Time is what clocks measure. The three key features of time are that it orders events in sequence one after the other; it specifies how long any event lasts; and it specifies when events occur. Yet despite 2,500 years of investigating time, many issues about it are unresolved. Here is a list of the most important ones, in no particular order: •What time actually is; •Whether time exists when nothing is changing; •What kinds of time travel are possible; •Why time has an arrow; •Whether the future and past are as real as the present; •How to analyze the metaphor of time’s flow; •Whether contingent sentences about the future have truth values now; •Whether future time will be infinite; •Whether there was time before the Big Bang event; •Whether tensed or tenseless concepts are semantically basic; •What the proper formalism or logic is for capturing the special role that time plays in reasoning; •What neural mechanisms account for our experience of time; •Which aspects of time are conventional; •Why time is one-dimensional and not two-dimensional; and •Whether there is a timeless substratum from which time emerges.
Some of these issues will be resolved by scientific advances alone, but others require philosophical analysis. For example, we look to science to explain why time has only one dimension, but we expect that answering the question of whether the future is real is a matter for philosophical analysis.
Consider this one issue upon which philosophers are deeply divided: What sort of ontological differences are there among the present, past and future? There are three competing theories. Presentists argue that necessarily only present objects and present experiences are real, and we conscious beings recognize this in the special “vividness” of our present experience. So, the dinosaurs have slipped out of reality. However, according to the growing-universe or growing-block theory, the past and present are both real, but the future is not real because the future is indeterminate or merely potential. Dinosaurs are real, but our death is not. The third theory is that there are no objective ontological differences among present, past, and future because the differences are merely subjective. This view is called “the block universe theory” or “eternalism.”
That controversy raises the issue of tenseless versus tensed theories of time. The block universe theory implies a tenseless theory. The earliest version of this theory implied that tensed terminology can be replaced adequately with tenseless terminology. For example, the future-tensed sentence, “The Lakers will win the basketball game” might be analyzed as, “The Lakers do win at time t, and time t happens after the time of this utterance.” Notice that the future tense has been removed, and the new verb phrases “do win” and “happens after” are tenseless logically, although they are grammatically in the present tense. (Similarly, when we use the present-tense verb “is” in “Seven plus five is twelve” we are not making a claim just about the present.) Advocates of a tensed theory counter by saying that tenseless terminology is not semantically basic but should be analyzed in tensed terms, and that tensed facts are needed to make tensed statements be true. For example, a tensed theory might imply that no adequate account of the present tensed fact that it is now midnight can be given without irreducible tensed properties such as presentness or now-ness. So, the philosophical debate is over whether tensed concepts have semantical priority over untensed concepts, and whether tensed facts have ontological priority over untensed facts.
Table of Contents
- What Should a Philosophical Theory of Time Do?
- How Is Time Related to Mind?
- What Is Time?
- What Does Science Require of Time?
- What Kinds of Time Travel Are Possible?
- Does Time Require Change? (Relational vs. Substantival Theories)
- Does Time Flow?
- What Gives Time Its Direction or Arrow?
- What are the Differences among the Past, Present, and Future?
- Are There Essentially-Tensed Facts?
- What is Temporal Logic?
- References and Further Reading
Philosophers of time tend to divide into two broad camps on some of the key philosophical issues, although many philosophers do not fit into these pigeonholes. Members of the A camp say that McTaggart’s A-theory is the fundamental way to view time; the now is objectively real and so is time’s flow; ontologically we should accept either presentism or the growing-past theory; predictions are not true or false at the time they are uttered; tenses are semantically basic; and the ontologically fundamental entities are 3-dimensional objects. Members of the B camp say that McTaggart’s B-theory is the fundamental way to view time; the now is subjective and so is time’s flow; ontologically we should accept eternalism or the block universe theory; predictions are true or false at the time they are uttered; tenses are not semantically basic; and the fundamental entities are 4-dimensional events. This article provides an introduction to this controversy between the camps.
However, there are many other issues about time whose solutions do not fit into one or the other of the above two camps. (i) Does time exist only for beings who have minds? (ii) What sorts of time travel are possible? (iii) Why does time have an arrow? (iv) Can time exist if no event is happening anywhere? This last question raises the thorny metaphysical issue of relational vs. substantival theories of time. (v) Is time a fundamental feature of nature, or does it emerge from more basic timeless features–in analogy to the way the smoothness of water flow emerges from the complicated behavior of the underlying molecules, none of which is properly called “smooth”? (vi) How is science’s concept of time related to an ordinary speaker’s concept of time?
A full theory of time should address this constellation of philosophical issues about time. Narrower theories of time will focus on resolving one or more members of this constellation, but the long-range goal is to knit together these theories into a full, systematic, and detailed theory of time. Given a theory of time, philosophers may ask the metaphysical question about realism vs. anti-realism, “Is the proper goal in producing a theory of time to produce true propositions (such as, “An interval of time is a set of densely ordered instants”) corresponding to the universe’s temporal facts and to have theoretical terms (such as “instant” and “set of densely ordered instants”) that successfully refer to existing objects, or is the goal to produce merely a useful or empirically adequate set of propositions and theoretical terms for explaining observable phenomena?” This is the question of adopting a realist vs. anti-realist interpretation of a theory, but this article does not explore this subtle metaphysical question.
Physical time is public time, the time that clocks are designed to measure. Biological time is indicated by an organism’s circadian rhythm or body clock, which is normally regulated by the pattern of sunlight and darkness. Psychological time is private time. It is also called phenomenological time, and it is perhaps best understood as awareness of physical time. Psychological time passes relatively swiftly for us while we are enjoying an activity, but it slows dramatically if we are waiting anxiously for the pot of water to boil on the stove. The slowness is probably due to focusing our attention on short intervals of physical time. Meanwhile, the clock by the stove is measuring physical time and is not affected by anybody’s awareness. Psychological time is faster for older people than for children. Some philosophers claim that psychological time is completely transcended in the mental state called nirvana because psychological time slows to a complete stop.
When a physicist defines speed to be the rate of change of position with respect to time, the term “time” refers to physical time, not psychological time. Physical time is more basic than psychological time for helping us understand our shared experiences in the world, and so it is more useful for doing science, but psychological time is vitally important for understanding many human thought processes.
Within the field of cognitive science, one wants to know what are the neural mechanisms that account not only for our experience of time’s flow, but also for our ability to place events into the proper time order. We have immediate experiences of a difference between our present perceptions and our present memories of past perceptions. Those differences are interpreted by us as evidence that the world we are experiencing is changing through time. Most cognitive scientists and philosophers believe our ability to imagine other times is a necessary ingredient in our having consciousness.
The most surprising experimental result about psychological time is Benjamin Libet’s experiments in the 1970s that show, or so it is claimed, that the brain events involved in initiating our free choices occur about a third of a second before we are aware of our choice. Before Libet’s work, it was universally agreed that a person is aware of deciding to act freely, then later the body initiates the action. Libet’s work has been used to challenge this universal claim about decisions. However, Libet’s own experiments have been difficult to repeat because he drilled through the skull and inserted electrodes to shock the underlying brain tissue.
The brain takes an active role in building a mental scenario of what is taking place beyond the brain. For example, try tapping your nose with one hand and your knee with your other hand at the same time. Even though it takes longer for the signal from your knee to reach your brain than the signal from your knee, you will have the experience of the two tappings being simultaneous thanks to the brain’s manipulation of the data. Neuroscientists suggest that your brain waits about 80 milliseconds for all the relevant input to come in before you experience a “now.” Craig Callender surveys the psycho-physics literature on human experience of the present, and concludes that, if the duration between two experienced events is less than about a quarter of a second, then humans will say both events happened simultaneously, and this duration is different for different people but stable within the experience of any single person. Also, “our impression of subjective present-ness…can be manipulated in a variety of ways” such as by what other sights or sounds are present at nearby times. (Callender, 2003-4, p. 124)
Neuroscientists and psychologists have investigated whether they can speed up our minds relative to physical time. If so, we might become mentally more productive, and get more high quality decision making done per fixed amount of physical time, and learn more per minute. Several avenues have been explored: using cocaine, amphetamines and other drugs, undergoing extreme experiences such as jumping backwards off a tall tower with bungee cords attached to one’s ankles, and trying different forms of meditation. So far, none of these avenues have led to success productivity-wise.
Any organism’s sense of time is subjective, but is the time that is sensed also subjective, a mind-dependent phenomenon? Without minds in the world, nothing in the world would be surprising or beautiful or interesting. Can we add that nothing would be in time? If judgments of time were subjective in the way judgments of being interesting vs. not-interesting are subjective, then it would be miraculous that everyone can so easily agree on the ordering of public events in time. For example, first, Einstein was born, then he went to school, then he died. Everybody agrees that it happened in this order: birth, school, death. No other order. The agreement on time order for so many events is part of the reason that most philosophers and scientists believe physical time is an objective phenomenon that is not dependent on being consciously experienced. Another part of the reason time is believed to be objective is that our universe has a large number of different processes that bear consistent time relations, or frequency of occurrence relations, to each other. For example, the frequency of rotation of the Earth around its axis is a constant multiple of the frequency of oscillation of a fixed-length pendulum, which in turn is a constant multiple of the half life of a specific radioactive uranium isotope, which is a multiple of the frequency of a vibrating violin string; the relationship of these oscillators does not change as time goes by (at least not much and not for a long time, and when there is deviation we know how to predict it and compensate for it). The existence of these sorts of relationships makes our system of physical laws much simpler than it otherwise would be, and it makes us more confident that there is something objective we are referring to with the time-variable in those laws. The stability of these relationships over a long time also makes it easy to create clocks. Time can be measured easily because we have access to long-term simple harmonic oscillators that have a regular period or “regular ticking.” This regularity shows up in completely different stable systems when they are disturbed: a ball hanging from a string (a pendulum), a ball hanging from a coiled spring, a planet orbiting the Sun, organ pipes, electric circuits, and atoms in a crystal lattice. Many of these systems make good clocks.
Aristotle raised this issue of the mind-dependence of time when he said, “Whether, if soul (mind) did not exist, time would exist or not, is a question that may fairly be asked; for if there cannot be someone to count there cannot be anything that can be counted…” (Physics, chapter 14). He does not answer his own question because, he says rather profoundly, it depends on whether time is the conscious numbering of movement or instead is just the capability of movements being numbered were consciousness to exist.
St. Augustine, adopting a subjective view of time, said time is nothing in reality but exists only in the mind’s apprehension of that reality. The 13th century philosophers Henry of Ghent and Giles of Rome said time exists in reality as a mind-independent continuum, but is distinguished into earlier and later parts only by the mind. In the 13th century, Duns Scotus clearly recognized both physical and psychological time.
At the end of the 18th century, Kant suggested a subtle relationship between time and mind–that our mind actually structures our perceptions so that we can know a priori that time is like a mathematical line. Time is, on this theory, a form of conscious experience, and our sense of time is a necessary condition of our experience or sensation. In the 19th century, Ernst Mach claimed instead that our sense of time is a simple sensation, not an a priori form of sensation. This controversy took another turn when other philosophers argued that both Kant and Mach were incorrect because our sense of time is an intellectual construction (see Whitrow, p. 64).
In the 20th century, the philosopher of science Bas van Fraassen described physical time by saying, “There would be no time were there no beings capable of reason” just as “there would be no food were there no organisms, and no teacups if there were no tea drinkers.”
The controversy in metaphysics between idealism and realism is that, for the idealist, nothing exists independently of the mind. If this controversy is settled in favor of idealism, then physical time, too, would have that subjective feature.
It has been suggested by some philosophers that Einstein’s theory of relativity, when confirmed, showed us that time depends on the observer, and thus that time is subjective, or dependent on the mind. This error is probably caused by Einstein’s use of the term “observer.” Einstein’s theory implies that the duration of an event depends on the observer’s frame of reference or coordinate system, but what Einstein means by “observer’s frame of reference” is merely a perspective or coordinate framework from which measurements could be made. The “observer” need not have a mind. So, Einstein is not making a point about mind-dependence.
For more on the consciousness of time and related issues, see the article “Phenomenology and Time-Consciousness.” For more on whether the present, as opposed to time itself, is subjective, see the section called “Is the Now Objectively Real?“
We use our concept of time to place events in sequence one after the other, to compare how long an event lasts, and to tell when an event occurs. These are the three key features of time, but they do not quite tell us what time itself is.
If physical time and psychological time are two different kinds of time, then two answers are required to the question “What is time?” and some commentary is required regarding their relationships, such as whether one is more fundamental. Physical time seems to be objective, whereas psychological time is subjective. Many philosophers of science argue that physical time is more fundamental even though psychological time is discovered first by each of us during our childhood, and even though psychological time was discovered first as we human beings evolved from our animal ancestors. The remainder of this article focuses more on physical time than psychological time.
Another answer to our question, “What is time?” is that time is whatever the time variable t is denoting in the best-confirmed and most fundamental theories of current science. “Time” is given an implicit definition this way. Nearly all philosophers would agree that we do learn much about physical time by looking at the behavior of the time variable in these theories; but they complain that the full nature of physical time can be revealed only with a philosophical theory of time that addresses the many philosophical issues that scientists do not concern themselves with.
Earlier we said time is a sequence of moments in a linear order. Presumably a moment is a durationless instant. Michael Dummett’s constructive model of time implies that time is a composition of intervals rather than of durationless instants. The model is constructive in the sense that it implies there do not exist any times which are not detectable in principle by a physical process.
One answer to the question “What is time?” is that it is a collection of objects called “times” that ultimately reduce to relationships among events. A competing answer is that time is a substance, not a relationship among events. A more popular answer post-Einstein is that time is not a substance but spacetime is, and time is a part of spacetime. These answers to our question are explored in a later section.
Bothered by the contradictions they claimed to find in our concept of time, Zeno, Plato, Spinoza, Hegel, and McTaggart answer the question, “What is time?” by replying that it is nothing because it does not exist. In a similar vein, the early 20th century English philosopher F. H. Bradley argues, “Time, like space, has most evidently proved not to be real, but a contradictory appearance….The problem of change defies solution.” In the mid-twentieth century, Gödel argued for the unreality of time because Einstein’s equations allow for events to precede themselves. In the twenty-first century some physicists such as Julian Barbour who are hoping to reconcile general relativity with quantum mechanics suggest that time does not exist or else that it is not fundamental in nature; see Callender (2010). However, most philosophers agree that time does exist. They just can not agree on what it is.
Let’s briefly explore other answers that have been given throughout history to our question, “What is time?” Aristotle claimed that “time is the measure of change” (Physics, chapter 12), but he emphasized “that time is not change [itself]” because a change “may be faster or slower, but not time…” (Physics, chapter 10). For example, a specific change such as the descent of a leaf can be faster or slower, but time itself can not be faster or slower. In developing his views about time, Aristotle advocated what is now referred to as the relational theory when he said, “there is no time apart from change….” (Physics, chapter 11). In addition, Aristotle said time is not discrete or atomistic but “is continuous…. In respect of size there is no minimum; for every line is divided ad infinitum. Hence it is so with time” (Physics, chapter 11).
René Descartes had a very different answer to “What is time?” He argued that a material body has the property of spatial extension but no inherent capacity for temporal endurance, and that God by his continual action sustains (or re-creates) the body at each successive instant. Time is a kind of sustenance or re-creation (“Third Meditation” in Meditations on First Philosophy).
In the 17th century, the English physicist Isaac Barrow rejected Aristotle’s linkage between time and change. Barrow said time is something which exists independently of motion or change and which existed even before God created the matter in the universe. Barrow’s student, Isaac Newton, agreed with this substantival theory of time. Newton argued very specifically that time and space are an infinitely large container for all events, and that the container exists with or without the events. He added that space and time are not material substances, but are like substances in not being dependent on anything except God.
Gottfried Leibniz objected. He argued that time is not an entity existing independently of actual events. He insisted that Newton had underemphasized the fact that time necessarily involves an ordering of any pair of non-simultaneous events. This is why time “needs” events, so to speak. Leibniz added that this overall order is time. He accepts a relational theory of time and rejects a substantival theory.
In the 18th century, Immanuel Kant said time and space are forms that the mind projects upon the external things-in-themselves. He spoke of our mind structuring our perceptions so that space always has a Euclidean geometry, and time has the structure of the mathematical line. Kant’s idea that time is a form of apprehending phenomena is probably best taken as suggesting that we have no direct perception of time but only the ability to experience things and events in time. Some historians distinguish perceptual space from physical space and say that Kant was right about perceptual space. It is difficult, though, to get a clear concept of perceptual space. If physical space and perceptual space are the same thing, then Kant is claiming we know a priori that physical space is Euclidean. With the discovery of non-Euclidean geometries in the 1820s, and with increased doubt about the reliability of Kant’s method of transcendental proof, the view that truths about space and time are a priori truths began to lose favor.
The above discussion does not exhaust all the claims about what time is. And there is no sharp line separating a definition of time, a theory of time, and an explanation of time.
Whatever time is, it is not “time.” “Time” is the most common noun in all documents on the Internet’s web pages; time is not. Nevertheless, it might help us understand time if we improved our understanding of the sense of the word “time.” Should the proper answer to the question “What is time?” produce a definition of the word as a means of capturing its sense? Definitely not–if the definition must be some analysis that provides a simple paraphrase in all its occurrences. There are just too many varied occurrences of the word: time out, behind the times, in the nick of time, and so forth.
But how about narrowing the goal to a definition of the word “time” in its main sense, the sense that most interests philosophers and physicists? That is, explore the usage of the word “time” in its principal sense as a means of learning what time is. Well, this project would require some consideration of the grammar of the word “time.” Most philosophers today would agree with A. N. Prior who remarked that, “there are genuine metaphysical problems, but I think you have to talk about grammar at least a little bit in order to solve most of them.” However, do we learn enough about what time is when we learn about the grammatical intricacies of the word? John Austin made this point in “A Plea for Excuses,” when he said, if we are using the analytic method, the method of analysis of language, in order to sharpen our perception of the phenomena, then “it is plainly preferable to investigate a field where ordinary language is rich and subtle, as it is in the pressingly practical matter of Excuses, but certainly is not in the matter, say, of Time.” Ordinary-language philosophers have studied time talk, what Wittgenstein called the “language game” of discourse about time. Wittgenstein’s expectation is that by drawing attention to ordinary ways of speaking we will be able to dissolve rather than answer our philosophical questions. But most philosophers of time are unsatisfied with this approach; they want the questions answered, not dissolved, although they are happy to have help from the ordinary language philosopher in clearing up misconceptions that may be produced by the way we use the word in our ordinary, non-technical discourse.
Bertrand Russell argued that causation is not part of the fundamental physical description of the world, and he described the notion of cause as “a relic of a bygone age.” Not everyone agrees with Russell. In 1924, Hans Reichenbach defined time order in terms of possible cause. Event A happens before event B if A could have caused B but B could not have caused A. This was the first causal theory of time, although Leibniz had said, “If of two elements which are not simultaneous one comprehends the cause of the other, then the former is considered as preceding, the latter as succeeding.” The usefulness of the causal theory depends on a clarification of the notorious notions of causality and possibility without producing a circular explanation that presupposes an understanding of time order. Reichenbach’s particular idea here was that causal order can be explained in terms of the “fork asymmetry.” The asymmetry is due to the fact that outgoing processes from a common center tend to be correlated with one another, but incoming processes to a common center are uncorrelated. [Do you remember ever tossing a rock into a still pond? There’s a correlation among all sorts of later events such as the rock’s disappearing under the water, the water surface getting wavy, your hearing a splash sound, the water surging slightly up the bank at the edge of the pond, and even of the pond being warmer. Imagine what the initial conditions at the edge and bottom of the pond must be like to produce correlated, incoming, concentric water waves so that as they reach the center the rock flies out of the water, leaving the water surface smooth, and sound waves rush out of your ear and converge on the surface where the splash is not occurring, and the pond is left cooler.] Some philosophers argue that temporal asymmetry, but not temporal priority, can be analyzed in terms of causation. Put more simply, event A’s not occurring simultaneously with B can be analyzed in terms of cause and possible cause, but what can’t be analyzed in this manner is A’s occurring first. Even if Reichenbach were correct that temporal priority can be analyzed in terms of causation, the question remains whether time itself can be analyzed in those terms. A. N. Prior said, “There is, to be sure, no plausibility at all in the attempts of … physicists to define expressions like ‘earlier’ or ‘past’ in terms of entropy or causation….” Prior 1969 p. 459.
The usefulness of the causal theory also depends on a refutation of David Hume’s view that causation is simply a matter of constant conjunction [that is, event A's causing event B is simply B's always occurring if A does]. For Hume, there is nothing metaphysically deep about causes preceding their effects; it is just a matter of convention that we use the terms “cause” and “effect” to distinguish the earlier and later members of a pair of events which are related by constant conjunction.
If you travel to your past and then return to the place and moment of your leaving, your personal time (that is, proper time) is circular. If your personal time were circular, your death, if you die, would occur before your birth as well as after it. With circular time, the future is the past and every event occurs before itself. If your time is like this, then the question arises as to whether there would be an endless number of reoccurrences of a state of the world, or whether, accepting Leibniz’s Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles, each supposedly repeating state of the world would occur just once because each state would not be discernible from the repeated state. The idea of eternal recurrence seems to presuppose a linear ordering in time of all the cycles, so there’d need to be some “hypertime” in addition to ordinary time.
During history (and long before Einstein made a distinction between proper time and coordinate time), a variety of answers were given to the question of whether time is like a line or, instead, closed like a circle. The concept of linear time first appeared in the writings of the Hebrews and the Zoroastrian Iranians. The Roman writer Seneca also advocated linear time. Plato and most other Greeks and Romans believed time to be motion and believed cosmic motion was cyclical, but this was not envisioned as requiring any detailed endless repetition such as the multiple rebirths of Socrates. However, the Pythagoreans and some Stoic philosophers such as Chrysippus did adopt this drastic position. The idea was picked up again by Nietzsche in 1882. Scholars do not agree on whether Nietzsche meant his idea of circular time to be taken literally or merely for a moral lesson about how you should live your life if you knew that you’d live it over and over.
Islamic and Christian theologians adopted the ancient idea that time is linear plus the Jewish-Zoroastrian idea that the universe was created at a definite moment in the past. Augustine emphasized that human experience is a one-way journey from Genesis to Judgment, regardless of any recurring patterns or cycles in nature. In the Medieval period, Thomas Aquinas agreed. Nevertheless, it was not until 1602 that the concept of linear time was more clearly formulated–by the English philosopher Francis Bacon. In 1687, Newton advocated linear time when he represented time mathematically by using a continuous straight line. The concept of linear time was promoted by Barrow, Leibniz, Locke and Kant, with Kant arguing that it is a matter of necessity. In 19th century Europe, the idea of linear time became dominant in both science and philosophy. However, in the twentieth century, Gödel and others discovered solutions to the equations of Einstein’s general theory of relativity that allowed closed loops of proper time (closed time-like curves). Each event in the loop lies in its own causal history. These causal loops or closed curves in spacetime allow you to go forward continuously in time until you arrive back into your past. As far as we can tell today, our universe does not exemplify any of these solutions to Einstein’s equations.
In thinking about possible topologies for time, time might be circular or linear. Linear time might have a beginning or no beginning, an ending or no ending. There could be two disconnected time streams, in two parallel worlds. There could be branching time, in which time is like the letter “Y”, and there could be a fusion time in which two different time streams merge into one. Time might be two dimensional instead of one dimensional. For all these topologies, there could be atomistic or discrete time instead of continuous time, that is, the micro-structure of time might be like a sequence of instants rather than a continuum of point-like instants.
In ancient Greece, Aristotle claimed that time had no beginning because, for any time, we always imagine an earlier time. The Greeks believed time existed before the Unmoved Mover intervened to create order from the previously existing chaos. In Medieval times, Aquinas objected to the ancient Greek view, saying past time is finite and that our imagination can’t always be trusted to tell us how things are. Instead, the past is finite because time began with God’s creation of Earth a finite time ago. In the late 17th century, Newton declared that time is infinite in both the past and future, and in the 18th century, Kant argued that this is not an empirical matter but rather a matter of necessity. In the most well accepted version of the Big Bang Theory (namely, for large scale activity, the Friedman model of Einstein’s equations plus early inflation), the past is finite. Time began about 13.8 billion years ago when the universe had infinitesimal size and a nearly infinite gravitational field. About 10-35 second after the beginning, there was an inflation or accelerating expansion that lasted for 10-30 seconds during which the universe expanded by a factor of 1025, which is considerably faster than today’s speed of light. Once this brief period of inflation ended, the energy causing the inflation was transformed into a dense gas of expanding hot radiation that has never stopped expanding. As it expanded, the radiation cooled, allowing individual material particles to form and eventually to clump into galaxies over billions of years. Nine billion years after the big bang, dark energy took over and started to accelerate the expansion again. This expansion of the universe will accelerate forever, turning space into an almost perfect vacuum as the remaining matter-energy becomes more and more diluted. The implication for both space and time is that, although they both were finite in the past, they will be potentially infinite in the future. Actually the age of the universe since the Big Bang depends on where you are in calculating the age. If you are out in relatively empty space between the galaxies, the age is a few billion years more than 13.8. These differences in age are due to gravitational time dilation.
Consider this argument from Newton-Smith (1980, p. 111) that time cannot have had a beginning: “And as we have reasons for supposing that macroscopic events have causal origins, we have reason to suppose that some prior state of the universe led to the product of [the Big Bang]. So the prospects for ever being warranted in positing a beginning of time are dim.” The usual response here is two-fold. First, the Big Bang is a microscopic event, not a macroscopic event. Second, if a cosmological theory implies there is a first event and if that theory has indirect confirmation, then we can say there is an exception to the claim that every event has a prior cause.
The classical Big Bang Theory with inflation is challenged by other theories such as a cyclic theory in which every trillion years the expansion changes to contraction until the universe becomes infinitesimal, at which time there is a bounce or new Big Bang. The cycles of Bang and Crunch continue forever, and they might or might not have existed forever. (For the details, see Steinhardt 2012.)
When we discuss whether time was infinite in the past or will be in the future we are presuming an ordinary scale of time. Using a logarithmic scale can turn the finite into the infinite. With a scale change of time t to time log t, a finite event lasting from year 0 to year 1 becomes an infinite event lasting from -∞ to 0 because the log 0 = -∞ and log 1 = 0. An ordinary scale is one for which it is easy to find periodic processes to use in building clocks.
Is time ontologically basic, or does it depend on something even more basic? The question is asking whether there is nature beyond spacetime. We might rephrase this question by asking whether facts about time supervene on more basic facts. Facts about sound supervene on, or are a product of, facts about changes in the molecules of the air, so molecular change is more basic than sound. Minkowski argued in 1908 that we should believe spacetime is more basic than time, but is this spacetime itself basic? Some physicists argue that spacetime is the product of some more basic micro-substrate, although there is no agreed-upon theory of what the substrate is. Other physicists say space is not basic, but time is. In 2004, after winning the Nobel Prize in physics, David Gross expressed this viewpoint:
Everyone in string theory is convinced…that spacetime is doomed. But we don’t know what it’s replaced by. We have an enormous amount of evidence that space is doomed. We even have examples, mathematically well-defined examples, where space is an emergent concept…. But in my opinion the tough problem that has not yet been faced up to at all is, “How do we imagine a dynamical theory of physics in which time is emergent?” …All the examples we have do not have an emergent time. They have emergent space but not time. It is very hard for me to imagine a formulation of physics without time as a primary concept because physics is typically thought of as predicting the future given the past. We have unitary time evolution. How could we have a theory of physics where we start with something in which time is never mentioned?
The discussion in this section about whether time is ontologically basic has no implications for whether the word “time” is semantically basic or whether the idea of time is basic to concept formation.
The French physicist Henri Poincaré argued that there is no true time in reality but only more or less convenient conventions to adopt as to what time is. He preferred the concept of time that makes for the simplest laws of physics. Other philosophers of science have recommended adopting a less idealistic view of time itself, but have said that the metric of time is conventional. Philosophers have disagreed about the extent to which there is an element of conventionality in Einstein’s notion of two separated events happening at the same time. Einstein said that two events can be simultaneous in one reference frame but not simultaneous in another reference frame moving relative to the first. In addition, and more controversially, Einstein said that to define simultaneity in a single reference frame you must adopt a convention about how fast light travels going one way as opposed to coming back (or going any other direction). He recommended adopting the convention that light travels the same speed in all directions (in a vacuum free of the influence of gravity). He claimed there is no way to measure whether the speed is really the same in opposite directions because any measurement of the two speeds between two locations requires first having synchronized clocks at those two locations, yet the synchronization process will presuppose whether the speed is the same in both directions. The philosophers B. Ellis and P. Bowman in 1967 and D. Malament in 1977 give different reasons why Einstein is mistaken. For an introduction to this dispute, see the Frequently Asked Questions. For more discussion, see Callender and Hoefer (2002). A related controversy about the metric of time concerns whether our choosing an atomic clock rather than the Earth’s rotation as our standard clock indicates we’ve chosen a more correct metric or instead merely a more convenient metric. And when we decide to compute the duration of an event by subtracting the difference between the times of the start and end of the event, is this choice of computational method merely arbitrary, or could we have chosen to compute, instead, the square root of the difference, or perhaps the difference of the square roots of the readings for the start and end and called this the “duration”?
It is an arbitrary convention that we design clocks to count up to higher numbers rather than down to lower numbers as time goes on, and that we re-set our clock by one hour as we cross a time-zone. It is an arbitrary convention that there are twenty-four hours in a day instead of ten, that there are sixty seconds in a minute rather than twelve, that a second lasts as long as it does, and that the origin of our coordinate system for time is associated with the birth of Jesus on some calendars but the entry of Mohammed into Mecca on other calendars.
Suppose a speaker refers to event A, the event of Queen Anne’s death, and event B, an explosion on the supergiant star Betelgeuse. The speaker points out that this is an odd pair of events, because A doesn’t happen before B happens, and B doesn’t happen before A, and yet no parts of the two events are simultaneous. Consider what grounds you have for saying, “That is impossible.” This impossibility is one of the requirements that science places on its concept of time. It is the requirement that in any reference frame the binary happens-before relation be total on events.
Science places many other requirements on its concept of time. Science currently requires almost all the basic laws of science to be time symmetric—that the law not distinguish between backward and forward time directions. Also the laws can not change from one day to another. Another requirement that relativity, quantum mechanics and the Big Bang theory place on any duration is that is be a continuum very much like a segment of the real number line. So, time is required to not be atomistic or discrete, even in quantum mechanics. In a world with time being a continuum, we cannot speak of some event being caused by the state of the world at the immediately preceding instant since there is no immediately preceding instant.
Relativity has had the biggest impact on our understanding of time. Relativity’s spacetime is more fundamental than either space or time alone. Spacetime is commonly said to be four-dimensional, but because time is not space it is more accurate to think of spacetime as being (3 + 1)-dimensional. Time is a distinguished, linear subspace of four-dimensional spacetime. Unlike in Newton’s physics and the physics of special relativity, spacetime is not a passive container for events; it is dynamic in the sense that any change in the amount and distribution of matter-energy will change the curvature of spacetime itself. Gravity is a manifestation of the warping of spacetime.
Another profound idea from relativity theory is that accurate clocks do not tick the same for everyone everywhere. Each object has its own proper time, so the correct time shown by a clock depends on its history. Time is relative in the sense that the duration of an event depends on the reference frame used in measuring the duration. For some pairs of events, even the order in which they occur is relative, although all correct observers must agree on the order if the two events could be causally related. Specifying that an event lasted three minutes without giving even an implicit indication of the reference frame is like asking someone to stand over there and not giving any indication of where “there” is. Relative to clocks that are stationary in the reference frame, clocks in motion run slower, as do clocks in higher gravitational fields. In general, two synchronized clocks do not stay synchronized if they move relative to each other or undergo different gravitational forces. Clocks in cars driving by your apartment building run slower than your apartment’s clock.
In 1611, Bishop James Ussher declared that the beginning of time occurred on October 23, 4004 B.C.E. Today’s science disagrees. According to the classical Big Bang theory of cosmology, the universe began 13.8 billion years ago as spacetime started to expand from an infinitesimal volume, and the expansion continues today, with the volume of space now doubling in size about every ten billion years. The future space and time created from our Big Bang theory are potential infinities (in Aristotle’s sense of the term) as opposed to actual infinities. For more discussion of all these compressed remarks, see What Science Requires of Time.
Most philosophers and scientists believe time travel is physically possible. To define the term, we can say that in time travel, the traveler’s journey as judged by the traveler’s clock takes a different amount of time than the journey does as judged by the clocks of those who do not take the journey. The physical possibility of travel to the future is well accepted, but travel to the past is more controversial, and time travel that changes the future or the past is generally considered to be impossible.
According to relativity theory, there are two ways to travel into the future using time dilation—either by moving at high speed or by taking advantage of the presence of an intense gravitational field. If you move at extremely high speed, you can travel into the future to the year 2,300 on Earth (as measured by Earth-based clocks or by clocks elsewhere that are not moving relative to Earth) while your personal clock measures that only ten years have elapsed. You can participate in that future, not just view it. But you can not get back to the twenty-first century on Earth by reversing your velocity. It’s not that you suddenly jump into the Earth’s future of the year 2,300; you have continually been traveling forward in both your personal time and the world’s external time, and you could have been continuously observed from Earth. But as judged by the world’s external time you do have a much longer lifetime than your biological twin whom you left back on Earth long ago. (See the discussion of the twin paradox for the solution to the famous paradox involving time dilation.)
In addition to time dilation due to high speed there is time dilation due to being in the presence of a gravitation field; this is called gravitational time dilation or gravitational red shift. Because of Earth’s gravity, people who live in the ground floor apartment age slower than their twin who lives in the top floor apartment of the same building. This kind of time travel is more noticeable if the younger twin lives near a black hole where the gravity is much stronger than on Earth.
You may have heard the remark that you have no time to take a spaceship ride across the galaxy since it is 100,000 light years across. So, even if you were to travel at just under the speed of light, it would take you over 100,000 years. Who has that kind of time? This remark contains a misunderstanding about time dilation. This is 100,000 years as judged by clocks that are stationary relative to Earth, not as judged by your clock. If you were in the spaceship that accelerated quickly to just under the speed of light, then you and your clock might age hardly at all as you traveled across the galaxy. In fact, with a very fast spaceship, you have plenty of time to go anywhere in the universe you wish to go.
How about travel to the past, the more interesting kind of time travel? This is not allowed by special relativity, but is allowed by general relativity. In 1949, Kurt Gödel discovered a solution to Einstein’s field equations that allows continuous, closed future-directed timelike curves. To say this more simply, Gödel discovered that in some possible worlds that obey the theory of general relativity, you can continually travel forward in your personal time but eventually arrive into your own past. In this unusual non-Minkowski spacetime, the universe as a whole is the time machine; no one needs to build a device in order to travel this way. If someone builds a machine which allows this kind of travel to the past that otherwise would not occur naturally, then the person is said to have built a time machine. In travel to the past, the traveler’s personal future (as judged by their proper time) becomes part of the universe’s past (as judged by cosmological time or coordinate time). While going forward in your own personal time you may be able to travel into your own past and perhaps die before you were born, or perhaps meet yourself as a child, or perhaps even become your earlier self and never die. But, unless you move into some alternative universe, you can not change what has really happened in the past. You can’t go back and prevent Adolf Hitler from gaining political power in Germany in the 1930s. You cannot kill your childhood self no matter how hard you try, and you cannot suddenly fade out of the present and pop into some past time.
There are several well known philosophical arguments against past-directed time travel. None are generally considered to be decisive. Here are the arguments:
- Time travel is impossible because if it were possible we should have seen many time travelers by now, but nobody has encountered any time travelers.
- If there were time travel, then when time travelers go back and attempt to change history they must always botch their attempts to change anything, and it will appear to anyone watching them at the time as if nature is conspiring against them. Since observers have never witnessed this apparent conspiracy of nature, there is no time travel.
- If there were travel to the past along a closed timelike curve, then these events would occur before themselves and after themselves, but this violates our definition of the word “before.”
- Travel to the past is impossible because it allows the gaining of information for free. For example, buy a copy of Darwin’s book The Origin of Species, that was published in 1859. In the 21st century, enter a time machine with it, go back to 1855 and give the book to Darwin himself. He could use your copy in order to write his manuscript which he sends off to the publisher. If so, who first came up with the knowledge about evolution? Because this scenario contradicts what we know about where knowledge comes from, past-directed time travel isn’t really possible.
- Suppose you enter a time machine and bring along several male and female squirrels of one species. You take these back to the time of the dinosaurs. The squirrels begin breeding, the dinosaurs die out, and the species of squirrel survives into modern times. Since this scenario allows a species to come into existence without its going through the process of Darwinian evolution, time travel is impossible.
- In 1972, John Earman described a rocket ship that carries a time machine capable of firing a probe (perhaps a smaller rocket) into its recent past. The ship is programmed to fire the probe at a certain time unless a safety switch is on at that time. Suppose the safety switch is programmed to be turned on if and only if the “return” or “impending arrival” of the probe is (or has been) detected by a sensing device on the ship. Does the probe get launched? At first glance it seems to be launched if and only if it is not launched. Is this like designing a gun that shoots if and only if it does not shoot? Not quite. The argument of this paradox depends on the assumptions that the rocket ship does work as intended–that people are able to build the computer program, the probe, the safety switch, and an effective sensing device. Earman himself says all these premises are acceptable and so the only weak point in the reasoning to the paradoxical conclusion is the assumption that travel to the past is physically possible.
These six complaints are a mixture of arguments that past-directed time travel is not logically possible, that it is not physically possible, that it is not technologically possible with current technology, and that it is unlikely, given today’s empirical evidence.
For more discussion of time travel, see the encyclopedia article “Time Travel.”
Substantival theories are theories that imply time is substance-like in that it exists independently of the spacetime relations exhibited by physical processes. On the other hand, relational theories imply time’s existence requires there to be some physical process in the universe–such as a movement or a change in a field. In short, no change implies no time. Some substantival theories describe spacetime as being like a container for events. The container exists with or without events in it. Relational theories imply there is no container without contents. But the substance that substantivalists have in mind is more like a medium pervading all of spacetime and less like an external container. John Norton’s metaphors might help. Our universe is like a painting, and substantival spacetime is like the painter’s canvas. If you take away the paint (the spacetime events) from the painting, you still have the canvas. Relational spacetime is like citizenship. Take away the citizens (the spacetime events), and you have no citizenship left. When the relational theory says change is necessary for time to exist, what is meant by “change” is first-order change, not second-order change. That is, the second-order change that occurs when Queen Anne’s death recedes ever farther into the past does not count as the kind of change emphasized by the relational theory. Its snowing on her grave does count. If there are no first-order changes, then time stops existing, according to the relational theory.
Everyone agrees time cannot be measured without there being changes, but the present issue is whether it exists without changes. The substantival theories are theories that spacetime could exist even if there were no physical objects and events (changes or processes) in the universe. Relational theories, on the other hand, imply that spacetime is nothing but the spatiotemporal relationships among possible objects and their possible events. Relational theories are also called “relationalist” theories. Substantival theories are sometimes called “absolute theories.” Unfortunately the term “absolute theory” is used in two other ways. A second use of the term “absolute” is to say spacetime is immutable in the sense of not changing its properties, and a third sense occurs when we suggest that time is independent of observer or reference frame. Although Einstein’s theory implies there is no absolute time in these last two ways (immutable and independent of reference frame), it is an open question whether relativity theory undermines absolute time in the sense of substantival time.
The first advocate of a relational theory of time was Aristotle. He said, “neither does time exist without change.” (Physics, 218b) However, the battle lines were most clearly drawn in the early 18th century when Leibniz argued for the relational position against Newton, who had adopted a substantival theory of time. Leibniz’s principal argument against Newton is a reductio ad absurdum. Suppose Newton’s space and time were to exist. But one could then imagine a universe just like ours except with everything shifted five kilometers east and five minutes earlier. However, there would be no reason why this shifted universe does not exist and ours does. Now we have arrived at a contradiction because, if there is no reason for there to be our universe rather than the shifted universe, then we have violated Leibniz’s Principle of Sufficient Reason: that there is an understandable reason for everything being the way it is. So, by reductio ad absurdum, Newton’s substantival space and time do not exist. In short, the trouble with Newton’s theory is that it leads to too many unnecessary possibilities.
Newton offered this two-part response: (1) Leibniz is correct to accept the Principle of Sufficient Reason regarding the rational intelligibility of the universe, but there do not have to be knowable reasons for humans; God might have had His own sufficient reason for creating the universe at a given place and time even though mere mortals cannot comprehend His reasons. (2) The bucket thought-experiment shows that acceleration relative to absolute space is detectable; thus absolute space is real, and if absolute space is real, so is absolute time. Here’s how to detect absolute space. Suppose we tie a bucket’s handle to a rope hanging down from a tree branch. Partially fill the bucket with water, and let it come to equilibrium. Notice that there is no relative motion between the bucket and the water, and in this case the water surface is flat. Now spin the bucket, and keep doing this until the angular velocity of the water and the bucket are the same. In this second case there is again no relative motion between the bucket and the water, but now the water surface is concave. So spinning makes a difference, but how can a relational theory explain the difference in the shape of the surface? It can not, says Newton. When the bucket and water are spinning, what are they spinning relative to? Because we can disregard the rest of the environment including the tree and rope, says Newton, the only explanation of the difference in surface shape between the non-spinning case and the spinning case is that when it is not spinning there is no motion relative to space, but when it is spinning there is motion relative to a third thing, space itself, and space itself is acting upon the water surface to make it concave. Alternatively expressed, the key idea is that the presence of centrifugal force is a sign of rotation relative to absolute space. Leibniz had no rebuttal. So, for over two centuries after this argument was created, Newton’s absolute theory of space and time was generally accepted by European scientists and philosophers.
One hundred years later, Kant entered the arena on the side of Newton. In a space containing only a single glove, said Kant, Leibniz could not account for its being a right-handed glove versus a left-handed glove because all the internal relationships would be the same in either case. However, we all know that there is a real difference between a right and a left glove, so this difference can only be due to the glove’s relationship to space itself. But if there is a “space itself,” then the absolute or substantival theory is better than the relational theory.
Newton’s theory of time was dominant in the 18th and 19th centuries, even though during those centuries Huygens, Berkeley, and Mach had entered the arena on the side of Leibniz. Mach argued that it must be the remaining matter in the universe, such as the “fixed” stars, which causes the water surface in the bucket to be concave, and that without these stars or other matter, a spinning bucket would have a flat surface. In the 20th century, Reichenbach and the early Einstein declared the special theory of relativity to be a victory for the relational theory, in large part because a Newtonian absolute space would be undetectable. Special relativity, they also said, ruled out a space-filling ether, the leading candidate for substantival space, so the substantival theory was incorrect. And the response to Newton’s bucket argument is to note Newton’s error in not considering the environment. Einstein agreed with Mach that, if you hold the bucket still but spin the background stars in the environment, then the water will creep up the side of the bucket and form a concave surface—so the bucket thought experiment does not require absolute space.
Although it was initially believed by Einstein and Reichenbach that relativity theory supported Mach regarding the bucket experiment and the absence of absolute space, this belief is controversial. Many philosophers argue that Reichenbach and the early Einstein have been overstating the amount of metaphysics that can be extracted from the physics. Remember the ambiguity in “substantival” mentioned above? There is substantival in the sense of independent of reference frame and substantival in the sense of independent of events. Which sense is ruled out when we reject a space-filling ether? The critics admit that general relativity does show that the curvature of spacetime is affected by the distribution of matter, so today it is no longer plausible for a substantivalist to assert that the “container” is independent of the matter it contains. But, so they argue, general relativity does not rule out a more sophisticated substantival theory–to be discussed below. By the end of the 20th century, substantival theories had gained some ground.
In 1969, Sydney Shoemaker presented an argument to convince us of the understandability of time existing without change, as Newton’s absolutism requires. Divide space into three disjoint regions, called region 3, region 4, and region 5. In region 3, change ceases every third year for one year. People in regions 4 and 5 can verify this and convince the people in region 3 after they come back to life at the end of their frozen year. Similarly, change ceases in region 4 every fourth year for a year; and change ceases in region 5 every fifth year. Every sixty years, that is, every 3 x 4 x 5 years, all three regions freeze simultaneously for a year. In year sixty-one, everyone comes back to life, time having marched on for a year with no change. But philosophers of time point out that, even if Shoemaker’s scenario shows time’s existing without change is understandable, the deeper question is whether time does exist without change.
If time does exist without change, then how could human beings ever know how long an event lasts? If someone claims the tick of the clock lasts one second, the skeptic could challenge this by saying perhaps the duration contains three changeless intervals each lasting one billion years, so the duration is really three billion and one second rather than one second. The response to the skeptic usually is that there is no known need for changeless intervals so on grounds of simplicity we should say they don’t exist.
If events occur in a room before and after 11:01 AM, but not exactly at 11:01 AM, must the relationalist say there never was a time of 11:01 AM in the room? To avoid saying “yes,” which would be absurd, a relationalist might say 11:01 exists in the room and everywhere else because somewhere outside the room something is happening then, and somehow or other sense can be made of time in the room in terms of these external events. The absolutist then asks us to consider the possibility that the room is the whole universe. In that case, the relationalist response to losing 11:01 AM would probably be to say possible events occur then in the room even if actual events do not. But now look where we are, says the absolutist. If the relational theory is going to consider spacetime points to be permanent possibilities of the location of events, then the relational theory collapses into substantivalism. This is because, to a substantivalist, a spacetime point is also just a place where something could happen.
The general theory of relativity does imply it is possible for spacetime to be empty of events. This is difficult to reconcile with relationism since classical relationism for time requires time not to be empty but to be a relationship among events within space.
Hartry Field offers another argument for the substantival theory by pointing out that modern physics requires gravitational and electromagnetic fields that cover spacetime–a light wave, say, is considered to be a ripple in the field. The fields are states of spacetime, with the field having a value (a number or vector) at points throughout the field. These fields cannot be states of some Newtonian ether, but there must be something to have the field properties. What else except substantive spacetime points? A similar argument is made for substantivalism by suggesting that the Higgs field provides an absolute spacetime background.
Another criticism goes like this. For the relational theory, all that exists are physical objects and their relationships, so its temporal continuum is just a useful fiction created by mathematical abstraction from what really exists. Since this continuum is not just a fiction, we should reject the relational theory.
In 1938, George Santayana offered a metaphor about the flow of time: “The essence of nowness runs like fire along the fuse of time.” Time seems to flow, but there is philosophical disagreement about whether it really does flow. The dispute is often related to the dispute about whether McTaggart’s A-series or B-series is more fundamental.
In 1908, the philosopher J. M. E. McTaggart proposed two ways of ordering all events. Consider two events that occurred before now. In his B-series, event 1 happens before event 2 because the time of occurrence of event 1 is less than the time of occurrence of event 2. But when ordering the events into McTaggart’s A-series, event 1 happens before event 2 because event 1 is more in the past than event 2. Both series produce exactly the same ordering of events. Philosophers dispute whether the series of events is best explained as the A-series or as the B-series.
There are two theories (or opposing categories of theories) about time’s flow: the flow is a myth and the flow is objectively real. The first theory is that the flow is an illusion, the product of a faulty metaphor. Time exists, things change, but time does not flow objectively. According to this treatment of flow, there may well be some objective feature of our brains that causes us to believe we are experiencing a flow of time, such as the fact that anticipations of experiences happens before memories of those experiences; but the flow itself is not objective. It is as subjective as an object’s being here rather than there; whether it is here depends on where we are. This kind of theory of time’s flow is often characterized as a “myth-of-passage” theory. The myth-of-passage theory is more likely to be adopted by those who believe that McTaggart’s B-series way of ordering events is more fundamental than his A-series way.
The second category of theories of time’s flow is the dynamic theory The various theories in this category imply that the flow is objective, a feature of our mind-independent reality. A dynamic theory is closer to common sense, and has historically been the more popular theory among philosophers. It is more likely to be adopted by those who believe that McTaggart’s A-series is more fundamental than his B-series.
One dynamic theory implies that the flow is a matter of events changing from being future, to being present, to being past. This is the kind of flow associated with McTaggart’s A-series of events.
A second dynamic theory implies that the flow is a matter of events changing from being indeterminate in the future to being determinate in the present and past. Time’s flow is really events becoming determinate, so dynamic theorists speak of time’s flow as “temporal becoming.”
Opponents of these two dynamic theories complain that when events are said to change, the change is not a real change in the event’s essential, intrinsic properties, but only in the event’s relationship to the observer. For example, saying the death of Queen Anne is an event that changes from present to past is no more of a real change in the event than saying her death changed from being approved of to being disapproved of. This extrinsic change in approval does not count as a real change in her death, and neither does the so-called second-order change from present to past or from indeterminate to determinate. Attacking the notion of time’s flow in this manner, Adolf Grünbaum said: “Events simply are or occur…but they do not ‘advance’ into a pre-existing frame called ‘time.’ … An event does not move and neither do any of its relations.”
A third dynamic theory says time’s flow is the coming into existence of facts, the actualization of new states of affairs; but unlike the first dynamic theory there is no commitment to events changing. This is the theory of flow that is usually accepted by advocates of presentism. A fourth dynamic theory suggests the flow is (reflected in) the change over time of truth values of declarative sentences or propositions. For example, the sentence “It is now raining” was true during the rain yesterday but has changed to false on today’s sunny day. It is these sorts of truth value changes that are at the root of time’s flow. In response, critics suggest that the indexical (or token reflexive) sentence “It is now raining” has no truth value because the reference of “now” is unspecified. If it can not have a truth value, it can not change its truth value. However, the sentence is related to a sentence that does have a truth value. Supposing it is now midnight here on April 1, 2007, and the speaker is in Sacramento, California, then the indexical sentence “It is now raining” is related to the more complete or context-explicit sentence “It is raining at midnight on April 1, 2007 in Sacramento, California.” Only these non-indexical, non-context-dependent, complete sentences have truth values, and these truth values do not change with time. So, fully-described events do not change their properties because complete or “eternal” sentences do not change their truth values.
There are other dynamic theories of time. John Norton (Norton, 2010) argues that time’s flow is objective but so far is beyond the reach of our understanding. Tim Maudlin argues that the objective flow of time is fundamental and unanalyzable. He is happy to say “time does indeed pass at the rate of one hour per hour.” (Maudlin, 2007, p. 112)
Regardless of how we analyze the metaphor of time’s flow we also need to analyze the metaphor of time’s having a direction—the arrow of time.
Time’s arrow is the way processes go over time, and that way is the direction of disarray, the direction toward equilibrium. The world’s processes are such that we can make an omelet from eggs but never can make eggs from an omelet. We can ring a bell but never un-ring it. The arrow of a physical process is the way it normally goes, the way it normally unfolds through time. If a process goes only one-way, we call it an irreversible process; otherwise it is reversible. (Strictly speaking, a reversible process is one that is reversed by an infinitesimal change of its surrounding conditions, but we can overlook this fine point because of the general level of the present discussion.) The amalgamation of the universe’s irreversible processes produces the cosmic arrow of time, the master arrow. Usually this arrow is what is meant when one speaks of time’s arrow. So, time’s arrow indicates directed processes in time, and the arrow may or may not have anything to do with the flow of time. How to explain the arrow is still an open question in science and philosophy.
Because so many of the physical processes that we commonly observe do have an arrow, you might think that an inspection of the basic physical laws would readily reveal time’s arrow. It will not. With some exceptions, such as the collapse of the quantum mechanical wave function and the decay of the Bo meson, all the basic laws of fundamental processes are time symmetric. This means that if a certain process is allowed by the laws, then that process reversed in time is also allowed. Maxwell’s equations of electromagnetism, for example, can be used to predict that television signals can exist, but these equations do not tell us whether those signals arrive before or arrive after they are transmitted. In other words, the basic laws of science do not by themselves imply an arrow of time. Something else must tell us how television signals work, and why omelets don’t turn into whole eggs, and so forth.
There are many goals for a fully developed theory of time’s arrow. It should tell us (1) why time has an arrow; (2) why the basic laws of science do not reveal the arrow, (3) how the arrow is connected with entropy, (4) why the arrow is apparent in macro processes but not micro processes; (5) why the entropy of a closed system increases in the future rather than decreases even though the decrease is physically possible given current basic laws; (6) what it would be like for our arrow of time to reverse direction; (7) what are the characteristics of a physical theory that would pick out a preferred direction in time; (8) what the relationships are among the various more specific arrows of time–the various kinds of temporally asymmetric processes such as the Bo meson decay [the B-meson arrow], the collapse of the wave function [the quantum mechanical arrow], entropy increases [the thermodynamic arrow], causes preceding their effects [the causal arrow], light radiating away from hot objects rather than converging into them [the electromagnetic arrow], and our knowing the past more easily than the future [the knowledge arrow].
There are three principal explanations of the arrow: (i) it is a product of one-way entropy flow which in turn is due to the initial conditions of the universe, (ii) it is a product of one-way entropy flow which in turn is due to some as yet unknown asymmetrical laws of nature, (iii) it is a product of causation which itself is asymmetrical. Physicists generally favor (i). They say the most likely explanation of the emergence of an arrow of time in a world with time-blind basic laws is that the arrow is a product of the direction of entropy change, that it goes from low to high, and this directedness of entropy change is due to, among other things, the low-entropy state of the universe at the time of the Big Bang. Unfortunately there is no known explanation of why the entropy was so low at the time of the Big Bang. Some say the initially low entropy is just a brute fact with no more fundamental explanation. Others say it is due to as yet undiscovered basic laws that are time-asymmetric. And still others say it must be the product of the way the universe was before the Big Bang.
There are many useful definitions of entropy. On one definition, it is a measure inversely related to the energy available for work in a physical system. According to another definition, the entropy of a physical system that is isolated from external influences is a measure [specifically, the logarithm] of how many microstates are macroscopically indistinguishable. Less formally, entropy can be defined as being a measure of the disorganization of the system. More entropy implies more disorganization. Changes toward disorganization are so much more frequent than changes toward more organization because there are so many more ways for a closed system to be disorganized than for it to be organized. According to the 2nd Law of Thermodynamics, which is not one of our basic laws of science, entropy change in the future is almost always entropy increase until equilibrium is reached, so the change in entropy of a system that is not yet in equilibrium is a one-way street toward greater disorganization and less useful forms of energy. For example, when a car burns gasoline, the entropy increase is evident in the fact that the new heat energy distributed throughout the byproducts of the gasoline combustion is much less useful than was the potential chemical energy in the pre-combustion gasoline. The entropy of our universe, conceived of as the largest isolated system, has been increasing for the last 13.8 billion years and will continue to do so for a very long time. At the time of the Big Bang event, our universe was in a highly organized, low-entropy, non-equilibrium state, and it has been running down and getting more disorganized ever since. This running down is the cosmic arrow of time.
According to the 2nd Law of Thermodynamics, if an isolated system is not in equilibrium and has a great many particles, then it is overwhelmingly likely that the system’s entropy will increase in the future. Ludwig Boltzmann claimed to have deduced this macroscopic law from reversible microscopic laws of Newtonian physics. Yet it seems odd, said Joseph Loschmidt (and Boltzmann), that a one-way macroscopic process can be deduced from two-way microscopic processes. In 1876, Loschmidt argued that if you look at our present state (the black dot in the diagram below), then you ought to deduce from the basic laws (and having no knowledge that the universe had lower entropy in the past) that it evolved not from a state of low entropy in the past, but from a state of higher entropy, which of course is not at all what we know our past to be like. The difficulty is displayed in the diagram below.
Yet we know our universe is an isolated system by definition, and we have good observational evidence that it surely did not have high entropy in the past—at least not in the past that is between now and the Big Bang event—so the actual low value of entropy in the past is puzzling. Sean Carroll (2010) offers a simple illustration of the puzzle. If you found a half-melted ice cube in an isolated glass of water (analogous to the black dot in the diagram), and all you otherwise knew about the universe is that it obeys our current, basic time-reversible laws and knew nothing about its low entropy past, then you’d infer, not surprisingly, that the ice cube would melt into a liquid in the future (solid green line). But, more surprisingly, you also would infer that your glass evolved from a state of liquid water (dashed red line). You would not infer that the present half-melted state evolved from a state where the glass had a solid ice cube in it (dashed green line). To infer the solid cube you would need to appeal to your empirical experience of how processes are working around you, but you’d not infer the solid cube if all you had to work with were the basic time-reversible laws. To solve this so-called Loschmidt Paradoxe for the cosmos as a whole, and to predict the dashed green line rather than the dashed red line, physicists have suggested it is necessary to adopt the Past Hypothesis—that the universe at the time of the Big Bang was in a state of very low entropy. Using this Past Hypothesis the most probable history of the universe over the last 13.8 billion years is one in which entropy increases.
Can the Past Hypothesis be justified from other principles? Some physicists (for example, Richard Feynman) and philosophers (for example, Craig Callender) say the initial low entropy may simply be a brute fact—that is, there is no causal explanation for the initial low entropy. Objecting to inexplicable initial facts as being unacceptably ad hoc, the physicists Walther Ritz and Roger Penrose say we need to keep looking for basic, time-asymmetrical laws that will account for the initial low entropy and thus for time’s arrow. A third perspective on the Past Hypothesis is that perhaps a future theory of quantum gravity will provide a justification of the Hypothesis. A fourth perspective appeals to God’s having designed the Big Bang to start with low entropy. A fifth perspective appeals to the anthropic principle and the many-worlds interpretation of quantum mechanics in order to argue that since there exist so many universes with different initial entropies, there had to be one universe like our particular universe with its initial low entropy—and that is the only reason why our universe had initial low entropy.
The past and future are different in many ways that reflect the arrow of time. Consider the difference between time’s arrow and time’s arrows. The direction of entropy change is the thermodynamic arrow. Here are some suggestions for additional arrows:
- We remember last week, not next week.
- There is evidence of the past but not of the future.
- Our present actions affect the future and not the past.
- It is easier to know the past than to know the future.
- Radio waves spread out from the antenna, but never converge into it.
- The universe expands in volume rather than shrinks.
- Causes precede their effects.
- We see black holes but never white holes.
- B meson decay, neutral kaon decay, and Higgs boson decay are each different in a time reversed world.
- Quantum mechanical measurement collapses the wave function.
- Possibilities decrease as time goes on.
Most physicists suspect all these arrows are linked so that we can not have some arrows reversing while others do not. For example, the collapse of the wave function is generally considered to be due to an increase in the entropy of the universe. It is well accepted that entropy increase can account for the fact that we remember the past but not the future, that effects follow causes rather than precede them, and that animals grow old and never young. However, whether all the arrows are linked is still an open question.
Could the cosmic arrow of time have gone the other way? Most physicists suspect that the answer is yes, and they say it could have gone the other way if the initial conditions of the universe at the Big Bang event had been different. Crudely put, if all the particles’ trajectories and charges are reversed, then the arrow of time would reverse. Here is a scenario of how it might happen. As our universe evolves closer to a point of equilibrium and very high entropy, time would lose its unidirectionality. Eventually, though, the universe could evolve away from equilibrium and perhaps it would evolve so that the directional processes we are presently familiar with would go in reverse. We’d get eggs from omelets very easily, but it would be too difficult to get omelets from eggs. This new era would be an era of reversed time, and there would be a period of non-directional time separating the two eras.
If the cosmic arrow of time were to reverse this way, perhaps our past would be re-created and lived in reverse order. This re-occurrence of the past is different than the re-living of past events via time travel. With time travel the past is re-visited in the original order, not in reverse order.
Philosophers have asked interesting questions about the reversal of time’s arrow. What does it really mean to say time reverses? Does it require entropy to decrease on average in closed systems? If time were to reverse only in some far off corner of the universe, but not in our region of the universe, would dead people there become undead, and would the people there walk backwards up steps while remembering the future? First off, would it even be possible for them to be conscious? Assuming consciousness is caused by brain processes, could there be consciousness if their nerve pulses reversed, or would this reversal destroy consciousness? Supposing the answer is that they would be conscious, would people in that far off corner appear to us to be pre-cognitive if we could communicate with them? Would the feeling of being conscious be different for time-reversed people? [Here is one suggestion. There is one direction of time they would remember and call “the past,” and it would be when the entropy is lower. That is just as it is for us who do not experience time-reversal.] Consider communication between us and the inhabitants of that far off time-reversed region of the universe. If we sent a signal to the time-reversed region, could our message cross the border, or would it dissolve there, or would it bounce back? If residents of the time-reversed region successfully sent a recorded film across the border to us, should we play it in the ordinary way or in reverse?
Have dinosaurs slipped out of existence? More generally, we are asking whether the past is part of reality. How about the future? Philosophers are divided into three camps on the question of the reality of the past, present, and future. The presentist viewpoint maintains that the past and the future are not real, and that only the present is real, so if a statement about the past is true, this is because some present facts make it true. Parmenides, Duns Scotus and A. N. Prior were presentists. Advocates of a growing past argue that, in addition to the present, the past is also real. Reality “grows” with the coming into being of determinate reality from an indeterminate or potential reality. “The world grows by accretion of facts,” said Richard Jeffrey. This growing-past theory was advocated by C. D. Broad. It is not clear whether Aristotle accepted this theory or accepted a form of presentism; see (Putnam, 1967), p. 244 for commentary. William James famously remarked that the future is so unreal that even God can’t anticipate it.
Opposing both presentism and the growing past theory, Bertrand Russell, J.J.C. Smart, W.V.O. Quine, Adolf Grünbaum, and Paul Horwich object to assigning special ontological status to the present. They say there is no objective ontological difference among the past, the present, and the future just as there is no objective ontological difference among here, there, and far. Yes, we thank goodness that the pain is there rather than here, and that it is past rather than present, but these differences are subjective, being dependent on our point of view. This third ontology of time is called the block universe theory because it regards reality as a single block of spacetime with its time slices ordered by the temporally-before relation. It is mental perspectives only that divide the block into a past part, a present part, and a future part. The future, by the way, is the actual future, not all possible futures. William James coined the term “block universe,” but the theory is also called “eternalism” and the “static theory of time.” If time has an infinite future or infinite past, or if space has an infinite extent, then the block is infinitely large. On the block theory, time is like a very special extra dimension of space, as in a Minkowski diagram, so the view is also said to promote the spatialization of time.
The presentist says that when an entity loses its presentness it goes out of existence. One of the major issues for presentism is how to ground true propositions about the past. What makes it true that Abraham Lincoln was assassinated or that there’s a difference between last April and last May? And the presentist must account for causation, for April showers causing May flowers. A survey of defenses of presentism can be found in Markosian, 2003.
The presentist and the advocate of the growing past will usually unite in opposition to the block universe theory on two grounds: (i) the present is so much more vivid to a conscious being than is any other time. (ii) the block theory misses the special “open” character of the future. In the block universe there is only one future, so this implies the future exists already, which is fatalism or determinism, and we know both of these are incorrect. The counter from the defenders of the block universe is that, regarding (i), the now is significant but not objectively real. Regarding (ii) and the open future, the block theory allows determinism and fatalism but does not require either one. Eventually there will be one future, regardless of whether that future is now open or closed, and that is what constitutes the future portion of the block.
The advocates of the block universe attack both presentism and the growing-past theory by claiming that only the block universe can make sense of the theory of relativity’s implication that, if persons A and B are in relative motion, an event in person A’s present can be in person B’s future, yet advocates of presentism and the growing-past theories must suppose that this event is both real and unreal because it is real for A but not real for B. Surely that conclusion is unacceptable, claim the block theorists. Their two key assumptions here are that relativity does provide an accurate account of the spatiotemporal relations among events, and that if there is some frame of reference in which two events are simultaneous, then if one of the events is real, so is the other. See (Putnam, 1967) for a discussion of this argument.
Opponents of the block universe counter that it does not provide an accurate account of the way things are because it considers the present to be subjective, and not part of objective reality. For a review of the argument from relativity against presentism and its counters, see (Saunders, 2002).
All of our experience takes place in the present, but proponents of the objectivity of the now are committed to claiming the universe would have a present or a now even if there were no consciousness in the universe. This claim is controversial.
One argument for believing in the objectivity of the now points out that there is so much agreement among people about what is happening now and what is not. So, isn’t that a sign that the concept of the now is objective, not subjective. A second argument for objectivity of the now is that when we examine ordinary language we find evidence that a belief in the now is ingrained in our language. Notice all the present-tensed terminology. It is unlikely that it would be so ingrained if it were not correct to believe it.
A third argument, and the principal one, for objectivity of the now is that the present is sensed as special. When we sense present events, they are so much more vivid than remembered events and anticipated events. We all directly apprehend the present and do not infer it from the B-relations among events.
There are several criticisms of this third argument. (1) Some critics complain that they find no stamp of the present upon their own experiences. (2) Even if the argument from direct sense of the now worked for the now here, it does not work for what is happening now on the moon, so how is a global now rather than a local now to be defended? We can directly tell that we are here rather than there, but we don’t conclude from this that the here is somehow objective geographically. We don’t print “here” on maps, and we don’t print “now” on clock faces. (3) There are empirical studies by cognitive psychologists and neuroscientists which show that our judgment about what is happening now is plastic and can be affected by our expectations and by what other experiences we are having at the time. For example, we see and hear a man speaking to us from across the room; then we construct an artificial now in which hearing him speak and seeing him speak happen at the same time, whereas the acoustic engineer tells us we are mistaken because the sound traveled much slower than the light.
The main positive argument for the subjectivity of the now appeals to the relativity of simultaneity. The argument points out that in the theory of special relativity the line between the past and future is a ’time slice’ of simultaneous events that is different in different reference frames. The proponent of an objective now must select one of these planes of simultaneous events as being “what’s happening now,” but surely any such choice is just arbitrary, or so Einstein would say. Surely objective reality is not frame relative. Therefore, if we aren’t going to reject Einstein’s interpretation of his theory of special relativity, then we should reject the objectivity of the now.
One implication of the block universe theory is that events are the basic objects of the universe. These objects are not three-dimensional but rather four-dimensional. Just as all of spacetime is a four-dimensional block, so also basic objects are four-dimensional sub-blocks. Traditionally an adult human being is considered to be a three-dimensional object existing wholly at an instant, but for the four-dimensionalist, the human being consists of its childhood and its middle age and its future death and thus exists over a time period rather than wholly at a time. Objects considered four-dimensionally are said to be “perduring objects” as opposed to the three-dimensional “enduring objects” of common sense. The ontological question is to decide which of three camps is correct. The first camp says 3-d objects are the basic ontological objects. The second camp says 4-d objects are basic, and that they have proper parts which exist at various times. The third camp says there is no real fact of the matter in dispute here but merely one of terminology, that for some discussions the 3-d perspective is more convenient and for other discussions the 4-d perspective is the more convenient.
One famous argument in favor of 4-dimensionalism and perduring objects is that it solves the Heraclitus paradox of not being able to step into the same river twice. The mereological essentialist agrees with Heraclitus, but a 4-dimensionalist says you can step into the same river twice by stepping into two different time slices of the same 4-d river. Similarly, you cannot see a football game at a moment but only a part of the game because the game lasts longer than a moment.
This philosophical dispute has taken a linguistic turn by focusing upon a question about language: “Are predictions true or false at the time they are uttered?” Those who believe in the block universe (and thus in the determinate reality of the future) will answer “Yes” while a “No” will be given by presentists and advocates of the growing past. The issue is whether contingent sentences uttered now about future events are true or false now rather than true or false only in the future at the time the predicted event is supposed to occur.
Suppose someone says, “Tomorrow the admiral will start a sea battle.” And suppose that tomorrow the admiral orders a sneak attack on the enemy ships. And suppose that this action starts a sea battle. Advocates of the block universe argue that, if so, then the above sentence was true all along. Truth is eternal or fixed, they say, and “is true” is a tenseless predicate, not one that merely says “is true now.” These philosophers point favorably to the ancient Greek philosopher Chrysippus who was convinced that a contingent sentence about the future is true or false, and it can not be any value in between such as “indeterminate.” Many others, following a suggestion from Aristotle, argue that the sentence is not true until it can be known to be true, namely at the time at which the sea battle occurs. The sentence was not true before the battle occurred. In other words, predictions have no (classical) truth values at the time they are uttered. Predictions fall into the “truth value gap.” This position that contingent sentences have no classical truth values is called the Aristotelian position because many researchers throughout history have taken Aristotle to be holding the position in chapter 9 of On Interpretation–although today it is not so clear that Aristotle himself held it.
The principal motive for adopting the Aristotelian position arises from the belief that if sentences about future human actions are now true, then humans are determined to perform those actions, and so humans have no free will. To defend free will, we must deny truth values to predictions.
The Aristotelian argument against predictions being true or false has been discussed as much as any in the history of philosophy, and it faces a series of challenges. First, if there really is no free will, or if free will is compatible with determinism, then the motivation to deny truth values to predictions is undermined.
Second, according to the compatibilist, your choices affect the world, and if it is true that you will perform an action in the future, it does not follow that now you will not perform it freely, nor that you are not free to do otherwise if your intentions are different, but only that you will not do otherwise. For more on this point about modal logic, see Foreknowledge and Free Will.
A third challenge arises from moral discussions about the interests of people who are as yet unborn. Quine argues that if we have an obligation to conserve the environment for these people, then we are treating them as being as real as the people around us now. Only the block universe view can make sense of this treatment.
A fourth challenge, from Quine and others, claims the Aristotelian position wreaks havoc with the logical system we use to reason and argue with predictions. For example, here is a deductively valid argument:
There will be a sea battle tomorrow.
If there will be a sea battle tomorrow, then we should wake up the admiral.
So, we should wake up the admiral.
Without the premises in this argument having truth values, that is, being true or false, we cannot properly assess the argument using the usual standards of deductive validity because this standard is about the relationships among truth values of the component sentences–that a valid argument is one in which it is impossible for the premises to be true and the conclusion to be false. Unfortunately, the Aristotelian position says that some of these component sentences are neither true nor false, so Aristotle’s position is implausible.
In reaction to this fourth challenge, proponents of the Aristotelian argument claim that if Quine would embrace tensed propositions and expand his classical logic to a tense logic, he could avoid those difficulties in assessing the validity of arguments that involve sentences having future tense.
Quine has claimed that the analysts of our talk involving time should in principle be able to eliminate the temporal indexical words because their removal is needed for fixed truth and falsity of our sentences [fixed in the sense of being eternal sentences whose truth values are not relative to the situation because the indicator words have been replaced by times, places and names, and whose verbs are treated as tenseless], and having fixed truth values is crucial for the logical system used to clarify science. “To formulate logical laws in such a way as not to depend thus upon the assumption of fixed truth and falsity would be decidedly awkward and complicated, and wholly unrewarding,” says Quine.
Philosophers are still divided on the issues of whether only the present is real, what sort of deductive logic to use for reasoning about time, and whether future contingent sentences have truth values.
All the world’s cultures have a conception of time, but in only half the world’s languages is the ordering of events expressed in the form of tense (Pinker, p. 189). The English language, for example, expresses conceptions of time with tenses but also in other ways, such as with adverbial time phrases such as “now,” “tomorrow” and “twenty-three days ago.” Philosophers have asked what we are basically committed to when we locate an event in the past, in the present, or in the future. For example, how should we understand the past tense verb in, “Custer died in Montana”? For those philosophers who believe in the reality of the past, there are two major answers. One answer is that tense distinctions represent objective features of reality that are not captured by the popular block universe approach. This answer takes tenses very seriously and is called the tensed theory of time, or the A-theory in McTaggart’s sense of A vs. B. A second, contrary answer to the question of the significance of tenses is that they are subjective features of the perspective from which the subject views the universe. Actually this disagreement is not really about tenses in the grammatical sense, but rather is about the significance of the distinctions of past, present, and future which those tenses are used to mark.
On the tenseless theory of time, or the B-theory, whether the death of U.S. Lieutenant Colonel George Armstrong Custer occurred here depends on the speaker’s perspective (Is the speaker is standing at the battle site in Montana?); similarly, whether the death occurs now is equally subjective (Is it now 1876?). The proponent of the tenseless view does not deny the importance or coherence of talk about the past, but will say it really is (or should be analyzed as being) talk about our own relation to events. My assertion that the event of Custer’s death has occurred might be analyzed by the B-theorist as asserting that the death event happens before the event of my writing this sentence.
This controversy is often presented as a dispute about whether tensed facts exist, with advocates of the tenseless theory objecting to tensed facts such as the fact of Mohammed’s having been born. The primary function of tensed facts is to make tensed sentences true. For the purposes of explaining that point, let us uncritically accept the Correspondence Theory of Truth and apply it to the sentence:
Custer died in Montana.
If we apply the Correspondence Theory directly to this sentence, then the tensed theory would imply
The sentence “Custer died in Montana” is true because it corresponds to the tensed fact that Custer died in Montana.
The old tenseless theory, created by Bertrand Russell (1915), would give a different analysis. It would say that the Correspondence Theory should be applied only to the result of analyzing away tensed sentences into equivalent sentences that do not use tenses. They would say that the sentence “Custer died in Montana” has the same meaning as this “eternal” sentence:
There is a time t such that Custer dies in Montana at time t, and time t is before the time of the writing of the sentence “Custer died in Montana” by B. Dowden in the article “Time” in The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
In this analysis, the verb dies is logically tenseless (although grammatically it is present tensed). Applying the Correspondence Theory to this new sentence yields:
The sentence “Custer died in Montana” is true because it corresponds to the tenseless fact that there is a time t such that Custer dies in Montana at time t, and time t is before the time of the utterance (or writing) of the sentence “Custer died in Montana” by B. Dowden in the article “Time” in The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
This analysis is less straight-forward than the analysis offered by the tensed theory, but it does not require tensed facts. The analysis is challenged by proponents of the tensed theory on the grounds that it can succeed only for utterances or inscriptions, but a sentence can be true even if never uttered or written by anyone.
There are other challenges. Roderick Chisholm and A. N. Prior claim that the word “is” in the sentence “It is now midnight” is essentially present tensed because there is no translation using only tenseless verbs. Trying to analyze it as, say, “There is a time t such that t = midnight” is to miss the essential reference to the present in the original sentence because the original sentence is not always true, but the sentence “There is a time t such that t = midnight” is always true. So, the tenseless analysis fails. There is no escape by adding “and t is now” because this last indexical still needs analysis, and we are starting a vicious regress.
An advocate of the tenseless theory might try to respond to Chisholm and Prior by saying the statement “It is now midnight” is true if and only if the event of the standard clock indicating the time is midnight happens at the same time as the utterance of the statement.
Earlier, (Prior 1959) had supported the tensed theory by arguing that after experiencing a painful event,
one says, e.g., “Thank goodness that’s over,” and [this]…says something which it is impossible that any use of a tenseless copula with a date should convey. It certainly doesn’t mean the same as, e.g., “Thank goodness the date of the conclusion of that thing is Friday, June 15, 1954,” even if it be said then. (Nor, for that matter, does it mean “Thank goodness the conclusion of that thing is contemporaneous with this utterance.” Why should anyone thank goodness for that?).
Some advocates of the tenseless treatment respond by saying, “What is wrong with thanking goodness for that?”
D. H. Mellor and J.J.C. Smart advocate a newer tenseless theory by saying the truth conditions of any tensed declarative sentence can be explained without tensed facts even if Chisholm and Prior are correct that some tensed sentences can not be translated into tenseless ones. [What is meant by "truth conditions of a sentence"? These are the conditions which must be satisfied in the world in order for the sentence to be true. The sentence "Snow is white" is true on the condition that snow is white. More particularly, it is true if whatever is referred to by the term 'snow' satisfies the predicate 'is white'. The conditions under which the sentence "If it's snowing then it's cold" are true are that it is not both true that it is snowing and false that it is cold.] If I’m speaking to you and say, “It is now midnight,” then this sentence admittedly cannot be translated into tenseless terminology without loss of meaning, for two reasons: (I) because because it uses the concept of the present and (ii) because it has different truth values at different times, whereas the supposed equivalent sentence from the old tenseless theory uses different concepts and the sentence never changes its truth value. But the truth conditions of “It is now midnight” are that my utterance occurs at the same time as your hearing the utterance, which in turn is the same time as when our standard clock declares the time to be midnight in our reference frame. Notice that no tensed facts were appealed to in the explanation of those truth conditions. Similarly, an advocate of the new tenseless theory could say it is not the pastness of the painful event that explains why I say, “Thank goodness that’s over.” I say it because I believe that the time of the occurrence of that utterance is greater than the time of the occurrence of the painful event, and because I am glad about this. Of course I’d be even gladder if there were no pain at any time. I may not be consciously thinking about the time of the utterance when I make it; nevertheless that time is what helps explain what I am glad about. Notice that appeal to tensed terminology was removed in that explanation. In addition, it is claimed by Mellor that tenseless sentences can be used to explain the logical relations between tensed sentences: that one tensed sentence implies another, is inconsistent with yet another, and so forth. Understanding a declarative sentence’s truth conditions and its truth implications and how it behaves in a network of inferences is what we understand whenever we know the meaning of the sentence. Once it is established that tensed sentences can be explained without utilizing tensed facts, then Ockham’s Razor is applied. If we can do without essentially-tensed facts, then we should say essentially-tensed facts do not exist. To summarize, tensed facts were presumed to be needed to account for the truth of tensed talk; but the analysis shows that ordinary tenseless facts are adequate. Proponents of the tensed theory of time do not agree with this conclusion, and the debate continues.
Temporal logic is the representation of reasoning about time by using the methods of symbolic logic in order to formalize which statements (propositions, sentences) about time imply which others. For example, in McTaggart’s B-series, the most important relation is the happens-before relation on events. Logicians have asked what sort of principles must this relation obey in order to properly account for our reasoning about time. Let the two-argument relation B(x,y) be interpreted as “x happens before y.” Now, consider this informally valid reasoning:
Adam’s arrival at the train station happened before Bryan’s. Therefore, Bryan’s arrival at the station did not happen before Adam’s.
If we translate this into predicate logic using a domain of events, where the individual constant ‘a’ denotes Adam’s arrival at the train station and ‘b’ denotes Bryan’s arrival at the train station, then we have:
Unfortunately, this formal reasoning is invalid. What is wrong (according to many logicians although even this answer is controversial) is that a premise is missing that states one of the principles obeyed by the B relation, namely that it is asymmetric. We need the implicit premise:
∀x∀y[B(x,y) → ~B(y,x)]
But in other informally valid reasoning we discover a need to make even more assumptions about the happens-before relation. Suppose Adam arrived at the train station before Bryan, and suppose Bryan arrived before Charles. Is it valid reasoning to infer that Adam arrived before Charles? Yes, but if we translate directly into predicate logic we get this invalid argument:
To make this argument be valid we need the implicit premise that says the happens-before relation is transitive, that is:
∀x∀y∀z [(B(x,y) & B(y,z)) → B(x,z)]
What other constraints should be placed on the B relation (when it is to be interpreted as the happens-before relation)? Logicians have offered many suggestions: that B is irreflexive, that in any reference frame any two events are related somehow by the B relation (there are no disconnected pairs of events), that B is dense in the sense that there is an event between any two events that aren’t simultaneous, and so forth.
The classical approach to temporal logic, however, is not to add premises to arguments in classical predicate logic as we have just been doing. Instead it is via tense logic, a formalism that adds tense operators on propositions of propositional logic. The pioneer in the late 1950s was A. N. Prior. He created a new symbolic logic to describe our reasoning that uses time words such as “now,” “happens before,” “afterwards,” “at all times,” and “sometimes.” He hoped that a precise, formal treatment of these concepts could lead to resolution of some of the controversial philosophical issues about time. Prior begins with an important assumption: that a proposition such as “Custer dies in Montana” can be true at one time and false at another time. That assumption is challenged by some philosophers, such as W.V. Quine, who prefer to avoid use of this sort of proposition and who recommend that temporal logics use only sentences that are timelessly true or timelessly false, and that have no indexicals whose reference can shift from one context to another.
Prior’s main original idea was to appreciate that time concepts are similar in structure to modal concepts such as “it is possible that” and “it is necessary that.” He adapted modal propositional logic for his tense logic. Michael Dummett and E. J. Lemmon also made major, early contributions to tense logic. One standard system of tense logic is a variant of the S4.3 system of modal logic. In this formal tense logic, the modal operator that is interpreted to mean “it is possible that” is re-interpreted to mean “at some past time it was the case that” or, equivalently, “it once was the case that,” or “it once was that.” Let the capital letter ‘P’ represent this operator. P will operate on propositions, such as p. If p represents the proposition “Custer dies in Montana,” then Pp says Custer died in Montana.
Prior added to the axioms of classical propositional logic the axiom P(p v q) ↔ (Pp v Pq). The axiom says that for any two propositions p and q, at some past time it was the case that p or q if and only if either at some past time it was the case that p or at some past time (perhaps a different past time) it was the case that q.
If p is the proposition “Custer dies in Montana” and q is “Sitting Bull dies in Montana,” then
P(p v q) ↔ (Pp v Pq)
Custer or Sitting Bull died in Montana if and only if either Custer died in Montana or Sitting Bull died in Montana.
The S4.3 system’s key axiom is the equivalence, for all propositions p and q,
Pp & Pq ↔ [P(p & q) v P(p & Pq) v P(q & Pp)].
This axiom when interpreted in tense logic captures part of our ordinary conception of time as a linear succession of states of the world.
Another axiom of tense logic might state that if proposition q is true, then it will always be true that q has been true at some time. If H is the operator “It has always been the case that,” then a new axiom might be
Pp ↔ ~H~p.
This axiom of tense logic is analogous to the modal logic axiom that p is possible if and only if it is not the case that it is necessary that not-p. Prior and others have suggested a wide variety of additional axioms for tense logic, but logicians still disagree about which axioms to accept.
It is controversial whether to add axioms that express the topology of time, for example that it comes to an end or doesn’t come to an end; the argument here is that this is an empirical matter, not a matter for logic to settle. Some extension of classical tense logic is definitely needed in order to express “q has been true for the past week.”
Regarding a semantics for tense logic, Prior had the idea that the truth of a tensed proposition should be expressed in terms of truth at a time. That is, a modal proposition Pp (it was once the case that p) is true at a time t if and only if p is true at some time earlier than t. This suggestion has led to an extensive development of the formal semantics for tense logic.
The concept of being in the past is usually treated by metaphysicians as a predicate that assigns properties to events, but, in the tense logic just presented, the concept is treated as an operator P upon propositions, and this difference in treatment is objectionable to some metaphysicians.
The other major approach to temporal logic does not use a tense logic. Instead, it formalizes temporal reasoning within a first-order logic without modal-like tense operators.
Another method for developing ideas about temporal logic is the “method of temporal arguments” which adds an additional temporal argument to any predicate involving time in order to indicate how its satisfaction depends on time. A predicate such as “is less than seven” does not involve time, but the predicate “is resting” does, even though both use the word “is”. If the “x is resting” is represented classically as R(x), where R is a one-argument predicate, then it could be represented in temporal logic as the two-argument predicate R(x,t), and this would be interpreted as saying x has property R at time t. R has been changed to a two-argument predicate by adding a “temporal argument.” The time variable ‘t’ is treated as a new sort of variable requiring new axioms. Suggested new axioms allow time to be a dense linear ordering of instantaneous instants or to be continuous or to have some other structure.
Occasionally the method of temporal arguments uses a special constant symbol, say ‘n’, to denote now, the present time. This helps with the translation of common temporal propositions (statements, or declarative sentences). For example, let Q(t) be interpreted as “Socrates is sitting down at t.” The proposition that Socrates has always been sitting down may be translated into first-order temporal logic as
(∀t)[(t < n) → Q(t)].
Some temporal logics allow sentences to lack both classical truth-values. The first person to give a clear presentation of the implications of treating declarative sentences as being neither true nor false was the Polish logician Jan Lukasiewicz in 1920. To carry out Aristotle’s suggestion that future contingent sentences do not yet have truth values, he developed a three-valued symbolic logic, with each grammatical declarative sentence having the truth-values True, or False, or else Indeterminate [T, F, or I]. Contingent sentences about the future, such as “There will be a sea battle tomorrow,” are assigned an I. Truth tables for the connectives of propositional logic are redefined to maintain logical consistency and to maximally preserve our intuitions about truth and falsehood. See (Haack, 1974) for more details about this application of three-valued logic.
Different temporal logics have been created depending on whether one wants to model circular time, discrete time, time obeying general relativity, the time of ordinary discourse, and so forth. For an introduction to tense logic and other temporal logics, see (Øhrstrøm and Hasle, 1995).
The following questions are addressed in the Time Supplement article:
- What are Instants and Durations?
- What is an Event?
- What is a Reference Frame?
- What is an Inertial Frame?
- What is Spacetime?
- What is a Minkowski Diagram?
- What are the Metric and the Interval?
- Does the Theory of Relativity Imply Time is Part of Space?
- Is Time the Fourth Dimension?
- Is There More Than One Kind of Physical Time?
- How is Time Relative to the Observer?
- What is the Relativity of Simultaneity?
- What is the Conventionality of Simultaneity?
- What is the Difference Between the Past and the Absolute Past?
- What is Time Dilation?
- How does Gravity Affect Time?
- What Happens to Time Near a Black Hole?
- What is the Solution to the Twin Paradox (Clock Paradox)?
- What is the Solution to Zeno’s Paradoxes?
- How do Time Coordinates Get Assigned to Points of Spacetime?
- How do Dates Get Assigned to Actual Events?
- What is Essential to Being a Clock?
- What does It Mean for a Clock To Be Accurate?
- What is Our Standard Clock?
- Why are Some Standard Clocks Better Than Others?
- Callender, Craig, and Ralph Edney. Introducing Time, Totem Books, USA, 2001.
- A cartoon-style book covering most of the topics in this encyclopedia article in a more elementary way. Each page is two-thirds graphics and one-third text.
- Callender, Craig and Carl Hoefer. “Philosophy of Space-Time Physics” in The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Science, ed. by Peter Machamer and Michael Silberstein, Blackwell Publishers, 2002, pp. 173-98.
- Discusses whether it is a fact or a convention that in a reference frame the speed of light going one direction is the same as the speed coming back.
- Callender, Craig. “The Subjectivity of the Present,” Chronos, V, 2003-4, pp. 108-126.
- Surveys the psychological and neuroscience literature and suggests that the evidence tends to support the claim that our experience of the “now” is the experience of a subjective property rather than merely of an objective property, and it offers an interesting explanation of why so many people believe in the objectivity of the present.
- Callender, Craig. “Is Time an Illusion?”, Scientific American, June, 2010, pp. 58-65.
- Explains how the belief that time is fundamental may be an illusion because time emerges from a universe that is basically static.
- Carroll, John W. and Ned Markosian. An Introduction to Metaphysics. Cambridge University Press, 2010.
- This introductory, undergraduate metaphysics textbook contains an excellent chapter introducing the metaphysical issues involving time, beginning with the McTaggart controversy.
- Carroll, Sean. From Eternity to Here: The Quest for the Ultimate Theory of Time, Dutton/Penguin Group, New York, 2010.
- Part Three “Entropy and Time’s Arrow” provides a very clear explanation of the details of the problems involved with time’s arrow. For an interesting answer to the question of whether any interaction between our part of the universe and a part in which the arrow of times goes in reverse, see endnote 137 for p. 164.
- Carroll, Sean. “Ten Things Everyone Should Know About Time,” Discover Magazine, Cosmic Variance, online 2011.
- Contains the quotation about how the mind reconstructs its story of what is happening “now.”
- Damasio, Antonio R. “Remembering When,” Scientific American: Special Edition: A Matter of Time, vol. 287, no. 3, 2002; reprinted in Katzenstein, 2006, pp.34-41.
- A look at the brain structures involved in how our mind organizes our experiences into the proper temporal order. Includes a discussion of Benjamin Libet’s discovery in the 1970s that the brain events involved in initiating a free choice occur about a third of a second before we are aware of our making the choice.
- Dainton, Barry. Time and Space, Second Edition, McGill-Queens University Press: Ithaca, 2010.
- A survey of all the topics in this article, but at a deeper level.
- Davies, Paul. About Time: Einstein’s Unfinished Revolution, Simon & Schuster, 1995.
- An easy to read survey of the impact of the theory of relativity on our understanding of time.
- Davies, Paul. How to Build a Time Machine, Viking Penguin, 2002.
- A popular exposition of the details behind the possibilities of time travel.
- Deutsch, David and Michael Lockwood, “The Quantum Physics of Time Travel,” Scientific American, pp. 68-74. March 1994.
- An investigation of the puzzle of getting information for free by traveling in time.
- Dowden, Bradley. The Metaphysics of Time: A Dialogue, Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc. 2009.
- An undergraduate textbook in dialogue form that covers most of the topics discussed in this encyclopedia article.
- Dummett, Michael. “Is Time a Continuum of Instants?,” Philosophy, 2000, Cambridge University Press, pp. 497-515.
- A constructivist model of time that challenges the idea that time is composed of durationless instants.
- Earman, John. “Implications of Causal Propagation Outside the Null-Cone,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 50, 1972, pp. 222-37.
- Describes his rocket paradox that challenges time travel to the past.
- Grünbaum, Adolf. “Relativity and the Atomicity of Becoming,” Review of Metaphysics, 1950-51, pp. 143-186.
- An attack on the notion of time’s flow, and a defense of the treatment of time and space as being continua and of physical processes as being aggregates of point-events. Difficult reading.
- Haack, Susan. Deviant Logic, Cambridge University Press, 1974.
- Chapter 4 contains a clear account of Aristotle’s argument (in section 9c of the present article) for truth value gaps, and its development in Lukasiewicz’s three-valued logic.
- Hawking, Stephen. “The Chronology Protection Hypothesis,” Physical Review. D 46, p. 603, 1992.
- Reasons for the impossibility of time travel.
- Hawking, Stephen. A Brief History of Time, Updated and Expanded Tenth Anniversary Edition, Bantam Books, 1996.
- A leading theoretical physicist provides introductory chapters on space and time, black holes, the origin and fate of the universe, the arrow of time, and time travel. Hawking suggests that perhaps our universe originally had four space dimensions and no time dimension, and time came into existence when one of the space dimensions evolved into a time dimension. He calls this space dimension “imaginary time.”
- Horwich, Paul. Asymmetries in Time, The MIT Press, 1987.
- A monograph that relates the central problems of time to other problems in metaphysics, philosophy of science, philosophy of language and philosophy of action.
- Katzenstein, Larry, ed. Scientific American Special Edition: A Matter of Time, vol. 16, no. 1, 2006.
- A collection of Scientific American articles about time.
- Krauss, Lawrence M. and Glenn D. Starkman, “The Fate of Life in the Universe,” Scientific American Special Edition: The Once and Future Cosmos, Dec. 2002, pp. 50-57.
- Discusses the future of intelligent life and how it might adapt to and survive the expansion of the universe.
- Lasky, Ronald C. “Time and the Twin Paradox,” in Katzenstein, 2006, pp. 21-23.
- A short, but careful and authoritative analysis of the twin paradox, with helpful graphs showing how each twin would view his clock and the other twin’s clock during the trip. Because of the spaceship’s changing velocity by turning around, the twin on the spaceship has a shorter world-line than the Earth-based twin and takes less time than the Earth-based twin.
- Le Poidevin, Robin and Murray MacBeath, The Philosophy of Time, Oxford University Press, 1993.
- A collection of twelve influential articles on the passage of time, subjective facts, the reality of the future, the unreality of time, time without change, causal theories of time, time travel, causation, empty time, topology, possible worlds, tense and modality, direction and possibility, and thought experiments about time. Difficult reading for undergraduates.
- Le Poidevin, Robin, Travels in Four Dimensions: The Enigmas of Space and Time, Oxford University Press, 2003.
- A philosophical introduction to conceptual questions involving space and time. Suitable for use as an undergraduate textbook without presupposing any other course in philosophy. There is a de-emphasis on teaching the scientific theories, and an emphasis on elementary introductions to the relationship of time to change, the implications that different structures for time have for our understanding of causation, difficulties with Zeno’s Paradoxes, whether time passes, the nature of the present, and why time has an arrow. The treatment of time travel says, rather oddly, that time machines “disappear” and that when a “time machine leaves for 2101, it simply does not exist in the intervening times,” as measured from an external reference frame.
- Lockwood, Michael, The Labyrinth of Time: Introducing the Universe, Oxford University Press, 2005.
- A philosopher of physics presents the implications of contemporary physics for our understanding of time. Chapter 15, “Schrödinger’s Time-Traveller,” presents the Oxford physicist David Deutsch’s quantum analysis of time travel.
- Markosian, Ned, “A Defense of Presentism,” in Zimmerman, Dean (ed.), Oxford Studies in Metaphysics, Vol. 1, Oxford University Press, 2003.
- Maudlin, Tim. The Metaphysics Within Physics, Oxford University Press, 2007.
- Chapter 4, “On the Passing of Time,” defends the dynamic theory of time’s flow, and argues that the passage of time is objective.
- McTaggart, J. M. E. The Nature of Existence, Cambridge University Press, 1927.
- Chapter 33 restates more clearly the arguments that McTaggart presented in 1908 for his A series and B series and how they should be understood to show that time is unreal. Difficult reading. The argument that a single event is in the past, is present, and will be future yet it is inconsistent for an event to have more than one of these properties is called “McTaggart’s Paradox.”
- Mellor, D. H. Real Time II, International Library of Philosophy, 1998.
- This monograph presents a subjective theory of tenses. Mellor argues that the truth conditions of any tensed sentence can be explained without tensed facts.
- Newton-Smith, W. H. The Structure of Time, Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1980.
- A survey of the philosophical issues involving time. It emphasizes the logical and mathematical structure of time.
- Norton, John. “Time Really Passes,” Humana.Mente: Journal of Philosophical Studies, 13 April 2010.
- Argues that “We don’t find passage in our present theories and we would like to preserve the vanity that our physical theories of time have captured all the important facts of time. So we protect our vanity by the stratagem of dismissing passage as an illusion.”
- Øhrstrøm, P. and P. F. V. Hasle. Temporal Logic: from Ancient Ideas to Artificial Intelligence. Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1995.
- An elementary introduction to the logic of temporal reasoning.
- Pinker, Steven. The Stuff of Thought: Language as a Window into Human Nature, Penguin Group, 2007.
- Chapter 4 discusses how the conceptions of space and time are expressed in language in a way very different from that described by either Kant or Newton.
- Pöppel, Ernst. Mindworks: Time and Conscious Experience. San Diego: Harcourt Brace Jovanovich. 1988.
- A neuroscientist explores our experience of time.
- Prior, A. N. “Thank Goodness That’s Over,” Philosophy, 34 (1959), p. 17.
- Argues that a tenseless or B-theory of time fails to account for our relief that painful past events are in the past rather than in the present.
- Prior, A. N. Past, Present and Future, Oxford University Press, 1967.
- A pioneering work in temporal logic, the symbolic logic of time, which permits propositions to be true at one time and false at another.
- Prior, A. N. “Critical Notices: Richard Gale, The Language of Time,” Mind, 78, no. 311, 1969, 453-460.
- Contains his attack on the attempt to define time in terms of causation.
- Prior, A. N. “The Notion of the Present,” Studium Generale, volume 23, 1970, pp. 245-8.
- A brief defense of presentism, the view that the past and the future are not real.
- Putnam, Hilary. “Time and Physical Geometry,” The Journal of Philosophy, 64 (1967), pp. 240-246.
- Comments on whether Aristotle is a presentist and why Aristotle was wrong if Relativity is right.
- Russell, Bertrand. “On the Experience of Time,” Monist, 25 (1915), pp. 212-233.
- The classical tenseless theory.
- Saunders, Simon. “How Relativity Contradicts Presentism,” in Time, Reality & Experience edited by Craig Callender, Cambridge University Press, 2002, pp. 277-292.
- Reviews the arguments for against the claim that, since the present in the theory of relativity is relative to reference frame, presentism must be incorrect.
- Savitt, Steven F. (ed.). Time’s Arrows Today: Recent Physical and Philosophical Work on the Direction of Time. Cambridge University Press, 1995.
- A survey of research in this area, presupposing sophisticated knowledge of mathematics and physics.
- Sciama, Dennis. “Time ‘Paradoxes’ in Relativity,” in The Nature of Time edited by Raymond Flood and Michael Lockwood, Basil Blackwell, 1986, pp. 6-21.
- A good account of the twin paradox.
- Shoemaker, Sydney. “Time without Change,” Journal of Philosophy, 66 (1969), pp. 363-381.
- A thought experiment designed to show us how time could exist even without any change in the universe.
- Sklar, Lawrence. Space, Time, and Spacetime, University of California Press, 1976.
- Chapter III, Section E discusses general relativity and the problem of substantival spacetime, where Sklar argues that Einstein’s theory does not support Mach’s views against Newton’s interpretations of his bucket experiment; that is, Mach’s argument against substantivialism fails.
- Sorabji, Richard. Matter, Space, & Motion: Theories in Antiquity and Their Sequel. Cornell University Press, 1988.
- Chapter 10 discusses ancient and contemporary accounts of circular time.
- Steinhardt, Paul J. “The Inflation Debate: Is the theory at the heart of modern cosmology deeply flawed?” Scientific American, April, 2011, pp. 36-43.
- Argues that the Big Bang Theory with inflation is incorrect and that we need a cyclic cosmology with an eternal series of big bangs and big crunches but with no inflation.
- Thorne, Kip S. Black Holes and Time Warps: Einstein’s Outrageous Legacy, W. W. Norton & Co., 1994.
- Chapter 14 is a popular account of how to use a wormhole to create a time machine.
- Van Fraassen, Bas C. An Introduction to the Philosophy of Time and Space, Columbia University Press, 1985.
- An advanced undergraduate textbook by an important philosopher of science.
- Veneziano, Gabriele. “The Myth of the Beginning of Time,” Scientific American, May 2004, pp. 54-65, reprinted in Katzenstein, 2006, pp. 72-81.
- An account of string theory’s impact on our understanding of time’s origin. Veneziano hypothesizes that our Big Bang event was not the origin of time but simply the outcome of a preexisting state.
- Whitrow. G. J. The Natural Philosophy of Time, Second Edition, Clarendon Press, 1980.
- A broad survey of the topic of time and its role in physics, biology, and psychology. Pitched at a higher level than the Davies books.
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