Dualism and Mind
Dualists in the philosophy of mind emphasize the radical difference between mind and matter. They all deny that the mind is the same as the brain, and some deny that the mind is wholly a product of the brain. This article explores the various ways that dualists attempt to explain this radical difference between the mental and the physical world. A wide range of arguments for and against the various dualistic options are discussed.
Substance dualists typically argue that the mind and the body are composed of different substances and that the mind is a thinking thing that lacks the usual attributes of physical objects: size, shape, location, solidity, motion, adherence to the laws of physics, and so on. Substance dualists fall into several camps depending upon how they think mind and body are related. Interactionists believe that minds and bodies causally affect one another. Occasionalists and parallelists, generally motivated by a concern to preserve the integrity of physical science, deny this, ultimately attributing all apparent interaction to God. Epiphenomenalists offer a compromise theory, asserting that bodily events can have mental events as effects while denying that the reverse is true, avoiding any threat to the scientific law of conservation of energy at the expense of the common sense notion that we act for reasons.
Property dualists argue that mental states are irreducible attributes of brain states. For the property dualist, mental phenomena are non-physical properties of physical substances. Consciousness is perhaps the most widely recognized example of a non-physical property of physical substances. Still other dualists argue that mental states, dispositions and episodes are brain states, although the states cannot be conceptualized in exactly the same way without loss of meaning.
Dualists commonly argue for the distinction of mind and matter by employing Leibniz’s Law of Identity, according to which two things are identical if, and only if, they simultaneously share exactly the same qualities. The dualist then attempts to identify attributes of mind that are lacked by matter (such as privacy or intentionality) or vice versa (such as having a certain temperature or electrical charge). Opponents typically argue that dualism is (a) inconsistent with known laws or truths of science (such as the aforementioned law of thermodynamics), (b) conceptually incoherent (because immaterial minds could not be individuated or because mind-body interaction is not humanly conceivable), or (c) reducible to absurdity (because it leads to solipsism, the epistemological belief that one’s self is the only existence that can be verified and known).
Table of Contents
- Platonic Dualism in the Phaedo
- Descartes’ Dualism
- Other Leibniz’s Law Arguments for Dualism
- The Free Will and Moral Arguments
- Property Dualism
- Objections to Dualism Motivated by Scientific Considerations
- The Problem of Other Minds
- Criticisms of the Mind as a Thinking Thing
- References and Further Reading
The most basic form of dualism is substance dualism, which requires that mind and body be composed of two ontologically distinct substances. The term “substance” may be variously understood, but for our initial purposes we may subscribe to the account of a substance, associated with D. M. Armstrong, as what is logically capable of independent existence. (Armstrong, 1968, p. 7). According to the dualist, the mind (or the soul) is comprised of a non-physical substance, while the body is constituted of the physical substance known as matter. According to most substance dualists, mind and body are capable of causally affecting each other. This form of substance dualism is known as interactionism.
Two other forms of substance dualism are occasionalism and parallelism. These theories are largely relics of history. The occasionalist holds that mind and body do not interact. They may seem to when, for example, we hit our thumb with a hammer and a painful and distressing sensation occurs. Occassionalists, like Malebranche, assert that the sensation is not caused by the hammer and nerves, but instead by God. God uses the occasion of environmental happenings to create appropriate experiences.
According to the parallelist, our mental and physical histories are coordinated so that mental events appear to cause physical events (and vice versa) by virtue of their temporal conjunction, but mind and body no more interact than two clocks that are synchronized so that the one chimes when hands of the other point out the new hour. Since this fantastic series of harmonies could not possibly be due to mere coincidence, a religious explanation is advanced. God does not intervene continuously in creation, as the occasionalist holds, but builds into creation a pre-established harmony that largely eliminates the need for future interference.
Another form of dualism is property dualism. Property dualists claim that mental phenomena are non-physical properties of physical phenomena, but not properties of non-physical substances. Some forms of epiphenomenalism fall into this category. According to epiphenomenalism, bodily events or processes can generate mental events or processes, but mental phenomena do not cause bodily events or processes (or, on some accounts, anything at all, including other mental states). (McLaughlin, p. 277) Whether an epiphenomenalist thinks these mental epiphenomena are properties of the body or properties of a non-physical mental medium determines whether the epiphenomenalist is a property or substance dualist.
Still other dualists hold not that mind and body are distinct ontologically, but our mentalistic vocabulary cannot be reduced to a physicalistic vocabulary. In this sort of dualism, mind and body are conceptually distinct, though the phenomena referred to by mentalistic and physicalistic terminology are coextensive.
The following sections first discuss dualism as expounded by two of its primary defenders, Plato and Descartes. This is followed by additional arguments for and against dualism, with special emphasis on substance dualism, the historically most important and influential version of dualism.
The primary source for Plato‘s views on the metaphysical status of the soul is the Phaedo, set on the final day of Socrates’ life before his self-administered execution. Plato (through the mouth of Socrates, his dramatic persona) likens the body to a prison in which the soul is confined. While imprisoned, the mind is compelled to investigate the truth by means of the body and is incapable (or severely hindered) of acquiring knowledge of the highest, eternal, unchanging, and non-perceptible objects of knowledge, the Forms. Forms are universals and represent the essences of sensible particulars. While encumbered by the body, the soul is forced to seek truth via the organs of perception, but this results in an inability to comprehend that which is most real. We perceive equal things, but not Equality itself. We perceive beautiful things but not Beauty itself. To achieve knowledge or insight into the pure essences of things, the soul must itself become pure through the practice of philosophy or, as Plato has Socrates provocatively put it in the dialogue, through practicing dying while still alive. The soul must struggle to disassociate itself from the body as far as possible and turn its attention toward the contemplation of intelligible but invisible things. Though perfect understanding of the Forms is likely to elude us in this life (if only because the needs of the body and its infirmities are a constant distraction), knowledge is available to pure souls before and after death, which is defined as the separation of the soul from the body.
Plato’s Phaedo contains several arguments in support of his contention that the soul can exist without the body. According to the first of the Phaedo‘s arguments, the Argument from Opposites, things that have an opposite come to be from their opposite. For example, if something comes to be taller, it must come to be taller from having been shorter; if something comes to be heavier, it must come to be so by first having been lighter. These processes can go in either direction. That is, things can become taller, but they also can become shorter; things can become sweeter, but also more bitter. In the Phaedo, Socrates notes that we awaken from having been asleep and go to sleep from having been awake. Similarly, since dying comes from living, living must come from dying. Thus, we must come to life again after we die. During the interim between death and rebirth the soul exists apart from the body and has the opportunity to glimpse the Forms unmingled with matter in their pure and undiluted fullness. Death liberates the soul, greatly increasing its apprehension of truth. As such, the philosophical soul is unafraid to die and indeed looks forward to death as to liberation.
A second argument from the Phaedo is the Argument from Recollection. Socrates argues that the soul must exist prior to birth because we can recollect things that could not have been learned in this life. For example, according to Socrates we realize that equal things can appear to be unequal or can be equal in some respects but not others. People can disagree about whether two sticks are equal. They may disagree about if they are equal in length, weight, color, or even whether they are equally “sticks.” The Form of Equality—Equality Itself—can never be or appear unequal. According to Socrates, we recognize that the sticks are unequal and that they are striving to be equal but are nevertheless deficient in terms of their equality. Now, if we can notice that the sticks are unequal, we must comprehend what Equality is. Just as I could not recognize that a portrait was a poor likeness of your grandfather unless I already knew what your grandfather looked like, I cannot reccognize that the sticks are unequal by means of the senses, without an understanding of the Form of Equality. We begin to perceive at birth or shortly thereafter. Hence, the soul must have existed prior to birth. It existed before it acquires a body. (A similar argument is developed in Plato’s Meno (81a-86b).
A third argument from the Phaedo is the Argument from Affinity. Socrates claims that things that are composite are more liable to be destroyed than things that are simple. The Forms are true unities and therefore least likely ever to be annihilated. Socrates then posits that invisible things such as Forms are not apt to be disintegrated, whereas visible things, which all consist of parts, are susceptible to decay and corruption. Since the body is visible and composite, it is subject to decomposition. The soul, on the other hand, is invisible. The soul also becomes like the Forms if it is steadfastly devoted to their consideration and purifies itself by having no more association with the body than necessary. Since the invisible things are the durable things, the soul, being invisible, must outlast the body. Further, the philosophical soul, that becomes Form-like, is immortal and survives the death of the body.
Some of these arguments are challenged even in the Phaedo itself by Socrates’ friends Simmias and Cebes and the general consensus among modern philosophers is that the arguments fail to establish the immortality of the soul and its independence and separability from the body. (Traces of the Affinity argument in a more refined form will be observed in Descartes below). The Argument from Opposites applies only to things that have an opposite and, as Aristotle notes, substances have no contraries. Further, even if life comes from what is itself not alive, it does not follow that the living human comes from the union of a dead (i.e. separated) soul and a body. The principle that everything comes to be from its opposite via a two-directional process cannot hold up to critical scrutiny. Although one becomes older from having been younger, there is no corresponding reverse process leading the older to become younger. If aging is a uni-directional process, perhaps dying is as well. Cats and dogs come to be from cats and dogs, not from the opposites of these (if they have opposites). The Arguments from Recollection and Affinity, on the other hand, presuppose the existence of Forms and are therefore no more secure than the Forms themselves (as Socrates notes in the Phaedo at 76d-e).
We turn now to Descartes’ highly influential defense of dualism in the early modern period.
The most famous philosophical work of René Descartes is the Meditations on First Philosophy (1641). In the Sixth Meditation, Descartes calls the mind a thing that thinks and not an extended thing. He defines the body as an extended thing and not a thing that thinks (1980, p. 93). “But what then am I? A thing that thinks. What is that? A thing that doubts, understands, affirms, denies, wills, refuses, and which also imagines and senses.” (1980, p. 63). He expands on the notion of extension in the Fifth Meditation saying, “I enumerate the [extended] thing’s various parts. I ascribe to these parts certain sizes, shapes, positions, and movements from place to place; to these movements I ascribe various durations” (1980, p. 85). Bodies, but not minds, are describable by predicates denoting entirely quantifiable qualities and hence bodies are fit objects for scientific study.
Having thus supplied us with the meanings of “mind” and “body,” Descartes proceeds to state his doctrine: “I am present to my body not merely in the way a seaman is present to his ship, but . . . I am tightly joined and, so to speak, mingled together with it, so much so that I make up one single thing with it” (1980, p. 94). The place where this “joining” was believed by Descartes to be especially true was the pineal gland—the seat of the soul. “Although the soul is joined to the whole body, there is yet in the body a certain part in which it seems to exercise its functions more specifically than in all the others. . . I seem to find evidence that the part of the body in which the soul exercises its functions immediately is. . . solely the innermost part of the brain, namely, a certain very small gland.” (1952, p. 294). When we wish to “move the body in any manner, this volition causes the gland to impel the spirits towards the muscles which bring about this effect” (1952, p. 299). Conversely, the body is also able to influence the soul. Light reflected from the body of an animal and entering through our two eyes “form but one image on the gland, which, acting immediately on the soul, causes it to see the shape of the animal.” (1952, p. 295-96).
It is clear, then, that Descartes held to a form of interactionism, believing that mental events can sometimes cause bodily events and that bodily events can sometimes cause mental events. (This reading of Descartes-as-interactionist has recently been challenged. See Baker and Morris (1996). Also, Daniel Garber suggests that Descartes is a quasi-occasionalist, permitting minds to act on bodies, but invoking God to explain the actions of inanimate bodies on each other and phenomena where bodies act on minds, such as sensation. See Garber, 2001, ch. 10).
Descartes’ primary metaphysical justification of the distinction of mind and body is the Argument from Indivisibility. He writes, “there is a great difference between a mind and a body, because the body, by its very nature, is something divisible, whereas the mind is plainly indivisible. . . insofar as I am only a thing that thinks, I cannot distinguish any parts in me. . . . Although the whole mind seems to be united to the whole body, nevertheless, were a foot or an arm or any other bodily part amputated, I know that nothing would be taken away from the mind. . .” (1980, p. 97). Decartes argues that the mind is indivisible because it lacks extension. The body, as an object that takes up space, can always be divided (at least conceptually), whereas the mind is simple and non-spatial. Since the mind and body have different attributes, they must not be the same thing, their “unity” notwithstanding.
This Indivisibility Argument makes use of Leibniz’s Law of Identity: two things are the same if, and only if, they have all of the same properties at the same time. More formally, x is identical to y if, and only if, for any property p had by x at time t, y also has p at t, and vice versa. Descartes uses Leibniz’s Law to show that the mind and body are not identical because they do not have all of the same properties. An illustration (for present purposes a property can be considered anything that may be predicated of a subject): If the man with the martini is the mayor, it must be possible to predicate all and only the same properties of both “the man” and “the mayor,” including occupying (or having bodies that occupy) the same exact spatial location at the same time.
Since divisibility may be predicated of bodies (and all of their parts, such as brains) and may not be predicated of minds, Leibniz’s Law suggests that minds cannot be identical to bodies or any of their parts or systems. Although it makes sense to speak of the left or right half of the brain, it makes no sense to speak of half of a desire, several pieces of a headache, part of joy, or two-thirds of a belief. What is true of mental states is held to be true of the mind that has the states as well. In the synopsis of the Meditations, Descartes writes, “we cannot conceive of half a soul, as we can in the case of any body, however small.” (1980, p. 52). The mind has many ideas, but they are all ideas of one indivisible mind.
John Locke argued that awareness is rendered discontinuous by intervals of sleep, anesthesia, or unconsciousness. (Bk.II, ch.I, sect.10). Is awareness then divisible? Locke suggests that the mind cannot exhibit temporal discontinuity and also have thought as its essence. But even if Descartes was wrong to consider the mind an essentially thinking thing, the concept of mind is not reduced to vacuity if some other, positive characteristic can be found by which to define it. But what might that be? (Without some such means of characterizing the mind it would be defined entirely negatively and we would have no idea what it is).
Against Locke, Dualists can argue in several ways. (1) That the mind has both conscious and unconscious thoughts and that Locke’s argument shows only that the mind is not always engaged in conscious reflection, though it may be perpetually busy at the unconscious level. Locke argues that such a maneuver creates grave difficulties for personal identity (Bk.II, Ch.I, sect.11), however, and denies that thoughts can exist unperceived. (2) Dualists can argue that the soul always thinks, but that the memory fails to preserve those thoughts when asleep or under anesthesia. (3) Dualists can argue that the Lockean observation is not relevant to the Argument from Indivisibility because the discontinuity Locke identifies in consciousness is not a spatial discontinuity but a temporal one. The Argument from Indivisibility seeks to show that bodies but not minds are spatially divisible and that argument is not rebutted by pointing out that consciousness is temporally divisible. (Indeed, if minds are temporally divisible and bodies are not, we have an argument for dualism of a different sort).
David Hume, on the other hand, questioned of what the unity of consciousness might consist. The Indivisibility Argument suggests that the mind is a simple unity. Hume finds no reason to grant or assume that the diversity of our experiences (whether visual perception, pain or active thinking and mathematical apprehension) constitute a unity rather than a diversity. For Hume, all introspection reveals is the presence of various impressions and ideas, but does not reveal a subject in which those ideas inhere. Accordingly, if observation is to yield knowledge of the self, the self can consist in nothing but a bundle of perceptions. Even talk of a “bundle” is misleading if that suggests an empirically discoverable internal unity. Thus, Descartes’ commitment to a res cogitans or thing which thinks is unfounded and substance dualism is undermined. (For a contrary view on what constitutes the unity of the self, see Madell’s view that, “What unites all of my experiences…is simply that they all have the irreducible and unanalyzable property of ‘mineness,’” in Nagel, 1986, p. 34, n. 5).
Immanuel Kant replied to Hume that we must suppose or posit the unity of the ego (which he called the “transcendental unity of apperception”) as a preliminary to all experience since without such a unity the manifold of sense-data (or “sensibility”) could not constitute, for example, the experience of seeing a clock. However, Kant agreed that we must not mistake the unity of apperception for the perception of unity—that is, the perception of a unitary thing or substance. Kant also argued that there is little reason to suppose that the mind or ego cannot be destroyed despite its unity since its powers may gradually attenuate to the point where they simply fade away. The mind need not be separated into non-physical granules to be destroyed since it can suffer a kind of death through loss of its powers. Awareness, perception, memory and the like admit of degrees. If the degree of consciousness decreases to zero, then the mind is effectively annihilated. Even if, as Plato and Descartes agree, the mind is not divisible, it does not follow that it survives (or could survive) separation from the body. Additionally, if the mind is neither physical nor identical to its inessential characteristics (1980, p. 53), it is impossible to distinguish one mind from another. Kant argues that two substances that are otherwise identical can be differentiated only by their spatial locations. If minds are not differentiated by their contents and have no spatial positions to distinguish them, there remains no basis for individuating their identities. (On numerically individuating non-physical substances, see Armstrong, 1968, pp. 27-29. For a general discussion of whether the self is a substance, see Shoemaker, 1963, ch. 2).
Descartes’ other major argument for dualism in the Meditations derives from epistemological considerations. After taking up his celebrated method of doubt, which commits him to reject as false anything that is in the slightest degree uncertain, Descartes finds that the entirety of the physical world is uncertain. Perhaps, after all, it is nothing but an elaborate phantasm wrought by an all-powerful and infinitely clever, but deceitful, demon. Still, he cannot doubt his own existence, since he must exist to doubt. Because he thinks, he is. But he cannot be his body, since that identity is doubtful and possibly altogether false. Therefore, he is a non-bodily “thinking thing,” or mind. As Richard Rorty puts it: “If we look in Descartes for a common factor which pains, dreams, memory-images, and veridical and hallucinatory perceptions share with concepts of (and judgments about) God, number, and the ultimate constituents of matter, we find no explicit doctrine. . . . The answer I would give to the question ‘What did Descartes find?’ is ‘Indubitability’” (1979 p. 54). In sum, I cannot doubt the existence of my mind, but I can doubt the existence of my body. Since what I cannot doubt cannot be identical to what I can doubt (by Leibniz’s Law), mind and body are not identical and dualism is established.
This argument is also featured in Descartes’ Discourse on Method part four: “[S]eeing that I could pretend that I had no body and that there was no world nor any place where I was, but that I could not pretend, on that account, that I did not exist; and that, on the contrary, from the very fact that I thought about doubting the truth of other things, it followed very evidently and very certainly that I existed. . . . From this I knew that I was a substance the whole essence or nature of which was merely to think, and which, in order to exist, needed no place and depended on no material things. Thus this ‘I,’ that is, the soul through which I am what I am, is entirely distinct from the body. . .” (1980, p. 18).
The Argument from Indubitability has been maligned in the philosophical literature from the very beginning. Most famously, Arnauld comments in the objections originally published with the Meditations that, “Just as a man errs in not believing that the equality of the square on its base to the squares on its sides belongs to the nature of that triangle, which he clearly and distinctly knows to be right angled, so why am I perhaps not in the wrong in thinking that nothing else belongs to my nature which I clearly and distinctly know to be something that thinks, except that fact that I am this thinking being? Perhaps it also belongs to my essence to be something extended.” (1912, p. 84). Suppose that I cannot doubt whether a given figure is a triangle, but can doubt whether its interior angles add up to two right angles. It does not follow from this that the number of degrees in triangles may be more or less than 180. This is because the doubt concerning the number of degrees in a triangle is a property of me, not of triangles. Similarly, I may doubt that my body is not a property of my body, believing it to be a property of whatever part of me it is that doubts, and that “whatever” may be something extended.
The dualist can reply in two ways. First, he or she may argue that, while doubting the body is not a property of bodies, being doubtable is a property of bodies. Since bodies have the property of being doubtable, and minds do not, by Leibniz’s Law the diversity of the two is established. Second, the dualist may reply that it is always possible to doubt whether the figure before me is a triangle. As such, Arnauld’s supposedly parallel argument is not parallel at all. Similar objections are open against other, more recent rebuttals to Descartes’ argument. Consider, for example, the following parallel argument from Paul Churchland (1988, p. 32): I cannot doubt that Mohammed Ali was a famous heavyweight boxer but can doubt that Cassius Clay was a famous heavyweight boxer. Following Descartes, it ought to be that Ali is not Clay (though in fact Clay was a famous heavyweight and identical to Ali). By way of reply, surely it is possible for an evil demon to deceive me about whether Mohammed Ali was a famous heavyweight boxer. So, the dualist might insist, the case of mind is unique in its immunity from doubt. It is only with reference to our own mental states that we can be said to know incorrigibly.
A third argument in the Meditations maintains that the mind and body must really be separate because Descartes can conceive of the one without the other. Since he can clearly and distinctly understand the body without the mind and vice versa, God could really have created them separately. But if the mind and body can exist independently, they must really be independent, for nothing can constitute a part of the essence of a thing that can be absent without the thing itself ceasing to be. If the essence of the mind is incorporeal, so must be the mind itself.
As noted earlier, dualists have argued for their position by employing Leibniz’s Law in many ingenious ways. The general strategy is to identify some property or feature indisputably had by mental phenomena but not attributable in any meaningful way to bodily or nervous phenomena, or vice versa. For example, some have suggested that mental states are private in the sense that only those who possess them can know them directly. If I desire an apple, I know that I have this desire “introspectively.” Others can know of my desire only by means of my verbal or non-verbal behavior or, conceivably, by inspection of my brain. (The latter assumes a correlation, if not an identity, between nervous and mental states or events). My linguistic, bodily and neural activities are public in the sense that anyone suitably placed can observe them. Since mental states are private to their possessors, but brain states are not, mental states cannot be identical to brain states. (Rey pp. 55-56).
A closely related argument emphasizes that my own mental states are knowable without inference; I know them “immediately.” (Harman, 1973, pp. 35-37). Others can know my mental states only by making inferences based on my verbal, non-verbal or neurophysiological activity. You may infer that I believe it will rain from the fact that I am carrying an umbrella, but I do not infer that I believe it will rain from noticing that I am carrying an umbrella. I do not need to infer my mental states because I know them immediately. Since mental states are knowable without inference in the first person case, but are knowable (or at least plausibly assigned) only by inference in the third person case, we have an authority or incorrigibility with reference to our own mental states that no one else could have. Since beliefs about the physical world are always subject to revision (our inferences or theories could be mistaken), mental states are not physical states.
Some mental states exhibit intentionality. Intentional mental states include, but are not limited to, intendings, such as plans to buy milk at the store. They are states that are about, of, for, or towards things other than themselves. Desires, beliefs, loves, hates, perceptions and memories are common intentional states. For example, I may have a desire for an apple; I may have love for or towards my neighbor; I may have a belief about republicans or academics; or I may have memories of my grandfather.
The dualist claims that brain states, however, cannot plausibly be ascribed intentionality. How can a pattern of neural firings be of or about or towards anything other than itself? As a purely physical event, an influx of sodium ions through the membrane of a neural cell creating a polarity differential between the inside and outside of the cell wall, and hence an electrical discharge, cannot be of Paris, about my grandfather, or for an apple. [Although Brentano goes further than most contemporary philosophers in regarding all mental phenomena as intentional, he argues that "the reference to something as an object is a distinguishing characteristic of all mental phenomena. No physical phenomena exhibits anything similar." (Brentano, 1874/1973, p. 97, quoted in Rey, 1997, p. 23).] Thus, by Leibniz’s Law, if minds are capable of intentional states and bodies are not, minds and bodies must be distinct. (Taylor, pp. 11-12; Rey pp. 57-59).
Another attempt to derive dualism by means of Leibniz’s Law observes that some mental states, especially beliefs, have truth-values. My belief that it will rain can be either true or false. But, the dualist may urge, as a purely physical event, an electrical or chemical discharge in the brain cannot be true or false. Indeed, it lacks not only truth, but also linguistic meaning. Since mental states such as beliefs possess truth-value and semantics, it seems incoherent to attribute these properties to bodily states. Thus, mental states are not bodily states. Presumably, then, the minds that have these states are also non-physical. (Churchland, 1988, p. 30; Taylor, 1983, p. 12).
Although each of these arguments for dualism may be criticized individually, they are typically thought to share a common flaw: they assume that because some aspect of mental states, such as privacy, intentionality, truth, or meaning cannot be attributed to physical substances, they must be attributable to non-physical substances. But if we do not understand how such states and their properties can be generated by the central nervous system, we are no closer to understanding how they might be produced by minds. (Nagel, 1986, p. 29). The question is not, “How do brains generate mental states that can only be known directly by their possessors?” Rather, the relavent question is “How can any such thing as a substance, of whatever sort, do these things?” The mystery is as great when we posit a mind as the basis of these operations or capacities as when we attribute them to bodies. Dualists cannot explain the mechanisms by which souls generate meaning, truth, intentionality or self-awareness.Thus, dualism creates no explanatory advantage. As such, we should use Ockham’s razor to shave off the spiritual substance, because we ought not to multiply entities beyond what is necessary to explain the phenomena. Descartes’ prodigious doubt notwithstanding, we have excellent reasons for thinking that bodies exist. If the only reasons for supposing that non-physical minds exist are the phenomena of intentionality, privacy and the like, then dualism unnecessarily complicates the metaphysics of personhood.
On the other hand, dualists commonly argue that it makes no sense to attribute some characteristics of body to mind; that to do so is to commit what Gilbert Ryle called a “category mistake.” For example, it makes perfect sense to ask where the hypothalamus is, but not, in ordinary contexts, to ask where my beliefs are. We can ask how much the brain weighs, but not how much the mind weighs. We can ask how many miles per hour my body is moving, but not how many miles per hour my mind is moving. Minds are just not the sorts of things that can have size, shape, weight, location, motion, and the other attributes that Descartes ascribes to extended reality. We literally could not understand someone who informed us that the memories of his last holiday are two inches behind the bridge of his nose or that his perception of the color red is straight back from his left eye. If these claims are correct, then some Leibniz’s Law arguments for dualism are not obviously vulnerable to the critique above.
Another argument for dualism claims that dualism is required for free will. If dualism is false, then presumably materialism, the thesis that humans are entirely physical beings, is true. (We set aside consideration of idealism—the thesis that only minds and ideas exist). If materialism were true, then every motion of bodies should be determined by the laws of physics, which govern the actions and reactions of everything in the universe. But a robust sense of freedom presupposes that we are free, not merely to do as we please, but that we are free to do otherwise than as we do. This, in turn, requires that the cause of our actions not be fixed by natural laws. Since, according to the dualist, the mind is non-physical, there is no need to suppose it bound by the physical laws that govern the body. So, a strong sense of free will is compatible with dualism but incompatible with materialism. Since freedom in just this sense is required for moral appraisal, the dualist can also argue that materialism, but not dualism, is incompatible with ethics. (Taylor, 1983, p. 11; cf. Rey, 1997, pp. 52-53). This, the dualist may claim, creates a strong presumption in favor of their metaphysics.
This argument is sometimes countered by arguing that free will is actually compatible with materialism or that even if the dualistic account of the will is correct, it is irrelevant because no volition on the part of a non-physical substance could alter the course of nature anyway. As Bernard Williams puts it, “Descartes’ distinction between two realms, designed to insulate responsible human action from mechanical causation, insulated the world of mechanical causation, that is to say, the whole of the external world, from responsible human action. Man would be free only if there was nothing he could do.” (1966, p. 7). Moreover, behaviorist opponents argue that if dualism is true, moral appraisal is meaningless since it is impossible to determine another person’s volitions if they are intrinsically private and otherworldly.
Property dualists claim that mental phenomena are non-physical properties of physical phenomena, but not properties of non-physical substances. Property dualists are not committed to the existence of non-physical substances, but are committed to the irreducibility of mental phenomena to physical phenomena.
An argument for property dualism, derived from Thomas Nagel and Saul Kripke, is as follows: We can assert that warmth is identical to mean kinetic molecular energy, despite appearances, by claiming that warmth is how molecular energy is perceived or manifested in consciousness. Minds detect molecular energy by experiencing warmth; warmth “fixes the reference” of heat. (“Heat” is a rigid designator of molecular motion; “the sensation of heat” is a non-rigid designator.) Similarly, color is identical to electromagnetic reflectance efficiencies, inasmuch as color is how electromagnetic wavelengths are processed by human consciousness. In these cases, the appearance can be distinguished from the reality. Heat is molecular motion, though it appears to us as warmth. Other beings, for example, Martians, might well apprehend molecular motion in another fashion. They would grasp the same objective reality, but by correlating it with different experiences. We move toward a more objective understanding of heat when we understand it as molecular energy rather than as warmth. in our case, or as whatever it appears to them to be in theirs. Consciousness itself, however, cannot be reduced to brain activity along analogous lines because we should then need to say that consciousness is how brain activity is perceived in consciousness, leaving consciousness unreduced. Put differently, when it comes to consciousness, the appearance is the reality. Therefore, no reduction is possible. Nagel writes:
Experience . . . does not seem to fit the pattern. The idea of moving from appearance to reality seems to make no sense here. What is the analogue in this case to pursuing a more objective understanding of the same phenomena by abandoning the initial subjective viewpoint toward them in favor of another that is more objective but concerns the same thing? Certainly it appears unlikely that we will get closer to the real nature of human experience by leaving behind the particularity of our human point of view and striving for a description in terms accessible to beings that could not imagine what it was like to be us. (Nagel 1974; reprinted in Block et. al. p. 523).
Consciousness is thus sui generis (of its own kind), and successful reductions elsewhere should give us little confidence when it comes to experience.
Some property dualists, such as Jaegwon Kim, liken “having a mind” to “a property, capacity, or characteristic that humans and some higher animals possess in contrast with things like pencils and rocks. . . . Mentality is a broad and complex property.” (Kim, 1996, p. 5). Kim continues: “[Some properties] are physical, like having a certain mass or temperature, being 1 meter long, and being heavier than. Some things—in particular, persons and certain biological organisms—can also instantiate mental properties, like being in pain and liking the taste of avocado.” (p. 6). Once we admit the existence of mental properties, we can inquire into the nature of the relationship between mental and physical properties. According to the supervenience thesis, there can be no mental differences without corresponding physical differences. If, for example, I feel a headache, there must be some change not only in my mental state, but also in my body (presumably, in my brain). If Mary is in pain, but Erin is not, then, according to the supervenience thesis, there must be a physical difference between Mary and Erin. For example, Mary’s c-fibers might are firing and Erin’s are not. If this is true, it is possible to argue for a type of property dualism by arguing that some mental states or properties, especially the phenomenal aspects of consciousness, do not “supervene on” physical states or properties in regular, lawlike ways. (Kim, p. 169).
Why deny supervenience? Because it seems entirely conceivable that there could exist a twin Earth where all of the physical properties that characterize the actual world are instantiated and are interrelated as they are here, but where the inhabitants are “zombies” without experience, or where the inhabitants have inverted qualia relative to their true-Earth counterparts. If it is possible to have mental differences without physical differences, then mental properties cannot be identical to or reducible to physical properties. They would exist as facts about the world over and above the purely physical facts. Put differently, it always makes sense to wonder “why we exist and not zombies.” (Chalmers, 1996, p. 110). (Kim, 169 and following.; Kripke, 1980, throughout; Chalmers, 1996, throughout, but esp. chs. 3 & 4).
Some have attempted to rebut this “conceivability argument” by noting that the fact that we can ostensibly imagine such a zombie world does not mean that it is possible. Without the actual existence of such a world, the argument that mental properties do not supervene on physical properties fails.
A second rebuttal avers that absent qualia thought experiments (and inverted spectra though experiments) only support property dualism if we can imagine these possibilities obtaining. Perhaps we think we can conceive a zombie world, when we really can’t. We may think we can conceive of such a world but attempts to do so do not actually achieve such a conception.
To illustrate, suppose that Goldbach’s Conjecture is true. If it is, its truth is necessary. If, then, someone thought that they imagined a proof that the thesis is false, they would be conceiving the falsity of what is in reality a necessary truth. This is implausible. What we should rather say in such a case is that the person was mistaken, and that what they imagined false was not Goldbach’s Conjecture after all, or that the “proof” that was imagined was in fact no proof, or that what they were really imagining was something like an excited mathematician shouting, “Eureka! So it’s false then!” Perhaps it is likewise when we “conceive” a zombie universe. We may be mistaken about what it is that we are actually “picturing” to ourselves. Against this objection, however, one could argue that there are independent grounds for thinking that the truth-value of Goldbach’s theorem is necessary and no independent reasons for thinking that Zombie worlds are impossible; therefore, the dualist deserves the benefit of the doubt.
But perhaps the physicalist can come up with independent reasons for supposing that the dualist has failed to imagine what she claims. The physicalist can point, for example, to successful reductions in other areas of science. On the basis of these cases she can argue the implausibility of supposing that, uniquely, mental phenomena resist reduction to the causal properties of matter. That is, an inductive argument for reduction outweighs a conceivability argument against reduction. And in that case, the dualist must do more than merely insist that she has correctly imagined inverted spectra in isomorphic individuals. (For useful discussions of some of these issues, see Tye 1986 and Horgan 1987.)
The Ockham’s Razor argument creates a strong methodological presumption against dualism, suggesting that the mind-body split multiplies entities unnecessarily in much the way that a demon theory of disease complicates the metaphysics of medicine compared to a germ theory. It is often alleged, more broadly, that dualism is unscientific and renders impossible any genuine science of mind or truly empirical psychology.
Those eager to defend the relevance of science to the study of mind, such as Paul Churchland, have argued that dualism is inconsistent with the facts of human evolution and fetal development. (1988, pp. 27-28; see also Lycan, 1996, p. 168). According to this view, we began as wholly physical beings. This is true of the species and the individual human. No one seriously supposes that newly fertilized ova are imbued with minds or that the original cell in the primordial sea was conscious. But from those entirely physical origins, nothing non-physical was later added. We can explain the evolution from the unicellular stage to present complexities by means of random mutations and natural selection in the species case and through the accretion of matter through nutritional intake in the individual case. But if we, as species or individuals, began as wholly physical beings and nothing nonphysical was later added, then we are still wholly physical creatures. Thus, dualism is false. The above arguments are only as strong as our reasons for thinking that we began as wholly material beings and that nothing non-physical was later added. Some people, particularly the religious, will object that macro-evolution of a species is problematic or that God might well have infused the developing fetus with a soul at some point in the developmental process (traditionally at quickening). Most contemporary philosophers of mind put little value in these rejoinders.
Others argue that dualism is scientifically unacceptable because it violates the well-established principle of the conservation of energy. Interactionists argue that mind and matter causally interact. But if the spiritual realm is continually impinging on the universe and effecting changes, the total level of energy in the cosmos must be increasing or at least fluctuating. This is because it takes physical energy to do physical work. If the will alters states of affairs in the world (such as the state of my brain), then mental energy is somehow converted into physical energy. At the point of conversion, one would anticipate a physically inexplicable increase in the energy present within the system. If it also takes material energy to activate the mind, then “physical energy would have to vanish and reappear inside human brains.” (Lycan, 1996, 168).
The dualists’ basically have three ways of replying. First, they could deny the sacredness of the principle of the conservation of energy. This would be a desperate measure. The principle is too well established and its denial too ad hoc. Second, the dualist might offer that mind does contribute energy to our world, but that this addition is so slight, in relation to our means of detection, as to be negligible. This is really a re-statement of the first reply above, except that here the principle is valid in so far as it is capable of verification. Science can continue as usual, but it would be unreasonable to extend the law beyond our ability to confirm it experimentally. That would be to step from the empirical to the speculative—the very thing that the materialist objects to in dualism. The third option sidesteps the issue by appealing to another, perhaps equally valid, principle of physics. Keith Campbell (1970) writes:
The indeterminacy of quantum laws means that any one of a range of outcomes of atomic events in the brain is equally compatible with known physical laws. And differences on the quantum scale can accumulate into very great differences in overall brain condition. So there is some room for spiritual activity even within the limits set by physical law. There could be, without violation of physical law, a general spiritual constraint upon what occurs inside the head. (p. 54)
Mind could act upon physical processes by “affecting their course but not breaking in upon them” (1970, p. 54). If this is true, the dualist could maintain the conservation principle but deny a fluctuation in energy because the mind serves to “guide” or control neural events by choosing one set of quantum outcomes rather than another. Further, it should be remembered that the conservation of energy is designed around material interaction; it is mute on how mind might interact with matter. After all, a Cartesian rationalist might insist, if God exists we surely wouldn’t say that He couldn’t do miracles just because that would violate the first law of thermodynamics, would we?
The conservation of energy argument points to a more general complaint often made against dualism: that interaction between mental and physical substances would involve a causal impossibility. Since the mind is, on the Cartesian model, immaterial and unextended, it can have no size, shape, location, mass, motion or solidity. How then can minds act on bodies? What sort of mechanism could convey information of the sort bodily movement requires, between ontologically autonomous realms? To suppose that non-physical minds can move bodies is like supposing that imaginary locomotives can pull real boxcars. Put differently, if mind-body interaction is possible, every voluntary action is akin to the paranormal power of telekinesis, or “mind over matter.” If minds can, without spatial location, move bodies, why can my mind move immediately only one particular body and no others? Confronting the conundrum of interaction implicit in his theory, Descartes posited the existence of “animal spirits” somewhat subtler than bodies but thicker than minds. Unfortunately, this expedient proved a dead-end, since it is as incomprehensible how the mind could initiate motion in the animal spirits as in matter itself.
These problems involved in mind-body causality are commonly considered decisive refutations of interactionism. However, many interesting questions arise in this area. We want to ask: “How is mind-body interaction possible? Where does the interaction occur? What is the nature of the interface between mind and matter? How are volitions translated into states of affairs? Aren’t minds and bodies insufficiently alike for the one to effect changes in the other?”
It is useful to be reminded, however, that to be bewildered by something is not in itself to present an argument against, or even evidence against, the possibility of that thing being a matter of fact. To ask “How is it possible that . . . ?” is merely to raise a topic for discussion. And if the dualist doesn’t know or cannot say how minds and bodies interact, what follows about dualism? Nothing much. It only follows that dualists do not know everything about metaphysics. But so what? Psychologists, physicists, sociologists, and economists don’t know everything about their respective disciplines. Why should the dualist be any different? In short, dualists can argue that they should not be put on the defensive by the request for clarification about the nature and possibility of interaction or by the criticism that they have no research strategy for producing this clarification.
The objection that minds and bodies cannot interact can be the expression of two different sorts of view. On the one hand, the detractor may insist that it is physically impossible that minds act on bodies. If this means that minds, being non-physical, cannot physically act on bodies, the claim is true but trivial. If it means that mind-body interaction violates the laws of physics (such as the first law of thermodynamics, discussed above), the dualist can reply that minds clearly do act on bodies and so the violation is only apparent and not real. (After all, if we do things for reasons, our beliefs and desires cause some of our actions). If the materialist insists that we are able to act on our beliefs, desires and perceptions only because they are material and not spiritual, the dualist can turn the tables on his naturalistic opponents and ask how matter, regardless of its organization, can produce conscious thoughts, feelings and perceptions. How, the dualist might ask, by adding complexity to the structure of the brain, do we manage to leap beyond the quantitative into the realm of experience? The relationship between consciousness and brain processes leaves the materialist with a causal mystery perhaps as puzzling as that confronting the dualist.
On the other hand, the materialist may argue that it is a conceptual truth that mind and matter cannot interact. This, however, requires that we embrace the rationalist thesis that causes can be known a priori. Many prefer to assert that causation is a matter for empirical investigation. We cannot, however, rule out mental causes based solely on the logic or grammar of the locutions “mind” and “matter.” Furthermore, in order to defeat interactionism by an appeal to causal impossibility, one must first refute the Humean equation of causal connection with regularity of sequence and constant conjunction. Otherwise, anything can be the cause of anything else. If volitions are constantly conjoined with bodily movements and regularly precede them, they are Humean causes. In short, if Hume is correct, we cannot refute dualism a priori by asserting that transactions between minds and bodies involve links where, by definition, none can occur.
Some, such as Ducasse (1961, 88; cf. Dicker pp. 217-224), argue that the interaction problem rests on a failure to distinguish between remote and proximate causes. While it makes sense to ask how depressing the accelerator causes the automobile to speed up, it makes no sense to ask how pressing the accelerator pedal causes the pedal to move. We can sensibly ask how to spell a word in sign language, but not how to move a finger. Proximate causes are “basic” and analysis of them is impossible. There is no “how” to basic actions, which are brute facts. Perhaps the mind’s influence on the pineal gland is basic and brute.
One final note: epiphenomenalism, like occasionalism and parallelism, is a dualistic theory of mind designed, in part, to avoid the difficulties involved in mental-physical causation (although occasionalism was also offered by Malebranche as an account of seemingly purely physical causation). According to epiphenomenalism, bodies are able to act on minds, but not the reverse. The causes of behavior are wholly physical. As such, we need not worry about how objects without mass or physical force can alter behavior. Nor need we be concerned with violations of the conservation of energy principle since there is little reason to suppose that physical energy is required to do non-physical work. If bodies affect modifications in the mental medium, that need not be thought to involve a siphoning of energy from the world to the psychic realm. On this view, the mind may be likened to the steam from a train engine; the steam does not affect the workings of the engine but is caused by it. Unfortunately, epiphenomenalism avoids the problem of interaction only at the expense of denying the common-sense view that our states of mind have some bearing on our conduct. For many, epiphenomenalism is therefore not a viable theory of mind. (For a defense of the common-sense claim that beliefs and attitudes and reasons cause behavior, see Donald Davidson.)
The correlation and dependence argument against dualism begins by noting that there are clear correlations between certain mental events and neural events (say, between pain and a-fiber or c-fiber stimulation). Moreover, as demonstrated in such phenomena as memory loss due to head trauma or wasting disease, the mind and its capacities seem dependent upon neural function. The simplest and best explanation of this dependence and correlation is that mental states and events are neural states and events and that pain just is c-fiber stimulation. (This would be the argument employed by an identity theorist. A functionalist would argue that the best explanation for the dependence and correlation of mental and physical states is that, in humans, mental states are brain states functionally defined).
Descartes himself anticipated an objection like this and argued that dependence does not strongly support identity. He illustrates by means of the following example: a virtuoso violinist cannot manifest his or her ability if given an instrument in deplorable or broken condition. The manifestation of the musician’s ability is thus dependent upon being able to use a well-tuned instrument in proper working order. But from the fact that the exhibition of the maestro’s skill is impossible without a functioning instrument, it hardly follows that being skilled at playing the violin amounts to no more than possessing such an instrument. Similarly, the interactionist can claim that the mind uses the brain to manifest it’s abilities in the public realm. If, like the violin, the brain is in a severely diseased or injurious state, the mind cannot demonstrate its abilities; they of necessity remain private and unrevealed. However, for all we know, the mind still has its full range of abilities, but is hindered in its capacity to express them. As for correlation, interactionism actually predicts that mental events are caused by brain events and vice versa, so the fact that perceptions are correlated with activity in the visual cortex does not support materialism over this form of dualism. Property dualists agree with the materialists that mental phenomena are dependent upon physical phenomena, since the fomer are (non-physical) attributes of the latter. Materialists are aware of these dualist replies and sometimes invoke Ockham’s razor and the importance of metaphysical simplicity in arguments to the best explanation. (See Churchland, 1988, p. 28). Other materialist responses will not be considered here.
The problem of how we can know other minds has been used as follows to refute dualism. If the mind is not publicly observable, the existence of minds other than our own must be inferred from the behavior of the other person or organism. The reliability of this inference is deeply suspect, however, since we only know that certain mental states cause characteristic behavior from our own case. To extrapolate to the population as a whole from the direct inspection of a single example, our own case, is to make the weakest possible inductive generalization. Hence, if dualism is true, we cannot know that other people have minds at all. But common sense tell us that others do have minds. Since common sense can be trust, dualism is false.
This problem of other minds, to which dualism leads so naturally, is often used to support rival theories such as behaviorism, the mind-brain identity theory, or functionalism (though functionalists sometimes claim that their theory is consistent with dualism). Since the mind, construed along Cartesian lines, leads to solipsism (that is, to the epistemological belief that one’s self is the only existence that can be verified and known), it is better to operationalize the mind and define mental states behaviorally, functionally, or physiologically. If mental states are just behavioral states, brain states, or functional states, then we can verify that others have mental states on the basis of publicly observable phenomena, thereby avoiding skepticism about other selves.
Materialist theories are far less vulnerable to the problem of other minds than dualist theories, though even here other versions of the problem stubbornly reappear. Deciding to define mental states behaviorally does not mean that mental states are behavioral, and it is controversial whether attempts to reduce mentality to behavioral, brain, or functional states have been successful. Moreover, the “Absent Qualia” argument claims that it is perfectly imaginable and consistent with everything that we know about physiology that, of two functionally or physiologically isomorphic beings, one might be conscious and the other not. Of two outwardly indistinguishable dopplegangers, one might have experience and the other none. Both would exhibit identical neural activity; both would insist that they can see the flowers in the meadow and deny that they are “blind”; both would be able to obey the request to go fetch a red flower; and yet only one would have experience. The other would be like an automaton. Consequently, it is sometimes argued, even a materialist cannot be wholly sure that other existing minds have experience of a qualitative (whence, “qualia”) sort. The problem for the materialist then becomes not the problem of other minds, but the problem of other qualia. The latter seems almost as severe an affront to common sense as the former. (For an interesting related discussion, see Churchland on eliminative materialism, 1988, pp. 43-49.)
We earlier observed that some philosophers, such as Hume, have objected that supposing that the mind is a thinking thing is not warranted since all we apprehend of the self by introspection is a collection of ideas but never the mind that purportedly has these ideas. All we are therefore left with is a stream of impressions and ideas but no persisting, substantial self to constitute personal identity. If there is no substratum of thought, then substance dualism is false. Kant, too, denied that the mind is a substance. Mind is simply the unifying factor that is the logical preliminary to experience.
The idea that the mind is not a thinking thing was revived in the twentieth century by philosophical behaviorists. According to Gilbert Ryle in his seminal 1949 work The Concept of Mind, “when we describe people as exercising qualities of mind, we are not referring to occult episodes of which their overt acts and utterances are effects; we are referring to those overt acts and utterances themselves.” (p. 25). Thus, “When a person is described by one or other of the intelligence epithets such as ‘shrewd’ or ‘silly’, ‘prudent’ or ‘imprudent’, the description imputes to him not the knowledge, or ignorance, of this or that truth, but the ability, or inability, to do certain sorts of things.” (p. 27). For the behaviorist, we say that the clown is clever because he can fall down deliberately yet make it look like an accident We say the student is bright because she can tell us the correct answer to complex, involved equations. Mental events reduce to bodily events or statements about the body. As Ludwig Wittgenstein notes in his Blue Book:
It is misleading then to talk of thinking as of a “mental activity.” We may say that thinking is essentially the activity of operating with signs. This activity is performed by the hand, when we think by writing; by the mouth and larynx, when we think by speaking; and if we think by imagining signs or pictures, I can give you no agent that thinks. If then you say that in such cases the mind thinks, I would only draw your attention to the fact that you are using a metaphor. (1958, p. 6)
John Wisdom (1934) explains: “‘I believe monkeys detest jaguars’ means ‘This body is in a state which is liable to result in the group of reactions which is associated with confident utterance of ‘Monkeys detest jaguars,’ namely keeping ‘favorite’ monkeys from jaguars and in general acting as if monkeys detested jaguars.’” (p. 56-7).
Philosophical behaviorism as developed by followers of Wittgenstein was supported in part by the Private Language Argument. Anthony Kenny (1963) explains:
Any word purporting to be the name of something observable only by introspection (i.e. a mental event)… would have to acquire its meaning by a purely private and uncheckable performance . . . If the names of the emotions acquire their meaning for each of us by a ceremony from which everyone else is excluded, then none of us can have any idea what anyone else means by the word. Nor can anyone know what he means by the word himself; for to know the meaning of a word is to know how to use it rightly; and where there can be no check on how a man uses a word there is no room to talk of “right” and “wrong” use (p. 13).
Mentalistic terms do not have meaning by virtue of referring to occult phenomena, but by virtue of referring to something public in a certain way. To understand the meaning of words like “mind,” “idea,” “thought,” “love,” “fear,” “belief,” “dream,” and so forth, we must attend to how these words are actually learned in the first place. When we do this, the behaviorist is confident that the mind will be demystified.
Although philosophical behaviorism has fallen out of fashion, its recommendations to attend to the importance of the body and language in attempting to understand the mind have remained enduring contributions. Although dualism faces serious challenges, we have seen that many of these difficulties can be identified in its philosophical rivals in slightly different forms.
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Last updated: June 9, 2005 | Originally published: June/9/2005
Categories: Mind & Cognitive Science