Time

clock2Time is what we use a clock to measure. Information about time tells us the durations of events, and when they occur, and which events happen before which others. Nevertheless, despite 2,500 years of investigation into the nature of time, there are many unresolved issues.

Consider this one issue upon which philosophers are deeply divided: What sort of ontological differences are there among the present, the past and the future? There are three competing theories. Presentists argue that necessarily only present objects and present experiences are real, and we conscious beings recognize this in the special vividness of our present experience compared to our dim memories of past experiences and our expectations of future experiences. So, the dinosaurs have slipped out of reality even though our current ideas of them have not. However, according to the growing-past theory, the past and present are both real, but the future is not real because the future is indeterminate or merely potential. Dinosaurs are real, but our future death is not. The third theory is that there are no objective ontological differences among present, past, and future because the differences are merely subjective. They come from us. This third theory is often called “eternalism.”

Here is a list of other issues, in no particular order: •What time actually is; •Whether time exists when nothing is changing; •What kinds of time travel are possible; •Why time has an arrow; •How to correctly analyze the metaphors of time’s flow and time's passage; •Which features of our ordinary sense of the word "time" should be captured by the concept of time in physics; •Whether contingent sentences about the future have truth-values now; •When time will end; •Whether tensed facts or tenseless facts are ontologically fundamental; •What the proper formalism or logic is for capturing the special role that time plays in reasoning; •Whether there are points of time, or only intervals; •What neural mechanisms account for our experience of time; •Whether time is objective or, instead, subjective and mind-dependent; •How else time is related to mind; •Whether there is a timeless substratum from which time emerges; •Why our universe has time instead of no time; •Whether time is unreal either by being an illusion or by being wholly conventional; •If time is not wholly conventional, then which aspects of time are conventional; and •How to settle the disputes between advocates of McTaggart's A-theory of time and his B-theory of time.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. How is Time Related to Mind?
  3. What is Time?
    1. The Negative Answer: Time is Not Real
      1. Because Time is Subjective
      2. Because Time is Conventional
      3. Because Time is Inconsistent
      4. Because Scientific Time is Too Unlike Ordinary Time
      5. Because Time is Emergent
    2. The Positive Answer: Time is Real
    3. Why is There Time Instead of No Time?
    4. Is Time Ever Circular?
    5. Does Time Have a Beginning or End?
    6. Does Time Emerge from Something More Fundamental?
    7. Which Aspects of Time are Conventional?
  4. What does Science Require of Time?
  5. Is Time Travel Possible?
    1. To the Future?
    2. To the Past?
  6. Does Time Require Change? (Relational vs. Substantival Theories)
    1. History of the Debate up to Kant
    2. History of the Debate after Kant
  7. McTaggart's A-Theory and B-Theory
  8. What is the Flow of Time?
  9. What are the Differences among the Past, Present, and Future?
    1. Presentism, the Growing-Past, Eternalism, and the Block-Universe
    2. Is the Present, the Now, Objectively Real?
    3. Persist, Endure, Perdure, and Four-Dimensionalism
    4. Truth-Values of Tensed Sentences
    5. Are There Essentially-Tensed Facts?
  10. What Gives Time Its Arrow?
    1. Time without an Arrow
    2. What Needs To Be Explained?
    3. Explanations or Theories of the Arrow
    4. Multiple Arrows
    5. Reversing the Arrow
  11. What is Temporal Logic?
  12. Supplements
    1. Frequently Asked Questions
    2. What Else Science Requires of Time
    3. Special Relativity: Proper Times, Coordinate Systems, and Lorentz Transformations (by Andrew Holster)
  13. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Philosophers of time would like to resolve as many issues as they can from the list of philosophical issues mentioned in the opening summary. Some issues are intimately related to others so that it is reasonable to expect a resolution of one to have deep implications for another. For example, there is an important subset of related philosophical issues about time that cause many philosophers of time to divide into two broad camps, the A-camp and the B-camp, because they are on the opposite sides of those issues.

Members of the A-camp often say that McTaggart's A-theory is the fundamental way to view time; events are always changing as they move farther away from the present, the now is objectively real and so is time's flow; ontologically we should accept either presentism or the growing-past theory; predictions are not true or false at the time they are uttered; tensed facts are ontologically fundamental rather than untensed facts; and the ontologically fundamental objects are 3-dimensional, not 4-dimensional. [All these ideas will be explained in more detail later.] Persons are considered members of the A-camp if they accept most of the above claims.

Members of the B-camp usually say instead that McTaggart's B-theory is the fundamental way to view time; events never undergo real change; the now is not objectively real and neither is time's flow; ontologically we should accept eternalism and the block-universe theory; predictions are true or false at the time they are uttered; untensed facts are more fundamental than tensed facts; and the fundamental objects are not 3-dimensional but rather 4-dimensional events or processes.

This article provides an introduction to the controversy between the A and B camps, as well as an introduction to other issues about time, for example the issue of the relationship between the "manifest image" of time and the scientific image of time. This is the relationship between time as it is ordinarily understood or intuitively believed and time as it is understood within science in the sense that any objective property of time is describable by the techniques of our fundamental physical science.

The manifest image contains the following beliefs about time: the world was not created five minutes ago; events occur at certain times; some events happen before others; events have durations; there is a present that everyone shares; time is independent of the presence and motion of matter; the future does not exist; and the present continuously flows into the past. Many of these features of the manifest image are not features of time as it is treated in contemporary physical theory. There is considerable controversy in the philosophical literature about whether a feature of the manifest image is not objectively real if it is not also in the scientific image.

2. How is Time Related to Mind?

Physical time is public time, the time that clocks are designed to measure. Biological time, by contrast, is indicated by an organism's various internal clocks or cyclic processes such as its heartbeats and repeated breathing and its sleep/wake cycle (circadian rhythm). It is also indicated by signs of aging. Psychological time is different from both physical time and biological time. Psychological time is private time. It is also called "subjective time" and "phenomenological time," and it is best understood not as a kind of time but rather as awareness of physical time. It can be helpful to think of psychological time as the time of the manifest image, and physical time as the time of the scientific image, although that characterization is more in line with the B-camp than the A-camp.

Physical time affects minds, but not vice versa. There is no experimental evidence that the character of physical time is affected in any way by the presence or absence of mental awareness or the presence or absence of any biological phenomenon. For that reason, physical time is often called "objective time."

When a physicist defines "speed" to be the rate of change of position with respect to time, the term “time” in that definition refers to physical time. Physical time is more fundamental than psychological time for helping us understand our shared experiences in the world, and so it is more useful for doing physical science; but psychological time is vitally important for understanding many mental experiences, as is biological time for understanding biological phenomena.

We don't need to look at a clock to detect time's existence. We notice time by seeing a leaf fall. Change indicates the presence of time—ordinary change in time, not, say, change in a tree's color from its gray trunk to its green leaves. But if we close our eyes, we still can encounter time by imagining the leaf fall. What all these encounters with time have in common is that we are having more experiences and accumulating more memories of those experiences. The leading explanation of why psychological time exists is the accumulation of memories.

What about time does we experience directly instead of indirectly? A common answer is that we directly experience the present moment, but only indirectly experience precedence, that the spilling of the milk preceded the milk's splashing on the floor. We infer the temporal precedence without directly experiencing it.

With the notable exception of Husserl, most philosophers say our ability to imagine other times is a necessary ingredient in our having any consciousness at all. We make use of our ability to imagine other times when we experience a difference between our present perceptions and our present memories of past perceptions. Somehow the difference between the two gets interpreted by us as evidence that the world we are experiencing is changing through time with some events succeeding other events. Locke said our train of ideas produces our idea that events succeed each other in time, but he offered no details on how this train does the producing.

Psychological time's rate of passage is a fascinating phenomenon to study. At the end of viewing an engrossing television program, we think, “Where did the time go? It sped by.” When we are hungry and have to wait until we can leave work and go to lunch, we might think, “Why is everything taking so long?” When we are younger, we lay down richer memories because everything is new. When we are older, the memories we lay down are much less rich because we have "seen it all before." That is why older people report that a decade goes by so much more quickly than it does for younger people.

Do things seem to move more slowly when we are terrified? "Yes," most people would say. "No," says neuroscientist David Eagleman, "it's a retrospective trick of memory." A terrifying event does seem to move more slowly when you think about it later, but not at the time it is occurring, he says. What is key about the terrifying event is that you remember so much more about it than about ordinary events. When you store richer memories for events, those events seem to you later to have lasted longer. Because memories of the terrifying event are "laid down so much more densely," or richly, he says, it seems to you, upon your remembering, that your terrifying event lasted longer than it really did as measured by a clock. For these events, remembered psychological time is stretched compared to physical time.

A major problem is to explain the origin and character of our temporal experiences. Philosophers and cognitive scientists continue to investigate, but so far do not agree on, either how we experience temporal phenomena or how we are conscious that we do. A pessimistic physicist, Julian Barbour, says, "I do not believe that science...will ever explain why we experience instants...." (Barbour 1999, p. 255)

Although the cerebral cortex is usually considered to be the base for our conscious experience, it is surprising that rats distinguish a five-second interval and a forty-second interval even with their cerebral cortex removed. So, a rat's means of sensing time is probably distributed throughout many places in its brain. Perhaps the human's time sense is similarly distributed. However, surely the fact that we know that we know about time is specific to our cerebral cortex. A rat does not know that it knows. It has competence without comprehension. A cerebral cortex is required for this comprehension.

Philosophers also want to know which aspects of time we have direct experience of, and which we have only indirect experience of. Is our direct experience only of the momentary present, the instantaneous present, as Aristotle, Thomas Reid, and Alexius Meinong believed, or instead do we have direct experience of what William James called a "specious present," a short stretch of physical time?

Among those accepting the notion of a specious present, the best estimate of its duration in physical time is less than a tenth of a second, about 80 milliseconds, although neuroscientists do not yet know why it is not two milliseconds or one hour. There is continuing controversy about whether the individual specious presents can overlap each other and about how the individual specious presents combine to form our unified stream of consciousness.

Neuroscientists have come to agree that the brain does take an active role in building a mental scenario of what is taking place beyond the brain. As one piece of suggestive evidence, notice that if you look at yourself in the mirror and glance at your left eyeball, then at your right eyeball, and then back to the left, you can never see your own eyes move. Your brain always constructs a continuous story of non-moving eyes. However, a video camera taking a picture of your face easily records your eyeballs' movements.

We all live in the past—in the sense that our brain takes time to reconstruct a story of what is happening based on the information coming in from our different sense organs. The story-building must wait those milliseconds until the brain acquires all the information from all the sense organs. The fact that a specious present includes activity for 80 milliseconds or so is why we can directly perceive motion at a moment, such as a tennis ball's being in flight. Our having a direct perception of motion during the specious present leads some philosophers to say we are thereby directly perceiving the flow or passage of time while other philosophers say we are thereby directly perceiving not the flow or passage of time but rather the existence of time.

Direct vs. indirect perception is probably just a matter of more or less mental processing per second. Seeing the ball is yellow is a direct perception. Seeing that it is presently moving is still direct but takes a bit more time and processing. Seeing that the racquet swinging began before the ball crossed the net is indirectly perceived and requires even more inference over more time. Direct vs. indirect perception is not really a matter of having sense data vs. making an inference about the data, as was once believed by epistemologists.

In the early days of television broadcasting, engineers worried about the problem of keeping audio and video signals synchronized. Then they accidentally discovered that they had around a tenth-of-a-second of "wiggle room." As long as the signals arrive within this tenth-of-a-second period, viewers' brains automatically will resynchronize the signals; outside that tenth-of-a-second window, it seems to viewers like a badly dubbed movie. (Eagleman, 2009)

The light from the bounce of a basketball arrives into our eyes before the sound arrives into our ears, but then our brain builds a story that the vision and sound of the bounce happen simultaneously. This sort of subjective synchronizing of vision and sound works for the bouncing ball so long as the ball is less than 100 feet away. Any farther and we begin to notice that the sound arrives more slowly.

In some of neuroscientist David Eagleman's experiments, he has shown clearly that a person can be tricked into believing event A occurred before event B, when in fact the two occurred in the reverse order according to clock time. For more on these topics, see (Eagleman, 2011).

The "time dilation effect" in psychology occurs when events involving an object coming toward you last longer in psychological time than an event with the same object being stationary. With repeated events lasting the same amount of clock time, presenting a bright object will make that event seem to last longer. Similarly for loud sounds.

Within the field of cognitive science, researchers want to know what are the neural mechanisms that account for our experience of time—for our awareness of change, for our ability to anticipate the future, for our sense of time’s flow, for our ability to place events into the correct time order (temporal succession), and for our ability to notice, and often accurately estimate, durations (persistence). Suppose you live otherwise normally within a mine for a while, and are temporarily closed off from communicating with the world above. You can keep track of whether it is night or day outside; you can give a good estimate of how long it will be until noon; you can keep track of how long you've been inside the mine; and you can do all three of these things simultaneously.

Neuroscientists and psychologists have investigated whether they can speed up our minds relative to a duration of physical time. If so, we might become mentally more productive, and get more high quality decision making done per fixed amount of physical time, and learn more per minute. Several avenues have been explored: using cocaine, amphetamines and other drugs; undergoing extreme experiences such as jumping backwards off a ledge into a net; and trying different forms of meditation. These avenues definitely affect the ease with which pulses of neurotransmitters can be sent from one neuron to a neighboring neuron and thus affect our psychological time, but so far, none of these avenues has led to success productivity-wise.

Philosophers of time and psychologists are interested in both how a person's temporal experiences are affected by deficiencies in their imagination and their memory and what kind of interventions in a healthy person's brain might control that person's temporal experience.

To mention one more issue about the relationship between mind and time, if all organisms were to die, there would be events after those deaths. The stars would continue to shine, but would any of these star events be in the future? This is a controversial question because advocates of McTaggart’s A-theory will answer “yes,” whereas advocates of McTaggart’s B-theory will answer “no” and say “Whose future?”

The issue of whether time itself is subjective, a mind-dependent phenomenon, is explored in another section of this article, where there is more commentary on the relationship between time and mind.

According to René Descartes' dualistic philosophy of mind, the mind is not in space, but it is in time. The current article accepts the more popular philosophy of mind that rejects dualism and claims that our mind is in both space and time because of appropriate functioning of our brain.

Einstein’s theory of relativity showed us that physical time depends upon the observer's reference frame. Unfortunately, some philosophers drew the conclusion from this that physical time is subjective, or dependent on the mind. This error is probably caused by Einstein’s overuse of the term “observer.” Einstein’s theory implies that the duration (the measure of the elapsed time) of a non-instantaneous event depends on the observer’s frame of reference, and so can be different for different observers. This was a revolutionary idea in physics, but what Einstein meant by “observer” is merely a perspective or reference frame or coordinate system from which measurements could be made. The “observer” need not have a mind. So, Einstein is not making a point about mind-dependence.

For our final issue about time and mind, do we humans have an a priori awareness of time that can be used to give mathematics on a firm foundation? In the early twentieth century, the mathematician and philosopher L. E. J. Brouwer believed so. Many mathematicians and philosophers at that time were suspicious that mathematics was not as certain as they hoped for, and they worried that contradictions might be uncovered within mathematics. Their suspicions were raised by the discovery of Russell’s Paradox and the introduction into set theory of the controversial non-constructive axiom of choice. In response, Brouwer attempted to place mathematics on what he believed to be a firmer epistemological foundation by arguing that mathematical concepts are admissible only if they can be constructed from an ideal mathematician’s vivid, a priori awareness of time, what in Kantian terminology would be called an intuition of inner time. Brouwer supported Kant's claim in the early 1800s that arithmetic is the pure form of temporal intuition. Brouwer tried to show how to construct higher level mathematical concepts (for example, the mathematical line) from lower level temporal intuitions, but unfortunately he had to accept the consequence that his program required both rejecting Aritotle's law of excluded middle in logic and rejecting some important theorems in mathematics such as the theorem that every real number has a decimal expansion and the theorem that there is an actual infinity as opposed to a potential infinity of points between any two points on a line (which is the key idea in the modern, standard solution to Zeno's Paradoxes). Unwilling to accept those inconsistencies with classical mathematics, most other mathematicians and philosophers instead rejected Brouwer's idea of an intimate connection between mathematics and time.

For a video presentation about psychological time, see (Carroll 2012) and (Eagleman 2011). For the role of time in phenomenology, see the article “Phenomenology and Time-Consciousness.” According to the phenomenologist Edmund Husserl, "One cannot discover the least thing about objective time through phenomenological analysis" (Husserl, 1991, p. 6).

The remainder of this article is devoted to physical time.

3. What is Time?

A metaphysician who asks, "What is a ghost?" does not want a definition of the word. What is wanted is a description of the most important features of ghosts, and knowledge of whether they exist and how they might be reliably detected if they do exist. We want something like this when we ask, "What is time?"
Here are three brief answers to the question.

(1) Time is an overall structure of events that has an arrow or directionality due to later states of the universe being produced from the earlier states.

This answer is saying what time is. It is not an attempt to define the word "time" with terminology not involving time.

(2) Physical time is what we intend to measure with a clock.

This answer is not as trivial as it might seem since it is a deep truth about our physical universe that it is capable of having a clock. We are lucky we live in a universe with so many different kinds of clocks: pendulums, oscillating electric circuits, rotations of our planet, decay of radioactive carbon 14, candles that burn at a predictable rate, and so forth. Clocks count repetitions of some process that is regular in the sense that each repetition of the process has the same duration. If it were just as likely for any process to go forward as to go backwards, then there could be no clocks.

(3) Time is what the time variable t is denoting in the best theories of fundamental science.

The three answers just given to the question, "What is time?" are informative. However, when philosophers ask the question, they normally do not want such a succinct answer. They want to be told more about the nature of time. They complain that the full nature of physical time can be revealed only by adding a philosophical theory of time that addresses the many philosophical issues that scientists do not concern themselves with.

So, let us continue to explore the nature of time. The exploration will presuppose a realist perspective on the scientific theories to be discussed ahead. That is, it interprets them to mean what they say, and it does not take a fictionalist perspective on them by considering their apparently ontological implications as being merely useful fictions.

Words, software, and songs are not physical objects although instances of them can be found in physical objects and processes. Similarly, time is not a physical object, but it can be found in the processes of physical objects. When we measure time, we are not intending merely to measure an object or substance. Time is composed of times, but a time is neither a process nor an event. So, if time actually exists, then we are measuring "something" that is abstract in the sense of being pervasive or global. It occurs everywhere. However, it is not universal; it is not the same for each person, which is a surprising implication of the theory of relativity.

Here are five important characteristics of time. (1) For any event, time fixes when it occurs. (2) For any event, it fixes that event's duration. (3) For any event, it fixes what other events occur simultaneously with it. (4) For any pair of non-simultaneous events, it fixes which one happens first. (5) It has an arrow pointing from past events toward future events.

The implication of the special theory of relativity is that the first four of these five characteristics are all relative; they can be different in different reference frames. Nevertheless, within a single reference frame, these are still key characteristics of time.

Relativity theory implies that part of the correct answer to the question "What is time?" is that it is a linear continuum of zero-duration instants. This implies that time is gap-free, and not discrete or granular.

continuous vs discrete

Being a continuum implies that the points of time, the instants, have the structure of the real numbers in their natural order rather than merely the structure of the integers. There is a next integer after three but not a next real number after three.

Physicists find it convenient to speak of instants as points of time, but there is a deep dispute about whether points of time actually exist, just as there is a similar dispute about whether spatial points actually exist.

Would it help, in answering the question, "What is time?" to have a precise definition of the word "time," the most common noun on the Internet? Shouldn't that be found before launching into an answer to what time really is? Well, this is an admirable project. The first step would be to clarify the difference between meaning and reference. The word "now" does not change its meaning every instant, but it does change its reference. Ordinary-language philosophers have carefully studied time talk, what Wittgenstein called the “language game” of discourse about time. Wittgenstein said in 1953:

For a large class of cases—though not for all—in which we employ the word ‘meaning’ it can be defined thus: the meaning of a word is its use in the language.

If the word "time" were a member of this large class, then by drawing attention to use, to ordinary ways of using the word "time," Wittgenstein would expect that we will be able to dissolve rather than answer most of our philosophical questions. Unfortunately, the word "time" probably is not a member of the large class that Wittgenstein is speaking of, and even if it were, most philosophers want to know much more than what "time" means. Philosophers of time are usually not interested in precisely defining the word but rather are interested in what time's important characteristics are and in resolving philosophical disputes about time that do not seem to turn on what the word means. For one example, they want to know about the relationship between the manifest image and the scientific image of time. For a second example, when Newton discovered that the fall of an apple and the circular orbit of the moon were both caused by gravity, this was not a discovery about the meaning of "gravity," but rather about what gravity is. Do we not want some advance like this for time?

a. The Negative Answer: Time is Not Real

When we ask, "What is Time?", we can take the route of explaining it or explaining it away. Consider the latter route.

We can see a clock, but we cannot see time, so how do we know whether time is real? You might think that time is real because it is what clocks are designed to measure, and because there certainly are clocks. The trouble with this reasoning is that it is analogous to saying that unicorns are real because unicorn hunters intend to find unicorns, and because there certainly are unicorn hunters.

The logical positivist Rudolf Carnap said, "The external questions of the reality of physical space and physical time are pseudo-questions" ("Empiricism, Semantics, and Ontology," 1950). He meant these two questions are meaningless because there is no way to empirically verify their answer one way or the other. Subsequent philosophers have generally disagreed with Carnap and have taken these questions seriously.

Nobody doubts that the concept of time has immense practical value, but there are serious reasons to believe time itself is not real. The major reasons are that time is unreal because (i) it is subjective, or (ii) it is merely conventional, or (iii) it is denoted by an inconsistent concept, or (iv) its scientific image deviates too much from its manifest image, or (v) it is emergent. Let's consider all these claims.

i. Because Time is Subjective

It has been claimed that time is not real because it is merely subjective. Psychological time is clearly subjective, but the focus now is on physical time. Any organism’s sense of time is subjective, but is the time that is sensed also subjective, a mind-dependent phenomenon, something that depends upon being represented by a mind? The point can be made by asking whether time comes just from us or instead is out there in the external world. Throughout history, philosophers of time have disagreed on the answer. Without minds, nothing in the world would be surprising or beautiful or interesting. Can we add that nothing would be in time?

Aristotle raised the issue of the mind-dependence of time when he said, “Whether, if soul (mind) did not exist, time would exist or not, is a question that may fairly be asked; for if there cannot be someone to count there cannot be anything that can be counted…” (Physics, chapter 14). He does not answer his own question because, he says rather profoundly, it depends on whether time is the conscious numbering of movement or instead is just the capability of movements to be numbered were consciousness to exist.

St. Augustine, clearly adopted a subjective view of time, and said time is nothing in reality but exists only in the mind’s apprehension of that reality.

ii. Because Time is Merely Conventional

Philosophers generally agree that humans invented the concept of time, but some argue that time itself is invented. It was created as a useful convention, like when we decided to use certain coin-shaped metal objects as money. Money is culturally real but not objectively real because it would disappear if human culture were to disappear, even if the coin-shaped objects were not to disappear.

Although it would be inconvenient to do so, our society could eliminate money and return to barter transactions. Analogously, Callender asks us to consider the question, “Who Needs Time Anyway?”

Time is a way to describe the pace of motion or change, such as the speed of a light wave, how fast a heart beats, or how frequently a planet spins…but these processes could be related directly to one another without making reference to time. Earth: 108,000 beats per rotation. Light: 240,000 kilometers per beat. Thus, some physicists argue that time is a common currency, making the world easier to describe but having no independent existence. (Callender 2010, p. 63)

In 1905, the French physicist Henri Poincaré argued that time is not a feature of reality to be discovered, but rather is something we have invented for our convenience. He said possible empirical tests cannot determine very much about time, so he recommended the convention of adopting whatever concept of time that makes for the simplest laws of physics. Nevertheless, he said, time is otherwise wholly conventional, not objective and not a natural kind.

iii. Because Time is Inconsistent

Bothered by the contradictions they claimed to find in our concept of time, Parmenides, Zeno, Spinoza, Hegel, and McTaggart said time is not real.

Zeno's Dichotomy Paradox and his Achilles Paradox can be used to argue that any continuous process such as a running race to the goal line must take an infinite amount of time, which is a paradoxical result. Zeno's Arrow and Stadium paradoxes can be used to argue that the concept of discontinuous change is paradoxical. Because both continuous and discontinuous change are paradoxical, so is any change. Therefore, time is not real.

The early 20th century British philosopher J.M.E. McTaggart believed he had a convincing argument for why a single event is a future event, a present event and also a past event, and that since these are contrary properties, our concept of time is inconsistent.

The early 20th century absolute-idealist philosopher F. H. Bradley claimed, “Time, like space, has most evidently proved not to be real, but a contradictory appearance…. The problem of change defies solution.

If any of the above arguments are successful, then the concept of time is essentially inconsistent, and time itself is not real.

iv. Because Scientific Time is Too Unlike Ordinary Time

If you believe that for time to exist it needs to have certain features of the manifest image of time, but you believe that science implies time does not have those features, you may be tempted to conclude that science has really discovered that time does not exist.

There is no doubt that the scientific image of time has rejected a great many of the features of our manifest image, as this article explains in the paragraphs ahead. Nevertheless, the two images do agree in important ways. Here are some examples. (1) The time dimension has a direction, unlike the space dimension. You can walk back to where you came from, but you cannot turn omelets back into whole eggs and milk. (2) Every event has a unique duration which can be assigned a measure such as its lasting so many seconds (or zero seconds for the instantaneous events). (3) Given any two events happening near each other, we can make sense of their occurring in some order or of their being simultaneous. We might not know their order, but we never conclude that they have no order. Despite these three examples of how the manifest image and the scientific image agree, the two images are radically different. Are there certain essential features of time's manifest image, none of which can be rejected by science without destroying the concept of time?

Kurt Gödel believed so. In the mid 20th century, he argued for the unreality of time as described by contemporary physical science because the equations of the general theory of relativity allow for physically possible universes in which all events precede themselves. People can, "travel into any region of the past, present, and future and back again" (Gödel, 1959, pp. 560-1). It should not even be possible for time to be circular like this, Gödel believed, so if we suppose time is the time described by relativity theory, then time is not real.

v. Because Time is Emergent

It has been argued that time is not real because it is emergent (or derivative rather than fundamental). In explaining the workings of a bicycle, we talk about the bicycle's spokes and tires and gears and handlebars and how they are arranged and how they work together. The bicycle emerges from the arrangement and working together of its spokes, tires, gears, handlebars, and other parts. Does time emerge in a similar manner? In explaining time, many philosophers claim that time can or someday will be understood as emerging from more basic phenomena. Many other philosophers, especially Newton, disagree and say time is fundamental and thus not emergent, so time is to be explained via how other phenomena depend upon time. Leading this debate, Leibniz argued time emerges from the order relations between pairs of events; Minkowski argued it emerges from spacetime; advocates of the theory of loop quantum gravity argue it emerges from quantum fields.

The English physicist Julian Barbour said, “I now believe that time does not exist at all, and that motion itself is pure illusion" (Barbour 1999, p. 4). "The here and now arises not from a past, but from the totality of things..." (p. 313). He then offered an exotic explanation (which won't be described here) of how nature creates the false impression that time exists. He argued that, although there does exist objectively an infinity of individual, instantaneous moments, nevertheless there is no objective happens-before ordering of them, no objective time order. There is just a vast, jumbled heap of moments (p. 37). Each moment is an instantaneous configuration (relative to one observer's reference frame) of all the objects in space. If the universe is as Barbour describes, then space (the relative spatial relationships within a configuration) is ontologically fundamental, but time is not, and neither is spacetime. In this way, time is removed from the foundations of physics and emerges as some measure of the differences among the existing spatial configurations.

b. The Positive Answer: Time is Real

Proponents of the objective reality of time offer responses to the above arguments.

(i) Regarding subjectivity, notice that our clock will tick in synchrony with other clocks even when no one is paying attention to the clocks. Second, notice the ability of the concept of time to help make such good sense of our evidence involving change, persistence, and succession of events. Consider succession. This is the order of events in time. If judgments of time order were subjective in the way judgments of being interesting vs. not-interesting are subjective, then it would be too miraculous that everyone can so easily agree on the temporal ordering of so many pairs of events.

W. V. O. Quine might add the point that the character of the objective world with all its patterns is a theoretical entity in a grand inference to the best explanation of the data of our experiences, and the result of this inference tells us that the world is an entity containing an objective time, a time that gets detected by us mentally as psychological time and gets detected by our clocks as physical time.

(ii) There are two primary reasons to believe time is not merely conventional: (1) There are so many one-way processes in nature. For example, mixing cold milk into black coffee produces cooler, brown coffee, but agitations of brown coffee will never turn it back into hotter black coffee with cool milk. The amalgamation of all these one-way processes is time’s arrow, and no human choice affects its existence. And time's arrow is a key feature of time itself.

(2) Our universe has so many periodic processes whose periods are constant multiples of each other over time. That is, their periods keep the same constant ratio to each other. For example, the frequency of rotation of the Earth around its axis, relative to the "fixed" stars, is a constant multiple of the frequency of swings of a fixed-length pendulum, which in turn is a constant multiple of the half-life of a specific radioactive uranium isotope, which in turn is a constant multiple of the frequency of a vibrating quartz crystal. The relationships do not change as time goes by (at least not much and not for a long time, and when there is deviation we know how to predict it and compensate for it). The existence of these sorts of constant relationships—which cannot be changed by convention—makes our system of physical laws much simpler than it otherwise would be, and it makes us more confident that there is some convention-free, natural kind of entity that we are referring to with the time-variable in those physical laws.

(iii) Regarding the inconsistencies in our concept of time that Zeno, McTaggart, Bradley, and others claim to have revealed, most philosophers of time will say that there is no inconsistency, and that the complaint can be handled by revising the relevant concepts. For example, Zeno's paradoxes were treated by requiring time to be a linear continuum, very much like a segment of the real number line. Yes, the mathematicians did change Zeno’s concept, but the change was very fruitful and not ad hoc.

(iv) If contemporary science were to say that the new scientific image of time has none of the intuitions about time that are contained in the manifest image, then everyone would agree that science has shown that time does not exist. But surely science has not required us to reject our intuition that some events happen in time before other events, and our intuition that some events last for a time. There is no agreement about which particular features of our manifest image of time cannot be rejected, although not all can be or else we would be rejecting time itself. Gödel's complaint about relativity theory's allowing for circular time has been treated by the majority of physicists and philosophers of time by saying he should accept that time might possibly be circular, and he needs to revise his intuitions about what is essential to the concept.

(v) Suppose time does emerge from events, or spacetime, or the quantum gravitational field, or Barbour’s moments. Does this imply time is not real? Most scientists and philosophers will answer "no" for the following reasons. Scientists once were surprised to learn from Ludwig Boltzmann that heat emerges from the motion of molecules, and that a molecule itself has no heat. Would it not have been a mistake to conclude from this that Boltzmann showed heat to be unreal? And when it became clear that footballs are basically a collection of atoms, and so footballs can be said to emerge from atoms, would it not have been a mistake to say footballs no longer exist?

String theory and loop quantum gravity are two leading, but as yet experimentally unconfirmed, theories of how to reconcile relativity theory with quantum theory. Loop quantum gravity describes phenomena occurring at the Planck scale. The Planck scale length is 10-33 centimeters. The principal equation of loop quantum gravity, the Wheeler-DeWitt equation, does not contain a time variable. If that theory were to be correct, then the implication would be that our concept of time is not basic and does not exist at that scale or below and emerges from more basic phenomena. But it will not follow that time does not exist at all, because the concept of time is already known to be so extremely useful at the larger scales of quarks and molecules and mountains and galaxies.

Most philosophers agree that time does exist, that the concept is objective rather than subjective, that it is not primarily conventional, that any inconsistency in time's description is merely apparent (or is not essential and can be eliminated), and that time is real regardless of whether it is emergent. Most philosophers just cannot agree on what time is, beyond agreeing to the three very brief answers given at the beginning of section 3.

Let’s explore some noteworthy answers that have been given throughout history to the question, “What is time?”

Aristotle claimed that “time is the measure of change” (Physics, chapter 12). He never said space is the measure of anything. Aristotle emphasized “that time is not change [itself]” because a change “may be faster or slower, but not time….” (Physics, chapter 10). For example, a leaf can fall faster or slower, but time itself cannot be faster or slower. In developing his views about time, Aristotle advocated what is now referred to as the relational theory when he said, “there is no time apart from change….” (Physics, chapter 11). In addition, Aristotle said time is not discrete or atomistic but “is continuous…. In respect of size there is no minimum; for every line is divided ad infinitum. Hence it is so with time” (Physics, chapter 11). The experts to this day are divided about whether to accept relationism and the continuity of time. The issue of relationism, which is the issue of whether time requires change, gets more extensive coverage in another section of this article.

René Descartes had a very different answer to, “What is time?” He argued that a material body has the property of spatial extension but no inherent capacity for temporal endurance, and that God by his continual action sustains (or re-creates) the body at each successive instant. Time is a kind of sustenance or re-creation ("Third Meditation" in Meditations on First Philosophy).

In the 18th century, Immanuel Kant said time and space are forms that the mind projects upon the external things-in-themselves; they are, to use his terminology, forms of human sensible intuition. He spoke of our mind structuring our perceptions so that space always has a Euclidean geometry, and time has the structure of the mathematical line. Kant’s idea that time is "the form of inner sense" and “is an a priori condition of all appearance whatsoever” is probably best understood as suggesting that we have no direct perception of time but only the ability to experience individual things and events in time. Some historians distinguish perceptual space from physical space and say that Kant was right about perceptual space. It is difficult, though, to get a clear concept of perceptual space.

Kant claimed to know a priori that space obeys the principle of Euclidean geometry. With the discovery of non-Euclidean geometries in the 19th century and Einstein's use of those geometries as descriptive of physical spacetime, the belief that synthetic truths about space and time are knowable a priori lost many advocates. In the twenty-first century, some synthetic a priori knowledge is still accepted by certain groups of philosophers, and considerably more philosophers accept that we have a priori beliefs, for example, "You shouldn't swallow it, if it tastes bad."

In the early twentieth century, the general theory of relativity gave a partial answer to our question, "What is time?" This theory implies gravity is any distortion of spacetime’s geometry, so a gravitational field warps time. Before Einstein, no one suspected there is such a deep connection between time and gravity. Details of this connection are discussed elsewhere in this article. General relativity also implies time is intimately linked to space, more specifically that time is a distinguished aspect or dimension of a more basic entity, spacetime.

In the early 20th century, Alfred North Whitehead said time is essentially the form of becoming, an idea that excited a great many philosophers, but not scientists.

An answer to the question, "What is time?" should take a stand on the issue of whether time is composed of instants or, instead, intervals. We mentioned earlier that a physics book will define time as a linear continuum of point instants, and the basic relationship between the instants is the happens-before relationship, called "precedence." Michael Dummett, in (Dummett 2000), provides an alternative to this treatment of time. He says time is a composition of non-zero periods rather than of instants. His particular model is constructive in the sense that it implies there do not exist any times which are not detectable in principle by a physical process, but many other treatments of interval-based time are not constructive. For the history of the dispute between instants and intervals, see (Øhrstrøm and Hasle 1995).

The above answers to "What is time?" do not exhaust all the claims about what time is, as we shall see.

c. Why is there Time Instead of No Time?

There is no agreed upon answer to why our universe contains time instead of no time, why it contains physical laws instead of no physical laws, and why it exists instead of does not exist, although there have been interesting speculations on all these issues.

One suggestion from proponents of the Multiverse Theory is that the reason why our universe exists with time and with the particular laws it has is that every kind of physically possible universe exists. Our single universe exists by means of a random selection process, by a process in which any physically possible universe inevitably arises as an actual universe, in analogy to how continual re-shuffling a deck of cards inevitably produces any possible ordering of the cards. To improve the analogy, one should suppose that there is no Supernatural Shuffler involved. There are related issues of philosophical interest. One is what it means to be physically possible if the laws of a multiverse can be different from ours since the term "physically possible" means "allowed by the laws of nature." A second is whether every universe that can exist really does. A third is how the Multiverse Theory is related to modal realism in which every universe that is logically possible actually exists. For an introduction to the various Multiverse Theories without considering the related issues just mentioned, see (Krauss, 2012, pp. 170 and 206).

d. Is Time Ever Circular?

Time is linear and not circular. At least there is no experimental evidence to doubt this. But the possibility cannot be ruled out.

If any part of time were circular, then, for that part, the future is also the past, and every event in that part occurs before itself. If your entire personal time or proper time were such a part, then the question would arise as to whether you lived through the circle an infinite number of times or only once. The argument that there would be only one cycle appeals to Leibniz’s Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles. According to this principle, each supposedly repeating state of the world would actually not repeat but would occur just once because each state would not be discernible from the state that recurs. [What is a state of the world? Classically, it is the positions of all the world's objects and the motions of those objects at some particular instant. In field theory, a state is the values of all the fields everywhere at some particular instant.] One way to support the idea of repeated occurrence of seemingly perfectly identical states would be to presuppose a linear ordering of the states in some "hyper" time so that each cycle is discernible from its predecessor only because it occurs at a different hyper time. That is, the cycles can be counted or ordered in hyper time. But there is no evidence of a hyper time. Another way to support the idea of repeated occurrence is to say that a person's proper time might be circular [more specifically, a closed timelike curve in spacetime] in our universe, but not from the perspective of the multiverse, and so from that perspective the number of times around the circle could be counted. The difficulty here is to make sense of the phrase "perspective of the multiverse." Most multiverse theories do not allow comparison of times between universes.

Even if the two scenarios (one repetition vs. an infinity of repetitions) are not discernible by the experimental data, there can be mathematically distinct descriptions of the two. Perhaps someday we may be able to choose between the two mathematical descriptions by relying upon something else about the nature of time, something, say, that would suggest time could not have a nature that allowed infinite repetitions.

Long before Einstein made a distinction between proper time and coordinate time, a variety of answers were given to the question of whether time is like a line or a circle. The concept of linear time first appeared in the writings of the Hebrews and the Zoroastrian Iranians. The Roman writer Seneca also advocated linear time. However, Plato and most other Greeks and Romans believed time to be cyclical, but this was not envisioned as requiring the birth of Socrates after his death. The Pythagoreans and some Stoic philosophers did adopt this drastic position. Aristotle's student Eudemus stood before his own students and said: “If one were to believe the Pythagoreans, with the result that the same individual things will recur, then I shall be talking to you again sitting as you are now, with this pointer in my hand, and everything else will be just as it is now” (Kirk & Raven, 1957: Fragment 272). Circular time was promoted in the Bible in Ecclesiastes 1:9: "That which has been is what will be, That which is done is what will be done, And there is nothing new under the sun." The idea was picked up again by Nietzsche in 1882. Scholars do not agree on whether Nietzsche meant his idea of circular time to be taken literally or merely as a moral lesson for us about how we should live our lives if each of us believed we would have to live it over and over.

Many Islamic and Christian theologians adopted the ancient idea that time is linear. Nevertheless, it was not until 1602 that the concept of linear time was more clearly formulated—by the English philosopher Francis Bacon. In 1687, Newton advocated linear time when he represented time mathematically by using a continuous straight line with points being analogous to instants of time. Kant argued that time exists and is linear as a matter of necessity. In the early 19th century in Europe, the idea of linear time had become dominant in both science and philosophy.

Nevertheless, there are many other possible structures for time besides linear and circular. Linear time could have an end or no end, and a beginning or no beginning. It could be like a figure eight. There could be two disconnected time streams, in two parallel worlds, and perhaps one would be linear and the other circular. There could be branching time, in which time is like the letter "Y". There could be a fusion time in which two different time streams are separate but then merge into one stream. Time might be two-dimensional instead of one-dimensional. However, it is generally believed that time does not have of this odd structure. What is more controversial is whether time is discrete or continuous. The majority view is that it is continuous, but an increasing minority disagree. For those physicists, if time is not continuous, that is, not a continuum, then their favorite lower limit on a possible duration is the Planck time of about 10-43 seconds. This would be the size of an atom of time.

e. Does Time Have a Beginning or End?

Time probably has a infinite future, but there is no consensus among scientists about whether the past is infinite.

There have been many speculations throughout history about the end of time, although most have contained serious ambiguities. For example, is the subject (a) the end of humanity, or (b) the end of life, or (c) the end of the world that was created by God, but not counting God, or (d) the end of all natural and supernatural change? Intimately related to these questions are two others: Is it being assumed that time exists without change, and just what is meant by the term "change"?

Regarding the beginning of time, in ancient Greece both Plato and Aristotle agreed that the past is infinite or eternal. Aristotle offered two reasons. Time had no beginning because, for any time, we always can imagine an earlier time. In addition, time had no beginning because, for any present situation, we always can ask for its prior, efficient cause. In the fifth century, Augustine disagreed with Aristotle and said the past is finite.

Martin Luther estimated the universe to have begun in 4,000 B.C.E. Then Johannes Kepler estimated it began in 4,004 B.C.E. The Calvinist James Ussher calculated from the Bible that the world began in 4,004 B.C.E. on Friday, October 28.

In about 1700, Isaac Newton claimed future time is infinite and that, although God created the material world some finite time ago, there was an infinite period of past time before that. His position was accepted for many centuries in the West.

Advances in geology eventually refuted all the small estimates that the universe was created in about 4,000 B.C.E.

Almost all contemporary physicists accept the big bang theory that was developed during the twentieth century. It places a definite minimum on the amount of past time, approximately 13.8 billion years. There is no known evidence that contradicts the theory. The big bang theory says our universe was once very small, hot and dense, and it has expanded into its large, cool and less dense state we know today.

Our universe has been expanding and cooling ever since the beginning of the big bang. When the universe cooled below 1010 degrees, individual particles could form into atomic nuclei. When it cooled below 10,000 degrees, individual electrons and atomic nuclei could form into atoms. This was about 380,000 years after the big bang. Later, as the expansion continued, many atoms clumped into stars and galaxies, eventually producing the universe of today.

In the 1960s, assuming the general theory of relativity, Roger Penrose and Stephen Hawking proved that the origin of any expanding universe (such as the one required by the big bang theory) is a singularity, a point in time when the universe had zero volume and infinite density. Looking backward in time, it would be natural to say the singularity is where spacetime terminates. This singularity, if there were such a thing, is considered to be at time t = 0 in discussions about the big bang.

The Penrose and Hawking proof left out quantum theory. Because of confidence that a correct theory of origins needs to incorporate quantum theory, hardly any twenty-first century physicist believes our universe arose from a singularity, nor even that the first event, if there was one, was at t = 0, but nearly every physicist agrees that the universe once had an extremely tiny volume. Physicists also generally agree that the concept of time described by the theory of general relativity is not an appropriate concept to use during the Planck epoch, the period from the hypothetical initial singularity at t = 0 until approximately 10-43 seconds afterwards. It is not appropriate because there is no accepted physical theory involving both relativity and quantum mechanics that can make sense of time during that epoch. There has been much speculation that, during this period, time was more like a space dimension than a time dimension.

Because the big bang is an explosion of space and not of matter-energy into a pre-existing space, and because an expansion of space carries all its objects with it, the separation between some galaxies after the big bang surely increased faster than the speed of light. Here is an analogy. Think of clusters of galaxies as raisins. They are distributed throughout uncooked bread dough. The raisins could move away from each other with some relative velocity, but they are not moving; they are just sitting there in the dough. There is a second way for raisins to have a relative velocity. Start baking the raisin bread, and the raisins will start increasing their relative distance from each other. This increasing separation most everywhere is why astronomers can see about 45 billion light years in any direction even though the visible universe is only 14 billion years old. The deeper issue of why the big bang theory should be interpreted as an expansion of space and not of matter and energy into a pre-existing space is discussed in the big bang section of a supplement to this article.

When contemporary physicists speak of the age of our universe and of the time since our big bang, they are implicitly referring to cosmic time, the time in a reference frame in which the average motion of the galaxies is stationary. They are not assuming an arbitrary reference frame, nor one in which the Earth is stationary. To say this another way, cosmic time is time as measured locally by a clock that is sitting still while the universe expands around it, so its only velocity is due to drifting along with the Hubble expansion of space.

Because of the average homogeneity of matter throughout our visible universe, wherever you are you will judge that the 1011 galaxies in the visible universe are on average moving away from you. Also, no matter where you are you will calculate the same age for the big bang.

The most popular version of the big bang theory is inflation theory, which implies that, when our universe had an extremely tiny size, its expansion rate suddenly inflated, that is, increased dramatically. Earlier, for some unknown reason, it contained an unstable inflaton field. This field underwent a spontaneous phase transition (analogous to liquid water turning to ice) causing its region of highly repulsive material to inflate exponentially in volume for a short time, from approximately 10-37 after t = 0 until approximately 10-32 seconds after t = 0. During this primeval inflationary epoch, the inflaton field's stored, negative gravitational energy was released; all space wildly expanded; and the universe's volume doubled every 10-35 seconds. At the end of this early inflationary epoch, the highly repulsive material decayed, and the universe's expansion rate settled down to just below the rate of expansion we find in the universe today.

In 1998, it was discovered that the expansion rate is increasing again due to the repulsive influence of another material, dark energy. This expansion rate is also exponential but it is much slower than during the inflationary epoch. This expansion was cosmologically negligible until about five billion years ago.

The most widely accepted version of inflationary theory is called eternal inflation because, although the exponential inflation in any specific region eventually stops, the exponential inflation continues elsewhere forever. It has stopped in our region, a region that is commonly called "our universe."

Most advocates of eternal inflation theory accept the controversial multiverse theory that our particular big bang event is merely one among many other big bang events occurring elsewhere both before and after our big bang. These universes (called bubble universes and pocket universes) occurred and continue to occur within a background space that is filled with energy and that is rapidly inflating as fast as our own primeval inflation. The visible bubble caused by our big bang is commonly called the Hubble Bubble. Each bubble universe need not be shaped like a bubble having a closed geometry like a hyper sphere. The bubbles can have different geometries.

In the most popular version of the multiverse theory, the inflation goes on forever elsewhere—so, future time is infinite. Every bubble has a finite past, so the inflation might not have been occurring forever. This does not imply necessarily that the universe (or multiverse) itself began with some first bubble, but many cosmologists believe the multiverse did begin then. However, there is no consensus on this.

The likely philosophical implications of eternal inflation are that (i) everything that can happen will happen, (ii) future time is countably infinite, (iii) the universe has no maximum entropy, and (iv) there are no Poincaré cycles requiring the universe to return infinitesimally close to every one of its earlier states.

The big bang theory with or without inflation fails to solve the origins problem. The theory does not tell us what happened during the Planck epoch, nor what happened at or before t = 0.

The big bang theory with the multiverse amendment also so far fails to solve the measure problem. It implies that anything allowed by the laws of science will eventually happen a countably infinite number of times. That prevents physicists from justifying a claim that universes with feature x are more probable than universes with feature y. Here 'x' might refer to "having living creatures."

Because of the lack of experimental evidence for the multiverse theory and for string theory, many physicists complain that their fellow physicists who are developing these theories are doing technical metaphysics, not physics. See (Greene, 2011) for a popular discussion of the different multiverse theories.

Here is a summary of some serious suggestions by twenty-first century cosmologists about our future:

  • Big Chill (eternal expansion of space)
  • Big Crunch (eventually the current expansion stops and the universe contracts to a state much like when the big bang began)
  • Big Rip (Every system of particles is ripped apart, and the expansion rate rapidly approaches infinity)
  • Big Snap (the fabric of space suddenly reveals a lethal granular nature when stretched too much)
  • Death Bubbles (some regions of space will turn into lethal bubbles that expand at the speed of light, destroying everything else)

The first alternative is the most popular. It implies an extremely cold future because of the increasing dilution of the matter-energy throughout the universe. It also implies a dark future as nearby galaxies eventually drift away from us faster than the speed of light.

f. Does Time Emerge from Something More Fundamental?

Is time a basic feature of nature, or does it emerge from more basic timeless features?

The classical relationists such as Leibniz argued that time emerges from events, and if there were no events, then there would be no time. This metaphysical position is called relationism. The substantivalists such as Newton said time is basic and not emergent, and this position was the majority position among scientists until the confirmation of the theory of relativity. Relativity theory suggested to most researchers in the first half of the 20th century that time emerges from spacetime.

Philosophers use the term “A emerges from B” in different senses: A is fully definable in terms of B, A is reducible in some form to B, and A supervenes upon B; overlook the use-mention error in this list. The latter is the weakest sense of emergence. Saying "sound in the air supervenes on movement of the air molecules" is a technical way of saying that there can be no changes in the sound without some changes in the movement of the air molecules.

Hermann Minkowski argued in 1908 that spacetime is more basic than time, and this is generally well accepted. However, is this spacetime itself basic or emergent? That is controversial.

Many physicists working in the field of quantum gravity suspect that resolving the contradiction between quantum theory and gravitational theory will require forcing spacetime and thus time to emerge from some more basic timeless substrate below the level of the Planck length and the Planck time. However, there is no empirical evidence of this, nor any agreed-upon theory of what the substrate is, other than that it is some sort of quantum gravitational field.

Earlier it was noted that the physicist Julian Barbour speculated that space is fundamental, but time is not. Other physicists speculate that time is fundamental but space is not. In 2004, after winning the Nobel Prize in physics, David Gross expressed that viewpoint:

Everyone in string theory is convinced…that spacetime is doomed. But we don’t know what it’s replaced by. We have an enormous amount of evidence that space is doomed. We even have examples, mathematically well-defined examples, where space is an emergent concept…. But in my opinion the tough problem that has not yet been faced up to at all is, “How do we imagine a dynamical theory of physics in which time is emergent?” …All the examples we have do not have an emergent time. They have emergent space but not time. It is very hard for me to imagine a formulation of physics without time as a primary concept because physics is typically thought of as predicting the future given the past. We have unitary time evolution. How could we have a theory of physics where we start with something in which time is never mentioned?

The discussion in this section about whether time is ontologically basic has no implications for whether the word “time” is semantically basic, nor for whether the concept of time is basic to concept formation.

g. Which Aspects of Time are Conventional?

The issue of whether time itself is wholly conventional has already been discussed above, but let’s consider what specific aspects of time are conventional, and then discuss what aspects of time’s measurement are conventional.

The transitivity of time order within a single reference frame is not a convention. If event 1 happens before event 2, and event 2 happens before event 3, then event 1 also happens before event 3. This transitivity seems not to be merely a human convention, but rather a general feature of change that "forces itself upon us."

Simultaneity is an aspect of time that is conventional because of the relativity of simultaneity in the theory of special relativity. Physicists generally consider statements that are objective and so not conventional to be invariant under change of reference frame, and vice versa. According to the special theory of relativity, two events which are simultaneous in one reference might not be simultaneous in a different reference frame moving with respect to the first frame. It is only by convention that we fix on one specific reference frame and from within it we declare which pairs of events are simultaneous. This relativity of simultaneity shows that simultaneity is conventional.

Because the spacetime of general relativity is curved, unlike in special relativity, simultaneity holds in general relativity only locally, in the infinitesimally-sized regions of spacetime where the special theory is true.

Let’s turn now from what aspects of time are conventional to what aspects of time’s measurement are conventional, in special relativity. The duration between two events A and B is conventional in the sense that if neither could have had a causal effect on the other, then physicists can always choose a reference frame in which A and B are simultaneous, so the duration between them is zero. However, once a frame is chosen, this fixes the duration between all pairs of events.

It is merely a matter of convention that what time it is changes by one hour as we cross into a new time-zone. It is an arbitrary convention that there are twenty-four hours in a day instead of twenty-three, that no week fails to contain a Tuesday, and that a second lasts as long as it is defined to last.

Consider the ordinary way we use a clock to measure how long an event lasts. We adopt the following metric or method: Take the time of the instant at which the event ends, and subtract the time of the instant at which the event starts. For example, to find how long an event lasts that starts at 3:00 and ends at 5:00, we subtract and get the answer of two hours. Is the use of this method merely a convention, or in some objective sense is it the only way that a clock should be used? That is, is there an objective metric, or is time "metrically amorphous"? Perhaps the duration between instants x and y could be

|log(y/x)|

instead of the ordinary

|y - x|.

The trouble with this log metric is that, for any three events x, y, and z, if t(x) < t(y) < t(z), then surely we demand that the duration from x to y plus the duration from y to z be equal to the duration from x to z. However, the log metric does not have this property.

Our civilization designs a clock to count up to higher numbers rather than down to lower numbers as time elapses. Is that a convention? Could the second hand go counterclockwise instead of clockwise? Yes. In fact, when Westerners talk about centuries they agree to use both A.D. and B.C.E. The laws of physics involving time t are unchanged regardless of whether the t is measured in B.C.E. years or A.D. years. The clock on their wall always counts up, but that is merely because they all agree we are in the A.D. era, so they have very little need for a clock that counts in years or seconds of B.C.E. A similar point applies to measures of time that use the origin of the time coordinate to be a Muhammed event instead of a Jesus event.

For a philosophically deeper and thus more controversial point about convention, consider this question. Our society's standard clock tells everyone what time it really is. Can our standard clock be inaccurate? Yes, say the objectivists about the standard clock. No, say the conventionalists who claim the standard clock is accurate by convention; if it acts strangely, then all clocks must act strangely in order to stay in synchrony with the standard clock. A closely related question is whether, when we change our standard clock, we are merely adopting constitutive conventions for our convenience, or in some objective sense we are making a more, or less, correct choice.

There is an ongoing philosophical dispute about the extent to which there is an element of conventionality in Einstein’s notion of two separated events happening at the same time, an issue discussed a few paragraphs ago. The philosopher Hans Reichenbach said that to define simultaneity in a single reference frame in special relativity you must adopt a convention about how fast light travels going one way as opposed to coming back (or going any other direction). He recommended adopting the convention that light travels the same speed in all directions (in a vacuum free of the influence of gravity). He claimed it must be a convention because there is no way to measure whether the speed is really the same in opposite directions since any measurement of the two speeds between two locations requires first having synchronized clocks at those two locations, yet the synchronization process will presuppose whether the speed is the same in both directions. The philosophers B. Ellis and P. Bowman in 1967, and D. Malament in 1977, gave different reasons why Reichenbach is mistaken. Once again, this discussion presumes special relativity and not general relativity. For an introduction to this dispute, see the Frequently Asked Questions. For more discussion, see (Callender and Hoefer 2002).

It would be very helpful to physics if there were a convention we could accept that would allow for a "cosmic time" in which any two events could be said to be connected in the sense that either they are simultaneous or one happens first or the other happens first. In general relativity, simultaneity does not always make sense globally; but it always does make sense in infinitesimally small regions where the special theory of relativity is true. Nevertheless, if we sacrifice the relativity of simultaneity and adopt the convention of using only one very special coordinate system, then sense can be made of simultaneity across the universe. The special coordinate system needs to be very curvilinear and "patched". In some models of general relativity, which might apply to our universe, curving spacetime can be exhaustively partitioned into non-intersecting “bumpy” three-dimensional sheets of simultaneous events, where each sheet is locally perpendicular to time-like geodesics. (Geodesics in spacetime are the free-fall world lines.) The bumps are due to local curvature associated with the presence of nearby matter. Einstein’s method of operationally defining simultaneity at a distance cannot be applied globally. Nevertheless, by accepting the convention that we will use only this special coordinate system, we can make sense of saying that, all the events in one sheet throughout the universe happen simultaneously.

There is a convention that, if adopted, makes physics much simpler. Place the origin of our global coordinate frame at a place where the light (which has now turned to heat) generated by the big bang arrives with the same intensity or temperature from all directions. Astrophysicists have found this best place for the origin. (Davies 1995, pp. 128-9) describes this place:

Although the view from Earth is of a slightly skewed cosmic heat bath, there must exist a motion, a frame of reference, which would make the bath appear exactly the same in every direction. It would in fact seem perfectly uniform from an imaginary spacecraft traveling at 350 km per second in a direction away from Leo (towards Pisces, as it happens)…. We can use this special clock to define a cosmic time…. Fortunately, the Earth is moving at only 350 km per second relative to this hypothetical special clock. This is about 0.1 per cent of the speed of light, and the time-dilation factor is only about one part in a million. Thus to an excellent approximation, Earth’s historical time coincides with cosmic time, so we can recount the history of the universe contemporaneously with the history of the Earth, in spite of the relativity of time.

Cosmologists presuppose this reference frame when they make remarks such as, “The big bang began 13.8 billion years ago.”

4. What does Science Require of Time?

At the beginning of the 20th century, the appearance of the theories of relativity and the big bang transformed the investigation of time from a primarily speculative and metaphysical investigation into one that occupied scientists in their professional journals.

The big bang theory places demands on the amount of past time there must be, about 13.8 billion years.

The fundamental laws of science do not pick out a present time. Scientists frequently do apply some law of science while assigning, say, t0 to be the temporal coordinate of the present moment, then they go on to calculate this or that. This insertion of the fact that t0 is the present time is an initial condition of the situation to which the law is being applied, and is not part of the law itself. The basic laws themselves treat all times equally.

In a spacetime obeying the theory of relativity, there is always a maximum possible speed for objects moving through space, a maximum ratio of distance covered, divided by time elapsed. This was one of Einstein's discoveries.

All the fundamental physical theories have symmetry under time-translation and time-reversal (or at least CPT reversal). If a theory has time-translation symmetry, then the laws of the theory do not change as time goes by. It follows that the law of gravitation in the 21st century is the same law of gravitation that held one thousand centuries ago. Note we are talking about the same laws, not the same events. Next century's sports scores will not be the same as this century's. Time-reversal symmetry implies that if you make a film of some process, then run the film backwards, the film still describes a process allowed by the laws.

Science places special requirements on the structure of time. For instance, physicists need to speak of one event happening pi seconds after another, and of one event happening the square root of three seconds before another. In ordinary discourse outside of science, we would never need this kind of detail. This need has led to requiring time to be a linear continuum. Any linear continuum has the same structure as the real numbers in their natural order. It follows from this that physical theories treat time as being somewhat like another spatial dimension, and it follows that time is one-dimensional and not two-dimensional. Time has this structure even in quantum theory. Quantum theory does not quantize time.

An instantaneous event at one place is said to be a "point" event. If we add a reference system to the space, we can name the point event. A reference system is just a perspective plus a coordinate system on the space and time. A typical coordinate system used in contemporary physics is a continuous labeling of events with real numbers. In this way, we can say a specific point event has just one temporal coordinate t1, with t1 being some real number, and we can say that at this time the event has just one spatial location coordinate <x1, y1, z1>, which is an ordered triple of real numbers, assuming we are assigning coordinates within a Cartesian coordinate system. By saying time has real-valued coordinates, we are implying that time's instants are gap-free and so densely packed that there is no next coordinate after t1, and we are implying that between any two different temporal coordinates, there is an aleph-one infinite number of other coordinates. The sciences have found no need to model time more densely than this, with, say, the hyperreal or surreal numbers. Nor is there any need to model time with two dimensions instead of one. Nor is there a need to model time discretely, with some smallest possible duration.

With the acceptance of relativity theory, and its implication that there are many valid perspectives or reference frames and so no one is the correct one, scientists have accepted that any objective description of the world can be made only with statements that are invariant under changes of the reference frame. Saying you are standing still is not an objective remark. You are not standing still as measured in a frame fixed to a global positioning satellite. Saying you are standing still in a specific reference frame fixed to the earth is an objective remark because no matter which reference frame you are using, even one fixed to the satellite, it will be true in any of them that you are standing still in that previous reference frame.

Let's explore this point in more detail. Isaac Newton assumed that, if you are as tall as two meter sticks in one reference frame, then you are that tall even if we change the reference frame. And Newton assumed that if event 1 lasts just as long as event 2 in one frame, then this is so even if we switch frames. Einstein undermined these two Newtonian assumptions.

EinsteinEinstein's theory of relativity is the scientific theory that has had the biggest impact upon our understanding of time. Einstein said time is relative. This means some, but not all, aspects of time are relative to the chosen reference frame. Relative to, in the sense of depending upon. Newton would say that if you are seated in a moving vehicle, then your speed relative to the vehicle is zero, but your speed relative to the road is not zero. Einstein would agree. However, he would surprise Newton by saying the length of your vehicle is slightly different in the two reference frames. Equally surprising to Newton, the duration of your drinking a cup of coffee while in the vehicle is slightly different in those two reference frames. These effects are called space contraction and time dilation. So, length and duration are frame dependent.

Using a stationary clock, suppose you correctly measure an event to have lasted t seconds. If the same event is measured correctly to have lasted t' seconds with a clock moving at constant speed v, then regardless of the moving clock's direction of motion,

t' =  t √ (1-v2/c2)

That is, the time of the moving clock always reads less because its time is dilated or stretched. '√' is the square root symbol, and 'c' is the speed of light when it moves unhindered through a vacuum. Time has to dilate and length has to contract in order to ensure that all observers measure the same number for the speed of light in a vacuum regardless of their own motion.

Suppose two observers A and B are moving relative to each other. Observer A can truly say, “In a reference frame fixed to me, you are moving, but I am stationary. Your time is dilated, and so your clock is running slow compared to mine.” But observer B can truly say the same about A. How is that possible without them contradicting each other? Can two clocks really run slower than each other? The answer is yes and no, and the 'yes' sense is one of the unintuitive consequences of the theory of relativity. The 'yes' scenario produces the situation of the twin paradox, in which each observer uses a reference frame fixed to themselves. The twin paradox is explained in more detail in the Supplement that accompanies this article. The 'no' sense occurs when both observers agree to use the same reference frame. In that case, their two clocks are not running slower than each other.

With space contraction and time dilation, namely with the relativity of length and of duration, Einstein's special theory is requiring a mixing of space and time. Spacetime divides into its space part and its time part differently for two reference frames that move relative to each other. So, to claim that an event lasted three minutes without giving even an implicit indication of the reference frame is to make an ambiguous claim. When we say the event of your drinking a cup of coffee lasted three minutes, the implicit assumption is that the reference frame is fixed to your body.

One philosophical implication of the relativity of time is that it seems to be more difficult to defend McTaggart's A-theory that says temporal properties of events such as "is happening now" or "happened in the past" are frame-free properties of those events.

Another profound implication of relativity theory is that two accurate clocks do not stay synchronized (that is, tick the same) if the clocks are initially synchronized. Each clock has its own proper time. So does any other physical object. Proper time for an object is the time that would be shown by a very small clock if it were attached to the object as the object travels around. In the technical terminology of relativity theory, we say a clock measures the elapsed proper time between events that occur along its own worldline. A clock's correct proper time depends on the clock's history, in particular, its history of speed and gravitational influence. Synchronized clocks will not stay synchronized if they either move relative to each other or undergo different gravitational forces. Relative to clocks that are stationary in the reference frame, clocks in motion in the frame run slower, as do clocks in stronger gravitational fields. So, a clock in a car parked near your apartment building runs slower than the stationary clock in your upper floor apartment. This is a sign of the warping of time by matter. These effects on time by speed and gravitation are called "time dilation effects." They affect all clocks, even biological ones.

Because every person has his or her own proper time, two persons undergoing different motions or different gravitational fields will correctly assign different times to the same event. This difference is not just for events the persons themselves are involved in; it is times that they assign to any event in the universe. For example, if I am walking along the road and you drive by me toward the traffic signal ahead, then we will very nearly agree on the time at which the traffic signal changed color, but if we ask what event on a planet in the Andromeda Galaxy is simultaneous with the traffic signal's color change, we will choose events that differ from each other by several weeks. This is yet another example of how relativistic effects usually do not arise in our everyday experience but only in extreme situations involving very high speeds, high-strength gravitational fields, or, in this example, extreme distances.

This situation with the Andromeda Galaxy is an example of how, for some pairs of events that are extremely distant from each other so that neither event could have had a causal effect upon the other, the theory of relativity does not put any precedence structure on the pair; one could happen first, the other could happen first, or they could be simultaneous, and only our imposition of a reference frame on the universe will force a decision on their temporal order.

According to special relativity, spacetime does not curve. According to general relativity it does, and the curvature is not relative to the chosen reference frame. Spacetime is dynamic in the sense that any change in the amount and distribution of matter-energy will change the curvature; and this change is propagated at the speed of light, not instantaneously. Gravity is nothing but the warping of spacetime, and this warping can be detected in various ways, such as the ways by which we detect time dilation and space contraction.

One noteworthy point here is that, according to general relativity, although the presence of gravity from a mass implies spacetime curvature, not all spacetime curvature implies the presence of mass. Spacetime containing no mass can still have curvature; therefore, the geometry of spacetime is not always determined by the behavior of its matter. This point has been interpreted by many philosophers as a good reason to reject Leibniz's classical relationism. It was first discovered by Arthur Eddington in his analysis of the de Sitter solution to Einstein's equations in his relativity theory.

There are many kinds of universes that are models of the equations of general relativity. For example, the theory of relativity does not say whether the universe is finite or infinite in volume, nor what its overall curvature is, nor whether it has a multi-connected topology (for example, a shape like a doughnut). That is, there are models of general relativity in which the universe is shaped like a doughnut and other models in which it is not shaped like a doughnut. Physicists generally agree that our universe is some model of the theory except that the theory fails for features involving the Planck epoch, as described several times in earlier sections of this article. The great goal of the field of physics is to find a new theory, called a theory of quantum gravity, that providea an understanding of what happens for durations shorter than the Planck time.

For more about science and time, see also What Else Science Requires of Time.

5. Is Time Travel Possible?

In discussions in the philosophy of physics, the term "time travel" is a technical term. It means physical time travel, not psychological time travel. You are not a time traveler if you merely dream of living at another time, and it does not mean that you time travel for five minutes by simply being alive for five minutes. You are not time traveling by crossing a time zone. In an attempt to clarify the term, the philosopher David Lewis recommended this definition:

In any case of physical time travel, the traveler’s journey as judged by a correct clock attached to the traveler takes a different amount of time than the journey does as judged by a correct clock of someone who does not take the journey.

This well-accepted definition has no implications about whether, if you travel forward to the year 2276 or backward to 1776, you can suddenly pop into existence then, or instead must have traveled continuously through all the intervening years. If Lewis' definition is acceptable, then any requirement that rules out sudden appearance and demands spatiotemporal continuity will have to be supported by an additional argument. The argument that relativity theory requires this continuity is such an argument. According to relativity theory, if you travel forward to the year 2276, you cannot suddenly jump discontinuously into the future. Instead you must travel continually forward in both your personal time and the Earth’s external time, and you can be continuously observed from Earth’s telescopes during your voyage, although these Earth observers would notice that you are very slow about turning the pages in your monthly calendar. According to relativity theory, travel to the past has similar continuity requirements.

One point to keep in mind is that even if a certain kind of time travel is logically possible, it does not follow that it is physically possible; and if it is physically possible, this does not imply that it does occur. "Logically possible" means not being logically inconsistent. "Physically possible" means being consistent with the accepted physical laws. "Metaphysically possible" means being consistent with accepted metaphysical principles. If we say a person undergoes time travel from one time to another, then we need to make sense of it being the same person at both times, and the notion of "same person" is metaphysically controversial. You can imagine how especially difficult it is to get agreement among the experts on what counts as metaphysically possible. For example, is it metaphysically possible to die before you are born? Is it metaphysically possible for your stepping into a time machine to cause your appearance at a past time?

Our understanding of what is physically possible about time travel comes primarily from the implications of Einstein’s general theory of relativity, and secondarily from quantum electrodynamics. These theories has never failed any experimental tests, so most experts trust their implications for time travel. Physicists generally agree that our universe is a model of general relativity. Physicists also generally agree that, in our universe, time travel does occur frequently.

i. To the Future?

There are two kinds of future time travel—either by moving at high speed or by taking advantage of the presence of an intense gravitational field.

Regarding time travel due to high speed, any motion produces time travel to the future (relative to the clocks of those who do not travel). That makes every bicycle be a time machine. The higher the speed, the more noticeable the time travel. By going at extremely high speed, you can return to Earth where you left and find that the year is now 2276 C.E. (as measured by a clock that has been fixed to the Earth) while your personal clock measures that merely ten years have elapsed. Both clocks can be giving correct readings of the time.

You can participate in that future, not just view it. A relevant philosophical controversy is whether there can be time travel that changes the future. This is impossible, according to David Lewis (Lewis 1976, 150). If you were to do that, then it would not have been the future. No action changes the future, regardless of whether time travel is involved.

If you do travel to 2276, and if the history books in 2276 say you died during twenty-first century experimenting with time travel, the books are mistaken. If in 2276 you were to reverse your velocity, this reversal alone would not be sufficient to travel back to the time when you began your journey even if you did travel back to the same place where you began.

As measured by an Earth-based clock, it takes 100,000 years for light to travel across the Milky Way Galaxy, but if you took the same trip in a spaceship traveling at very nearly the speed of light, the trip might last only ten years, as judged by your own clock that travels with you. The faster you travel the more the distance across the galaxy shrinks. In principle, you have enough time to travel anywhere in our universe before you die. Another implication is that, assuming the human race becomes extinct on Earth many centuries from now, you have enough time to travel away from Earth and back to Earth to learn what caused the extinction.

A second kind of future time travel is due not to speed but to a difference in the strength of the gravitational field between two places. This warp in time is especially noticeable near a black hole. If you were to orbit near a black hole, your friends back on Earth would see you live in slow motion. If you returned, your clock would show that less time had expired on your clock than on their clock. That is why ground floor clocks tick more slowly than penthouse clocks.

i. To the Past?

Backward time travel is not allowed by either Newton's physics or Einstein's special theory of relativity, but Einstein's general theory of relativity definitely allows it. Nevertheless, there is considerable controversy among philosophers and scientists as to whether travel to the past is possible. There are many arguments against backward time travel. Some astrophysicists claim that, because the general theory of relativity does allow backward time travel, the theory should be revised or supplemented to prevent this. Other astrophysicists respond, "Why should it?"

Members of McTaggart's B-camp are more likely than members of his A-camp to say past time travel is possible.

For an illustration of one kind of time travel to the past, imagine a Minkowski two-dimensional spacetime diagram written on a square sheet of paper, with the one space dimension going left and right on the page. Each point on the page represents a possible two-dimensional event. The time dimension points up and down the page, at right angles to the space dimension. The origin is at the center of the page. Now bend the page into a horizontal cylinder parallel to the space axis so that the future meets the past. In the universe described by this graph, any object that persists long enough will arrive into its past and become its earlier self. Happily, this graph (experts would call it a graph ofexternal curvature without internal curvature) is not an accurate description of our own universe.

This paper graph is useful for noting other characteristics about time. The object described by the circle on the page will participate in its past, but not change that past because there can be no erasing of events from the page. This point generalizes; if any kind of past time travel occurs, the traveler is never able to erase facts.

It you travel back in time via a time machine, it would be logically inconsistent to use the time machine to travel back to a time before the first time machine was invented, but if a time machine has always existed, such as in Gödel's rotating universe, then a person could follow along a closed time-like curve in that universe to visit any point in their past. Gödel discovered these universes, which are models of solutions to Einstein's equations of general relativity, in 1949. Einstein was upset upon learning that his own equations had such solutions, but he was became convinced by Gödel's arguments. In 1988 in an influential physics journal, Kip Thorne and colleagues described a new way to build a time machine:

…if the laws of physics permit traversable wormholes, then they probably also permit such a wormhole to be transformed into a "time machine" with which causality might be violatable." (Morris, 1988), p. 1446.

If a wormhole time machine were invented in the year 3000, you might use it in 3123 to travel back to become yourself in 3122. You could not use the machine to visit a time before your birth in 3100, such as 3080, if your birth counts as the first time you came into existence because you cannot both exist and not exist at a time. But if your birth does not count as the first time you came into existence, then in principle you might even go back and become your mother. This would require some revision in the biology textbooks, and in the metaphysics textbook definitions of personal identity, but it wouldn't be logically inconsistent, nor inconsistent with relativity theory.

If the Big Crunch model of the end of the universe is correct, and if there is a net rotation of the universe while it collapses, then there will be closed time-like curves within the universe and many cases of time travel.

In our own universe, there is no experimental evidence, nor good argument, that time travel to the past has ever occurred for macroscopic objects. But let's consider microscopic objects.

Feynman stamp
US Postal Museum

Inspired by an idea of John Wheeler, Richard Feynman suggested that a way to interpret the theory of quantum electrodynamics is that antimatter is regular matter traveling backward in time. For example, the positively charged positron is really a negatively charged electron moving backward in time. This phenomenon is pictured in the two diagrams on the left of the above postage stamp, where the positron e+ is moving downward or backward in time.

Actually, a single Feynman diagram can be misleading because it represents just a single term in an infinite sequence of diagrams, so it does not accurately represent a single process happening in spacetime.  Also, because Freeman Dyson proved that the Feynman diagrams are equivalent to Schwinger's equations, which do not have backward time, the majority of physicists in the early 21st century see no need to accept backward time travel due to Feynman's representations of quantum electrodynamics. See (Muller 2016, p. 246) for more details. At the heart of this dispute about whether to believe antimatter is regular matter traveling backward in time, physicists are very cautious because they realize that the more extraordinary the claim, the more extraordinarily good the evidence should be before accepting the claim.

When we speak of our time-traveling to the future, we mean, or should mean, travel to someone else's future, not to our own future. We never leave our own present. However, many experts believe we are able, in principle, to travel to our own past. At least this is consistent with general relativity.

But to repeat a point made earlier about erasing facts, even if you do successfully travel to your own past, you will not do anything that has not already been done, or else there would be a logical contradiction. In fact, if you do go back, you would already have been back there. For this reason, if you go back in time and try to kill your grandfather before he conceived a child, you will fail no matter how hard you try. You will fail because you have failed. You may believe you are able to kill your grandfather of your own free will, but you won't be able to. You could go back in time and meet your grandfather and aim your gun at him but slip and miss your shot, but you can do this only if it were already true in history that someone slipped while shooting at your grandfather.

Philosophers argue whether this restraint on your actions shows that humans do not really have free will in the libertarian sense of that term. The metaphysician David Lewis believes you can in one sense kill your grandfather but cannot in another sense. You can, relative to a set of facts that does not include the fact that your grandfather survived to have children. You cannot, relative to a set of facts that does include this fact. The metaphysician Donald C. Williams disagrees, and argues that we always need to make our “can” statement relative to all the available facts. Lewis is saying you can and can’t, and you can but won’t. Williams is saying simply that you can’t, so you won’t. For a discussion of this disagreement, see (Fisher, 2015).

Here are a variety of brief philosophical arguments against past-directed time travel.

  1. Time is not real, so time travel to the past is not real either.
  2. Time travel is impossible because, if it were possible, we should have seen many time travelers by now, but nobody has encountered any time travelers.
  3. You could go back in time and kill your grandfather, but then you wouldn’t be born and so could not go back in time and kill your grandfather. That’s a logical contradiction.
  4. If past time travel were possible, then you could be in two different bodies at the same time, which is metaphysically impossible.
  5. If you were to go back to the past, then you would have been fated to go back because you already did, and this rules out free will. Yet we do have free will, so travel to the past is metaphysically impossible.
  6. If past time travel were possible, then you could die before you were born, which is metaphysically impossible.
  7. If you were presently to go back in time, then your present events would cause past events, which violates our concept of causality.
  8. If there were time travel, then when time travelers go back and attempt to change history, they must always fail in their attempts to change anything, and it will appear to anyone watching them at the time as if Nature is conspiring against them. Since observers have never witnessed this apparent conspiracy of Nature, there probably cannot be time travel.
  9. Travel to the past is impossible because it allows the gaining of information for free. Here is a possible scenario. Buy a copy of Darwin's book The Origin of Species, which was published in 1859. In the 21st century, enter a time machine with it, go back to 1855 and give the book to Darwin himself. He could have used your copy in order to write his manuscript which he sent off to the publisher. If so, who first came up with the knowledge about evolution? Neither you nor Darwin. This is free information. Because this scenario contradicts what we know about where knowledge comes from, past-directed time travel isn't really possible.
  10. If past time travel is possible, then according to the philosopher John Earman, it should be possible for a rocket ship to carry a time machine capable of launching a probe (perhaps a smaller rocket) into its recent past which eventually reunites with the mother ship. The mother ship is programmed to launch the probe at a certain time unless a safety switch is on at that time. Suppose the safety switch is programmed to be turned on if and only if the “return” or “impending arrival” of the probe is detected by a sensing device on the mother ship. Does the probe get launched? It seems to be launched if and only if it is not launched.

These complaints about travel to the past are a mixture of arguments that past-directed time travel is not logically possible, not metaphysically possible, not physically possible, not technologically possible, and not probable given today's empirical evidence. Counters to all of these arguments have been suggested by advocates of time travel. For example, there are two responses to item 3, above. You always would fail to kill your grandfather, or you would kill him but then be in an alternative universe to the one where you did not kill him. A response to the Enrico Fermi Paradox, item 2, is that perhaps we have seen no time travelers because we live in a boring era of little interest to time travelers. Argument 7 is one of the favorites of the A-camp who say the travel violates our sense of what is metaphysically possible regarding causality. Some responses to Earman's argument 10 are that general relativity is somehow incorrect, or that there are additional, undiscovered restraints on the creation of the bizarre situation with the rocket ship.

If time were two-dimensional, we probably could travel back in time, analogously to how we can get back to the starting point of our run around a two-dimensional, oval race track. But our time is not two-dimensional.

For more discussion of time travel, see the encyclopedia article “Time Travel.”

6. Does Time Require Change? (Relational vs. Substantival Theories)

This is still an open question, with experts on both sides of the issue. Substantivalism implies space and time are like a container in which matter exists and moves independently of the container. Relationism implies space and time are not like this. If you take away the matter and its motion, you take away space and time.

Substantivalism is the thesis that space and time exist independently of physical material and its events.

Relationism is the thesis that space is only a set of relationships among existing physical material, and time is a set of relationships among the events of that physical material.

Relationism is inconsistent with substantivalism; they both cannot be true. Substantivalism implies there can be “empty time,” time without the existence of physical events. Relationism does not allow empty time. It says time requires change. That is,

Necessarily, if time exists, then change exists.

Everyone agrees time cannot be measured without there being changes, because we measure time by observing changes in some property or other such as the physical location of the hands of the clock, but the present issue is whether time exists without changes. Well is relationism testable? Could we, for instance, turn off all changes and then look to see whether time still exists? No, the issue will have to be approached more indirectly.

To begin, we need to be clearer about what we mean by “changes” when we say the dispute between substantivalists and relationists is over whether time exists without change. The word “change” is used here in the ordinary sense of an object changing its properties over time, such as an object in motion. If a house changes its properties over space, by being red on the roof and white on the sides, this is not ordinary change. And it is also not ordinary change when the death of Queen Anne changes by moving farther into the past.

If Ludwig Boltzmann changes his mind from liking Joseph Loschmidt to disliking him, does that count as an ordinary change? No, not if Cartesian dualism is correct, but yes if most philosophers of mind are correct because Boltzmann's mind cannot change without a spatio-temporal change in Boltzmann’s brain.

We also need to be clearer about what the word “properties” means when speaking of an object changing its properties over time. For the relational theory, the term "property" is intended to exclude what Nelson Goodman called grue-like properties. Let us define an object to be grue if and only if it is green before the beginning of the year 1888 but is blue thereafter. With this definition, we can conclude that the world’s chlorophyll underwent a change from grue to non-grue in 1888. We’d naturally react to drawing this conclusion by saying that this change in chlorophyll is not a “real change” or “ordinary change” in the chlorophyll.

Classical substantival theories are also called "absolute theories." Unfortunately, the term "absolute" is used in other ways in philosophy. One sense of "to be absolute" is to be immutable, or changeless. Another sense is to be independent of observer or reference frame. Although Einstein’s theory implies that time is not absolute in the sense of being independent of reference frame, it is an open question whether relativity theory undermines substantivalism.

a. History of the Debate up to Kant

Let's turn now to the history of the debate between the proponents and opponents of relationism.

The first advocate of a relational theory was Aristotle. He said, “neither does time exist without change” (Physics, book IV, chapter 11, page 218b). Plato had envisioned time as being substance-like, with time being an eternity that is measured by heavenly motion. Aristotle, on the other hand, envisioned time as not being substance-like but rather as being a property of motion, a measure of motion. The difference is between time being measured by motion and motion being measured by time. Plato’s position is a predecessor of Newton’s substantivalism, and Aristotle’s position is a predecessor of Leibniz’s relationism.

The battle lines between substantivalism and relationism were more clearly drawn in the early 18th century when Leibniz argued for the relational position against Newton, who had adopted a substantival theory of time. Newton's actual equations of motion and his law of gravity are consistent with both relationism and substantivalism, although this point was not clear at the time to either Leibniz or Newton.

In the 17th century, the English physicist Isaac Barrow rejected Aristotle’s and Leibniz's linkage between time and change. Barrow said time is something which exists independently of change and which existed even before God created the matter in the universe. Barrow’s student, Isaac Newton, agreed with this substantival theory of time. Although it is not clear what Newton’s own position was, Newton's followers argued very specifically that time and space are like an infinitely large arena or container for all events, and that the container exists with or without the events. He added that time (and space) are not primary substances, but are like primary substances in not being dependent on anything except God. For Newton, God chose some instant at which to create the world of physical objects, each having some velocity. From these initial conditions, the laws took over and guided the objects.

Gottfried Leibniz objected. He was suspicious of Newton's absolute time because it seemed to him to be undetectable. He argued that time is not an entity existing independently of actual events. He insisted that Newton had under-emphasized the fact that time necessarily involves an ordering of events. This is why time “needs” events, so to speak. Leibniz added that this overall order is time. So, he advocated relationism and rejected Newton's substantivalism.

One of Leibniz’s criticisms of Newton’s theory of absolute space and absolute time is that it violates a law of metaphysics that is now called Leibniz’s Law of the Identity of Indiscernibles: If two things or situations cannot be discerned by their different properties, then they are really just one and not two. Newton’s absolute theory violates this law, Leibniz said, because it implies that if God had moved the entire world 5 kilometers east and its history 5 minutes earlier, yet changed no properties of the objects nor relationships among the objects, then this would have been a different world. Leibniz objected that there is nothing to distinguish one point from another in absolute space, if there were to be absolute space, so there would be no discernible difference in the two worlds separated by 5 minutes and 5 kilometers. Leibniz claimed there is just one world here, not two, and Newton’s theory of absolute space and time is faulty.

Leibniz offered another criticism. Newton's theory violates Leibniz's Law of Sufficient Reason: that there is a reason why anything is the way it is. Leibniz complained that, if God shifted the world 5 kilometers east or 5 minutes earlier but made no other changes, then He could have no reason to do so.

Newton's response to this latter argument was two-fold. First, he said Leibniz is correct that we cannot directly observe absolute space and time, and he is correct to accept the Principle of Sufficient Reason, yet the Principle does not require there to be sufficient reasons for humans; God might have had His own reason for creating the universe at a given place and time even though mere mortals cannot comprehend His reasons, or those reasons were not revealed to mortals. Maybe God simply did not want to shift the universe five minutes earlier.

Second, regarding Leibniz’s complaint using the Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles, Newton suggested God is able to discern differences in absolute time that mere mortals cannot. Newton later admitted to friends that his two-part theological response to Leibniz was weak. Historians of philosophy generally agree that if Newton had said no more, he would have lost the debate.

However, Newton found a much better argument. Here is how to detect absolute space indirectly, he said. Suppose we tie a bucket’s handle to a rope hanging down from a tree branch. Partially fill the bucket with water, grasp the bucket, and, without spilling any water, rotate it many times until the rope is twisted. Don’t let go of the bucket. When everything quiets down, the water surface is flat and there is no relative motion between the bucket and its water. That is situation 1. Now let go of the bucket, and let it spin until there is once again no relative motion between the bucket and its water. At this time, the bucket is spinning, and there is a concave curvature of the water surface. That is situation 2.

How can a relational theory explain the difference in the shape of the water's surface in the two situations? It cannot, says Newton. If we ignore our hands, the rope, the tree, and the rest of the universe, says Newton, each situation is simply a bucket with still water; the situations appear to differ only in the shape of the surface. A relationist such as Leibniz cannot account for the difference in shape.

Newton said that even though Leibniz’s theory could not be used to explain the difference in shape, his own theory could. He said that when the bucket is not spinning, there is no motion relative to space itself, that is, to absolute space; but, when it is spinning, there is motion relative to space itself, and so space itself exerts a force on the water to make the concave shape. This force is called "centrifugal force," and its presence is a way to detect absolute space.

Leibniz and his allies had no rebuttal. So, for over two centuries after this argument was created, Newton’s absolute theory of space and time was generally accepted by European scientists and philosophers, although Newton's argument is more supportive of absolute space than absolute time.

One hundred years later, Kant entered the arena on the side of Newton. Consider two identical gloves except that one is right-handed and the other is left-handed. In a space containing only a single one of these gloves, said Kant, Leibniz could not account for its handedness because all the internal relationships would be the same in each of the two situations. However, intuitively we all know that there is a real difference between a right and a left glove, so this difference can only be due to the glove’s relationship to space itself. But if there is a “space itself,” then the absolute or substantival theory of space is better than the relational theory. This indirectly suggests that the absolute theory of time is better, too.

Newton’s theory of time was dominant in the 18th and 19th centuries, even though during those centuries Huygens, and George Berkeley, had entered the arena on the side of Leibniz.

b. History of the Debate after Kant

In 1969, the philosopher Sydney Shoemaker presented a thought experiment in favor of substantivalism. It was an original argument attempting to establish, not that time existing without change is understandable or conceivable, despite Aristotle's declaration that it is not.

With the following scenario, we all can understand how empty time could exist, says Shoemaker. Divide all space into three disjoint regions, called region 3, region 4, and region 5. In region 3, change ceases everywhere in the region every third year for one year. People in regions 4 and 5 can verify this and then convince the people in region 3 of it after they come back to life at the end of their frozen year. People in region 3 become convinced that the universe periodically freezes in their region every three years for just one year. Similarly, change ceases in region 4 every fourth year for a year; and change ceases in region 5 every fifth year for a year. Every sixty years—that is, every 3 x 4 x 5 years—all three regions freeze simultaneously for a year. In year sixty-one, everyone comes back to life, and they are justified in believing time has marched on for the previous year with no change anywhere in the universe, a year of empty time. Yes, there is no person available to observe the freezing in year sixty-one, but we all believe in things that we don't directly observe, don't we? Because this is a merely possible world, there need be no explanation of how the freezing and thawing is implemented, nor who could measure the freezing in year sixty, only a belief that the scenario is conceivable.

In the 19th century, a vast majority of physicists not only believed in absolute space and time, but also had a favorite candidate for a large substance that is stationary in absolute space, the ether. They believed the ether was needed for an adequate explanation of what waves when there is a light wave. In 1865, James Clerk Maxwell proposed his theory of light. The theory was quickly and universally accepted. So, they believed Maxwell when he said the ether was needed as a medium for the propagation of light and that it did exist even if it had not been directly detected.

The experimental physicist A. A. Michelson set out to detect the ether. His clever interferometer experiment failed to detect the ether, but he believed he should have detected it if it existed. So, he concluded that "the hypothesis of a stationary ether is thus shown to be incorrect" (American Journal of Science,  p. 128, 1881). Most physicists disagreed with Michelson's conclusion because they believed A. J. Fresnel who had said the Earth might drag the ether with it. If so, this would make the ether undetectable by Michelson's experimental apparatus, as long as the apparatus were used on Earth and not in outer space.

However, this rescue of the ether hypothesis, and substantivalism along with it, did not last long. In 1905, Einstein proposed his special theory of relativity that implied there should be no ether. When his theory was experimentally confirmed, beliefs in the ether, substantival space, and substantival time were largely abandoned.

Einstein and the philosopher Hans Reichenbach declared the special theory of relativity to be a victory for relationism.

The common relationist response to Newton’s bucket argument was to note Newton’s error in not considering the distant environment, as Ernst Mach had suggested. Einstein agreed with Mach that a body’s inertial mass comes from its interaction with all the other bodies in the universe and not with its interaction with space itself. So, if you were to hold Newton's bucket still but spin the background stars, then the water would creep up the side of the bucket and form a concave surface. By Ockham's Razor, if substantival space and time are not needed for successful explanations, then they should be rejected.

Despite these arguments for relationism, later in the 20th and 21st centuries, substantivalism was defended in various ways.

Here is one way. Relativity theory implies there is a four-dimensional continuous manifold of point-events having a metric field and matter fields. A new definition of “spacetime” is that it is only the manifold. This theory is often called “manifold substantivalism.” The manifold is the container that contains matter; and it is what continues to exist even after the matter is removed, removed in the sense that the matter field's values reach a minimum.

Another kind of substantivalism says that spacetime is not just the manifold but rather is a combination of the manifold plus a single, essential metrical structure. Yet another position is that the debate between substantivalism and relationism no longer makes sense given the new terminology of the general theory of relativity because the very distinction between spacetime and event in spacetime, or between space and matter, has broken down. Yet other philosophers of physics see this break down as a vindication of at least the “spirit” of relationism. For more discussion of these technical points, see (Dainton, 2010, chapter 21).

7. McTaggart's A-Theory and B-Theory

In 1908, the English philosopher J. M. E. McTaggart proposed two ways of linearly ordering all events in time. The resulting ordering is the same, but the methods by which the ordering is created are different.

Longer lasting events can be considered to be composed of their point events. Let a and b be two point events that occur in the past, but in which a is farther in the past and so occurs first. Using the standard time diagram with time increasing to the right along a horizontal line, event a in McTaggart's B-series will be ordered to the left of event b because a happens before b. But when ordering the same two events into McTaggart's A-series, event a is ordered to the left of b for a different reason—because event a is more in the past than event b, or has more pastness than b. Here is a picture of the ordering, with c being another point event that happens later than a and b.

Time-McTaggart1

There are many other events that are located within the series at event a's location, namely all events simultaneous with event a.

Let's suppose that event c occurs in our present and after events a and b. The information that c occurs in the present is not contained within either the A-series or the B-series itself. However, the information that c is in the present is used to create the A-series; it tells us to place c to the right of b because all present events go to the right of past events. The information that c is a present event is not used to create the B-series. The B-series places event c to the right of b just from the information that b happens before c.

McTaggart himself believed the A-series is paradoxical, but he also believed the A-properties (such as being past) are essential to our concept of time and the B-properties are not sufficient by themselves. So, for this reason he believed our current concept of time is incoherent. This reasoning is called "McTaggart's Paradox."

McTaggart is not an especially clear writer, so his remarks can be interpreted in different ways, and the reader needs to work hard to make sense of them. Too briefly, we can reconstruct McTaggart's Paradox for a specific event, say

Socrates spoke to Plato.

This speaking is in the past, so the speaking is past in the present. Nevertheless, back in the past, the event is present. From all this, McTaggart concludes both that the event is past and that the event is present, from which he declares that the A-series is contradictory. If so, and if the A-series is essential to time, then time itself is unreal.

When discussing the A-theory and the B-theory, metaphysicians often speak of

  • A-series and B-series
  • A-theory and B-theory
  • A-theorist and B-theorist
  • A-facts and B-facts
  • A-terms and B-terms
  • A-properties and B-properties
  • A-predicates and B-predicates
  • A-statements and B-statements
  • A-camp and B-camp.

Here are some examples. B-series terms are relational terms; a B-term refers to a property of a pair of events such as “is earlier than,” “happens twenty-three minutes after,” and “was simultaneous with.” An A-theory term is not relational; it refers to a one-place property of a single event, not a pair of events: "in the near future," "happened twenty-three minutes ago," and "is present." The B-theory terms represent distinctively B-properties; the A-theory terms represent distinctively A-properties. The B-fact that event a occurs before event b will always be a fact, but the A-fact that event a occurred about an hour ago soon won’t be a fact. Similarly, the A-statement that event a occurred about an hour ago, if true, will soon become false. However, B-facts are not transitory, and B-statements are eternal, they have fixed truth-values. For the B-theorist, the statement "The event of snowing occurs an hour before this act of utterance" will, if true, stay true forever. The A-theory usually says A-facts are the truthmakers of true A-statements and so A-facts are ontologically fundamental; the B-theorist, at least a B-theorist who believes in facts, appeals instead to B-facts. According to a classical B-theory, when the A-theorist correctly says, "It began snowing an hour ago," what really makes it true is not that the snowing has an hour of pastness but that the event of uttering the sentence occurs an hour after the event of it beginning to snow. Notice that "occurs an hour after" is a B-term.

When you like an event, say yesterday’s snowfalling, then change your mind and dislike the event, what sort of change of the event is that? Well, this change in attitude is not a change that is intrinsic to the event itself. When your attitude changes, the snowfalling itself undergoes no intrinsic change, only a change in its relationship to you. A-theorists prefer to focus on the second-order change of what they consider to be intrinsic properties of an event, such as its being past. They point out that the snowfalling event will change tomorrow by being even more past. And this second-order change occurs regardless of whether your attitude toward the event changes.

Members of the A-camp and B-camp recognize that ordinary speakers are not careful in their use of A and B terminology; but, when the terminology is used carefully, each camp member believes their camp's terminology can best explain the terminology of the other camp. Also, it is often the case that the A-theorist believes becoming is more fundamental than being, and the B-theorist believes the opposite. By "becoming," we mean a change in the A-series position of an event, such as its degree of pastness.

The B-theorists generally argue that there are no irreducible one-place A-qualities because they can all be reduced to two-place B-relations. The A-theorist in turn promotes A-properties over B-properties.

Is the A-theory or the B-theory the correct theory of reality? The A-theory comprises two theses, each of which is contrary to the B-theory: (1) Time is fundamentally constituted by an A-series in which any event's being in the past (or in the present or in the future) is an intrinsic, objective, non-relational property of the event itself. (2) The second thesis of the A-theory is that events change. In 1908, McTaggart described the special way that events change:

Take any event—the death of Queen Anne, for example—and consider what change can take place in its characteristics. That it is a death, that it is the death of Anne Stuart, that it has such causes, that it has such effects—every characteristic of this sort never changes.... But in one respect it does change. It began by being a future event. It became every moment an event in the nearer future. At last it was present. Then it became past, and will always remain so, though every moment it becomes further and further past.

This special change is called secondary change and second-order change and McTaggart change and McTaggartian change.

The B-theory disagrees with both thesis (1) and thesis (2) of the A-theory. According to the B-theory, the B-series and not the A-series is fundamental; fundamental temporal properties are relational; McTaggartian change is not an objective change and so is not metaphysically fundamental.

What do B-theorists mean by calling temporal properties "relational"? They mean that an event's property of occurring in the past (or occurring twenty-three minutes ago, or now, or in a future century) is relational because it is a relation between the event and us. When analyzed, it will be seen to make essential reference to our own perspective on the world. For example, Queen Anne's death has the A-property of occurring in the past only because it has the B-property of occuring before our present thinking about the event. Her death is not a past event for Aristotle. So, the labels, "past," "present," and "future" are all about us. There is no objective distinction among past, present and future, says the proponent of the B-theory.

The point is also made this way. The A-theory terminology about space uses the terms "here," "there," "far," and "near." These terms are essentially about the speaker; and the B-theory defender will argue,

Is a map drawn incorrectly because it leaves out an arrow pointing to 'here' and another arrow pointing to 'there'? If not, then the B-theory's spacetime diagram is also not an incorrect treatment of time even if our manifest image of time does require the event of Queen Anne's death to change by receding farther into the past.

The B-theorist also argues that the A-theory violates the special theory of relativity because an event can be present for one person but not for another person who is moving relative to the first person. So, being present is not an intrinsic property of the event. It is relative to reference frame.

A-theorists are aware of these criticisms, and there are many counterarguments. Some influential A-theorists are A. N. Prior, Quentin Smith, and W. L. Craig. Some influential B-theorists are Bertrand Russell, W. V .O. Quine, and Hugh Mellor.

Because the A-theory is so closely related to the manifest image and the B-theory is so closely related to the scientific image, disputes between the A-camp and B-camp are closely related to attempts to reconcile the manifest image with the scientific image. During a 1922 confrontation with the philosopher Henri Bergson, who supported the manifest image and the growing-past theory of time, Einstein defended his own scientific treatment of time and said the time of the philosophers is an illusion. As he put it,

Il n'y a donc pas un temps des philosophes.

This is an overstatement. He really meant to attack A-theory philosophers, not B-theory philosophers. He himself supported the B-theory.

Martin Heidegger said he wrote Being and Time in 1927 as a response to the conflict between the A-theory and the B-theory, the conflict between the time of Bergson and the time of Einstein.

8. What is the Flow of Time?

Time seems to flow like a river, many people say. The philosopher George Santayana offered a helpful metaphor when he said, “The essence of nowness runs like fire along the fuse of time.” What is the truth behind these metaphors?

A small number of philosophers question whether time really does seem to us to flow, and claim we are mistaken in describing how things seem to us to be. The vast majority, though, will agree that that time seems to us to flow, but there is significant philosophical disagreement among these philosophers about whether it really does. This controversial issue is about physical time, and it is directly related to whether McTaggart's A-theory or B-theory is more fundamental.

There are two primary theories about time’s flow: (A) the flow is objectively real. (B) the flow is either a myth or else is merely subjective. Very often, theory A is called the dynamic theory or the A-theory; and theory B is called the static theory or the B-theory or the myth of passage theory.

The B theory implies that the flow is the product of a faulty metaphor. The defense of that charge often proceeds like this. Time exists, things change, and so B-theorists say time “elapses,” but they say time itself does not change. It does not change by flowing. The present does not objectively flow or move into the past because the present is not an objective feature of the world. We all experience this flow or movement toward the past, but only in the sense that we all frequently misinterpret our experience.

One point offered in favor of the B-theory is to ask about the rate at which time flows. It would be a rate of one second per second. But that is silly, it is claimed. One second divided by one second is the unit-less number one. That is not a coherent rate.

In another sense of “rate” and of “flow,” there definitely can be different rates for time. According to the special theory of relativity, if I move at a high speed away from you, then you will correctly judge that my clock, which was once synchronized with your clock, ticks at a slower rate than your clock. Physicists sometimes speak of this situation as one in which time flows differently for different observers or different clocks. However, this is not the sense of flow being promoted by dynamic theories of time.

Physicists sometimes speak of time flowing in another sense of the term "flow." This is the sense in which change is continuous rather than discrete. They might say time flows continuously and not discretely. Again, this is not the sense of “flow” that philosophers have in mind when debating the objectivity of time's flow.

Physicists sometimes carelessly speak of time flowing when all they mean is that time elapses, that is, exists. Isaac Newton spoke this way. Newton believed that both time and time's flow are the duration of being of God. He believed both time and time's flow are God's continuing to exist.

Physicists also carelessly speak of time flowing in yet another sense—when what they mean is that time has an arrow, a direction, from the past to the future. But this conflates time's flow with time's arrow. Again, this is not the sense of “flow” that philosophers use when speaking of the dynamic theory of time's flow.

According to the dynamic theories, the flow of time is objective. It is a feature of our mind-independent reality, and is an intrinsic property of time. A dynamic theory is closer to common sense, and has historically been the more popular theory among philosophers. It is more likely to be adopted by those who believe that McTaggart's A-series is a more fundamental feature of time than his B-series.

There are several kinds of dynamic theory. One implies that the flow is a matter of events changing from being future, to being present, to being past, and they also change in their degree of pastness and degree of presentness. This kind of change is often called "McTaggart's second-order change" to distinguish it from more ordinary, first-order change as when a rolling ball changes location. For the B-theorist, the only proper kind of change is when different states of affairs obtain at different times. Proponents of the A-theory and of the B-theory agree that an event, say World War I, is changing its relationships to us, for example because some of us today are learning more about the war; but the two theories disagree about whether World War I is undergoing an intrinsic change in its degree of being past.

Opponents of the dynamic theory complain that when events are said to change, the change is not a real change in the event’s essential, intrinsic properties, but only in the event’s relationship to the observer. They complain that saying the death of Queen Anne is an event that changes from present to past is no more of an objectively real change in her death than saying her death changed from being approved of to being disapproved of. This extrinsic change in approval is not intrinsic to her death and so does not count as an objectively real change in her death, and neither does the so-called second-order change of her death from being present to being past. Attacking the notion of time’s flow in this manner, Adolf Grünbaum said: “Events simply are or occur…but they do not ‘advance’ into a pre-existing frame called ‘time.’ … An event does not move and neither do any of its relations.”

A second dynamic theory says time's flow is the coming into existence of tensed facts, the actualization of new states of affairs. Reality grows by the addition of more facts. There need be no commitment to events changing intrinsically.

A third dynamic theory says that the flow is a matter of events changing from being indeterminate in the future to being determinate in the present and past. Time’s flow is really events becoming determinate, so these dynamic theorists speak of time’s flow as "temporal becoming."

A fourth dynamic theory suggests the flow is (or is reflected in) the change over time of truth-values of declarative sentences. For example, suppose the sentence, “It is now raining,” was true during the rain yesterday but has changed to false today, which is sunny. That's an indication that time flowed from yesterday to today, and these sorts of truth-value changes are at the root of the flow. In response, critics of this dynamic theory suggest that the temporal indexical sentence, “It is now raining,” has no truth-value because the reference of the word “now” is unspecified. If it cannot have a truth-value, it cannot change its truth-value. However, the sentence is related to a sentence that does have a truth-value, the sentence with the temporal indexical replaced by the date that refers to a specific time and with the other indexicals replaced by names of whatever they refer to. Supposing it is now midnight here on April 1, 2017, and the speaker is in San Francisco, California, then the indexical sentence, “It is now raining,” is intimately related to the more complete or context-explicit sentence, “It is raining at midnight on April 1, 2017 in San Francisco, California.” Only these latter, non-indexical, non-context-dependent, complete sentences have truth-values, and these truth-values do not change with time, so they do not underlie any flow of time.

A fifth dynamic theory adds to the block-universe a flowing present which "spotlights" or makes vivid a new present slice of the block at every moment. The slice is of all events that are simultaneous in the block. This theory is usually called the moving spotlight view.

John Norton (Norton 2010) argues that time's flow is objective but so far is beyond the reach of our understanding. Tim Maudlin argues that the objective flow of time is fundamental and unanalyzable. He is happy to say “time does indeed pass at the rate of one hour per hour” (Maudlin 2007, p. 112).

9. What are the Differences among the Past, Present, and Future?

a. Presentism, the Growing-Past, Eternalism and the Block-Universe

Have dinosaurs slipped out of existence? More generally, we are asking whether the past is part of reality. How about the future? Philosophers are divided on the ontological question of the reality of the past, the present, and the future. There are three leading theories, and there is controversy over the exact wording of each.

graphic of metaphysics of time

In these three diagrams, the time axis goes up, and two space axes are perpendicular to the time axis. Real events are in orange except for the black, wiggly line which is the collection of events constituting what is objectively real about a typical moving object. The orange block in the Eternalism diagram is the spacetime diagram of the block universe. Below is a description of the metaphysical differences among the three diagrams.

(1) According to the ontological theory called presentism, necessarily only present physical objects exist. Stated another way: necessarily, if something is physically real, then it exists now. The presentist maintains that, unlike the present, both the past and the future are not real, so if a statement about the past is true, such as "Dinosaurs once existed," this must be because some present facts make it true. Heraclitus, Duns Scotus, Thomas Hobbes, and A. N. Prior are presentists. There were no rivals to presentism before the nineteenth century.

(2) Advocates of a growing-past agree with the presentists that the present is special ontologically, but they argue that, in addition to the present, the past is also real and is growing bigger all the time. H. Bergson, C. D. Broad, George Ellis, Richard Jeffrey, and Michael Tooley defended the growing-past theory. William James famously remarked that the future is so unreal that even God cannot anticipate it. It is not clear whether Aristotle accepted the growing-past theory or accepted a form of presentism; see Hilary Putnam (1967, p. 244) for commentary on this issue.

(3) Advocates of eternalism say there are no objective ontological differences among the past, present and future, just as there is no objective ontological difference between here and there. The difference is subjective, depending upon which person's experience is being implicitly referred to, yours or Julius Caesar's. Yes, we thank goodness that the threat to our safety is there rather than here, and that it is past rather than present, but these differences are subjective, being dependent on our point of view. Bertrand Russell, J. J. C. Smart, W. V. O. Quine, Adolf Grünbaum, and Paul Horwich have endorsed eternalism.

Eternalists usually adopt the block-universe theory and the theory of four-dimensionalism. Four-dimensionalism implies that the ontologically basic objects in the universe are four-dimensional rather than three-dimensional, with the fourth dimension being time. Four-dimensionalism plus the block theory is said to promote the "spatialization of time" because it treats time as a fourth dimension in a four-dimensional spacetime, as in the above graph of Eternalism. If time has an infinite future or infinite past, or if space has an infinite extent, then the block is infinitely large along those dimensions.

The block-universe theory implies that reality is a single block of spacetime with its time slices (its sheets of simultaneous events) ordered by the happens-before relation. You are fundamentally four-dimensional and not three-dimensional, even though it is often convenient to think of you only as three-dimensional. You are composed of all your infancy time-slices, plus your childhood time-slices, plus your teenage time-slices, plus your adult time-slices. Time-slices are also called "temporal parts." There is more than one way to describe you. You are also a fusion of all your instantaneous temporal parts.

The block is a real, an eternalist would say, even though no one knows which possible events are in the future region of the block. It contains your future death.  Experts today are undecided about whether the block is infinite in space and infinite in past time.

For the eternalist, the block itself has no distinguished past, present, and future; but any chosen reference frame placed upon the block will have its own definite past, present, and future. The future, by the way, is the actual future, not all possible futures. The philosopher William James coined the term “block universe.” The majority of physicists accept the block theory.

Some proponents of the growing-past theory have adopted a growing-block theory, which is depicted in the center of the above diagram. They say that the future is not included in their block because the future does not exist. The present moment is the latest moment within the block. The present is a three-dimensional time-slice that divides the past from the nothingness of the future. They do not go on to conclude that this makes the following sentence now true: "I will not exist tomorrow."

All three ontologies (namely, presentism, the growing-past, and eternalism) imply that, at the present moment, we only ever experience a part of the present. They all agree that nothing exists now that is not present. They all need to show somehow that there is an important difference between never existing (Santa Claus) and not still existing (Abraham Lincoln). Members of all three camps will understand an ordinary speaker who says, “There will be a storm tomorrow so it’s a good thing we fixed the roof last week,” but they will have different treatments of this at a metaphysical level.

One of the major issues for presentism is how to ground true propositions about the past. What makes it true that U.S. President Abraham Lincoln was assassinated in 1865? In technical-ease, we are asking what are the "truthmakers" of the true propositions and the "falsemakers" of the false propositions. Many presentists say past-tensed truths lack truthmakers in the past but are nevertheless true because their truthmakers are in the present. They say what makes a tensed proposition true are only features of the present way things are, perhaps traces of the past in pages of present books. The eternalist disagrees. When someone says truly that Abraham Lincoln was assassinated, the eternalist and the growing-past theorist believe this is to say something true of a real Abraham Lincoln who is not present. The block theorist and the growing-block theorist might add that Lincoln is real but far away from us along the time dimension just as the Moon is real but far away from us along a spatial dimension. Why not treat these distant realities in the same manner, they ask?

A related issue for the presentist is how to account for causation, for April showers bringing May flowers. For any effect, its cause is in the past. Can there be causation without both the cause and the effect being real?

A third major issue for the presentist is to account for the Special Theory of Relativity's treatment of the present. That theory allows event a to be simultaneous with event b in some reference frame, and it allows be to be simultaneous with event c in some other reference frame. So, if a is real, then shouldn’t the presentist allow c to be real also? Yet, according to relativity theory, in the first frame, c might be in the future of a. This argument against presentism presupposes the transitivity of co-existence. (Stein 1991) says presentism can be retained by rejecting transitivity and saying what is present and thus real is different depending on your spacetime location. The implication of this is that, for event a, the only events that are real are those with a zero spacetime interval from a, and many of Stein's opponents do not like this implication. A survey of defenses of presentism can be found in (Markosian 2003).

The presentist and the advocate of the growing-past usually will unite in opposition to eternalism on four grounds: (i) The present is so much more vivid to a conscious being than are expectations of future experiences. (ii) Eternalism misses the special “open” and changeable character of the future. In the classical block-universe theory promoted by most eternalists (as opposed to non-classical versions that say the block splits into multiple blocks for each quantum possibility at each instant), there is only one future, so this implies the future exists already; but we know this determinsm is incorrect because it denies libertarian free will. (iii) A present event "moves" in the sense that it is no longer present a moment later, having lost its property of presentness. (iv) Future-tensed statements that are contingent do not have truthmakers and so are neither true nor false.

The counter from the defenders of eternalism and the block-universe is that, regarding (i), the vividness of here does not imply the unreality of there. Regarding (ii) and the open future, the block theory allows determinism and fatalism but does not require either one. Eventually there will be one future, regardless of whether that future is now open or closed, and that is what constitutes the future portion of the block. Finally, don't we all fear impending doom? But according to presentism and the growing-block theory, why should we have this fear if the doom is known not to exist, as these two kinds of theorists evidently believe? The best philosophy of time will not make our different attitudes toward future danger and past danger be so mysterious, says the eternalist.

The advocates of the block-universe attack both presentism and the growing-past theory by claiming that only the block-universe can make sense of the special theory of relativity’s implication that, if persons A and B are separated but in relative motion, an event in person A’s present can be in person B’s future. Advocates of presentism and the growing-past theories must suppose that this event is both real and unreal because it is real for A but not real for B. Surely that conclusion is unacceptable, claim the eternalists. Two key assumptions of this argument are, first, that relativity does provide an accurate account of the spatiotemporal relations among events, and, second, that if there is some frame of reference in which two events are simultaneous, then if one of the events is real, so is the other.

Opponents of the block-universe counter that block theory does not provide an accurate account of the way things are because the block theory considers the present to be subjective, and not part of objective reality, yet the present is known to be part of objective reality. If science doesn't use the concept of the present in its basic laws, then this is one of science's faults.

Here is a common defense of the block-universe theory against the charge that it implies determinism, that the future is already "laid out" in the block:

The block universe is not necessarily a deterministic one. ...Strictly speaking, to say that the occurrence of a relatively later event is determined vis à vis a set of relatively earlier events, is only to say that there is a functional connection or physical law linking the properties of the later event to those of the earlier events. ...Now in the block universe we may have partial or even total indeterminacy—there may be no functional connection between earlier and later events. (McCall 1966, p. 271)

For a review of the argument from relativity against presentism, and for some criticisms of the block theory, see (Putnam 1967) and (Saunders 2002).

b. Is the Present, the Now, Objectively Real?

When you speak on the phone with someone two hundred miles away, the conversation is normal because you seem to share a common now. But that normalcy is only apparent because light travels the two hundred miles so quickly. During a conversation with someone far away on the moon, you would notice a strange 1.3 second time lag and thus a loss of a common now.

Suppose you were to look at your correct clock on Earth and notice it is midnight. What time would it be on the Moon, according to your clock? Well, midnight, of course. But what event on the Moon is simultaneous with your midnight on Earth? You can't look and see immediately. You will have to wait 1.3 seconds at least because it takes any signal that long to reach from the Moon to the Earth. If an asteroid were to strike the Moon, and you were to see the strike through your Earth telescope at 1.3 seconds after midnight, then you could compute later that the asteroid striking the Moon was simultaneous with your clock showing midnight. If you want to know what is presently happening on the other side of Milky Way, you'll have an even longer wait. So, the moral is that whatever collection of events is in your present is something you have to compute; you cannot just look and see at one time.

Einstein's theory of relativity implies that, if someone judges time using a clock fixed to their spaceship that is flying by you at a significant fraction of the speed of light, then when your clock shows it is now midnight, the collection of events that you eventually compute, and so can correctly say occurs now, must be different than the collection of events that the space traveler will be able to say occurs at midnight. You and your nearby space traveler will not notice much of a difference for an event on another continent, but you will notice the difference for an event on the moon. The difference in nows between you and the space traveler grows greater the farther the event is away from you, and it grows greater the faster the spaceship's speed. The implication is that there are different nows and nobody's now is the only correct one. Luckily, people on Earth moving at speeds insignificant compared to the speed of light do not disagree about what events occur now. That we all agree on the now is a feature of the manifest image.

All philosophers say we would be missing some important information if we did not know what time it is now, but these philosophers disagree over just what sort of information this is. Proponents of the objectivity of the present are committed to claiming the universe would have a present even if there were no living, conscious beings. This claim is controversial. For example, in 1915, Bertrand Russell objected to giving the present any special ontological standing:

In a world in which there was no experience, there would be no past, present, or future, but there might well be earlier and later. (Russell 1915, p. 212)

One argument for believing in the objectivity of the now is that the now is so much more vivid to everyone. If science does not explain this vividness, say the objectivists, then there is a defect within science. A second argument points out that there is so much agreement among people around us about what is happening now and what is not. So, isn't that a sign that the concept of the now is objective, not subjective, and real rather than unreal? A third argument for objectivity of the now is that when we examine ordinary language we find evidence that a belief in the now is ingrained in our language. It is unlikely that it would be so ingrained if it were not correct to believe it.

Let's re-examine these arguments. One criticism of the argument from vividness is that the now is vivid but so is the "here," yet we don't conclude from this that the here is somehow more objective geographically. Why then assume that the vividness of the now points to it as the sole real moment?

A second criticism is that we cannot now step outside our present experience and compare its vividness with an experience now of past nows and future nows. Instead, when we speak of the "vividness" of our present experience of a tree in front of us, we are really comparing our present experience of the tree with our dim memories of past trees and expectations of future trees. So, the comparison is unfair; the vividness of future events should be assessed, says the critic, by measuring those events and not merely by measuring expectations of those events.

A third criticism of the vividness argument points out that there are empirical studies by cognitive psychologists and neuroscientists showing that our judgment about what is vividly happening now is plastic and can be affected by our expectations and by what other experiences we are having at the time. For example, we see and hear a woman speaking to us from across the room; then we construct an artificial now, a specious present, in which hearing her speak and seeing her speak happen at the same time, whereas the acoustic engineer tells us we are mistaken because the sound traveled much slower than the light.

Another argument against the objectivity of the now comes from its absence in spacetime diagrams. To be overly brief, if physicists don't need it, then it's not real. The counterargument is that it is the mistake of scientism to suppose that if something is not in our current theories, then it is not real.

In any discussion about whether the now is objective, we need to remember that the term "objective" has different senses. There is objective in the sense of not being relative to the reference frame. But there is objective in the sense of not being mind-dependent. Since being subjective is not being objective, there are multiple senses of being subjective.

McTaggart's A-series necessarily designates some instant as the present, although this designation changes over time. The B-series does not indicate a present moment. According to McTaggart's A-camp, there is a global now shared by all of us. The now is objective in all both senses that were just mentioned. The B-camp disagrees and says this belief in a global now is a product of our falsely supposing that everything we see is happening now; we are not factoring in the finite speed of light. Proponents of the non-objectivity of the present frequently claim that a proper analysis of time talk should treat the phrases "the present" and "now" as indexical terms which refer to the time at which the phrases are uttered by the speaker, so their relativity to us speakers shows the essential subjectivity of the present.

There are interesting issues about the now even in theology. Norman Kretzmann has argued that if God is omniscient, then He knows what time it is, and to know this He must always be changing. Therefore, there is an incompatibility between God's being omniscient and God's being immutable. Thomas Aquinas, on the other hand, argues that God is unchanging and so is not in time.

c. Persist, Endure, Perdure, and Four-Dimensionalism

Some objects last longer than others. They persist longer. But there is philosophical disagreement about how to understand persistence. Objects considered four-dimensionally are said to persist by perduring rather than enduring. Think of events and processes as being four-dimensional. The familiar three-dimensional objects such as chairs and people are usually considered to exist wholly at a single time and are said to persist by enduring through time. Advocates of four-dimensionalism endorse perduring objects rather than enduring objects as the metaphysically basic entities. All events and processes are four-dimensional sub-blocks of the block-universe. The perduring object persists by being the sum or “fusion” of a series of its temporal parts (also called its temporal stages and temporal slices and time slices). For example, a thirty-five-year old man can be considered to be a four-dimensional perduring object consisting of his childhood, his middle age and his future old age. These are three of his infinitely many temporal parts.

One argument against four-dimensionalism is that it allows an object to have too many temporal parts. Four-dimensionalism implies that, during every second in which an object exists, there are at least as many temporal parts of the object as there are sub-segments of the mathematical line within the segment from zero to one. According to (Thomson 1983), this is too many parts for any object to have. She also says that as the present moves along, present temporal parts move into the past and go out of existence while some future temporal parts "pop" into existence, and she complains that this popping in and out of existence is implausible. The four-dimensionalist can respond to these complaints by remarking that the present temporal parts do not go out of existence when they are no longer in the present. Similarly, dinosaurs have not popped out of existence; they simply do not exist presently. By removing talk of "popping in and out," the source of intuitive implausibility is removed.

According to David Lewis in On the Plurality of Worlds, the primary argument for perdurantism is that it has an easy time of solving what he calls the problem of temporary intrinsics, of which the Heraclitus paradox is one example. The Heraclitus Paradox is the problem, first introduced by Heraclitus of ancient Greece, of explaining our not being able to step into the same river twice because the water is different the second time. The mereological essentialist agrees with Heraclitus, but our common sense says Heraclitus is mistaken.

The advocate of endurance has trouble showing that Heraclitus is mistaken. It is for the following reason: We do not step into two different rivers, do we? Yet the river has two different intrinsic properties, namely being two different collections of water; but, by Leibniz’s Law of the Indiscernibility of Identicals, identical objects cannot have different properties. So, the advocate of endurance and the mereological essentialist both have trouble escaping the Heraclitus Paradox.

A 4-dimensionalist who advocates perdurance says the proper metaphysical analysis of the Heraclitus Paradox is that we can step into the same river twice by stepping into two different temporal parts of the same 4-dimensional river. Similarly, we cannot see a football game at a moment; we can see only a momentary temporal part of the 4-D game. The upshot is that the 4-dimensionalist can make easy sense of stepping into the same river twice. For more discussion of this topic in metaphysics, see (Carroll and Markosian 2010, pp. 173-7).

Eternalism differs from 4-dimensionalism. Eternalism says the present, past, and future are equally real, whereas 4-dimensionalism says the basic objects are 4-dimensional. Most 4-dimensionalists accept eternalism and four-dimensionalism and McTaggart's B-theory.

One of A. N. Prior’s criticisms of the B-theory involves the reasonableness of our saying of some painful, past event, “Thank goodness that is over.” Prior says the B-theorist cannot explain this reasonableness because no B-theorist should thank goodness that the end of their pain happens before their present utterance of "Thank goodness that is over," since that B-fact or B-relationship is timeless; it has always held and always will. The only way then to make sense of our saying “Thank goodness that is over” is to assume we are thankful for the A-fact that the pain event has pastness. But if so, then the A-theory is correct and the B-theory is incorrect.

One B-theorist response is simply to disagree with Prior that it is improper for a B-theorist to thank goodness that the end of their pain happens before their present utterance, even though this is an eternal B-fact. Still another response from the B-theorist comes from the 4-dimensionalist who says that as 4-dimensional beings it is proper for us to care more about our later time-slices than our earlier time-slices. If so, then it is reasonable to thank goodness that the time slice at the end of the pain occurs before the time slice that is saying, "Thank goodness that is over." Admittedly this is caring about an eternal B-fact. So, Prior’s premise [that the only way to make sense of our saying “Thank goodness that is over” is to assume we are thankful for the A-fact that the pain event has pastness] is a faulty premise, and Prior’s argument for the A-theory is unsuccessful.

d. Truth-Values of Tensed Sentences

The philosophical dispute about presentism, the growing-past theory, and the block theory or eternalism has taken a linguistic turn by focusing upon a question about language: “Are predictions true or false at the time they are uttered?” Those who believe in the block-universe (and thus in the determinate reality of the future) will answer “Yes,” while a “No” will be given by presentists and advocates of the growing-past.

The issue is whether contingent sentences uttered now about future events are true or false now rather than true or false only in the future at the time the predicted event is supposed to occur. For example, suppose someone says, “Tomorrow the admiral will start a sea battle.” And suppose that tomorrow the admiral orders a sneak attack on the enemy ships which starts a sea battle. The eternalist says that, if this is so, then the above quoted sentence was true at the time it was uttered. Truth is eternal or fixed, they say, and “is true” is a timeless predicate, not one that merely says “is true now.” These philosophers point favorably to the ancient Greek philosopher Chrysippus who was convinced that a contingent sentence about the future is simply true or false, even if we do not know which.

Many other philosophers, usually in McTaggart's A-camp, agree with Aristotle's suggestion that the sentence is not true until it can be known to be true, namely at the time at which the sea battle occurs. The sentence was not true before the battle occurred. In other words, predictions have no (classical) truth-values at the time they are uttered. Predictions fall into the “truth-value gap.” This position that contingent sentences have no classical truth-values is called the "doctrine of the open future" and also the "Aristotelian position" because many researchers throughout history have taken Aristotle to be holding the position in chapter 9 of On Interpretation—although today it is not so clear that Aristotle himself held the position.

One principal motive for adopting the Aristotelian position arises from the belief that, if sentences about future human actions are now true, then humans are determined to perform those actions, and so humans have no free will. To defend free will, we must deny truth-values to predictions.

This Aristotelian argument against predictions being true or false has been discussed as much as any in the history of philosophy, and it faces a series of challenges. First, if there really is no free will, or if free will is compatible with determinism, then the motivation to deny truth-values to predictions is undermined.

Second, according to many compatibilists, but not all, your choices do affect the world as the libertarians believe, but if it is true that you will perform an action in the future, it does not follow that now you will not perform it freely, nor that you are not free to do otherwise if your intentions were to change, but only that you will not do otherwise. For more on this point about modal logic, see the discussion of it in Foreknowledge and Free Will.

A third challenge, from Quine and others, claims the Aristotelian position wreaks havoc with the logical system we use to reason and argue with predictions. For example, here is a deductively valid argument:

There will be a sea battle tomorrow.

If there will be a sea battle tomorrow, then we should wake up the admiral.

So, we should wake up the admiral.

Without the premises in this argument having truth-values, that is, being true or false, we cannot properly assess the argument using the usual standards of deductive validity because this standard is about the relationships among truth-values of the component sentences—that a valid argument is one in which it is impossible for the premises to be true and the conclusion to be false. Unfortunately, the Aristotelian position says that some of these component sentences are neither true nor false, so the Aristotelian position is implausible.

In reaction to this third challenge, proponents of the Aristotelian argument say that if Quine would embrace tensed propositions and expand his classical logic to a tense logic, he could avoid those difficulties in assessing the validity of arguments that involve sentences having future tense.

Quine has claimed that the analysts of our talk involving time should in principle be able to eliminate the temporal indexical words such as "now" and "tomorrow" because their removal is needed for fixed truth and falsity of our sentences [fixed in the sense of being eternal sentences whose truth-values are not relative to the situation and time of utterance because the indexicals and indicator words have been replaced by specific times, places and names, and whose verbs are treated as timeless and tenseless], and having fixed truth-values is crucial for the logical system used to clarify science. “To formulate logical laws in such a way as not to depend thus upon the assumption of fixed truth and falsity would be decidedly awkward and complicated, and wholly unrewarding,” says Quine.

Philosophers are still divided on all these issues.

e. Are There Essentially-Tensed Facts?

Using a tensed verb is a grammatical way of locating an event in time. All the world’s cultures have a conception of time, but only half the world’s languages use tenses. The Chinese, Burmese and Malay languages have no tenses. The English language expresses conceptions of time with tensed verbs; we distinguish "Her death has happened" from "Her death will happen." However, English expresses time in other ways: with the adverbial phrases “now” and “twenty-three days ago,” with the adjective phrases "new" and "ancient," and with the prepositions "until" and "since."

Philosophers have asked what we are basically committed to when we use tense to locate an event in time. There are two principal answers: tenses are objective and tenses are subjective.

The first answer is that tenses represent objective features of reality that are not captured by eternalism and the block-universe approach. This philosophical theory is said to "take tense seriously" and is called the tensed theory of time. The theory claims that when we learn the truth-values of certain tensed sentences we obtain knowledge that tenseless sentences do not and cannot provide, for example, that such and such a time is the present time—that it is now noon. Tenses are almost the same as what is represented by positions in McTaggart's A-series, so the theory is commonly called the A-theory of tense.

A second, contrary answer to the question of the significance of tenses is that they are merely subjective. Our saying the event happened rather than is happening indicates that we said this after the event happened rather than before. This theory is the B-theory of tense. W. V. O. Quine expressed the point this way:

Our ordinary language shows a tiresome bias in its treatment of time. Relations of date are exalted grammatically.... This bias is of itself an inelegance, or breach of theoretical simplicity. Moreover, the form that it takes—that of requiring that every verb form show a tense—is peculiarly productive of needless complications, since it demands lipservice to time even when time is farthest from our thoughts. Hence in fashioning canonical notations it is usual to drop tense distinctions. (Word and Object §36)

The philosophical disagreement about tenses is not so much about tenses in the grammatical sense, but rather about the significance of the distinctions of past, present, and future which those tenses are used to mark. The main metaphysical disagreement is about whether times and events have non-relational properties of pastness, presentness, and futurity. Does an event have or not have the property of, say, prresentness independent of the event's relation to us and our temporal location? The A-camp says it does; the B-camp disagrees.

On the tenseless theory of time, whether the infamous death of U. S. Lieutenant Colonel George Armstrong Custer occurred here depends on the speaker’s spatial relation to the death event. Is the speaker standing at the battle site in Montana, or sitting in Paris? Similarly, whether the death occurs now is equally subjective. It depends on the speaker's temporal relation to the event. That is, is the speaker hearing this in 1876 at the time the death event occurs or instead hearing this in the 21st century?

This controversy is often presented as a dispute about whether tensed facts exist, with advocates of the tenseless theory objecting to tensed facts and advocates of the tensed theory promoting them as essential. The primary function of tensed facts is to make tensed sentences true, to be their "truthmakers."

For purposes of simplifying the discussion, let us uncritically accept the correspondence of truth, that true sentences are true because they correspond to the facts. The A-theory and the B-theory disagree about what are the sorts of facts that are the truthmakers of a true, tensed sentence such as “Queen Anne of Great Britain died.” The A-theorist says the truthmaker is simply the "tensed" fact that the death is past, that is has pastness. The B-theorist gives a more complicated answer by saying the truthmaker is the fact that the time of Queen Anne’s death is-less-than the time of uttering the above sentence. Notice that the B-answer’s fact does not use any words in the past tense. According to the classical B-theorist, the use of tense (and more importantly, any appeal to tensed facts) is an extraneous and eliminable feature of our language, as is all other use of the terminology of the A-series (except in trival instances when it is self-referential such as "The A-series is constructed using A-facts").

If you, yourself had uttered “Queen Anne of Great Brain died,” then your utterance would be true. If Julius Caesar had uttered it, then his utterance would have been false. So, the truth-value of the tensed sentence is context-dependent.

The proponent of the tenseless or B viewpoint does not deny the importance or coherence of this talk about the past, but will deny that what makes the tensed sentence true is that it corresponds to a tensed fact or that the event has the property of presentness. Instead, argues the B-theorist, the truthmaker of the sentence involves only tenseless facts. For example, John's assertion that the event of Queen Anne's death occurred in the past might best be analyzed by the B-theorist as asserting that the time of the event of Queen Anne's death is-less-than the time of the event of John's assertion of the sentence. Notice that the description of the B-theory's truthmaker does not use the past tense.

This B-theory analysis is challenged by proponents of the A-theory on the grounds that it can succeed only for utterances or readings or inscriptions or explicit thoughts, but the A-theorist points out that a sentence can be true even if never uttered or read or inscribed or thought of.

There are other challenges to the B-theory. Roderick Chisholm and A. N. Prior claim that the word “is” in the sentence “It is now midnight” is essentially present tensed because there is no adequate translation using only tenseless verbs. Trying to give a B-style analysis such as, “There is a time t such that t = midnight” is to miss the essential reference to the present in the original sentence because the original sentence is not always true, but the sentence “There is a time t such that t = midnight” is always true. So, this tenseless analysis fails. There is no escape from this criticism by adding “and t is now” because this last indexical phrase needs its own analysis, and we are starting a vicious regress.

(Prior 1959) supported the tensed A-theory by arguing that after experiencing a painful event,

one says, e.g., “Thank goodness that’s over,” and [this]…says something which it is impossible that any use of a tenseless copula with a date should convey. It certainly doesn’t mean the same as, e.g., “Thank goodness the date of the conclusion of that thing is Friday, June 15, 1954,” even if it be said then. (Nor, for that matter, does it mean “Thank goodness the conclusion of that thing is contemporaneous with this utterance.” Why should anyone thank goodness for that?).

D. H. Mellor and J. J. C. Smart, proponents of the B-theory, agree that tensed talk is important for understanding how we think and speak—the temporal indexicals are essential, as are other indexicals—but they claim that tensed talk is not essential for describing extra-linguistic reality. These two philosophers, and other philosophers who "do not take tense seriously," advocate a newer tenseless B-theory by saying the truth conditions of any tensed, declarative sentence can be explained without tensed facts even if Chisholm and Prior are correct that some tensed sentences in English cannot be adequately translated into tenseless ones. [The truth conditions of a sentence are the conditions which must be satisfied in the world in order for the sentence to be true. The sentence "Snow is white" is true on the condition that snow is white. More particularly, it is true if whatever is referred to by the term 'snow' satisfies the predicate 'is white'. The conditions under which the conditional sentence "If it's snowing, then it's cold" are true are that it is not both true that it is snowing and false that it is cold. Other analyses are offered for the truth conditions of sentences that are more complex grammatically.] Mellor's and Smart's point is that truth conditions can adequately express the meaning of tensed sentences, so there is no need for tensed facts and tensed properties. The untranslatability of some tensed sentences merely shows a fault with ordinary language's ability to characterize objective, tenseless reality.

To make the same point in other words, according to the newer B-theory of Mellor and Smart, if I am speaking to you and say, "It is now midnight," then this sentence admittedly cannot be translated into tenseless terminology without loss of meaning, but the truth conditions can be explained fully with tenseless terminology. The truth conditions of "It is now midnight" are that my utterance occurs at the same time as your hearing the utterance, which in turn is the same time as when our standard clock declares the time to be midnight in our reference frame. In brief, it's true just in case it is uttered at midnight. Notice that no tensed facts are appealed to in this explanation of those truth conditions.

Similarly, an advocate of the new tenseless theory will say it is not the pastness of the painful event that explains why I say, “Thank goodness that’s over” after exiting the dentist's chair. I say it because I believe that the time of the occurrence of that utterance is greater than the time of the occurrence of the painful event, and because I am glad about this. Of course I'd be even gladder if there were no pain at any time. I may not be consciously thinking about the time of the utterance when I make it; nevertheless, that time is what helps explain what I am glad about.

In addition, it is claimed by Mellor and other new B-theorists that tenseless sentences can be used to explain the logical relations between tensed sentences; they can be used to explain why one tensed sentence implies another, is inconsistent with yet another, and so forth. According to this new theory of tenseless time, once it is established that the truth conditions of tensed sentences can be explained without utilizing tensed facts, then Ockham’s Razor is applied. If we can do without essentially-tensed facts, then we should say essentially-tensed facts do not exist.

To summarize, tensed facts were presumed by the A-theory to be needed to be the truthmakers for the truth of tensed talk; but proponents of the new B-theory claim their analysis shows that ordinary tenseless facts are adequate. The B-theory concludes that we should "not take tense seriously" in the sense of requiring tensed facts to account for the truth and falsity of sentences involving tenses because tensed facts are not needed.

Proponents of the tensed theory of time do not agree with this conclusion. Quentin Smith says, the "new tenseless theory of time is faced with insurmountable problems, and that it ought to be abandoned in favor of the tensed theory." So, the philosophical debate continues over whether tensed concepts have semantical priority over untensed concepts, and whether tensed facts have ontological priority over untensed facts.

10. What Gives Time Its Arrow?

Space has no direction, but time does. We see this about space when we notice that a bell can be moved up and down, and left or right. We see this about time when we notice that the bell can be rung but never un-rung, that whole eggs become omelets but omelets never become whole eggs, and that a stone will splash into the river and sink but the stone will never rise from the river bed and un-splash. This overall asymmetry in the direction of all the world’s large-scale processes in time is the arrow of time.

The “problem of the arrow of time” is the problem of reconciling the existence of this general arrow of time with the fact that nearly all the basic laws of science in the micro-world do not reveal the arrow. They are time-symmetric. That is, they are time reversible invariant. That means the basic laws treat going forward in time no differently than they treat coming backward in time. In other words, if the laws allow a process to go forward in time, then its going backward in time does not violate the laws. If you show a movie of fundamental phenomena in reverse, you are showing phenomena that are consistent with the laws. That is what it means for the fundamental laws to be time symmetric or time reversal symmetric or time reversible invariant. Nearly every micro-law is time symmetric, whether a Newtonian law, a law of relativity theory, or in quantum theory and the standard model of particle physics. The laws of B meson decay and kaon decay are not, but this seems to be irrelevant to the overall asymmetry of the cosmic arrow of time.

Actually, the fundamental laws are not simply time-symmetric. Strictly speaking, there is no distinction in the physical laws between the future and the past only so long as when you reverse the time you also reflect the phenomena by reversing parity (reflect it through a point) and reversing charge (turn every charged particle into its anti-particle), but we will ignore this subtle point from now on.

The second law, which is about entropy in closed systems almost always increasing and not decreasing, is sometimes said to be a time asymmetric fundamental law about thermodynamics. That remark contains two errors. (1) The Second Law is a statistical outcome of applying the fundamental laws, and is not itself a fundamental law. (2) The second law is time symmetric because it does not rule out the physical possibility of seeing entropy flow in the reverse to the way we always see it. It’s just that flow the other way is so extremely improbable, and it is this improbability that needs a deeper explanation.

Ever since 1876 when Josef Loschmidt first clearly described the problem of how to explain the arrow of time for the kinetic theory of gases, there has been considerable disagreement among the experts on how to solve the problem.

Let’s begin with four unpopular solutions: (a) God wanted the world to have an arrow like this. (b) Everything exists in some possible world or other, and our world just happens to be the one in which there is an arrow, and that’s the only reason why. (c) It’s just a brute fact with no explanation. (d) It has a correct explanation, but the cognitive power of homo sapiens is too limited to ever figure it out. (e) The arrow is a product of the human mind, and is not an objective feature of the external world.

Regarding answer (e), notice that the meteor crater appears after the collision, never before. Our measuring instruments give readings after the measuring, never before. Thinking does not make this so.

The physicists' most popular solution to the problem of the arrow of time is the one promoted by the physicist Arthur Eddington in 1927: the arrow is caused by the overall change of the world's isolated processes from low entropy to higher entropy.

Speaking informally, entropy is a numerical measure of the overall change toward disorder in isolated macroscopic systems. This overall change is a change toward equilibrium. Equilibrium—the goal state or ground state—is the state in which the system's energy is uniformly distributed, except for inevitable quantum fluctuations. It is the state in which the system is maximally disordered. Everything has run down, so to speak. The equilibrium state is the state of maximum entropy.

Entropy is not energy, however. In a closed system, the total entropy almost always increases, while the total energy stays the same.

There is a philosophical problem about Eddington's claim that entropy causes the arrow. It is not controversial that there is a correlation between time's arrow and the direction of entropy change. What is controversial is whether there's an identity or even a causal connection between the two. An alternative suggestion is that there is an intrinsic asymmetry in the geometry of spacetime that produces time's arrow, and the arrow is merely highly correlated with entropy change.

In the 19th century, Ludwig Boltzmann claimed to have discovered the reason why a closed system's entropy always increased. It is wholly a matter of probability, he said, and that is why the Second Law needs to be changed from saying entropy always increases to saying it almost always increases. Boltzmann said the probable increase of entropy is because there are so many more microscopically-indistinguishable ways for energy to be spread out than for it to be more concentrated, so, as particles in a system move around and interact, they will be more likely to adopt configurations in which the energy is more spread out. We make the same point by saying "high entropy" means there are more ways to arrange a system’s particle constituents to produce a set of fixed values for the macroscopic properties of the system, and "low entropy" means there are fewer ways. In time, the system shifts toward what is more probable. This tendency of any isolated system to evolve toward equilibrium is described quantitatively by Boltzmann’s Second Law of Thermodynamics.

A single particle has no entropy. Entropy is not a property of a single particle, such as a molecule, but only of a macroscopic group of particles. Unfortunately, physicists cannot well-define the term "macroscopic" by saying exactly how many particles are needed. Having 1023 of them is clearly sufficient; this is about Avogadro’s number of them.

At the macroscopic level, we are “coarse graining” or looking only at higher-level properties of groups of particles such as the group's entropy or heat or its density or whether the group is an ice cube or a potato. Two groups of molecules can have the same entropy, the same heat, the same density, and both be potatoes, even though the two are in completely different microstates.

Not everything has to continually increase its entropy. A child loses entropy as it grows up, but it does this at the overall expense of entropy loss in a greater system of fixed volume, one that includes the Sun and its valuable radiation reaching Earth to provide photosynthesis for plants and indirectly food for the child. Isolate Earth from the Sun’s radiation, and the child and all other life on Earth will suffer damaging entropy increases.

Ludwig Boltzmann claimed to have derived the Second Law of Thermodynamics from Newton's laws of mechanics. Josef Loschmidt complained in 1876 about the paradoxicality of deducing the practically irreversible Second Law of Thermodynamics from the reversible laws of Newtonian mechanics. This complaint is difficult to answer, and the problem is now called Loschmidt's Paradox. It is the thermodynamic version of the problem of the direction of time.

Could the low entropy initial state be the result of a random fluctuation from a larger state at equilibrium? Yes, said Boltzmann in 1895, but today’s physicists disagree with him and demand a better response to the Loschmidt Paradox.

The most favored response to the paradox is that Boltzmann's derivation contains a hidden premise. If we were to apply his derivation not from the present to the future, as he did, but rather from the present to the past, then it would imply that entropy was higher in the past. Yet we happen to know entropy was not higher in the past. It was lower. So, Boltzmann failed to notice that his derivation had assumed a hidden premise: that entropy was lower in the past. This lower entropy in turn is due to entropy being even lower in the even more distant past, and so on back.

The Past Hypothesis is the assumption, which Boltzmann did not make explicit, that in the past the state of the system's entropy was lower. The implication is that the universe's entropy was minimal at the big bang when the universe had an extremely high level of organization of its gravitational field. Theologians are fond of making this point by saying that at the big bang the universe was finely tuned.

As Sean Carroll remarks (Carroll 2012, Lecture 12), the Past Hypothesis helps us explain why a photograph is a reliable indicator of what happened in the past. Suppose we have a photograph of Donald Trump at his inauguration when he officially became president of the U.S. Without our knowing the Past Hypothesis is true, the best explanation of the origin of this photo should be that it was assembled from separated molecules without there being any inauguration event. Without the Past Hypothesis, some physicists would claim it is a mistake to infer from the existence of the photo that Trump was really inaugurated. And so it would be a mistake to infer from "I have a memory of event E" to "E happened in the past."

a. Time without an Arrow

If physical changes are all that is required for time to exist, and if the arrow of time is the overall directionality of macroscopic physical processes, and if the existing macroscopic physical changes were to be all random in the sense that any process is no more likely to go one way rather than the reverse, then there could be time without an arrow. And so there would be time with no clocks.

Tim Maudlin adds to the discussion:

[T]he temporal structure of the world, independently of its material contents, has an intrinsic directionality. The later states of the world arise from, are produced from, the earlier states. This is independent of, e.g., the direction in which entropy increases. Even if the world were at thermal equilibrium, with constant entropy, still the later states would be produced from the earlier states in accord with the fundamental laws of physics.

His point is that time could exist without an arrow.

b. What Needs to be Explained?

There are many goals for a fully developed theory of time’s arrow. It should tell us the answers to this constellation of issues: (1) whether the asymmetry in time is built into the fundamental structure of spacetime; (2) whether there are two arrows, one having to do with how physical processes evolve, and one having to do with the temporal structure of the world independently of its physical processes; (3) why the arrow points one way rather than the reverse way; (4) why the micro-physical laws of science do not readily reveal the arrow; (5) how the arrow is connected with entropy; (6) why the arrow goes in the same direction in all galaxies; (7) why it is so probable that the entropy of an isolated system increases in the future rather than decreases even though the decrease is physically possible given current basic laws; (8) what it would be like for our arrow of time to reverse direction; (9) what are the mathematical characteristics of a physical theory that would pick out a preferred direction in time; (10) what the relationships are among the various arrows of time; (11) how entropy is connected with quantum entanglement; (12) why the Past Hypothesis is true, if it is.

c. Explanations or Theories of the Arrow

Since the first quarter of the 20th century, there have been two principal explanations of the arrow of time: (i) it is a product of causation which itself is asymmetrical; (i) it is a product of one-way entropy flow which in turn is due to the initial conditions of our universe.

Leibniz first proposed explanation (i). It is called the causal theory of time's order. Informally, we understand very clearly that causation has a direction. As Craig Callender expressed the point, if I wiggle something now it cannot affect where I was born, but it might affect where I will die.

The philosopher Hans Reichenbach developed Leibniz's theory in more detail in 1928. He defined "happens before" by saying that event A happens before event B if A could have caused B, but B could not have caused A. Critics of Reichenbach have complained that the usefulness of this causal theory depends on clarifying the two notorious notions of causality and possibility without producing a circular explanation that presupposes an understanding of time order; and the critics doubt that this can be done. Also, the causal theory should explain why, if we grant that there is causal asymmetry, the asymmetry is in one direction rather than in the inverse direction. Bertrand Russell complained that time order is more fundamental than causal order; he noted that scientific laws are expressed as differential equations without using the word "cause," and said the notion of cause is "a relic of a bygone age."

The majority of 21st century physicists favor explanation (ii) involving entropy, but there is serious disagreement. And even if entropy is accepted as the explanation of the arrow, there is controversy about the Past Hypothesis.

Does Alan Guth's theory of cosmic inflation explain time asymmetry? Yes, says Paul Davies. No, says Guth; inflation shows how time asymmetry can be preserved and amplified in the early universe, but not how it began in the first place.

Can the Past Hypothesis be justified or explained in more depth? Here are some competing responses to that question. (1) The initially low entropy is simply a brute fact—that is, there is no causal explanation for it. The physicist Richard Feynman suggested this response. (2) Objecting to inexplicable initial facts as being unacceptably ad hoc, the physicists Walther Ritz and Roger Penrose have said we need to keep looking for some basic, time-asymmetrical laws that will account for the initially low entropy. (3) A third perspective on the Past Hypothesis appeals to God's having designed the big bang to start with low entropy. (4) A fourth perspective appeals to the many-worlds interpretation of quantum theory in order to argue that since there have to be so many universes with different initial entropies, there certainly has to be one universe that is like our particular universe with its particular, initially low entropy—and that is the only reason why our universe had low entropy at the beginning of the big bang. (5) An arrow of time could evolve naturally in a world with time reversible invariant laws (CPT invariant laws) and with no special initial conditions such as the Past Condition provided we wait long enough and other assumptions hold about the universe such it having and having had an expanding infinite volume, says Alan Guth. The implications for the past are, he says, that time's arrow once went backward in our very far past. See (Guth 2014).

To make one final point about entropy increase, in the early 21st century, M.I.T. professor Seth Lloyd suggested an original explanation for entropy increase: “What’s really going on [with the arrow of time pointing in the direction of equilibrium] is things are becoming more correlated with each other.” His point is that the increasing entropy in any process is really increasing quantum entanglement among the particles in that process. This does not explain, though, why things had less entanglement in the past.

d. Multiple Arrows

Consider the difference between time’s arrow and time’s arrows. The direction of entropy change is the thermodynamic arrow. Here are some suggestions for additional arrows:

  1. Causes precede their effects. (causal arrow)
  2. We remember last week, not next week.
  3. It is easier to know the past than to know the future.
  4. There is evidence of the past but not of the future.
  5. Our present actions affect the future and not the past.
  6. Possibilities decrease as time goes on.
  7. Radio waves spread out from the antenna, but never converge into it. (electromagnetic arrow)
  8. Our universe expands in volume rather than shrinks.
  9. We see black holes but never white holes; objects fall into but never out of black holes.
  10. B meson decay, neutral kaon decay, and Higgs boson decay are each different in a time reversed world.
  11. Quantum mechanical measurement collapses the wave function.
  12. We age and never get biologically younger.
  13. As time goes on, our universe splits into more parallel universes.

Many physicists suspect all these arrows are linked so that we cannot have some arrows reversing while others do not. The thermodynamic arrow, the arrow of entropy increase is the leading candidate for a unified explanation of all the arrows, but physicists are still debating this point. See chapter 15 in (Muller, 2016) for a non-technical discussion of why entropy change cannot be the cause of time's arrow, and see chapter 16 for a discussion of the competing arrows of time.

e. Reversing the Arrow

There has been disagreement over whether, if the universe’s expansion were to stop and it began to contract, the arrow of time would reverse as the contraction began. The generally accepted answer in the 21st century is that the arrow would not reverse.

But could the cosmic arrow of time have gone the other way? Most physicists agree that the answer is yes, and they say it would have gone the other way if the initial conditions of our universe at our big bang event had been very different. There could be initial conditions that make bells un-ring and dead people become living persons who live on until their birth.

In 1902 in Appearance and Reality, the British idealist philosopher F. H. Bradley said that when time runs backwards compared to our current world, "Death would come before birth, the blow would follow the wound, and all must seem irrational." The Australian philosopher J. J. C. Smart disagreed about the irrationality. He said all would seem as it is now because memory would become precognition, so an inhabitant of a time-reversed world would feel the blow and then the wound.

G. J. Whitrow in The Natural Philosophy of Time, defended Bradley and argued that memory would not become precognition; his justification was that memory, by definition, is of whatever happens first, so, "all must seem irrational."

11. What is Temporal Logic?

Temporal logic is the representation of reasoning about time and temporal information by using the methods of symbolic logic in order to formalize which statements imply which others. For example, in McTaggart's B-series, the most important relation is the happens-before relation on events. Logicians have asked what sort of principles must this relation obey in order to properly account for our reasoning about time and temporal information.

Here is one suggestion. Consider this informally valid reasoning:

Adam's arrival at the train station happens before Bryan's. Therefore, Bryan's arrival at the station does not happen before Adam's.

Let us translate this into classical predicate logic using a domain of instantaneous events, where the individual constant 'a' denotes Adam's arrival at the train station, and 'b' denotes Bryan's arrival at the train station. Let the two-place or two-argument relation Bxy be interpreted as "x happens before y." The direct translation of the above informal argument produces:

Bab
-------
~Bba

The symbol '~' is the negation operator; some logicians prefer to use the symbol '¬' for negation. Unfortunately, this simple formal argument is invalid. To make the argument become valid, we can add the implicit premise that the B relation is asymmetric. That is, we can add this additional premise to the argument:

∀x∀y[Bxy ~Byx]

The symbol '∀x' is the universal quantifier on x. Some logicians prefer to use '(x)' for the universal quantifier. The symbol '→' is the conditional operator or if-then operator; some logicians prefer to use the symbol '⊃' instead.

In other informally valid reasoning, we discover a need to make even more assumptions about the happens-before relation. For example, suppose Adam arrives at the train station before Bryan, and suppose Bryan arrives there before Charles. Is it valid reasoning to infer that Adam arrives before Charles? Yes, but if we translate directly into classical predicate logic we get this invalid argument:

Bab
Bbc
------
Bac

To make this argument be valid we can add the implicit premise that says the happens-before relation is transitive, that is:

∀x∀y∀z [(Bxy & Byz) Bxz]

The symbol '&' represents the conjunction operation. Some logicians prefer to use either the symbol '∧' or '·' for conjunction. The transitivity of B is a principle we may want to add into our temporal logic.

What other constraints should be placed on the B relation (when it is to be interpreted as the happens-before relation)? Here are some of the many suggestions: (1) ∀x~Bxx. An event cannot happen before itself. (2) ∀x∀y{[t(x) ≠ t(y)] → [Bxy v Byx]}. Any two non-simultaneous events are related somehow by the B relation. That is, there are no temporally unrelated pairs of events. 't(x)' is the time coordinate for event x. (3) ∀x∀y(Bxy → ~Byx). In a pair of events, one cannot happen both before and after the other. (4) ∀x∃yBxy. Time is infinite in the future. (5)∀x∀y(x ≠ y → ∃z(Bxz & Bzy)). B is dense in the sense that there is a third point event between any pair of non-simultaneous point events. This prevents quantized time.

To incorporate the ideas of the theory of relativity, we might want to make the happens-before relation be three-valued instead of two-valued by having it relate two events plus a reference frame.

When we formalized these principles of reasoning about the happens-before relation by translating them into predicate logic, we said we were creating temporal logic. However, strictly speaking a temporal logic is just a formal theory expressed in a logic. Calling it a logic, as is commonly done, is analogous to calling the formalization of Peano's axioms of arithmetic the development of number logic. Our axioms about B are not axioms of predicate logic, but only of a theory that uses predicate logic and that presumes the logic is interpreted on a domain of instantaneous events, and that presumes B is not open to re-interpretation as are the other predicate letters of predicate logic, but is always to be interpreted as "happens-before."

The more classical approach to temporal logic, however, does not add implicit premises to arguments formalized in classical predicate logic as we have just been doing. The classical approach is via tense logic, a formalism that adds tense operators on propositions of propositional logic or predicate logic. A. N. Prior was the pioneer in the late 1950s. Michael Dummett and E. J. Lemmon also made major, early contributions to tense logic. Prior created this new logic to describe our reasoning involving time phrases such as “now,” “happens before,” “twenty-three minutes afterwards,” “at all times,” and “sometimes.” He hoped that a precise, formal treatment of these concepts could lead to resolution of some of the controversial philosophical issues about time.

Prior begins with an important assumption: that a proposition such as “Custer dies in Montana” can be true at one time and false at another time. That assumption is challenged by some philosophers, such as W. V. O. Quine, who prefer to avoid use of this sort of context-dependent proposition and who recommends that temporal logics use only sentences that are timelessly true or timelessly false. This treatment also would rule out indexical terms such as "him" and "now" whose reference (but not meaning) can shift from one context to another.

Prior's main original idea was to appreciate that time concepts are similar in structure to modal concepts such as “it is possible that” and “it is necessary that.” He adapted modal propositional logic for his tense logic by re-interpreting its propositional operators. Or we can say he added four new propositional operators. Here they are with examples of their intended interpretations using an arbitrary present-tensed proposition p.

Pp “It has at some time been the case that p"
Fp “It will at some time be the case that p”
Hp “It has always been the case that p”
Gp “It will always be the case that p”

'Pp' might be interpreted also as "at some past time it was the case that,” or “it once was the case that,” or "it once was that," all these being equivalent English phrases for the purposes of applying tense logic to English.

One standard system of tense logic is a variant of the S4.3 system of modal logic. In this formal tense logic, if p represents the present-tensed proposition “Custer dies in Montana,” then Pp represents "It has at some time been the case that Custer dies in Montana" which is equivalent in English to simply "Custer died in Montana." So, we call P the past-tense operator.

Metaphysicians who are presentists are especially interested in this tense logic because, if Prior can make do with the variable p ranging only over present-tensed propositions, then this logic, with an appropriate semantics, may show how to eliminate any ontological commitment to the past and future while preserving the truth of past tense propositions that appear in biology books such as "There were dinosaurs" and "There was a time when the Earth did not exist."

Prior added to the axioms of classical propositional logic the axiom

P(p v q) ↔ (Pp v Pq).

The axiom says that for any two propositions p and q, at some past time it was the case that p or q if and only if either at some past time it was the case that p or at some past time (perhaps a different past time) it was the case that q.

If p is the proposition “Custer dies in Montana” and q is “Sitting Bull dies in Montana,” then

P(p v q) ↔ (Pp v Pq)

says

Custer or Sitting Bull died in Montana if and only if either Custer died in Montana or Sitting Bull died in Montana.

The S4.3 system’s key axiom is the following equivalence. For all propositions p and q,

(Pp & Pq) ↔ [P(p & q) v P(p & Pq) v P(q & Pp)].

This axiom when interpreted in tense logic captures part of our ordinary conception of time as a linear succession of states of the world.

Another axiom of tense logic might state that if proposition q is true, then it will always be true that q has been true at some time. If H is the operator “It has always been the case that,” then a new axiom might be

Pp ↔ ~H~p.

This axiom of tense logic is analogous to the modal logic axiom that p is possible if and only if it is not necessary that not-p.

A tense logic may need additional axioms in order to express “q has been true for the past two weeks.” Prior and others have suggested a wide variety of additional axioms for tense logic. It is controversial whether to add axioms that express the topology of time, for example that it comes to an end or doesn't come to an end; the reason usually given is that this is an empirical matter, not a matter for logic to settle.

Regarding a semantics for tense logic, Prior had the idea that the truth or falsehood of a tensed proposition could be expressed in terms of truth-at-a-time. For example, the proposition Pp (it was once the case that p) is true-at-a-time t if and only if p is true-at-a-time earlier than t. This suggestion has led to an extensive development of the formal semantics for tense logic.

Prior himself did not take a stand on which formal logic and formal semantics was correct for dealing with temporal expressions.

The concept of being in the past is usually treated by metaphysicians as a predicate that assigns properties to events, for example, "The event of Queen Anne's dying has the property of being in the past"; but, in the tense logic just presented, the concept is treated as an operator P upon propositions, "It has at some time in the past been the case that Queen Anne is dying," and this difference in treatment is objectionable to some metaphysicians.

The other major approach to temporal logic does not use a tense logic. Instead, it formalizes temporal reasoning within a first-order logic without modal-like tense operators. One method for developing ideas about temporal logic is the method of temporal arguments which adds an additional temporal argument to any predicate involving time in order to indicate how its satisfaction depends on time. Instead of translating the “x is resting” predicate as Qx, where Q is a one-argument predicate, it could be translated into temporal predicate logic as the two-argument predicate Rxt, and this would be interpreted as saying x is resting at time t. Q has been changed to a two-argument predicate R by adding a “temporal argument.” The time variable 't' is treated as a new sort of variable requiring new axioms to more carefully specify what can be assumed about the nature of time.

Occasionally the method of temporal arguments uses a special constant symbol, say 'n', to denote now, the present time. This helps with the translation of common temporal sentences. For example, let the individual constant 's' denote Socrates, and let Rst be interpreted as “Socrates is resting at t.” The false sentence that Socrates has always been resting would be expressed in this first-order temporal logic as

∀t(Ltn → Rst)

Here 'L' is the two-argument predicate for numerically less than that mathematicians usually write as '<'. And we see the usefulness of having the symbol 'n'.

Some temporal logics have a semantics that allows sentences to lack both classical truth-values. The first person to give a clear presentation of the implications of treating declarative sentences as being neither true nor false was the Polish logician Jan Lukasiewicz in 1920. To carry out Aristotle’s suggestion that future contingent sentences do not yet have truth-values, he developed a three-valued symbolic logic, with each grammatical declarative sentence having the truth-values True, or False, or else Indeterminate [T, F, or I]. Contingent sentences about the future, such as, "There will be a sea battle tomorrow," are assigned an I value in order to indicate the indeterminacy of the future. Truth tables for the connectives of propositional logic are redefined to maintain logical consistency and to maximally preserve our intuitions about truth and falsehood. See (Haack 1974) for more details about this application of three-valued logic.

For an introduction to temporal logics and their formal semantics, see (Øhrstrøm and Hasle 1995).

12. Supplements

a. Frequently Asked Questions

The following questions are addressed in the Time Supplement article:

  1. What are Instants and Durations?
  2. What is an Event?
  3. What is a Reference Frame?
  4. What is an Inertial Frame?
  5. What is Spacetime?
  6. What is a Minkowski Diagram?
  7. What are the Metric and the Interval?
  8. Does the Theory of Relativity Imply Time is Part of Space?
  9. Is Time the Fourth Dimension?
  10. Is There More Than One Kind of Physical Time?
  11. How is Time Relative to the Observer?
  12. What is the Relativity of Simultaneity?
  13. What is the Conventionality of Simultaneity?
  14. What is the Difference Between the Past and the Absolute Past?
  15. What is Time Dilation?
  16. How does Gravity Affect Time?
  17. What Happens to Time Near a Black Hole?
  18. What is the Solution to the Twin Paradox (the Clock Paradox)?
  19. What is the Solution to Zeno’s Paradoxes?
  20. How do Time Coordinates Get Assigned to Points of Spacetime?
  21. How do Dates Get Assigned to Actual Events?
  22. What is Essential to Being a Clock?
  23. What does It Mean for a Clock To Be Accurate?
  24. What is Our Standard Clock?
  25. Why are Some Standard Clocks Better than Others?
  26. What is a Field?

b. What Else Science Requires of Time

What Else Science Requires of Time

c. Special Relativity: Proper times, Coordinate systems, and Lorentz Transformations

Proper Times, Coordinate Systems, and Lorentz Transformations (by Andrew Holster)

13. References and Further Reading

  • Barbour, Julian. The End of Time, Weidenfeld and Nicolson, London, and Oxford University Press, New York, 1999.
    • A popular presentation of Barbour's theory that if we could see the universe as it is, we should see that it is static. It is static, he says, because his way of quantizing general relativity, namely quantum geometrodynamics with its Wheeler-DeWitt equation, implies a time-independent quantum state for the universe as a whole. He then offers an exotic explanation of why time seems to exist.
  • Butterfield, Jeremy. “Seeing the Present” Mind, 93, (1984), pp. 161-76.
    • Defends the B-camp position on the subjectivity of the present; and argues against a global present.
  • Callender, Craig, and Ralph Edney. Introducing Time, Totem Books, USA, 2001.
    • A cartoon-style book covering most of the topics in this encyclopedia article in a more elementary way. Each page is two-thirds graphics and one-third text.
  • Callender, Craig and Carl Hoefer. “Philosophy of Space-Time Physics” in The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Science, ed. by Peter Machamer and Michael Silberstein, Blackwell Publishers, 2002, pp. 173-98.
    • Discusses whether it is a fact or a convention that in a reference frame the speed of light going one direction is the same as the speed coming back.
  • Callender, Craig. "Is Time an Illusion?", Scientific American, June, 2010, pp. 58-65.
    • Explains how the belief that time is fundamental may be an illusion.
  • Carroll, John W. and Ned Markosian. An Introduction to Metaphysics. Cambridge University Press, 2010.
    • This introductory, undergraduate metaphysics textbook contains an excellent chapter introducing the metaphysical issues involving time, beginning with the McTaggart controversy.
  • Carroll, Sean. From Eternity to Here: The Quest for the Ultimate Theory of Time, Dutton/Penguin Group, New York, 2010.
    • Part Three "Entropy and Time's Arrow" provides a very clear explanation of the details of the problems involved with time's arrow. For an interesting answer to the question of whether any interaction between our part of the universe and a part in which the arrow of times goes in reverse, see endnote 137 for p. 164.
  • Carroll, Sean. "Ten Things Everyone Should Know About Time," Discover Magazine, Cosmic Variance, online 2011.
    • Contains the quotation about how the mind reconstructs its story of what is happening "now."
  • Carroll, Sean. Mysteries of Modern Physics: Time. The Teaching Company, The Great Courses: Chantilly, Virginia 2012.
    • A series of popular lectures about time by a renowned physicist with an interest in philosophical issues, but emphasizing the arrow of time.
  • Damasio, Antonio R. “Remembering When,” Scientific American: Special Edition: A Matter of Time, vol. 287, no. 3, 2002; reprinted in Katzenstein, 2006, pp.34-41.
    • A look at the brain structures involved in how our mind organizes our experiences into the proper temporal order. Includes a discussion of Benjamin Libet’s claim to have discovered in the 1970s that the brain events involved in initiating a free choice occur about a third of a second before we are aware of our making the choice. This claim has radical implications for the philosophical issue of free will.
  • Dainton, Barry. Time and Space, Second Edition, McGill-Queens University Press: Ithaca, 2010.
    • An easy-to-read, but technically correct, book. This is probably the best single book to read for someone desiring to understand in more depth the issues presented in this encyclopedia article.
  • Davies, Paul. About Time: Einstein’s Unfinished Revolution, Simon & Schuster, 1995.
    • An easy to read survey of the impact of the theory of relativity on our understanding of time.
  • Davies, Paul. How to Build a Time Machine, Viking Penguin, 2002.
    • A popular exposition of the details behind the possibilities of time travel.
  • Deutsch, David and Michael Lockwood, “The Quantum Physics of Time Travel,” Scientific American, pp. 68-74. March 1994.
    • An investigation of the puzzle of getting information for free by traveling in time.
  • Dowden, Bradley. The Metaphysics of Time: A Dialogue, Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc. 2009.
    • An undergraduate textbook in dialogue form that covers many of the topics discussed in this encyclopedia article.
  • Dummett, Michael. “Is Time a Continuum of Instants?,” Philosophy, 2000, Cambridge University Press, pp. 497-515.
    • A constructivist model of time that challenges the idea that time is composed of durationless instants.
  • Eagleman David. "Brain Time," What's Next? Dispatches on the Future of Science. Max Brockman, Ed., Penguin Random House. 2009.
    • A neuroscientist discusses the plasticity of time perception or temporal distortion.
  • Eagleman David. "David Eagleman on CHOICE," Oct. 4, 2011. https://www.youtube.com/watch?v=MkANniH8XZE.
    • Commentary on research on subjective time.
  • Earman, John. “Implications of Causal Propagation Outside the Null-Cone," Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 50, 1972, pp. 222-37.
    • Describes his rocket paradox that challenges time travel to the past.
  • Fisher, A. R. J. “David Lewis, Donald C. Williams, and the History of Metaphysics in the Twentieth Century.” Journal of the American Philosophical Association, volume 1, issue 1, Spring 2015.
    • Discusses the disagreements between Lewis and Williams, who both are four-dimensionalists, about the nature of time travel.
  • Gödel, Kurt. "A Remark about the Relationship between Relativity Theory and Idealistic Philosophy," in P. A. Schilpp, ed., Albert Einstein: Philosopher-Scientist, Harper & Row, New York. 1959.
    • Discussion of solutions to Einstein's equations that allow closed causal chains, that is, traveling to your past.
  • Grant, Andrew. "Time's Arrow," Science News, July 25, 2015, pp. 15-18.
    • Popular description of why our early universe was so orderly even though nature should always have preferred the disorderly.
  • Greene, Brian. The Hidden Reality: Parallel Universes and the Deep Laws of the Universe, Vintage Books, New York. 2011.
    • Describes nine versions of the Multiverse Theory, including the Ultimate multiverse theory described by the philosopher Robert Nozick.
  • Grünbaum, Adolf. “Relativity and the Atomicity of Becoming,” Review of Metaphysics, 1950-51, pp. 143-186.
    • An attack on the notion of time’s flow, and a defense of the treatment of time and space as being continua and of physical processes as being aggregates of point-events. Difficult reading.
  • Guth, Alan. "Infinite Phase Space and the Two-Headed Arrow of Time," FQXi conference 2014 in Vieques, Puerto Rico. https://www.youtube.com/watch?v=AmamlnbDX9I. 2014.
    • Guth argues that an arrow of time could evolve naturally even though it had no special initial conditions on entropy, provided the universe has an infinite available phase space in which the universe could spread out into. If so, it's maximum possible entropy is infinite, and any other state in which the universe begins will have relatively low entropy.
  • Haack, Susan. Deviant Logic, Cambridge University Press, 1974.
    • Chapter 4 contains a clear account of Aristotle’s argument (in section 9c of the present article) for truth-value gaps, and its development in Lukasiewicz’s three-valued logic.
  • Hawking, Stephen. “The Chronology Protection Hypothesis,” Physical Review. D 46, p. 603, 1992.
    • Here Hawking recommends saying we should not trust any physical theory that allows travel to the past. But because general relativity does allow this, and because Hawking has no replacement theory to offer, most physicists do not believe the Chronology Protection Hypothesis.
  • Hawking, Stephen. A Brief History of Time, Updated and Expanded Tenth Anniversary Edition, Bantam Books, 1996.
    • A leading theoretical physicist provides introductory chapters on space and time, black holes, the origin and fate of the universe, the arrow of time, and time travel. Hawking suggests that perhaps our universe originally had four space dimensions and no time dimension, and time came into existence when one of the space dimensions evolved into a time dimension. He calls this space dimension “imaginary time.”
  • Horwich, Paul. Asymmetries in Time, The MIT Press, 1987.
    • A monograph that relates the central problems of time to other problems in metaphysics, philosophy of science, philosophy of language and philosophy of action.
  • Husserl, Edmund. On the Phenomenology of the Consciousnss of Internal Time. Translated by J. B. Brough. Originally published 1893-1917. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1991.
    • The father of phenomenology discusses internal time consciousness.
  • Katzenstein, Larry, ed. Scientific American Special Edition: A Matter of Time, vol. 16, no. 1, 2006.
    • A collection of Scientific American articles about time.
  • Kirk, G.S. & Raven, J.E. The Presocratic Philosophers. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1957.
  • Krauss, Lawrence M. and Glenn D. Starkman, “The Fate of Life in the Universe,” Scientific American Special Edition: The Once and Future Cosmos, Dec. 2002, pp. 50-57.
    • Discusses the future of intelligent life and how it might adapt to and survive the expansion of the universe.
  • Krauss, Lawrence M. A Universe from Nothing. Atria Paperback, New York, 2012.
    • Discusses on p. 170 why we live in a universe with time rather than with no time. The issue is pursued further in the afterward to the paperback edition that is not included within the hardback edition. Krauss' position on why there is something rather than nothing was challenged by the philosopher David Albert in his March 23, 2012 review of Krauss' hardback book in The New York Times newspaper.
  • Kretzmann, Norman, “Omniscience and Immutability,” The Journal of Philosophy, July 1966, pp. 409-421.
    • If God knows what time it is, does this demonstrate that God is not immutable?
  • Lasky, Ronald C. “Time and the Twin Paradox,” in Katzenstein, 2006, pp. 21-23.
    • A short, but careful and authoritative analysis of the twin paradox, with helpful graphs showing how each twin would view his clock and the other twin’s clock during the trip. Because of the spaceship’s changing velocity by turning around, the twin on the spaceship has a shorter world-line than the Earth-based twin and takes less time than the Earth-based twin.
  • Le Poidevin, Robin and Murray MacBeath, The Philosophy of Time, Oxford University Press, 1993.
    • A collection of twelve influential articles on the passage of time, subjective facts, the reality of the future, the unreality of time, time without change, causal theories of time, time travel, causation, empty time, topology, possible worlds, tense and modality, direction and possibility, and thought experiments about time. Difficult reading for undergraduates.
  • Le Poidevin, Robin, Travels in Four Dimensions: The Enigmas of Space and Time, Oxford University Press, 2003.
    • A philosophical introduction to conceptual questions involving space and time. Suitable for use as an undergraduate textbook without presupposing any other course in philosophy. There is a de-emphasis on teaching the scientific theories, and an emphasis on elementary introductions to the relationship of time to change, the implications that different structures for time have for our understanding of causation, difficulties with Zeno’s Paradoxes, whether time passes, the nature of the present, and why time has an arrow. The treatment of time travel says, rather oddly, that time machines “disappear” and that when a “time machine leaves for 2101, it simply does not exist in the intervening times,” as measured from an external reference frame.
  • Lewis, David. "The Paradoxes of Time Travel." American Philosophical Quarterly, 13:145-52, 1976.
    • A classic argument against changing the past. Lewis assumes the B-theory of time.
  • Lockwood, Michael, The Labyrinth of Time: Introducing the Universe, Oxford University Press, 2005.
    • A philosopher of physics presents the implications of contemporary physics for our understanding of time. Chapter 15, “Schrödinger’s Time-Traveller,” presents the Oxford physicist David Deutsch’s quantum analysis of time travel.
  • Markosian, Ned, “A Defense of Presentism,” in Zimmerman, Dean (ed.), Oxford Studies in Metaphysics, Vol. 1, Oxford University Press, 2003.
  • Maudlin, Tim. The Metaphysics Within Physics, Oxford University Press, 2007.
    • Chapter 4, “On the Passing of Time,” defends the dynamic theory of time’s flow, and argues that the passage of time is objective.
  • McCall, Storrs. "II. Temporal Flux," American Philosophical Quarterly, October 1966.
    • An analysis of the block universe, the flow of time, and the difference between past and future.
  • McTaggart, J. M. E. The Nature of Existence, Cambridge University Press, 1927.
    • Chapter 33 restates more clearly the arguments that McTaggart presented in 1908 for his A series and B series and how they should be understood to show that time is unreal. Difficult reading. The argument that a single event is in the past, is present, and will be future yet it is inconsistent for an event to have more than one of these properties is called "McTaggart's Paradox." The chapter is renamed "The Unreality of Time," and is reprinted on pp. 23-59 of (Le Poidevin and MacBeath 1993).
  • Mellor, D. H. Real Time II, International Library of Philosophy, 1998.
    • This monograph presents a subjective theory of tenses. Mellor argues that the truth conditions of any tensed sentence can be explained without tensed facts.
  • Morris, Michael S. and Kip S. Thorne and Ulvi Yurtsever, "Wormholes, Time Machines, and the Weak Energy Condition," Physical Review Letters, vol. 61, no. 13, 26 September 1988.
    • The first description of how to build a time machine using a wormhole.
  • Mozersky, M. Joshua. "The B-Theory in the Twentieth Century," in A Companion to the Philosophy of Time. Ed. by Heather Dyke and Adrian Bardon, John Wiley & Sons, Inc., 2013, pp. 167-182.
    • A detailed evaluation and defense of the B-Theory.
  • Muller, Richard A. NOW: The Physics of Time. W. W. Norton & Company, New York, 2016.
    • An informal presentation of the nature of time by an experimental physicist at U.C. Berkeley. Chapter 15 argues that the correlation between the arrow of time and the increase of entropy is not a causal connection. Chapter 16 discusses the competing arrows of time. Muller favors space expansion as the cause of time's arrow, with entropy not being involved. And he recommends a big bang theory in which both space and time expand, not simply space.
  • Nadis, Steve. "Starting Point," Discover, September 2013, pp. 36-41.
    • Non-technical discussion of the argument by cosmologist Alexander Vilenkin that the past of the multiverse must be finite (there was a first bubble) but its future must be infinite (always more bubbles).
  • Norton, John. "Time Really Passes," Humana.Mente: Journal of Philosophical Studies, 13 April 2010.
    • Argues that "We don't find passage in our present theories and we would like to preserve the vanity that our physical theories of time have captured all the important facts of time. So we protect our vanity by the stratagem of dismissing passage as an illusion."
  • Øhrstrøm, P. and P. F. V. Hasle. Temporal Logic: from Ancient Ideas to Artificial Intelligence. Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1995.
    • An elementary introduction to the logic of temporal reasoning.
  • Perry, John. "The Problem of the Essential Indexical," Noûs, 13(1), (1979), pp. 3-21.
    • Argues that indexicals are essential to what we want to say in natural language; they cannot be eliminated in favor of B-theory discourse.
  • Pinker, Steven. The Stuff of Thought: Language as a Window into Human Nature, Penguin Group, 2007.
    • Chapter 4 discusses how the conceptions of space and time are expressed in language in a way very different from that described by either Kant or Newton. Page 189 says that time in only half the world’s languages is the ordering of events expressed in the form of grammatical tenses. Chinese has no tenses, in the sense of verb conjugations, but of course it expresses all sorts of concepts about time in other ways.
  • Pöppel, Ernst. Mindworks: Time and Conscious Experience. San Diego: Harcourt Brace Jovanovich. 1988.
    • A neuroscientist explores our experience of time.
  • Prior, A. N. “Thank Goodness That’s Over,” Philosophy, 34 (1959), p. 17.
    • Argues that a tenseless or B-theory of time fails to account for our relief that painful past events are in the past rather than in the present.
  • Prior, A. N. Past, Present and Future, Oxford University Press, 1967.
    • A pioneering work in temporal logic, the symbolic logic of time, which permits propositions to be true at one time and false at another.
  • Prior, A. N. “Critical Notices: Richard Gale, The Language of Time,” Mind, 78, no. 311, 1969, 453-460.
    • Contains his attack on the attempt to define time in terms of causation.
  • Prior, A. N. “The Notion of the Present,” Studium Generale, volume 23, 1970, pp. 245-8.
    • A brief defense of presentism, the view that the past and the future are not real.
  • Putnam, Hilary. "Time and Physical Geometry," The Journal of Philosophy, 64 (1967), pp. 240-246.
    • Comments on whether Aristotle is a presentist and why Aristotle was wrong if Relativity is right.
  • Russell, Bertrand. "On the Experience of Time," Monist, 25 (1915), pp. 212-233.
    • The classical tenseless theory.
  • Rovelli, Carlo. Reality is Not What It Seems: The Journey to Quantum Gravity. Riverhead Books, New York, 2017.
    • A look at time in the theory of loop quantum gravity.
  • Russell, Bertrand. Our Knowledge of the External World. W. W. Norton and Co., New York, 1929, pp. 123-128.
    • Russell develops his formal theory of time that presupposes the relational theory of time.
  • Saunders, Simon. "How Relativity Contradicts Presentism," in Time, Reality & Experience edited by Craig Callender, Cambridge University Press, 2002, pp. 277-292.
    • Reviews the arguments for and against the claim that, since the present in the theory of relativity is relative to reference frame, presentism must be incorrect.
  • Savitt, Steven F. (ed.). Time’s Arrows Today: Recent Physical and Philosophical Work on the Direction of Time. Cambridge University Press, 1995.
    • A survey of research in this area, presupposing sophisticated knowledge of mathematics and physics.
  • Sciama, Dennis. “Time ‘Paradoxes’ in Relativity,” in The Nature of Time edited by Raymond Flood and Michael Lockwood, Basil Blackwell, 1986, pp. 6-21.
    • A good account of the twin paradox.
  • Shoemaker, Sydney. “Time without Change,” Journal of Philosophy, 66 (1969), pp. 363-381.
    • A thought experiment designed to show us circumstances in which the existence of changeless periods in the universe could be detected.
  • Sider, Ted. “The Stage View and Temporary Intrinsics,” The Philosophical Review, 106 (2) (2000), pp. 197-231.
    • Examines the problem of temporary intrinsics and the pros and cons of four-dimensionalism.
  • Sklar, Lawrence. Space, Time, and Spacetime, University of California Press, 1976.
    • Chapter III, Section E discusses general relativity and the problem of substantival spacetime, where Sklar argues that Einstein’s theory does not support Mach’s views against Newton’s interpretations of his bucket experiment; that is, Mach’s argument against substantivialism fails.
  • Smith, Quentin. "Problems with the New Tenseless Theories of Time," pp. 38-56 in Oaklander, L. Nathan and Smith, Quentin (eds.), The New Theory of Time, New Haven: Yale University Press, 1994.
    • Challenges the new B-theory of time promoted by Mellor and Smith.
  • Sorabji, Richard. Matter, Space, & Motion: Theories in Antiquity and Their Sequel. Cornell University Press, 1988.
    • Chapter 10 discusses ancient and contemporary accounts of circular time.
  • Steinhardt, Paul J. "The Inflation Debate: Is the theory at the heart of modern cosmology deeply flawed?" Scientific American, April, 2011, pp. 36-43.
    • Argues that the big bang Theory with inflation is incorrect and that we need a cyclic cosmology with an eternal series of big bangs and big crunches but with no inflation.
  • Thomson, Judith Jarvis. "Parthood and Identity across Time," Journal of Philosophy 80, 1983, 201-20.
    • Argues against four-dimensionalism and its idea of objects having infinitely many temporal parts.
  • Van Fraassen, Bas C. An Introduction to the Philosophy of Time and Space, Columbia University Press, 1985.
    • An advanced undergraduate textbook by an important philosopher of science.
  • Veneziano, Gabriele. “The Myth of the Beginning of Time,” Scientific American, May 2004, pp. 54-65, reprinted in Katzenstein, 2006, pp. 72-81.
    • An account of string theory’s impact on our understanding of time’s origin. Veneziano hypothesizes that our big bang was not the origin of time but simply the outcome of a preexisting state.
  • Whitrow, G. J. The Natural Philosophy of Time, Second Edition, Clarendon Press, 1980.
    • A broad survey of the topic of time and its role in physics, biology, and psychology. Pitched at a higher level than the Davies books.

Author Information

Bradley Dowden
Email: dowden@csus.edu
California State University, Sacramento
U. S. A.