Panpsychism

Panpsychism

Panpsychism is the view that all things have a mind or a mind-like quality. The word itself was coined by the Italian philosopher Francesco Patrizi in the sixteenth century, and derives from the two Greek words pan (all) and psyche (soul or mind). This definition is quite general, and raises two immediate questions: (1) What does one mean by “all things”? (2) What does one mean by “mind”? On the first question, some philosophers have argued that literally every object in the universe, every part of every object, and every system of objects possesses some mind-like quality. Other philosophers have been more restrictive, arguing that only certain broad classes of things possess mind (in which case one is perhaps not a true panpsychist), or that, at least, the smallest parts of things—such as atoms—possess mind. The second question—what is mind?—is more difficult and contentious. Here panpsychism is on neither better nor worse footing than any other approach to mind; it argues only that one's notion of mind, however conceived, must apply in some degree to all things.

The panpsychist conception of mind must be sufficiently broad to plausibly encompass humans and non-human objects as well. Panpsychists typically see the human mind as a unique, highly-refined instance of some more universal concept. They argue that mind in, say, lower animals, plants, or rocks is neither as sophisticated nor as complex as that of human beings. But this in turn raises new questions: What common mental quality or qualities are shared by these things? And why should we even call such qualities "mental” in the first place?

Panpsychism, then, is not a formal theory of mind. Rather, it is a conjecture about how widespread the phenomenon of mind is in the universe. Panpsychism does not necessarily attempt to define “mind” (although many panpsychists do this), nor does it necessarily explain how mind relates to the objects that possess it. As a result, panpsychism is more of an overarching concept, a kind of meta-theory of mind. More details are required to incorporate it into a fully-developed theory of mind.

A view such as panpsychism seems perhaps unlikely at first glance. And in fact many contemporary philosophers have argued that panpsychism is simply too fantastic or improbable to be true. However, there is actually a very long and distinguished history of panpsychist thinking in Western philosophy, from its beginnings in ancient Greece through the present day. Some of the greatest names in philosophy have argued for some form of panpsychism, or expressed a strong sympathy toward the idea. Notably, as we progress into the 21st century, we find the beginnings of a philosophical renaissance for the subject. Once again panpsychism is finding a place in the larger philosophical discourse, and is being explored in a number of different ways.

Table of Contents

  1. The Concept of Panpsychism
  2. A Historical Overview
    1. Ancient Philosophy
    2. Renaissance Thinking
    3. Eighteenth and Nineteenth Centuries
    4. Twentieth Century to the Present
  3. Arguments: Pro and Con
  4. Panpsychism vs. Emergentism
  5. References and Further Reading

1. The Concept of Panpsychism

In a general sense, panpsychism may be defined as the view that all things possess mind, or some mind-like quality. The specific meanings of “all things” and “mind” vary widely among particular thinkers, but there is a broad consensus on three points. First, the mind in all things is something internal to, or inherent in, things themselves (as opposed to being injected or sustained by some outside entity). Second, such mind has a sort of focus or unity to it, in that it is typically assumed to be of a singular nature. Third, "things" usually (but not always) include systems or collections of lower-order entities; thus, a forest may be considered as a thing, though it is composed of a variety of individual trees, plants, animals, and so forth.

Panpsychist theories generally attempt to encompass both the material realm and the mental realm in a single comprehensive framework, in a way that fundamentally connects the two. These realms are central to many aspects of philosophy, but panpsychism lies at a unique intersection of the two, wherein mind is seen as fundamental to the nature of existence and being. It is at once an ontology and a theory of mind.

This latter point requires elaboration. Panpsychism, in itself, is not a theory of mind per se, because it does not in general give an account of the precise nature of mind, nor of how it relates to material things. Rather, it is a meta-theory; it is a theory about theories, a framework which says: However mind is to be conceived, it applies, in some sense, to all things.

Thus panpsychism can apply, in principle, to virtually any conventional theory of mind. There could exist, for example, a panpsychist substance dualism in which some Supreme Being grants a soul/mind to all things. There could be a panpsychist functionalism that interprets the functional role of every object as mind, even if such a role is only “to gravitate,” “to resist pressure,” and so forth. One could argue for a panpsychist identism in which mind is identical to matter; or a panpsychist reductive materialism in which the mind of each thing is reducible to its physical states. The only theories not amenable to panpsychism are those that (a) explicitly argue that only a certain restricted class of beings can possess mind (such as living things or Homo sapiens), or (b) deny the existence of mind altogether (that is, eliminativism). The fact that such restricted conceptions of mind are on shaky theoretical ground suggests that one should not rule out the panpsychist extension of other theories. Rather, the opposite view is perhaps the more reasonable: that one should hold panpsychism as a natural and logical extension of any given theory of mind, until demonstrated otherwise.

A few further points should be made clear at the outset of any discussion of panpsychism. First, philosophers typically do not take panpsychism in the literal sense, meaning all things have a soul; this interpretation of psyche is primarily a remnant of the theological philosophy of the Renaissance. Psyche is today most often interpreted as synonymous with mind or, in a secular sense, spirit.

Second, panpsychism needs to be distinguished from some closely related concepts: animism, hylozoism, pantheism, panentheism, and panexperientialism:

  • Animism, as commonly understood, is the view that all things possess a fully-developed, intelligent, and complex conscious-like spirit. It is a concept arising more from mythology than philosophy, and few panpsychists actually attribute human-like (or god-like) consciousness to all objects.
  • Hylozoism is the theory that everything is alive. This concept originated in ancient philosophy when the notion of life was less well-understood, and hence easily conflated with ideas of spirit and mind. Thus when past writers argue that “everything is alive” we are justified in interpreting this in a panpsychist light. The term has been used sporadically even through the early twentieth century, but based on our current understanding of living organisms, it is less useful or appropriate today.
  • Pantheism identifies everything, collectively, with God, as a single unified being. For the pantheist, the universe itself is God. In general this says nothing about individual things, nor about the nature of mind, and hence has no direct bearing on panpsychism (though some panpsychists do equate God with the cosmos, and hence are pantheists as well—Spinoza being the prime example).
  • Panentheism is the view that God penetrates, or is in, everything. Again, this typically assumes a single unified God, whose omnipresence is taken as the spirit in all things. Such a view is actually close to the standard Christian position, where the Holy Spirit dwells everywhere. But because it offers a notion of spirit as a part of a unified God, and not as spirit of the thing itself, it is not a true form of panpsychism.
  • Finally, panexperientialism is a term that was invented by process philosopher David Ray Griffin in the 1970’s. It holds that everything experiences, or is capable of experiencing.

Of the above terms, only panexperientialism deserves to be considered as true panpsychism; the others are either archaic or largely irrelevant. And due to the prominence of process philosophy over the past few decades, panexperientialism is perhaps the most widely discussed form of panpsychism today.

The process view of panpsychism raises a third issue. When process philosophers argue that all things have a mind or that all things experience, they refer to all “true” or “genuine” individuals. A human being is a genuine individual, as are all animals. One-celled microbes are included, as well as cells in the animal body. Plant cells count as individuals, but, interestingly, whole plants do not—based on a particular reading of some rather cryptic statements by Whitehead. On the process view, rocks and tables are not individuals, but the atoms and molecules that compose them are. Since atoms are seen as possessing mind, all material things are thereby enminded: either as individuals in themselves, or as a collection of sentient atoms. It should be emphasized, however, that the process view is a minority position; most panpsychists throughout history have held to the stronger view that all things possess mind.

Finally, it is clearly debatable what one means by “mind.” Panpsychists have employed a variety of descriptive terms to articulate the mental quality that all things share: sentience, experience, feeling, inner life, subjectivity, qualia, will, perception. In the vast majority of cases such terms are used in a very broad sense, and are not defined in a specifically human sense. In fact, panpsychists deliberately avoid terms that are too closely identified with uniquely human mental characteristics, such as consciousness (or self-consciousness), cognition, thought, belief, and the like. The usual intention is that only mind in the broadest sense is applicable to all things.

2. A Historical Overview

a. Ancient Philosophy

Panpsychism is an ancient concept in Western philosophy, predating even the earliest writings of the pre-Socratics. It was in fact an essential part of the cosmology into which philosophy was born. Thus we should not be too surprised to find its influence recurring throughout our history.

We see evidence of this at the very beginning of philosophy, in the few remaining fragments of Thales, the man widely regarded as the first philosopher of ancient Greece. Thales believed that the lodestone (magnet) possessed a psyche or soul: “According to Thales…the lodestone has a soul because it moves iron” (Aristotle, De Anima, 405a19). Furthermore, the power of the lodestone was seen as a particularly powerful manifestation of a divine animate quality shared by all things: “Certain thinkers say that soul is intermingled in the whole universe, and it is perhaps for that reason that Thales came to the opinion that all things are full of gods” (Ibid, 411a7).

Other pre-Socratics held similar views:

  • Anaximenes put forth the pneuma (air) as the underlying arche, or ruling principle, of the cosmos. Pneuma has a number of related meanings, many of which correspond closely with psyche; in addition to “air” it can also mean breath, soul, spirit, or mind. Since pneuma penetrates and underlies all things, this implies that all things are endowed with a spiritual or soul-like quality.
  • Heraclitus’ arche was fire. Fire, like the pneuma, was associated with life-energy; thus Heraclitus referred to this fire not merely as pyr, but as pyr aeizoon – an “ever-living fire.” Consequently, this life-energy was seen as residing in all things: “All things are full of souls and of divine spirits” (Smith, 1934: 13). In another fragment he proclaimed: “The thinking faculty is common to all” (Freeman, 1948: 32).
  • Anaxagoras envisioned the world as composed of a myriad of substances, but these were ordered and regulated by the single over-arching principle of nous (mind). Nous was a unifying, cosmic mental force that was interwoven with the movement and actions of disparate elements. The mind that is ubiquitous is not just some amorphous, abstract mind, but essentially like that of animals, that is, an animated soul or spirit: “[J]ust as in animals, so in nature, mind is present and responsible for the world…” (Aristotle, Metaphysics, 984b15).

Of special note is the thinking of Empedocles. He invented the four-element view of the cosmos—fire, air, water, and earth—that held for nearly two millennia. All things, including psyche, were composed of these four substances. Furthermore, the elements themselves were seen as ensouled: “Empedocles [says that the soul] is composed of all the elements and that each of them actually is a soul” (Aristotle, De Anima, 404b11). These elements were presided over by two animate forces, Love (attraction) and Strife (repulsion). Hence panpsychism was central to Empedocles’ worldview. Guthrie (1962-81: 233) stated that “it was in fact fundamental to Empedocles’ whole system that there is no distinction between animate and inanimate, and everything has some degree of awareness and power of discrimination.” Perhaps the clearest indication comes in fragment 103: “all things have the power of thought” (Smith, 1934: 31).

Moving to the heart of Greek philosophy, Plato made a number of intriguing comments in support of panpsychism. Notably, passages suggesting such a view occur in four of his last works – Sophist,PhilebusTimaeus, and Laws. This implies that they represent his mature thinking on the matter, and thus have some strong degree of significance in his overall metaphysical system.

Sophist discusses Plato’s ideas about the Form of Being. Since being, on Plato’s view, has the power of self-generating motion (247e), he concludes that the Form of Being must itself have an inherent psychic aspect:

O heavens, can we ever be made to believe that motion [kinesi] and life [zoe] and soul [psyche] and mind [phronesi] are not present with perfect being? Can we imagine that, being is devoid of life and mind, and exists in awful unmeaningness an everlasting fixture? -- That would be a dreadful thing to admit (249a).

All real things participate in the Form of Being, as this is how they acquire their actual existence. Thus, everything may be said to participate in life, mind, and soul.

In the Philebus Plato introduced the concept of the anima mundi—the world-soul (30a). He argued that the universe, like the human body, is composed of the four Empedoclean elements (fire, air, water, earth). Both the human and the cosmos are well-ordered and exhibit clear signs of logos, of rationality. The body, though nothing more than a well-ordered combination of the elements, possesses a soul; therefore a reasonable implication is that the universe too, and everything in it, are ensouled. If this were not the case, then there must be something fundamentally unique about the structure of mankind and the cosmos that they alone are ensouled. Plato gave no indication that this is true and, in fact, argued later to the contrary.

Timaeus contains an account of how the creator of the universe—the Demiurge—brought the cosmos into existence, and endowed it with a world-soul. One learns that not only is the cosmos as a whole ensouled, but so too are the stars, individually; they are “divine living things” (40b), for which “[the Demiurge] assigned each soul to a star” (41e). As well the Earth, described as a “god” (40c), “foremost” in the cosmos. Later (77b) Plato explains that even plants possess the third kind of soul (appetitive), and thus are animate.

Finally, in Laws Plato offers perhaps his final statement on the matter:

Now consider all the stars and the moon and the years and the months and all the seasons: what can we do except repeat the same story? A soul or souls...have been shown to be the cause of all these phenomena, and whether it is by their living presence in matter...or by some other means, we shall insist that these souls are gods. Can anybody admit all this and still put up with people who deny that ‘everything is full of gods’? (899b).

In a nod to the famous line by Thales, Plato seems to resolve this issue for us: everything is full of gods.

Regarding Aristotle, we know that he viewed the psyche or soul as the form (or structure) of living things. Accordingly, non-living things have no soul—hence, technically, Aristotle was no panpsychist. But the question remains whether non-living things have something soul-like in them.

First, we note that there is a kind of evolutionary imperative in Aristotle’s thinking. He envisioned all of nature as continually striving toward “the better” or “the good” (see Physics 192a18; On Generation and Corruption 336b28; Eudemian Ethics 1218a30). By “better” Aristotle has in mind certain specific qualities; he comments that being is better than non-being, life better than non-life, and soul better than matter. Thus, as Rist (1989: 123) points out, there is a meaningful sense in which “the whole of the cosmos is permeated by some kind of upward desire and aspiration”—upward in the sense of toward form, life, and soul.

This outlook is essential to Aristotle because he sought to explain the puzzling phenomenon of spontaneous generation. Plant and animal life seem to materialize out of inanimate matter—such as the maggots and flies that quickly appear in decaying animal waste. How is this possible? The upward striving of matter is part of the explanation, but not the whole story.

Aristotle argued that all natural (as opposed to manmade) objects possess an inherent “principle of motion” (Physics 192b9). This fact permits one to see such motion as “an immortal never-failing property of things that are, a sort of life as it were to all naturally constituted things” (Physics, 250b12). The “sort of life” in matter was no idle concept, but directly connected to the process of spontaneous generation. This life-energy initiates the generative process, thus bringing into being true life and soul.

The life-energy in all things had to be grounded in some kind of substance, in order to be manifest in the real world. So Aristotle adopted, perhaps via Anaximenes, the notion of the pneuma. The pneuma is not, strictly speaking, mind or soul; rather, it is something soul-like. As he says in Generation of Animals, it is the “faculty of all kinds of soul,” the “vital heat” (thermoteta psychiken), the “principle of soul” (736b29).

The soul-like pneuma is ubiquitous in the natural world, penetrating and informing all things. It not only brings soul to the embryo and to the spontaneously-generated creatures, but it accounts for the general desire of matter for form, and for the good. Aristotle is explicit and unambiguous that all things are inspirited by the pneuma. With rather stunning clarity he informs us:

Animals and plants come into being in earth and in liquid because there is water in earth, and pneuma in water, and in all pneuma is vital heat, so that in a sense all things are full of soul (Generation of Animals 762a18-20).

Echoing panpsychist thinking from Thales to Plato, Aristotle apparently came to the conclusion that something soul-like, of varying degrees, inhered in all objects of the natural world.

Post-Aristotelian (Hellenistic) Greek philosophy continued to incorporate panpsychist themes. The two dominant schools of that era were those of Epicurus and the Stoics.

Epicurean physical theory relied heavily on the atomism of Democritus, and followed his central thesis of material objects as composed of atoms moving through the void. The early atomists held to a strict determinism, but this was problematic for Epicurus, as his ethical system required the existence of free will. He therefore discarded the determinism by introducing a new factor that he called “swerve” (parenklisis; in Latin, declinare, a deflection or turning-aside). The swerve was due to a tiny amount of free will exhibited by all atoms.

The willful swerving of the atoms is the basis for our own free will. As Lucretius describes it, “[Out of the swerve] rises, I say, that will torn free from fate, through which we follow wherever pleasure leads, and likewise swerve aside at times and places” (pp. 255-60). Human free will cannot arise ex nihilo (“since nothing, we see, could be produced from nothing”; p. 287), and hence must be present in the atoms themselves: “Thus to the atoms we must allow…one more cause of movement [namely, that of free will]—the one whence comes this power we own” (pp. 284-6). The necessary conclusion, then, is that since all things are composed of willful atoms, all things can be said to be animate.

The early Stoic philosophers— ZenoCleanthes, and Chrysippus—adopted many of their predecessors’ fundamental assumptions about the nature of being and mind, most importantly the Aristotelian/Anaximean conception of the pneuma. Composed of fire and air, the Stoic pneuma was put forth as the creative life energy of the universe. This was most evident in human bodies, in which both warmth (fire) and breath (air) were seen as the essential defining characteristics of life and soul. Pneuma was the active principle made tangible, and as such it accounted for all form that was seen in worldly objects. Pneuma was the “creative fire” of the cosmos, a pyr technikon. It had the status of divinity, and was equated with both god and cosmic reason.

A. A. Long (1974) notes that in the Stoic system “mind and matter are two constituents or attributes of one thing, body, and this analysis applies to human beings as it does to everything else” (p. 171). All material objects are “bodies,” and they are in fact “compounds of ‘matter’ and ‘mind’ (God or logos). Mind is not something other than body but a necessary constituent of it, the ‘reason’ in matter” (p. 174).

b. Renaissance Thinking

The end of Hellenism and the Stoic philosophy coincided with the beginnings of the monotheistic religious worldview. Monotheism and the Christian worldview were fundamentally opposed to panpsychism, and thus it is perhaps not surprising that we find relatively little articulation of panpsychist ideas for several centuries.

The next major advance did not occur until the Italian Renaissance. Five of the most important philosophers of that era—Cardano, Telesio, Patrizi, Bruno, and Campanella—were panpsychists.

Cardano was the first notable philosopher in over a millennium to put forth an unambiguous panpsychist philosophy. His ontological system consisted of a nested hierarchy in which each individual thing was seen as (1) a part (of the larger whole, or One), (2) a unity in itself, and (3) a composition of sub-parts. The fundamental principle maintaining the unity of each part was anima (soul); the particularly human form of this principle he recognized as mind. As the unifying principle, soul was present in all unities large and small.

Like Empedocles, Telesio saw two fundamental and opposing forces in the universe: an expanding and motive principle that he called heat, and a contracting principle, cold. These forces acted on and shaped the so-called third principle, passive matter, which was associated with the Earth. Every object was a composition of passive matter and the heat/cold principles. Heat and cold also had the notable property of perception. Heat sought to stay warm, and cold to stay cool, and this tendency Telesio interpreted as a kind of sensation or knowledge. As he says, “It is quite evident that nature is propelled by self-interest” (1586/1967: 304). And since heat and cold inhered in all things, all things shared in this ability to sense. Thus his position is sometimes referred to as pansensism, a particular form of panpsychism.

Patrizi’s chief work, New Philosophy of the Universe (1591), laid out a complete cosmological system, and introduced into the Western vocabulary the term “panpsychism.” Following the model of Ficino, Patrizi created a nine-level hierarchical system of being, with soul (anima) in the center. As such it permeated all levels, existing simultaneously at the level of the world-soul, the human soul, and the soul of inanimate things. “Patrizi does not treat the individual souls as [mere] parts of the world soul, but believes, rather, that their relation to their bodies is analogous to that of the world soul to the universe as a whole” (Kristeller, 1964: 122). Soul is “both [unity and plurality], with the many contained in the one” (Brickman, 1941: 41).

Bruno was very frank about his panpsychist view, and even acknowledged its unconventionality. In his 1584 dialogue, Cause, Principle and Unity, one character exclaims, “Common sense tells us that not everything is alive. ... [W]ho will agree with you?” Another replies, “But who could reasonably refute it?” (1998: 42). Bruno believed that the same principles must apply throughout the cosmos; the Earth held no privileged position in the universe (such as being at the center), and humans held no privilege with respect to possessing a soul. He took the world-soul and the human soul as given, and concluded that all things, all parts of the whole, must be animated: “[N]ot only the form of the universe, but also all the forms of natural things are souls.” He adds, “there is nothing that does not possess a soul and that has no vital principle” (p. 43). The skeptic retorts: “Then a dead body has a soul? So, my clogs, my slippers, my boots...are supposedly animated?” Bruno clarifies his position by explaining that such “dead” things are not to be considered animate in themselves, but rather as containing elements that either are themselves animate or have the innate power of animation:

I say, then, that the table is not animated as a table, nor are the clothes as clothes...but that, as natural things and composites, they have within them matter and form [that is, soul]. All things, no matter how small and miniscule, have in them part of that spiritual substance... [F]or in all things there is spirit, and there is not the least corpuscle that does not contain within itself some portion that may animate it (p. 44).

Campanella’s system centered on his doctrine of the “three primalities”: power, wisdom, and love. These are three qualities that Campanella saw as residing in all things, from the lowliest rock to the human being, to God himself. He argued that all things possess wisdom and sensation, and therefore can be said to possess the power of knowing. First and foremost, things know themselves: “All things have the sensation of their own being and of their conservation. They exist, are conserved, operate, and act because they know” (in Bonansea, 1969: 156). Cassirer (1963: 148) noted “Panpsychism emerges as a simple corollary to his theory of knowledge.” We see this, very explicitly, in the subtitle of Campanella’s workDe sensu rerum:

A remarkable tract of occult philosophy in which the world is shown to be a living and truly conscious image of God, and all its parts and particles thereof to be endowed with sense perception, some more clearly, some more obscurely, to the extent required for the preservation of themselves and of the whole in which they share sensation.

Campanella offered a number of arguments in support of his panpsychism. For example, following Epicurus and Telesio he argued that “like comes from like,” that is, that emergence is impossible:

Now, if the animals are sentient...and sense does not come from nothing, the elements whereby they and everything else are brought into being must be said to be sentient, because what the result has the cause must have. Therefore the heavens are sentient, and so [too] the earth... (cited in Dooley, 1995: 39).

Campanella was an important thinker, but the two great panpsychists of the seventeenth century were certainly Spinoza and Leibniz. Spinoza created a radical monism in which the single underlying substance of all reality was what he identified as “God, or Nature.” God/Nature possessed two knowable attributes: mind (thought) and matter (extension).

In Spinoza’s psycho-physical parallelism, every object has both its own unique mode of extension and its corresponding mode of thought (also called the “idea” of the object): “In God [/Nature] there is necessarily the idea…of all things…” (Ethics, II Prop 3). Moreover, the idea of an object has a very specific interpretation: it is the mind of that object. Since every object has a corresponding idea, every object can be said to have a mind. This is most apparent to us in our own case, wherein the human mind is simply the idea of the human body. But it is a general ontological principle, and thus applies to all things:

From these [propositions] we understand not only that the human mind is united to the body, but also what should be understood by the union of mind and body. [...] For the things we have shown so far are completely general and do not pertain more to man than to other individuals, all of which, though in different degrees, are nevertheless animate. ... [W]hatever we have asserted of the idea [that is, mind] of the human body must necessarily also be asserted of the idea of everything else (ibid: II Prop. 13, Scholium).

There is some considerable disagreement as to the proper interpretation of Spinoza’s psycho-physical parallelism, and the meaning of the crucial Proposition 13 (above). Yet there seems to be a consensus in recent years that any proper reading will entail some form of panpsychism.

Leibniz’s panpsychism was based on his Monadology, or science of monads. Monads are the point-like constituents of reality, and they possess a number of characteristics that are related to mental qualities. The structure of the monad is to be understood as consisting of two primary qualities, “perception” and “appetite.” Perceptions are the changing internal states of the monads, and these changes are brought about (in a rather vague way) by the monad’s appetite; the appetite was a kind of seeking or desiring, a compelling need to reflect the universe.

The strongly animistic tone of the terms perception and appetite is not coincidental; each monad is identified with a soul:

I found that [the monad’s] nature consists in force, and that from this there follows something analogous to sensation [that is, perception] and appetite, so that we must conceive of them on the model of the notion we have of souls (1989: 139).

Monads themselves are unities, but so too, in a different way, are collections of monads. Any material object is such a collection, and is integrated by the action of a “dominant monad” which represents the integrated unity of the object. Leibniz, following Bruno, made a critical distinction between objects with a truly organic sense of unity and objects that are mere sets, collections, or aggregations of distinct things. Aggregates such as “an army or a flock,” or “a heap of stones” do not possess a dominant monad and thus no unified mind. Interestingly, Leibniz never gave a formal definition as to what qualifies as a group and what defines a true individual. Nonetheless, all things—even mere aggregates—possess mind, if only in their parts. Of this Leibniz was clear: “[W]e see that there is a world of creatures, of living beings, of animals, of entelechies, of souls in the least part of matter” (Monadology, sec. 66).

c. Eighteenth and Nineteenth Centuries

French thinkers Julien LaMettrie and Denis Diderot discarded the concept of the supernatural soul, and concluded that mind, or a mind-like nature, must be present in all matter. This was the view that came to be known as vitalistic materialism. Diderot’s work D'Alembert's Dream (1769) put forth a very explicit panpsychist view: “this faculty of sensation…is a general and essential quality of matter” (1769/1937: 49). Throughout the dialogue one finds repeated references to the “general sensitivity of matter.” At one point he observes that “[f]rom the elephant to the flea, from the flea to the sensitive living atom, the origin of all, there is no point in nature but suffers and enjoys” (ibid: 80).

In the century following the French Enlightenment, panpsychist thought developed most rapidly in Germany. Among its more prominent advocates: Herder, Schopenhauer, Goethe, Fechner, Lotze, Hartmann, Mach, and Haeckel.

Herder was a dynamist philosopher who argued that Kraft (force or energy) was the single underlying substance of reality. As such it reflected both mental and physical properties. Herder sought to unify the diversity of forces (gravity, electricity, magnetism, and light) under the single framework of Kraft, of which the various Kraefte were different manifestations. The Kraft was at once material-energy, life-energy, spirit, and mind. “[Herder] represents the Kraefte of plants and stones as analogous to the soul. [...] [E]ach endowed with a different degree of consciousness...” (Nisbet, 1970: 11). In 1784 he wrote: “All active forces of Nature are, each in its own way, alive; in their interior there must be Something that corresponds to their effects without—as Leibniz himself assumed....”

Schopenhauer’s masterwork, The World as Will and Idea (1819), describes a two-fold system of reality. From one perspective, the world is to be taken according to classical idealism—it exists only as our minds grasp and perceive it, hence as pure idea. On the other hand, the things of the world must also possess an inner reality. When we humans look inside ourselves, we find, ultimately, only forms of wanting, desiring, urging—in short, will. Yet we are material objects, not essentially unlike other material objects; hence all things, not just humans, are, on the inside, will:

We shall accordingly make further use of [the knowledge of the world as will and idea] as a key to the nature of every phenomenon in nature, and shall judge of all objects which are not our own bodies…according to the analogy of our own bodies, and shall therefore assume that as in one aspect they are idea, …so in another aspect, what remains of objects when we set aside their existence as idea of the subject, must in its inner nature be the same as that in us which we call will (1819/1995: 37).

Not just objects, but all the forces of nature are to be seen as forms of will: “[G]enerally every original force manifesting itself in physical and chemical appearances, in fact gravity itself—all these in themselves...are absolutely identical with what we find in ourselves as will” (1836/1993: 20).

Schopenhauer’s theory thus brings an effective unity to the notions of mind and matter:

Now if you suppose the existence of a mind in the human head, [...] you are bound to concede a mind to every stone. [...] [A]ll ostensible mind can be attributed to matter, but all matter can likewise be attributed to mind; from which it follows that the antithesis [between mind and matter] is a false one (1851/1974: 212-213).

Goethe developed a poetic form of panpsychism that displayed itself chiefly in his writings that personified nature. His most explicit statement came from a short essay of 1828: “Since, however, matter can never exist and act without spirit [Seele], nor spirit without matter, matter is also capable of undergoing intensification, and spirit cannot be denied its attraction and repulsion” (1988: 6). Here we find a beautifully concise articulation of panpsychism: no matter without mind, no mind without matter. This is not to say that mind is identical with matter, nor that one can be reduced to the other. It simply claims (like Spinoza and Schopenhauer) that neither mind nor matter exist without the other.

Fechner’s panpsychism was focused primarily on plant life. The fact that plants have a Seele is of critical importance to him because it serves as the basis for a completely panpsychic universe, and a corresponding new worldview. Fechner’s concept of the plant-soul was based, like Aristotle’s, on a comparison and analogy with other living beings:

[I]s not the plant quite as well organized as the animal, though on a different plan, a plan entirely of its own, perfectly consonant with its idea? If one will not venture to deny that the plant has a life, why deny it a soul? For it is much simpler to think that a different plan of bodily organization built upon the common basis of life indicates only a different plan of psychic organization (1848/1946: 168-9).

The Earth itself is “animated,” and is furthermore “an angel, so rich and fresh and blooming, ... turning wholly towards heaven its animated face” (1861/1946: 150, 153). The animate Earth further implies “belief in the animate character of all other stars.”

Lotze’s central work, Microcosmos (1856-64/1885), described a comprehensive philosophical viewpoint based on a rejection of mechanistic thinking. He advocated the notion that all material objects have “a double life, appearing outwardly as matter, and as such manifesting...mechanical [properties, while] internally, on the other hand, moved mentally...” (p. 150). He concluded that “no part of being is any longer devoid of life and animation” (p. 360). Lotze acknowledged the prima facie improbability of his panpsychist view: “Who could endure the thought that in the dust trodden by our feet, in the...cloth that forms our clothing, in the materials shaped into all sorts of utensils..., there is everywhere present the fullness of animated life...?” (p. 361). Ultimately it is the “beauty of the living form [that] is made to us more intelligible by this hypothesis” (p. 366).

Eduard von Hartmann further developed Schopenhauer’s system of the world as will and idea, combining elements of Leibniz, Schelling, and Hegel into a doctrine of spiritual monism. He articulated a worldview in which the unconscious will is the cause of all things. The fact that matter is resolvable into will and idea led Hartmann to accept “the essential likeness of Mind and Matter” (1869/1950, vol. 2: 81): “The identity of mind and matter [becomes] elevated to a scientific cognition, and that, too, not by killing the spirit but by vivifying matter” (ibid: 180).

Mach’s philosophical writings emerged in the early 1880's. A strong empiricist, he developed a neutral monistic philosophy in which the primary substance of existence was something that he called “sensations.” This realization led him rather suddenly to a panpsychist conception of reality: “Properly speaking the world is not composed of ‘things’...but of colors, tones, pressures, spaces, times, in short what we ordinarily call individual sensations” (1883/1974: 579). Recalling Schopenhauer’s tone, Mach wrote:

We shall then discover that our hunger is not so essentially different from the tendency of sulphuric acid for zinc, and our will not so greatly different from the pressure of a stone, as now appears. We shall again feel ourselves nearer nature, without its being necessary that we should resolve ourselves into a nebulous and mystical mass of molecules, or make nature a haunt of hobgoblins (ibid: 560).

Haeckel developed a monistic philosophy in which both evolution and the unity of all natural phenomena played a major part. The unity and relation of all living things convinced him that all dualities were false, especially the Cartesian dualism of body and mind. Haeckel was explicitly panpsychist by 1892: “One highly important principle of my monism seems to me to be, that I regard all matter as ensouled, that is to say as endowed with feeling (pleasure and pain) and motion…” (p. 486). He offered one argument for panpsychism, namely that “all natural bodies possess determinate chemical properties,” the most important being that of “chemical affinity.” This affinity, Haeckel argued, can only be explained “on the supposition that the molecules… mutually feel each other” (p. 483). Three years later he observed, “Our conception of Monism…is clear and unambiguous; …an immaterial living spirit is just as unthinkable as a dead, spiritless material; the two are inseparably combined in every atom” (1895: 58).

By the latter part of the nineteenth century, panpsychist thought began to develop in England and America. The first major British panpsychist of that time was William Kingdon Clifford. He believed in a form of Spinozist parallelism—that some process of mind exists concurrently with all forms of matter. Clifford cited evolutionary continuity in arguing that there is no point in the chain of material organization at which mind can be conceived to suddenly appear. Fellow Briton Herbert Spencer wrote an article in 1884 explaining that modern physics has revealed the “incredible power” of matter. The scientist is forced to conclude that:

every point in space thrills with an infinity of vibrations passing through it in all directions; the conception to which [the enlightened scientist] tends is much less that of a Universe of dead matter than that of a Universe everywhere alive: alive if not in the restricted sense, still in a general sense (1884: 10).

Royce’s 1892 book, Spirit of Modern Philosophy, introduced a form of panpsychism based on absolute idealism: “The theory of the ‘double aspect’, applied to the facts of the inorganic world, suggests at once that they, too, in so far as they are real, must possess their own inner and appreciable aspect” (1892: 419-20). A few years later he added this observation:

[W]e have no sort of right to speak in any way as if the inner experience behind any fact of nature were of a grade lower than ours, or less conscious, or less rational, or more atomic. [...] [T]his reality is, like that of our own experience, conscious, organic, full of clear contrasts, rational, definite. We ought not to speak of dead nature (1898/1915: 230).

Charles Peirce’s article, “Man's Glassy Essence” (1892), begins by noting “[T]here is fair analogical inference that all protoplasm feels. It not only feels but exercises all the functions of mind” (1892/1992: 343). And yet protoplasm is simply complex chemistry, a particular arrangement of molecules. We are therefore compelled “[to] admit that physical events are but degraded or undeveloped forms of psychical events” (ibid: 348). Peirce then laid out his own dual-aspect theory of mind:

[A]ll mind is directly or indirectly connected with all matter, and acts in a more or less regular way; so that all mind more or less partakes of the nature of matter. [...] Viewing a thing from the outside, [...] it appears as matter. Viewing it from the inside, [...] it appears as consciousness (ibid: 349).

d. Twentieth Century to the Present

William James first addressed the subject of panpsychism in his Principles of Psychology. He devoted a full chapter to Clifford’s mind-stuff theory, and displayed notable sympathy to the view. James’ first personal endorsement of panpsychism came in his Harvard lecture notes of 1902-3, in which he noted, “pragmatism would be [my] method and ‘pluralistic panpsychism’ [my] doctrine” (Perry, 1935: 373). In his 1905-6 lecture notes he observed: “Our only intelligible notion of an object in itself is that it should be an object for itself, and this lands us in panpsychism and a belief that our physical perceptions are effects on us of ‘psychical’ realities...” (ibid: 446).

James arrived at a clear and unambiguous position in his 1909 book, A Pluralistic Universe. He explained that his theory of radical empiricism is a form of pluralist monism in which all things are both pure experience and “for themselves,” that is, are objects with their own independent psychical perspectives. In the end he endorsed “a general view of the world almost identical with Fechner’s” (ibid: 309-10). He saw in this new worldview “a great empirical movement towards a pluralistic panpsychic view of the universe” (ibid: 313).

In the early part of the twentieth century, panpsychist philosophy continued to develop rapidly in England and the USA. The dominant philosophical system, the one most connected with panpsychism, was Process Philosophy. Its earliest advocates were Bergson and Whitehead.

Bergson wrote Creative Evolution in 1907. His thesis—that matter is “the lowest degree of mind”—echoes Peirce. He added, following Schopenhauer, that “pure willing [is the] current that runs through matter, communicating life to it” (1907/1911: 206). But Bergson’s clearest elaboration came in Duration and Simultaneity (1922). Here he achieved a true process philosophy wherein all physical events contain a memory of the past. Given his earlier insistence that memory is essential to mind, one can see the conclusion that mind, or consciousness, is in all things:

What we wish to establish is that we cannot speak of a reality that endures without inserting consciousness into it. ... [I]t is impossible to imagine or conceive a connecting link between the before and after without an element of memory and, consequently, of consciousness. ... We may perhaps feel averse to the use of the word “consciousness” if an anthropomorphic sense is attached to it. [But] there is no need to take one’s own memory and transport it, even attenuated, into the interior of the thing. ... It is the opposite course we must follow. ... [D]uration is essentially a continuation of what no longer exists into what does exist. This is real time, perceived and lived. ... Duration therefore implies consciousness; and we place consciousness at the heart of things for the very reason that we credit them with a time that endures (1922/1965: 48-49).

Whitehead’s panpsychism is relatively well known. It is based in his view of an “occasion of experience” as the ultimate particle of reality, and as possessing both a physical pole and a mental pole. If things are nothing but occasions, and occasions are in part mental, then all things have a mental dimension. In Modes of Thought (1938), in the chapter titled “Nature Alive,” he observed, “this [traditional] sharp division between mentality and nature has no ground in our fundamental observation. [...] I conclude that we should conceive mental operations as among the factors which make up the constitution of nature” (p. 156).

Bertrand Russell ultimately came to a neutral monist view in which events were the primary reality, and mind and matter were both constructed from them. After some early, suggestive comments, he became increasingly supportive of panpsychism in the late 1920's. Russell’s book An Outline of Philosophy(1927) directly addressed this. He wrote: “My own feeling is that there is not a sharp line, but a difference of degree [between mind and matter]; an oyster is less mental than a man, but not wholly un-mental” (p. 209). Part of the reason why we cannot draw a line, he says, is that an essential aspect of mind is memory, and a memory of sorts is displayed even by inanimate objects: “we cannot, on this ground [of memory], erect an absolute barrier between mind and matter. ... [I]nanimate matter, to some slight extent, shows analogous behavior” (p. 306). In the summary he adds,

The events that happen in our minds are part of the course of nature, and we do not know that the events which happen elsewhere are of a totally different kind. The physical world…is perhaps less rigidly determined by causal laws than it was thought to be; one might, more or less fancifully, attribute even to the atom a kind of limited free will (p. 311).

Perhaps Russell’s clearest statement came in his Portraits from Memory (1956). Memory is “the most essential characteristic of mind, ... using this word [memory] in its broadest sense to include every influence of past experience on present reactions” (pp. 153-4). As before, memory applies to all physical objects and systems:

This [memory] also can be illustrated in a lesser degree by the behavior of inorganic matter. A watercourse which at most times is dry gradually wears a channel down a gully at the times when it flows, and subsequent rains follow [a similar] course... You may say, if you like, that the river bed 'remembers' previous occasions when it experienced cooling streams. ... You would say [this] was a flight of fancy because you are of the opinion that rivers and river beds do not 'think'. But if thinking consists of certain modifications of behavior owing to former occurrences, then we shall have to say that the river bed thinks, though its thinking is somewhat rudimentary (p. 155).

In contrast to Whitehead, Charles Hartshorne articulated a clear and explicit form of process panpsychism. Beginning with his Beyond Humanism (1937), he laid out the unambiguous position that all true individuals possess a kind of psyche: “Molecules, atoms, and electrons all show more analogy of behavior to animals than do sticks and stones. The constitutions of inorganic masses may then after all belong on the scale of organic being…” (pp. 111-112). Elaborating on this notion over four decades, through such articles as “Panpsychism” (1950), “Physics and Psychics” (1977), and “The Rights of the Subhuman World” (1979), his panpsychism (or, “psychicalism”) is a clear and consistent theme. He combined the insights of Leibniz with Whitehead’s process view into a system which, he claimed, resolved many long-standing philosophical problems: most notably that it serves as a third way between dualism and materialism. Ultimately, panpsychism/psychicalism is, he says, the most viable ontology available to us—certainly preferable to an utterly unintelligible materialism: “the concept of ‘mere dead insentient matter’ is an appeal to invincible ignorance. At no time will this expression ever constitute knowledge” (1977: 95).

Many other great thinkers of the twentieth century promoted panpsychist ideas, including:

  • F. S. C. Schiller: “A stone, no doubt, does not apprehend us as spiritual beings… But does this amount to saying that it does not apprehend us at all, and takes no note whatever of our existence? Not at all; it is aware of us and affected by us on the plane on which its own existence is passed… It faithfully exercises all the physical functions, and influences us by so doing. It gravitates and resists pressure, and obstructs…vibrations, and so forth, and makes itself respected as such a body. And it treats us as if of a like nature with itself, on the level of its understanding…” (1907: 442).
  • Samuel Alexander: “there is nothing dead, or senseless in the universe, [even] Space-Time itself being animated”(1920: 69).
  • John Dewey : “[T]here is nothing which marks off the plant from the physico-chemical activity of inanimate bodies. The latter also are subject to conditions of disturbed inner equilibrium, which lead to activity in relation to surrounding things, and which terminate after a cycle of changes…” (1925: 253).
  • Sir Arthur Eddington: “The stuff of the world is mind-stuff” (1928: 276).
  • J. B. S. Haldane: “We do not find obvious evidence of life or mind in so-called inert matter…; but if the scientific point of view is correct, we shall ultimately find them, at least in rudimentary form, all through the universe” (1932: 13).
  • J. Huxley: “[M]ind or something of the nature as mind must exist throughout the entire universe. This is, I believe, the truth” (1942: 141).
  • Teilhard de Chardin: “there is necessarily a double aspect to [matter’s] structure... [C]o-extensive with their Without, there is a Within to things.” “[W]e are logically forced to assume the existence in rudimentary form...of some sort of psyche in every corpuscle, even in those (the mega-molecules and below) whose complexity is of such a low or modest order as to render it (the psyche) imperceptible...” (1959: 56, 301).
  • C. H. Waddington: “[S]omething must go on in the simplest inanimate things which can be described in the same language as would be used to describe our self-awareness” (1961: 121).
  • Gregory Bateson: “The elementary cybernetic system with its messages in circuit is, in fact, the simplest unit of mind; ... More complicated systems are perhaps more worthy to be called mental systems, but essentially this is what we are talking about. ... We get a picture, then, of mind as synonymous with cybernetic system... [W]e know that within Mind in the widest sense there will be a hierarchy of subsystems, any one of which we can call an individual mind” (1972: 459-60).
  • Freeman Dyson: “The laws [of physics] leave a place for mind in the description of every molecule… In other words, mind is already inherent in every electron, and the processes of human consciousness differ only in degree and not in kind…” (1979: 249).
  • David Bohm: “That which we experience as mind…will in a natural way ultimately reach the level of the wavefunction and of the ‘dance’ of the particles. There is no unbridgeable gap or barrier between any of these levels. ... It is implied that, in some sense, a rudimentary consciousness is present even at the level of particle physics” (1986: 131).

Panpsychism enters the 21st century with vigor and diversity of thought. A number of recent works have focused attention on it. If we look back to the year 1996 we find two books that contributed to a resurrection of sorts. First, Chalmers’ The Conscious Mind lays out a naturalistic dualism theory of mind in which he suggests (with an apparent diffidence) that mind can be associated with ubiquitous information states—following Bateson and Bohm, though without citing their panpsychist views. His relatively detailed discussion of panpsychism sparked a resurgence of discussion on the matter, and contributed to a wider interest. Also, Abram’s Spell of the Sensuous argued from a phenomenological basis for a return to an animistic worldview, though his work was more poetic essay than detailed philosophical inquiry. In 1998 process philosopher David Ray Griffin published Unsnarling the World-Knot, a major milestone in panpsychist philosophy. Griffin supplies a detailed and scholarly assessment of the subject, though with a strong focus on the process view, and with only a cursory historical study.

Into the present century, Christian DeQuincey’s Radical Nature (2002) offers another process perspective, and a more satisfying review of the historical aspect. In 2003 there were two more books dedicated to panpsychism: David Clarke’s Panpsychism and the Religious Attitude, and Freya Mathews’ For Love of Matter. Clarke again takes the process view, underscoring the dominance of this philosophical perspective on the discussion. Mathews moves into new territory; drawing inspiration from Schopenhauer, she crafts a truly metaphysical philosophy in which humans are sensitive participants in an animate cosmos. Gregg Rosenberg released a nominally panpsychist approach to mind in 2004, with his book A Place for Consciousness. In 2005, Skrbina published the first-ever comprehensive study of the subject, Panpsychism in the West. Most recently, Galen Strawson has presented a forceful argument for panpsychism based on the inexplicability of emergence of mind (see Section 4).

Thus, at present we can discern at least six active lines of inquiry into panpsychism:

  1. the Process Philosophy view, as conceived by Bergson and Whitehead, and developed by Hartshorne, Griffin, DeQuincey, and Clarke;
  2. the Quantum Physics approach, as developed by Bohm, Hameroff, and others;
  3. the Information Theory approach, arising from the work of Bateson, Wheeler (1994), Bohm, and Chalmers;
  4. the Part-Whole Hierarchy, as envisioned by Cardano and elaborated by Koestler (1967) and Wilber (1995);
  5. the Nonlinear Dynamics approach, as inspired by Peirce (1892) and further articulated by Skrbina (1994, 2001); and
  6. Strawson’s (2006) “real physicalism” (see Section 4).

These areas all offer significant opportunity for development and articulation. They hold out the hope of resolving otherwise intractable problems of emergentism and mechanism, especially when so many conventional approaches have reached a dead end. As Nagel, Searle, and others have noted, the problems of mind and consciousness are so difficult that “drastic actions” are warranted—perhaps even as drastic as panpsychism.

Panpsychism, with its long list of advocates and sympathizers, is a robust and respectable approach to mind. It offers a naturalistic escape from Cartesian dualism and Christian theology. And, by undermining the mechanistic worldview, it promises to resolve not only long-standing philosophical problems but persistent social and ecological problems as well. Many great thinkers, from Empedocles and Epicurus to Campanella and LaMettrie, Fechner and James to Gregory Bateson, have recognized the potential for the panpsychist view to fundamentally alter, for the better, our outlook on the world. An animated worldview is not only philosophically rigorous, but it can have far-reaching and unanticipated effects.

3. Arguments: Pro and Con

An analysis of historical views, and recent discussions by such individuals as Griffin (1998), Popper (1977), McGinn (1997), and Seager (1995), demonstrate a number of distinct arguments for, and against, panpsychism. Skrbina (2005) identifies a total of six objections and twelve supporting arguments, though with some overlap between them. Below is a summary of the more compelling arguments and objections.

The first major argument for panpsychism is also one of the oldest: the Argument from Continuity. This argument, which is expressed in a variety of forms, claims that there is some critical thread of continuity among all things—a thread intimately related to the processes of mind. The particular entity that is continuous varies, but is typically expressed as either a substance or as a common form, structure, or function. We humans possess mind-like qualities that are a direct consequence of some substance, form, or structure; hence all things, to the degree that they share this common nature, have a corresponding share in mentality.

This is best illustrated through examples. The earliest such argument was presented by Anaximenes, with his arche of pneuma. As a kind of airy spirit, the pneuma accounted for our own minds but also permeated and sustained the entire cosmos and all things in it. Anaxagoras’ nous, and Heraclitus’ pyr, or fire, served a similar purpose, and thus were also arguments by continuity. Empedocles and Plato argued for pluralist, rather than monist, continuity. They saw all things as composed of the four elements (fire, air, water, and earth), and these elements were either souls in themselves (Empedocles), or the basis for human, cosmic, and other soul (Plato).

Among the German philosophers, Herder’s Kraft (force or power) played a similar role. For Schopenhauer, the will was our essential inner nature; since we are simply an “object among objects,” all things must possess an inner will. Fechner (1848/1946) emphasized the functional similarity between humans and, for example, plants. Though obviously different in many ways, living plants share essential functional qualities with humans, both representing a kind of living dynamism that suggests an inner striving and desire, a joy in being alive. Later, the American philosopher Dewey made a related case, stressing the continuity between living and nonliving systems.

At the heart of these arguments is an attempt to draw a fundamental analogy between humans and nonhumans. Some philosophers prefer to call such arguments “analogical,” and for good reason. But this is not sufficiently precise. Nearly every conceivable argument for panpsychism must start from the fact of our own human mind, and draw some analogy from that. It is the nature of the analogy that distinguishes the arguments. The continuity arguments are one particular form of analogical thinking, and hence deserve special designation.

In order to oppose an argument by continuity, one must either refute the existence of the substance or structure, or deny that it relates to mind in any fundamental way—the latter being the more common approach. The critic may argue that the continuity analogy simply fails to hold; hence we have the Inconclusive Analogy objection. Such a critic typically would take the extreme cases of a human versus a rock or an atom, and argue that no relevant analogy can be made. But of course, what seems obvious in the extreme cases is less so when one examines the intermediate points; it is there that the critic has to make his case.

A second general argument for panpsychism, also dating back to ancient Greece, relates to the notion of emergence of mind. The Greeks developed the idea that ex nihilo, nihil fit: out of nothing comes nothing. We thus get the argument that mind cannot arise from no-mind, and hence that mind must have been present at the very origin of things. This is the Argument from Non-Emergence. An extended treatment follows in Section 4.

The Non-Emergence Argument is countered by claiming, naturally, that emergence of mind is in fact intelligible and explicable (this is the majority view, but no philosopher to date has succeeded in giving a widely-accepted explanation for it). Popper (1977) was perhaps the first to use emergence as an objection to panpsychism, but recently an entire volume was dedicated to this topic; see Strawson, et al (2006).

With the advent of Darwin’s theory of evolution in the mid-1800’s there came new support for both continuity and non-emergence arguments. If humans evolved from lower animals, they from single-celled creatures, and they in turn from nonliving matter, then the continuity of beings suggests a continuity of the fundamental qualities of experience, awareness, and mind. Evolutionary continuity over time makes difficult any attempt to define the supposed point in history at which mind suddenly appeared. Haeckel (1892) was the first to offer an evolutionary argument, but Paulsen, Royce, Waddington, and Rensch made essentially the same claim.

Others expressed it differently. There is, they said, no place within the hierarchy of organism complexity—the so-called phylogenetic chain—where one can “draw a line” to distinguish those with mind from those without. Clifford (1874) was perhaps the first to put it this way:

[I]t is impossible for anybody to point out the particular place...where [absence of consciousness] can be supposed to have taken place. [...] [E]ven in the very lowest organisms, even in the Amoeba...there is something or other, inconceivably simple to us, which is of the same nature with our own consciousness... [Furthermore] we cannot stop at organic matter, [but] we are obliged to assume...that along with every motion of matter, whether organic or inorganic, there is some fact which corresponds to the mental fact in ourselves (pp. 60-61).

Others, including Globus, Chalmers (1996), and Rensch, have argued in similar terms.

To counter this argument one must identify a plausible point at which to break the hierarchical chain. Where, and why, does the continuity suddenly fail to hold? All agree that it holds, to some degree, for higher mammals, such as chimpanzees and dolphins. If the critic believes it to fail with rocks and atoms, he must explain this discrepancy—otherwise the objection is invalid. To date few have attempted this. Tye (2000: 171) is one exception; he draws the line at fish and honey bees, which, he says, are the simplest beings that experience a kind of “phenomenal consciousness.” Whether his rationale for this line is acceptable is an open question.

Two final objections bear mentioning. First is the Not Testable, or No Signs, objection: there is no empirical evidence, nor any conceivable test, that could point to the presence of mind in lesser beings. McGinn (1997) and Seager (1995) have raised this point, among others. Yet it is hard to see what might actually count as valid evidence of mind. As Royce and Peirce have observed, simpler minds may appear to us as law-like phenomena. Analogy and rational thinking about metaphysical continuity are all we have to go on. Given the conceptual difficulty in determining, with certainty, the existence of minds in other human beings, one should not be surprised that definitive evidence of lesser minds is lacking. Certainly there is, we may say, an epistemological gap here, in that our knowledge is deficient; but this does not imply an ontological gap, that is, an absence of mind in other things.

Lastly we have the Combination Problem: If mind is supposed to exist in atoms or cells, then higher-order minds, such as humans have, must be some kind of combination or sum of these lesser minds. But it is inconceivable how such a summing would work and how it might account for the richness of experience that we all feel. Because panpsychism cannot account for higher mind, the objector says, it must be false.

We should first note that this is not an objection to panpsychism per se, but only to the particular theory that says that higher-order mind must be composed of lower-order mental elements. Granting this, there remains the general question of the relation between higher- and lower-order minds within the same being. As such, the Combination Problem may be better seen as a call for details.

The problem was first addressed by Leibniz in the late 1600’s. His panpsychist theory of monads allowed for a single dominant monad to unify the collective, and serve as the mind of the body. Kant, in an early work Dreams of a Spirit-Seer, criticized Leibniz’s theory and thus became the first to employ the Combination Problem against panpsychism. In 1890 William James raised the issue, in objection to Clifford’s “mind-stuff” form of panpsychism—though by 1909 he had changed his mind, and stopped viewing combination as an insurmountable hurdle. More recently Seager (1995) highlights the combination problem as one of particular importance, as do a number of contributors to Strawson, et al (2006).

4. Panpsychism vs. Emergentism

The issue of emergence of mind is important because it is the mutually exclusive counterpart to panpsychism: either you are a panpsychist, or you are an emergentist. Either mind was present in things from the very beginning or it appeared (emerged) at some point in the history of evolution. If, however, emergence is inexplicable, or is less viable, then one is left with the panpsychist alternative. This line of reasoning, as mentioned above, is the argument from Non-Emergence.

To briefly recap the historical forms of this argument: it was first formulated by Epicurus circa 300 B.C.E. As we have seen, he argued that the mental quality called will could not arise from non-will, and therefore that the atoms from which everything was made had to possess a kind of will themselves. Will cannot emerge ex nihilo, and thus is present in the very constituents of matter.

Others were likewise convinced by this approach. Telesio held that “nothing can give what it does not possess,” and thus it is inconceivable that mind arises from no-mind. Patrizi believed, similarly, that nothing can be in the effect that is not in the cause; hence, the elements themselves must have life and soul, which they in turn grant to all things. In 1620 Campanella wrote: “If the animals are sentient…and sentience does not come from nothing, the elements whereby they and everything else are brought into being must be said to be sentient, because what the result has the cause must have” (in Dooley, 1995: 39).

The German panpsychists also found this argument compelling. Fechner argued that “animate beings cannot arise from inanimate.” Paulsen examined the question, “Whence did psychical life arise?” His answer: it did not arise, but was present at the origin of things. The sudden appearance of a mental realm “would be an absolute world-riddle; it would mean a creation out of nothing” (1892: 100).

The Non-Emergence argument resurfaced in the late twentieth century with the work of zoologist Sewall Wright. In his 1977 article “Panpsychism and Science” he argued that brute emergence of mind would be a kind of inexplicable miracle in the natural order of things: “Emergence of mind from no mind at all is sheer magic” (p. 82). Thomas Nagel flirted with this argument in his “Panpsychism” essay (1979), but opted not to follow through on all the implications.

The basic problem is this: emergence seems, at first glance, to be a reasonable enough idea, but when pressed for details it comes up sorely lacking. In fact, emergence of mind is very difficult to sensibly explain. Mind is not like five-fingered-ness, or warm-bloodedness. These things, which clearly did emerge, are ontologically unlike mind. They are simply reconfigurations of existing physical matter, whereas mind is of a different ontological order. It is too fundamental an aspect of existence to be comparable to ordinary biological structural features.

Furthermore, emergence of mind is not just some fact of the distant evolutionary past; it must recur every day, in, for example, the development of a human embryo. That is, if a human egg is utterly without mind, and a newborn infant has one, when in the ontogenetic process does mind emerge? Why just there? So in addition to the phylogenetic (historical) emergence problem, we have the related ontogenetic problem as well.

Given that there are very few panpsychists in the world, most everyone is an emergentist. But, as Galen Strawson (2006) has recently emphasized, emergentism is not a forgone conclusion. In fact, it is highly dubious. His piece “Realistic Monism: Why Physicalism Entails Panpsychism” presses this point with notable urgency, and offers the most detailed and complete version of the Non-Emergence argument to date. If one is not a panpsychist, then one necessarily believes that only some subset of creatures is privileged to possess mind. The vast remainder of nature, then, is utterly non-mental. This, Strawson observes, is pure presumption: “there is absolutely no evidence whatsoever” (p. 20) for a non-mental component of reality. We simply assume it to be so.

Strawson’s argument, in a nutshell, is this:

  • There is one ultimate reality to the universe (“realistic physicalism,” as he calls it).
  • Mental (that is, experiential) phenomena are a part of this monistic reality. Therefore, experiential phenomena are physical phenomena, rightly understood.
  • Radical-kind, or brute, emergence is impossible; mental phenomena cannot arise from any purely non-mental stuff.
  • Therefore, the one reality and all things in it are necessarily experiential.

If we are to be physicalists, Strawson says, then let us be real physicalists and take the implications seriously. When we do so, we find that “something akin to panpsychism is not merely one possible form of realistic physicalism, but the only possible form, and hence, the only possible form of physicalism tout court” (p. 9).

Strawson tackles head-on those who implicitly endorse emergence. He asks, “Does this conception of emergence make sense? I think that it is very, very hard to understand what it is supposed to involve. I think that it is incoherent, in fact, and that this general way of talking of emergence has acquired an air of plausibility…for some simply because it has been appealed to many times in the face of a seeming mystery” (p. 12). He gives a number of examples of putative emergence, showing that each is really unintelligible. His slogan: “emergence can’t be brute,” that is, higher-order mind can emerge from lower-order, but mind cannot possibly emerge from no-mind. “Brute emergence is by definition a miracle every time it occurs,” which is rationally inconceivable.

Panpsychism thus offers a kind of resolution to the problem of emergence, and is supported by several other arguments as well. The viability of panpsychism is no longer really in question. At issue is the specific form it might take, and what its implications are. Panpsychism suggests a radically different worldview, one that is fundamentally at odds with the dominant mechanistic conception of the universe. Arguably, it is precisely this mechanistic view—which sees the universe and everything in it as a kind of giant machine—that lies at the root of many of our philosophical, sociological, and environmental problems. Panpsychism, by challenging this worldview at its root, potentially offers new solutions to some very old problems.

5. References and Further Reading

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Author Information

David Skrbina
Email: skrbina@umd.umich.edu
University of Michigan at Dearborn