment, as Mach had suggested. Einstein initially agreed with Mach that a body’s inertial mass comes from its interaction with all the other bodies in the universe and not with its interaction with space itself. So, if you hold Newton's bucket still but spin the background stars, then the water will creep up the side of the bucket and form a concave surface because the bucket is rotating with respect to the center of mass of the galaxy and not because the bucket is rotating with respect to substantival space.
There is "substantival" in the sense of independent of reference frame and also in the sense of independent of events. Only the first sense is ruled out when we reject a space-filling ether. But regarding the second sense, either there is no substance, in which case relationism is still correct, or there is a substance, namely spacetime itself, but this substance can no longer be independent of its matter, because, as John Wheeler quipped, “Spacetime tells matter how to move,” so again relationism is vindicated since there is no clear distinction between container and the contents it contains.
Despite these arguments for relationism, substantivalism can be defended in various ways.
One way is by redefining the term “spacetime” and the phrase “the matter is removed” and giving a realist interpretation of the general theory of relativity, while assuming that the metric of spacetime is not essential to spacetime. Relativity theory, as it is usually presented, says there is a four-dimensional continuous manifold of point-events, points that do not endure over time. To this manifold, it adds a metric field and a matter field. The metric field specifies, among other things, the intervals between points, and thus the spatial distances and temporal durations and certain geometrical properties. The metric field is often included explicitly or implicitly in the definition of “spacetime.” The Standard Model of Particle Physics, which includes the general theory of relativity, adds that there are twelve matter fields, not one, because there is an electron field, a quark field, and so forth. The new definition of “spacetime” is that spacetime is only the manifold. This is the substance of the new substantivalism, which is why it is often called “manifold substantivalism.” The manifold is the container that contains matter; and it is what continues to exist after the matter is removed.
The new meaning of the term “the matter is removed” is that the values of the matter fields are zero at each point. The physical theory does not allow any of the matter fields to stop existing merely because their value at each point might be zero. Nor do the metric field and manifold stop existing when the matter fields have these values. So, it can be said that with this terminology, spacetime continues to exist even though the matter it contains is removed, and in this way substantivalism is rescued.
However, by having no metric field, this spacetime does not specify for each event which other events are in its past and which events are in its future. But perhaps the loss of this intuitive feature of spacetime is an acceptable loss in order to save substantivalism.
Another kind of substantivalism says that spacetime is not just the manifold but rather is a combination of the manifold plus a single, essential metrical structure. Yet another position is that the debate between substantivalism and relationism no longer makes sense given the new terminology of the general theory of relativity. The very distinction between spacetime and event in spacetime, or between space and matter, has broken down. Yet other philosophers of physics see this break down as a vindication of at least the “spirit” of relationism. For more discussion of these technical points, see (Dainton, 2010, chapter 21).
In 1908, the English philosopher J. M. E. McTaggart proposed two ways of linearly ordering all events in time. The resulting ordering is the same, but the methods by which the ordering is created are different.
Longer lasting events can be considered to be composed of their point events. Let a and b be two point events that occur in the past, but in which a is farther in the past and so occurs first. Using the standard time diagram with time increasing to the right along a horizontal line, event a in McTaggart's B-series will be ordered to the left of event b because a happens before b. But when ordering the same two events into McTaggart's A-series, event a is ordered to the left of b for a different reason—because event a is more in the past than event b, or has more pastness than b. Here is a picture of the ordering, with c being another point event that happens later than a and b.
There are many other events that are located within the series at event a's location, namely all events simultaneous with event a.
McTaggart himself believed the A-series is paradoxical [for reasons that will not be explored in this article], but McTaggart also believed the A-properties (such as being past) are essential to our current concept of time, so for this reason he believed our current concept of time is incoherent. This reasoning is sometimes called "McTaggart's Paradox."
Let's suppose that event c occurs in our present and after events a and b. The information that c occurs in the present is not contained within either the A-series or the B-series itself. However, the information that c is in the present is used to create the A-series; it tells us to place c to the right of b because all present events go to the right of past events. The information that c is a present event is not used to create the B-series. The B-series places event c to the right of b just from the information that b happens before c.
Metaphysicians dispute whether the A-theory or instead the B-theory is the correct theory of reality. The A-theory comprises two theses, each of which is contrary to the B-theory: (1) The A-series is fundamental. Time is basically constituted by an A-series in which any event's being in the past (or in the present or in the future) is an intrinsic, objective, monadic property of the event itself and is not merely a subjective relation between the event and us, or between the event and the context of our utterance. (2) The second thesis of the A-theory is that events change. In 1908, McTaggart described the special way that events change:
Take any event—the death of Queen Anne, for example—and consider what change can take place in its characteristics. That it is a death, that it is the death of Anne Stuart, that it has such causes, that it has such effects—every characteristic of this sort never changes.... But in one respect it does change. It began by being a future event. It became every moment an event in the nearer future. At last it was present. Then it became past, and will always remain so, though every moment it becomes further and further past.
This special change is called secondary change and second-order change and also McTaggartian change.
The B-theory disagrees with both thesis (1) and thesis (2) of the A-theory. According to the B-theory, the B-series and not the A-series is fundamental; fundamental temporal properties are relational, not monadic; McTaggartian change is not an objective change and so is not metaphysically fundamental. The B-theory implies that an event's property of occurring in the past (or occurring twenty-three minutes ago, or now, or in a future century) is relational because it is merely a subjective relation between the event and us. When analyzed, it will be seen to make reference to our own perspective on the world. Queen Anne's death has the property of occurring in the past because it occurs in our past as opposed to, say, Aristotle's past; and it occurs in our past rather than our present or our future because it occurs at a time that is less than the time of occurrence of some event that we (rather than Aristotle) would say is occurring. The B-theory is committed to there being no objective distinction among past, present and future.
The B-theorists complain that thesis (1) of the A-theory implies that an event’s being in the present is an intrinsic, monadic property of the event, not a binary property between the event and a person, so this implies that if an event is present, then it is present for everybody. That implication violates the special theory of relativity because an event can be present for one person but not for another person who is moving relative to the first person. So, being present is relative and not an intrinsic, monadic property of the event. Being present is relative to reference frame. An event's being present in a given reference frame is a better candidate for an intrinsic, monadic property of the event, say the B-theorists.
When discussing the A-theory and the B-theory, metaphysicians often speak of an
- A-series and B-series
- A-theory and B-theory
- A-theorist and B-theorist
- A-facts and B-facts
- A-terms and B-terms
- A-properties and B-properties
- A-predicates and B-predicates
- A-statements and B-statements
- A-camp and B-camp.
Here are some examples. B-series terms are relational terms; a B-term refers to a property of a pair of events such as “is earlier than,” “happens twenty-three minutes after,” and “was simultaneous with.” An A-theory term is monadic; it refers to a one-place property of a single event, not a pair of events: "in the near future," "happened twenty-three minutes ago," and "is present." The B-theory terms represent distinctively B-properties; the A-theory terms represent distinctively A-properties. The B-fact that event a occurs before event b will always be a fact, but the A-fact that event a occurred about an hour ago soon won’t be a fact. Similarly, the A-statement that event a occurred about an hour ago, if true, will soon become false. However, B-facts are not transitory, and B-statements are eternal, they have fixed truth values. For the B-theorist, the statement "The event of snowing occurs an hour before this act of utterance" will, if true, stay true forever. The A-theory usually says A-facts are the truthmakers of true A-statements and so A-facts are ontologically fundamental; the B-theorist, at least a B-theorist who believes in facts, appeals instead to B-facts. According to a classical B-theory, when the A-theorist correctly says, "It began snowing an hour ago," what really makes it true is not that the snowing has an hour of pastness but that the event of uttering the sentence occurs an hour after the event of it beginning to snow. Notice that "occurs an hour after" is a B-term.
When you like an event, say yesterday’s snowfalling, then change your mind and dislike the event, what sort of change of the event is that? Well, this change in attitude is not a change that is intrinsic to the event itself. When your attitude changes, the snowfalling itself undergoes no intrinsic change, only a change in its relationship to you. A-theorists prefer to focus on the second-order change of what they consider to be intrinsic properties of an event, such as its being past. They point out that the snowfalling event will change tomorrow by being even more past. And this second-order change occurs regardless of whether your attitude toward the event changes.
Members of the A-camp and B-camp recognize that ordinary speakers are not careful in their use of A and B terminology; but, when the terminology is used carefully, each camp member believes their camp's terminology can best explain the terminology of the other camp.
Time seems to flow, in two senses. First, future events eventually become present events and then become past events, just like a boat-event that drifts past us on the riverbank and then recedes farther and farther from us. Second, in the converse sense, we flow into the future and leave past events ever farther behind us. This is the sense that the philosopher George Santayana offered in 1938 when he said, “The essence of nowness runs like fire along the fuse of time.”
Time definitely seems to flow, but there is philosophical disagreement about whether it really does. This issue is about physical time, not merely psychological time, and it is directly related to whether McTaggart's A-theory or B-theory is more fundamental.
There are two primary theories about time’s flow: (A) the flow is objectively real. (B) the flow is either a myth or else is merely subjective. Often theory A is called the dynamic theory or the A-theory; and often theory B is called the static theory or B-theory or myth-of-passage theory.
The B theory implies that the flow is the product of a faulty metaphor. The defense of that charge often proceeds like this. Time exists, things change, and so we say time “elapses,” but time itself does not change. It does not change by flowing. The present does not objectively flow or move into the past because the present is not an objective feature of the world. We all experience this flow, but only in the sense that we all frequently misinterpret our experience.
One point offered in favor of the B-theory is to ask about the rate at which time flows. It would be a rate of one second per second. But that is silly, it is claimed. One second divided by one second is the unit-less number one. That is not a coherent rate.
In another sense of “rate” and of “flow,” there definitely can be different rates for time. According to the special theory of relativity, if I move at a high speed away from you, then you will judge that my time elapses at a slower rate than your time. Physicists sometimes speak of this situation as one in which time flows differently for different observers. However, this is not the sense of flow being promoted by dynamic theories of time.
Physicists sometimes speak of time flowing in another sense of the term "flow." This is the sense in which change is continuous rather than discrete. Again, this is not the sense of “flow” that philosophers have in mind when debating the objectivity of time's flow.
Physicists sometimes carelessly speak of time flowing when all they mean is that time elapses, that is, exists. They also carelessly speak of time flowing in yet another sense—when what they mean is that time has an arrow, a direction, from the past to the future. But again this is not the sense of “flow” that philosophers use when speaking of the dynamic theory of time's flow.
There is no doubt that time seems to pass. There surely is some objective feature of our brains, say the proponents of the static theories, that causes us to mistakenly believe there is a flow of time which we are experiencing. Perhaps it is due to the objective fact that we have different perceptions at different times and that anticipations of experiences always happen before memories of those experiences.
According to the dynamic theories, the flow of time is objective. It is a feature of our mind-independent reality, and is an intrinsic property of time. A dynamic theory is closer to common sense, and has historically been the more popular theory among philosophers. It is more likely to be adopted by those who believe that McTaggart's A-series is a fundamental feature of time but his B-series is not.
There are several kinds of dynamic theory. One dynamic theory implies that the flow is a matter of events changing from being future, to being present, to being past, and they also change in their degree of pastness and degree of presentness. This kind of change is often called McTaggart's second-order change to distinguish it from more ordinary, first-order change as when a leaf changes from a green state to a brown state. For the B-theorist, the only proper kind of change is when different states of affairs obtain at different times. Proponents of the A-theory and of the B-theory agree that an event, say World War I, is changing its relationships to us, for example because some of us today are learning more about the war; but the two theories disagree about whether World War I is undergoing an intrinsic change, not just a change in relationship to us.
Opponents of the dynamic theory complain that when events are said to change, the change is not a real change in the event’s essential, intrinsic properties, but only in the event’s relationship to the observer. They complain that saying the death of Queen Anne is an event that changes from present to past is no more of an objectively real change in her death than saying her death changed from being approved of to being disapproved of. This extrinsic change in approval is not intrinsic to her death and so does not count as an objectively real change in her death, and neither does the so-called second-order change of her death from being present to being past. Attacking the notion of time’s flow in this manner, Adolf Grünbaum said: “Events simply are or occur…but they do not ‘advance’ into a pre-existing frame called ‘time.’ … An event does not move and neither do any of its relations.”
A second dynamic theory implies that the flow is a matter of events changing from being indeterminate in the future to being determinate in the present and past. Time’s flow is really events becoming determinate, so these dynamic theorists speak of time’s flow as "temporal becoming."
A third dynamic theory says time's flow is the coming into existence of facts, the actualization of new states of affairs; but, unlike the first two dynamic theories, there is no commitment to events changing. This is the theory of flow that is usually accepted by advocates of presentism.
A fourth dynamic theory suggests the flow is (or is reflected in) the change over time of truth values of declarative sentences. For example, suppose the sentence, “It is now raining,” was true during the rain yesterday but has changed to false today, which is sunny. That's an indication that time flowed from yesterday to today, and these sorts of truth value changes are at the root of the flow. In response, critics of this dynamic theory suggest that the temporal indexical sentence, “It is now raining,” has no truth value because the reference of the word “now” is unspecified. If it cannot have a truth value, it cannot change its truth value. However, the sentence is related to a sentence that does have a truth value, the sentence with the temporal indexical replaced by the date that refers to a specific time and with the other indexicals replaced by names of whatever they refer to. Supposing it is now midnight here on April 1, 2017, and the speaker is in Sacramento, California, then the indexical sentence, “It is now raining,” is intimately related to the more complete or context-explicit sentence, “It is raining at midnight on April 1, 2017 in Sacramento, California.” Only these latter, non-indexical, non-context-dependent, complete sentences have truth values, and these truth values do not change with time, so they do not underlie any flow of time. Fully-described events do not change their properties and so time does not flow because complete or "eternal" sentences do not change their truth values.
Another dynamic theory adds to the block-universe a flowing present which "spotlights" or makes vivid a new present slice of the block at every moment. This is often called the moving spotlight view.
John Norton (Norton 2010) argues that time's flow is objective but so far is beyond the reach of our understanding. Tim Maudlin argues that the objective flow of time is fundamental and unanalyzable. He is happy to say “time does indeed pass at the rate of one hour per hour” (Maudlin 2007, p. 112).
Have dinosaurs slipped out of existence? More generally, we are asking whether the past is part of reality. How about the future? Philosophers are divided on the ontological question of the reality of the past, the present, and the future. There are three leading theories. (1): According to the ontological theory called presentism, if something is real, then it is real now; all and only things that exist now are real. The presentist maintains that the past and the future are not real, so if a statement about the past is true, this must be because some present facts make it true. Heraclitus, Duns Scotus, Thomas Hobbes, and A. N. Prior are presentists.
(2): Advocates of a growing-past agree with the presentists that the present is special ontologically, but they argue that, in addition to the present, the past is also real and is growing bigger all the time. C. D. Broad, George Ellis, Richard Jeffrey, and Michael Tooley have defended this view. They claim the past and present are real, but the future is not real. William James famously remarked that the future is so unreal that even God cannot anticipate it. It is not clear whether Aristotle accepted the growing-past theory or accepted a form of presentism; see (Putnam 1967, p. 244) for commentary on this issue.
(3): Proponents of eternalism oppose both presentism and the growing-past theory—but not because they believe reality is composed of the past, present, and future. Rather, the eternalists object to assigning special ontological status to the past, the present, or the future. Advocates of eternalism do not deny the reality of the events that we classify as being in our past, present or future, but they say there is no objective ontological difference between present and future, just as there is no objective ontological difference between here and there. The difference is subjective, depending upon which person's experience is being implicitly referred to. Yes, we thank goodness that the threat to our safety is there rather than here, and that it is past rather than present, but these differences are subjective, being dependent on our point of view. Some eternalists say that because of the finite speed of light we can see distant objects only as they were in the past. We never see them as they are presently. Bertrand Russell, J. J. C. Smart, W. V. O. Quine, Adolf Grünbaum, and Paul Horwich have endorsed eternalism.
Eternalism is closely associated with the block-universe theory, as is the theory of four-dimensionalism. Four-dimensionalism implies that the ontologically basic objects in the universe are four-dimensional rather than three-dimensional. Four-dimensionalism plus the block theory is said to promote the "spatialization of time" because it treats time as a fourth dimension in a four-dimensional spacetime. For a graphic presentation, see a Minkowski diagram. If time has an infinite future or infinite past, or if space has an infinite extent, then the block is thereby infinitely large along those dimensions.
The block-universe theory implies that reality is a single block of spacetime with its time slices (its sheets of simultaneous events) ordered by the happens-before relation. We adults are composed of our infancy time-slices, plus our childhood time-slices, plus our teenage time-slices, plus our adult time-slices. Time-slices are also called "temporal parts."
For the eternalist, the block itself has no distinguished past, present, and future, but any chosen reference frame can be assigned its own definite past, present, and future. The future, by the way, is the actual future, not all possible futures. The philosopher William James coined the term “block universe.”
Some proponents of the growing-past theory have adopted a growing-block theory. They say that the future is not included in their block because it does not exist. The present moment is the latest moment within the block. The present is a three-dimensional time slice that divides the past from the nothingness of the future.
All three ontologies [namely, presentism, the growing-past, and eternalism] imply that at the present moment we only ever experience a part of the present. One of the major issues for presentism is how to ground true propositions about the past. What makes it true that U.S. President Abraham Lincoln was assassinated? In technical-ease we are asking what are the "truthmakers" of the true propositions and the "falsemakers" of the false propositions. Some presentists say past-tensed truths lack truthmakers but are nevertheless true. Most presentists will say what makes a tensed proposition true are only features of the present way things are. The eternalist disagrees. When someone says truly that Abraham Lincoln was assassinated, the eternalist believes this is to say something true of a real Abraham Lincoln who is not present. The block theorist might add that Lincoln is real but far away from us along the time dimension just as the Moon is real even though far away from us along a spatial dimension.
A second major issue for the presentist is to account for causation, for the fact that April showers caused May flowers. Normally, when causes occur, their effects are not yet present. A survey of defenses of presentism can be found in (Markosian 2003).
A third major issue for the presentist is to account for the Special Theory of Relativity's treatment of the present. That theory allows event a to be simultaneous with event b in some reference frame, and it allows be to be simultaneous with event c in some other reference frame. Yet in the first frame, c is in the future of a. So, if a is real, then shouldn’t the presentist allow c to be real also? This argument against presentism presupposes the transitivity of co-existence. (Stein 1991) says presentism can be retained by rejecting transitivity and saying what is present and thus real is different depending on your spacetime location. For event a, the only events that are real are those with a zero interval from a.
The presentist and the advocate of the growing-past will usually unite in opposition to eternalism on four grounds: (i) The present is so much more vivid to a conscious being than are memories of past experiences and expectations of future experiences. (ii) Eternalism misses the special “open” and changeable character of the future. In the classical block-universe theory promoted by most eternalists (as opposed to non-classical versions that say the block splits into multiple blocks for each quantum possibility at each instant), there is only one future, so this implies the future exists already; but we know this determinsm is incorrect because it denies libertarian free will. (iii) A present event "moves" in the sense that it is no longer present a moment later, having lost its property of presentness. (iv) Future-tensed statements that are contingent do not have truthmakers.
The counter from the defenders of eternalism and the block-universe is that, regarding (i), the vividness of here does not imply the unreality of there. Regarding (ii) and the open future, the block theory allows determinism and fatalism but does not require either one. Eventually there will be one future, regardless of whether that future is now open or closed, and that is what constitutes the future portion of the block. Finally, don't we all fear impending doom? But according to presentism and the growing-block theory, why should we have this fear if the doom is known not to exist, as these two kinds of theorists evidently believe? The best philosophy of time will not make our different attitudes toward future danger and past danger be so mysterious.
The advocates of the block-universe attack both presentism and the growing-past theory by claiming that only the block-universe can make sense of the special theory of relativity’s implication that, if persons A and B are separated but in relative motion, an event in person A’s present can be in person B’s future. Advocates of presentism and the growing-past theories must suppose that this event is both real and unreal because it is real for A but not real for B. Surely that conclusion is unacceptable, claim the eternalists. Two key assumptions of this argument are, first, that relativity does provide an accurate account of the spatiotemporal relations among events, and, second, that if there is some frame of reference in which two events are simultaneous, then if one of the events is real, so is the other.
Opponents of the block-universe counter that block theory does not provide an accurate account of the way things are because the block theory considers the present to be subjective, and not part of objective reality, yet the present is known to be part of objective reality. If science doesn't use the concept of the present in its basic laws, then this is one of science's faults. For a review of the argument from relativity against presentism, and for some criticisms of the block theory, see (Putnam 1967) and (Saunders 2002).
Suppose you look at your correct clock near you in your apartment building on Earth and notice it is shows midnight. What time is it on the Moon? Well, midnight, of course. But what event on the Moon is simultaneous with midnight on Earth? You can't look and see immediately. You will have to wait 1.3 seconds at least because it takes light that long to reach from the Moon to the Earth. If an asteroid were to strike the Moon, and you were to see the strike through your Earth telescope at 1.3 seconds after midnight, then you could compute later that the asteroid striking the Moon was simultaneous with your clock showing midnight. If you want to know what is presently happening on the other side of Milky Way, you'll have an even longer wait. So, the moral is that whatever collection of events is in your present is something you have to compute; you cannot just look and see at one time.
Einstein's theory of relativity implies that, if someone judges time using a clock fixed to their spaceship that is flying over your apartment building at a significant fraction of the speed of light, then when your clock shows it is now midnight, the collection of events that you eventually compute and so can correctly say occurs now must be different than the collection of events that the space traveler will be able to say occurs now, and the difference grows greater the father away that the events occur from Earth. The implication is that nobody's now is the only correct one. We all have our nows, and they are as valid as the next person's. But for people on Earth who aren't moving fast relative to each other, we more or less all share the same now. That is, we all can eventually agree on our computations about what events occur now. For further discussion of this point, see (Butterfield 1984).
All philosophers agree that we would be missing some important information if we did not know what time it is now, but these philosophers disagree over just what sort of information this is. Proponents of the objectivity of the present are committed to claiming the universe would have a present even if there were no conscious beings. This claim is controversial. For example, in 1915, Bertrand Russell objected to giving the present any special ontological standing:
In a world in which there was no experience, there would be no past, present, or future, but there might well be earlier and later. (Russell 1915, p. 212)
The principal argument for believing in the objectivity of the now is that the now is so much more vivid to everyone. If science does not explain this vividness, then there is a defect within science. A second argument points out that there is so much agreement among people around us about what is happening now and what is not. So, isn't that a sign that the concept of the now is objective, not subjective, and existent rather than non-existent? A third argument for objectivity of the now is that when we examine ordinary language we find evidence that a belief in the now is ingrained in our language. It is unlikely that it would be so ingrained if it were not correct to believe it.
Let's re-examine these arguments. One criticism of the argument from vividness is that the now is vivid but so is the "here," yet we don't conclude from this that the here is somehow objective geographically. Why then assume that the vividness of the now points to it being objective temporally? A second criticism is that we cannot now step outside our present experience and compare its vividness with experience now of future time and experience now of past times. Instead, when we speak of the "vividness" of our present experience of, say, a tree in front of us, we are really comparing our present experience of the tree with our dim memories of past trees and expectations of future trees. So, the comparison is unfair; the vividness of future events should be assessed by measuring those events and not merely by measuring expectations of those events.
A third criticism of the vividness argument points out that there are empirical studies by cognitive psychologists and neuroscientists showing that our judgment about what is vividly happening now is plastic and can be affected by our expectations and by what other experiences we are having at the time. For example, we see and hear a woman speaking to us from across the room; then we construct an artificial now in which hearing her speak and seeing her speak happen at the same time, whereas the acoustic engineer tells us we are mistaken because the sound traveled much slower than the light.
In any discussion about whether the now is objective, we need to remember that the term "objective" has different senses. There is objective in the sense of not being relative to the reference frame. But there is also objective in the sense of not being mind-dependent and in the sense of not being dependent upon which person we are talking about. Since being subjective is not being objective, there are multiple senses of being subjective.
According to McTaggart's A-camp, there is a global now shared by all of us. The now is objective in all the senses that were just mentioned. The B-camp disagrees and says this belief in a global now is a product of our falsely supposing that everything we see is happening now; we are not factoring in the finite speed of light. Proponents of the non-objectivity of the present frequently claim that a proper analysis of time talk should treat the phrases "the present" and "now" as indexical terms which refer to the time at which the phrases are uttered or written by the speaker, so their relativity to us speakers shows the essential subjectivity of the present.
There are interesting issues about the now even in theology. Norman Kretzmann has argued that if God is omniscient, then He knows what time it is, and to know this He must always be changing. Therefore, there is an incompatibility between God's being omniscient and God's being immutable. Thomas Aquinas, on the other hand, argues that God is unchanging and so is not in time.
Some objects last longer than others. They persist longer. But there is philosophical disagreement about how to understand persistence. Objects considered four-dimensionally are said to persist by perduring rather than enduring. Think of events and processes as being four-dimensional. The familiar three-dimensional objects such as chairs and people are usually considered to exist wholly at a single time and are said to persist by enduring through time. Advocates of four-dimensionalism endorse perduring objects rather than enduring objects as the metaphysically basic entities. All events and processes are four-dimensional sub-blocks of the block-universe. The perduring object persists by being the sum or “fusion” of a series of its temporal parts (also called its temporal stages and temporal slices and time slices). For example, a thirty-five-year old man can be considered to be a four-dimensional perduring object consisting of his childhood, his middle age and his future old age. These are three of his infinitely many temporal parts.
One argument against four-dimensionalism is that it allows an object to have too many temporal parts. Four-dimensionalism implies that, during every second in which an object exists, there are at least as many temporal parts of the object as there are sub-segments of the mathematical line within the segment from zero to one. According to (Thomson 1983), this is too many parts for any object to have. She also says that as the present moves along, present temporal parts move into the past and go out of existence while some future temporal parts "pop" into existence, and she complains that this popping in and out of existence is implausible. The four-dimensionalist can respond to these complaints by remarking that the present temporal parts do not go out of existence when they are no longer in the present; instead, they simply do not presently exist. Similarly, dinosaurs have not popped out of existence; they simply do not exist presently. By removing talk of popping in and out, one removes the source of intuitive implausibility.
According to David Lewis in On the Plurality of Worlds, the primary argument for perdurantism is that it has an easy time of solving what he calls the problem of temporary intrinsics, of which the Heraclitus paradox is one example. The Heraclitus Paradox is the problem, first introduced by Heraclitus of ancient Greece, of explaining our not being able to step into the same river twice because the water is different the second time. The mereological essentialist agrees with Heraclitus, but our common sense says Heraclitus is mistaken. The advocate of endurance has trouble showing that Heraclitus is mistaken for the following reason: We do not step into two different rivers, do we? Yet the river has two different intrinsic properties, namely being two different collections of water; but, by Leibniz’s Law of the Indiscernibility of Identicals, identical objects cannot have different properties. A 4-dimensionalist who advocates perdurance says the proper metaphysical analysis of the Heraclitus paradox is that we can step into the same river twice by stepping into two different temporal parts of the same 4-d river. Similarly, we cannot see a football game at a moment; we can see only a momentary temporal part of the 4-d game. For more discussion of this topic in metaphysics, see (Carroll and Markosian 2010, pp. 173-7).
Eternalism differs from 4-dimensionalism. Eternalism says the present, past, and future are equally real, whereas 4-dimensionalism says the basic objects are 4-dimensional. Most 4-dimensionalists accept eternalism and four-dimensionalism and McTaggart's B-theory.
One of A. N. Prior’s criticisms of the B-theory involves the reasonableness of our saying of some painful, past event, “Thank goodness that is over.” Prior says the B-theorist cannot explain this reasonableness because no B-theorist should thank goodness that the end of their pain happens before their present utterance of "Thank goodness that is over," since that B-fact or B-relationship is timeless; it has always held and always will. The only way then to make sense of our saying “Thank goodness that is over” is to assume we are thankful for the A-fact that the pain event has pastness. But if so, then the A-theory is correct and the B-theory is incorrect.
One B-theorist response is discussed in a later section, but another response is simply to disagree with Prior that it is improper for a B-theorist to thank goodness that the end of their pain happens before their present utterance, even though this is an eternal B-fact. Still another response from the B-theorist comes from the 4-dimensionalist who says that as 4-dimensional beings it is proper for us to care more about our later time-slices than our earlier time-slices. If so, then it is reasonable to thank goodness that the time slice at the end of the pain occurs before the time slice that is saying, "Thank goodness that is over." Admittedly this is caring about an eternal B-fact. So Prior’s premise [that the only way to make sense of our saying “Thank goodness that is over” is to assume we are thankful for the A-fact that the pain event has pastness] is a faulty premise, and Prior’s argument for the A-theory is invalid.
Four-dimensionalism has implications for the philosophical problem of personal identity. According to four-dimensionalism, you as a teenager and you as a child are not the same 3-dimensional person but rather are two different parts of the same 4-dimensional person.
The philosophical dispute about presentism, the growing-past theory, and the block theory or eternalism has taken a linguistic turn by focusing upon a question about language: “Are predictions true or false at the time they are uttered?” Those who believe in the block-universe (and thus in the determinate reality of the future) will answer “Yes,” while a “No” will be given by presentists and advocates of the growing-past.
The issue is whether contingent sentences uttered now about future events are true or false now rather than true or false only in the future at the time the predicted event is supposed to occur. Proponents of the position that the sentences do have truth values now will appeal to their intuition that, if something has happened as specified in the sentence about the future, then, if we look back at the earlier time when the sentence is uttered, it was the case that it would happen. Not that they say "would happen" and not "must happen."
For example, suppose someone says, “Tomorrow the admiral will start a sea battle.” And suppose that tomorrow the admiral orders a sneak attack on the enemy ships which starts a sea battle. Advocates of the block-universe argue that, if so, then the above quoted sentence was true at the time it was uttered. Truth is eternal or fixed, they say, and “is true” is a timeless predicate, not one that merely says “is true now.” These philosophers point favorably to the ancient Greek philosopher Chrysippus who was convinced that a contingent sentence about the future is true or false. If so, the sentence cannot have any other value such as “indeterminate” or "neither true or false now."
Many other philosophers, usually in McTaggart's A-camp, agree with Aristotle's suggestion that the sentence is not true until it can be known to be true, namely at the time at which the sea battle occurs. The sentence was not true before the battle occurred. In other words, predictions have no (classical) truth values at the time they are uttered. Predictions fall into the “truth value gap.” This position that contingent sentences have no classical truth values is called the "doctrine of the open future" and also the "Aristotelian position" because many researchers throughout history have taken Aristotle to be holding the position in chapter 9 of On Interpretation—although today it is not so clear that Aristotle himself held the position.
One principal motive for adopting the Aristotelian position arises from the belief that, if sentences about future human actions are now true, then humans are determined to perform those actions, and so humans have no free will. To defend free will, we must deny truth values to predictions.
This Aristotelian argument against predictions being true or false has been discussed as much as any in the history of philosophy, and it faces a series of challenges. First, if there really is no free will, or if free will is compatible with determinism, then the motivation to deny truth values to predictions is undermined.
Second, according to many compatibilists, but not all, your choices do affect the world, and if it is true that you will perform an action in the future, it does not follow that now you will not perform it freely, nor that you are not free to do otherwise if your intentions were to change, but only that you will not do otherwise. For more on this point about modal logic, see Foreknowledge and Free Will.
A third challenge, from Quine and others, claims the Aristotelian position wreaks havoc with the logical system we use to reason and argue with predictions. For example, here is a deductively valid argument:
There will be a sea battle tomorrow.
If there will be a sea battle tomorrow, then we should wake up the admiral.
So, we should wake up the admiral.
Without the premises in this argument having truth values, that is, being true or false, we cannot properly assess the argument using the usual standards of deductive validity because this standard is about the relationships among truth values of the component sentences—that a valid argument is one in which it is impossible for the premises to be true and the conclusion to be false. Unfortunately, the Aristotelian position says that some of these component sentences are neither true nor false, so the Aristotelian position is implausible.
In reaction to this third challenge, proponents of the Aristotelian argument say that if Quine would embrace tensed propositions and expand his classical logic to a tense logic, he could avoid those difficulties in assessing the validity of arguments that involve sentences having future tense.
Quine has claimed that the analysts of our talk involving time should in principle be able to eliminate the temporal indexical words such as "now" and "tomorrow" because their removal is needed for fixed truth and falsity of our sentences [fixed in the sense of being eternal sentences whose truth values are not relative to the situation because the indexicals and indicator words have been replaced by times, places and names, and whose verbs are treated as timeless and tenseless], and having fixed truth values is crucial for the logical system used to clarify science. “To formulate logical laws in such a way as not to depend thus upon the assumption of fixed truth and falsity would be decidedly awkward and complicated, and wholly unrewarding,” says Quine.
Philosophers are still divided on the issues of whether only the present is real, what sort of deductive logic to use for reasoning about time, and whether future contingent sentences have truth values.
Using a tensed verb is a grammatical way of locating an event in time. All the world’s cultures have a conception of time, but only half the world’s languages use tenses. The Chinese, Burmese and Malay languages have no tenses. The English language expresses conceptions of time with tensed verbs but also in other ways, such as with the adverbial phrases “now” and “twenty-three days ago,” and with the adjective phrases "brand-new" and "ancient," and with the prepositions "until" and "since."
Philosophers have asked what we are basically committed to when we use tense to locate an event in time. There are two principal answers: that tenses are objective and that they are subjective. The first answer is that tenses represent objective features of reality that are not captured by eternalism and the block-universe approach. This theory is said to "take tense seriously" and is called the tensed theory of time. The theory claims that when we learn the truth values of certain tensed sentences we obtain knowledge that tenseless sentences do not and cannot provide, for example, that such and such a time is the present time—that it is now noon. Tenses are almost the same as positions in McTaggart's A-series, so the tensed theory is commonly called the A-theory of tense.
A second, contrary answer to the question of the significance of tenses is that they are merely subjective. Our saying the event happened rather than is happening indicates that we said this after the event happened rather than before. This theory is the B-theory of tense.
The philosophical disagreement here is not so much about tenses in the grammatical sense, but rather about the significance of the distinctions of past, present, and future which those tenses are used to mark. The main metaphysical disagreement is about whether times and events have non-relational properties of pastness, presentness, and futurity. Does an event have or not have the property of, say, pastness independent of the event's relation to us and our temporal location? The A-camp says it does; the B-camp disagrees.
On the tenseless theory of time, whether the death of U. S. Lieutenant Colonel George Armstrong Custer occurred here depends on the speaker’s spatial relation to the death event. Is the speaker standing at the battle site in Montana, or sitting in Paris? Similarly, whether the death occurs now is equally subjective. It depends on the speaker's temporal relation to the event. That is, is the speaker hearing this in 1876 at the time the death event occurs or instead hearing this in the 21st century?
This controversy is often presented as a dispute about whether tensed facts exist, with advocates of the tenseless theory objecting to tensed facts and advocates of the tensed theory promoting them as essential. The primary function of tensed facts is to make tensed sentences true, to be their "truthmakers." For purposes of simplifying the discussion, let us uncritically accept the correspondence of truth, that true sentences are true because they correspond to the facts.
The A-theory and the B-theory disagree about what are the sorts of facts that are the truthmakers of a true, tensed sentence such as “Queen Anne of Great Britain died.” The A-theorist says the truthmaker is simply the fact that the death is past, that is has pastness. The B-theorist gives a more complicated answer by saying the truthmaker is the fact that the time of Queen Anne’s death is-less-than the time of uttering the original sentence. Notice that the B-answer’s fact does not use any words in the past tense. According to the classical B-theorist, the use of tense (and more importantly, appeal to tensed facts) is an extraneous and eliminable feature of our language, as is all use of the terminology of the A-series.
If you, yourself had uttered “Queen Anne of Great Brain died,” then your utterance would be true. If Julius Caesar had uttered it, then his utterance would have been false. So, the truth value of the sentence is context-dependent.
The proponent of the tenseless or B viewpoint does not deny the importance or coherence of talk about the past, but will deny that what makes the tensed sentence true is that it corresponds to a tensed fact or that the event has the monadic property of presentness. Instead, argues the B-theorist, the truthmaker of the sentence involves only tenseless facts. For example, John's assertion that the event of Custer's death occurred in the past might best be analyzed by the B-theorist as asserting that the time of the event of Custer's death is-less-than the time of the event of John's assertion of the sentence. Notice that the description of the B-theory's truthmaker does not use the past tense.
This B-theory analysis is challenged by proponents of the tensed A-theory on the grounds that it can succeed only for utterances or readings or inscriptions, but a sentence can be true even if never uttered or read or inscribed.
There are other challenges to the B-theory. Roderick Chisholm and A. N. Prior claim that the word “is” in the sentence “It is now midnight” is essentially present tensed because there is no adequate translation using only tenseless verbs. Trying to give a B-style analysis such as, “There is a time t such that t = midnight” is to miss the essential reference to the present in the original sentence because the original sentence is not always true, but the sentence “There is a time t such that t = midnight” is always true. So, the tenseless analysis fails. There is no escape from this criticism by adding “and t is now” because this last indexical phrase needs its own analysis, and we are starting a vicious regress.
(Prior 1959) supported the tensed A-theory by arguing that after experiencing a painful event,
one says, e.g., “Thank goodness that’s over,” and [this]…says something which it is impossible that any use of a tenseless copula with a date should convey. It certainly doesn’t mean the same as, e.g., “Thank goodness the date of the conclusion of that thing is Friday, June 15, 1954,” even if it be said then. (Nor, for that matter, does it mean “Thank goodness the conclusion of that thing is contemporaneous with this utterance.” Why should anyone thank goodness for that?).
D. H. Mellor and J. J. C. Smart agree that tensed talk is important for understanding how we think and speak—the temporal indexicals are essential, as are other indexicals—but they claim tensed talk is not essential for describing extra-linguistic reality. These two philosophers, and other philosophers who "do not take tense seriously," advocate a newer tenseless B-theory by saying the truth conditions of any tensed declarative sentence can be explained without tensed facts even if Chisholm and Prior are correct that some tensed sentences in English cannot be adequately translated into tenseless ones. [The truth conditions of a sentence are the conditions which must be satisfied in the world in order for the sentence to be true. The sentence "Snow is white" is true on the condition that snow is white. More particularly, it is true if whatever is referred to by the term 'snow' satisfies the predicate 'is white'. The conditions under which the conditional sentence "If it's snowing, then it's cold" are true are that it is not both true that it is snowing and false that it is cold. Other analyses are offered for the truth conditions of sentences that are more complex grammatically.]
According to the newer B-theory of Mellor and Smart, if I am speaking to you and say, "It is now midnight," then this sentence admittedly cannot be translated into tenseless terminology without loss of meaning, but the truth conditions can be explained fully with tenseless terminology. The truth conditions of "It is now midnight" are that my utterance occurs at the same time as your hearing the utterance, which in turn is the same time as when our standard clock declares the time to be midnight in our reference frame. In brief, it's true just in case it is uttered at midnight. Notice that no tensed facts are appealed to in the explanation of those truth conditions.
Similarly, an advocate of the new tenseless theory will say it is not the pastness of the painful event that explains why I say, “Thank goodness that’s over” after exiting the dentist's chair. I say it because I believe that the time of the occurrence of that utterance is greater than the time of the occurrence of the painful event, and because I am glad about this. Of course I'd be even gladder if there were no pain at any time. I may not be consciously thinking about the time of the utterance when I make it; nevertheless, that time is what helps explain what I am glad about.
In addition, it is claimed by Mellor and other new B-theorists that tenseless sentences can be used to explain the logical relations between tensed sentences; they can be used to explain why one tensed sentence implies another, is inconsistent with yet another, and so forth. According to this new theory of tenseless time, once it is established that the truth conditions of tensed sentences can be explained without utilizing tensed facts, then Ockham’s Razor is applied. If we can do without essentially-tensed facts, then we should say essentially-tensed facts do not exist.
To summarize, tensed facts were presumed by the A-theory to be needed to be the truthmakers for the truth of tensed talk; but the new B-theory analysis shows that ordinary tenseless facts are adequate. The B-theory concludes that we should "not take tense seriously" in the sense of requiring tensed facts to account for the truth and falsity of sentences involving tenses because tensed facts are not needed. Proponents of the tensed theory of time do not agree with this conclusion. So, the philosophical debate continues over whether tensed concepts have semantical priority over untensed concepts, and whether tensed facts have ontological priority over untensed facts.
Space has no direction, but time does. We see this about space when we notice that a bell can be moved up and down, and left or right. We see this about time when we notice that the bell can be rung but never un-rung, that eggs become omelets but omelets never become eggs, and that a stone will splash into the river and sink but the stone will never rise from the river bed and un-splash. This overall asymmetry in the direction of all the world’s large-scale processes in time is the arrow of time.
The “problem of the arrow of time” is the problem of reconciling the existence of this general arrow of time with the fact that nearly all the basic laws of science in the micro-world do not reveal the arrow. They are time-symmetric. That means the process treats going forward in time no differently than it treats coming backward in time. To understand this, let's do a thought experiment. Suppose you could make a film of a few electrons and protons interacting. If you showed the film in reverse, this would be a film of physically possible activity, according to the micro-physical laws of electrons and protons. That is what it means for the laws of electrons and protons to be time-symmetric. Almost every micro-law is time-symmetric. B meson decay is not time-symmetric, but it seems to be irrelevant to the overall asymmetry of the arrow of time.
Ever since the problem of the direction of time was first described clearly by Josef Loschmidt in 1876 for the kinetic theory of gases, there has been considerable disagreement among the experts on how to solve it.
Let’s begin with the four least popular answers to the problem of time: (a) God wanted the world to have an arrow like this. (b) Everything exists in some possible world or other, and our world just happens to be the one in which things are this way, and that’s the only reason why. (c) It’s just a brute fact with no explanation. (d) It has a correct explanation, but the cognitive power of homo sapiens is too limited to ever figure it out.
The most popular answer to the problem of time’s arrow appeals to the claim that the arrow emerges from the overall chane of a system at low entropy to higher entropy. Entropy is a numerical measure of the overall change toward disorder in isolated macroscopic systems. This overall change is a change toward equilibrium. Equilibrium, the goal state or ground state, is the state in which the system's energy is uniformly distributed and the system is maximally disordered and at maximum entropy. Everything has run down, so to speak.
Ludwig Boltzmann discovered that entropy evolves toward higher entropy and ultimately to equilibrium because there are more microscopically-indistinguishable ways for energy to be spread out than for it to be more concentrated, so, as particles in a system move around and interact, they will be more likely to adopt configurations in which the energy is more spread out. We make the same point by saying high entropy means there are more ways to arrange a system’s particle constituents to produce a set of fixed values for the macroscopic properties of the system, and low entropy means there are fewer ways. In time, the system shifts toward what is more probable. This tendency of any isolated system to evolve toward equilibrium is described quantitatively by Boltzmann’s Second Law of Thermodynamics. The law says it is extremely unlikely for the entropy of any isolated, complex system to decrease. If a basic law has to say that certain states are definitely followed by certain other states, then the Second Law is not really a law, but only a statistical statement about states.
A molecule has no entropy. Entropy is not a property of a single particle, such as a molecule, but only of a macroscopic group of particles such as 1023 of them, which is about Avogadro’s number of them. At the macroscopic level we are “coarse graining” or looking only at higher-level properties of groups of particles such as heat or density or whether the group is an ice cube or a potato.
Not everything has to continually increase its entropy. A child loses entropy as it grows into adulthood, but it does this at the overall expense of entropy loss in a greater system, one that includes the Sun and its radiation toward Earth that provides photosynthesis for plants and indirectly food for the child. Isolate Earth from the Sun’s radiation, and all life will suffer damaging entropy increases.
Ludwig Boltzmann claimed to have derived the Second Law of Thermodynamics from Newton's laws of mechanics. Josef Loschmidt complained in 1876 about the paradoxicality of deducing the practically irreversible Second Law of Thermodynamics from the reversible laws of Newtonian mechanics. This complaint is difficult to answer, and the problem is now called "Loschmidt's Paradox." It is the thermodynamic version of the problem of the direction of time.
The most favored response to the paradox is that Boltzmann's derivation contains a hidden premise. If we were to apply his derivation not from the present to the future, as he did, but rather from the present to the past, then it would imply that entropy was higher in the past. Yet we happen to know entropy was not higher in the past. It was lower. So, Boltzmann failed to notice that his derivation had assumed a hidden premise: that entropy was lower in the past. This lower entropy in turn is due to entropy being even lower in the even more distant past, and so on back.
The Past Hypothesis is the assumption that in the past the state of the system was much lower during the intervening time. We need to add “in the intervening time” because, if we wait long enough—much longer than the current history of the universe—then anything can evolve into almost anything else; a field full of slaughtered chickens can evolve into a field full of living cows. The development of this idea about waiting long enough requires discussing the Poincaré Recurrence Theorem and its premise that the universe is finite in volume. If so, the theorem implies the universe will repeat any state it is ever in, so in a world obeying this theorem, any interval having an arrow of time has to be very short compared to the Poincaré recurrence time. However, the recurrence time is very, very much longer than the present history of the universe.
There is no corresponding future hypothesis needed to solve the problem of time’s arrow.
The Past Hypothesis a very special boundary condition about the beginning of the system. If the universe is the system we are interested in, then the Past Hypothesis is a cosmological hypothesis about the entropy at the time of the big bang.
Its philosophical implications are often overlooked. As Sean Carroll explains (Carrroll (2012), Lecture 12), the past hypothesis helps us explain why a photograph or a human memory is a reliable indicator of what happened in the past. Suppose we have a photograph of Donald Trump at his inauguration when he officially became president of the U.S. What is most likely to happen to that photograph in the future? We do not know exactly, but we do know that it very likely will crumble into separate molecules that are scattered throughout the universe. Should we say the same thing about its past, that the photo came from molecules that were scattered throughout the universe and that there was no actual inauguration event intervening? Yes, without the Past Hypothesis.
But with the Past Hypothesis we are justified in saying that the photo was caused by special lower-entropy conditions in the past, and ultimately in this way we can trace out the causal connection between the inauguration event actually happening and the creation of the photo of that event, with entropy decreasing during this interval. Without our knowing the Past Hypothesis is true, the best explanation of the origin of the photo is that it was assembled from separated molecules without an intervening inauguration event. Without the Past Hypothesis, it would be a mistake to infer from the photo that Trump was really inaugurated. This point is often overlooked by epistemologists.
If physical changes are all that is required for time to exist, and if the arrow of time is the overall directionality of macroscopic physical processes, and if the existing macroscopic physical changes were to be all random in the sense that any process is no more likely to go one way rather than the reverse, then there could be time without an arrow. There would be no clocks either.
A few philosophers respond to this reasoning by saying time's existence requires, by definition, some sort of arrow and some sort of clock.
Tim Maudlin adds to the discussion:
[T]he temporal structure of the world, independently of its material contents, has an intrinsic directionality. The later states of the world arise from, are produced from, the earlier states. This is independent of, e.g., the direction in which entropy increases. Even if the world were at thermal equilibrium, with constant entropy, still the later states would be produced from the earlier states in accord with the fundamental laws of physics.
His point is that time could exist without an arrow.
b. What Needs to be Explained
There are many goals for a fully developed theory of time’s arrow. It should tell us the answers to this constellation of issues: (1) why time has any direction at all; (2) whether there are two arrows, one having to do with how physical processes evolve, and one having to do with the temporal structure of the world independently of its physical processes; (3) why the arrow points one way rather than the reverse way; (4) why the micro-physical laws of science do not reveal the arrow, (5) how the arrow is connected with entropy, (6) why the arrow goes in the same direction in all galaxies; (7) why it is so probable that the entropy of an isolated system increases in the future rather than decreases even though the decrease is physically possible given current basic laws; (8) what it would be like for our arrow of time to reverse direction; (9) what are the characteristics of a physical theory that would pick out a preferred direction in time; (10) what the relationships are among the various arrows of time; (11) how entropy is connected with quantum entanglement, (12) why the Past Hypothesis is true, (13) whether the Past Hypothesis is needed, and (14) what it is that distinguishes the past from the present and future.
Historically, there have been two principal explanations of the arrow of time: (i) it is a product of causation which itself is asymmetrical; (i) it is a product of one-way entropy flow which in turn is due to the initial conditions of our universe.
Leibniz first proposed explanation (i), which is called the causal theory of time's order. Informally, we understand very clearly that causation has a direction. As Craig Callender expressed the point, if I wiggle something now it cannot affect where I was born, but it might affect where I will die. The philosopher Hans Reichenbach developed Leibniz's theory in more detail in 1928. He defined "happens before" by saying that event A happens before event B if A could have caused B, but B could not have caused A. The usefulness of this causal theory depends on clarifying the two notorious notions of causality and possibility without producing a circular explanation that presupposes an understanding of time order. Also, the causal theory should explain why, if we grant that there is causal asymmetry, the asymmetry is in one direction rather than in the inverse direction. Another difficulty for a causal theory of time is that it can succeed only for special relativity but not general relativity. General relativity allows two different spacetimes to have the same relations of causal connectibility among events. A causal theory cannot distinguish the two spacetimes.
21st century physicists generally favor explanation (ii), but there is some disagreement about the Past Hypothesis. Can the Past Hypothesis be justified or explained in more depth? Here are four responses to that question. (1) The initially low entropy is simply a brute fact—that is, there is no causal explanation for it. The physicist Richard Feynman suggested this response. (2) Objecting to inexplicable initial facts as being unacceptably ad hoc, the physicists Walther Ritz and Roger Penrose have said we need to keep looking for some basic, time-asymmetrical laws that will account for the initially low entropy. (3) A third perspective on the Past Hypothesis appeals to God's having designed the big bang to start with low entropy. (4) A fourth perspective appeals to the many-worlds interpretation of quantum mechanics in order to argue that since there have to be so many universes with different initial entropies, there certainly has to be one universe that is like our particular universe with its initially low entropy—and that is the only reason why our universe had low entropy at the beginning of the big bang.
To make one final point about entropy increase, in the early 21st century, M.I.T. professor Seth Lloyd suggested an original explanation for entropy increase: “What’s really going on [with the arrow of time pointing in the direction of equilibrium] is things are becoming more correlated with each other.” His point is that the increasing entropy in any process is really increasing quantum entanglement among the particles in that process. This does not explain, though, why things had less entanglement in the past.
Consider the difference between time’s arrow and time’s arrows. The direction of entropy change is the thermodynamic arrow. Here are some suggestions for additional arrows:
- Causes precede their effects.
- We remember last week, not next week.
- It is easier to know the past than to know the future.
- There is evidence of the past but not of the future.
- Our present actions affect the future and not the past.
- Possibilities decrease as time goes on.
- Radio waves spread out from the antenna, but never converge into it.
- Our universe expands in volume rather than shrinks.
- We see black holes but never white holes; objects fall into but never out of black holes.
- B meson decay, neutral kaon decay, and Higgs boson decay are each different in a time reversed world.
- Quantum mechanical measurement collapses the wave function.
- We age and never get biologically younger.
Most physicists suspect all these arrows are linked so that we cannot have some arrows reversing while others do not. The thermodynamic arrow, the arrow of entropy increase is the leading candidate for a unified explanation of all the arrows. Regarding the quantum mechanical arrow due to measurement collapse, according to the classical Copenhagen Interpretation of quantum mechanics, any wave function collapse is time asymmetric, but in the many worlds interpretation of quantum mechanics there is no collapse, only a split into alternate worlds.
Some physicists say the details of the linkage of the arrows is still an open question, so it is not yet completely clear whether or how the thermodynamic arrow underlies all other arrows.
Could the cosmic arrow of time have gone the other way? Most physicists agree that the answer is yes, and they say it would have gone the other way if the initial conditions of our universe at our big bang event had been very different. There could be initial conditions that make bells un-ring and people rise from their graves.
In 1902 in Appearance and Reality, the British idealist philosopher F. H. Bradley said that when time runs backwards compared to our current world, "Death would come before birth, the blow would follow the wound, and all must seem irrational." The Australian philosopher J. J. C. Smart disagreed about the irrationality. He said all would seem as it is now because memory would become precognition, so an inhabitant of a time-reversed world would feel the blow and then the wound.
G. J. Whitrow in The Natural Philosophy of Time, defended Bradley and argued that memory would not become precognition; his justification was that memory, by definition, is of whatever happens first, so, "all must seem irrational."
Temporal logic is the representation of reasoning about time by using the methods of symbolic logic in order to formalize which statements about time imply which others. For example, in McTaggart's B-series, the most important relation is the happens-before relation on events. Logicians have asked what sort of principles must this relation obey in order to properly account for our reasoning about time.
Here is one suggestion. Consider this informally valid reasoning:
Adam's arrival at the train station happens before Bryan's. Therefore, Bryan's arrival at the station does not happen before Adam's.
Let us translate this into classical predicate logic using a domain of instantaneous events, where the individual constant 'a' denotes Adam's arrival at the train station, and 'b' denotes Bryan's arrival at the train station. Let the two-argument relation Bxy be interpreted as "x happens before y." The direct translation of the informal argument produces:
(The symbol '~' is the negation operator; some logicians prefer to use the symbol '¬' for negation.) Unfortunately, this simple formal argument is invalid. To make the argument become valid, we should add the implicit premise that the B relation is asymmetric. That is, we need to add this additional premise to the argument:
∀x∀y[Bxy → ~Byx]
We might want to add this principle as an axiom into our temporal logic. (The symbol '→' is the conditional operator or if-then operator; some logicians prefer to use the symbol '⊃' instead.)
In other informally valid reasoning, we discover a need to make even more assumptions about the happens-before relation. For example, suppose Adam arrives at the train station before Bryan, and suppose Bryan arrives before Charles. Is it valid reasoning to infer that Adam arrives before Charles? Yes, but if we translate directly into classical predicate logic we get this invalid argument:
To make this argument be valid we need the implicit premise that says the happens-before relation is transitive, that is:
∀x∀y∀z [(Bxy & Byz) → Bxz]
The symbol '∀x' is the universal quantifier on x. The symbol '&' is the conjunction operator. Some logicians prefer to use '(x)' for the universal quantifier and either '∧' or '∙' for conjunction.
What other constraints should be placed on the B relation (when it is to be interpreted as the happens-before relation)? Here are some of the many suggestions: (1) ∀x~Bxx. An event cannot happen before itself. (2) In any reference frame any two events are related somehow by the B relation. There are no temporally unrelated pairs of events. (3) B is dense in the sense that there is a third point event between any two point events that are not simultaneous. This prevents quantized time. (4) ∀x∀y(Bxy → ~Byx). An event cannot happen both before and after some event. (5) ∀x∃yBxy. Time is infinite in the future.
The more classical approach to temporal logic, however, does not add premises to arguments in classical predicate logic as we have just been doing. The classical approach is via tense logic, a formalism that adds tense operators on propositions of propositional logic or predicate logic. The pioneer in the late 1950s was A. N. Prior. He created a new symbolic logic to describe our reasoning involving time phrases such as “now,” “happens before,” “twenty-three minutes afterwards,” “at all times,” and “sometimes.” He hoped that a precise, formal treatment of these concepts could lead to resolution of some of the controversial philosophical issues about time.
Prior begins with an important assumption: that a proposition such as “Custer dies in Montana” can be true at one time and false at another time. That assumption is challenged by some philosophers, such as W.V. Quine, who prefer to avoid use of this sort of proposition and who recommend that temporal logics use only sentences that are timelessly true or timelessly false, and that have no indexicals whose reference can shift from one context to another.
Prior's main original idea was to appreciate that time concepts are similar in structure to modal concepts such as “it is possible that” and “it is necessary that.” He adapted modal propositional logic for his tense logic. Michael Dummett and E. J. Lemmon also made major, early contributions to tense logic. One standard system of tense logic is a variant of the S4.3 system of modal logic. In this formal tense logic, the modal operator that is interpreted to mean “it is possible that” is re-interpreted to mean “at some past time it was the case that” or, equivalently, “it once was the case that,” or "it once was that." Let the capital letter 'P' represent this operator. P will operate on present-tensed propositions, such as p. If p represents the proposition “Custer dies in Montana,” then Pp says Custer died in Montana. If Prior can make do with the variable p ranging only over present-tensed propositions, then he may have found a way to eliminate any ontological commitment to non-present entities such as dinosaurs while preserving the possibility of true past tense propositions such as "There were dinosaurs."
Prior added to the axioms of classical propositional logic the axiom P(p v q) ↔ (Pp v Pq). The axiom says that for any two propositions p and q, at some past time it was the case that p or q if and only if either at some past time it was the case that p or at some past time (perhaps a different past time) it was the case that q.
If p is the proposition “Custer dies in Montana” and q is “Sitting Bull dies in Montana,” then
P(p v q) ↔ (Pp v Pq)
Custer or Sitting Bull died in Montana if and only if either Custer died in Montana or Sitting Bull died in Montana.
The S4.3 system’s key axiom is the equivalence, for all propositions p and q,
(Pp & Pq) ↔ [P(p & q) v P(p & Pq) v P(q & Pp)].
This axiom when interpreted in tense logic captures part of our ordinary conception of time as a linear succession of states of the world.
Another axiom of tense logic might state that if proposition q is true, then it will always be true that q has been true at some time. If H is the operator “It has always been the case that,” then a new axiom might be
Pp ↔ ~H~p.
This axiom of tense logic is analogous to the modal logic axiom that p is possible if and only if it is not the case that it is necessary that not-p.
A tense logic may need additional axioms in order to express “q has been true for the past two weeks.” Prior and others have suggested a wide variety of additional axioms for tense logic, but logicians still disagree about which axioms to accept.
It is controversial whether to add axioms that express the topology of time, for example that it comes to an end or doesn't come to an end; the reason usually given is that this is an empirical matter, not a matter for logic to settle.
Regarding a semantics for tense logic, Prior had the idea that the truth of a tensed proposition should be expressed in terms of truth-at-a-time. For example, a modal proposition Pp (it was once the case that p) is true at-a-time t if and only if p is true-at-a-time earlier than t. This suggestion has led to an extensive development of the formal semantics for tense logic.
The concept of being in the past is usually treated by metaphysicians as a predicate that assigns properties to events, but, in the tense logic just presented, the concept is treated as an operator P upon propositions, and this difference in treatment is objectionable to some metaphysicians.
The other major approach to temporal logic does not use a tense logic. Instead, it formalizes temporal reasoning within a first-order logic without modal-like tense operators. One method for developing ideas about temporal logic is the method of temporal arguments which adds an additional temporal argument to any predicate involving time in order to indicate how its satisfaction depends on time. A predicate such as “is less than seven” does not involve time, but the predicate “is resting” does, even though both use the word "is". If the “x is resting” is represented classically as P(x), where P is a one-argument predicate, then it could be represented in temporal logic instead as the two-argument predicate P(x,t), and this would be interpreted as saying x has property P at time t. P has been changed to a two-argument predicate by adding a “temporal argument.” The time variable 't' is treated as a new sort of variable requiring new axioms. Suggested new axioms allow time to be a dense linear ordering of instantaneous instants or to be continuous or to have some other structure.
Occasionally the method of temporal arguments uses a special constant symbol, say 'n', to denote now, the present time. This helps with the translation of common temporal sentences. For example, let Q(t) be interpreted as “Socrates is sitting down at t.” The sentence or proposition that Socrates has always been sitting down may be expressed in first-order temporal logic as
(∀t)[(t < n) → Q(t)].
Some temporal logics allow sentences to lack both classical truth-values. The first person to give a clear presentation of the implications of treating declarative sentences as being neither true nor false was the Polish logician Jan Lukasiewicz in 1920. To carry out Aristotle’s suggestion that future contingent sentences do not yet have truth values, he developed a three-valued symbolic logic, with each grammatical declarative sentence having the truth-values True, or False, or else Indeterminate [T, F, or I]. Contingent sentences about the future, such as, "There will be a sea battle tomorrow," are assigned an I value in order to indicate the indeterminacy of the future. Truth tables for the connectives of propositional logic are redefined to maintain logical consistency and to maximally preserve our intuitions about truth and falsehood. See (Haack 1974) for more details about this application of three-valued logic.
Different temporal logics have been created depending on whether one wants to model circular time, discrete time, time obeying general relativity, the time of ordinary discourse, and so forth. There is considerable interest in how to account for reasoning that presumes the existence of an open future, perhaps in a non-deterministic universe that branches from the present into many possible futures. For an introduction to tense logic and other temporal logics, see (Øhrstrøm and Hasle 1995).
The following questions are addressed in the Time Supplement article:
- What are Instants and Durations?
- What is an Event?
- What is a Reference Frame?
- What is an Inertial Frame?
- What is Spacetime?
- What is a Minkowski Diagram?
- What are the Metric and the Interval?
- Does the Theory of Relativity Imply Time is Part of Space?
- Is Time the Fourth Dimension?
- Is There More Than One Kind of Physical Time?
- How is Time Relative to the Observer?
- What is the Relativity of Simultaneity?
- What is the Conventionality of Simultaneity?
- What is the Difference Between the Past and the Absolute Past?
- What is Time Dilation?
- How does Gravity Affect Time?
- What Happens to Time Near a Black Hole?
- What is the Solution to the Twin Paradox (the Clock Paradox)?
- What is the Solution to Zeno’s Paradoxes?
- How do Time Coordinates Get Assigned to Points of Spacetime?
- How do Dates Get Assigned to Actual Events?
- What is Essential to Being a Clock?
- What does It Mean for a Clock To Be Accurate?
- What is Our Standard Clock?
- Why are Some Standard Clocks Better than Others?
- What is a Field?
- Barbour, Julian. The End of Time, Weidenfeld and Nicolson, London, and Oxford University Press, New York, 1999.
- A popular presentation of Barbour's theory that if we could see the universe as it is, we should see that it is static. It is static, he says, because his way of quantizing general relativity, namely quantum geometrodynamics with its Wheeler-DeWitt equation, implies a time-independent quantum state for the universe as a whole. He then offers an exotic explanation of why time seems to exist.
- Butterfield, Jeremy. “Seeing the Present” Mind, 93, (1984), pp. 161-76.
- Defends the B-camp position on the subjectivity of the present; and argues against a global present.
- Callender, Craig, and Ralph Edney. Introducing Time, Totem Books, USA, 2001.
- A cartoon-style book covering most of the topics in this encyclopedia article in a more elementary way. Each page is two-thirds graphics and one-third text.
- Callender, Craig and Carl Hoefer. “Philosophy of Space-Time Physics” in The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Science, ed. by Peter Machamer and Michael Silberstein, Blackwell Publishers, 2002, pp. 173-98.
- Discusses whether it is a fact or a convention that in a reference frame the speed of light going one direction is the same as the speed coming back.
- Callender, Craig. "The Subjectivity of the Present," Chronos, V, 2003-4, pp. 108-126.
- Surveys the psychological and neuroscience literature and suggests that the evidence tends to support the claim that our experience of the "now" is the experience of a subjective property rather than merely of an objective property, and it offers an interesting explanation of why so many people believe in the objectivity of the present.
- Callender, Craig. " The Common Now," Philosophical Issues 18, pp. 339-361 (2008).
- Develops the ideas presented in (Callender 2003-4).
- Callender, Craig. "Is Time an Illusion?", Scientific American, June, 2010, pp. 58-65.
- Explains how the belief that time is fundamental may be an illusion.
- Carroll, John W. and Ned Markosian. An Introduction to Metaphysics. Cambridge University Press, 2010.
- This introductory, undergraduate metaphysics textbook contains an excellent chapter introducing the metaphysical issues involving time, beginning with the McTaggart controversy.
- Carroll, Sean. From Eternity to Here: The Quest for the Ultimate Theory of Time, Dutton/Penguin Group, New York, 2010.
- Part Three "Entropy and Time's Arrow" provides a very clear explanation of the details of the problems involved with time's arrow. For an interesting answer to the question of whether any interaction between our part of the universe and a part in which the arrow of times goes in reverse, see endnote 137 for p. 164.
- Carroll, Sean. "Ten Things Everyone Should Know About Time," Discover Magazine, Cosmic Variance, online 2011.
- Contains the quotation about how the mind reconstructs its story of what is happening "now."
- Carroll, Sean. Mysteries of Modern Physics: Time. The Teaching Company, The Great Courses: Chantilly, Virginia 2012.
- A series of popular lectures about time by a renowned physicist with an interest in philosophical issues, but emphasizing the arrow of time.
- Damasio, Antonio R. “Remembering When,” Scientific American: Special Edition: A Matter of Time, vol. 287, no. 3, 2002; reprinted in Katzenstein, 2006, pp.34-41.
- A look at the brain structures involved in how our mind organizes our experiences into the proper temporal order. Includes a discussion of Benjamin Libet’s discovery in the 1970s that the brain events involved in initiating a free choice occur about a third of a second before we are aware of our making the choice.
- Dainton, Barry. Time and Space, Second Edition, McGill-Queens University Press: Ithaca, 2010.
- An easy-to-read, but technically correct, book. This is probably the best single book to read for someone desiring to understand in more depth the issues presented in this encyclopedia article.
- Davies, Paul. About Time: Einstein’s Unfinished Revolution, Simon & Schuster, 1995.
- An easy to read survey of the impact of the theory of relativity on our understanding of time.
- Davies, Paul. How to Build a Time Machine, Viking Penguin, 2002.
- A popular exposition of the details behind the possibilities of time travel.
- Deutsch, David and Michael Lockwood, “The Quantum Physics of Time Travel,” Scientific American, pp. 68-74. March 1994.
- An investigation of the puzzle of getting information for free by traveling in time.
- Dowden, Bradley. The Metaphysics of Time: A Dialogue, Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc. 2009.
- An undergraduate textbook in dialogue form that covers most of the topics discussed in this encyclopedia article.
- Dummett, Michael. “Is Time a Continuum of Instants?,” Philosophy, 2000, Cambridge University Press, pp. 497-515.
- A constructivist model of time that challenges the idea that time is composed of durationless instants.
- Earman, John. “Implications of Causal Propagation Outside the Null-Cone," Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 50, 1972, pp. 222-37.
- Describes his rocket paradox that challenges time travel to the past.
- Fisher, A. R. J. “David Lewis, Donald C. Williams, and the History of Metaphysics in the Twentieth Century.” Journal of the American Philosophical Association, volume 1, issue 1, Spring 2015.
- Discusses the disagreements between Lewis and Williams, who both are four-dimensionalists, about the nature of time travel.
- Grant, Andrew. "Time's Arrow," Science News, July 25, 2015, pp. 15-18.
- Popular description of why our early universe was so orderly even though nature should always have preferred the disorderly.
- Greene, Brian. The Hidden Reality: Parallel Universes and the Deep Laws of the Universe, Vintage Books, New York. 2011.
- Describes nine versions of the Multiverse Theory, including the Ultimate multiverse theory described by the philosopher Robert Nozick.
- Grünbaum, Adolf. “Relativity and the Atomicity of Becoming,” Review of Metaphysics, 1950-51, pp. 143-186.
- An attack on the notion of time’s flow, and a defense of the treatment of time and space as being continua and of physical processes as being aggregates of point-events. Difficult reading.
- Haack, Susan. Deviant Logic, Cambridge University Press, 1974.
- Chapter 4 contains a clear account of Aristotle’s argument (in section 9c of the present article) for truth value gaps, and its development in Lukasiewicz’s three-valued logic.
- Hawking, Stephen. “The Chronology Protection Hypothesis,” Physical Review. D 46, p. 603, 1992.
- Reasons for the impossibility of time travel.
- Hawking, Stephen. A Brief History of Time, Updated and Expanded Tenth Anniversary Edition, Bantam Books, 1996.
- A leading theoretical physicist provides introductory chapters on space and time, black holes, the origin and fate of the universe, the arrow of time, and time travel. Hawking suggests that perhaps our universe originally had four space dimensions and no time dimension, and time came into existence when one of the space dimensions evolved into a time dimension. He calls this space dimension “imaginary time.”
- Horwich, Paul. Asymmetries in Time, The MIT Press, 1987.
- A monograph that relates the central problems of time to other problems in metaphysics, philosophy of science, philosophy of language and philosophy of action.
- Katzenstein, Larry, ed. Scientific American Special Edition: A Matter of Time, vol. 16, no. 1, 2006.
- A collection of Scientific American articles about time.
- Krauss, Lawrence M. and Glenn D. Starkman, “The Fate of Life in the Universe,” Scientific American Special Edition: The Once and Future Cosmos, Dec. 2002, pp. 50-57.
- Discusses the future of intelligent life and how it might adapt to and survive the expansion of the universe.
- Krauss, Lawrence M. A Universe from Nothing. Atria Paperback, New York, 2012.
- Discusses on p. 170 why we live in a universe with time rather than with no time. The issue is pursued further in the afterward to the paperback edition that is not included within the hardback edition. Krauss' position on why there is something rather than nothing was challenged by the philosopher David Albert in his March 23, 2012 review of Krauss' hardback book in The New York Times newspaper.
- Kretzmann, Norman, “Omniscience and Immutability,” The Journal of Philosophy, July 1966, pp. 409-421.
- If God knows what time it is, does this demonstrate that God is not immutable?
- Lasky, Ronald C. “Time and the Twin Paradox,” in Katzenstein, 2006, pp. 21-23.
- A short, but careful and authoritative analysis of the twin paradox, with helpful graphs showing how each twin would view his clock and the other twin’s clock during the trip. Because of the spaceship’s changing velocity by turning around, the twin on the spaceship has a shorter world-line than the Earth-based twin and takes less time than the Earth-based twin.
- Le Poidevin, Robin and Murray MacBeath, The Philosophy of Time, Oxford University Press, 1993.
- A collection of twelve influential articles on the passage of time, subjective facts, the reality of the future, the unreality of time, time without change, causal theories of time, time travel, causation, empty time, topology, possible worlds, tense and modality, direction and possibility, and thought experiments about time. Difficult reading for undergraduates.
- Le Poidevin, Robin, Travels in Four Dimensions: The Enigmas of Space and Time, Oxford University Press, 2003.
- A philosophical introduction to conceptual questions involving space and time. Suitable for use as an undergraduate textbook without presupposing any other course in philosophy. There is a de-emphasis on teaching the scientific theories, and an emphasis on elementary introductions to the relationship of time to change, the implications that different structures for time have for our understanding of causation, difficulties with Zeno’s Paradoxes, whether time passes, the nature of the present, and why time has an arrow. The treatment of time travel says, rather oddly, that time machines “disappear” and that when a “time machine leaves for 2101, it simply does not exist in the intervening times,” as measured from an external reference frame.
- Lewis, David. "The Paradoxes of Time Travel." American Philosophical Quarterly, 13:145-52, 1976.
- A classic argument against changing the past. Lewis assumes the B-theory of time.
- Lockwood, Michael, The Labyrinth of Time: Introducing the Universe, Oxford University Press, 2005.
- A philosopher of physics presents the implications of contemporary physics for our understanding of time. Chapter 15, “Schrödinger’s Time-Traveller,” presents the Oxford physicist David Deutsch’s quantum analysis of time travel.
- Markosian, Ned, “A Defense of Presentism,” in Zimmerman, Dean (ed.), Oxford Studies in Metaphysics, Vol. 1, Oxford University Press, 2003.
- Maudlin, Tim. The Metaphysics Within Physics, Oxford University Press, 2007.
- Chapter 4, “On the Passing of Time,” defends the dynamic theory of time’s flow, and argues that the passage of time is objective.
- McTaggart, J. M. E. The Nature of Existence, Cambridge University Press, 1927.
- Chapter 33 restates more clearly the arguments that McTaggart presented in 1908 for his A series and B series and how they should be understood to show that time is unreal. Difficult reading. The argument that a single event is in the past, is present, and will be future yet it is inconsistent for an event to have more than one of these properties is called "McTaggart's Paradox." The chapter is renamed "The Unreality of Time," and is reprinted on pp. 23-59 of (LePoidevin and MacBeath 1993).
- Mellor, D. H. Real Time II, International Library of Philosophy, 1998.
- This monograph presents a subjective theory of tenses. Mellor argues that the truth conditions of any tensed sentence can be explained without tensed facts.
- Mozersky, M. Joshua. "The B-Theory in the Twentieth Century," in A Companion to the Philosophy of Time. Ed. by Heather Dyke and Adrian Bardon, John Wiley & Sons, Inc., 2013, pp. 167-182.
- A detailed evaluation and defense of the B-Theory.
- Nadis, Steve. "Starting Point," Discover, September 2013, pp. 36-41.
- Non-technical discussion of the argument by cosmologist Alexander Vilenkin that the past of the multiverse must be finite (there was a first bubble) but its future must be infinite (always more bubbles).
- Norton, John. "Time Really Passes," Humana.Mente: Journal of Philosophical Studies, 13 April 2010.
- Argues that "We don't find passage in our present theories and we would like to preserve the vanity that our physical theories of time have captured all the important facts of time. So we protect our vanity by the stratagem of dismissing passage as an illusion."
- Øhrstrøm, P. and P. F. V. Hasle. Temporal Logic: from Ancient Ideas to Artificial Intelligence. Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1995.
- An elementary introduction to the logic of temporal reasoning.
- Perry, John. "The Problem of the Essential Indexical," Noûs, 13(1), (1979), pp. 3-21.
- Argues that indexicals are essential to what we want to say in natural language; they cannot be eliminated in favor of B-theory discourse.
- Pinker, Steven. The Stuff of Thought: Language as a Window into Human Nature, Penguin Group, 2007.
- Chapter 4 discusses how the conceptions of space and time are expressed in language in a way very different from that described by either Kant or Newton. Page 189 says that t in only half the world’s languages is the ordering of events expressed in the form of grammatical tenses. Chinese has no tenses.
- Pöppel, Ernst. Mindworks: Time and Conscious Experience. San Diego: Harcourt Brace Jovanovich. 1988.
- A neuroscientist explores our experience of time.
- Prior, A. N. “Thank Goodness That’s Over,” Philosophy, 34 (1959), p. 17.
- Argues that a tenseless or B-theory of time fails to account for our relief that painful past events are in the past rather than in the present.
- Prior, A. N. Past, Present and Future, Oxford University Press, 1967.
- A pioneering work in temporal logic, the symbolic logic of time, which permits propositions to be true at one time and false at another.
- Prior, A. N. “Critical Notices: Richard Gale, The Language of Time,” Mind, 78, no. 311, 1969, 453-460.
- Contains his attack on the attempt to define time in terms of causation.
- Prior, A. N. “The Notion of the Present,” Studium Generale, volume 23, 1970, pp. 245-8.
- A brief defense of presentism, the view that the past and the future are not real.
- Putnam, Hilary. "Time and Physical Geometry," The Journal of Philosophy, 64 (1967), pp. 240-246.
- Comments on whether Aristotle is a presentist and why Aristotle was wrong if Relativity is right.
- Russell, Bertrand. "On the Experience of Time," Monist, 25 (1915), pp. 212-233.
- The classical tenseless theory.
- Rovelli, Carlo. Reality is Not What It Seems: The Journey to Quantum Gravity. Riverhead Books, New York, 2017.
- A look at time in the theory of loop quantum gravity.
- Russell, Bertrand. Our Knowledge of the External World. W. W. Norton and Co., New York, 1929, pp. 123-128.
- Russell develops his formal theory of time that presupposes the relational theory of time.
- Saunders, Simon. "How Relativity Contradicts Presentism," in Time, Reality & Experience edited by Craig Callender, Cambridge University Press, 2002, pp. 277-292.
- Reviews the arguments for and against the claim that, since the present in the theory of relativity is relative to reference frame, presentism must be incorrect.
- Savitt, Steven F. (ed.). Time’s Arrows Today: Recent Physical and Philosophical Work on the Direction of Time. Cambridge University Press, 1995.
- A survey of research in this area, presupposing sophisticated knowledge of mathematics and physics.
- Sciama, Dennis. “Time ‘Paradoxes’ in Relativity,” in The Nature of Time edited by Raymond Flood and Michael Lockwood, Basil Blackwell, 1986, pp. 6-21.
- A good account of the twin paradox.
- Shoemaker, Sydney. “Time without Change,” Journal of Philosophy, 66 (1969), pp. 363-381.
- A thought experiment designed to show us circumstances in which the existence of changeless periods in the universe could be detected.
- Sider, Ted. “The Stage View and Temporary Intrinsics,” The Philosophical Review, 106 (2) (2000), pp. 197-231.
- Examines the problem of temporary intrinsics and the pros and cons of four-dimensionalism.
- Sklar, Lawrence. Space, Time, and Spacetime, University of California Press, 1976.
- Chapter III, Section E discusses general relativity and the problem of substantival spacetime, where Sklar argues that Einstein’s theory does not support Mach’s views against Newton’s interpretations of his bucket experiment; that is, Mach’s argument against substantivialism fails.
- Sorabji, Richard. Matter, Space, & Motion: Theories in Antiquity and Their Sequel. Cornell University Press, 1988.
- Chapter 10 discusses ancient and contemporary accounts of circular time.
- Steinhardt, Paul J. "The Inflation Debate: Is the theory at the heart of modern cosmology deeply flawed?" Scientific American, April, 2011, pp. 36-43.
- Argues that the big bang Theory with inflation is incorrect and that we need a cyclic cosmology with an eternal series of big bangs and big crunches but with no inflation.
- Thomson, Judith Jarvis. "Parthood and Identity across Time," Journal of Philosophy 80, 1983, 201-20.
- Argues against four-dimensionalism and its idea of objects having infinitely many temporal parts.
- Thorne, Kip S. Black Holes and Time Warps: Einstein’s Outrageous Legacy, W. W. Norton & Co., 1994.
- Chapter 14 is a popular account of how to use a wormhole to create a time machine.
- Van Fraassen, Bas C. An Introduction to the Philosophy of Time and Space, Columbia University Press, 1985.
- An advanced undergraduate textbook by an important philosopher of science.
- Veneziano, Gabriele. “The Myth of the Beginning of Time,” Scientific American, May 2004, pp. 54-65, reprinted in Katzenstein, 2006, pp. 72-81.
- An account of string theory’s impact on our understanding of time’s origin. Veneziano hypothesizes that our big bang was not the origin of time but simply the outcome of a preexisting state.
- Whitrow. G. J. The Natural Philosophy of Time, Second Edition, Clarendon Press, 1980.
- A broad survey of the topic of time and its role in physics, biology, and psychology. Pitched at a higher level than the Davies books.
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