Time is what we use a clock to measure. Despite 2,500 years of investigation into the nature of time, many issues about it are unresolved. Here is a list in no particular order of the most important issues that are discussed in this article: •What time actually is; •Whether time exists when nothing is changing; •What kinds of time travel are possible; •How time is related to mind; •Why time has an arrow; •Whether the future and past are as real as the present; •How to correctly analyze the metaphor of time’s flow; •Whether contingent sentences about the future have truth values now; •When time will end; •Whether there was time before the beginning of our Big Bang; •Whether tensed or tenseless concepts are semantically basic; •What the proper formalism or logic is for capturing the special role that time plays in reasoning; •What neural mechanisms account for our experience of time; •Which aspects of time are conventional; •Which aspects of time are subjective or mind-dependent; and •Whether there is a timeless substratum from which time emerges.
Consider this one issue upon which philosophers are deeply divided: What sort of ontological differences are there among the present, the past and the future? There are three competing theories. Presentists argue that necessarily only present objects and present experiences are real, and we conscious beings recognize this in the special vividness of our present experience compared to our dim memories of past experiences and our expectations of future experiences. So, the dinosaurs have slipped out of reality even though our current ideas of them have not. However, according to the growing-past theory, the past and present are both real, but the future is not real because the future is indeterminate or merely potential. Dinosaurs are real, but our future death is not. The third theory is that there are no objective ontological differences among present, past, and future because the differences are merely subjective. This third theory is called “eternalism.”
Table of Contents
- What Should a Philosophical Theory of Time Do?
- How Is Time Related to Mind?
- What Is Time?
- What does Science Require of Time?
- What Kinds of Time Travel are Possible?
- Does Time Require Change? (Relational vs. Substantival Theories)
- McTaggart's A-Theory and B-Theory
- Does Time Flow?
- What are the Differences among the Past, Present, and Future?
- What Gives Time Its Direction or Arrow?
- What is Temporal Logic?
- References and Further Reading
Philosophers of time tend to divide into two broad camps on some of the key philosophical issues, although many philosophers do not fit into these pigeonholes. Members of the A-camp say that McTaggart's A-theory is the fundamental way to view time; events are always changing, the now is objectively real and so is time's flow; ontologically we should accept either presentism or the growing-past theory; predictions are not true or false at the time they are uttered; tenses are semantically basic; and the ontologically fundamental entities are 3-dimensional objects. Members of the B-camp say that McTaggart's B-theory is the fundamental way to view time; events are never changing; the now is not objectively real and neither is time's flow; ontologically we should accept eternalism and the block-universe theory; predictions are true or false at the time they are uttered; tenses are not semantically basic; and the fundamental entities are 4-dimensional events or processes. This article provides an introduction to this controversy between the camps.
However, there are many other issues about time whose solutions do not fit into one or the other of the above two camps. (i) Does time exist only for beings who have minds? (ii) Can time exist if no event is happening anywhere? (iii) What sorts of time travel are possible? (iv) Why does time have a direction or arrow? (v) Could two different pasts lead to the same present, an does the present determine the future? (vi) How did various organisms evolve their internal clocks, and what is the neural basis of the human sense of time?
Philosophers have an interest in the concept of time in addition to time itself. What are the features of time that are required by the very concept? This question is sometimes expressed in the terminology of essential and accidental features. Is time’s being one dimensional an essential feature of time, or does the time we are familiar with just happen to be one dimensional? Even if time is one-dimensional, could it be circular or must it be linear? Can we rule out circularity just by examining the concept of time, or does it take empirical evidence to rule out circularity?
A full theory of time should address this constellation of philosophical issues about time. Narrower theories of time will focus on resolving one or more members of this constellation, but the long-range goal is to knit together these theories into a full, systematic, and detailed theory of time. Philosophers also ask whether to adopt a realist or anti-realist interpretation of a theory of time, but this article does not explore this subtle metaphysical question.
Physical time is public time, the time that clocks are designed to measure. Biological time, by contrast, is indicated by an organism's various internal clocks such as its circadian rhythm. Psychological time is different from both physical time and biological time. Psychological time is private time. It is also called phenomenological time, and it is perhaps best understood as awareness of physical time.
Psychological time passes relatively swiftly for us while we are enjoying an activity, but it slows dramatically if we are waiting anxiously for the pot of water to boil on the stove. The slowness is probably due to focusing our attention on short periods of physical time. Meanwhile, the clock by the stove is measuring physical time and is not affected by any person’s awareness nor by any organism's biological time.
When a physicist defines speed to be the rate of change of position with respect to time, the term “time” refers to physical time, not psychological time or biological time. Physical time is more fundamental than psychological time for helping us understand our shared experiences in the world, and so it is more useful for doing physical science, but psychological time is vitally important for understanding many mental experiences.
Psychological time is faster for older people than for children, as you notice when your grandmother says, "Oh, it's my birthday again." That is, an older person's psychological time is faster relative to physical time. Psychological time is slower or faster depending upon where we are in the spectrum of conscious experience: awake normally, involved in a daydream, sleeping normally, drugged with anesthetics, or in a coma. Some philosophers claim that psychological time is completely transcended in the mental state called nirvana because psychological time slows to a complete stop. .
A major philosophical problem is to explain the origin and character of our temporal experiences. Philosophers continue to investigate, but so far do not agree on, how our experience of temporal phenomena produces our consciousness of our experiencing temporal phenomena. With the notable exception of Husserl, most philosophers say our ability to imagine other times is a necessary ingredient in our having any consciousness at all. Many philosophers also say people in a coma have a low level of consciousness, yet when a person awakes from a coma they can imagine other times but have no good sense about how long they've been in the coma.
We make use of our ability to imagine other times when we experience a difference between our present perceptions and our present memories of past perceptions. Somehow the difference between the two gets interpreted by us as evidence that the world we are experiencing is changing through time, with some events succeeding other events. Locke said our train of ideas produces our idea that events succeed each other in time, but he offered no details on how this train does the producing.
Although our cerebral cortex is usually considered to be the base for conscious experience, it is surprising that rats distinguish one time interval from another—such as the difference between a five second interval and a forty second interval—even with their cerebral cortex removed.
Philosophers also want to know which aspects of time we have direct experience of, and which we have only indirect experience of. Is our direct experience only of the momentary present, as Aristotle, Thomas Reid, and Alexius Meinong believed, or instead do we have direct experience of what William James called a "specious present," a short stretch of physical time? Among those accepting the notion of a specious present, there is continuing controversy about whether the individual specious presents can overlap each other and about how the individual specious presents combine to form our stream of consciousness.
The brain takes an active role in building a mental scenario of what is taking place beyond the brain. For one example, the "time dilation effect" in psychology occurs when events involving an object coming toward you last longer in psychological time than an event with the same object being stationary. For another example, try tapping your nose with one hand and your knee with your other hand at the same time. Even though it takes longer for the signal from your knee to reach your brain than the signal from your nose to reach your brain, you will have the experience of the two tappings being simultaneous—thanks to the brain's manipulation of the data. Neuroscientists suggest that your brain waits about 80 milliseconds for all the relevant input to come in before you experience a “now.” This is sufficient physical time for the brain to manipulate data arriving from your nose before data arriving from your knee. Craig Callender surveyed the psycho-physics literature on human experience of the present, and concluded that, only if the duration in physical time between two experienced events is less than about a quarter of a second (250 milliseconds)will humans say both events happened simultaneously. This approximately 250 millisecond duration is slightly different for different people but is stable within the experience of any single person. Also, "our impression of subjective present-ness...can be manipulated in a variety of ways" such as by what other sights or sounds are present at nearby times. See (Callender 2003-4, p. 124) and (Callender 2008).
According to Rene Descartes' dualistic philosophy of mind, the mind is not in space, but it is in time. The current article accepts the more popular philosophy of mind that rejects dualism and claims that our mind is caused by our brain or is due to some proper functioning of our brain.
Within the field of cognitive science, researchers want to know what are the neural mechanisms that account for our experience of time—for our awareness of change, for our sense of time’s flow, for our ability to place events into the correct time order (temporal succession), and for our ability to notice, and often accurately estimate, durations (persistence). Suppose you live otherwise normally within a mine for a while. You can keep track of whether it is night or day; you can give a good estimate of how long it will be until dinner time; and you can keep track of how long you've been in the mine. And you can do all three of these things simultaneously.
The most surprising experimental result about our experience of time is Benjamin Libet’s claim in the 1970s that his experiments show that the brain events involved in initiating our free choice occur about a third of a second before we are aware of our choice. Before Libet’s work, it was universally agreed that a person is aware of deciding to act freely, then later the body initiates the action. Libet's work has been used to challenge this universal claim about decisions. However, Libet's own experiments have been difficult to repeat because he drilled through the skull and inserted electrodes to shock the underlying brain tissue. See (Damasio 2002) for more discussion of Libet's experiments.
Neuroscientists and psychologists have investigated whether they can speed up our minds relative to a duration of physical time. If so, we might become mentally more productive, and get more high quality decision making done per fixed amount of physical time, and learn more per minute. Several avenues have been explored: using cocaine, amphetamines and other drugs; undergoing extreme experiences such as jumping backwards off a tall bridge with bungee cords attached to one's ankles; and trying different forms of meditation. So far, none of these avenues have led to success productivity-wise.
Any organism’s sense of time is subjective, but is the time that is sensed also subjective, a mind-dependent phenomenon? Throughout history, philosophers of time have disagreed on the answer. Without minds in the world, nothing in the world would be surprising or beautiful or interesting. Can we add that nothing would be in time? Philosophers disagree on this.
The majority answer is "no." The ability of the concept of time to help us make sense of our phenomenological evidence involving change, persistence, and succession of events is a sign that time may be objectively real. Consider succession, that is, order of events in time. We all agree that our memories of events occur after the events occur. If judgments of time were subjective in the way judgments of being interesting vs. not-interesting are subjective, then it would be too miraculous that everyone can so easily agree on the ordering of events in time. For example, first Einstein was born, then he went to school, then he died. Everybody agrees that it happened in this order: birth, school, death. No other order. The agreement on time order for so many events, both psychological events and physical events, is part of the reason that most philosophers and scientists believe physical time is objective and not dependent on being consciously experienced.
Another large part of the reason to believe time is objective is that our universe has so many periodic processes that constant multiples of each other over time. The different processes bear consistent frequencies relative to each other. Think of the term "frequency" as meaning "number of repetitions per second." For example, the frequency of rotation of the Earth around its axis, relative to the "fixed" stars, is a constant multiple of the frequency of oscillation of a fixed-length pendulum, which in turn is a constant multiple of the half life of a specific radioactive uranium isotope, which in turn is a constant multiple of the frequency of a vibrating violin string. The relationship of the frequencies of all these oscillators does not change as time goes by (at least not much and not for a long time, and when there is deviation we know how to predict it and compensate for it). The existence of these sorts of constant relationships makes our system of physical laws much simpler than it otherwise would be, and it makes us more confident that there is something objective we are referring to with the time-variable in those laws. The stability of these relationships over a long time makes it easy to create clocks. Time can be measured easily because we have access to long-term simple harmonic oscillators that have a regular period or “regular ticking.” This regularity shows up in completely different stable systems: rotations of the Earth, a swinging ball hanging from a string (a pendulum), a bouncing ball hanging from a coiled spring, revolutions of the Earth around the Sun, oscillating electronic circuits, and vibrations of a quartz crystal. Many of these systems make good clocks. The existence of these possibilities for clocks strongly suggests that time is objective, and is not merely an aspect of consciousness.
The issue about objectivity vs. subjectivity is related to another issue: realism vs. idealism. Is time real or instead just a useful instrument or just a useful convention? This issue will appear several times throughout this article, including in the later section on conventionality.
Aristotle raised this issue of the mind-dependence of time when he said, “Whether, if soul (mind) did not exist, time would exist or not, is a question that may fairly be asked; for if there cannot be someone to count there cannot be anything that can be counted…” (Physics, chapter 14). He does not answer his own question because, he says rather profoundly, it depends on whether time is the conscious numbering of movement or instead is just the capability of movements being numbered were consciousness to exist.
St. Augustine, adopting a subjective view of time, said time is nothing in reality but exists only in the mind’s apprehension of that reality. The 13th century philosophers Henry of Ghent and Giles of Rome said time exists in reality as a mind-independent continuum, but is distinguished into earlier and later parts only by the mind. In the 13th century, Duns Scotus clearly recognized both physical and psychological time.
At the end of the 18th century, Kant suggested a subtle relationship between time and mind–that our mind actually structures our perceptions so that we can know a priori that time is like a mathematical line. Time is, on this theory, a form of conscious experience, and our sense of time is a necessary condition of our having experiences such as sensations. In the 19th century, Ernst Mach claimed instead that our sense of time is a simple sensation, not an a priori form of sensation. This controversy took another turn when other philosophers argued that both Kant and Mach were incorrect because our sense of time is, instead, an intellectual construction (see Whitrow 1980, p. 64).
In the 20th century, the philosopher of science Bas van Fraassen described time, including physical time, by saying, “There would be no time were there no beings capable of reason” just as “there would be no food were there no organisms, and no teacups if there were no tea drinkers.”
The controversy in metaphysics between idealism and realism is that, for the idealist, nothing exists independently of the mind. If this controversy is settled in favor of idealism, then physical time, too, would have that subjective feature.
It has been suggested by some philosophers that Einstein’s theory of relativity, when confirmed, showed us that physical time depends on the observer, and thus that physical time is subjective, or dependent on the mind. This error is probably caused by Einstein’s use of the term “observer.” Einstein’s theory implies that the duration (the measure of the time) of a non-instantaneous event depends on the observer’s frame of reference or coordinate system, but what Einstein means by “observer’s frame of reference” is merely a perspective or coordinate framework from which measurements could be made. The “observer” need not have a mind. So, Einstein is not making a point about mind-dependence.
To mention one last issue about the relationship between mind and time, if all organisms were to die, there would be events after those deaths. The stars would continue to shine, for example, but would any of these events be in the future? This is a controversial question because advocates of McTaggart’s A-theory will answer “yes,” whereas advocates of McTaggart’s B-theory will answer “no” and say “whose future?”
For more on the consciousness of time and related issues, see the article “Phenomenology and Time-Consciousness.” For a video presentation of these issues, see (Carroll 2012).
Is it invented or discovered? This question is not as straightforward as it might seem. Before responding to the question or trying to say what time is, it is helpful to distinguish physical time from psychological time. Physical time seems to many philosophers to be objective, whereas psychological time is our awareness of physical time, and so is subjective. These philosophers argue that physical time is more fundamental even though psychological time is discovered first by each of us during our childhood, and even though psychological time was discovered first as we human beings evolved from our animal ancestors. The remainder of this article focuses more on physical time than psychological time.
First, some attention needs to be paid to terminology. A moment is not an event [think of the event of feeling a specific pain] but rather is either a time [as in, "He called me the moment he felt the pain"] or the duration of a brief event [as in, "The pain lasted for only a moment”]. The terms “instant” and “moment” are often used interchangeably, but, when "instant" is used as a duration (that is, as a measure of time) in physics, then an instant's duration is exactly zero seconds. When the term "instant" is used as a time rather than as a duration, we can say time is composed of the instants—in a special sense of "composed" to be discussed below.
Instantaneous events, on the other hand, are not instants. They are events that last only for an instant [in the sense of duration] and only at an instant [in the sense of a single time coordinate]. Although instants are not events, too often an author will conflate the terms "instantaneous event" and "instant" and say, "There is an ordering of instants that forms the totality of all the events throughout history" when the author really means instantaneous events and not instants.
Another terminological difficulty occurs when an author speaks of a time series or says, "Time is a series of instants." This is a misuse of the word "series." A series is a sum of discrete terms; but time is not discrete; it is a linear continuum of instants. To add a fine point here, time is a continuum locally. In addition, there are theories of quantum gravity which do treat time as discrete or atomistic rather than continuous.
Any definition of the word "instant" that ties instants to events will presuppose the controversial relational theory of time. For example, in 1929 Bertrand Russell offered these precise definitions of instant and of occurring at an instant:
X is an instant iff X is an exhaustive class of mutually overlapping events.
Event E is at instant X iff E is a member of X.
The term "iff" is the philosopher's abbreviation for "if and only if." On Russell's definition, an instant is a class, a set.
Now, back to the question, "What is time?" Time is what we use a clock or calendar to measure, but this does not tell us what time is. What are we measuring? Are we measuring something our civilization discovered or something it invented?
Also, measurements depend on frames of reference. Before the creation of Einstein's special theory of relativity, it might have been said that time fixes these four features of reality: (1) For any event, it fixes when it occurs. (2) For any event, it fixes its duration—how long it lasts. (3) For any event, it fixes what other events occur simultaneously with it. (4) For any pair of events, it fixes which happens first. With the creation of the special theory of relativity in 1905, it was realized that these four features of time can be different in different reference frames. Nevertheless, within a single reference frame, these are still four key parts of the answer to the question, "What is time?"
Relativity theory implies that, in any reference frame, any short period of time can be embedded in the mathematician's real line, so the time coordinates have the structure of the real numbers—a linear continuum, a continuum of one dimension—rather than merely the structure of the integers, or even the structure of the fractions. It is because of what time is that we can succeed in this embedding.
All of the above are important and essential features of time, of what time is, but they do not tell us all of what time itself is.
Bothered by the contradictions they claimed to find in our concept of time, Zeno, Plato, Spinoza, Hegel, and McTaggart gave a radical answer the question, “What is time?” by replying that it is nothing because time does not exist. (For more discussion of this point, see LePoidevin and MacBeath 1993, p. 23.) In a similar vein, the early 20th century idealist philosopher F. H. Bradley argued, “Time, like space, has most evidently proved not to be real, but a contradictory appearance….The problem of change defies solution.” In the mid-twentieth century, Gödel argued for the unreality of time because Einstein's equations allow for physically possible universes in which all events precede themselves. [Gödel's special universe is rotating but not expanding, and every event sits on a closed timelike curve, so his universe is clearly not our own universe.]
If time does not exist, then what is your wristwatch telling you? The answer is that it tells you the time in the same sense as a fiction story can tell you about Santa Claus.
However, most philosophers agree that time does exist. They just cannot agree on what it is. We cannot trip over time, so what exactly is it? Is time human-made in analogy to how, according to some constructivist philosophers, mathematical objects are created by humans, and once created then they have well-determined properties some of which might be difficult for humans to discover? Or is time a Platonic idea existing outside of the physical world where it is independent of human activity? Or is time an emergent feature of physical changes, in analogy to how a sound wave is an emergent feature of the molecules of a vibrating tuning fork, with no single molecule making a sound?
If there is time, then there is change, but can there be change without time? One reason to answer "yes" is that if the changes are so chaotic that there is no arrow of time and no processes that could serve as clocks, then there would be no time. Another reason to answer "yes" is that time does not exist in Gödel's rotating universe.
One answer to our question, “What is time?” is that time is whatever the time variable t is denoting in the best-confirmed and most fundamental theories of current science. Nearly all philosophers would agree that we do learn much about physical time by looking at the behavior of the time variable in these theories; but they complain that the full nature of physical time can be revealed only with a philosophical theory of time that addresses the many philosophical issues that scientists do not concern themselves with.
Let’s briefly explore other answers that have been given throughout history to our question, “What is time?”
Aristotle claimed that “time is the measure of change” (Physics, chapter 12). He never said space is a measure of anything. Aristotle emphasized “that time is not change [itself]” because a change “may be faster or slower, but not time…” (Physics, chapter 10). For example, a specific change such as the descent of a leaf can be faster or slower, but time itself cannot be faster or slower. In developing his views about time, Aristotle advocated what is now referred to as the relational theory when he said, “there is no time apart from change….” (Physics, chapter 11). In addition, Aristotle said time is not discrete or atomistic but “is continuous…. In respect of size there is no minimum; for every line is divided ad infinitum. Hence it is so with time” (Physics, chapter 11).
René Descartes had a very different answer to “What is time?” He argued that a material body has the property of spatial extension but no inherent capacity for temporal endurance, and that God by his continual action sustains (or re-creates) the body at each successive instant. Time is a kind of sustenance or re-creation ("Third Meditation" in Meditations on First Philosophy).
In the 17th century, the English physicist Isaac Barrow rejected Aristotle’s linkage between time and change. Barrow said time is something which exists independently of motion or change and which existed even before God created the matter in the universe. Barrow’s student, Isaac Newton, agreed with this substantival theory of time. Newton argued very specifically that time and space are an infinitely large container for all events, and that the container exists with or without the events. He added that space and time are not material substances, but are like substances in not being dependent on anything except God.
Gottfried Leibniz objected. He argued that time is not an entity existing independently of actual events. He insisted that Newton had underemphasized the fact that time necessarily involves an ordering of events. This is why time “needs” events, so to speak. Leibniz added that this overall order is time. He accepted a relational theory of time and rejected a substantival theory.
In the 18th century, Immanuel Kant said time and space are forms that the mind projects upon the external things-in-themselves. He spoke of our mind structuring our perceptions so that space always has a Euclidean geometry, and time has the structure of the mathematical line. Kant’s idea that time is a form of apprehending phenomena is probably best taken as suggesting that we have no direct perception of time but only the ability to experience individual things and events in time. Some historians distinguish perceptual space from physical space and say that Kant was right about perceptual space. It is difficult, though, to get a clear concept of perceptual space. If physical space and perceptual space are the same thing, then Kant is claiming we know a priori that physical space is Euclidean. With the discovery of non-Euclidean geometries in the 19th century, and with increased doubt about the reliability of Kant’s method of transcendental proof, the view that truths about space and time are a priori truths began to lose favor.
In the early 20th century, Alfred North Whitehead said time is essentially the form of becoming—a cryptic, but interesting philosophical claim.
By contrast, a physics book will say time is locally a linear continuum of instants. Michael Dummett’s model of time implies instead that time is a composition of non-zero periods rather than of instants. His model is controversial for a second reason. It is constructive in the sense that it implies there do not exist any times which are not detectable in principle by a physical process.
The above discussion does not exhaust all the claims about what time is. And there is no sharp line separating a definition of time, a theory of time, and an explanation of time.
Whatever time is, it is not “time.” “Time” is the most common noun on the Internet; time is not. Nevertheless, it might help us understand time if we improved our understanding of the sense of the word “time.” Should the proper answer to the question “What is time?” produce a definition of the word as a means of capturing its sense? No. At least not if the definition must be some analysis that provides a simple paraphrase in all its occurrences. There are just too many varied occurrences of the word: time out, behind the times, in the nick of time, and so forth.
But how about narrowing the goal to a definition of the word “time” in its main sense, the sense that most interests philosophers and physicists? That is, explore the usage of the word “time” in its principal sense as a means of learning what time is. Well, this project would require some consideration of the grammar of the word “time.” Most philosophers today would agree with A. N. Prior who remarked that, “there are genuine metaphysical problems, but I think you have to talk about grammar at least a little bit in order to solve most of them.” However, do we learn enough about what time is when we learn about the grammatical intricacies of the word? Ordinary-language philosophers have studied time talk, what Wittgenstein called the “language game” of discourse about time. Wittgenstein’s expectation is that by drawing attention to ordinary ways of speaking we will be able to dissolve rather than answer our philosophical questions. But most philosophers of time are unsatisfied with this approach; they want the questions answered, not dissolved, although they are happy to have help from the ordinary language philosopher in clearing up misconceptions that may be produced by the way we use the word in our ordinary, non-technical discourse.
When chemists made their great breakthrough in understanding water by finding that it is essentially H2O, this wasn't a discovery about the meaning of "water," but about what water is. Don't we want something like this for time?
Is time more like a straight line or instead more like a circle? If your personal time were circular, then eventually you would be reborn. With circular time, the future is also in the past, and every event occurs before itself. If your time is like this, then the question arises as to whether you would be born an infinite number of times or only once. The argument that you'd be born only once appeals to Leibniz’s Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles: each supposedly repeating state of the world would occur just once because each state would not be discernible from the state that recurs, so counting the recurrences wouldn't make sense. The way to support the idea of eternal recurrence or repeated occurrence seems to be to presuppose a linear ordering in some "hyper" time of all the cycles so that each cycle is discernible from its predecessor because it occurs at a different hyper time.
During history (and long before Einstein made a distinction between proper time and coordinate time), a variety of answers were given to the question of whether time is like a line or, instead, closed like a circle. The concept of linear time first appeared in the writings of the Hebrews and the Zoroastrian Iranians. The Roman writer Seneca also advocated linear time. Plato and most other Greeks and Romans believed time to be motion and believed cosmic motion was cyclical, but this was not envisioned as requiring any detailed endless repetition such as the multiple rebirths of Socrates. However, the Pythagoreans and some Stoic philosophers such as Chrysippus did adopt this drastic position. Circular time was promoted in the Bible in Ecclesiastes 1:9: "That which has been is what will be, That which is done is what will be done, And there is nothing new under the sun." The idea was picked up again by Nietzsche in 1882. Scholars do not agree on whether Nietzsche meant his idea of circular time to be taken literally or merely for a moral lesson about how you should live your life if you knew that you'd live it over and over.
Many Islamic and Christian theologians adopted the ancient idea that time is linear. Nevertheless, it was not until 1602 that the concept of linear time was more clearly formulated—by the English philosopher Francis Bacon. In 1687, Newton advocated linear time when he represented time mathematically by using a continuous straight line with points being analogous to instants of time. The concept of linear time was promoted by Descartes, Spinoza, Hobbes, Barrow, Newton, Leibniz, Locke and Kant. Kant argued that it is a matter of necessity. In the early 19th century in Europe, the idea of linear time had become dominant in both science and philosophy.
There are many other mathematically possible topologies for time. Time could be linear or closed (circular). Linear time might have a beginning or have no beginning; it might have an ending or no ending. There could be two disconnected time streams, in two parallel worlds, and perhaps one would be linear and the other circular. There could be branching time, in which time is like the letter "Y", and there could be a fusion time in which two different time streams are separate for some period but then merge into one stream. Time might be two dimensional instead of one dimensional. For all these topologies, there could be discrete time or, instead, continuous time. That is, the micro-structure of time's instants might be analogous to a sequence of integers or, instead, analogous to a continuum of real numbers. For physicists, if time were discrete or quantized, their favorite lower limit on a possible duration is the Planck time of about 10-43 seconds.
In ancient Greece, Plato and Aristotle agreed that the past is eternal. Aristotle claimed that time had no beginning because, for any time, we always can imagine an earlier time. The reliability of appealing to our imagination to tell us how things are eventually waned, thanks in large part to the influence of Aquinas. In Medieval times, Aquinas' contemporary St. Bonaventure said there was a first motion and thus a first time, so Plato and Aristotle were mistaken in saying the past is eternal. Martin Luther estimated the world to have begun in 4,000 B.C.E. Johannes Kepler estimated it to have begun in 4,004 B.C.E. The Calvinist James Ussher calculated that the world began on Friday, October 28, 4,004 B.C.E. Advances in the science of geology eventually refuted all these small estimates, and advances in astronomy eventually refuted the idea that the Earth and the universe were created at about the same time.
Isaac Newton believed future time is infinite and that, although God created the material world some finite time ago, there was an infinite period of past time before that.
Contemporary physicists generally agree with Newton that future time is potentially infinite, but it is an open question whether past time is finite or infinite. Many physicists believe that past time is infinite, but many others believe instead that time began with the Big Bang event about 13.8 billion years ago, that is, 13,800,000,000 years ago.
In the most well-accepted version of the Big Bang Theory in the field of astrophysics [also called the Big Bang Model], our universe once had an almost infinitesimal size and an almost infinite temperature and gravitational field strength. Our universe has been expanding and cooling ever since. It has also been increasing in entropy, as the second law of thermodynamics implies.
In the more popular version of the Big Bang theory, the Big Bang theory with inflation, our universe once was an extremely tiny bit of highly organized and explosively inflating material. About 10-36 second later, this inflationary material underwent an accelerating expansion that lasted for 10-30 seconds during which the volume of the universe expanded by a factor of 1078. Once this brief period of inflation ended, the volume of our universe was the size of an orange, and the energy causing the inflation was transformed into a dense gas of expanding hot radiation. This expansion has never stopped. But with expansion came cooling, and this allowed individual material particles to condense into atoms and then eventually to clump into stars and galaxies. The mutual gravitational force of the universe’s matter and energy decelerated this expansion, but seven billion years after the beginning of our Big Bang, our universe’s dark energy became especially influential and started to accelerate the expansion again, despite the mutual gravitational force, although not at the explosive rate of the initial inflation. This more recent inflation of the universe will continue forever at an exponentially accelerating rate, as the remaining matter-energy becomes more and more diluted.
The Big Bang Theory with or without inflation is challenged by other theories such as a cyclic theory in which every trillion years the expansion changes to contraction until our universe becomes infinitesimal, at which time there is a bounce or new Big Bang. The cycles of Bang and Crunch continue forever, and they might or might not have existed forever. For the details, see (Steinhardt 2012). A promising but as yet untested theory called "eternal inflation" implies that our particular Big Bang event is one among many other Big Bangs that occurred within a background spacetime that is actually infinite in space and in both past time and future time.
Consider this challenging argument from (Newton-Smith 1980, p. 111) that claims time cannot have had a finite past: “As we have reasons for supposing that macroscopic events have causal origins, we have reason to suppose that some prior state of the universe led to the product of [the Big Bang]. So the prospects for ever being warranted in positing a beginning of time are dim.” The usual response to Newton-Smith here is two-fold. First, our Big Bang event is a microscopic event, not a macroscopic event, so it might not be relevant that macroscopic events have causal origins. Second, and more importantly, if a confirmed cosmological theory implies there is a first event, we can say this event is an exception to any metaphysical principle that requires every event to have a prior cause.
Cosmologists such as Stephen Hawking believe the beginning of the Big Bang was time t = 0, but other cosmologists (including Sean Carroll, Jennifer Chen, and Julian Barbour) believe our universe had a Big Bang event but that the universe did not begin with this event and that our universe may be eternal in the past and future. See (Grant, pp. 17 and 18) for a popular discussion of their ideas.
Is time a fundamental feature of nature, or does it emerge from more basic timeless features–in analogy to the way the smoothness of water flow emerges from the complicated behavior of the underlying molecules, none of which is properly called "smooth"? That is, is time ontologically basic (fundamental), or does it depend on something even more basic?
We might rephrase this question more technically by asking whether facts about time supervene on more basic facts. Facts about sound in the air supervene on, or are a product of, facts about changes in the molecules of the air, so molecular change is more basic than sound. Minkowski argued in 1908 that we should believe spacetime is more basic than time, and this argument is generally well accepted. However, is this spacetime itself basic? Some physicists argue that spacetime is the product of some more basic micro-substrate at the level of the Planck length, although there is no agreed-upon theory of what the substrate is, although a leading candidate is quantum information.
Other physicists say space is not basic, but time is. In 2004, after winning the Nobel Prize in physics, David Gross expressed this viewpoint:
Everyone in string theory is convinced…that spacetime is doomed. But we don’t know what it’s replaced by. We have an enormous amount of evidence that space is doomed. We even have examples, mathematically well-defined examples, where space is an emergent concept…. But in my opinion the tough problem that has not yet been faced up to at all is, “How do we imagine a dynamical theory of physics in which time is emergent?” …All the examples we have do not have an emergent time. They have emergent space but not time. It is very hard for me to imagine a formulation of physics without time as a primary concept because physics is typically thought of as predicting the future given the past. We have unitary time evolution. How could we have a theory of physics where we start with something in which time is never mentioned?
The discussion in this section about whether time is ontologically basic has no implications for whether the word “time” is semantically basic or whether the idea of time is basic to concept formation.
It is an arbitrary convention that our civilization designs clocks to count up to higher numbers rather than down to lower numbers as time goes on. It is just a matter of convenience that we agree to the convention of re-setting our clock by one hour as we cross a time-zone. It is an arbitrary convention that there are twenty-four hours in a day instead of ten, that no week fails to contain a Tuesday, that a second lasts as long as it does, and that the origin of our coordinate system for time is associated with the birth of Jesus on some calendars but the beginning of the year when Muhammad emigrated from Mecca to Medina on other calendars.
Other features of time and its measurement may or may not be conventional, and there is controversy in the literature. Here our question is more directly about conventionality, than about subjectivity or mind-dependence.
According to the majority interpretation of relativity theory, if two events couldn't have had a causal effect on each other, then we analysts are free to choose a reference frame in which one of the events happens first, or instead the other event happens first, or instead the two events are simultaneous. But once a frame is chosen, this fixes objectively the time order of any pair of events. This point is discussed further in the next section. Isaac Newton would have challenged the claim that the choice of reference frame is free.
In 1905, the French physicist Henri Poincaré argued that time is not a feature of reality to be discovered, but rather is something we've invented for our convenience. He said possible empirical tests cannot determine very much about time, so he recommended the convention of adopting the concept of time that makes for the simplest laws of physics. Opposing this conventionalist picture of time, other philosophers of science have recommended a less idealistic view in which time is an objective feature of reality. These philosophers are recommending an objectivist picture of time.
Turning now from the question of whether time is objective, let's consider whether the the measure of time is objective. Can our standard clock be inaccurate? Yes, say the objectivists about the standard clock. No, say the conventionalists who say that the standard clock is accurate by convention; if it acts strangely, then all clocks must act strangely in order to stay in synchrony with the standard clock that tells everyone the correct time. A closely related question is whether, when we change our standard clock, from being the Earth's rotation to being an atomic clock, or just our standard from one kind of atomic clock to another kind of atomic clock, are we merely adopting constitutive conventions for our convenience, or in some objective sense are we making a more correct choice?
Consider how we use a clock to measure how long an event lasts, that is, to produce durations. We always use the following metric or method: Take the time of the instant at which the event ends, and subtract the time of the instant when the event starts. For example, to find how long an event lasts that starts at 3:00 and ends at 5:00, we subtract and get the answer of two hours. Is the use of this method merely a convention, or in some objective sense is it the only way that a clock should be used? That is, is there an objective metric, or is time "metrically amorphous," because there are alternatively acceptable metrics?
There is also an ongoing dispute about the extent to which there is an element of conventionality in Einstein’s notion of two separated events happening at the same time. Einstein said that to define simultaneity in a single reference frame you must adopt a convention about how fast light travels going one way as opposed to coming back (or going any other direction). He recommended adopting the convention that light travels the same speed in all directions (in a vacuum free of the influence of gravity). He claimed it must be a convention because there is no way to measure whether the speed is really the same in opposite directions since any measurement of the two speeds between two locations requires first having synchronized clocks at those two locations, yet the synchronization process will presuppose whether the speed is the same in both directions. The philosophers B. Ellis and P. Bowman in 1967 and D. Malament in 1977 gave different reasons why Einstein is mistaken. For an introduction to this dispute, see the Frequently Asked Questions. For more discussion, see (Callender and Hoefer 2002).
This article has already said quite a bit about what science requires of time, but in this section we re-describe some of those points and add a few more.
Although all sciences use the concept of time, physics and astronomy are the only sciences that explicitly study time. Yet different physical theories place different demands on this concept.
At the beginning of the 20th century, the appearance of the special and general theories of relativity and the theory of the Big Bang transformed the investigation of time from a primarily speculative and metaphysical investigation into one that occupied scientists in their professional journals.
The Big Bang theory places demands on the amount of past time there must be. In 1611, Irish Bishop James Ussher declared that the implication of his reading of the Bible reveals that the beginning of time occurred on October 23, 4004 B.C.E. Today's science disagrees; it implies that our universe is at least as old as the beginning of the Big Bang, which was about 13.8 billion years ago. Other astronomical observations suggest future time is probably not finite but rather a potential infinity (in Aristotle's sense of the term).
Physical theories treat time as being another dimension, analogous to a spatial dimension, and they describe an event as being located at temporal coordinate t, where t is a real number rather than a rational number. Each specific temporal coordinate is called a "time." An instantaneous event is located at just one time, or one temporal coordinate, say t1. It is said to last for an "instant." If the event is also a so-called "point event," then it is located at a single point location, at the single ordered triple <x1, y1, z1> of spatial coordinates in a Cartesian coordinate system. This treatment of time is an example of the mathematization of physics, and of time in particular. The word "moment" is a more informal term, and it is ambiguous because it stands both for a short event and for the time at which the event occurs.
The fundamental laws of science do not pick out a present time. This fact is often surprising to a student who takes a science class and notices all sorts of talk about the present. Scientists frequently do apply some law of science while assigning, say, t0 to be the temporal coordinate of the present moment, then calculate this or that. This insertion of the fact that t0 is the present is an initial condition of the situation to which the law is being applied, and is not part of the law itself. The basic laws themselves treat all times equally.
Science does not require that all its theories have symmetry under time-translation, but this is a goal that physicists do pursue. If a theory has symmetry under time-translation, then the laws of the theories do not change as time goes by. The law of gravitation in the 21st century is the same law that held one thousand centuries ago. The speed of light in a vacuum will be constant next week.
Science places requirements on the structure of time. For instance, in physics we need to speak of one event happening pi seconds after another, and of one event happening the square root of three seconds before another. In ordinary discourse outside of science we would never need this kind of precision. The need for this precision has led to requiring time to be a continuum. A linear continuum has the same structure as a real number line or as a segment of a real number line. One requirement that our theories of relativity, quantum mechanics and the Big Bang Model place on any segment of time is that it be a linear continuum. This implies that time is not quantized, even in quantum mechanics.
A linear continuum has unusual properties. For example, in a world with time being a linear continuum, we cannot speak of an event at some instant being caused by the state of the world at the immediately preceding instant because there is no immediately preceding instant, just as there is no real number immediately preceding pi.
Einstein's theory of relativity is the scientific theory that has had the biggest impact on our understanding of time. Einstein said time is relative. What does that mean? It means some, but not all, aspects of time are relative to the chosen reference frame. For example, Newton would say that if you are seated in a moving passenger train, then your speed relative to the train is zero, but your speed relative to the train track is not zero. Einstein would agree. However, he would surprise Newton by saying the length of the train is different in different reference frames, and the duration of your lunch on the train is different in different reference frames. The effects are called space contraction and time dilation. These relativity effects are difficult to observe, but they can be and have been observed, and the theory of relativity has survived extensive testing.
What is happening with space contraction and time dilation, namely with the relativity of length and of duration, is that Einstein's theory is requiring a mixing of space and time. Minkowski said it follows that there is an underlying spacetime which is more fundamental than either time or space alone. Also, spacetime divides into its space part and time part differently for two reference frames that move relative to each other. So, specifying that an event lasted three minutes without giving even an implicit indication of the reference frame is like asking someone to stand over there and not giving any indication of where “there” is.
One implication of this is that it becomes more difficult to defend McTaggart's A-theory which says that properties of events such as "is happening now" or "happened twenty-three minutes ago" are basic properties of those events; Einstein says they are not basic but are relationships between the events and chosen reference frames.
Another profound implication of relativity theory is that accurate clocks do not tick the same for everyone everywhere even if they are initially synchronized. Each object has its own proper time. This is the time shown by a clock if it were attached to the object. So, the correct proper time shown by a clock depends on the clock's history (in particular, its history of speed and gravitational influence). Synchronized clocks will not stay synchronized if they move relative to each other or undergo different gravitational forces. Relative to clocks that are stationary in the reference frame, clocks in motion in the frame run slower, as do clocks in stronger gravitational fields. Clocks in cars driving by your apartment building run slower than your apartment’s clock. Ground floor clocks in your apartment building run slower than clocks in the top floor. These effects are called time dilation effects.
To appreciate how time can "dilate" due to motion, suppose there are two twins. One stays on Earth while the other twin zooms away in a spaceship and returns ten years later according to the spaceship’s clock. Provided the spaceship went fast enough, that same arrival event could be twenty-three years later according to the correct clock of the Earth-based twin, but only thirteen years later according to the correct clock of the spaceship twin. This ten year difference would be shown both by the fact that their initially synchronized clocks would now differ by ten years and also by the fact that the Earth-based twin looked ten years older than the spaceship twin. The spaceship twin's time has dilated or curved.
Unlike special relativity, general relativity allows spacetime to be curved, both in its space part and in its time part. And it allows spacetime to change. According to general relativity our spacetime is dynamic in the sense that any change in the amount and distribution of matter-energy will change the curvature of spacetime itself. Gravity is a manifestation of the warping of spacetime. (In the theory of special relativity, spacetime has no curvature.) What is perhaps even more surprising is that in general relativity a spacetime containing no mass and no energy might or might not have curvature, so the geometry of spacetime is not always determined by the behavior of matter and energy. This point has been interpreted by many philosophers as a good reason to reject relationism.
If we accept both the classical Big Bang Theory and the Theory of General Relativity, then together they imply there is no time before the Big Bang event. Physicists say that classical general relativity breaks down at the time of the Big Bang, namely at t = 0, because of all the infinities (such as infinite curvature and infinite energy density and infinite expansion rate). Many physicists do not accept that these theoretical implications are real, not only because they don't like infinities but also because they are unhappy that in this situation general relativity conflicts with quantum mechanics, which they trust, so these physicists recommend that we keep open the possibility that there was a time before the Big Bang event.
For further discussion of all these topics, go to What Else Science Requires of Time.
Most scientists and philosophers of time agree that there is good evidence that human time travel has occurred. To explain, let’s first clarify the term "time travel." We mean physical time travel, not psychological time travel, nor travel by dreaming of being at another time. Here is David Lewis' well-accepted definition:
In any case of physical time travel, the traveler’s journey as judged by a correct clock attached to the traveler takes a different amount of time than the journey does as judged by a correct clock of someone who does not take the journey.
Relativity theory implies that the clocks of two people not taking the journey might disagree but still be correct, so there's no unique time external to the time traveler.
The physical possibility of human travel to the future is well accepted, but travel to the past is more controversial, and time travel that changes either the future or the past is generally considered to be impossible.
One point to keep in mind is that even if a certain kind of time travel is logically possible, it does not follow that it is physically possible. Our understanding of what is physically possible about time travel comes mostly from the implications of Einstein’s general theory of relativity. This theory has never failed any of its many experimental tests, so most experts trust its implications for time travel.
Einstein’s general theory of relativity permits two kinds of future time travel—either by moving at high speed or by taking advantage of the presence of an intense gravitational field. Let's first consider the time travel due to high speed. Actually any motion produces time travel (relative to the clocks of those who do not travel). That makes every bicycle be a time machine. If you move at extremely high speed, the time travel is more noticeable; you can travel travel very fast and then return to Earth to find that you've been gone for two hundred years (as measured by clocks fixed to the Earth) while your personal clock measures that merely, let’s say, ten years have elapsed. You can participate in that future, not just view it. You can meet your twin sister’s descendants, but you cannot get back to the twenty-first century on Earth by reversing your velocity. If do go back, it will have to be by some other way.
Using high speed, you are able to travel into the future only as judged by clocks not traveling with you. You cannot use high speed in order to visit the future of the world after your death.
With time travel due to high speed, you do not suddenly jump discontinuously into the future. Instead you have continually been traveling forward in both your personal time and the Earth’s external time, and you could have been continuously observed from Earth’s telescopes during your voyage, although these observers would notice that you are very slow about turning the pages in your monthly calendar.
As measured by an Earth-based clock, it takes a 100,000 years for light to travel across the Milky Way Galaxy, but if you took the same trip in a spaceship traveling at very near the speed of light, the trip might last only twenty-five years, as judged by your own clock. In principle, you have enough time to travel almost anywhere.
So far, we have been discussing time travel due to high speed. A second kind of time travel, called gravitational time dilation, is due to a difference in the gravitational field. If you live in the ground floor apartment, you age slower than your twin in the top floor of the same building, because the gravitational field strength is less on the top floor than the ground floor. If you lived nearer a supermassive black hole, the difference would be much more significant. If you left Earth in a spaceship that flew close to the black hole and then returned, you might return and find that you now look as youthful as your grandchildren although you would be much older than them, as judged by their clocks (and your appearance to them). You will not, however, look more youthful than when you left on your journey.
How about travel to the past, the more interesting kind of time travel? This is not allowed by either Newton's physics or Einstein's special theory of relativity, but is allowed by the general theory of relativity. In 1949, Kurt Gödel surprised Albert Einstein by discovering that in some unusual worlds that obey the equations of general relativity—but not in the actual world—you can continually travel forward in your personal time but eventually arrive into your own past.
When we speak of our time traveling to the past, we normally mean travel to our own past. Unfortunately, say nearly all philosophers and scientists, even if you do travel to your own past, you will not do anything that has not already been done, or else there would be a contradiction. In fact, if you do go back, you would already have been back there. For this reason, if you go back in time and try to kill your grandfather before he conceived a child, you will fail no matter how hard you try. You will fail because you have failed. For this same reason, you will never be able to use a time machine to go back to a time before the time machine was created.
The metaphysician David Lewis believes you can in one sense kill your grandfather but cannot in another sense. You can, relative to a set of facts that does not include the fact that your grandfather survived to have children. You cannot, relative to a set of facts that does include this fact. The metaphysician Donald C. Williams disagrees, saying we need to make our “can” statement relative to all the available facts. So, Lewis says you can and can’t, and you can but won’t. Williams simply says you can’t, so you won’t. For a discussion of this disagreement, see (Fisher, 2015).
An interesting philosophical question is to ask whether, if you do go back to the past, you go back of your own free will, or instead you are fated to go back because you already did. Donald Williams argues that you are not fated. Others disagree.
David Lewis' definition of time travel given in the first paragraph of this section has no implications about whether, if you travel back to 1776, you can suddenly pop into existence in 1776 or, instead, you must travel continuously to 1776 through all the intervening years. If the definition is acceptable, then any requirement that rules out sudden appearance and demands spatiotemporal continuity will have to be supported by an additional argument.
Here are a variety of philosophical arguments against past-directed time travel (into one's own past, not merely someone else's past).
- You could go back in time and kill your grandfather, so then you wouldn’t be born and couldn’t go back in time and kill your grandfather. That’s a contradiction.
- If past time travel were possible, then you could be in two different bodies at the same time, which is metaphysically impossible.
- If past time travel were possible, then you could die before you were born, which is also metaphysically impossible.
- If you were presently to go back in time, then your present events would cause past events, which violates our concept of causality.
- Time travel is impossible because, if it were possible, we should have seen many time travelers by now, but nobody has encountered any time travelers.
- If past time travel were possible, criminals could avoid their future arrest by traveling back in time, but that is absurd, so time travel is, too.
- If there were time travel, then when time travelers go back and attempt to change history, they must always botch their attempts to change anything, and it will appear to anyone watching them at the time as if Nature is conspiring against them. Since observers have never witnessed this apparent conspiracy of Nature, there is no time travel.
- Travel to the past is impossible because it allows the gaining of information for free. Here is a possible scenario. Buy a copy of Darwin's book The Origin of Species, which was published in 1859. In the 21st century, enter a time machine with it, go back to 1855 and give the book to Darwin himself. He could have used your copy in order to write his manuscript which he sent off to the publisher. If so, who first came up with the knowledge about evolution? Neither you nor Darwin. This is free information. Because this scenario contradicts what we know about where knowledge comes from, past-directed time travel isn't really possible.
- The philosopher John Earman describes a rocket ship that carries a time machine capable of firing a probe (perhaps a smaller rocket) into its recent past. The ship is programmed to fire the probe at a certain time unless a safety switch is on at that time. Suppose the safety switch is programmed to be turned on if and only if the “return” or “impending arrival” of the probe is detected by a sensing device on the ship. Does the probe get launched? It seems to be launched if and only if it is not launched. However, the argument of Earman’s Paradox depends on the assumptions that the rocket ship does work as intended—that people are able to build the computer program, the probe, the safety switch, and an effective sensing device. Earman himself says all these premises are acceptable and so the only weak point in the reasoning to the paradoxical conclusion is the assumption that travel to the past is physically possible. There is an alternative solution to Earman’s Paradox. Nature conspires to prevent the design of the rocket ship just as it conspires to prevent anyone from building a gun that shoots if and only if it does not shoot. We cannot say what part of the gun is the obstacle, and we cannot say what part of Earman’s rocket ship is the obstacle.
These complaints about travel to the past are a mixture of arguments that past-directed time travel is not logically possible, that it is not physically possible, that it is not technologically possible with current technology, and that it is unlikely, given today's empirical evidence.
For more discussion of time travel, see the encyclopedia article “Time Travel.”
By "time requires change," we mean that for time to exist something must change its properties over time. We don't mean, change it properties over space as in a house's change from red on the roof to brown on the sides. There are two main types of philosophical theories about whether time requires change—relational theories and substantival theories.
In a relational theory of time, time is defined in terms of relationships among objects, in particular their changes. Substantival theories are theories that imply time is substance-like in that it exists independently of changes; it exists independently of all the spacetime relations exhibited by physical processes. This theory allows "empty time" in which nothing changes. On the other hand, relational theories do not allow this. They imply that at every time something is happening—such as an electron moving through space or a tree leaf changing its color. In short, no change implies no time. Some substantival theories describe spacetime as being like a container for events. The container exists with or without events in it. Relational theories imply there is no container without contents. But the substance that substantivalists have in mind is more like a medium pervading all of spacetime and less like an external container. The vast majority of relationists present their relational theories in terms of actually instantiated relations and not merely possible relations.
Everyone agrees time cannot be measured without there being changes, because we measure time by observing changes in some property or other, but the present issue is whether time exists without changes. On this issue, we need to be clear about what sense of change and what sense of property we are intending. For the relational theory, the term "property" is intended to exclude what Nelson Goodman called grue-like properties. Let us define an object to be grue if it is green before the beginning of the year 1888 but is blue thereafter. Then the world’s chlorophyll undergoes a change from grue to non-grue in 1888. We’d naturally react to this by saying that change in chlorophyll's grue property is not a “real change” in the world’s chlorophyll.
Does Queen Anne’s death change when I forget about it? Yes, in one sense of "change," but that is an extrinsic property of her death, and is subjective and not the kind of change philosophers have in mind when they speak of the issue of time's requiring change. Also, Queen Anne's death clearly cannot change to Queen Anne's living. But there is a philosophical debate as to whether time requires change in another sense of "change." Can her death change its intrinsic property of occurring so many years ago? This special intrinsic change is called by many names: "second-order change," "secondary change," "McTaggartian change" and "McTaggart change." Second-order change is the kind of change that A-theorists say occurs when Queen Anne's death recedes ever farther into our past. The objection from the B-theorists here is that this sort of change is not a "real, objective, intrinsic change" in her death. First-order change is ordinary change, the kind that occurs when a person changes from sitting to standing, or changes from living to dead. That is the only kind of change that B-theorists will countenance as objective, and it is the only kind of change that is essential to time, if any is, they say.
Substantival theories are sometimes called "absolute theories." Unfortunately the term "absolute theory" is used in two other ways. A second sense of " to be absolute" is to be immutable, or changeless. A third sense is to be independent of observer or reference frame. Although Einstein’s theory implies there is no absolute time in the sense of being independent of reference frame, it is an open question whether relativity theory undermines absolute time in the sense of substantival time; Einstein believed it did, but many philosophers of science do not.
Einstein's general theory of relativity does imply it is possible for spacetime to exist while empty of events. This empty time is permissible according to the substantival theory but not allowed by the relational theory. Yet Einstein considered himself to be a relationist because he believed that the concept of absolute space was associated with the idea of particles in an inertial system, yet his general theory replaced this with the field concept, and he believed there is no space without a field and thus there could be no empty space in the absolutist's idea of empty space. [Einstein expressed his views on this in 1953 at the end of his introduction to Max Jammer's book, Concepts of Space.]
The first advocate of a relational theory of time was Aristotle. He said, “neither does time exist without change.” (Physics, book IV, chapter 11, page 218b) However, the battle lines were most clearly drawn in the early 18th century when Leibniz argued for the relational position against Newton, who had adopted a substantival theory of time. Leibniz’s principal argument against Newton is a reductio ad absurdum. Suppose Newton’s space and time were to exist. But one could then imagine a universe just like ours except with everything shifted five kilometers east and five minutes earlier. However, there would be no reason why this shifted universe does not exist and ours does. Now we have arrived at a contradiction because, if there is no reason for there to be our universe rather than the shifted universe, then we have violated Leibniz’s Principle of Sufficient Reason: that there is an understandable reason for everything being the way it is. So, by reductio ad absurdum, Newton’s substantival space and time do not exist. In short, the trouble with Newton’s theory is that it leads to too many unnecessary possibilities.
Newton offered this two-part response: (1) Leibniz is correct to accept the Principle of Sufficient Reason regarding the rational intelligibility of the universe, but there do not have to be knowable reasons for humans; God might have had His own sufficient reason for creating the universe at a given place and time even though mere mortals cannot comprehend His reasons. (2) The bucket thought-experiment shows that acceleration relative to absolute space is detectable; thus absolute space is real, and if absolute space is real, so is absolute time. Here's how to detect absolute space. Suppose we tie a bucket’s handle to a rope hanging down from a tree branch. Partially fill the bucket with water, and let it come to equilibrium. Notice that there is no relative motion between the bucket and the water, and in this case the water surface is flat. Now spin the bucket, and keep doing this until the angular velocity of the water and the bucket are the same. In this second case there is again no relative motion between the bucket and the water, but now the water surface is concave. So spinning makes a difference, but how can a relational theory explain the difference in the shape of the surface? It cannot, says Newton. When the bucket and water are spinning, what are they spinning relative to? Because we can disregard the rest of the environment including the tree and rope, says Newton, the only explanation of the difference in surface shape between the non-spinning case and the spinning case is that when it is not spinning there is no motion relative to space, but when it is spinning there is motion relative to a third thing, space itself, and space itself is acting upon the water surface to make it concave. Alternatively expressed, the key idea is that the presence of centrifugal force is a sign of rotation relative to absolute space. Leibniz had no rebuttal. So, for over two centuries after this argument was created, Newton’s absolute theory of space and time was generally accepted by European scientists and philosophers.
One hundred years later, Kant entered the arena on the side of Newton. In a space containing only a single glove, said Kant, Leibniz could not account for its being a right-handed glove versus a left-handed glove because all the internal relationships would be the same in either case. However, we all know that there is a real difference between a right and a left glove, so this difference can only be due to the glove’s relationship to space itself. But if there is a “space itself,” then the absolute or substantival theory is better than the relational theory.
Newton’s theory of time was dominant in the 18th and 19th centuries, even though during those centuries Huygens, Berkeley, and Mach had entered the arena on the side of Leibniz. Mach argued that it must be the remaining matter in the universe, such as the "fixed" stars, which causes the water surface in the bucket to be concave, and that without these stars or other matter, a spinning bucket would have a flat surface. In the 20th century, Hans Reichenbach and the early Einstein declared the special theory of relativity to be a victory for the relational theory, in large part because a Newtonian absolute space would be undetectable. Special relativity, they also said, ruled out a space-filling ether, the leading candidate for substantival space, so the substantival theory was incorrect. And the response to Newton’s bucket argument is to note Newton’s error in not considering the environment. Einstein agreed with Mach that, if you hold the bucket still but spin the background stars in the environment, then the water will creep up the side of the bucket and form a concave surface—so the bucket thought experiment does not require absolute space.
Although it was initially believed by Einstein and Reichenbach that relativity theory supported Mach regarding the bucket experiment and the absence of absolute space, this belief is controversial. Many philosophers argue that Reichenbach and the early Einstein have been overstating the amount of metaphysics that can be extracted from the physics. There is substantival in the sense of independent of reference frame and substantival in the sense of independent of events. Isn't only the first sense ruled out when we reject a space-filling ether? The critics admit that general relativity does show that the curvature of spacetime is affected by the distribution of matter, so today it is no longer plausible for a substantivalist to assert that the “container” is independent of the behavior of the matter it contains. But, so they argue, general relativity does not rule out a more sophisticated substantival theory in which spacetime exists even if it is empty and in which two empty universes could differ in the curvature of their spacetime. For this reason, by the end of the 20th century, substantival theories had gained some ground.
In 1969, Sydney Shoemaker presented an argument attempting to establish the understandability of time existing without change, as Newton’s absolutism requires. Divide all space into three disjoint regions, called region 3, region 4, and region 5. In region 3, change ceases every third year for one year. People in regions 4 and 5 can verify this and then convince the people in region 3 of it after they come back to life at the end of their frozen year. Similarly, change ceases in region 4 every fourth year for a year; and change ceases in region 5 every fifth year. Every sixty years, that is, every 3 x 4 x 5 years, all three regions freeze simultaneously for a year. In year sixty-one, everyone comes back to life, time having marched on for a year with no change. Note that even if Shoemaker’s scenario successfully shows that the notion of empty time is understandable, it does not show that empty time actually exists.
Empty time isn't directly detectable by those who are frozen, but it may be indirectly detectable, perhaps in the manner described by Shoemaker or by signs in advance of the freeze:
Suppose that immediately prior to the beginning of a local freeze there is a period of "sluggishness" during which the inhabitants of the region find that it makes more than the usual amount of effort for them to move the limbs of their bodies, and we can suppose that the length of this period of sluggishness is found to be correlated with the length of the freeze. (Shoemaker 1969, p. 374)
Is the ending of the freeze causeless, or does something cause the freeze to end? Perhaps the empty time itself causes the freeze to end—which would be a very odd kind of causation.
In 1908, the English philosopher J. M. E. McTaggart proposed two ways of linearly ordering all events in time by placing them into a series according to the times at which they occur. The events (that is, sets of simultaneous events) are not really in a series because time has the structure of the continuum of real numbers and not the structure of the series of whole numbers, but we will overlook that detail. The ordering of (non-simultaneous) events can be created in two ways, an A way and a B way. Consider two past events a and b, in which b is the most recent of the two. In McTaggart's B-series, event a happens before event b in the series because the time of occurrence of event a is less than the time of occurrence of event b. But when ordering the same events into McTaggart's A-series, event a happens before event b for a different reason—because event a is more in the past than event b. Both series produce exactly the same ordering of events. Here is a picture of the ordering. c is another event that happens after a and b.
There are many other events that are located within the series at event a's location, namely all events simultaneous with event a. If we were to consider an instant of time to be a set of simultaneous events, then instants of time are also linearly ordered into an A-series and a B-series. McTaggart himself believed the A-series is paradoxical [for reasons that will not be explored in this article], but McTaggart also believed the A-properties such as being past are essential to our current concept of time, so for this reason he believed our current concept of time is incoherent.
Let's suppose that event c occurs in our present after events a and b. The information that c occurs in the present is not contained within either the A-series or the B-series. However, the information that c is in the present is used to create the A-series; it is what tells us to place c to the right of b. That information is not used to create the B-series.
Metaphysicians dispute whether the A-theory or instead the B-theory is the correct theory of reality. The A-theory comprises two theses, each of which is contrary to the B-theory: (1) Time is constituted by an A-series in which any event's being in the past (or in the present or in the future) is an intrinsic, objective, monadic property of the event itself and is not merely a subjective relation between the event and us, or between the event and the context of our utterance. (2) The second thesis of the A-theory is that events change. In 1908, McTaggart described the special way that events change:
Take any event—the death of Queen Anne, for example—and consider what change can take place in its characteristics. That it is a death, that it is the death of Anne Stuart, that it has such causes, that it has such effects—every characteristic of this sort never changes.... But in one respect it does change. It began by being a future event. It became every moment an event in the nearer future. At last it was present. Then it became past, and will always remain so, though every moment it becomes further and further past.
This special change is called secondary change and second-order change and also McTaggartian change.
The B-theory disagrees with both thesis (1) and thesis (2) of the A-theory. According to the B-theory, the B-series and not the A-series is fundamental; fundamental temporal properties are relational; McTaggartian change is not an objective change and so is not metaphysically basic or ultimately real. The B-theory implies that an event's property of occurring in the past (or occurring twenty-three minutes ago, or now, or in a future century) is merely a subjective relation between the event and us because, when analyzed, it will be seen to make reference to our own perspective on the world. Here is how it is subjective, according to the B-theory. Queen Anne's death has the property of occurring in the past because it occurs in our past as opposed to, say, Aristotle's past; and it occurs in our past rather than our present or our future because it occurs at a time that is less than the time of occurrence of some event that we (rather than Aristotle) would say is occurring. The B-theory is committed to there being no objective distinction among past, present and future. Both the A-theory and B-theory agree, however, that it would be a mistake to say of some event that it happens on a certain date but then later it fails to happen on that date.
The B-theorists complain that thesis (1) of the A-theory implies that an event’s being in the present is an intrinsic property of that event, so it implies that there is an absolute, global present for all of us. The B-theorist points out that according to Einstein’s Special Theory of Relativity there is no global present. An event can be present in a reference frame in which you are a fixed observer, but if you are moving relative to me, then that same event will not be present in a reference frame in which I am a fixed observer. So, being present is not an intrinsic property of an event, as the A theory implies. Being present in a given reference frame is an intrinsic property of the event.
When discussing the A-theory and the B-theory, metaphysicians often speak of an
- A-series and B-series, of an
- A-theory and B-theory, of an
- A-facts and B-facts, of an
- A-terms and B-terms, of an
- A-properties and B-properties, of an
- A-predicates and B-predicates, of an
- A-statements and B-statements, and of an
- A-camp and B-camp.
Here are some examples. Typical B-series terms are relational; they are relations between events: "earlier than," "happens twenty-three minutes after," and "simultaneous with." Typical A-theory terms are monadic, they are one-place qualities of events: "the near future," "twenty-three minutes ago," and "present." The B-theory terms represent distinctively B-properties; the A-theory terms represent distinctively A-properties. The B-fact that event a occurs before event b will always be a fact, but the A-fact that event a occurred about an hour ago soon won’t be a fact. Similarly the A-statement that event a occurred about an hour ago will, if true, soon become false. However, B-facts are not transitory, and B-statements have fixed truth values. For the B-theorist, the statement "Event a occurs an hour before b" will, if true, never become false. The A-theory usually says A-facts are the truthmakers of true A-statements and so A-facts are ontologically fundamental; the B-theorist appeals instead to B-facts, insofar as one accepts facts into one’s ontology, which is metaphysically controversial. According to the B-theory, when the A-theorist correctly says "It began snowing twenty-three minutes ago," what really makes it true isn't the A-fact that the event of the snow's beginning has twenty-three minutes of pastness; what makes it true is that the event of uttering the sentence occurs twenty-three minutes after the event of it beginning to snow. Notice that "occurs ... after" is a B-term. Those persons in the A-camp and B-camp recognize that in ordinary speech we are not careful to use one of the two kinds of terminology, but each camp believes that it can best explain the terminology of the other camp in its own terms.
Time seems to flow or pass in the sense that future events become present events and then become past events, just like a boat that drifts past us on the riverbank and then recedes farther and farther from us. In 1938, the philosopher George Santayana offered this description of the flow of time: “The essence of nowness runs like fire along the fuse of time.” The converse image of time's flowing past us is our advancing through time; we plunge into the future and leave past events ever farther behind us.
Time definitely seems to flow, but there is philosophical disagreement about whether it really does. This issue is about physical time, not merely psychological time, and is directly related to whether McTaggart's A-theory or B-theory is more fundamental.
There are two primary theories about time’s flow: (A) the flow is objectively real. (B) the flow is either a myth or else is merely subjective. Often theory A is called the dynamic theory or the A-theory while theory B is called the static theory or B-theory.
The static theory implies that the flow is an illusion, the product of a faulty metaphor. The defense of the theory goes something like this. Time exists, things change, but time itself does not change by flowing. The present does not move objectively because the present is not an objective feature of the world. We all experience this flow, but only in the sense that we all frequently misinterpret our experience. For this reason, the static theory is sometimes called a myth-of-passage theory.
One point offered in favor of the myth-of-passage theory is to ask about the rate at which time flows. It would be a rate of one second per second. But that is silly. One second divided by one second is the number one. That is not a coherent rate.
Physicists sometimes speak of time flowing in another sense of the term "flow." This is the sense in which change is continuous rather than discrete. That is not the sense of “flow” that philosophers normally use when debating the objectivity of time's flow.
There is another uncontroversial sense of flow—when physicists say that time flows differently for the two twins in Einstein's twin paradox. All the physicists mean here is that durations are different in different reference frames that are moving relative to each other; they need not be promoting the dynamic theory over the static theory, since defenders of the static theory can readily agree that time is different in different reference frames.
Physicists sometimes carelessly speak of time flowing in yet another sense—when what they mean is that time has an arrow, a direction, from the past to the future. But again this is not the sense of “flow” that philosophers use when speaking of the dynamic theory of time's flow.
There is no doubt that time seems to pass. There surely is some objective feature of our brains, say the proponents of the static theories, that causes us to mistakenly believe there is a flow of time which we are experiencing. Perhaps it is due to the objective fact that we have different perceptions at different times and that anticipations of experiences always happen before memories of those experiences. So, they argue, the beliefs that time flows are objectively real, but the flow itself is not objectively real.
According to the dynamic theories, the flow of time is objective, a feature of our mind-independent reality. A dynamic theory is closer to common sense, and has historically been the more popular theory among philosophers. It is more likely to be adopted by those who believe that McTaggart's A-series is a fundamental feature of time but his B-series is not.
One dynamic theory implies that the flow is a matter of events changing from being future, to being present, to being past, and they also change in their degree of pastness and degree of presentness. This kind of change is often called McTaggart's second-order change to distinguish it from more ordinary, first-order change as when a leaf changes from a green state to a brown state. For the B-theorist the only proper kind of change is when different states of affairs obtain at different times.
Opponents of this dynamic theory complain that when events are said to change, the change is not a real change in the event’s essential, intrinsic properties, but only in the event’s relationship to the observer. For example, saying the death of Queen Anne is an event that changes from present to past is no more of an objectively real change in her death than saying her death changed from being approved of to being disapproved of. This extrinsic change in approval is not intrinsic to her death and so does not count as an objectively real change in her death, and neither does the so-called second-order change of her death from present to past or from indeterminate to determinate. Attacking the notion of time’s flow in this manner, Adolf Grünbaum said: “Events simply are or occur…but they do not ‘advance’ into a pre-existing frame called ‘time.’ … An event does not move and neither do any of its relations.”
A second dynamic theory implies that the flow is a matter of events changing from being indeterminate in the future to being determinate in the present and past. Time’s flow is really events becoming determinate, so these dynamic theorists speak of time’s flow as temporal becoming.
A third dynamic theory says time's flow is the coming into existence of facts, the actualization of new states of affairs; but, unlike the first two dynamic theories, there is no commitment to events changing. This is the theory of flow that is usually accepted by advocates of presentism.
A fourth dynamic theory suggests the flow is (or is reflected in) the change over time of truth values of declarative sentences. For example, suppose the sentence, “It is now raining,” was true during the rain yesterday but has changed to false on today’s sunny day. That's an indication that time flowed from yesterday to today, and these sorts of truth value changes are at the root of the flow. In response, critics suggest that the temporal indexical sentence, “It is now raining,” has no truth value because the reference of the word “now” is unspecified. If it cannot have a truth value, it cannot change its truth value. However, the sentence is related to a sentence that does have a truth value, the sentence with the temporal indexical replaced by the date that refers to a specific time and with the other indexicals replaced by names of whatever they refer to. Supposing it is now midnight here on April 1, 2007, and the speaker is in Sacramento, California, then the indexical sentence, “It is now raining,” is intimately related to the more complete or context-explicit sentence, “It is raining at midnight on April 1, 2007 in Sacramento, California.” Only these latter, non-indexical, non-context-dependent, complete sentences have truth values, and these truth values do not change with time so they do not underlie any flow of time. Fully-described events do not change their properties and so time does not flow because complete or "eternal" sentences do not change their truth values.
Among B-theorists, Hans Reichenbach has argued that the flow of time is produced by the collapse of the quantum mechanical wave function. Another dynamic theory is promoted by advocates of the B-theory who add to the block-universe a flowing present which "spotlights" or makes vivid a new present slice of the block at every moment. This is often called the moving spotlight view.
John Norton (Norton 2010) argues that time's flow is objective but so far is beyond the reach of our understanding. Tim Maudlin argues that the objective flow of time is fundamental and unanalyzable. He is happy to say “time does indeed pass at the rate of one hour per hour.” (Maudlin 2007, p. 112)
Have dinosaurs slipped out of existence? More generally, we are asking whether the past is part of reality. How about the future? Philosophers are divided on the ontological question of the reality of the past, the present, and the future. There are three leading theories. (1): According to the ontological theory called presentism, if something is real, then it is real now; all and only things that exist now are real. The presentist maintains that the past and the future are not real, so if a statement about the past is true, this must be because some present facts make it true. Heraclitus, Duns Scotus, Thomas Hobbes, and A. N. Prior are presentists.
(2): Advocates of a growing-past agree with the presents that the present is special ontologically, but they argue that, in addition to the present, the past is also real and is growing bigger all the time. C. D. Broad, George Ellis, Richard Jeffrey, and Michael Tooley have defended this view. They claim the past and present are real, but the future is not real. William James famously remarked that the future is so unreal that even God cannot anticipate it. It is not clear whether Aristotle accepted the growing-past theory or accepted a form of presentism; see (Putnam 1967), p. 244 for commentary on this issue.
(3): Proponents of eternalism oppose both presentism and the growing-past theory—but not because they believe reality is composed of the past, present, and future. Rather, the eternalists object to assigning special ontological status to the past, the present, or the future. Advocates of eternalism do not deny the reality of the events that we classify as being in our past, present or future, but they say there is no objective ontological difference among the past, the present, and the future, just as there is no objective ontological difference among here, there, and far. Yes, we thank goodness that the threat to our safety is there rather than here, and that it is past rather than present, but these differences are subjective, being dependent on our point of view. The classification of events into past, or present, or future is a subjective classification, not an objective one. Bertrand Russell, J. J. C. Smart, W. V. O. Quine, Adolf Grünbaum, and Paul Horwich have endorsed eternalism.
Eternalism is closely associated with the block-universe theory, as is the theory of four-dimensionalism. Four-dimensionalism implies that the ontologically basic (that is, fundamental) objects in the universe are four-dimensional rather than three-dimensional. Here, time is treated as being somewhat like a fourth dimension of space, though strictly speaking time is not a dimension of space, but rather of space-time. The block theory is said to promote the "spatialization of time" because it treats time as an extra dimension of mathematical space, as in a Minkowski diagram. If time has an infinite future or infinite past, or if space has an infinite extent, then the block is thereby infinitely large along those dimensions.
The block-universe theory implies that reality is a single block of spacetime with its time slices (planes of simultaneous events) ordered by the happens-before relation. Four-dimensionalism adds that every object is in fact a four-dimensional object, and if an object has a non-zero duration, and if time is not discrete or atomistic, then the object has an infinite number of time-slices. We adults are composed of our infancy time-slices, plus our childhood time-slices, plus our teenage time-slices, plus our adult time-slices. Time-slices are also called "temporal parts."
For the eternalist, the block itself has no distinguished past, present, and future, but any chosen reference frame can be assigned its own definite past, present, and future. The future, by the way, is the actual future, not all possible futures. William James coined the term “block-universe.”
Some proponents of the growing-past theory have adopted a growing-block theory. They say that the future is not included in their block, and the present moment is the latest moment within the block. The present is a three-dimensional time slice that divides the past from nothingness.
All three ontologies [namely presentism, the growing-past, and eternalism] imply that we only ever experience the present. One of the major issues for presentism is how to ground true propositions about the past. What makes it true that U.S. President Abraham Lincoln was assassinated? In technical-ease we are asking what are the "truthmakers" of the true proposition that U.S. President Abraham Lincoln was assassinated. Whatever makes this true, the presentist cannot say it is Abraham Lincoln. Some presentists say past-tensed truths lack truthmakers but are nevertheless true. Most presentists will say what makes it true are only features of the present way things are. The eternalist disagrees. When someone says truly that Abraham Lincoln was assassinated, the eternalist believes this is to say something true of an existing Abraham Lincoln who is not present.
A second issue for the presentist is to account for causation, for the fact that April showers caused May flowers. Normally, when causes occur, their effects are not yet present. A survey of defenses of presentism can be found in (Markosian 2003).
The presentist and the advocate of the growing-past will usually unite in opposition to eternalism on four grounds: (i) The present is so much more vivid to a conscious being than are memories of past experiences and expectations of future experiences. (ii) Eternalism misses the special “open” and changeable character of the future. In the block-universe, which is the ontological theory promoted by most eternalists, there is only one future, so this implies the future exists already, but we know this determinsm and its denial of free will is incorrect. (iii) A present event "moves" in the sense that it is no longer present a moment later, having lost its property of presentness. (iv) Future-tensed statements that are contingent do not have truthmakers.
The counter from the defenders of eternalism and the block-universe is that, regarding (i), the vividness of here does not imply the unreality of there. Regarding (ii) and the open future, the block theory allows determinism and fatalism but does not require either one. Eventually there will be one future, regardless of whether that future is now open or closed, and that is what constitutes the future portion of the block. Finally, don't we all fear impending doom? But according to presentism and the growing-block theory, why should we have this fear if the doom is known not to exist? The best philosophy of time will not make our different attitudes toward future danger and past danger be so mysterious.
The advocates of the block-universe attack both presentism and the growing-past theory by claiming that only the block-universe can make sense of the special theory of relativity’s implication that, if persons A and B are separated but in relative motion, an event in person A’s present can be in person B’s future, yet this implies that advocates of presentism and the growing-past theories must suppose that this event is both real and unreal because it is real for A but not real for B. Surely that conclusion is unacceptable, claim the eternalists. Two key assumptions of this argument are, first, that relativity does provide an accurate account of the spatiotemporal relations among events, and, second, that if there is some frame of reference in which two events are simultaneous, then if one of the events is real, so is the other.
Opponents of the block-universe counter that block theory does not provide an accurate account of the way things are because the block theory considers the present to be subjective, and not part of objective reality, yet the present is known to be part of objective reality. If science doesn't use the concept of the present in its basic laws, then this is one of science's faults. For a review of the argument from relativity against presentism, and for some criticisms of the block theory, see (Putnam 1967) and (Saunders 2002).
Suppose you look at your correct clock near you in your apartment building on Earth and notice it is shows midnight. What time is it on the Moon? Well, midnight, of course. But what event on the Moon is simultaneous with midnight on Earth? You can't look and see immediately. You will have to wait 1.3 seconds at least because it takes light that long to reach from the Moon to the Earth. If an asteroid were to strike the Moon, and you were to see the strike through your Earth telescope at 1.3 seconds after midnight, then you could compute later that the asteroid striking the Moon was simultaneous with your clock showing midnight. If you want to know what is presently happening on the other side of Milky Way, you'll have an even longer wait. So, the moral is that whatever collection of events is in your present is something you have to compute; you can't just look and see.
Einstein's theory of relativity implies that, if someone judges time using a clock fixed to their spaceship that is flying over your apartment building at a significant fraction of the speed of light, then when your clock shows it is now midnight, the collection of events that you eventually compute and so can correctly say occurs now must be different than the collection of events that the space traveler will be able to say occurs now, and the difference grows greater the father away that the events occur from Earth. The implication is that nobody's now is the only correct one. We all have our nows, and they are as valid as the next person's. But for people on Earth who aren't moving fast relative to each other, we more or less all share the same now. That is, we all can eventually agree on our computations about what events occur now.
All philosophers agree that we would be missing some important information if we did not know what the present time is, that is, what time it is now, but these philosophers disagree over just what sort of information this is. Proponents of the objectivity of the present are committed to claiming the universe would have a present even if there were no conscious beings. This claim is controversial. For example, in 1915, Bertrand Russell objected to giving the present any special ontological standing:
In a world in which there was no experience, there would be no past, present, or future, but there might well be earlier and later. (Russell 1915, p. 212)
The principal argument for believing in the objectivity of the now is that the now is so vivid to everyone; the present stands out specially among all times. If science doesn't explain this vividness, then there is a defect within science. A second argument points out that there is so much agreement among people around us about what is happening now and what is not. So, isn't that a sign that the concept of the now is objective, not subjective, and existent rather than non-existent? A third argument for objectivity of the now is that when we examine ordinary language we find evidence that a belief in the now is ingrained in our language. Notice all the present-tensed terminology in the English language. It is unlikely that it would be so ingrained if it were not correct to believe it.
Let's re-examine these arguments. One criticism of the first argument, the argument from vividness, is that the now is vivid but so is the "here," yet we don't conclude from this that the here is somehow objective geographically. Why then assume that the vividness of the now points to it being objective temporally? A second criticism is that we cannot now step outside our present experience and compare its vividness with experience now of future time and of past times. Instead, when we speak of the "vividness" of our present experience of, say, a tree in front of us, we are really comparing our present experience of the tree with our dim memories of trees and expectations of trees and not with experience of past trees or experience of future trees. So, the comparison is unfair; the vividness of future events should be taken from those events and not merely from expectations of those events.
A third criticism of the first argument regarding vividness points out that there are empirical studies by cognitive psychologists and neuroscientists showing that our judgment about what is vividly happening now is plastic and can be affected by our expectations and by what other experiences we are having at the time. For example, we see and hear a woman speaking to us from across the room; then we construct an artificial now in which hearing her speak and seeing her speak happen at the same time, whereas the acoustic engineer tells us we are mistaken because the sound traveled much slower than the light.
According to McTaggart's A-camp, there is a global now shared by all of us. The B-camp disagrees and says this belief is a product of our falsely supposing that everything we see is happening now; we are not factoring in the finite speed of light. Proponents of the subjectivity of the present frequently claim that a proper analysis of time talk should treat the phrases "the present" and "now" as indexical terms which refer to the time at which the phrases are uttered or written by the speaker, so their relativity to us speakers shows the essential subjectivity of the present. The main positive argument for subjectivity, and against the A-camp, appeals to the relativity of simultaneity, a feature of Einstein's Special Theory of Relativity of 1905. The argument points out that in this theory there is a block of space-time in which past events are separated from future events by a plane or "time slice" of simultaneous, presently-occurring instantaneous events, but this time slice is different in different reference frames. For example, take a reference frame in which you and I are not moving relative to each other; then we should agree on what is happening now—that is, on the 'now' slice of spacetime—because our clocks tick at the same rate. Not so for someone moving relative to us. If that other person is far enough away from us (that any causal influence of Beethoven's death couldn't have reached that person) and is moving fast enough away from us, then that person might truly say that Beethoven's death is occurring now! Yet if that person were moving rapidly towards us, they might truly say that our future death is happening now. Because the A-camp proponent must choose just one frame and its now as being "what's really happening now," and say the now of other frames is incorrect, the B-camp opponents will complain that any such choice is just arbitrary. Therefore, if we aren't going to reject Einstein's interpretation of his theory of special relativity, then we should reject the objectivity of the now. Instead we should think of every event as having its own past and future, with its present being all events that are simultaneous with it. For further discussion of this issue, see (Butterfield 1984).
There are interesting issues about the now even in theology. Norman Kretzmann has argued that if God is omniscient, then He knows what time it is, and so must always be changing. Therefore, there is an incompatibility between God's being omniscient and God's being immutable.
Some objects last longer than others. They persist longer. But there is philosophical disagreement about how to understand persistence. Objects considered four-dimensionally are said to persist by perduring rather than enduring. Think of events and processes as being four-dimensional. The more familiar three-dimensional objects such as chairs and people are usually considered to exist wholly at a single time and are said to persist by enduring through time. Advocates of four-dimensionalism endorse perduring objects rather than enduring objects as the metaphysically basic entities. All events, processes and other physical objects are four-dimensional sub-blocks of the block-universe. The perduring object persists by being the sum or “fusion” of a series of its temporal parts (also called its temporal stages and temporal slices and time slices). For example, a middle-aged man can be considered to be a four-dimensional perduring object consisting of his childhood, his middle age and his future old age. These are three of his infinitely many temporal parts.
One argument against four-dimensionalism is that it allows an object to have too many temporal parts. Four-dimensionalism implies that, during every second in which an object exists, there are at least as many temporal parts of the object as there are sub-segments of the mathematical line within the segment from zero to one. According to (Thomson 1983), this is too many parts for any object to have. Thomson also says that as the present moves along, present temporal parts move into the past and go out of existence while some future temporal parts "pop" into existence, and she complains that this popping in and out of existence is implausible. The four-dimensionalist can respond to these complaints by remarking that the present temporal parts do not go out of existence when they are no longer in the present; instead, they simply do not presently exist. Similarly dinosaurs have not popped out of existence; they simply do not exist presently.
According to David Lewis in On the Plurality of Worlds, the primary argument for perdurantism is that it has an easy time of solving what he calls the problem of temporary intrinsics, of which the Heraclitus paradox is one example. The Heraclitus Paradox is the problem, first introduced by Heraclitus, of explaining our not being able to step into the same river twice because the water is different the second time. The mereological essentialist agrees with Heraclitus, but our common sense says Heraclitus is mistaken. The advocate of endurance has trouble showing that Heraclitus is mistaken for the following reason: We do not step into two different rivers, do we? Yet the river has two different intrinsic properties, namely being two different collections of water; but, by Leibniz’s Law of the Indiscernibility of Identicals, identical objects cannot have different properties. A 4-dimensionalist who advocates perdurance says the proper metaphysical analysis of the Heraclitus paradox is that we can step into the same river twice by stepping into two different temporal parts of the same 4-d river. Similarly, we cannot see a football game at a moment; we can see only a momentary temporal part of the 4-d game. For more discussion of this topic in metaphysics, see (Carroll and Markosian 2010, pp. 173-7).
Eternalism differs from 4-dimensionalism. Eternalism says the present, past, and future are equally real, whereas 4-dimensionalism says the basic objects are 4-dimensional. Most 4-dimensionalists accept eternalism and four-dimensionalism and McTaggart's B-theory.
One of A. N. Prior’s criticisms of the B-theory involves the reasonableness of our saying of some painful, past event, “Thank goodness that is over.” Prior says the B-theorist cannot explain this reasonableness because no B-theorist should thank goodness that the end of their pain happens before their present utterance of "Thank goodness that is over," since that B-fact or B-relationship is timeless or tenseless; it has always held and always will. The only way then to make sense of our saying “Thank goodness that is over” is to assume we are thankful for the A-fact that the pain event has pastness. But if so, then the A-theory is correct and the B-theory is incorrect.
One B-theorist response is discussed in a later section, but another response is simply to disagree with Prior that it is improper for a B-theorist to thank goodness that the end of their pain happens before their present utterance, even though this is an eternal B-fact. Still another response from the B-theorist comes from the 4-dimensionalist who says that as 4-dimensional beings it is proper for us to care more about our later time-slices than our earlier time-slices. If so, then it is reasonable to thank goodness that the time slice at the end of the pain occurs before the time slice that is saying, "Thank goodness that is over." Admittedly this is caring about an eternal B-fact. So Prior’s premise [that the only way to make sense of our saying “Thank goodness that is over” is to assume we are thankful for the A-fact that the pain event has pastness] is a faulty premise, and Prior’s argument for the A-theory is invalid.
Four-dimensionalism has implications for the philosophical problem of personal identity. According to four-dimensionalism, you as a teenager and you as a child are not the same 3-dimensional person but rather are two different parts of the same 4-dimensional person.
The philosophical dispute about presentism, the growing-past theory, and the block theory or eternalism has taken a linguistic turn by focusing upon a question about language: “Are predictions true or false at the time they are uttered?” Those who believe in the block-universe (and thus in the determinate reality of the future) will answer “Yes” while a “No” will be given by presentists and advocates of the growing-past. The issue is whether contingent sentences uttered now about future events are true or false now rather than true or false only in the future at the time the predicted event is supposed to occur.
Suppose someone says, “Tomorrow the admiral will start a sea battle.” And suppose that tomorrow the admiral orders a sneak attack on the enemy ships which starts a sea battle. Advocates of the block-universe argue that, if so, then the above quoted sentence was true at the time it was uttered. Truth is eternal or fixed, they say, and “is true” is a tenseless predicate, not one that merely says “is true now.” These philosophers point favorably to the ancient Greek philosopher Chrysippus who was convinced that a contingent sentence about the future is true or false. If so, the sentence cannot have any other value such as “indeterminate” or "neither true or false now." Many other philosophers, usually in McTaggart's B-camp, agree with Aristotle's suggestion that the sentence is not true until it can be known to be true, namely at the time at which the sea battle occurs. The sentence was not true before the battle occurred. In other words, predictions have no (classical) truth values at the time they are uttered. Predictions fall into the “truth value gap.” This position that contingent sentences have no classical truth values is called the Aristotelian position because many researchers throughout history have taken Aristotle to be holding the position in chapter 9 of On Interpretation—although today it is not so clear that Aristotle himself held the position.
The principal motive for adopting the Aristotelian position arises from the belief that if sentences about future human actions are now true, then humans are determined to perform those actions, and so humans have no free will. To defend free will, we must deny truth values to predictions.
This Aristotelian argument against predictions being true or false has been discussed as much as any in the history of philosophy, and it faces a series of challenges. First, if there really is no free will, or if free will is compatible with determinism, then the motivation to deny truth values to predictions is undermined.
Second, according to the compatibilist, your choices affect the world, and if it is true that you will perform an action in the future, it does not follow that now you will not perform it freely, nor that you are not free to do otherwise if your intentions are different, but only that you will not do otherwise. For more on this point about modal logic, see Foreknowledge and Free Will.
A third challenge, from Quine and others, claims the Aristotelian position wreaks havoc with the logical system we use to reason and argue with predictions. For example, here is a deductively valid argument:
There will be a sea battle tomorrow.
If there will be a sea battle tomorrow, then we should wake up the admiral.
So, we should wake up the admiral.
Without the premises in this argument having truth values, that is, being true or false, we cannot properly assess the argument using the usual standards of deductive validity because this standard is about the relationships among truth values of the component sentences—that a valid argument is one in which it is impossible for the premises to be true and the conclusion to be false. Unfortunately, the Aristotelian position says that some of these component sentences are neither true nor false, so Aristotle’s position is implausible.
In reaction to this third challenge, proponents of the Aristotelian argument say that if Quine would embrace tensed propositions and expand his classical logic to a tense logic, he could avoid those difficulties in assessing the validity of arguments that involve sentences having future tense.
Quine has claimed that the analysts of our talk involving time should in principle be able to eliminate the temporal indexical words such as "now" and "tomorrow" because their removal is needed for fixed truth and falsity of our sentences [fixed in the sense of being eternal sentences whose truth values are not relative to the situation because the indexicals and indicator words have been replaced by times, places and names, and whose verbs are treated as tenseless], and having fixed truth values is crucial for the logical system used to clarify science. “To formulate logical laws in such a way as not to depend thus upon the assumption of fixed truth and falsity would be decidedly awkward and complicated, and wholly unrewarding,” says Quine.
Philosophers are still divided on the issues of whether only the present is real, what sort of deductive logic to use for reasoning about time, and whether future contingent sentences have truth values.
Using a tensed verb is a grammatical way of locating an event in time. All the world’s cultures have a conception of time, but in only half the world’s languages is the ordering of events expressed in the form of grammatical tenses. For example, the Chinese, Burmese and Malay languages do not have any tenses. The English language expresses conceptions of time with tensed verbs but also in other ways, such as with the adverbial time phrases “now” and “twenty-three days ago,” and with the adjective phrases "brand-new" and "ancient," and with the prepositions "until" and "since." Philosophers have asked what we are basically committed to when we use tense to locate an event in the past, in the present, or in the future.
There are two principal answers or theories. One is that tense distinctions represent objective features of reality that are not captured by eternalism and the block-universe approach. This theory is said to "take tense seriously" and is called the tensed theory of time, or the A-theory. This theory claims that when we learn the truth values of certain tensed sentences we obtain knowledge that tenseless sentences do not provide, for example, that such and such a time is the present time. Perhaps the tenseless theory rather than the tensed theory can be more useful for explaining human behavior than a tensed theory. Tenses are almost the same as positions in McTaggart's A-series, so the tensed theory is commonly associated with the A-camp that was discussed earlier in this article.
A second, contrary answer to the question of the significance of tenses is that tenses are merely subjective features of the perspective from which the speaking subject views the universe. Using a tensed verb is a grammatical way, not of locating an event in the A-series, but rather of locating the event in time relative to the time that the verb is uttered or written. Actually this philosophical disagreement is not just about tenses in the grammatical sense. It is primarily about the significance of the distinctions of past, present, and future which those tenses are used to mark. The main metaphysical disagreement is about whether times and events have non-relational properties of pastness, presentness, and futurity. Does an event have or not have the property of, say, pastness independent of the event's relation to us and our temporal location?
On the tenseless theory of time, or the B-theory, whether the death of U. S. Lieutenant Colonel George Armstrong Custer occurred here depends on the speaker’s relation to the death event (Is the speaker standing at the battle site in Montana?); similarly, whether the death occurs now is equally subjective (Is it now 1876 for the speaker?). The proponent of the tenseless view does not deny the importance or coherence of talk about the past, but will say it should be analyzed in terms of talk about the speaker's relation to events. My assertion that the event of Custer's death occurred in the past might be analyzed by the B-theorist as asserting that Custer's death event happens before the event of my writing this sentence. This latter assertion does not explicitly use the past tense. According to the classical B-theorist, the use of tense is an extraneous and eliminable feature of language, as is all use of the terminology of the A-series.
This controversy is often presented as a dispute about whether tensed facts exist, with advocates of the tenseless theory objecting to tensed facts and advocates of the tensed theory promoting them as essential. The primary function of tensed facts is to make tensed sentences true. For the purposes of explaining this dispute, let us uncritically accept the Correspondence Theory of Truth and apply it to the following sentence:
Custer died in Montana.
If we apply the Correspondence Theory directly to this sentence, then the tensed theory or A-theory implies
The sentence “Custer died in Montana” is true because it corresponds to the tensed fact that Custer died in Montana.
The old tenseless theory or B-theory, created by Bertrand Russell (1915), would give a different analysis without tensed facts. It would say that the Correspondence Theory should be applied only to the result of first analyzing away tensed sentences into equivalent sentences that do not use tenses. Proponents of this classical tenseless theory prefer to analyze our sentence “Custer died in Montana” as having the same meaning as the following “eternal” sentence:
There is a time t such that Custer dies in Montana at time t, and time t is before the time of the writing of the sentence “Custer died in Montana” by B. Dowden in the article “Time” in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
In this analysis, the verb dies is logically tenseless (although grammatically it is in the present tense just like the "is" in "7 plus 5 is 12"). Applying the Correspondence Theory to this new sentence then yields:
The sentence “Custer died in Montana” is true because it corresponds to the tenseless fact that there is a time t such that Custer dies in Montana at time t, and time t is before the time of your reading the sentence “Custer died in Montana” by B. Dowden in the article “Time” in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
This Russell-like analysis is less straight-forward than the analysis offered by the tensed theory, but it does not use tensed facts.
This B-theory analysis is challenged by proponents of the tensed A-theory on the grounds that it can succeed only for utterances or readings or inscriptions, but a sentence can be true even if never read or inscribed. There are other challenges. Roderick Chisholm and A. N. Prior claim that the word “is” in the sentence “It is now midnight” is essentially present tensed because there is no adequate translation using only tenseless verbs. Trying to analyze it as, say, “There is a time t such that t = midnight” is to miss the essential reference to the present in the original sentence because the original sentence is not always true, but the sentence “There is a time t such that t = midnight” is always true. So, the tenseless analysis fails. There is no escape from this criticism by adding “and t is now” because this last indexical still needs analysis, and we are starting a vicious regress.
(Prior 1959) supported the tensed A-theory by arguing that after experiencing a painful event,
one says, e.g., “Thank goodness that’s over,” and [this]…says something which it is impossible that any use of a tenseless copula with a date should convey. It certainly doesn’t mean the same as, e.g., “Thank goodness the date of the conclusion of that thing is Friday, June 15, 1954,” even if it be said then. (Nor, for that matter, does it mean “Thank goodness the conclusion of that thing is contemporaneous with this utterance.” Why should anyone thank goodness for that?).
D. H. Mellor and J. J. C. Smart agree that tensed talk is important for understanding how we think and speak—the temporal indexicals are essential, as are other indexicals—but they claim it is not important for describing temporal, extra-linguistic reality. They advocate a newer tenseless B-theory by saying the truth conditions of any tensed declarative sentence can be explained without tensed facts even if Chisholm and Prior are correct that some tensed sentences in English cannot be translated into tenseless ones. [The truth conditions of a sentence are the conditions which must be satisfied in the world in order for the sentence to be true. The sentence "Snow is white" is true on the condition that snow is white. More particularly, it is true if whatever is referred to by the term 'snow' satisfies the predicate 'is white'. The conditions under which the conditional sentence "If it's snowing, then it's cold" are true are that it is not both true that it is snowing and false that it is cold. Other analyses are offered for the truth conditions of sentences that are more complex grammatically.]
According to the newer B-theory of Mellor and Smart, if I am speaking to you and say, "It is now midnight," then this sentence admittedly cannot be translated into tenseless terminology without loss of meaning, but the truth conditions can be explained with tenseless terminology. The truth conditions of "It is now midnight" are that my utterance occurs at the same time as your hearing the utterance, which in turn is the same time as when our standard clock declares the time to be midnight in our reference frame. In brief, it's true just in case it is uttered at midnight. Notice that no tensed facts are appealed to in the explanation of those truth conditions. Similarly, an advocate of the new tenseless theory could say it is not the pastness of the painful event that explains why I say, “Thank goodness that’s over.” I say it because I believe that the time of the occurrence of that utterance is greater than the time of the occurrence of the painful event, and because I am glad about this. Of course I'd be even gladder if there were no pain at any time. I may not be consciously thinking about the time of the utterance when I make it; nevertheless that time is what helps explain what I am glad about. Notice that appeal to tensed terminology was removed in that explanation.
In addition, it is claimed by Mellor and other new B-theorists that tenseless sentences can be used to explain the logical relations between tensed sentences: that one tensed sentence implies another, is inconsistent with yet another, and so forth. Understanding a declarative sentence's truth conditions and its truth implications and how it behaves in a network of inferences is what we understand whenever we know the meaning of the sentence. According to this new theory of tenseless time, once it is established that tensed sentences can be explained without utilizing tensed facts, then Ockham’s Razor is applied. If we can do without essentially-tensed facts, then we should say essentially-tensed facts do not exist. To summarize, tensed facts were presumed to be needed to account for the truth of tensed talk; but the new B-theory analysis shows that ordinary tenseless facts are adequate. The theory concludes that we should not take seriously metaphysical tenses with their tensed facts because they are not needed for describing the objective features of the extra-linguistic world. Proponents of the tensed theory of time do not agree with this conclusion. So, the philosophical debate continues over whether tensed concepts have semantical priority over untensed concepts, and whether tensed facts have ontological priority over untensed facts.
Why is the past so different from the future? The answer is that there is an arrow of time which makes it be that way.
Time's arrow is revealed in the way macroscopic processes tend to go over time—toward equilibrium, toward more stability, toward, in some cases, the conversion of useful heat into useless heat. For example, a glass of hot water with floating ice cubes never naturally evolves into a glass of hotter water with even more ice cubes. When we prick a balloon filled with air, the inside air rushes out; the outside air never rushes in. Unbroken eggs become omelets; omelets never become unbroken eggs. All these practically one-way processes are processes toward equilibrium. Even if it were physically possible for one of these one-way process to reverse spontaneously, so long as there is no serious chance of it ever doing so, we still informally call it a one-way process.
The amalgamation of the universe’s one-way processes produces the cosmic arrow of time, the master arrow. The master arrow of time is the same for all of us. This arrow is what is meant by time’s arrow. So, time's arrow is not so much a feature of time itself as it is of the directed processes in time.
This arrow of time is universal in the sense that it is the same arrow for everyone, unlike proper time, which is different for everyone. ==
Philosophers and physicists want more explanation of why there is an arrow. The most favored explanation by physicists is that the arrow exists and points the direction it does for two reasons: (i) entropy increases according to the Second Law of Thermodynamics, and (ii) things were arranged in a special way at the time of the Big Bang. Both these factors also need more explanation.
Sometimes it is helpful to think of entropy of a physical system as a measure of the system's useful energy . The heat energy in a system of physical objects at equilibrium with its surroundings—so every object is at the same temperature—is not heat we can use for anything. That same amount of heat in the right place within a steam engine is something we can use; it can power our trains and heat our offices. So, the entropy in the steam engine is high, and the entropy in the system that is at equilibrium is very low. That is why the arrow of time is primarily about entropy and not energy.
Our best definition of the future of the universe is that it is the direction of time in which entropy increases, and our best definition of the past of the universe is that it is the direction of time in which entropy decreases.
In the late 19th century, Ludwig Boltzmann discovered why entropy naturally increases from low to high in a closed system of particles. A closed system is a region where nothing gets in or out. The universe is an example of a closed system. A thermos bottle is a less good example. Boltzmann said entropy increases over time because there are so many more macroscopically indistinguishable micro-states with high entropy than there are macroscopically indistinguishable micro-states with low entropy. Entropy change is a matter of statistics, of what are the probable arrangements of atoms, he argued at a time when physicists were undecided about whether to believe that atoms are real. The principle that entropy is likely to increase in the future within any closed system is half of what is called the Second Law of Thermodynamics, and physicists generally agree that Boltzmann gave a correct explanation of this half. The philosophical difficulty involves the second half of the Second Law—that as you look back into the past of a closed system, it is likely that entropy was higher. This difficulty will be discussed in more detail below in section c.
Because big things are built out of little things and because so many of the physical processes that we commonly observe do have an arrow, you might think that an inspection of the basic micro-physical laws would readily reveal time’s arrow. It will not. With some exceptions (that are not enough to account for the arrow of time), such as the collapse of the quantum mechanical wave function and the weak-force interactions, all the basic laws of fundamental physical processes are time symmetric. That means that it is physically possible for them to reverse, to go the other way than the way we commonly observe them to go. A process that is time symmetric can go forward or backward in time, and the basic laws allow both. For example, Maxwell’s equations of electromagnetism are a set of basic laws that can be used to predict that television signals can exist, but these equations cannot tell us whether those signals are detected by our TV set at home before or after they are transmitted from the TV station. A film showing them broadcast first from the TV station and a film showing them first being detected in our TV set at home are both films of physically possible phenomena . Because we have a similar problem for the other laws, it follows that the basic laws of science do not by themselves imply an arrow of time.
Something other than basic laws must tell us why our home TV detects the program only after it is broadcast, and why omelets never turn into whole, unbroken eggs. The leading explanation is that the existence of the arrow of time is due how things were a long time ago. More precisely, the arrow is due both to entropy flow plus the fact that entropy was low in the distant past.
This extra fact is called the Past Hypothesis. It is an unexplained fact, not an unexplained law. A later section delves more deeply into the philosophical controversy surrounding the Past Hypothesis.
Although our universe has a very distinct arrow of time, it is physically possible for there to be universes in which time has no arrow. In a universe with no changes, there would be no time and so also no arrow of time. If a universe had changes but those changes were all random in the sense that any process is no more likely to go one way rather than the reverse, then there would be no arrow of time in that universe.
There are many goals for a fully developed theory of time’s arrow. It should tell us (1) why time has any direction at all; (2) why the arrow points one way rather than the reverse way; (3) why the basic laws of science do not reveal the arrow, (4) how the arrow is connected with entropy, (5) why the arrow is apparent in macro processes but not micro processes; (6) why it is so probable that the entropy of a closed system increases in the future rather than decreases even though the decrease is physically possible given current basic laws; (7) what it would be like for our arrow of time to reverse direction; (8) what are the characteristics of a physical theory that would pick out a preferred direction in time; (9) what the relationships are among the various more specific arrows of time—the various kinds of temporally asymmetric processes such as a B meson decay [the B-meson arrow], the collapse of the wave function [the quantum mechanical arrow], entropy increases [the thermodynamic arrow], causes preceding their effects [the causal arrow], light radiating away from hot objects rather than converging into them [the electromagnetic arrow], and our knowing the past more easily than the future [the knowledge arrow]; (10) how entropy is connected with quantum entanglement, and (11) why the Past Hypothesis is true.
Historically, there have been three principal explanations of the arrow of time: (i) it is a product of causation which itself is asymmetrical; (i) it is a product of one-way entropy flow which in turn is due to the initial conditions of our universe; (iii) it is a product of one-way entropy flow which in turn is due to some as yet unknown asymmetrical laws of nature,
Leibniz first proposed (i), the so-called causal theory of time's order. Hans Reichenbach developed the idea in more detail in 1928. He defined "happens before" by saying that event A happens before event B if A could have caused B but B could not have caused A. The usefulness of this causal theory depends on a clarification of the two notorious notions of causality and possibility without producing a circular explanation that presupposes an understanding of time order. Also, the causal theory should explain why, if we grant that there is causal asymmetry, the asymmetry is in one direction rather than in the inverse direction.
21st century physicists generally favor explanation (ii). They say the most likely explanation of the emergence of an arrow of time is that the arrow is a product of the direction of entropy change. There is disagreement about how to explain entropy change, but however it is to be explained, there still needs to be a Past Hypothesis about the low-entropy state of the universe at the beginning of our Big Bang. Unfortunately there is no generally accepted explanation of why the entropy was so low then.
There are many useful definitions of entropy, some being more appropriate than others for a specific kind of system. It is sometimes appropriate to say entropy is a measure of how disordered or "run down" or "mixed up" a closed system is. But there are exceptions; when we add oil to water; they don't get mixed up; they naturally become unmixed. According to a more general definition, from the 19th century physicist Ludwig Boltzmann, the entropy of a physical system that is isolated from external influences is proportional to the logarithm of how many ways the system's particles could be reconfigured so you would not notice the difference macroscopically. Why doesn’t lukewarm water ever spontaneously turn into hot water with ice cubes? The answer from Boltzmann is that the number of macroscopically indistinguishable arrangements of the atoms in the system that appear to us macroscopically as lukewarm water is so very much greater than the number of macroscopically indistinguishable arrangements of the atoms that appear to us as ice cubes floating in the hot water. It is all about probabilities of arrangements of the constituent atoms, he said. Boltzmann's idea that entropy is related to the number of microstates (atomic arrangements) that are macroscopically indistinguishable is now recognized as one of the greatest original ideas in the history of science.
Boltzmann discovered that entropy change is statistical, unlike change of energy and voltage and charge. For that reason physicists say the first law of thermodynamics is basic but the second law is not. [The first law expresses the conservation of energy in a closed system.]
But there is a special controversy involving entropy change, namely why it was lower in the past. Boltzmann was the first person to claim to have deduced the 2nd law of thermodynamics from reversible microscopic laws involving individual particles. Yet it seems too odd, said his friend Joseph Loschmidt in 1876, that a one-way macroscopic process can be deduced only from two-way microscopic processes because macroscopic processes are made from their constituent microscopic processes. Most physicists now agree that Loschmidt was correct in his suspicions and that Boltzmann had unknowingly introduced an assumption in his own deduction that presupposed the directedness of time's arrow.
Loschmidt's point is that if you didn't know time had an arrow, and you didn't know the Second Law was true, then just by using the laws and statistical mechanics you could not predict that entropy would be low in the past. Past states with high entropy would be much more common that past states with low entropy, so you would expect the past entropy to be high.
To illustrate Loschmidt's point, if you look at our present state (at the black dot in the diagram below), then you ought to deduce from the basic laws (assuming you have no knowledge that our universe actually had lower entropy in the past) that this state evolved, not from a state of low entropy in the past, but from a state of higher entropy in the past since there are so many more past microstates with high entropy than low entropy. Yet we all know that entropy was actually lower in the past not higher. The difficulty is displayed in the diagram below.
Why is history like the green dashed arrow, not the red dashed arrow? We know our universe really took the dashed green path and did not have high entropy in the past—at least not in the past that is between now and the initial Big Bang event—so the actual low value of entropy in the past is puzzling.
To properly respond to this Loschmidt Reversibility Objection or Loschmidt Paradox, and to properly predict the dashed green line rather than the dashed red line, most physicists say it is necessary to adopt the Past Hypothesis—that our universe at the time of the Big Bang event was in a state of very low entropy.
Can the Past Hypothesis be justified or explained in more depth? Here are four responses to that question. (1) The initially low entropy is simply a brute fact—that is, there is no causal explanation for it. Richard Feynman and Craig Callender suggest this response. (2) Objecting to inexplicable initial facts as being unacceptably ad hoc, the physicists Walther Ritz and Roger Penrose say we need to keep looking for some basic, time-asymmetrical laws that will account for the initially low entropy and thus for time’s arrow. Maybe a future theory of quantum gravity will provide those laws, or maybe we will develop laws about the state of the universe before the Big Bang event and these will imply that entropy was low then. (3) A third perspective on the Past Hypothesis appeals to God's having designed the Big Bang to start with low entropy. (4) A fourth perspective appeals to the anthropic principle and the many-worlds interpretation of quantum mechanics in order to argue that since there exist so many universes with different initial entropies, there had to be one universe like our particular universe with its initially low entropy—and that is the primary reason why our universe had low entropy at the beginning of the Big Bang.
To make one final point about entropy increase, in the early 21st century, M.I.T. professor Seth Lloyd suggested an original explanation for entropy increase: “What’s really going on [with the arrow of time pointing in the direction of equilibrium] is things are becoming more correlated with each other.” His point is that the increasing entropy in any process is really increasing quantum entanglement among the particles in that process.
Consider the difference between time’s arrow and time’s arrows. The direction of entropy change is the thermodynamic arrow. Here are some suggestions for additional arrows:
- Causes precede their effects.
- We remember last week, not next week.
- It is easier to know the past than to know the future.
- There is evidence of the past but not of the future.
- Our present actions affect the future and not the past.
- Possibilities decrease as time goes on.
- Radio waves spread out from the antenna, but never converge into it.
- Our universe expands in volume rather than shrinks.
- We see black holes but never white holes.
- B meson decay, neutral kaon decay, and Higgs boson decay are each different in a time reversed world.
- Quantum mechanical measurement collapses the wave function.
Most physicists suspect all these arrows are linked so that we cannot have some arrows reversing while others do not. For example, the collapse of the wave function is generally considered to be due to an increase in the entropy of our universe. It is well accepted that entropy increase can account for the fact that we remember the past but not the future, and that effects follow causes rather than precede them. However, whether all the arrows are linked is still an open question.
Could the cosmic arrow of time have gone the other way? Most physicists suspect that the answer is yes, and they say it would have gone the other way if the initial conditions of our universe at our Big Bang event had been different. There are initial conditions that make scrambled eggs turn into whole eggs, make bells un-ring but never ring, and people drink black coffee that naturally evolved from brown coffee.
In 1902 in Appearance and Reality, the British idealist philosopher F. H. Bradley said that when time runs backwards compared to our current world, "Death would come before birth, the blow would follow the wound, and all must seem irrational." J.J.C. Smart disagreed about the irrationality. He said all would seem as it is now because memory would become precognition, so an inhabitant of a time-reversed world would feel the blow and then the wound.
G. J. Whitrow in The Natural Philosophy of Time, defended Bradley and argued that memory would not become precognition; his justification was that memory, by definition, is of whatever happens first, so, "all must seem irrational."
Boltzmann discovered that a changing system very probably goes to a state of higher entropy. However, the probability is extremely high, and it increases with the number of atoms in the region. There is a chance that your brown coffee will spontaneously separate into black coffee and white cream, but it’s such a slim chance that you’d have to wait much, much longer than the past history of the universe to ever see it happen. That is why there is no realistic chance that in our universe we will ever discover a special region of space where people drink black coffee that evolved from brown coffee, remember the future, undigest their meals, and grow from adulthood into infancy.
Temporal logic is the representation of reasoning about time by using the methods of symbolic logic in order to formalize which statements about time imply which others. For example, in McTaggart's B-series, the most important relation is the happens-before relation on events. Logicians have asked what sort of principles must this relation obey in order to properly account for our reasoning about time.
Here is one suggestion. Consider this informally valid reasoning:
Adam's arrival at the train station happens before Bryan's. Therefore, Bryan's arrival at the station does not happen before Adam's.
Let us translate this into classical predicate logic using a domain of instantaneous events, namely point events, where the individual constant 'a' denotes Adam's arrival at the train station, and 'b' denotes Bryan's arrival at the train station. Let the two-argument relation B(x,y) be interpreted as "x happens before y." The direct translation produces:
Unfortunately, this formal reasoning is invalid. To make the formal argument become valid, we could make explicit the implicit premise that the B relation is asymmetric. That is, we need to add the implicit premise:
∀x∀y[B(x,y) → ~B(y,x)]
So, we might want to add this principle as an axiom into our temporal logic.
In other informally valid reasoning, we discover a need to make even more assumptions about the happens-before relation. Suppose Adam arrives at the train station before Bryan, and suppose Bryan arrives before Charles. Is it valid reasoning to infer that Adam arrives before Charles? Yes, but if we translate directly into classical predicate logic we get this invalid argument:
To make this argument be valid we need the implicit premise that says the happens-before relation is transitive, that is:
∀x∀y∀z [(B(x,y) & B(y,z)) → B(x,z)]
What other constraints should be placed on the B relation (when it is to be interpreted as the happens-before relation)? Logicians have offered many suggestions: that B is irreflexive, that in any reference frame any two events are related somehow by the B relation (there are no disconnected pairs of events), that B is dense in the sense that there is a third point event between any two point events that are not simultaneous, and so forth.
The more classical approach to temporal logic, however, does not add premises to arguments in classical predicate logic as we have just been doing. The classical approach is via tense logic, a formalism that adds tense operators on propositions of propositional logic. The pioneer in the late 1950s was A. N. Prior. He created a new symbolic logic to describe our reasoning involving time phrases such as “now,” “happens before,” “twenty-three minutes afterwards,” “at all times,” and “sometimes.” He hoped that a precise, formal treatment of these concepts could lead to resolution of some of the controversial philosophical issues about time.
Prior begins with an important assumption: that a proposition such as “Custer dies in Montana” can be true at one time and false at another time. That assumption is challenged by some philosophers, such as W.V. Quine, who prefer to avoid use of this sort of proposition and who recommend that temporal logics use only sentences that are timelessly true or timelessly false, and that have no indexicals whose reference can shift from one context to another.
Prior's main original idea was to appreciate that time concepts are similar in structure to modal concepts such as “it is possible that” and “it is necessary that.” He adapted modal propositional logic for his tense logic. Michael Dummett and E. J. Lemmon also made major, early contributions to tense logic. One standard system of tense logic is a variant of the S4.3 system of modal logic. In this formal tense logic, the modal operator that is interpreted to mean “it is possible that” is re-interpreted to mean “at some past time it was the case that” or, equivalently, “it once was the case that,” or "it once was that." Let the capital letter 'P' represent this operator. P will operate on present-tensed propositions, such as p. If p represents the proposition “Custer dies in Montana,” then Pp says Custer died in Montana. If Prior can make do with the variable p ranging only over present-tensed propositions, then he may have found a way to eliminate any ontological commitment to non-present entities such as dinosaurs while preserving the possibility of true past tense propositions such as "There were dinosaurs."
Prior added to the axioms of classical propositional logic the axiom P(p v q) ↔ (Pp v Pq). The axiom says that for any two propositions p and q, at some past time it was the case that p or q if and only if either at some past time it was the case that p or at some past time (perhaps a different past time) it was the case that q.
If p is the proposition “Custer dies in Montana” and q is “Sitting Bull dies in Montana,” then
P(p v q) ↔ (Pp v Pq)
Custer or Sitting Bull died in Montana if and only if either Custer died in Montana or Sitting Bull died in Montana.
The S4.3 system’s key axiom is the equivalence, for all propositions p and q,
Pp & Pq ↔ [P(p & q) v P(p & Pq) v P(q & Pp)].
This axiom when interpreted in tense logic captures part of our ordinary conception of time as a linear succession of states of the world.
Another axiom of tense logic might state that if proposition q is true, then it will always be true that q has been true at some time. If H is the operator “It has always been the case that,” then a new axiom might be
Pp ↔ ~H~p.
This axiom of tense logic is analogous to the modal logic axiom that p is possible if and only if it is not the case that it is necessary that not-p.
A tense logic may need additional axioms in order to express “q has been true for the past two weeks.” Prior and others have suggested a wide variety of additional axioms for tense logic, but logicians still disagree about which axioms to accept.
It is controversial whether to add axioms that express the topology of time, for example that it comes to an end or doesn't come to an end; the reason usually given is that this is an empirical matter, not a matter for logic to settle.
Regarding a semantics for tense logic, Prior had the idea that the truth of a tensed proposition should be expressed in terms of truth-at-a-time. For example, a modal proposition Pp (it was once the case that p) is true at-a-time t if and only if p is true-at-a-time earlier than t. This suggestion has led to an extensive development of the formal semantics for tense logic.
The concept of being in the past is usually treated by metaphysicians as a predicate that assigns properties to events, but, in the tense logic just presented, the concept is treated as an operator P upon propositions, and this difference in treatment is objectionable to some metaphysicians.
The other major approach to temporal logic does not use a tense logic. Instead, it formalizes temporal reasoning within a first-order logic without modal-like tense operators. One method for developing ideas about temporal logic is the method of temporal arguments which adds an additional temporal argument to any predicate involving time in order to indicate how its satisfaction depends on time. A predicate such as “is less than seven” does not involve time, but the predicate “is resting” does, even though both use the word "is". If the “x is resting” is represented classically as P(x), where P is a one-argument predicate, then it could be represented in temporal logic instead as the two-argument predicate P(x,t), and this would be interpreted as saying x has property P at time t. P has been changed to a two-argument predicate by adding a “temporal argument.” The time variable 't' is treated as a new sort of variable requiring new axioms. Suggested new axioms allow time to be a dense linear ordering of instantaneous instants or to be continuous or to have some other structure.
Occasionally the method of temporal arguments uses a special constant symbol, say 'n', to denote now, the present time. This helps with the translation of common temporal sentences. For example, let Q(t) be interpreted as “Socrates is sitting down at t.” The sentence or proposition that Socrates has always been sitting down may be translated into first-order temporal logic as
(∀t)[(t < n) → Q(t)].
Some temporal logics allow sentences to lack both classical truth-values. The first person to give a clear presentation of the implications of treating declarative sentences as being neither true nor false was the Polish logician Jan Lukasiewicz in 1920. To carry out Aristotle’s suggestion that future contingent sentences do not yet have truth values, he developed a three-valued symbolic logic, with each grammatical declarative sentence having the truth-values True, or False, or else Indeterminate [T, F, or I]. Contingent sentences about the future, such as, "There will be a sea battle tomorrow," are assigned an I value in order to indicate the indeterminacy of the future. Truth tables for the connectives of propositional logic are redefined to maintain logical consistency and to maximally preserve our intuitions about truth and falsehood. See (Haack 1974) for more details about this application of three-valued logic.
Different temporal logics have been created depending on whether one wants to model circular time, discrete time, time obeying general relativity, the time of ordinary discourse, and so forth. For an introduction to tense logic and other temporal logics, see (Øhrstrøm and Hasle 1995).
The following questions are addressed in the Time Supplement article:
- What are Instants and Durations?
- What is an Event?
- What is a Reference Frame?
- What is an Inertial Frame?
- What is Spacetime?
- What is a Minkowski Diagram?
- What are the Metric and the Interval?
- Does the Theory of Relativity Imply Time is Part of Space?
- Is Time the Fourth Dimension?
- Is There More Than One Kind of Physical Time?
- How is Time Relative to the Observer?
- What is the Relativity of Simultaneity?
- What is the Conventionality of Simultaneity?
- What is the Difference Between the Past and the Absolute Past?
- What is Time Dilation?
- How does Gravity Affect Time?
- What Happens to Time Near a Black Hole?
- What is the Solution to the Twin Paradox (Clock Paradox)?
- What is the Solution to Zeno’s Paradoxes?
- How do Time Coordinates Get Assigned to Points of Spacetime?
- How do Dates Get Assigned to Actual Events?
- What is Essential to Being a Clock?
- What does It Mean for a Clock To Be Accurate?
- What is Our Standard Clock?
- Why are Some Standard Clocks Better than Others?
- Butterfield, Jeremy. “Seeing the Present” Mind, 93, (1984), pp. 161-76.
- Defends the B-camp position on the subjectivity of the present and its not being a global present.
- Callender, Craig, and Ralph Edney. Introducing Time, Totem Books, USA, 2001.
- A cartoon-style book covering most of the topics in this encyclopedia article in a more elementary way. Each page is two-thirds graphics and one-third text.
- Callender, Craig and Carl Hoefer. “Philosophy of Space-Time Physics” in The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Science, ed. by Peter Machamer and Michael Silberstein, Blackwell Publishers, 2002, pp. 173-98.
- Discusses whether it is a fact or a convention that in a reference frame the speed of light going one direction is the same as the speed coming back.
- Callender, Craig. "The Subjectivity of the Present," Chronos, V, 2003-4, pp. 108-126.
- Surveys the psychological and neuroscience literature and suggests that the evidence tends to support the claim that our experience of the "now" is the experience of a subjective property rather than merely of an objective property, and it offers an interesting explanation of why so many people believe in the objectivity of the present.
- Callender, Craig. "The Common Now," Philosophical Issues 18, pp. 339-361 (2008).
- Develops the ideas presented in (Callender 2003-4).
- Callender, Craig. "Is Time an Illusion?", Scientific American, June, 2010, pp. 58-65.
- Explains how the belief that time is fundamental may be an illusion because time emerges from a universe that is basically static.
- Carroll, John W. and Ned Markosian. An Introduction to Metaphysics. Cambridge University Press, 2010.
- This introductory, undergraduate metaphysics textbook contains an excellent chapter introducing the metaphysical issues involving time, beginning with the McTaggart controversy.
- Carroll, Sean. From Eternity to Here: The Quest for the Ultimate Theory of Time, Dutton/Penguin Group, New York, 2010.
- Part Three "Entropy and Time's Arrow" provides a very clear explanation of the details of the problems involved with time's arrow. For an interesting answer to the question of whether any interaction between our part of the universe and a part in which the arrow of times goes in reverse, see endnote 137 for p. 164.
- Carroll, Sean. "Ten Things Everyone Should Know About Time," Discover Magazine, Cosmic Variance, online 2011.
- Contains the quotation about how the mind reconstructs its story of what is happening "now."
- Carroll, Sean. “The Perception of Time,” Lecture 15 of “Mysteries of Modern Physics: Time,” The Great Courses. http://www.thegreatcourses.com/, 2012.
- A video lecture on 21st century research about how humans and other animals perceive time.
- Damasio, Antonio R. “Remembering When,” Scientific American: Special Edition: A Matter of Time, vol. 287, no. 3, 2002; reprinted in Katzenstein, 2006, pp.34-41.
- A look at the brain structures involved in how our mind organizes our experiences into the proper temporal order. Includes a discussion of Benjamin Libet’s discovery in the 1970s that the brain events involved in initiating a free choice occur about a third of a second before we are aware of our making the choice.
- Dainton, Barry. Time and Space, Second Edition, McGill-Queens University Press: Ithaca, 2010.
- A survey of all the topics in this article, but at a deeper level.
- Davies, Paul. About Time: Einstein’s Unfinished Revolution, Simon & Schuster, 1995.
- An easy to read survey of the impact of the theory of relativity on our understanding of time.
- Davies, Paul. How to Build a Time Machine, Viking Penguin, 2002.
- A popular exposition of the details behind the possibilities of time travel.
- Deutsch, David and Michael Lockwood, “The Quantum Physics of Time Travel,” Scientific American, pp. 68-74. March 1994.
- An investigation of the puzzle of getting information for free by traveling in time.
- Dowden, Bradley. The Metaphysics of Time: A Dialogue, Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc. 2009.
- An undergraduate textbook in dialogue form that covers most of the topics discussed in this encyclopedia article.
- Dummett, Michael. “Is Time a Continuum of Instants?,” Philosophy, 2000, Cambridge University Press, pp. 497-515.
- A constructivist model of time that challenges the idea that time is composed of durationless instants.
- Earman, John. “Implications of Causal Propagation Outside the Null-Cone," Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 50, 1972, pp. 222-37.
- Describes his rocket paradox that challenges time travel to the past.
- Fisher, A. R. J. “David Lewis, Donald C. Williams, and the History of Metaphysics in the Twentieth Century.” Journal of the American Philosophical Association, volume 1, issue 1, Spring 2015.
- Discusses the disagreements between Lewis and Williams, who both are four-dimensionalists, about the nature of time travel.
- Grant, Andrew. "Time's Arrow," Science News, July 25, 2015, pp. 15-18.
- Popular description of why our early universe was so orderly even though nature should always have preferred the disorderly.
- Grünbaum, Adolf. “Relativity and the Atomicity of Becoming,” Review of Metaphysics, 1950-51, pp. 143-186.
- An attack on the notion of time’s flow, and a defense of the treatment of time and space as being continua and of physical processes as being aggregates of point-events. Difficult reading.
- Haack, Susan. Deviant Logic, Cambridge University Press, 1974.
- Chapter 4 contains a clear account of Aristotle’s argument (in section 9c of the present article) for truth value gaps, and its development in Lukasiewicz’s three-valued logic.
- Hawking, Stephen. “The Chronology Protection Hypothesis,” Physical Review. D 46, p. 603, 1992.
- Reasons for the impossibility of time travel.
- Hawking, Stephen. A Brief History of Time, Updated and Expanded Tenth Anniversary Edition, Bantam Books, 1996.
- A leading theoretical physicist provides introductory chapters on space and time, black holes, the origin and fate of the universe, the arrow of time, and time travel. Hawking suggests that perhaps our universe originally had four space dimensions and no time dimension, and time came into existence when one of the space dimensions evolved into a time dimension. He calls this space dimension “imaginary time.”
- Horwich, Paul. Asymmetries in Time, The MIT Press, 1987.
- A monograph that relates the central problems of time to other problems in metaphysics, philosophy of science, philosophy of language and philosophy of action.
- Katzenstein, Larry, ed. Scientific American Special Edition: A Matter of Time, vol. 16, no. 1, 2006.
- A collection of Scientific American articles about time.
- Krauss, Lawrence M. and Glenn D. Starkman, “The Fate of Life in the Universe,” Scientific American Special Edition: The Once and Future Cosmos, Dec. 2002, pp. 50-57.
- Discusses the future of intelligent life and how it might adapt to and survive the expansion of the universe.
- Kretzmann, Norman, “Omniscience and Immutability,” The Journal of Philosophy, July 1966, pp. 409-421.
- If God knows what time it is, does this demonstrate that God is not immutable?
- Lasky, Ronald C. “Time and the Twin Paradox,” in Katzenstein, 2006, pp. 21-23.
- A short, but careful and authoritative analysis of the twin paradox, with helpful graphs showing how each twin would view his clock and the other twin’s clock during the trip. Because of the spaceship’s changing velocity by turning around, the twin on the spaceship has a shorter world-line than the Earth-based twin and takes less time than the Earth-based twin.
- Le Poidevin, Robin and Murray MacBeath, The Philosophy of Time, Oxford University Press, 1993.
- A collection of twelve influential articles on the passage of time, subjective facts, the reality of the future, the unreality of time, time without change, causal theories of time, time travel, causation, empty time, topology, possible worlds, tense and modality, direction and possibility, and thought experiments about time. Difficult reading for undergraduates.
- Le Poidevin, Robin, Travels in Four Dimensions: The Enigmas of Space and Time, Oxford University Press, 2003.
- A philosophical introduction to conceptual questions involving space and time. Suitable for use as an undergraduate textbook without presupposing any other course in philosophy. There is a de-emphasis on teaching the scientific theories, and an emphasis on elementary introductions to the relationship of time to change, the implications that different structures for time have for our understanding of causation, difficulties with Zeno’s Paradoxes, whether time passes, the nature of the present, and why time has an arrow. The treatment of time travel says, rather oddly, that time machines “disappear” and that when a “time machine leaves for 2101, it simply does not exist in the intervening times,” as measured from an external reference frame.
- Lockwood, Michael, The Labyrinth of Time: Introducing the Universe, Oxford University Press, 2005.
- A philosopher of physics presents the implications of contemporary physics for our understanding of time. Chapter 15, “Schrödinger’s Time-Traveller,” presents the Oxford physicist David Deutsch’s quantum analysis of time travel.
- Markosian, Ned, “A Defense of Presentism,” in Zimmerman, Dean (ed.), Oxford Studies in Metaphysics, Vol. 1, Oxford University Press, 2003.
- Maudlin, Tim. The Metaphysics Within Physics, Oxford University Press, 2007.
- Chapter 4, “On the Passing of Time,” defends the dynamic theory of time’s flow, and argues that the passage of time is objective.
- McTaggart, J. M. E. The Nature of Existence, Cambridge University Press, 1927.
- Chapter 33 restates more clearly the arguments that McTaggart presented in 1908 for his A series and B series and how they should be understood to show that time is unreal. Difficult reading. The argument that a single event is in the past, is present, and will be future yet it is inconsistent for an event to have more than one of these properties is called "McTaggart's Paradox." The chapter is renamed "The Unreality of Time," and is reprinted on pp. 23-59 of (LePoidevin and MacBeath 1993).
- Mellor, D. H. Real Time II, International Library of Philosophy, 1998.
- This monograph presents a subjective theory of tenses. Mellor argues that the truth conditions of any tensed sentence can be explained without tensed facts.
- Mozersky, M. Joshua. "The B-Theory in the Twentieth Century," in A Companion to the Philosophy of Time. Ed. by Heather Dyke and Adrian Bardon, John Wiley & Sons, Inc., 2013, pp. 167-182.
- A detailed evaluation and defense of the B-Theory.
- Nadis, Steve. "Starting Point," Discover, September 2013, pp. 36-41.
- Non-technical discussion of the argument by cosmologist Alexander Vilenkin that the past of the multiverse must be finite (there was a first bubble) but its future must be infinite (always more bubbles).
- Newton-Smith, W. H. The Structure of Time, Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1980.
- A survey of the philosophical issues involving time. It emphasizes the logical and mathematical structure of time.
- Norton, John. "Time Really Passes," Humana.Mente: Journal of Philosophical Studies, 13 April 2010.
- Argues that "We don't find passage in our present theories and we would like to preserve the vanity that our physical theories of time have captured all the important facts of time. So we protect our vanity by the stratagem of dismissing passage as an illusion."
- Øhrstrøm, P. and P. F. V. Hasle. Temporal Logic: from Ancient Ideas to Artificial Intelligence. Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1995.
- An elementary introduction to the logic of temporal reasoning.
- Perry, John. "The Problem of the Essential Indexical," Noûs, 13(1), (1979), pp. 3-21.
- Argues that indexicals are essential to what we want to say in natural language; they cannot be eliminated in favor of B-theory discourse.
- Pinker, Steven. The Stuff of Thought: Language as a Window into Human Nature, Penguin Group, 2007.
- Chapter 4 discusses how the conceptions of space and time are expressed in language in a way very different from that described by either Kant or Newton. Page 189 says that t in only half the world’s languages is the ordering of events expressed in the form of grammatical tenses. Chinese has no tenses.
- Pöppel, Ernst. Mindworks: Time and Conscious Experience. San Diego: Harcourt Brace Jovanovich. 1988.
- A neuroscientist explores our experience of time.
- Prior, A. N. “Thank Goodness That’s Over,” Philosophy, 34 (1959), p. 17.
- Argues that a tenseless or B-theory of time fails to account for our relief that painful past events are in the past rather than in the present.
- Prior, A. N. Past, Present and Future, Oxford University Press, 1967.
- A pioneering work in temporal logic, the symbolic logic of time, which permits propositions to be true at one time and false at another.
- Prior, A. N. “Critical Notices: Richard Gale, The Language of Time,” Mind, 78, no. 311, 1969, 453-460.
- Contains his attack on the attempt to define time in terms of causation.
- Prior, A. N. “The Notion of the Present,” Studium Generale, volume 23, 1970, pp. 245-8.
- A brief defense of presentism, the view that the past and the future are not real.
- Putnam, Hilary. "Time and Physical Geometry," The Journal of Philosophy, 64 (1967), pp. 240-246.
- Comments on whether Aristotle is a presentist and why Aristotle was wrong if Relativity is right.
- Russell, Bertrand. "On the Experience of Time," Monist, 25 (1915), pp. 212-233.
- The classical tenseless theory.
- Russell, Bertrand. Our Knowledge of the External World. W. W. Norton and Co., New York, 1929, pp. 123-128.
- Russell develops his formal theory of time that presupposes the relational theory of time.
- Saunders, Simon. "How Relativity Contradicts Presentism," in Time, Reality & Experience edited by Craig Callender, Cambridge University Press, 2002, pp. 277-292.
- Reviews the arguments for and against the claim that, since the present in the theory of relativity is relative to reference frame, presentism must be incorrect.
- Savitt, Steven F. (ed.). Time’s Arrows Today: Recent Physical and Philosophical Work on the Direction of Time. Cambridge University Press, 1995.
- A survey of research in this area, presupposing sophisticated knowledge of mathematics and physics.
- Sciama, Dennis. “Time ‘Paradoxes’ in Relativity,” in The Nature of Time edited by Raymond Flood and Michael Lockwood, Basil Blackwell, 1986, pp. 6-21.
- A good account of the twin paradox.
- Shoemaker, Sydney. “Time without Change,” Journal of Philosophy, 66 (1969), pp. 363-381.
- A thought experiment designed to show us circumstances in which the existence of changeless periods in the universe could be detected.
- Sider, Ted. “The Stage View and Temporary Intrinsics,” The Philosophical Review, 106 (2) (2000), pp. 197-231.
- Examines the problem of temporary intrinsics and the pros and cons of four-dimensionalism.
- Sklar, Lawrence. Space, Time, and Spacetime, University of California Press, 1976.
- Chapter III, Section E discusses general relativity and the problem of substantival spacetime, where Sklar argues that Einstein’s theory does not support Mach’s views against Newton’s interpretations of his bucket experiment; that is, Mach’s argument against substantivialism fails.
- Sorabji, Richard. Matter, Space, & Motion: Theories in Antiquity and Their Sequel. Cornell University Press, 1988.
- Chapter 10 discusses ancient and contemporary accounts of circular time.
- Steinhardt, Paul J. "The Inflation Debate: Is the theory at the heart of modern cosmology deeply flawed?" Scientific American, April, 2011, pp. 36-43.
- Argues that the Big Bang Theory with inflation is incorrect and that we need a cyclic cosmology with an eternal series of Big Bangs and big crunches but with no inflation.
- Thomson, Judith Jarvis. "Parthood and Identity across Time," Journal of Philosophy 80, 1983, 201-20.
- Argues against four-dimensionalism and its idea of objects having infinitely many temporal parts.
- Thorne, Kip S. Black Holes and Time Warps: Einstein’s Outrageous Legacy, W. W. Norton & Co., 1994.
- Chapter 14 is a popular account of how to use a wormhole to create a time machine.
- Van Fraassen, Bas C. An Introduction to the Philosophy of Time and Space, Columbia University Press, 1985.
- An advanced undergraduate textbook by an important philosopher of science.
- Veneziano, Gabriele. “The Myth of the Beginning of Time,” Scientific American, May 2004, pp. 54-65, reprinted in Katzenstein, 2006, pp. 72-81.
- An account of string theory’s impact on our understanding of time’s origin. Veneziano hypothesizes that our Big Bang was not the origin of time but simply the outcome of a preexisting state.
- Whitrow. G. J. The Natural Philosophy of Time, Second Edition, Clarendon Press, 1980.
- A broad survey of the topic of time and its role in physics, biology, and psychology. Pitched at a higher level than the Davies books.
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