John McTaggart Ellis McTaggart (1866-1925)

McTaggartJ. M. E. McTaggart is a British idealist, best known for his argument for the unreality of time and for his system of metaphysics advocating personal idealism. By the early twentieth century, the philosophical movement known as British Idealism was waning, while the ‘new realism’ (later dubbed ‘analytic philosophy’) was gaining momentum. Although McTaggart’s commitment to idealism never faltered, he enjoyed an usually close relationship with several of the new realists. McTaggart spent almost his entire career at Trinity College, Cambridge, and there he taught Bertrand Russell, G. E. Moore and C. D. Broad. McTaggart influenced all of these figures to some degree, and all of them speak particularly highly of his careful and clear philosophical method.

McTaggart studied Hegel from the very beginning of his philosophical career and produced a large body of Hegel scholarship, including the mammoth Studies in Hegelian Cosmology (1901). Towards the end of his career he produced his two volume magnum opus The Nature of Existence (1921 & posthumously 1927), a highly original metaphysical system developing─what McTaggart took to be─Hegel’s ontology. This personal idealism holds that the universe is composed solely of minds and their perceptions, bound into a tight unity by love. However, McTaggart is best known for his influential paper “The Unreality of Time” in which he argues that change and time are contradictory and unreal. This argument, and the metaphysical groundwork it lays down, especially its contrast between his A-series and B-series of time, is still widely discussed.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Philosophical Influences
    1. The British Idealists
    2. The British New Realists
  3. Philosophical Writings
    1. Hegel
    2. Some Dogmas of Religion
    3. The Unreality of Time
    4. The Nature of Existence
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Selected Secondary Sources

1. Biography

McTaggart was born in London on 3 September 1866, the son of Francis Ellis, a county court judge, and his wife Caroline Ellis. McTaggart was born ‘John McTaggart Ellis’ and acquired the name ‘McTaggart’ as a surname when his father adopted it on condition of inheriting an uncle’s wealth. As a boy McTaggart attended a preparatory school in Weybridge, from which he was expelled for his frequent avowal of atheism. He subsequently attended school in Caterham and Clifton College, Bristol. He began studying philosophy at Trinity College, Cambridge in 1885. Once McTaggart began at Trinity, he hardly left: he graduated in 1888 with a first class degree, became a Prize Fellow in 1891, became a lecturer in Moral Sciences in 1897 and stayed until his retirement in 1923. In a letter to a friend, he writes of Cambridge: ‘Unless I am physically or spiritually at Cambridge or Oxford, I have no religion, no keenness (I do not identify them) except by snatches. I must have been made for a don… I learn a good many things there, the chief one being that I am a damned sight happier than I deserve to be’. In addition to being an academic, McTaggart was a mystic. He reports having visions ─ not imaginary, but literal perceptions of the senses ─ conveying the spiritual nature of the world; this may have played a part in his unswerving devotion to idealism. McTaggart investigates the nature of mysticism in “Mysticism” ─ reprinted in his Philosophical Studies (1934) ─ and he takes it to involve an awareness of the unity of the universe.

Beginning in 1891, McTaggart took a number of trips to New Zealand to visit his mother, and it was there that he met his future wife. He married Margaret Elizabeth Bird in New Zealand on 5 August 1899, and subsequently removed her to Cambridge. They had no children. During the first World War, McTaggart worked as a special constable and helped in a munitions factory. McTaggart’s friend Dickinson writes of him, ‘it is essential to remember that, if he was a philosopher by nature and choice he was also a lover and a husband… and a whole-hearted British patriot’ (Dickinson, 1931, 47).

Towards the end of his life McTaggart produced the first volume of his magnum opus The Nature of Existence (1921). He retired shortly afterwards in 1923, and died unexpectedly two years later on 18 January 1925. In his introduction to the second edition of Some Dogmas of Religion, McTaggart’s friend and former student Broad describes McTaggart’s funeral and mentions how one of McTaggart’s favourite Spinozistic passages were read out. It is worth mentioning here that, although McTaggart never contributed to Spinoza scholarship, he admired him greatly ─ perhaps even more than Hegel. McTaggart describes Spinoza as a great religious teacher, ‘in whom philosophical insight and religious devotion were blended as in no other man before or since’ (McTaggart, 1906, 299). The passage from Spinoza was consequently engraved on McTaggart’s memorial bass in Trinity College. McTaggart did not live to see the second volume of The Nature of Existence in print but fortunately the manuscript was largely complete and it was finally published in 1927, under Broad’s careful editorial care. Broad describes McTaggart as follows:

‘Take an eighteenth-century English Whig. Let him be a mystic. Endow him with the logical subtlety of the great schoolmen and their belief in the powers of human reason, with the business capacity of a successful lawyer, and with the lucidity of the best type of French mathematician. Inspire him (Heaven knows how) in early youth with a passion for Hegel. Then subject him to the teaching of Sidgwick and the continual influence of Moore and Russell. Set him to expound Hegel. What will be the result? Hegel himself could not have answered this question a priori, but the course of world history has solved it ambulando by producing McTaggart.’

For further biographical information (and anecdotes) see Dickinson’s (1931) biographical sketch of McTaggart, and Broad’s (1927) notice on McTaggart.

2. Philosophical Influences

McTaggart was active in British philosophy at a time when it was caught between two opposing philosophical currents ─ British Idealism and the New Realism ─ and McTaggart was involved with figures within both of these movements.

a. The British Idealists

McTaggart began his career in British philosophy when it was firmly under the sway of British Idealism, a movement which argues that the world is inherently unified, intelligible and idealist. Due to the influence of Hegel on these philosophers, the movement is also sometimes known as British Hegelianism. The movement began in the latter half of the nineteenth century; J. H. Stirling is generally credited with introducing Hegel’s work to Britain via his book The Secret of Hegel (1865). Aside from McTaggart himself, important figures in British Idealism include T. H. Green, F. H. Bradley, Harold Joachim, Bernard Bosanquet and Edward Caird. Early on, a schism appeared in the movement as to how idealism should be understood. Absolute idealists ─ such as Bradley ─ argued that reality is underpinned by a single partless spiritual unity known as the Absolute. In contrast, personal idealists ─ such as G. F. Stout and Andrew Seth ─ argued that reality consists of many individual spirits or persons. McTaggart firmly endorses personal idealism, the doctrine that he took to be Hegel’s own. In addition to his idealism, McTaggart shared other neo-Hegelian principles. Among these are his convictions that the universe is as tightly unified as it is possible for a plurality of existents to be, that the universe is fundamentally rational and open to a priori investigation, and his disregard for naturalism. On this last point, McTaggart goes so far as to say that, while science may investigate the nature of the universe, only philosophy investigates its ‘ultimate nature’ (McTaggart, 1906, 273).

Nearly all of McTaggart’s early work concerns Hegel, or Hegelian doctrines, and this work forms the basis of the metaphysical system he would later develop in so much detail. A good example of this is his earliest publication, a pamphlet printed for private circulation entitled “The Further Determination of the Absolute” (1893); it is reprinted in McTaggart’s Philosophical Studies. In this defence of idealism, McTaggart’s Hegelian credentials are well established: he repeatedly references Hegel, Green, and Bradley ─ whom he later describes as ‘the greatest of all living philosophers’. McTaggart apparently cared  greatly about this paper. In its introduction, McTaggart apologises for its ‘extreme crudeness… and of its absolute inadequacy to its subject’. In private correspondence (see Dickinson) McTaggart describes the experience of writing it. ‘It has been shown to one or two people who are rather authorities (Caird of Glasgow and Bradley of Oxford) and they have been very kind and encouraging about it… [writing] it was almost like turning one’s heart out’.

b. The British New Realists

Despite his close philosophical ties to British Idealism, McTaggart bucked the trends of the movement in a number of ways. (In fact, Broad (1927) goes so far as to say that English Hegelianism filled McTaggart with an ‘amused annoyance’). To begin with, McTaggart spent his entire career at Cambridge. Not only was Oxford, rather than Cambridge, the spiritual home of British Idealism but Cambridge became the home of new realism. While at Trinity College, McTaggart taught a number of the new realists ─ including Moore, Russell and Broad ─ and held great influence over them. Moore read and gave notes on a number of McTaggart’s works prior to publication, including Some Dogmas of Religion (1906) and the first volume of The Nature of Existence. In his obituary note on McTaggart, Moore describes him as a philosopher ‘of the very first rank’ (Moore, 1925, 271). For more on McTaggart’s influence on Moore, see Baldwin (1990). McTaggart was also involved with some of the realist debates of the time; for example, see his discussion note on Wittgenstein “Propositions Applicable to Themselves”, reprinted in his Philosophical Studies (1906).

As a young philosopher, Russell was so impressed by McTaggart’s paper “The Further Determination of the Absolute” and its doctrine of philosophical love that he used it to woo his future wife. In his autobiography, Russell writes that he remembers wondering as a student ‘as an almost unattainable ideal, whether I should ever do work as good as McTaggart’s’ (Russell, 1998, 129). Later, their relationship soured; McTaggart took a leading role in the expulsion of Russell from his fellowship following Russell’s controversial pacifist wartime writings. For more on this, and on McTaggart’s more general influence on Russell, see Dickinson (1931) and Griffin (1984). McTaggart, Russell and Moore were described at one point as ‘The Mad Tea Party of Trinity’, with McTaggart painted as the Dormouse.

As for Broad, McTaggart describes him as his ‘most brilliant’ pupil. Broad edited the two volumes of McTaggart’s The Nature of Existence, and produced extensive studies of both. Both Moore and Broad heap praise upon McTaggart for his exceptional clarity and philosophic rigour; the lack of these qualities in other idealists played a part in driving both of these new realists away from British Idealism. For example, Broad writes: ‘The writings of too many eminent Absolutists seem to start from no discoverable premises; to proceed by means of puns, metaphors, and ambiguities; and to resemble in their literary style glue thickened with sawdust’ (Broad, 1933, ii). In contrast, Broad says of McTaggart that he ‘was an extremely careful and conscientious writer… [to] be ranked with Hobbes, Berkeley and Hume among the masters of English philosophical prose… [his] style is pellucidly clear’ (Broad, 1927, 308).

Not only did McTaggart enjoy close relationships with the new realists, they shared some basic philosophic tenets. For example, McTaggart and the new realists reject the Bradleyian claim that reality and truth come in degrees. McTaggart argues that there is a ‘confusion’ which leads philosophers to move from one to the other (McTaggart, 1921, 4). McTaggart also rejects the coherence theory of truth espoused by British idealists such as Joachim (and, arguably, Bradley) in favour of the correspondence theory of truth (McTaggart, 1921, 10).

3. Philosophical Writings

a. Hegel

While many of the British idealists studied Hegel, few entered into the murky waters of Hegel scholarship. McTaggart is an exception: Hegel scholarship occupied McTaggart for most of his career. Hegel is a German idealist and his work is notoriously difficult. While some of the British  idealists understood Hegel to be arguing that reality consists of a single partless spiritual being known as the Absolute, McTaggart took Hegel to be arguing for personal idealism.

Hegel is discussed in McTaggart’s very first publication, “The Further Determination of the Absolute” (1893). McTaggart argues that the progress of any idealistic philosophy may be divided into three stages: the proof that reality is not exclusively matter, the proof that reality is exclusively spirit and determining the fundamental nature of that spirit. McTaggart describes Hegel’s understanding of the fundamental nature of spirit as follows. ‘Spirit is ultimately made up of various finite individuals, each of which finds his character and individuality by relating himself to the rest, and by perceiving that they are of the same nature as himself’. The individuals that make up spirit are interdependent, united by a pattern or design akin to an organic unity. McTaggart adds that justifying this ‘would be a task beyond the limits of this paper… it could only be done by going over the whole course of Hegel’s Logic’. One way of understanding the rest of McTaggart’s career is to see that he is making good on his threat to justify Hegel’s understanding of spirit.

Just some of McTaggart’s works on Hegel include Studies in the Hegelian Dialectic (1896), Studies in Hegelian Cosmology (1901) and A Commentary on Hegel’s Logic (1910). A central theme in these books is the question of how the universe, as unified spirit, is differentiated into finite spirits ─ how can a unity also be a plurality? McTaggart takes Hegel to have solved this problem by postulating a unity which is not only in the individuals, but also for the individuals, in that reality is a system of conscious individuals wherein each individual reflects the whole: ‘If we take all reality, for the sake of convenience, as limited to three individuals, A, B, and C, and suppose them to be conscious, then the whole will be reproduced in each of them… [A will] be aware of himself, of B, and of C, and of the unity which joins them in a system’ (McTaggart, 1901, 14). Later, this is exactly the position that McTaggart himself advances. McTaggart also discusses Hegel’s dialectic method at length; this is the process whereby opposition between a thesis and an anti-thesis is resolved into a synthesis. For example, ‘being’ and ‘not being’ are resolved into ‘becoming’. Despite his admiration for this method, McTaggart does not use it in his Nature of Existence; instead of proceeding by dialectic, his argument proceeds via the more familiar method of principles and premises.

There is disagreement within contemporary Hegel scholarship as to how correct McTaggart’s reading of Hegel is. Stern argues that McTaggart’s reading of Hegel bears close similarities to contemporary readings, and that it should be seen as an important precursor (Stern, 2009, 121). In contrast, in his introduction to Some Dogmas of Religion, Broad argues that ‘if McTaggart’s account of Hegelianism be taken as a whole and compared with Hegel’s writings as a whole, the impression produced is one of profound unlikeness’. Similarly, Geach compares McTaggart’s acquaintance with Hegel’s writings to the chapter-and-verse knowledge of the Bible that out-of-the-way Protestant sectarians often have; he adds that the ‘unanimous judgement’ of Hegel scholars appears to be that McTaggart’s interpretations of Hegel were as perverse as these sectarians’ interpretations of the Bible (Geach, 1979, 17).

b. Some Dogmas of Religion

Some Dogmas of Religion (1906) is an exception to McTaggart’s main body of work, in that it assumes no knowledge of philosophy and is intended for general audience. The book covers a large number of topics, from the compatibility of God’s attributes to human freewill. This section picks out three of the book’s central themes: the role of metaphysics, McTaggart’s brand of atheism and the immortality of the soul.

McTaggart defines metaphysics as ‘the systematic study of the ultimate nature of reality’. A dogma is ‘any proposition which has a metaphysical significance’, such as belief in God (McTaggart, 1906, 1). McTaggart argues that dogmas can only be produced by reason ─ by engaging in metaphysics. Science does not produce dogmas, for scientific claims do not aim to express the fundamental nature of reality. For example, science tells us about the laws governing the part of the universe know as ‘matter’ are mechanical. Science does not go on to tell us whether these laws are manifestations of deeper laws, or the will of God (McTaggart, 1906, 13-4). In fact, McTaggart argues that the consistency of science would be unaffected if its object of study ─ matter ─ turned out to be immaterial. To learn about the ultimate nature of the world, we must look to metaphysics, not science.

McTaggart embodies two apparently contradictory characteristics: he is religious and an atheist. The apparent contradiction is resolved by McTaggart’s definition of religion. ‘Religion is clearly a state of mind… an emotion resting on a conviction of a harmony between ourselves and the universe at large’ (McTaggart, 1906, 3). McTaggart aims to define religion as broadly as possible, so as to include the traditional systems ─ such as those of the Greeks, Roman Christians, Judaism and Buddhism ─ and the idiosyncratic ones espoused by philosophers like Spinoza and Hegel. Given this very broad definition of religion, McTaggart’s own system of personal idealism qualifies as religious. However, McTaggart is an atheist, for he denies the existence of God. In Some Dogmas of Religion McTaggart does not argue for atheism, he merely rejects some of the traditional arguments for theism. He defines God as ‘a being that is personal, supreme and good’ (McTaggart, 1906, 186) and argues that theistic arguments do not prove the existence of such a being. For example, the cosmological ‘first cause’ argument claims that if every event must have a cause, including the universe’s very first event, then the first cause must being a which is uncaused: God. McTaggart argues that even if this argument is valid, it does not prove the existence of God, for it does not prove that the first existing being is either personal or good (McTaggart, 1906, 190-1). In The Nature of Existence, McTaggart goes even further than this and argues directly for atheism (McTaggart, 1927, 176-89).

Given that McTaggart denies the reality of time and the existence of God, it may seem strange that he also affirms the immortality of the human soul. However, McTaggart held all three of these claims throughout his life. In Some Dogmas of Religion, McTaggart takes the immortality of the soul as a postulate, and considers objections to it, such as the claim that the soul or self is an activity of the finite human body, or that it cannot exist without it. McTaggart argues that none of these objections are successful. For example, concerning the claim that the self is of such a nature that it cannot exist outside of its present body, McTaggart argues that while we have no evidence of disembodied selves, this shows at most that the self needs some body, not that it needs the body it currently has (McTaggart, 1906, 104-5). McTaggart concludes that the immortality of the soul is at least a real possibility, for souls can move from body to body. He argues that souls are immortal, not in the sense of existing at every time ─ for time does not exist ─ but in the sense that we enjoy a succession of lives, before and after this one. McTaggart calls this the doctrine of the ‘plurality of lives’ (McTaggart, 1906, 116). He goes on to argue that our journey throughout these lives is not guided by chance or mechanical necessity, but rather by the interests of spirit: love, which ‘would have its way’. For example, our proximity to our loved ones is not the product of chance or mechanical arrangement, but is rather caused by the fact that our spirits are more closely connected to these selves than to others. This accounts for phenomena such as ‘love at first sight’: we have loved these people before, in previous lives (McTaggart, 1906, 134-5). In The Nature of Existence, McTaggart puts forward a positive argument for the immortality of the soul and continues to emphasise that love is of the utmost importance. By affirming the immortality of the soul, McTaggart seems to take himself to be following Spinoza in making death ‘the least of all things’ (McTaggart, 1906, 299).

c. The Unreality of Time

McTaggart’s paper “The Unreality of Time” (1908) presents the argument he is best known for. (The argument of this paper is also included in the second volume of The Nature of Existence.) McTaggart argues that the belief in the unreality of time has proved ‘singularly attractive’ throughout the ages, and attributes such belief to Spinoza, Kant, Hegel and Bradley. (In the case of Spinoza, this attribution is arguable; Spinoza describes time as a general character of existents, albeit one conceived using the imagination.) McTaggart offers us a wholly new argument in favour of this belief, and here is its outline.

McTaggart distinguishes two ways of ordering events or ‘positions’ in time: the A series takes some position as present, and orders other positions as running from the past to the present and from the present to the future; meanwhile the B series orders events in virtue of whether they are earlier or later than other events. The argument itself has two steps. In the first step, McTaggart aims to show that there is no time without the A series because only the A series can account for change. On the B series nothing changes, any event N has ─ and will always have ─ the same position in the time series: ‘If N is ever earlier than O and later then M, it will always be, and has always been… since the relations of earlier and later are permanent’. In contrast, change does occur on the A series. For example an event, such as the death of Queen Anne, began by being a future event, became present and then became past. Real change only occurs on the A series when events move from being in the future, to being in the present, to being in the past.

In the second step, McTaggart argues that the A series cannot exist, and hence time cannot exist. He does so by attempting to show that the existence of the A series would generate contradiction because past, present and future are incompatible attributes; if an event M has the attribute of being present it cannot also be in the past and the future. However, McTaggart maintains that ‘every event has them all’ ─ for example, if M is past, then it has been present and future ─ which is inconsistent with change. As the application of the A series to reality involves a contradiction, the A series cannot be true of reality. This does not entail that our perceptions are false; on the contrary, McTaggart maintains that it is possible that the realities which we perceive as events in a time series do really form a non-temporal C series. Although this C series would not admit of time or change, it does admit of order. For example, if we perceive two events M and N as occurring at the same time, it may be that ─ while time does not exist ─ M and N have the same position in the ordering of the C series. McTaggart attributes this view of time to Hegel, claiming that Hegel regards the time series as a distorted reflexion of something in the real nature of the timeless reality. In “The Unreality of Time”, McTaggart does not consider at length what the C series is; he merely suggests that the positions within it may be ultimate facts or that they are determined by varying quantities within objects. In “The Relation of Mind to Eternity” (1909) ─ reprinted in his Philosophical Studies ─ McTaggart goes further than this. He compares our perception of time to viewing reality through a tinted glass, and suggests that the C series is an ordering of representations of reality according to how accurate they are. Our ersatz temporal perception that we are moving through time reflects our movement towards the end point of this series, which is the correct perception of reality. This end point will involve the fact that reality is really timeless, so time is understood as the process by which we reach the timeless. Later still, in the second volume of The Nature of Existence, McTaggart reconsiders this position and argues that while the objects of the C series are representations of reality, they are not ordered by veracity. Instead, McTaggart argues that the ‘fundamental sense’ of the C series is that it is ordered according to the ‘amount of content of the whole that is included in it’: it runs from the less inclusive to the more inclusive (McTaggart, 1927, 362). However, McTaggart does not give up his claim that the C series will reach a timeless end point. For more on this, see The Nature of Existence (1927), chapters 59-61.

Reception to “The Unreality of Time” among McTaggart’s contemporaries was mixed. Ewing describes its implausible conclusion as ‘heroic’, while Broad describes it ‘as an absolute howler’. This argument is probably the most influential piece of philosophy that McTaggart ever produced. Although the paper’s conclusions are rarely endorsed in full, it is credited with providing the framework for a debate ─ between the A and B series of time ─ which is still alive today.  For discussion, see Dummett “A Defence of McTaggart’s Proof of the Unreality of Time” (1960),  Lowe “The Indexical Fallacy in McTaggart’s Proof of the Unreality of Time” (1987) and Le Poidevin & Mellor “Time, Change, and the ‘ Indexical Fallacy’” (1987). For an extended, more recent discussion, see Dainton (2001).

d. The Nature of Existence

McTaggart’s magnum opus aims to provide a comprehensive, systematic a priori description of the world; the conclusion of this system is personal idealism. Broad claims that The Nature of Existence may quite fairly be ranked with the Enneads of Plotinus, the Ethics of Spinoza, and the Encyclopaedia of Hegel (Broad, 1927). The central argument of The Nature of Existence is based on the nature of substance and it is extremely complex. The bare bones of the argument contains three steps but along the way, McTaggart makes use of a number of subsidiary arguments.

In the first step, McTaggart argues that the universe contains multiple substances. McTaggart defines a substance as whatever exists and has qualities, or stands in relations, but is not itself a quality or relation, entailing that the following are all substances: sneezes, parties and red-haired archdeacons (McTaggart, 1921, 73). Given this broad definition, McTaggart argues that at least one substance exists; this is true given the evidence of our senses, and that there is anything around to consider the statement at all. All substances have qualities (today, we would say ‘properties’) such as redness and squareness. If there are multiple substances, then relations hold between them. Although to contemporary philosophers the claim that relations are real is familiar, in the context of British Idealism this is a significant departure from Bradley’s claim that relations are unreal. The qualities and relations possessed by a substance are jointly called its characteristics. McTaggart puts forward two kinds of arguments for the claim that there are multiple substances. Firstly, there are empirical proofs, such as the claim that if I and the things I perceive exist, then there are at least two substances (McTaggart, 1921, 75). Secondly, as we will see below, McTaggart argues that all substances can be differentiated into further substances. If this is true then it follows that if at least one substance exists, many exist.

In the second step, McTaggart places two necessary ontological conditions on the nature of substances ─ they must admit of sufficient descriptions, and they must be differentiated into further substances ─ which results in his theory of determining correspondence.

The first ontological condition McTaggart places on substance is that they must admit of sufficient descriptions. This grows out of McTaggart’s extended discussion of the ‘Dissimilarity of the Diverse’ ─ see Chapter 10 of the first volume of the Nature of Existence ─ which argues that diverse (that is, non-identical) things are dissimilar, that two things cannot have the same nature. This ‘similarity’ involves the properties and relations a substance has. For example, McTaggart argues that if space is absolute then two things will occupy different spatial positions and stand in dissimilar spatial relations. McTaggart discusses the relationship between his principle the ‘Dissimilarity of the Diverse’, and Leibniz’s principle the ‘Identity of Indiscernibles’, which states that two things are identical if they are indiscernible. McTaggart prefers the name of his principle, for it does not suggest that there are indiscernibles which are identical but rather that there is nothing which is indiscernible from anything else. McTaggart goes on to argue that all substances admit of an ‘exclusive description’ which applies only to them via a description of their qualities. For example, the description ‘The continent lying over the South Pole’ applies to just one substance. All substances admit of exclusive descriptions because, given the Dissimilarity of the Diverse, no substance can have exactly the same nature as any other (McTaggart, 1921, 106). There are two kinds of exclusive descriptions: firstly, the kind that introduce another substance into the description, such as ‘The father of Henry VIII’; secondly, the kind known as ‘sufficient descriptions’, which describe a substance purely in terms of its qualities, without introducing another substance into the description, such as ‘The father of a monarch’. McTaggart argues that all substances must admit of sufficient descriptions: all substances are dissimilar to all other substances and as a result they admit of exclusive descriptions. If a substance could not be described without making reference to other substances then we would arrive at an infinite regress (because, as we will see, all substances are differentiated to infinity) and the description would correspondingly be infinite (McTaggart, 1921, 108). Such a regress would be vicious because it would never be completed. As substances do exist, they must admit of sufficient descriptions.

The second ontological condition placed on substances is that they are infinitely differentiated into proper parts which are also substances. By ‘differentiated,’ McTaggart implies that they are divisible and that they are divisible into parts unlike their wholes. To illustrate, a homogeneous ─ that is, uniform ─ liquid akin to milk might be infinitely divisible, but all of its parts would be like their wholes, they would merely be smaller portions of milk. In contrast, a heterogeneous ─ that is, non-uniform ─ liquid akin to a fruit smoothie would be infinitely divisible into parts that are unlike their whole: the whole might contain cherry and orange, while its parts contain pieces of cherry and orange respectively. McTaggart argues that all substances are infinitely differentiated by denying a priori that ‘simple’ partless substances are possible; he does so in two ways. The first way is based on divisibility. Simples would have to be indivisible in every dimension ─ in length, breadth and time ─ and this is impossible because even a substance like ‘pleasure’ has two dimensions, if it lasts for at least two moments of time (McTaggart, 1921, 175). The second way is based on notion of content. A simple substance would be a substance without ‘content’ in that it would lack properties and would not stand in relations. McTaggart argues that it is part of our notion of a substance that they must have a ‘filling’ of some sort ─  an ‘internal structure’ ─ and this could only be understood to mean that they must have parts (McTaggart, 1921, 181). Both of these arguments are somewhat hazy; see Broad (1933) for an extensive discussion and critique.

McTaggart’s full account of parts and wholes ─ which discusses divisibility, simples and composition ─ can be found in the first volume of The Nature of Existence, chapters 15-22. McTaggart endorses the doctrine of unrestricted composition, whereby any two substances compose a further compound substance. It follows from this that the universe or ‘all that exists’ is a single substance composed of all other substances (McTaggart, 1921, 78). While we might doubt the existence of simples (that is, partless atoms) we cannot doubt the existence of the universe because it includes all content (McTaggart, 1921, 172). Given McTaggart’s claim that all substances are differentiated and that unrestricted composition occurs, it follows that all parts and all collections of substances are themselves substances. These dual claims have made their way into an argument within contemporary metaphysics by Jonathan Schaffer. In contemporary parlance, anything that is infinitely divisible into proper parts which also have proper parts is ‘gunky’. One way of understanding McTaggart is to see that he claiming that, while all substances lack a ‘lower’ level ─ because they are gunky, infinitely divisible into further parts ─ all substances have a ‘highest’ level in the form of the universe, a substance which includes all content. Schaffer makes use of this asymmetry of existence ─ the fact that one can seriously doubt the existence of simples but not the existence of the universe as a whole ─ to argue for priority monism (Schaffer, 2010, 61).

With these two ontological conditions in place ─ that substances must admit of sufficient descriptions and be differentiated ─ McTaggart sets out to combine them into his theory of determining correspondence. This theory is extremely difficult and rather obscure; see Wisdom (1928) and Broad (1933). Essentially, McTaggart argues that the two ontological conditions result in contradiction unless substances fulfil a certain requirement. The worry is that a substance A cannot be given a sufficient description in virtue of sufficient descriptions of its parts M, for they can only be described in virtue of a sufficient descriptions of their parts… and so on to infinity. This is a vicious series because the sufficient descriptions of the members of M can only be made sufficient by means of the last stage of an unending series; in other words, they cannot be made sufficient at all (McTaggart, 1921, 199). Of course, as there are substances, they must admit of sufficient descriptions. McTaggart’s way out of this apparent contradiction seems to be to reverse the direction of epistemological priority: we have been considering deducing a sufficient description of a substance in virtue of its parts; instead, we should be deducing sufficient descriptions of the parts in virtue of the substance of which they are a whole. ‘[If] the contradiction is to be avoided, there must be some description of every substance which does imply sufficient descriptions of every part through all its infinite series of sets of parts’ (McTaggart, 1921, 204). The only way to provide such a description is via the law of determining correspondence, which asserts that each part of A is in a one-to-one correspondence with each term of its infinite series, the nature of the correspondence being such that, in the fact that a part of A corresponded in this way to a reality with a given nature, there would be implied a sufficient description of that part of A. The theory of determining correspondence involves a classification of the contents of the universe. The universe is a primary whole and it divides into primary parts, whose sufficient descriptions determine ─ by virtue of the relation of determining correspondence ─ the sufficient description of all further, secondary parts.

In the third step of his argument, McTaggart shows that the only way the nature of substance could comply with the theory of determining correspondence is if substance is spirit. He does this by eliminating the other candidates for the nature of substance, matter and sense data. His objections to both of these rival candidates are similar; we will focus on his rejection of matter. McTaggart argues that while there ‘might’ be no difficulty in the claim that matter is infinitely divisible, there is certainly is difficulty in the claim that matter can allow for determining correspondence (McTaggart, 1927, 33). This is impossible because, in a material object, the sufficient description of the parts determines the sufficient description of the whole, not the other way around. ‘If we know the shape and size of each one of a set of parts of A, and their position relatively to each other, we know the size and shape of A… we shall thus have an infinite series of terms, in which the subsequent terms imply the precedent’ (McTaggart, 1927, 36). As we have already seen above, such a series will involve a contradiction, for the description will never ‘bottom out’. One way out of this contradiction might be to postulate that, at each level of composition, the parts bear a ‘new’ property ─ such as a new colour or taste ─ which would be sufficient to describe them. McTaggart swiftly dispenses with this reply by arguing that it would require matter to possess an infinite number of sorts of qualities ─ ‘one sort for each of the infinite series of grades of secondary parts’ ─ and there is no reason to suppose that matter possesses more than the very limited number of qualities that are currently known to us (McTaggart, 1927, 35). McTaggart briefly considers dividing matter to infinity in time but dismisses the idea because of course, for McTaggart, time is unreal. McTaggart concludes that matter cannot exist. Interestingly, he does not take this conclusion to imply anti-realism about science or common sense, for when those disciplines use terms which assume the existence of matter, what is meant by those terms ‘remains just as true’ if we take the view that matter does not exist (McTaggart, 1927, 53).

Having dispensed with its rivals, McTaggart turns to idealism. Spiritual substances include selves, their parts, and compounds of multiple selves. Idealism is compatible with the theory of determining correspondence when the primary parts of the universe are understood to be selves, and the secondary parts their perceptions which are differentiated to infinity (McTaggart, 1927, 89).   While this does not amount to a positive proof of idealism, it gives us good reason to believe that nothing but spirit exists, for there is no other option on the table (McTaggart, 1927, 115). McTaggart also describes how the universe is a ‘self-reflecting unity’, in that the parts of the universe reflect every other part (McTaggart, 1921, 299). As we saw above, this is the view that McTaggart attributed to Hegel. McTaggart’s system also bears some similarity to the monadism advanced in Leibniz’s Monadology, wherein each monad is a spirit that reflects every other monad. Furthermore, in Leibniz’s system the highest ranks of monads are capable of entering into a community with God of pure love. Similarly, in McTaggart’s system (although there is no divine monarch) the souls are bound together by the purest form of love which results in the purest form of happiness (McTaggart, 1927, 156). These arguments are but developments of principles that McTaggart had espoused his entire life.

This section merely describes the main thread of argument in The Nature of Existence; the work itself covers many more topics. These include the notion of organic unity, the nature of cogitation, volition, emotion, good and evil, and error. Further topics are also covered in McTaggart’s Philosophical Studies, such the nature of causality and the role of philosophy as opposed to science.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • (1893) “The Further Determination of the Absolute”. Pamphlet designed for private distribution only. Reprinted in McTaggart’s Philosophical Studies.
  • (1896) “Time and the Hegelian Dialectic”. Mind Vol. 2, 490–504.
  • (1896) Studies in the Hegelian Dialectic. CUP: GB.
  • (1897) “Hegel’s Treatment of the Categories of the Subjective Notion”. Mind Vol. 6, 342–358.
  • (1899) “Hegel’s Treatment of the Categories of the Objective Notion”. Mind Vol. 8, 35–62.
  • (1900) “Hegel’s Treatment of the Categories of the Idea”. Mind Vol. 9, 145–183.
  • (1901) Studies in Hegelian Cosmology. CUP: Glasgow.
  • (1906) Some Dogmas of Religion. Edward Arnold press: GB.
  • (1908) “The Unreality of Time”. Mind Vol. 17, 457–474.
  • (1909) “The Relation of Time to Eternity” Mind Vol. 18, 343-362.
  • (1910) A Commentary on Hegel’s Logic. CUP: GB.
  • (1916) Human Immortality and Pre-Existence. Edward Arnold Press: GB.
  • (1921) The Nature of Existence I. CUP: London.
  • (1927)The Nature of Existence II. Edited by C. D. Broad. CUP: London.
  • (1934) Philosophical Studies. Edited by S.V. Keeling. Theomes Press: England.
    • [A large collection of McTaggart’s papers]

b. Selected Secondary Sources

  • Baldwin, Thomas (1990). G. E. Moore. Routledge: UK.
    • [Describes the relationship between Moore and McTaggart]
  • Bradley, F. (1920). Appearance and Reality. George Allen & Unwin Ltd: GB
    • [Bradley is the arch British idealist]
  • Broad, C. D. (1927). “John McTaggart Ellis McTaggart 1866-1925”, Proceedings of the British Academy Vol. XIII, 307-334.
  • Broad, C.D. (1933) An Examination of McTaggart’s Philosophy. CUP: GB
  • Dainton, Barry (2001). Time and Space. Acumen Publishing Ltd: GB.
    • [Provides an excellent discussion of McTaggart’s argument on the unreality of time]
  • Dickinson, G. Lowes (1931). J. M. E. McTaggart. CUP: GB.
  • Geach, Peter (1979). Truth, Love and Immortality: an Introduction to McTaggart’s Philosophy. University of California Press: GB.
  • Moore, G.E. (1925). “Death of Dr. McTaggart”, Mind Vol. 34, 269–271.
  • Moore, G.E. (1942). “An Autobiography”, in The Philosophy of G.E. Moore. Tudor Publishing Company: GB.
  • Russell, Bertrand (1998). The Autobiography of Bertrand Russell. Routledge: GB.
  • Schaffer, Jonathan (2010). “Monism: The Priority of the Whole”, Philosophical Review, Vol. 119, pp. 31-76.
    • [Utilises McTaggart’s asymmetry of existence – between the non-existence of simples and the existence of the universe as a whole – in a new way]
  • Stern, Robert (2009). Hegelian Metaphysics. OUP: GB.
    • [Gives an excellent history of the movement, and discusses how close McTaggart’s interpretation of Hegel is to Hegel himself]
  • Wisdom, John. 1928. “McTaggart’s Determining Correspondence of Substance: a Refutation”, Mind Vol. 37, 414–438.


Author Information

Emily Thomas
University of Cambridge
United Kingdom

Categories: Metaphysics, Philosophers