Immortality is the indefinite continuation of a person’s existence, even after death. In common parlance, immortality is virtually indistinguishable from afterlife, but philosophically speaking, they are not identical. Afterlife is the continuation of existence after death, regardless of whether or not that continuation is indefinite. Immortality implies a never-ending existence, regardless of whether or not the body dies (as a matter of fact, some hypothetical medical technologies offer the prospect of a bodily immortality, but not an afterlife).
Immortality has been one of mankind’s major concerns, and even though it has been traditionally mainly confined to religious traditions, it is also important to philosophy. Although a wide variety of cultures have believed in some sort of immortality, such beliefs may be reduced to basically three non-exclusive models: (1) the survival of the astral body resembling the physical body; (2) the immortality of the immaterial soul (that is an incorporeal existence); (3) resurrection of the body (or re-embodiment, in case the resurrected person does not keep the same body as at the moment of death). This article examines philosophical arguments for and against the prospect of immortality.
A substantial part of the discussion on immortality touches upon the fundamental question in the philosophy of mind: do souls exist? Dualists believe souls do exist and survive the death of the body; materialists believe mental activity is nothing but cerebral activity and thus death brings the total end of a person’s existence. However, some immortalists believe that, even if immortal souls do not exist, immortality may still be achieved through resurrection.
Discussions on immortality are also intimately related to discussions of personal identity because any account of immortality must address how the dead person could be identical to the original person that once lived. Traditionally, philosophers have considered three main criteria for personal identity: the soul criterion , the body criterion and the psychological criterion.
Although empirical science has little to offer here, the field of parapsychology has attempted to offer empirical evidence in favor of an afterlife. More recently, secular futurists envision technologies that may suspend death indefinitely (such as Strategies for Engineered Negligible Senescence, and mind uploading), thus offering a prospect for a sort of bodily immortality.
Table of Contents
- Semantic Problems
- Three Models of Immortality
- Pragmatic Arguments for the Belief in Immortality
- Plato’s Arguments for Immortality
- A Brief Digression: Criteria for Personal Identity
- Problems with the Resurrection of the Body
- The Technological Prospect of Immortality
- References and Further Reading
Discourse on immortality bears a semantic difficulty concerning the word ‘death’. We usually define it in physiological terms as the cessation of biological functions that make life possible. But, if immortality is the continuation of life even after death, a contradiction appears to come up (Rosemberg, 1998). For apparently it makes no sense to say that someone has died and yet survived death. To be immortal is, precisely, not to suffer death. Thus, whoever dies, stops existing; nobody may exist after death, precisely because death means the end of existence.
For convenience, however, we may agree that ‘death’ simply means the decomposition of the body, but not necessarily the end of a person’s existence, as assumed in most dictionary definitions. In such a manner, a person may ‘die’ in as much as their body no longer exists (or, to be more precise, no longer holds vital signs: pulse, brain activity, and so forth), but may continue to exist, either in an incorporeal state, with an ethereal body, or with some other physical body.
Some people may think of ‘immortality’ in vague and general terms, such as the continuity of a person’s deeds and memories among their friends and relatives. Thus, baseball player Babe Ruth is immortal in a very vague sense: he is well remembered among his fans. But, philosophically speaking, immortality implies the continuation of personal identity. Babe Ruth may be immortal in the sense that he is well remembered, but unless there is someone that may legitimately claim “I am Babe Ruth,” we shall presume Babe Ruth no longer exists and hence, is not immortal.
Despite the immense variety of beliefs on immortality, they may be reduced to three basic models: the survival of the astral body, the immaterial soul and resurrection (Flew, 2000). These models are not necessarily mutually exclusive; in fact, most religions have adhered to a combination of them.
Much primitive religious thought conceives that human beings are made up of two body substances: a physical body, susceptible of being touched, smelt, heard and seen; and an astral body made of some sort of mysterious ethereal substance. Unlike the physical body, the astral body has no solidity (it can go through walls, for example.) and hence, it cannot be touched, but it can be seen. Its appearance is similar to the physical body, except perhaps its color tonalities are lighter and its figure is fuzzier.
Upon death, the astral body detaches itself from the physical body, and mourns in some region within time and space. Thus, even if the physical body decomposes, the astral body survives. This is the type of immortality most commonly presented in films and literature (for example, Hamlet’s ghost). Traditionally, philosophers and theologians have not privileged this model of immortality, as there appears to be two insurmountable difficulties: 1) if the astral body does exist, it should be seen depart from the physical body at the moment of death; yet there is no evidence that accounts for it; 2) ghosts usually appear with clothes; this would imply that, not only are there astral bodies, but also astral clothes – a claim simply too extravagant to be taken seriously (Edwards, 1997: 21).
The model of the immortality of the soul is similar to the ‘astral body’ model, in as much as it considers that human beings are made up of two substances. But, unlike the ‘astral body’ model, this model conceives that the substance that survives the death of the body is not a body of some other sort, but rather, an immaterial soul. In as much as the soul is immaterial, it has no extension, and thus, it cannot be perceived through the senses. A few philosophers, such as Henry James, have come to believe that for something to exist, it must occupy space (although not necessarily physical space), and hence, souls are located somewhere in space (Henry, 2007). Up until the twentieth century, the majority of philosophers believed that persons are souls, and that human beings are made up of two substances (soul and body). A good portion of philosophers believed that the body is mortal and the soul is immortal. Ever since Descartes in the seventeenth century, most philosophers have considered that the soul is identical to the mind, and, whenever a person dies, their mental contents survive in an incorporeal state.
Eastern religions (for example, Hinduism and Buddhism) and some ancient philosophers (for example, Pythagoras and Plato) believed that immortal souls abandon the body upon death, may exist temporarily in an incorporeal state, and may eventually adhere to a new body at the time of birth (in some traditions, at the time of fertilization). This is the doctrine of reincarnation.
Whereas most Greek philosophers believed that immortality implies solely the survival of the soul, the three great monotheistic religions (Judaism, Christianity and Islam) consider that immortality is achieved through the resurrection of the body at the time of the Final Judgment. The very same bodies that once constituted persons shall rise again, in order to be judged by God. None of these great faiths has a definite position on the existence of an immortal soul. Therefore, traditionally, Jews, Christians and Muslims have believed that, at the time of death, the soul detaches from the body and continues on to exist in an intermediate incorporeal state until the moment of resurrection. Some others, however, believe that there is no intermediate state: with death, the person ceases to exist, and in a sense, resumes existence at the time of resurrection.
As we shall see, some philosophers and theologians have postulated the possibility that, upon resurrection, persons do not rise with the very same bodies with which they once lived (rather, resurrected persons would be constituted by a replica). This version of the doctrine of the resurrection would be better referred to as ‘re-embodiment’: the person dies, but, as it were, is ‘re-embodied’.
Most religions adhere to the belief in immortality on the basis of faith. In other words, they provide no proof of the survival of the person after the death of the body; actually, their belief in immortality appeals to some sort of divine revelation that, allegedly, does not require rationalization.
Natural theology, however, attempts to provide rational proofs of God’s existence. Some philosophers have argued that, if we can rationally prove that God exists, then we may infer that we are immortal. For, God, being omnibenevolent, cares about us, and thus would not allow the annihilation of our existence; and being just, would bring about a Final Judgement (Swinburne, 1997). Thus, the traditional arguments in favor of the existence of God (ontological, cosmological, teleological) would indirectly prove our immortality. However, these traditional arguments have been notoriously criticized, and some arguments against the existence of God have also been raised (such as the problem of evil) (Martin, 1992; Smith, 1999).
Nevertheless, some philosophers have indeed tried to rationalize the doctrine of immortality, and have come up with a few pragmatic arguments in its favor.
Blaise Pascal proposed a famous argument in favor of the belief in the existence of God, but it may well be extended to the belief in immortality (Pascal, 2005). The so-called ‘Pascal’s Wager’ argument goes roughly as follows: if we are to decide to believe whether God exists or not, it is wiser to believe that God does exist. If we rightly believe that God exists, , we gain eternal bliss; if God does not exist, we lose nothing, in as much as there is no Final Judgment to account for our error. On the other hand, if we rightly believe God does not exist, we gain nothing, in as much as there is no Final Judgment to reward our belief. But, if we wrongly believe that God does not exist, we lose eternal bliss, and are therefore damned to everlasting Hell. By a calculation of risks and benefits, we should conclude that it is better to believe in God’s existence. This argument is easily extensible to the belief in immortality: it is better to believe that there is a life after death, because if in fact there is a life after death, we shall be rewarded for our faith, and yet lose nothing if we are wrong; on the other hand, if we do not believe in a life after death, and we are wrong, we will be punished by God, and if we are right, there will not be a Final Judgment to reward our belief.
Although this argument has remained popular among some believers, philosophers have identified too many problems in it (Martin, 1992). Pascal’s Wager does not take into account the risk of believing in a false god (What if Baal were the real God, instead of the Christian God?), or the risk of believing in the wrong model of immortality (what if God rewarded belief in reincarnation, and punished belief in resurrection?). The argument also assumes that we are able to choose our beliefs, something most philosophers think very doubtful.
Other philosophers have appealed to other pragmatic benefits of the belief in immortality. Immanuel Kant famously rejected in his Critique of Pure Reason the traditional arguments in favor of the existence of God; but in his Critique of Practical Reason he put forth a so-called ‘moral argument’. The argument goes roughly as follows: belief in God and immortality is a prerequisite for moral action; if people do not believe there is a Final Judgment administered by God to account for deeds, there will be no motivation to be good. In Kant’s opinion, human beings seek happiness. But in order for happiness to coincide with moral action, the belief in an afterlife is necessary, because moral action does not guarantee happiness. Thus, the only way that a person may be moral and yet preserve happiness, is by believing that there will be an afterlife justice that will square morality with happiness. Perhaps Kant’s argument is more eloquently expressed in Ivan Karamazov’s (a character from Dostoevsky’s The Brothers Karamazov) famous phrase: “If there is no God, then everything is permitted… if there is no immortality, there is no virtue”.
The so-called ‘moral argument’ has been subject to some criticism. Many philosophers have argued that it is indeed possible to construe secular ethics, where appeal to God is unnecessary to justify morality. The question “why be moral?” may be answered by appealing to morality itself, to the need for cooperation, or simply, to one’s own pleasure (Singer, 1995; Martin, 1992). A vigilant God does not seem to be a prime need in order for man to be good. If these philosophers are right, the lack of belief in immortality would not bring about the collapse of morality. Some contemporary philosophers, however, align with Kant and believe that secular morality is shallow, as it does not satisfactorily account for acts of sacrifice that go against self-interest; in their view, the only way to account for such acts is by appealing to a Divine Judge (Mavrodes, 1995).
Yet another pragmatic argument in favor of the belief in immortality appeals to the need to find meaning in life. Perhaps Miguel de Unamuno’s Del sentimiento tràgico de la vida is the most emblematic philosophical treatise advocating this argument: in Unamuno’s opinion, belief in immortality is irrational, but nevertheless necessary to avoid desperation in the face of life’s absurdity. Only by believing that our lives will have an ever-lasting effect, do we find motivation to continue to live. If, on the contrary, we believe that everything will ultimately come to an end and nothing will survive, it becomes pointless to carry on any activity.
Of course, not all philosophers would agree. Some philosophers would argue that, on the contrary, the awareness that life is temporal and finite makes living more meaningful, in as much as we better appreciate opportunities (Heidegger, 1978). Bernard Williams has argued that, should life continue indefinitely, it would be terribly boring, and therefore, pointless (Williams, 1976). Some philosophers, however, counter that some activities may be endlessly repeated without ever becoming boring; furthermore, a good God would ensure that we never become bored in Heaven (Fischer, 2009).
Death strikes fear and anguish in many of us, and some philosophers argue that the belief in immortality is a much needed resource to cope with that fear. But, Epicurus famously argued that it is not rational to fear death, for two main reasons: 1) in as much as death is the extinction of consciousness, we are not aware of our condition (“if death is, I am not; if I am, death is not”); 2) in the same manner that we do not worry about the time that has passed before we were born, we should not worry about the time that will pass after we die (Rist, 1972).
At any rate, pragmatic arguments in favor of the belief in immortality are also critiqued on the grounds that the pragmatic benefits of a belief bear no implications on its truth. In other words, the fact that a belief is beneficial does not make it true. In the analytic tradition, philosophers have long argued for and against the pragmatic theory of truth, and depending on how this theory is valued, it will offer a greater or lesser plausibility to the arguments presented above.
Plato was the first philosopher to argue, not merely in favor of the convenience of accepting the belief in immortality, but for the truth of the belief itself. His Phaedo is a dramatic representation of Socrates’ final discussion with his disciples, just before drinking the hemlock. Socrates shows no sign of fear or concern, for he is certain that he will survive the death of his body. He presents three main arguments to support his position, and some of these arguments are still in use today.
First, Socrates appeals to cycles and opposites. He believes that everything has an opposite that is implied by it. And, as in cycles, things not only come from opposites, but also go towards opposites. Thus, when something is hot, it was previously cold; or when we are awake, we were previously asleep; but when we are asleep, we shall be awake once again. In the same manner, life and death are opposites in a cycle. Being alive is opposite to being dead. And, in as much as death comes from life, life must come from death. We come from death, and we go towards death. But, again, in as much as death comes from life, it will also go towards life. Thus, we had a life before being born, and we shall have a life after we die.
Most philosophers have not been persuaded by this argument. It is very doubtful that everything has an opposite (What is the opposite of a computer?) And, even if everything had an opposite, it is doubtful that everything comes from its opposite, or even that everything goes towards its opposite.
Socrates also appeals to the theory of reminiscence, the view that learning is really a process of ‘remembering’ knowledge from past lives. The soul must already exist before the birth of the body, because we seem to know things that were not available to us. Consider the knowledge of equality. If we compare two sticks and we realize they are not equal, we form a judgment on the basis of a previous knowledge of ‘equality’ as a form. That knowledge must come from previous lives. Therefore, this is an argument in favor of the transmigration of souls (that is, reincarnation or metempsychosis).
Some philosophers would dispute the existence of the Platonic forms, upon which this argument rests. And, the existence of innate ideas does not require the appeal to previous lives. Perhaps we are hard-wired by our brains to believe certain things; thus, we may know things that were not available to us previously.
Yet another of Socrates’ arguments appeals to the affinity between the soul and the forms. In Plato’s understanding, forms are perfect, immaterial and eternal. And, in as much as the forms are intelligible, but not sensible, only the soul can apprehend them. In order to apprehend something, the thing apprehending must have the same nature as the thing apprehended. The soul, then, shares the attributes of the forms: it is immaterial and eternal, and hence, immortal.
Again, the existence of the Platonic forms should not be taken for granted, and for this reason, this is not a compelling argument. Furthermore, it is doubtful that the thing apprehending must have the same nature as the thing apprehended: a criminologist need not be a criminal in order to apprehend the nature of crime.
Plato’s arguments take for granted that souls exist; he only attempts to prove that they are immortal. But, a major area of discussion in the philosophy of mind is the existence of the soul. One of the doctrines that hold that the soul does exist is called ‘dualism’; its name comes from the fact that it postulates that human beings are made up of two substances: body and soul. Arguments in favor of dualism are indirectly arguments in favor of immortality, or at least in favor of the possibility of survival of death. For, if the soul exists, it is an immaterial substance. And, in as much as it is an immaterial substance, it is not subject to the decomposition of material things; hence, it is immortal.
Most dualists agree that the soul is identical to the mind, yet different from the brain or its functions. Some dualists believe the mind may be some sort of emergent property of the brain: it depends on the brain, but it is not identical to the brain or its processes. This position is often labeled ‘property dualism’, but here we are concerned with substance dualism, that is, the doctrine that holds that the mind is a separate substance (and not merely a separate property) from the body, and therefore, may survive the death of the body (Swinburne, 1997).
René Descartes is usually considered the father of dualism, as he presents some very ingenuous arguments in favor of the existence of the soul as a separate substance (Descartes, 1980). In perhaps his most celebrated argument, Descartes invites a thought experiment: imagine you exist, but not your body. You wake up in the morning, but as you approach the mirror, you do not see yourself there. You try to reach your face with your hand, but it is thin air. You try to scream, but no sound comes out. And so on.
Now, Descartes believes that it is indeed possible to imagine such a scenario. But, if one can imagine the existence of a person without the existence of the body, then persons are not constituted by their bodies, and hence, mind and body are two different substances. If the mind were identical to the body, it would be impossible to imagine the existence of the mind without imagining at the same time the existence of the body.
This argument has been subject to much scrutiny. Dualists certainly believe it is a valid one, but it is not without its critics. Descartes seems to assume that everything that is imaginable is possible. Indeed, many philosophers have long agreed that imagination is a good guide as to what is possible (Hume, 2010). But, this criterion is disputed. Imagination seems to be a psychological process, and thus not strictly a logical process. Therefore, perhaps we can imagine scenarios that are not really possible. Consider the Barber Paradox. At first, it seems possible that, in a town, a man shaves only those persons that shave themselves. We may perhaps imagine such a situation, but logically there cannot be such a situation, as Bertrand Russell showed. The lesson to be learned is that imagination might not be a good guide to possibility. And, although Descartes appears to have no trouble imagining an incorporeal mind, such a scenario might not be possible. However, dualists may argue that there is no neat difference between a psychological and a logical process, as logic seems to be itself a psychological process.
Descartes presents another argument. As Leibniz would later formalize in the Principle of Identity of Indiscernibles, two entities can be considered identical, if and only if, they exhaustively share the same attributes. Descartes exploits this principle, and attempts to find a property of the mind not shared by the body (or vice versa), in order to argue that they are not identical, and hence, are separate substances.
Descartes states: “There is a great difference between a mind and a body, because the body, by its very nature, is something divisible, whereas the mind is plainly indivisible. . . insofar as I am only a thing that thinks, I cannot distinguish any parts in me. . . . Although the whole mind seems to be united to the whole body, nevertheless, were a foot or an arm or any other bodily part amputated, I know that nothing would be taken away from the mind” (Descartes, 1980: 97).
Descartes believed, then, that mind and body cannot be the same substance. Descartes put forth another similar argument: the body has extension in space, and as such, it can be attributed physical properties. We may ask, for instance, what the weight of a hand is, or what the longitude of a leg is. But the mind has no extension, and therefore, it has no physical properties. It makes no sense to ask what the color of the desire to eat strawberries is, or what the weight of Communist ideology is. If the body has extension, and the mind has no extension, then the mind can be considered a separate substance.
Yet another of Descartes’ arguments appeals to some difference between mind and body. Descartes famously contemplated the possibility that an evil demon might be deceiving him about the world. Perhaps the world is not real. In as much as that possibility exists, Descartes believed that one may be doubt the existence of one’s own body. But, Descartes argued that one cannot doubt the existence of one’s own mind. For, if one doubts, one is thinking; and if one thinks, then it can be taken for certain that one’s mind exists. Hence Descartes famous phrase: “cogito ergo sum”, I think, therefore, I exist. Now, if one may doubt the existence of one’s body, but cannot doubt the existence of one’s mind, then mind and body are different substances. For, again, they do not share exhaustively the same attributes.
These arguments are not without critics. Indeed, Leibniz’s Principle of Indiscernibles would lead us to think that, in as much as mind and body do not exhaustively share the same properties, they cannot be the same substance. But, in some contexts, it seems possible that A and B may be identical, even if that does not imply that everything predicated of A can be predicated of B.
Consider, for example, a masked man that robs a bank. If we were to ask a witness whether or not the masked man robbed the bank, the witness will answer “yes!”. But, if we were to ask the witness whether his father robbed the bank, he may answer “no”. That, however, does not imply that the witness’ father is not the bank robber: perhaps the masked man was the witness’ father, and the witness was not aware of it. This is the so-called ‘Masked Man Fallacy’.
This case forces us to reconsider Leibniz’s Law: A is identical to B, not if everything predicated of A is predicated of B, but rather, when A and B share exhaustively the same properties. And, what people believe about substances are not properties. To be an object of doubt is not, strictly speaking, a property, but rather, an intentional relation. And, in our case, to be able to doubt the body’s existence, but not the mind’s existence, does not imply that mind and body are not the same substance.
In more recent times, Descartes’ strategy has been used by other dualist philosophers to account for the difference between mind and body. Some philosophers argue that the mind is private, whereas the body is not. Any person may know the state of my body, but no person, including even possibly myself, can truly know the state of my mind.
Some philosophers point ‘intentionality’ as another difference between mind and body. The mind has intentionality, whereas the body does not. Thoughts are about something, whereas body parts are not. In as much as thoughts have intentionality, they may also have truth values. Not all thoughts, of course, are true or false, but at least those thoughts that pretend to represent the world, may be. On the other hand, physical states do not have truth values: neurons activating in the brain are neither ‘true’, nor ‘false’.
Again, these arguments exploit the differences between mind and body. But, very much as with Descartes’ arguments, it is not absolutely clear that they avoid the Masked Man Fallacy.
Opponents of dualism not only reject their arguments; they also highlight conceptual and empirical problems with this doctrine. Most opponents of dualism are materialists: they believe that mental stuff is really identical to the brain, or at the most, an epiphenomenon of the brain. Materialism limits the prospects for immortality: if the mind is not a separate substance from the brain, then at the time of the brain’s death, the mind also becomes extinct, and hence, the person does not survive death. Materialism need not undermine all expectations of immortality (see resurrection below), but it does undermine the immortality of the soul.
The main difficulty with dualism is the so-called ‘interaction problem’. If the mind is an immaterial substance, how can it interact with material substances? The desire to move my hand allegedly moves my hand, but how exactly does that occur? There seems to be an inconsistency with the mind’s immateriality: some of the time, the mind is immaterial and is not affected by material states, at other times, the mind manages to be in contact with the body and cause its movement. Daniel Dennett has ridiculed this inconsistency by appealing to the comic-strip character Casper. This friendly ghost is immaterial because he is able to go through walls. But, all of a sudden, he is also able to catch a ball. The same inconsistency appears with dualism: in its interaction with the body, sometimes the mind does not interact with the body, sometimes it does (Dennett, 1992).Dualists have offered some solutions to this problem. Occasionalists hold that God directly causes material events. Thus, mind and body never interact. Likewise, parallelists hold that mental and physical events are coordinated by God so that they appear to cause each other, but in fact, they do not. These alternatives are in fact rejected by most contemporary philosophers.
Some dualists, however, may reply that the fact that we cannot fully explain how body and soul interact, does not imply that interaction does not take place. We know many things happen in the universe, although we do not know how they happen. Richard Swinburne, for instance, argues as follows: “That bodily events cause brain events and that these cause pains, images, and beliefs (where their subjects have privileged access to the latter and not the former), is one of the most obvious phenomena of human experience. If we cannot explain how that occurs, we should not try to pretend that it does not occur. We should just acknowledge that human beings are not omniscient, and cannot understand everything” (Swinburne, 1997, xii).
On the other hand, Dualism postulates the existence of an incorporeal mind, but it is not clear that this is a coherent concept. In the opinion of most dualists, the incorporeal mind does perceive. But, it is not clear how the mind can perceive without sensory organs. Descartes seemed to have no problems in imagining an incorporeal existence, in his thought experiment. However, John Hospers, for instance, believes that such a scenario is simply not imaginable:
You see with eyes? No, you have no eyes, since you have no body. But let that pass for a moment; you have experiences similar to what you would have if you had eyes to see with. But how can you look toward the foot of the bed or toward the mirror? Isn’t looking an activity that requires having a body? How can you look in one direction or another if you have no head to turn? And this isn’t all; we said that you can’t touch your body because there is no body there; how did you discover this?… Your body seems to be involved in every activity we try to describe even though we have tried to imagine existing without it. (Hospers, 1997: 280)
Furthermore, even if an incorporeal existence were in fact possible, it could be terribly lonely. For, without a body, could it be possible to communicate with other minds. In Paul Edward’s words: “so far from living on in paradise, a person deprived of his body and thus of all sense organs would, quite aside from many other gruesome deprivations, be in a state of desolate loneliness and eventually come to prefer annihilation”. (Edwards, 1997:48). However, consider that, even in the absence of a body, great pleasures may be attained. We may live in a situation the material world is an illusion (in fact, idealists inspired in Berkley lean towards such a position), and yet, enjoy existence. For, even without a body, we may enjoy sensual pleasures that, although not real, certainly feel real. However, the problems with dualism do not end there. If souls are immaterial and have no spatial extension, how can they be separate from other souls? Separation implies extension. Yet, if the soul has no extension, it is not at all clear how one soul can be distinguished from another. Perhaps souls can be distinguished based on their contents, but then again, how could we distinguish two souls with exactly the same contents? Some contemporary dualists have responded thus: in as much as souls interact with bodies, they have a spatial relationships to bodies, and in a sense, can be individuated.
Perhaps the most serious objection to dualism, and a substantial argument in favor of materialism, is the mind’s correlation with the brain. Recent developments in neuroscience increasingly confirm that mental states depend upon brain states. Neurologists have been able to identify certain regions of the brain associated with specific mental dispositions. And, in as much as there appears to be a strong correlation between mind and brain, it seems that the mind may be reducible to the brain, and would therefore not be a separate substance.
In the last recent decades, neuroscience has accumulated data that confirm that cerebral damage has a great influence on the mental constitution of persons. Phineas Gage’s case is well-known in this respect: Gage had been a responsible and kind railroad worker, but had an accident that resulted in damage to the frontal lobes of his brain. Ever since, Gage turned into an aggressive, irresponsible person, unrecognizable by his peers (Damasio, 2006).
Departing from Gage’s case, scientists have inferred that frontal regions of the brain strongly determine personality. And, if mental contents can be severely damaged by brain injuries, it does not seem right to postulate that the mind is an immaterial substance. If, as dualism postulates, Gage had an immortal immaterial soul, why didn’t his soul remain intact after his brain injury?
A similar difficulty arises when we consider degenerative neurological diseases, such as Alzheimer’s disease. As it is widely known, this disease progressively eradicates the mental contents of patients, until patients lose memory almost completely. If most memories eventually disappear, what remains of the soul? When a patient afflicted with Alzheimer dies, what is it that survives, if precisely, most of his memories have already been lost? Of course, correlation is not identity, and the fact that the brain is empirically correlated with the mind does not imply that the mind is the brain. But, many contemporary philosophers of mind adhere to the so-called ‘identity theory’: mental states are the exact same thing as the firing of specific neurons.
Dualists may respond by claiming that the brain is solely an instrument of the soul. If the brain does not work properly, the soul will not work properly, but brain damage does not imply a degeneration of the soul. Consider, for example, a violinist. If the violin does not play accurately, the violinist will not perform well. But, that does not imply that the violinist has lost their talent. In the same manner, a person may have a deficient brain, and yet, retain her soul intact. However, Occam’s Razor requires the more parsimonious alternative: in which case, unless there is any compelling evidence in its favor, there is no need to assume the existence of a soul that uses the brain as its instrument.
Dualists may also suggest that the mind is not identical to the soul. In fact, whereas many philosophers tend to consider the soul and mind identical, various religions consider that a person is actually made up of by three substances: body, mind and soul. In such a view, even if the mind degenerates, the soul remains. However, it would be far from clear what the soul exactly could be, if it is not identical to the mind.
Any philosophical discussion on immortality touches upon a fundamental issue concerning persons–personal identity. If we hope to survive death, we would want to be sure that the person that continues to exist after death is the same person that existed before death. And, for religions that postulate a Final Judgment, this is a crucial matter: if God wants to apply justice, the person rewarded or punished in the afterlife must be the very same person whose deeds determine the outcome.
The question of personal identity refers to the criterion upon which a person remains the same (that is, numerical identity) throughout time. Traditionally, philosophers have discussed three main criteria: soul, body and psychological continuity.
According to the soul criterion for personal identity, persons remains the same throughout time, if and only if, they retain their soul (Swinburne, 2004). Philosophers who adhere to this criterion usually do not think the soul is identical to the mind. The soul criterion is favored by very few philosophers, as it faces a huge difficulty: if the soul is an immaterial non-apprehensible substance (precisely, in as much as it is not identical to the mind), how can we be sure that a person continues to be the same? We simply do not know if, in the middle of the night, our neighbor’s soul has transferred into another body. Even if our neighbor’s body and mental contents remain the same, we can never know if his soul is the same. Under this criterion, it appears that there is simply no way to make sure someone is always the same person.
However, there is a considerable argument in favor of the soul criterion. To pursue such an argument, Richard Swinburne proposes the following thought experiment: suppose John’s brain is successfully split in two, and as a result, we get two persons; one with the left hemisphere of John’s brain, the other with the right hemisphere. Now, which one is John? Both have a part of John’s brain, and both conserve part of John’s mental contents. So, one of them must presumably be John, but which one? Unlike the body and the mind, the soul is neither divisible nor duplicable. Thus, although we do not know which would be John, we do know that only one of the two persons is John. And it would be the person that preserves John’s souls, even if we have no way of identifying it. In such a manner, although we know about John’s body and mind, we are not able to discern who is John; therefore, John’s identity is not his mind or his body, but rather, his soul (Swinburne, 2010: 68).
Common sense informs that persons are their bodies (in fact, that is how we recognize people ) but, although many philosophers would dispute this, ordinary people seem generally to adhere to such a view). Thus, under this criterion, a person continues to be the same, if, and only if, they conserve the same body. Of course, the body alters, and eventually, all of its cells are replaced. This evokes the ancient philosophical riddle known as the Ship of Theseus: the planks of Theseus’ ship were gradually replaced, until none of the originals remained. Is it still the same ship? There has been much discussion on this, but most philosophers agree that, in the case of the human body, the total replacement of atoms and the slight alteration of form do not alter the numerical identity of the human body.
However, the body criterion soon runs into difficulties. Imagine two patients, Brown and Robinson, who undergo surgery simultaneously. Accidentally, their brains are swapped in placed in the wrong body. Thus, Brown’s brain is placed in Robinson’s body. Let us call this person Brownson. Naturally, in as much as he has Brown’s brain, he will have Brown’s memories, mental contents, and so forth. Now, who is Brownson? Is he Robinson with Brown’s brain; or is he Brown with Robinson’s body? Most people would think the latter (Shoemaker, 2003). After all, the brain is the seat of consciousness.
Thus, it would appear that the body criterion must give way to the brain criterion: a person continues to be the same, if and only if, she conserves the same brain. But, again, we run into difficulties. What if the brain undergoes fission, and each half is placed in a new body? (Parfit, 1984). As a result, we would have two persons pretending to be the original person, but, because of the principle of transitivity, we know that both of them cannot be the original person. And, it seems arbitrary that one of them should be the original person, and not the other (although, as we have seen, Swinburne bites the bullet, and considers that, indeed, only one would be the original person). This difficulty invites the consideration of other criteria for personal identity.
John Locke famously asked what we would think if a prince one day woke up in a cobbler’s body, and the cobbler in a prince’s body (Locke, 2009). Although the cobbler’s peers would recognize him as the cobbler, he would have the memories of the prince. Now, if before that event, the prince committed a crime, who should be punished? Should it be the man in the palace, who remembers being a cobbler; or should it be the man in the workshop, who remembers being a prince, including his memory of the crime?
It seems that the man in the workshop should be punished for the prince’s crime, because, even if that is not the prince’s original body, that person is the prince, in as much as he conserves his memories. Locke, therefore, believed that a person continues to be the same, if and only if, she conserves psychological continuity.
Although it appears to be an improvement with regards to the previous two criteria, the psychological criterion also faces some problems. Suppose someone claims today to be Guy Fawkes, and conserves intact very vividly and accurately the memories of the seventeenth century conspirator (Williams, 1976). By the psychological criterion, such a person would indeed be Guy Fawkes. But, what if, simultaneously, another person also claims to be Guy Fawkes, even with the same degree of accuracy? Obviously, both persons cannot be Guy Fawkes. Again, it would seem arbitrary to conclude that one person is Guy Fawkes, yet the other person isn’t. It seems more plausible that neither person is Guy Fawkes, and therefore, that psychological continuity is not a good criterion for personal identity.
In virtue of the difficulties with the above criteria, some philosophers have argued that, in a sense, persons do not exist. Or, to be more precise, the self does not endure changes. In David Hume’s words, a person is “nothing but a bundle or collection of different perceptions, which succeed each other with an inconceivable rapidity, and are in a perpetual flux and movement” (Hume, 2010: 178). This is the so-called ‘bundle theory of the self’.
As a corollary, Derek Parfit argues that, when considering survival, personal identity is not what truly matters (Parfit, 1984). What does matter is psychological continuity. Parfit asks us to consider this example.
Suppose that you enter a cubicle in which, when you press a button, a scanner records the states of all the cells in your brain and body, destroying both while doing so. This information is then transmitted at the speed of light to some other planet, where a replicator produces a perfect organic copy of you. Since the brain of your replica is exactly like yours, it will seem to remember living your life up to the moment when you pressed the button, its character will be just like yours, it will be every other way psychologically continuous with you. (Parfit, 1997: 311)
Now, under the psychological criterion, such a replica will in fact be you. But, what if the machine does not destroy the original body, or makes more than one replica? In such a case, there will be two persons claiming to be you. As we have seen, this is a major problem for the psychological criterion. But, Parfit argues that, even if the person replicated is not the same person that entered the cubicle, it is psychologically continuous. And, that is what is indeed relevant.
Parfit’s position has an important implication for discussions of immortality. According to this view, a person in the afterlife is not the same person that lived before. But, that should not concern us. We should be concerned about the prospect that, in the afterlife, there will at least be one person that is psychologically continuous with us.
As we have seen, the doctrine of resurrection postulates that on Judgment Day the bodies of every person who ever lived shall rise again, in order to be judged by God. Unlike the doctrine of the immortality of the soul, the doctrine of resurrection has not been traditionally defended with philosophical arguments. Most of its adherents accept it on the basis of faith. Some Christians, however, consider that the resurrection of Jesus can be historically demonstrated (Habermas, 2002; Craig, 2008). And, so the argument goes, if it can be proven that God resurrected Jesus from the dead, then we can expect that God will do the same with every human being who has ever lived.
Nevertheless, the doctrine of resurrection runs into some philosophical problems derived from considerations on personal identity; that is, how is the person resurrected identical to the person that once lived? If we were to accept dualism and the soul criterion for personal identity, then there is not much of a problem: upon the moment of death, soul and body split, the soul remains incorporeal until the moment of resurrection, and the soul becomes attached to the new resurrected body. In as much as a person is the same, if and only if, she conserves the same soul, then we may legitimately claim that the resurrected person is identical to the person that once lived.
But, if we reject dualism, or the soul criterion for personal identity, then we must face some difficulties. According to the most popular one conception of resurrection, we shall be raised with the same bodies with which we once lived. Suppose that the resurrected body is in fact made of the very same cells that made up the original body, and also, the resurrected body has the same form as the original body. Are they identical?
Peter Van Inwagen thinks not (Van Inwagen, 1997). If, for example, an original manuscript written by Augustine is destroyed, and then, God miraculously recreates a manuscript with the same atoms that made up Augustine’s original manuscript, we should not consider it the very same manuscript. It seems that, between Augustine’s original manuscript, and the manuscript recreated by God, there is no spatio-temporal continuity. And, if such continuity is lacking, then we cannot legitimately claim that the recreated object is the same original object. For the same reason, it appears that the resurrected body cannot be identical to the original body. At most, the resurrected body would be a replica.
However, our intuitions are not absolutely clear. Consider, for example, the following case: a bicycle is exhibited in a store, and a customer buys it. In order to take it home, the customer dismantles the bicycle, puts its pieces in a box, takes it home, and once there, reassembles the pieces. Is it the same bicycle? It certainly seems so, even if there is no spatio-temporal continuity.
Nevertheless, there is room to doubt that the resurrected body would be made up of the original body’s same atoms. We know that matter recycles itself, and that due to metabolism, the atoms that once constituted the human body of a person may later constitute the body of another person. How could God resurrect bodies that shared the same atoms? Consider the case of cannibalism, as ridiculed by Voltaire:
A soldier from Brittany goes into Canada; there, by a very common chance, he finds himself short of food, and is forced to eat an Iroquis whom he killed the day before. The Iroquis had fed on Jesuits for two or three months; a great part of his body had become Jesuit. Here, then, the body of a soldier is composed of Iroquis, of Jesuits, and of all that he had eaten before. How is each to take again precisely what belongs to him? And which part belongs to each? (Voltaire, 1997: 147)
However, perhaps, in the resurrection, God needn’t resurrect the body. If we accept the body criterion for personal identity, then, indeed, the resurrected body must be the same original body. But, if we accept the psychological criterion, perhaps God only needs to recreate a person psychologically continuous with the original person, regardless of whether or not that person has the same body. John Hick believes this is how God could indeed proceed (Hick, 1994).
Hick invites a thought experiment. Suppose a man disappears in London, and suddenly someone with his same looks and personality appears in New York. It seems reasonable to consider that the person that disappeared in London is the same person that appeared in New York. Now, suppose that a man dies in London, and suddenly appears in New York with the same looks and personality. Hick believes that, even if the cadaver is in London, we would be justified to claim that the person that appears in New York is the same person that died in London. Hick’s implication is that body continuity is not needed for personal identity; only psychologically continuity is necessary.
And, Hick considers that, in the same manner, if a person dies, and someone in the resurrection world appears with the same character traits, memories, and so forth, then we should conclude that such a person in the resurrected world is identical to the person who previously died. Hick admits the resurrected body would be a replica, but as long as the resurrected is psychologically continuous with the original person, then it is identical to the original person.
Yet, in as much as Hick’s model depends upon a psychological criterion for personal identity, it runs into the same problems that we have reviewed when considering the psychological criterion. It seems doubtful that a replica would be identical to the original person, because more than one replica could be recreated. And, if there is more than one replica, then they would all claim to be the original person, but obviously, they cannot all be the original person. Hick postulates that we can trust that God would only recreate exactly one replica, but it is not clear how that would solve the problem. For, the mere possibility that God could make more than one replica is enough to conclude that a replica would not be the original person.
Peter Van Inwagen has offered a somewhat extravagant solution to these problems: “Perhaps at the moment of each man’s death, God removes his corpse and replaces it with a simulacrum which is what is burned or rots. Or perhaps God is not quite so wholesale as this: perhaps He removes for ‘safekeeping’ only the ‘core person’ – the brain and central nervous system – or even some special part of it” (Van Inwagen, 1997: 246). This would seem to solve the problem of spatio-temporal continuity. The body would never cease to exist, it would only be stored somewhere else until the moment of resurrection, and therefore, it would conserve spatio-temporal continuity. However, such an alternative seems to presuppose a deceitful God (He would make us believe the corpse that rots is the original one, when in fact, it is not), and would thus contradict the divine attribute of benevolence (a good God would not lie), a major tenet of monotheistic religions that defend the doctrine of resurrection.
Some Christian philosophers are aware of all these difficulties, and have sought a more radical solution: there is no criterion for personal identity over time. Such a view is not far from the bundle theory, in the sense that it is difficult to precise how a person remains the same over time. This position is known as ‘anti-criterialism’, that is, there is no intelligible criterion for personal identity; Trenton Merricks (1998) is its foremost proponent. By doing away with criteria for personal identity, anti-criterialists purport to show that objections to resurrection based on difficulties of personal identity have little weight, precisely because we should not be concerned about criteria for personal identity.
The discipline of parapsychology purports to prove that there is scientific evidence for the afterlife; or at least, that there is scientific evidence for the existence of paranormal abilities that would imply that the mind is not a material substance. Originally founded by J.B.S. Rhine in the 1950s, parapsychology has fallen out of favor among contemporary neuroscientists, although some universities still support parapsychology departments.
Parapsychologists usually claim there is a good deal of evidence in favor of the doctrine of reincarnation. Two pieces of alleged evidence are especially meaningful: (1) past-life regressions; (2) cases of children who apparently remember past lives.
Under hypnosis, some patients frequently have regressions and remember events from their childhood. But, some patients have gone even further and, allegedly, have vivid memories of past lives. A few parapsychologists take these as so-called ‘past-life regressions’ as evidence for reincarnation (Sclotterbeck, 2003).
However, past-life regressions may be cases of cryptomnesia, that is, hidden memories. A person may have a memory, and yet not recognize it as such. A well-known case is illustrative: an American woman in the 1950s was hypnotized, and claimed to be Bridey Murphy, an Irishwoman of the 19th century. Under hypnosis, the woman offered a fairly good description of 19th century Ireland, although she had never been in Ireland. However, it was later discovered that, as a child, she had an Irish neighbor. Most likely, she had hidden memories of that neighbor, and under hypnosis, assumed the personality of a 20th century Irish woman.
It must also be kept in mind that hypnosis is a state of high suggestibility. The person that conducts the hypnosis may easily induce false memories on the person hypnotized; hence, alleged memories that come up in hypnosis are not trustworthy at all.
Some children have claimed to remember past lives. Parapsychologist Ian Stevenson collected more than a thousand of such cases (Stevenson, 2001). And, in a good portion of those cases, children know things about the deceased person that, allegedly, they could not have known otherwise.
However, Stevenson’s work has been severely critiqued for its methodological flaws. In most cases, the child’s family had already made contact with the deceased’s family before Stevenson’s arrival; thus, the child could pick up information and give the impression that he knows more than what he could have known. Paul Edwards has also accused Stevenson of asking leading questions towards his own preconceptions (Edwards, 1997: 14).
Moreover, reincarnation runs into conceptual problems of its own. If you do not remember past lives, then it seems that you cannot legitimately claim that you are the same person whose life you do not remember. However, a few philosophers claim this is not a good objection at all, as you do not remember being a very young child, and yet can still surely claim to be the same person as that child (Ducasse, 1997: 199).
Population growth also seems to be a problem for reincarnation: according to defenders of reincarnation, souls migrate from one body to another. This, in a sense, presupposes that the number of souls remains stable, as no new souls are created, they only migrate from body to body. Yet, the number of bodies has consistently increased ever since the dawn of mankind. Where, one may ask, were all souls before new bodies came to exist? (Edwards, 1997: 14). Actually, this objection is not so formidable: perhaps souls exist in a disembodied form as they wait for new bodies to come up (D’Souza, 2009: 57).
During the heyday of Spiritualism (the religious movement that sought to make contact with the dead), some mediums gained prominence for their reputed abilities to contact the dead. These mediums were of two kinds: physical mediums invoked spirits that, allegedly, produced physical phenomena (for example, lifting tables); and mental mediums whose bodies, allegedly, were temporarily possessed by the spirits.
Most physical mediums were exposed as frauds by trained magicians. Mental mediums, however, presented more of a challenge for skeptics. During their alleged possession by a deceased person’s spirit, mediums would provide information about the deceased person that, apparently, could not have possibly known. William James was impressed by one such medium, Leonora Piper, and although he remained somewhat skeptical, he finally endorsed the view that Piper in fact made contact with the dead.
Some parapsychologists credit the legitimacy of mental mediumship (Almeder, 1992). However, most scholars believe that mental mediums work through the technique of ‘cold reading’: they ask friends and relatives of a deceased person questions at a fast pace, and infer from their body language and other indicators, information about the deceased person (Gardner, 2003).
Parapsychologists have also gathered testimonies of alleged ghost appearances, especially cases where the spirit communicates something that no person could have known (for example, the location of a hidden treasure), and yet it is corroborated. This evidence seems far too anecdotal to be taken seriously; it does not go through the rigorous control that such a claim would require.
Some parapsychologists have tried to record white noise generated by vacant radio stations, and in places where it is known that no person is present (Raudive, 1991). Allegedly, some of those recordings have produced noises similar to human voices with strange messages, and these voices are believed to come from ghosts. Skeptics claim that such messages are too vague to be taken seriously, and that the tendency of the human mind to find purpose everywhere, promotes the interpretation of simple noises as human voices.
Ever since ancient times (for example, Plato’s myth of Er in The Republic), there have been reports of people who have lost some vital signs, and yet, regained them after a brief period of time. Some people have claimed to have unique experiences in those moments: an acute noise, a peaceful and relaxed sensation; the feeling of abandoning the body, floating in the air and watching the body from above; a passage thorough a dark tunnel; a bright light at the end of the tunnel; an encounter with friends, relatives, and religious characters; a review of life’s most important moments. These are described as near death experiences (Moody, 2001).
Some parapsychologists claim near death experiences are evidence of life after death, and some sort of window revealing the nature of the afterlife. Skeptical scientists, however, have offered plausible physiological explanations for such experiences. Carl Sagan considered the possibility that near death experiences evoke memories from the moment of birth: the transit through the tunnel would evoke the birth canal, and the sensation of floating in the air would evoke the sensation of floating in amniotic acid during gestation (Sagan, 1980).
There are still other physiological explanations. These experiences can be induced by stimulating certain regions of the brain. In moments of intense crises, the brain releases endorphins, and this may account for the peaceful and relaxed sensation. The experience of going through a tunnel may be due to anoxia (lack of oxygen), or the application of anesthetics containing quetamine. The review of life’s most important moments may be due to the stimulation of neurons in the temporal lobules. Encounters with religious characters may be hallucinations as a result of anoxia (Blackmore, 2002) Some patients that have undergone near death experiences have allegedly provided verifiable information that they had no way to know. Some parapsychologists take this as evidence that patients float through the air during near death experiences and, during the ordeal, they are capable to travel to other locations. This evidence is, however, anecdotal. And there is contrary evidence: Researchers have placed computer laptops with random images in the roof of emergency rooms, so that only someone watching from above could know the content of the images, but, so far, no patient has ever accurately described such images (Roach, 2005).
Parapsychologists have designed some experiments that purport to prove that some people have the ability of extrasensory perception or ESP (Radin, 1997). If this ability does indeed exist, it would not prove immortality, but it would seem to prove dualism; that is, the mind is not reducible to the brain.
The best formulated experiment is the so-called Ganzfeld experiment. Person A relaxes in a cabin, her eyes are covered with ping-pong ball halves, and listens to white noise for fifteen minutes. This is intended to promote sense deprivation. In another cabin, person B is shown a target image. Afterwards, subject A is shown the target image, along with three other images. We should expect a 25% chance probability that subject A will choose the target image, but when experiments are performed, 32% of the time, subject A is successful. Parapsychologists claim this is evidence that something strange is going on (as it defies the expectancy of chance), and their explanation is that some people have the ability of extra sensory perception.
However, this experiment is not without critics. There may be sensory leakage (perhaps the cabins are not sufficiently isolated from each other). The experiment’s protocols have not adequately presented the images in random sequences. And, even if, indeed, the results come out 32% accurate when only 25% is expected by chance, it should not be assumed that a paranormal phenomenon is going on; at most, further research would be required to satisfactorily reach a conclusion.
Most secular scientists have little patience for parapsychology or religiously-inspired immortality. However, the exponential growth of technological innovation in our era has allowed the possibility to consider that, in a not-too-distant future, bodily immortality may become a reality. A few of these proposed technologies raise philosophical issues.
Cryonics is the preservation of corpses in low temperatures. Although it is not a technology that purports to bring persons back to life, it does purport to conserve them until some future technology might be capable of resuscitating dead bodies. If, indeed, such technology were ever developed, we would need to revise the physiological criterion for death. For, if brain death is a physiological point of no return, then bodies that are currently cryogenically preserved and will be brought back to life, were not truly dead after all.
Most scientists are skeptical of the prospect of resuscitating already dead people, but some are more enthusiastic about the prospect of indefinitely procrastinating death by stopping the aging processes. Scientist Aubrey De Grey has proposed some strategies for engineered negligible senescence: their goal is to identify the mechanisms accountable for aging, and attempt to stop, or even, reverse them (by, say cell repair) (De Grey and Rae, 2008). Some of these strategies involve genetic manipulation and nanotechnology, and hence they bring forth ethical issues. These strategies also bring concern about the ethics of immortality, that is, is immortality even desirable? (See section 3 of this article).
Yet other futurists consider that, even if it were not possible to indefinitely suspend the body’s death, it would at least be possible to emulate the brain with artificial intelligence (Kurzweil, 1993; Moravec, 2003). Thus, some scientists have considered the prospect of ‘mind-uploading’, that is, the transfer of the mind’s information to a machine. Hence, even if the organic brain dies, the mind could continue to exist once it is uploaded in a silicon-based machine.
Two crucial philosophical issues are raised by this prospect. First, the field of philosophy of artificial intelligence raises the question: could a machine ever really be conscious? Philosophers who adhere to a functionalist understanding of the mind would agree; but other philosophers would not (Consider Searle’s Chinese Room Argument in Searle, 1998).
Even if we were to claim that a machine could in fact be conscious, the technological prospect of mind uploading raises a second philosophical issue: would an emulation of the brain preserve personal identity? If we adhere to a soul or body criterion of personal identity, we should answer negatively. If we adhere to a psychological criterion of personal identity, then we should answer affirmatively, for the artificial brain would indeed be psychologically continuous with the original person.
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Last updated: February 11, 2011 | Originally published: February 11, 2011