The term “resurrection” refers to the raising of someone from the dead. The resurrection of the dead brings to the forefront topics from the study of personal identity and philosophical anthropology. For example, some people think that we have souls and that the souls play an important role in resurrection. Others claim that we do not have souls and that this is a reason to deny that there is any life after death. In addition, the study of resurrection has benefited from interaction with topics in contemporary metaphysics. There are many puzzles about how things survive change. Philosophers have taken insights and distinctions from those cases and used them in their discussion of resurrection.
The article begins with a brief overview of the doctrine of the resurrection. It touches on the essential parts of the Christian doctrine and points to some of the surrounding controversies. The most common objection to the Christian doctrine of the resurrection of the dead is that it cannot be made compatible with materialism, the claim that humans are material beings and have no non-physical parts. This article examines the supposed inconsistency and looks at four different attempts by philosophers to advance a coherent account of the doctrine of the resurrection. The conclusion is a brief look at immaterialist accounts of resurrection and a summary and criticism of John W. Cooper’s argument that the Christian belief in an intermediate state entails mind-body dualism.
Table of Contents
- The Christian Doctrine of Resurrection
- Objections to the Christian Doctrine of Resurrection
- Materialist Accounts of Resurrection
- Immaterialists Accounts of Resurrection
- References and Further Reading
Many different religions have accounts of life after death but the Christian doctrine of the resurrection of the dead has received the most attention by philosophers. This is in large part due to the centrality of the doctrine in the Western religious tradition. Because of the emphasis on Christian accounts of resurrection in the philosophical literature, this entry will focus on the debates about the Christian doctrine of resurrection. However, much of what is said can be applied to other religions and traditions. To see a contemporary non-Christian account of resurrection, see John Leslie’s Immortality Defended.
The raising of the dead plays a central role in Christian belief. To begin with, Christians believe that Jesus died and rose from the dead. Each of the four gospels contains testimony about the resurrection of Jesus (see Matthew 28:1-20, Mark 16:1-8, Luke 24:1-53, and John 20:1-21:25). Jesus’ resurrection is central to Christian belief because on it rests claims about Jesus’ divinity and various doctrines about salvation.
There is a fair amount of scholarly work done on the question of whether or not Jesus did rise from the dead. This debate falls outside the scope of the article but the interested reader will find The Son Rises: The Historical Evidence for the Resurrection of Jesus by William Craig and Did Jesus Rise From the Dead? The Resurrection Debate by Gary Habermas, Anthony Flew, and Terry Miethe to be good starting points.
Christians believe that Jesus’ resurrection serves as a model for the resurrection of some people (perhaps everyone) in the future. It is this belief that is known as the Christian doctrine of the resurrection of the dead (henceforth CDR). To be clear, this doctrine is one of bodily resurrection. It is not a claim about figurative or metaphorical resurrection. We will now look at various aspects of CDR.
First, one might wonder about the scope of CDR. Who, exactly, will be raised from the dead? By far, the majority of Christians (lay people, clergy, and scholars) have believed that both Christians and non-Christians will be resurrected. In addition, it has been believed that this resurrection is not the same for everyone. For example, some believe that Christians will be raised in a new spiritual body that will experience an eternity of blessing, while non-Christians will be raised so that they might undergo judgment and punishment.
Two doctrines that are compatible with a denial that both Christians and non-Christians will be resurrected are annihilationism and conditional immortality. Annihilationism is the view that non-Christians are not punished for eternity but rather are annihilated. Some versions of annihilationism hold that God will punish unrepentant sinners for a limited time in hell and then annihilate them (thus, endorsing some sort of afterlife) while others hold that sinners are not resurrected at all. Conditional immortality is the view that the soul is not inherently immortal and that it is only God’s gift that grants the soul eternal life. Both of these views are held by a small minority of evangelical Protestants and various Adventist churches.
Proponents of the resurrection of the godly and the ungodly point to scripture in support of their belief in a general resurrection. For example, in Acts 24:15 it is reported that Paul believed that “there shall certainly be a resurrection of both the righteous and the wicked” (all verses quoted are from the New American Standard Bible translation, NASB). In addition to the verse in Acts the reader can also look to Daniel 12:2 and Revelation 20:13-15 for support of the belief in a general resurrection. In any case, it must be acknowledged that historically and scripturally the bulk of attention is placed on the resurrection of the believer. Thus, while CDR’s scope may include the non-believer, it is primarily a doctrine about what happens to the believer in the afterlife.
Second, one might wonder about the timing of the resurrection in CDR. When will the dead be raised? This is a contentious issue among Christian theologians and the timing of the resurrection (or resurrections) is largely determined by whether one is an amillennialist, postmillennialist, or premillenialist. Amillenialists believe that Jesus will return to earth and at that time the resurrection of the dead will take place along with the establishment of the New Heaven and the New Earth. Postmillennialists believe that there will be a “millennial age,” which need not be a thousand years long, characterized by Christianity becoming the dominant religion and the world turning towards God. At the end of this age, Christ will return and the resurrection of the dead will take place. Finally, premillenialists hold that the resurrection of the believers will occur when Christ returns to earth. Following Christ’s return, there will be a millennial age in which Christ reigns on earth. At the end of this time, among other things, the resurrection of unbelievers will occur and the New Heaven and New Earth will be established. (This last characterization is a simplification. There are some versions of premillenialism in which more than two large scale resurrections take place.)
Third, one might wonder about the nature of the resurrection in CDR. What will people be like once they are raised from the dead? After all, if someone was merely restored to his or her physical state right before death, then in many cases death would occur immediately afterwards. First, CDR teaches that the resurrection will be a physical or bodily resurrection. For example, Paul writes in Romans 8:11 that “He who raised Christ Jesus from the dead will also give life to your mortal bodies through His Spirit who dwells in you.” Additionally, Paul writes in 1 Corinthians 15:42-44:
So also is the resurrection of the dead. It is sown a perishable body, it is raised an imperishable body; it is sown in dishonor, it is raised in glory; it is sown in weakness, it is raised in power; it is sown a natural body, it is raised a spiritual body.
Also, Christians cite the example of Jesus after his resurrection. Jesus is depicted not as some ghostly figure but as an embodied person, able to eat, drink, and physically interact with others.
Second, the depictions of the resurrected Christ in the gospels and the scripture passages above indicate that the body that will be raised will be significantly different than the one that died. In Christ’s case people who knew him before he died had difficulty recognizing him after he died. However, they did recognize him after some prompting. (See John 20:11-18 for a case of this.) Additionally, while Paul contrasts the two bodies in the passage from Corinthians above, the New Testament also indicates that believers will be able to recognize one another. (See Matthew 8:11, 27:52-53 and Luke 9:30-33.)
We can now sum up what the core of CDR is. CDR is a doctrine that claims believers will be resurrected in bodily form when Christ returns to the earth. Christians disagree about the timing of Christ’s return, the particulars about the resurrected body, and the scope of the resurrection. However, the creeds have been consistent in affirming the essential parts of CDR. The Apostles Creed, written around the third or fourth century C.E., affirms “the resurrection of the body.” The Nicene Creed, C.E. 325, reads “I look for the resurrection of the dead, and the life of the world to come.” Additionally, various confessions and doctrinal statements have overwhelmingly endorsed CDR. For example, in the Westminster Confession of Faith, composed in 1643-46, there is a section on the resurrection of the dead which includes the claim that “all the dead shall be raised up, with the selfsame bodies, and none other (although with different qualities)….”
In this section of the article two objections to the Christian doctrine of resurrection (CDR) will be examined. First, the relationship between CDR and miracles will be discussed. Second, we will consider the claim that CDR is incompatible with materialism. The majority of this section will focus on the second objection because it is a) the most common objection to CDR and b) specific to CDR and not applicable to any number of different doctrines, unlike the first objection involving miracles. Ultimately, it will be suggested that the difficulties that CDR has with materialism are not due to a particular conflict with materialism. Instead, whether one is a dualist or a materialist supporter of CDR, one must account for how a material object can be numerically identical with a previous material object that was destroyed.
One objection to CDR is that it requires a miracle to take place. The objector presumably believes either that God would not perform such miraculous events or cannot perform such events. This sort of objection was more popular in the early to mid-20th century when many leading theologians and philosophers believed that the notion of a miracle was incoherent and that Christianity would be better off without a commitment to such overt supernatural events. Note that this sort of objection applies not only to CDR but to large parts of traditional Christian doctrine.
Defenders of CDR will admit that it would take a miracle for God to bring about the resurrection of the dead. However, the defenders of CDR do not see this as a problem. Rather, they embrace the coherence of the concept of a miracle, and argue that we are within our epistemic rights to believe in miracles. Recently, the position that Christianity has within it the resources to justify belief in miracles has become more popular among philosophers. If this position is true, then the defender of CDR is within her epistemic rights in believing that a supernatural act of God is required for a resurrection to occur. However, this does not mean that CDR is true. The opponent of CDR can still argue that CDR is false because it is committed to the existence of miracles. Of course, the opponent of CDR in raising this objection is also calling into question the greater theological scheme of which CDR is but a part. Therefore, any criticism of CDR’s commitment to miracles quickly escalates into a discussion about the truth of Christianity.
The most common objection to CDR is that it is incompatible with materialism. Since materialism is the predominant view of philosophers, this objection is taken to be a serious blow to both CDR and Christianity. In order to understand this objection, one must understand the distinction between qualitative and numerical identity.
Suppose one day that you hear the following comments: “Joe is wearing the same watch that he wore yesterday,” and “Joe is wearing the same watch that Amy is wearing.” Both of these comments make use of the phrase, “same watch,” but mean very different things. The first comment says that Joe is wearing a watch that is numerically identical to the watch he wore the day before. If Joe bought a warranty for the watch he was wearing yesterday, that warranty would apply to the watch he is wearing today. The first speaker is not talking of two different watches; he is talking of only one watch. The second speaker is not talking of one watch but of two. The speaker is claiming that the watch Joe is wearing is qualitatively identical to the watch that Amy is wearing. The two watches are such that they are of the same brand, have similar features, are of the same color, etc. If Joe were to purchase a warranty for the watch he is wearing, it would not apply to the watch that Amy is wearing. This case of watches generalizes to other objects. If object X is numerically identical to object Y, then there are not, in fact, two objects, but just one. For example, Superman is numerically identical to Clark Kent; there is just one person who happens to lead an interesting double life. If object X is qualitatively identical to object Y, then there are two objects that happen to be exactly alike in their various properties and qualities. For example, two electrons might be thought of as being qualitatively identical even though they are not numerically identical.
Note that very few pairs of things are qualitatively identical in a strict and philosophical sense. For example, we might speak of two desks of being “the same desk.” However, it is likely they have enough differences that they are not qualitatively identical. Rather, they are just very similar. They are qualitatively alike and for almost any purpose one of the desks will do just as well as the other. Additionally, almost all numerically distinct objects are qualitatively distinct as well. For, take any two numerically distinct objects, unless they occupy the very same space, we could say that one has the property of being in such and such a location and the other lacks that property.
If CDR is true, then there will be many people in the far future that will be resurrected. We can ask of each of these people, is he or she the same person who died? In asking this question we are not asking if they are qualitatively the same person. As we saw above, CDR claims that those that are resurrected will have very different bodies than they had before death. Furthermore, this change is unproblematic. People can undergo a vast amount of qualitative change in their present life and still be the same person. For example, a person can be involved in a terrible accident that leaves him or her both physically and mentally very different. However, we would still consider that person to be the same person, numerically speaking, as the person who was in the accident, despite the change he or she endured. So, when we ask whether or not the resurrected persons are the same persons who died, we are asking if they are numerically identical to someone who lived in the past.
This question is problematic for the proponent of CDR. Suppose the answer is no, then it seems as if CDR is an empty hope for those who believe in it. For, the Christian does not merely believe that someone like her will be resurrected, but believes that she will be the one who is resurrected in the future. Thus, CDR is committed to the claim that there must be some way for resurrection to occur that allows for numerical identity between a person before death and after resurrection.
The dualist seems to have an easier time meeting this commitment. Under many dualist views, a person is identical to a soul or some sort of non-physical entity. During a person’s life, one soul is “attached” or associated with one particular body. When death occurs, the dualist thinks that the soul and the body become “detached.” Later, when the resurrection of the dead occurs, the soul becomes attached to a new body. This is unproblematic because a person is not identical to the body but to the soul. The newly resurrected person is identical to someone who existed before because the soul is identical to a soul that existed before.
It seems it is more difficult for a materialist to give an account of resurrection that accounts for the numerical identity of persons before and after death. To see this, we will first look at a case involving the destruction and recreation of an everyday object and then apply that case to the materialist believer of CDR. The following case is taken from Peter van Inwagen (p.45). Consider an everyday material object, such as a book or a manuscript. Suppose that at some point in the past this manuscript was burned. Now, what would you think if someone told you that he or she was currently in possession of the very same manuscript that was burned in the past? Van Inwagen would find this incredible. He does not doubt that someone could possess an exact duplicate of the manuscript. He denies that anyone could possess a manuscript that was numerically identical to the one that was burned.
Suppose the owner of the manuscript tried to convince van Inwagen that it was possible for it to be the same one by describing a scenario in which God rebuilds the manuscript using the same atoms or other bits of matter that used to compose the manuscript. Van Inwagen claims that the manuscript God recreated is merely a duplicate. A duplicate is an object that is merely qualitatively identical to another object. Van Inwagen is not alone in thinking this. John Perry expresses this intuition in his work A Dialogue on Personal Identity and Immortality. In it, a character of his argues that Kleenex boxes cannot be rebuilt after being completely destroyed. Underlying these intuitions is the view that mere rebuilding of an object (even using the same parts) is not enough to insure that the object after rebuilding is numerically identical to the object before rebuilding.
Applying this intuition to the materialist we can see why CDR seems to be in conflict with materialism. For, materialism holds that people are material objects like manuscripts and Kleenex boxes. Thus, if a person’s body is destroyed then a person is destroyed and God can no better rebuild a person’s body than he can a manuscript or any other material object.
In response to this argument, the defender of CDR may reject the intuition behind van Inwagen’s argument and claim that God can rebuild material objects as long as he is using the same parts that composed the object when it is destroyed. Under this picture, the reassembly view of resurrection, God would resurrect people by assembling together all the bits of matter that used to be a part of their bodies and bringing them together again to form healthy bodies. The reader may wonder what is meant by “parts” or “bits of matter” in this discussion. Specification of these terms will vary depending on the proponent of the reassembly view, but typically the parts under consideration are the basic micro-physical parts that we are made of. For example, it would be a poor reassembly view of resurrection that held that God resurrected people by gathering all the organs that composed people at a previous time. After all, our organs will decay and decompose in a similar way that our bodies will. The protons, neutrons, electrons, quarks, superstrings, or whatever subatomic particle you choose will not decay in the same way, and presumably would survive into the future so that God might eventually gather them and reassemble them.
There are objections to the view of resurrection as assembly that go beyond the intuition that reassembly of a body is not enough to ensure that a reassembled person is numerically identical to someone in the past. First, it is not clear that all the parts that compose people now will exist later when the time for resurrection comes. It seems possible, if not plausible, that God would not be able to resurrect some people if the reassembly view was true. The defender of CDR would not be comfortable with such an outcome. Second, parts of people can become parts of other people. For example, when a cannibal bites into her latest victim, she digests and incorporates the parts of one person into her own person. God would not be able to rebuild everyone given the existence of cannibals and other mechanisms that allow parts of one person to become parts of another person after death.
For the reasons above, philosophers have tended to reject reassembly views. (For an account of the medieval debates about reassembly views and resurrection see Caroline Walker Bynum’s The Resurrection of the Body. Some of the defenses of reassembly views by medieval apologists are entertaining if not persuasive.) We are left with our original problem, how can a material object be rebuilt? If materialism is true, then how is resurrection possible? The remaining sections of this article explain several different ways in which philosophers have attempted to answer this question.
It should be noted that the argument against the materialist defender of CDR can be transformed slightly to apply to any defender of CDR. In the description of CDR the article left open the question of whether or not the resurrected body is numerically identical to the body pre-death. Many Christians think that it is true that a numerically identical body is resurrected. Trenton Merricks makes this case forcefully in his article “The Resurrection of the Body and the Life Everlasting.” There he argues that a) “the overwhelming majority of theologians and philosophers in the history of the church have endorsed the claim of numerical identity” (p. 268) and b) that scripture teaches this. In defense of his second point he points to 1 Corinthians 15 and the fact that Christ bore the scars of crucifixion. If Merricks is right, and numerical identity of the body is part of CDR, then a believer in CDR must defend the view that it is possible for God to resurrect a material object even if one is a dualist. If Merricks is not right, then the dualist has an easier time coming up with an account of resurrection than the materialist.
Peter van Inwagen has presented a model of resurrection that is compatible with materialism and the Christian doctrine of resurrection (CDR). The key problem for the defender of CDR is that once we die our bodies begin to disintegrate and eventually are destroyed by natural processes. Once this happens, it seems that even God cannot bring back that body because it is a logically impossible thing to do, given the intuition discussed above. Van Inwagen proposes solving this problem by giving an account of resurrection where our bodies do not in fact undergo decay. Under his account, “at the moment of each man’s death, God removes his corpse and replaces it with a simulacrum, which is what is burned or rots” (van Inwagen, p. 49). Later, at the time of the general resurrection, God will take the corpse that he has preserved and restore it to life.
One objection that van Inwagen addresses in his article is that there is no reason for God to replace genuine corpses with simulacra. If God does preserve our corpse, why does he not preserve it here on earth or remove the corpse from the earth without a replacement? Van Inwagen’s brief answer is that if God did not provide a simulacrum, then there would be widespread irrefutable evidence of the supernatural. Suppose someone put a torch to a corpse. If God were preserving that corpse, then no amount of effort would allow the natural process of cremation to take place. Van Inwagen goes on to say that there are good reasons for God to have a policy of not providing regular evidence of the supernatural (though in the article above van Inwagen is not specific about what those reasons are.)
Another objection to the simulacrum view is that it makes God out to be a great deceiver. We tend to think of the corpses that we bury or cremate as genuine corpses. Further, we have every reason to suspect that this is the case. If we are wrong, it is only due to God’s constant effort to deceive us. (See Hudson, p. 181, for a discussion of this point.)
Finally, it can be objected that the simulacrum view is incredible. Even though it is coherent, it requires us to adopt radically different beliefs than we currently hold. Van Inwagen acknowledges this point and in a postscript to his original article writes:
I am inclined now to think of the description that I gave in ‘The Possibility of Resurrection’ of how an omnipotent being could accomplish the Resurrection of the Dead as a ‘just-so story’: Although it serves to establish a possibility, it probably isn’t true (p.51).
He goes on to remark that while the theory itself might not be literally true, it is true in another way in that it shows us some important features about how God will accomplish the resurrection of the dead.
In the other sections of the article, we have assumed that a materialist is someone who holds the view that not only is a person a material object but that a person is identical to a material object, namely her body. Some materialists deny this. Instead, they hold that a person is constituted by her body and that this relation is not one of identity.
By looking at a statue and the matter it is composed of we can better understand the constitution view. Consider a hunk of marble; let us call that hunk “Hunk”. Suppose Hunk is carved into a wonderful statue which we call “Statue.” Arguably, Statue and Hunk are not identical for Hunk has properties that Statue lacks. Hunk, for example, can survive being carved into a different statue while Statue cannot. Statue cannot exist without an artworld, while Hunk can, etc. Thus, by Leibniz’s Law, Statue and Hunk are not identical. However, we can say that Statue is constituted by Hunk. (Lynne Rudder Baker argues for this view in Persons and Bodies.)
Given the constitution view of persons, we can construct an account of resurrection that purports to solve the problems of the reassembly view we described earlier. In her paper “Need a Christian be a Mind/Body Dualist,” Baker claims that at the general resurrection God will take some, not all, of the atoms that used to constitute a person, let’s call him Smith, and recreate Smith’s body. The difference between this and the reassembly view is that what God is recreating is not Smith but merely a body that constitutes Smith. Thus, while we are inclined to agree with van Inwagen that we do not have numerically identical body here, Baker suggests that we should think we have the same person here. For, unlike in the case of the manuscript, God can “simply will (it seems to [Baker]) there to be a body that has the complexity to ‘subserve’ Smith’s characteristic states, and that is suitably related to Smith’s biological body, to constitute Smith” (Baker, 1995, p. 499).
One might raise several objections to this view. First, it seems that the constitutionalist has to concede that the body raised in glory is not the same one that is sown in weakness. One constitutionalist, Kevin Corcoran, shows that the constitutionalist can avoid this consequence by combining the view expressed above with the falling elevator account discussed in the following section.
Second, one might object that this view is merely a replay of the reassembly view. After all, what makes this new person Smith and not some replica? According to Baker, it is that “what makes Smith the person she is are her characteristic intentional states, including first-person reference to her body” (1995, p. 499). Unlike inanimate objects, such as manuscripts, persons can survive by having a material object constitute a mental life that has the suitable characteristics. The thing constituting a person does not need to have a particular origin, as in the case of van Inwagen’s manuscript.
One can follow up this reply by asking: What would happen if God were to reassemble several bodies, all of which are exactly like the body God created for Smith? It seems like Baker is committed to them all being identical to Smith, which is absurd. Baker responds to this objection by claming that we can trust in God’s goodness to not bring this situation about.
Finally, some would object that this view commits us to a controversial metaphysics, namely that of the constitutionalist ontology. Exploring in detail this objection would go well outside the scope of the present article. Rather, the reader should keep in mind that this model of resurrection does require one to adopt an ontology that many philosophers find disagreeable. (See Hudson for one metaphysician who has argued against constitutionalism.)
One serious problem with the simulacra view is its commitment to mass deception by God. Recall that under this view none of the corpses we see here on Earth are genuine corpses. They are bodies that have never been alive and were not even around until God placed them, like movie props, on the earth. Dean Zimmerman, in his paper “The Compatibility of Materialism and Survival: The ‘Falling Elevator’ Model” has offered the materialist (he is not one himself) an account of resurrection that avoids the problems of both reassembly views and the simulacra view. The origins of the name “the falling elevator model” or the “jumping animals account” is due to the propensity of cartoon characters to avoid death in a falling elevator by jumping out at the last minute. In the same way, in the falling elevator model, bodies “jump” at the last second before death to avoid being destroyed.
According to the falling elevator model at the point just before death God enables a person to undergo fission. (An object undergoes a case of fission when it splits, like an amoeba, into two objects, both of which bear a causal relationship to the original object.) One body resulting from this case of fission goes on to die and becomes a genuine corpse. The second body is transported by God into the far future where it goes on to be resurrected. Both of these bodies have an immanent-causal connection to the body just before death and it is this connection that supports the claim that the resurrected person is identical with the person who died and the claim that the corpse is a genuine corpse and not a simulacrum.
The main objection to this view is that it is committed to denying the “only x and y principle.” This principle has many variants, but it basically states that the only things that matter when considering whether or not x is numerically identical to y are the intrinsic properties of x and y and the relationships between them. The falling elevator model violates this principle because it allows for there to be cases of fission where at one time there are two persons that are both alive and have an immanent-causal connection to a previous person. To see this, consider a case where this occurs and there are two people “Joe” and “Fred” who both have an immanent-causal connection to a previous person “Mark.” Since the causal connection between Joe and Mark and the causal connection between Fred and Mark are both of the sort used by the proponent of the falling elevator model, the proponent is forced to acknowledge that both Joe and Fred are numerically identical to Mark. But that can’t be! Joe and Fred are not numerically identical to one another, and the identity relationship is transitive. Thus, the proponent of the falling elevator model will have to insist that some other criteria, outside Joe, Fred, and Mark, be used to evaluate personal identity. For example, the proponent will likely say that an object x is numerically identical to a previous object y only if x is the closest continuer to y at that time. Thus, we have a violation of the only x and y principle.
Hudson adopts the falling elevator model but avoids the consequence of rejecting the “only x and y principle” by endorsing a perdurantist view of persons. According to the perdurantist, people are not wholly located at a particular time. Rather, they are spread out over time and are composed of temporal parts. In the case above, the perdurantist would not say that Joe and Fred are numerically identical to Mark. Instead, he would claim that the temporal parts of Joe and Fred are related to the temporal part of Mark in such a way that the object composed of Joe and Mark is a person and the object composed of Fred and Mark is a different person. Granted, these two persons overlap for the entirety of the temporal part Mark, but that is not an incoherent outcome.
Perdurantism is a controversial metaphysics. A full discussion of it falls outside the scope of this article. The reader should bear in mind that if one adopts Hudson’s view, one also has to adopt metaphysical theses that are criticized by a wide variety of philosophers.
In order to understand the motivations for anti-criterialism, it will help if we look at a puzzle known as the Ship of Theseus. The Ship of Theseus is a story about a ship captain, named Theseus, who slowly replaces each one of the parts of his ship with a new part. This change is gradual, and many are inclined to believe that at the end of the process the repaired ship (call it ship A) is numerically identical to the one he began with (see the distinction between numerical and qualitative identity in section 2). Suppose that someone were to reassemble the parts that were replaced and form a new ship (call it ship B). Would ship B also be numerically identical to the original ship? Again, many think so. Since identity is a transitive relationship it cannot be that both ships A and B are identical to the original ship. This poses a puzzle for us, as we have the intuitions that ships can both survive a replacement of their parts and can be disassembled and reassembled.
Faced with puzzles such as the Ship of Theseus, and the possibility of fission (a case where one object divides into two, such as an amoeba splitting into two amoebas), philosophers have tended to adopt criterialism. Criterialism is the claim that there are criteria for identity over time. One recent philosopher to deny this is Trenton Merricks. In this section of the article we will look at Merricks’ position and see how he applies it to the objections to the Christian doctrine of resurrection (CDR).
A criterion for identity over time is a criterion for a particular type of object that gives informative necessary and sufficient conditions for numerical identity over time. For example, if you possessed a criterion for identity over time for ships, then you would be able to say what it is about a ship at the present time that makes it identical to a ship that existed previously. Some philosophers think that such criteria are useful because having them would allow us to solve puzzles that involve questions regarding an objects identity over time. For example, a criterion for ships would help us solve the Ship of Theseus paradox by allowing us to determine whether or not ship A or ship B is numerically identical to the original ship.
Let us now look some models given for CDR. Van Inwagen, for example, believes that the criterion of identity over time for persons is that a person at a given time must be part of the same life as a person at a previous time. Hudson argues for what he calls a psychological criterion of personal identity. Given these criteria, each philosopher attempts to construct a model of resurrection that does not violate his or her criterion for personal identity. (It should be noted that Baker, a constitutionalist, does not think we can give a criterion of personal identity. This seems to be because the criterion is mysterious, and not because there is no criterion. While her model of resurrection appears under a different section in this article, the reader is encouraged to think about how an adoption of anti-criterialism might be used to defend a constitutionalist account of resurrection.)
The main objection to CDR was that there was no coherent account of resurrection in which the persons or bodies resurrected were numerically identical to persons or bodies before death. Note that there was very little argument behind this objection. Rather, the burden of proof was on the proponent of CDR to provide a “just-so” story that showed how it was possible for us to be resurrected. Underlying this assumption was the belief that there is some criterion of personal identity and the intuition that no story about resurrection can accommodate this criterion.
One might be able to shift the burden of proof away from the proponent of CDR by denying that there is any criterion of personal identity. Merricks does just this. He denies that there are any criteria of identity over time for any object. Further, he claims that he does not have an account of resurrection and that lacking such an account is no problem for the believer of CDR. It is now up to the opponent of CDR to say why CDR is impossible. Since there are no criteria of personal identity, this task will prove difficult if not impossible. Of course, the anti-criterialist might wish, along with the rest of us, that we knew how God will resurrect us. But this lack of knowledge merely shows that we are ignorant of how resurrection occurs, not that resurrection is impossible.
The main objection to this view of resurrection centers on the denial of criterialism. As in the case of constitutionalism and perdurantism, an account of the objections to this metaphysical thesis falls outside the scope of this article. However, the reader is encouraged to look at Dean Zimmerman’s paper “Criteria of Identity and the ‘Identity Mystics’” for one response to anti-criterialism.
Of course, not all Christians are materialists and in this section we will look briefly at two types of accounts of immaterialist resurrection. Note that by an “immaterialist account,” we mean an account that entails that materialism is false. Aquinas, for example, is an immaterialist in this sense even though he did not think that we are identical to our soul or essentially an immaterial object. Most of the contemporary literature on resurrection focuses on material accounts because a) many philosophers find the concept of an immaterial soul mysterious at best and b) the most common objection to the Christian doctrine of resurrection (CDR) involves its incompatibility with materialism. The reader should not take the current state of the literature to be a guide to the philosophical merits of either materialist or immaterialist accounts or the proportion of Christians who hold to each position.
One of the most popular forms of dualism held by Christians has been a dualism inspired by Plato and Descartes in which 1) the soul and body are separate substances, 2) the soul is immaterial, and 3) the soul is identical to or strongly connected to the mind. One of the early Christian adopters of this view was Augustine. He modified arguments from Plato’s Phaedo to show that the soul must be immortal. Additionally, he argued that the soul must be immortal because it desires perfect happiness. The desire for perfect happiness includes a desire for immortality because no happiness would be perfect if one feared losing it at death. This desire is a natural desire, and thus, Augustine claimed, the soul must naturally be immortal. Bonaventure later takes up this argument when he argues for the immortality of the soul. (See the Copleston reference for more details about Augustine, Bonaventure and Aquinas).
One contemporary philosopher who defends a dualism of mind and body in the Augustinian tradition is Richard Swinburne. Swinburne compares the soul to a light and the body to a light bulb. In his view, if our bodies are destroyed then the soul would naturally cease to function in the same way that a light would naturally go out when a light bulb is destroyed. However, he thinks it is within God’s power to “fix the light bulb” and restore the functioning of the soul by providing a new body or some other means. For example, God could by a miraculous divine act cause souls to function while disembodied. In any case, Swinburne emphasizes that the soul is not by nature immortal (this goes against Augustine). Swinburne’s view is compatible with the doctrine of an intermediate state (see 4.b below) but denies Merricks’ claim that we will have numerically the same body when we are resurrected. Swinburne himself thinks that there is no intermediate state.
Many contemporary Christian dualists are similar to Swinburne. They agree that a) the soul is not by nature immortal, b) the doctrine of the intermediate state is compatible with dualism, and c) we will receive new bodies at the time of the general resurrection and our souls will be “hooked up” to these bodies by a divine act. Disagreements among Cartesian dualist Christians tend to revolve around the origin of the soul and the way in which the soul interacts with the body. For example, William Hasker in his article “Emergentism” argues that the soul is generated by the body while Swinburne believes souls are created by God.
Some Christian immaterialists are not Platonic/Cartesian dualists but rather are dualists in the spirit of Thomas Aquinas. Aquinas held the hylomorphic view that persons are a composite substance of matter and form. The substantial form, that which makes someone a substance, is the rational soul. Among those who held to a hylomorphic view, there was a debate about whether or not the soul could survive death, and, if it could, whether or not this ensures a personal resurrection.
Unlike some hylomorphists (perhaps Aristotle) he argues that the human mind or soul can exist apart from the body. The human mind is not dependent on the body because the way in which it knows depends upon its state. So, instead of ceasing to exist when becoming disembodied, the soul would merely come to know the world in a different way. Additionally, Aquinas argued that we can look forward to a personal resurrection. While the various human souls are nearly identical, we can individuate them in virtue of the bodies they did have on Earth and will have in the general resurrection.
A Christian belief that is related to the doctrine of resurrection is the belief in an intermediate state. Many Christians believe that between the time of death and the time of resurrection there is an intermediate state at which people will continue to exist. This section of the article will look at accounts of this intermediate state and examine an argument for dualism based on the intermediate state.
It should be pointed out that Protestants and Catholics differ significantly on the nature of the intermediate state. Traditional Catholic thought holds that some people go to purgatory when they die, as opposed to ceasing to exist or immediately going to exist in the presence of God. Purgatory is a place where souls go to be cleansed of sin before entrance to heaven. Believers are encouraged to pray for those souls that are in purgatory so that the souls might escape purgatory sooner. Catholics find support for the doctrine of purgatory in 2 Maccabees 12:42-45 and in church tradition. Protestants reject the doctrine of purgatory because they deny that 2 Maccabees is an authoritative source and because they claim the doctrine of purgatory contradicts scripture. Additionally, some Catholics have held to a belief in Limbus Patrum, a place where Old Testament saints went to await the death and resurrection of Christ, and Limbus Infantum, a place where unbaptized infants go after death.
In addition to the above controversies, Christians debate the fate of believers after death. Many think that believers retain consciousness and go into the presence of God. Proponents of the intermediate state point to passages in the New Testament in support of the view. For example, 2 Corinthians 5:6-8 reads:
Therefore, being of good courage, and knowing that while we are at home in the body we are absent from the Lord…we are of good courage, I say, and prefer rather to be absent from the body and to be at home with the Lord.
Additionally, Jesus says to the thief in Luke 23:43, “Truly I say to you, today you shall be with Me in Paradise.” Some other verses that theologians cite are Hebrews 12:23 and Philippians 1:23.
Most Christians have thought that the doctrine of an intermediate state is taught by scripture. Occasionally, some thinkers have proposed the doctrine of soul sleep which is incompatible with the doctrine of an intermediate state. The doctrine of soul sleep is the claim that when a person dies he or she is unconscious until he or she is resurrected. This contradicts the doctrine of an intermediate state because the doctrine of an intermediate state holds that the believer is aware and mentally active during the time between death and the receiving of the resurrection body.
The philosophical upshot of the doctrine of an intermediate state is that some philosophers think that it entails mind-body dualism. This is one of the major arguments of John W. Cooper’s Body, Soul & Life Everlasting. In the book he argues that there are only three options given in the New Testament. The first is the view that there is an intermediate state (which according to Cooper implies dualism). The second is the view that resurrection does not happen at any future time and thus when it does happen (say outside our normal dimension of time) it is “instantaneous.” Finally, the third view is that of a resurrection after a passage of time here on earth.
Cooper accepts the theological arguments for the claim that there is an intermediate state. Why does he think that an intermediate state entails dualism? It seems to be because he thinks that an intermediate state is necessarily a disembodied state and thus is, by definition, one in which the person exists and is a non-physical entity. If this is the case then mind-body dualism does follow. However, not all scholars accept his contention that a person existing in an intermediate state is disembodied. For example, Baker claims “there is no reason to suppose that the intermediate state (if there is one) is one of disembodiment” (Baker, 1995, p. 498). Cooper, of course, would reject this claim. The reasons he cites mirror the claims made by the proponent of the incompatibility of materialism and CDR. In short, Cooper thinks that there is no coherent way for a material object to be resurrected which is numerically identical to one that previously existed, whether this resurrection occurs in an intermediate state or at the general resurrection.
- Baker, L.R. “Need a Christian be a Mind/Body Dualist?” Faith and Philosophy 12 (1995): 489-504.
- An article which presents the constitution view of persons and which argues that constitutionalism is compatible with the doctrine of the resurrection of the dead.
- Baker, L.R. Persons and Bodies. New York: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
- A major work in defense of constitutionalism.
- Baker, L.R. “Persons and the metaphysics of resurrection.” Religious Studies, 43 (2007): 333–48.
- An article which defends the constitution view of resurrection and touches on many of the other views discussed in this entry.
- Bynum, C.W. The Resurrection of the Body in Western Christianity, 200-1336. New York: Columbia University Press, 1995.
- A study of the doctrine of the resurrection of the dead in the early and medieval church.
- Cooper, J.W. Body, Soul, & Life Everlasting. Grand Rapids Michigan: Eerdmans Publishing Company, 1989.
- A book that argues for mind-body dualism based on the doctrine of the intermediate state. It includes a detailed study of the Old and New Testament accounts of the mind-body distinction and the doctrine of the resurrection.
- Copleston, F. A History of Philosophy, Volume II: Medieval Philosophy. New York: Doubleday, 1993.
- A good historical overview of medieval philosophy which includes details about Augustine, Bonaventure, and Aquinas and their views on resurrection and the relationship between the body and the soul.
- Corcoran, Kevin J. “Persons and Bodies.” Faith and Philosophy 15 (1998): 324-340.
- An article that combines constitutionalism and the falling elevator model.
- Craig, W. L. The Son Rises: The Historical Evidence for the Resurrection of Jesus. Chicago: Moody, 1981.
- An apologetic work in favor of the thesis that Jesus rose from the dead.
- Grudem, W. Systematic Theology: An Introduction to Biblical Doctrine. Grand Rapids Michigan: Zondervan Publishing House, 1994. 810-839, 1109-1139.
- A well organized systematic theology that contains references to many different religious traditions and creeds. Grudem is a conservative theologian and gives a clear, if not exhaustive, argument for traditional doctrines.
- Habermans, G., Flew, A., and Miethe, T. Did Jesus Rise From the Dead? The Resurrection Debate. New York: Harper and Row, 1987.
- Perspectives on whether or not Jesus did rise from the dead for a non-technical reader.
- Hasker, W. “Emergentism.” Religious Studies 18 (1982): 473-488.
- A defense of emergentism. Additionally, Hasker argues that the doctrine of resurrection makes dualism more attractive than materialism.
- Hick, J. Philosophy of Religion. Englewood Cliffs, New Jersey: Prentice-Hall, 1973. 97-117.
- Arguably, Hick argues for the replica model of resurrection. Additionally, there is a chapter on non-Christian accounts of life after death.
- Hudson, H. A Materialist Metaphysics of the Human Person. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 2001.
- A defense of perdurantism and the falling elevator model of resurrection.
- Leslie, John. Immortality Defended. Malden, Massachusetts: Blackwell publishing, 2007.
- A book that defends a theistic (not Christian) view of resurrection that is notable for its use of modern physics and incorporation of eastern philosophy.
- Merricks, T. “There are No Criteria of Identity Over Time.” Noûs 32 (1998): 106-124.
- A technical defense of anti-criterialism.
- Merricks, T. “The Resurrection of the Body and the Life Everlasting.” Reason for the Hope Within, ed. Michael Murray. Grand Rapids, Michigan: Eerdmans Publishing Company, 1999. 261-286.
- A discussion of different accounts of resurrection and an argument for the claim that the doctrine of the resurrection provides support for materialism.
- Perry, J. A Dialogue on Personal Identity and Immortality. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1978.
- A good introduction to the philosophical problems surrounding resurrection. Written in dialogue form.
- Plato, Phaedo. Translated by G.M.A Grube. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1977.
- A fine translation of Plato’s work on the immortality of the soul.
- Swinburne, R. The Evolution of the Soul. New York: Oxford, 1986.
- A defense of Cartesian dualism that has a chapter on the future of the soul.
- Van Inwagen, P. “The Possibility of Resurrection.” The Possibility of Resurrection and Other Essays in Christian Apologetics. Boulder, Colorado: Westview Press, 1998. 45-52.
- A reprint of van Inwagen’s older article which defends the simulacra view. This version contains a significant postscript.
- Zimmerman, D. “The Compatibility of Materialism and Survival: The ‘Falling Elevator’ Model.” Faith and Philosophy 16 (1999): 194-212.
- The origins of the falling elevator model of resurrection.
- Zimmerman, D. “Criteria of Identity and the ‘Identity Mystics’.” Erkenntnis 48 (1998): 281-301.
- A discussion of criterialism.
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Last updated: June 13, 2008 | Originally published: June/13/2008
Categories: Philosophy of Religion