Divine Immutability

Divine immutability, the claim that God is immutable, is a central part of traditional Christianity, though it has come under sustained attack in the last two hundred years.  This article first catalogues the historical precedent for and against this claim, then discusses different answers to the question, “What is it to be immutable?”   Two definitions of divine immutability receive careful attention.  The first is that for God to be immutable is for God to have a constant character and to be faithful in divine promises; this is a definition of “weak immutability.”  The second, “strong immutability,” is that for God to be immutable is for God to be wholly unchanging. After showing some implications of the definitions, the article focuses on strong immutability and provides some common arguments against the claim that God is immutable, understood in that way.  While most of the historical evidence discussed in this article is from Christian sources, the core discussion of what it is to be strongly immutable, and the arguments against it, are not particular to Christianity.

Table of Contents

  1. Some Historical Evidence for Divine Immutability
    1. Biblical Evidence for and against Divine Immutability
    2. Conciliar Evidence for Divine Immutability
    3. The Protestant Reformers and Divine Immutability
    4. Divine Immutability and Traditional Christianity
  2. What It Is To Be Immutable
    1. Immutability as Constancy of Character
    2. Strong Immutability—God Does Not Change in Any Way
  3. Objections to Strong Immutability
    1. God’s Knowledge of Temporally Indexed Truths, Omniscience and Immutability
    2. Immutability and Modal Collapse
    3. Responsiveness and an Immutable God
    4. Personhood and Immutability
    5. Immutability, Time, and Freedom
  4. Related Issues
    1. Divine Timelessness or Eternality
    2. Divine Impassibility
    3. The Incarnation
    4. Intrinsic/Extrinsic Properties
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Some Historical Evidence for Divine Immutability

Divine immutability is a central aspect of the traditional Christian doctrine of God, as this section will argue. For more detail on this point, see Dorner (1994) chapter 2 and Weinandy (1985).

a. Biblical Evidence for and against Divine Immutability

There are many biblical passages commonly cited as evidence either for or against the doctrine of divine immutability. This short section discusses just a few, with the aim of showing that the Bible is not explicitly clear one way or the other on the question of whether God is immutable. (See Gavrilyuk (2004), p 37-46, for a discussion of these passages and others.) Whichever view one takes on immutability, there are difficult passages for which one has to account.

In some places the Bible appears to speak in favor of divine mutability. For instance, consider these two passages:

Did Hezekiah king of Judah or anyone else in Judah put [Micah] to death? Did not Hezekiah fear the LORD and seek his favor? And did not the LORD relent, so that he did not bring the disaster he pronounced against them? (Jeremiah 26:1. This and all subsequent quotations from the Bible are taken from the New International Version).

In this first example we see the Lord relenting, not doing what he had said he would do.  That appears to be a case of changing from one course or plan of action to another.  Such change seems even clearer in the following case, where God, in response to a sin of David, both sends an angel to destroy Jerusalem, then, grieving the destruction, calls off the angel.

And God sent an angel to destroy Jerusalem. But as the angel was doing so, the LORD saw it and was grieved because of the calamity and said to the angel who was destroying the people, "Enough! Withdraw your hand" (1 Chronicles 21:15).

In this example, God puts a particular plan of action into effect, then, it appears, grieves his decision and reverses it.  God does it as a result of the calamity the angel was causing when destroying the people. God responds to his creation here, and relents.  Both of these texts, and others like them, seem to indicate that God changes, at least in changing his mind and commands. Other relevant biblical passages include, but are not limited to, Exodus 32:14 and Amos 7:1-3.

If all the evidence from the Bible were against immutability, one might think that the case against divine immutability, at least for the Christian and the Jew, would be closed.  However, the Bible also seems to teach that God does not change his mind.  For instance:

God is not a man, that he should lie, nor a son of man, that he should change his mind. Does he speak and then not act? Does he promise and not fulfill? (Numbers 23:19).

He who is the Glory of Israel does not lie or change his mind; for he is not a man, that he should change his mind (1 Samuel 15:29).

These two passages claim that God doesn’t change his mind and so are in tension with the previous two texts.  Beyond these two passages that claim that God does not change his mind, there are also passages where God is said not to change, for instance:

I the LORD do not change. So you, O descendants of Jacob, are not destroyed (Malachi 3:6).

Every good and perfect gift is from above, coming down from the Father of the heavenly lights, who does not change like shifting shadows (James 1:17).

Theologians and philosophers who wish to provide scriptural evidence for divine immutability have commonly cited these passages.

So the Biblical texts are either unclear as to whether God changes or not, or they are inconsistent.  If one wishes to maintain the consistency of scripture on the doctrine of God, one either needs to read the passages where God appears to change in light of the passages where it claims he does not, or vice versa.  But either way the Biblical evidence seems too weak to prove either divine immutability or its contrary.

b. Conciliar Evidence for Divine Immutability

While the biblical evidence seems to underdetermine whether divine immutability is true, the conciliar evidence favors the doctrine of divine immutability. While the later councils explicitly include immutability in their discussions of God’s nature, the earlier councils only discussed divine immutability in relation to the incarnation, the Christian teaching that the Second Person of the Trinity, the Son of God, became man.  This is because the incarnation seemed to require a change of some sort in God.  These early councils employed divine immutability to argue that there was no change in the Godhead when the Son became incarnate.

For instance, consider the conclusion to the creed of the first general council, Nicaea, in 325 (note that this is the end of the original creed, and not the more familiar Nicene-Constantinopolitan creed commonly employed in liturgies today):

And those who say “there once was when he was not”, and “before he was begotten he was not”, and that he came to be from things that were not, or from another hypostasis or substance, affirming that the Son of God is subject to change or alteration—these the catholic and apostolic church anathematizes (Tanner, 1990, p 5, emphasis  mine).

Here the council anathematizes those who claim that the Son of God is subject to change or alteration.  Some, particularly the Arians, were teaching that the Son was a creature and not the Creator.  This anathema is an attempt to rule out such a position by ruling out change in the Son, which only makes sense if God is changeless.  For, how would anathematizing the view that the Son changes rule out the Son’s being a creature unless being changing is incompatible with being God?  One should note, though, that even though the Arians taught that the Son was mutable, they didn’t deny the immutability of the Father, and in fact were attempting to safeguard the immutability of God in their teaching that the Son was a creature (see Gavrilyuk (2004) p 105-7, Weinandy (1985) p 5-20 for more on this).

Also, see the third letter of Cyril to Nestorius from the council of Ephesus, 431, which says, when speaking of Christ:

We do not say that his flesh was turned into the nature of the godhead or that the unspeakable Word of God was changed into the nature of the flesh. For he (the Word) is unalterable and absolutely unchangeable and remains always the same as the scriptures say (Tanner, 1990, p 51, the emphasis is mine.)

Here the council claims that the Word of God, the Second Person of the Trinity, is unalterable and absolutely unchangeable.  Notice, too, that the claim is made to defend against the unorthodox view that the twin natures of Christ mixed in the incarnation.  So whatever immutability comes to, it must come to something that rules out the admixture of natures.

Thirdly, see the Letter of Cyril to John of Antioch about Peace, again from the council of Ephesus:

...God the Word, who came down from above and from heaven, "emptied himself, taking the form of a slave", and was called son of man, though all the while he remained what he was, that is God (for he is unchangeable and immutable by nature)… (Tanner,1990, p 72, the emphasis is mine).

Here the council claims that God is unchangeable and immutable by nature.  Whereas the first two passages cited attribute immutability to the Son, this passage attributes it more generally to God.  But even still, it would be an odd Trinitarian theology that claimed the Son to be immutable but the other Persons to be mutable. Also of note is the letter of Pope Leo to Flavian, bishop of Constantinople, about Eutyches, read at the council of Chalcedon where Pope Leo writes of “the unalterable God, whose will is indistinguishable from his goodness” (Tanner, 1990, p 79).

The closer to the present one comes in western conciliar documents, the more explicitly and repeatedly one finds affirmation of divine immutability. For instance, see the fourth council of Constantinople (869-870), the eighth ecumenical council, by western reckoning, where the Fathers claim in their creedal statement:

We confess, indeed, God to be one…ever existing without beginning, and eternal, ever the same and like to himself, and suffering no change or alteration… (Tanner, 1990, p 161).

Notice that here the object said to be without change or alteration is explicitly God.  The first two conciliar statements cited claim that the Son is immutable, and the third quotation appears to claim that God, and not just the Son, is immutable, but here the object is clearly God.  Also, the creed from the Fourth Lateran council, which met in 1215, begins, “We firmly believe and simply confess that there is only one true God, eternal and immeasurable, almighty, unchangeable, incomprehensible and ineffable…” (Tanner, 1990, p 230); the council of Basel-Ferrara-Florence-Rome, which met from 1431-1445, “deliver[ing]…the following true and necessary doctrine...firmly professes and preaches one true God, almighty, immutable and eternal…” (Tanner, 1990, p 570); the First Vatican council, which met from 1869-1870, “believes and acknowledges that there is one true and living God…he is one, singular, completely simple and unchangeable spiritual substance…” (Tanner, 1990, p 805)  Such texts show that the early church councils of undivided Christendom, as well as the later western councils of the Catholic Church, clearly teach that God is immutable.

c. The Protestant Reformers and Divine Immutability

It isn’t just early Christianity in general and Catholicism in particular that dogmatically affirms divine immutability.  One can find divine immutability in the confessions and canons of traditional Protestantism.  For instance, see the confession of faith from the French (or Gallican) Confession of 1559:

We believe and confess that there is but one God, who is one sole and simple essence, spiritual, eternal, invisible, immutable, infinite, incomprehensible, ineffable, omnipotent; who is all-wise all-good, all-just, and all-merciful (Schaff, 1877, p 359-360).

Also, see the Belgic Confession of 1561, Article 1:

We all believe with the heart, and confess with the mouth, that there is one only simple and spiritual Being, which we call God; and that he is eternal, incomprehensible invisible, immutable, infinite, almighty, perfectly wise, just, good, and the overflowing fountain of all good. (Schaff, 1877, p 383-384)

For a confessional Lutheran affirmation of divine immutability, see, for instance, "The Strong Declaration of The Formula of Concord," XI.75, found in The Book of Concord:

And since our election to eternal life is founded not upon our godliness or virtue, but alone upon the merit of Christ and the gracious will of His Father, who cannot deny Himself, because He is unchangeable in will and essence…

In addition, see the first head, eleventh article of the canons of Dordt, from 1618-1619:

And as God himself is most wise, unchangeable, omniscient, and omnipotent, so the election made by him can neither be interrupted nor changed, recalled nor annulled; neither can the elect be cast away, nor their number diminished (Schaff, 1877, p 583).

And, finally, see the Westminster Confession of Faith from 1647:

There is but one only living and true God, who is infinite in being and perfection, 'a most pure spirit, invisible, without body, parts, or passions, immutable, immense, eternal, incomprehensible, almighty, most wise, most holy... (Schaff, 1877, p 606).

These texts show that the dogmatic and confessional affirmations of divine immutability carry on into Protestantism.

d. Divine Immutability and Traditional Christianity

If one understands traditional Christianity either as the faith of the early, undivided Church or as the intersection of the great, historical confessional statements of Christendom, then one has strong reason to believe that traditional Christianity includes the claim that God is immutable.  Just because one has reason to affirm that God is immutable, however, does not give one reason to favor a particular definition of immutability.  The following section discusses the two leading rival theories of what it is for God to be immutable.

2. What It Is To Be Immutable

Even if it is clear that traditional Christianity includes the doctrine of divine immutability, what, precisely, that doctrine amounts to is not perspicuous.  There are many subtle and nuanced views of immutability—far too many to receive individual attention in this article.  This article focuses on the two most commonly discussed views of immutability.  One is that divine immutability merely guarantees that God’s character is unchanging, and that God will remain faithful to his promises and covenants.  This first view does not preclude other sorts of change in God.  Another, stronger, view of immutability is that the doctrine of divine immutability rules out all intrinsic change in God.  This latter understanding of immutability is the historically common view.

a. Immutability as Constancy of Character

Some thinkers see immutability as the claim that God’s character is constant.  For instance, see Richard Swinburne’s The Coherence of Theism, where he discusses both types of immutability under consideration in this section. Here he sides with the constancy of character view, which he describes as "[i]n the weaker way to say of a person that he is immutable is simply to say that he cannot change in character." (Swinburne, 1993, p 219)  Isaak Dorner’s view is that God is ethically immutable but that divine vitality requires divine change. See Dorner (1994), especially the helpful introduction by Williams, p 19-23, and Dorner’s third essay, “The Reconstruction of the Immutability Doctrine.”  For discussions of Dorner, see Richards (2003) p 198-199 and Williams (1986). This view of immutability understands divine immutability to be the claim that God is constant in his character and virtue; that God is not fickle; and that God will remain true to his promises.

Notice that if immutability is understood in this sense, the Bible passages cited in section 1 may be easier to reconcile than on strong immutability.  The passages where God relents aren’t passages that prove that God is not constant in character.  It may well be God’s good character that causes him to relent.  Given the previous circumstances, God formed one set of intentions due to his constantly good character.  When the circumstances changed, God formed a different set of intentions, again due to his constantly good character.  What changes in these passages is not God’s good character. It is the circumstances God is in when he forms his intentions. Where the Bible teaches that God is unchanging, it means, in this understanding of immutability, that God’s character will not change.  It does not mean the stronger claim that God will not change at all.

One more point in favor of this understanding of immutability is that if it were true, other problems with divine immutability, problems discussed below in section 3, would no longer be problems.  For instance, there would be no problem of explaining how an unchanging God has knowledge of changing truths (e.g., like what time it is).  God’s knowledge could change, on this understanding of immutability, provided that such change in knowledge does not rule out constancy of character.

Another problem discussed in section 3 is that of the responsiveness of an immutable God.  Given weak immutability, divine immutability doesn’t necessitate divine unresponsiveness.  This is because God’s responding to prayers doesn’t require that his character change.  In fact, it could be exactly because his character does not change that he responds to prayers.  So responsiveness is not incompatible with this notion of immutability.  On the constancy of character understanding of immutability, not all change, and in particular, not change as a result of responding to prayer, is inconsistent with immutability.

Nevertheless, if this is the burden of divine immutability—that God’s character is constant—who would deny it (that is, what theist would deny it)?  Divine immutability is a modest thesis when understood as constancy of character.  But even if it is innocuous, and even if it has the above-mentioned positive features, it still has difficulties.  It still leaves a problem for biblical exegesis.  That’s because the first two passages discussed above in section 1 seem to show God changing his mind, whereas the second two seem to teach that God does not change his mind.  So while the fact that it provides some way to reconcile some of the biblical evidence is a point in favor of the constancy of character view, it still faces a difficulty in understanding the scriptures that seem to claim that God does not change his mind.

Moreover, divine immutability understood as only involving the constancy of character seems in tension with the use that the early teachings of the church at the first ecumenical councils made of the concept.  For instance, both quotations from the council of Ephesus claim that the Second Person of the Trinity did not change when assuming the human nature, and both point, as evidence, to the fact that he is unchangeable and immutable.  In fact, the second quotation from Ephesus has it that God is unchangeable and immutable by God’s very nature.  Immutability, however, would be no evidence for the claim that the Second Person of the Trinity didn’t change when assuming the human nature if all immutability amounts to is constancy of character.  How could the constancy of the Second Person’s character entail that he would not change when assuming the human nature?   What does that have to do with whether Christ’s “flesh was turned into the nature of the godhead or that the unspeakable Word of God was changed into the nature of the flesh”?  The change being ruled out at Ephesus is not moral change or change of character, but change of properties and change of nature.  So the early church councils don’t have the constancy of character view in mind when they claim that God is immutable.  If they had such a view in mind, they wouldn’t have thought to point to divine immutability in support of the claim that Christ didn’t change in becoming incarnate.

In regard to the later church councils and confessional statements, they don’t define the meaning of “immutability” when they assert it in the list of divine attributes.  Again, however, one notices that they do not put the affirmation of divine immutability in discussion of God’s character but in discussion of God’s existence.  One finds immutability in a list of other nonmoral attributes, and not subjugated to the affirmation that God is wholly good or holy.

For instance, the Fourth council of Constantinople teaches that God is immutable and unchangeable, and this not in relation to God’s character but in discussion of God’s very existence (“ever existing without beginning, and eternal, ever the same and like to himself, and suffering no change or alteration….”).  The claim of immutability isn’t made in relation to God’s moral character but in a list of affirmations concerning God’s mode of existence.

So, for the reasons given in the preceding paragraphs, divine immutability, taken in its traditional sense, should not be understood to mean merely constancy of character.  Surely constancy of character is a part of the concept.  But divine immutability must be more robust than that to do the work it has been tapped to do in traditional Christianity.

b. Strong Immutability—God Does Not Change in Any Way

A stronger understanding of divine immutability is that God is literally unable to change.  As Thomas Aquinas, a commonly cited proponent of this view, says: God is “altogether immutable…it is impossible for God to be in any way changeable” (Summa Theologiae, the First Part, Question nine, Article one, the response; the quotation is from the translation at newadvent.org). God doesn’t change by coming to be or ceasing to be; by gaining or losing qualities; by any quantitative growth or diminishment; by learning or forgetting anything; by starting or stopping willing what he wills; or in any other way that requires going from being one way to being another.

Whenever a proposition about God changes truth-value, the reason for the change in truth-value of the proposition is not, on this view of immutability, because of a change in God, but because of some other change in something else. (I speak here of a proposition changing its truth-value, though it is not essential for divine immutability that propositions can change truth-values.  If the reader holds a view where propositions have their truth-values eternally, the reader may substitute in his or her preferred paraphrase for apparent change in the truth-value of propositions.)  Father Jones is praising God, and so the proposition that God is being praised by Father Jones is true.  Later that same proposition is no longer true, but not because of any change in God.  It is no longer true because Father Jones stopped praising God, and not because God is in any way different than he was.  Likewise in other situations: God doesn’t go from being one way to being another; rather, something else changes and on account of that a proposition about God changes its truth-value.

One may wonder about the viability of this account when it deals with events that clearly seem to involve God doing something.  For instance, God talked to Abraham at a certain time in history.  Consider the proposition: God is talking to Abraham.  That was true at one point (Hagar might have whispered it to Ishmael after the youth asked what his father was doing).  At other times, God is not talking to Abraham.  But isn’t the change here a change in what God is doing?  Doesn’t God go from talking to not talking to Abraham?  And if so, how does that fit with the claim made in the previous paragraph, that changes in propositions about God are due to changes in things besides God?

The defender of strong immutability will draw a distinction here between the actions of God and their effects.  God, on this view, is unchangingly performing his divine action or actions, but the effects come and go.  Compare: In one swift action I throw a barrel full of messages in bottles overboard in the middle of the Atlantic.  This action of mine has multiple effects: it causes waves and ripples as the bottles hit the water.  Later, it causes other effects as people read the messages I’ve sent.  I convey some information to those whom the bottles reach, but the action I performed to do so has long since ceased.  Depending on one’s view of divine simplicity and divine eternity, some aspects of this analogy will have to be changed.  But the point remains: one action can have multiple effects at multiple times.  God immutably acts to talk with Abraham, and either does so atemporally or, if God is inside of time, has always and will always so act.  The changing of the truth-value of the proposition that God is talking to Abraham is not due to God changing, on this theory, but due to the effects of God’s action coming and going.

Strong immutability has a few things going for it.  First, it is congruent with the final four passages of Scripture cited in section 1.  If God is strongly immutable, he cannot change his mind, and he also cannot change.  So these last four passages pose no problem on this understanding of immutability.

Also, this stronger notion of immutability does the work needed for the early councils, which point to immutability to show that the Second Person of the Trinity does not change when assuming the human nature.  The conciliar reference to divine immutability is understandable if immutability is understood as strong immutability, whereas it is not understandable if it is understood in the weaker constancy of character sense.

Finally, this strong understanding of divine immutability is very common in church history. Just like the constancy of character model of divine immutability, however, this understanding is not without its own problems.  First it has to provide a way of understanding the first two scripture citations, as well as the many others where God appears to change. Furthermore, it has other difficulties, which are consider in the following section.

3. Objections to Strong Immutability

There are many objections to the strong view of divine immutability, some of which were discussed in the previous section, including changes which appear to be changes in God, but which, on this view, are parsed as changes in other things, such as the effects of the unchanging divine action.  This section discusses some other objections to strong immutability.

a. God’s Knowledge of Temporally Indexed Truths, Omniscience and Immutability

Here is a truth that I know:  that it is now 2:23pm.  That is something I couldn’t know a minute ago, and it is something that I won’t know in a minute.  At that time, I’ll know a different truth: that it is now 2:24pm.  Either God knows such temporally indexed truths—truths that include reference to particular times at which they are true—or not.  If God does not know such truths, then he is not omniscient, since there is something to be known—something a lowly creature like me does, in fact, know—of which God is ignorant.  Since very few theists, especially of a traditional stripe, are willing to give up divine omniscience, very few will be willing to claim that God is ignorant of temporally changing truths like truths about what time it is.

If God is omniscient, then God knows such temporally changing truths.  If God does know such temporally changing truths, then God changes, since God goes from knowing that it is now 2:23pm to knowing that it is now 2:24pm.  And worse, God changes with much more frequency, since there are more fine-grained truths to know about time than which minute it is (for instance, what second it is, what millisecond it is, etc.)  If God knows such truths at some times but not at others, God changes.  And if God changes, divine immutability is false.  So if God is omniscient, he is not immutable.  Therefore, God is either not immutable or not omniscient.  And since both views are explicitly held by traditional Christianity (and other monotheisms) there is a problem here for the traditional proponent of divine immutability.  This argument was put forward forcefully by Norman Kretzmann in his article Omniscience and Immutability (1966).

There are a few common responses to this argument.  First, one can claim that in order to be omniscient, God needn’t know indexed truths as indexed truths.  Second, one might claim that knowledge is not an intrinsic state or property, and that God’s immutability extends only to God’s intrinsic properties.  Third, one might argue that God does not know in the same way that we know, and this problem arises only if God knows things by being acquainted with particular propositions, as we know things.  Fourth, one might respond by assuming God is atemporally eternal and distinguishing the present-tensed terms in the premises between the eternal and temporal present.

Consider the first response.  God needn’t know that now it is 2:23pm.  Rather he knows the same fact under a non-temporally-indexed description.  For instance, God knows that the expression of this proposition, that it is now 2:23pm, is simultaneous with a state that, by convention, we call 2:23pm.  Such knowledge of simultaneity doesn’t require a temporal indexing, and so doesn’t require change across time.  One may wonder here, though, whether indexicals can be eliminated from all indexed propositions without any change in the meaning of the propositions. (For more on whether knowledge of indexical propositions can be reduced to knowledge of nonindexed propositions, see John Perry (1979).)

The second response is put forward by Brian Leftow.  Leftow understands divine immutability as the doctrine that God undergoes no change of intrinsic properties.  Intrinsic properties are properties that involve only the bearer of that property, or, put another way, properties that a thing would have even if it were the only thing in existence, or, put another way, properties a thing would have that don’t require other things to have particular properties (Leftow, 2004). My shape is a property intrinsic to me, as is my being rational.  If you could quarantine me from the influence of everything else, I’d still have my bodily shape and my rationality.  My distance from the Eiffel Tower or height relative to my little cousin, however, are extrinsic properties, since they require the existence of certain things and their having particular properties.  By changing something else and leaving me the same—let my cousin grow for a few more years—you can change my extrinsic properties.  But not so with my intrinsic properties. (This is a rough understanding of intrinsic properties, since if you quarantined me off from the influence of everything I wouldn’t have air to breathe, wouldn’t be under the influence of gravity, light, or anything else.  What it is to be intrinsic is notoriously difficult to define.  For more on intrinsic properties, see David Denby (2006).)

Is God’s knowledge intrinsic or extrinsic to God?  On this definition of intrinsic, God’s knowledge of creatures is extrinsic.  For instance, God’s being such that he knows that it is now 2:24pm entails that something else (for instance, the universe, or the present) has a property (for instance, to give some examples from Leftow (2008), being a certain age, or being a certain temporal distance from the first instant). Likewise for God’s knowledge of other changing facts; since God’s knowing that a is F, where a is not God, entails something about another being having a property—namely, it entails that a is F—such properties of God are extrinsic.  Hence God’s going from knowing that a is F to knowing that a is not F does not require an intrinsic change, and thus is not contrary to divine immutability.

This response faces a difficulty because even if God’s knowledge of other things is extrinsic, since it entails properties in things other than God, belief is not extrinsic.  My knowledge of who is in the adjoining office changes when people come and go, since knowledge entails truth, and the truth of who is there changes.  But my belief of who is there, having no necessary relation to truth, can remain constant even across change in truth-values.  This shows that even if knowledge is intrinsic, since it fluctuates with truth, belief is not extrinsic, since beliefs can be as they are whether or not the world is as they present it.

So even if God’s knowledge of creatures is extrinsic, God’s beliefs concerning creatures are intrinsic, since they don’t require anything of creatures.  This suggests that the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction will not save strong immutability from an argument from changing truths based on beliefs rather than knowledge.  In response to an argument run from beliefs rather than knowledge, one might point out that God believes all and only what is true.  Thus God's beliefs about creatures, and not merely his knowledge about them, will be extrinsic. This is because God believes something if and only if he knows it, and he knows it if and only if it is true: God's belief that a is F entails, and is entailed by, that a is F.

A second difficulty with Leftow’s response is that knowing and believing seem to be quintessential intrinsic properties, which might lead one to reject this understanding of intrinsic properties.  A third problem is that this view, far from keeping God unchanging, instead has some of his properties changing every instant, since he extrinsically changes with every passing instant.  If change of a property entails change full stop, and it seems to, then God is continually changing on this view.  A fourth and final problem is that this answer is inconsistent with another traditional attribute of God—atemporality.  An atemporal God cannot change at all, since change requires time.  So even if this response can answer the other problems, the proponent of divine eternality, and this includes Leftow, will not be able to embrace this response.

Tom Sullivan champions the third response. He argues that the problem arises due to a misunderstanding of how God knows.  We know by being properly related to certain thoughts or propositions.  So when the time changes, the proposition or thought we need to be related to in order to know the truth changes.  But if God does not know by being related to propositions, but in some other sui generis way that doesn’t require change in relation to propositions, then the problem may be defused (Sullivan, 1991).

This is a negative response, since it only says we don’t know as God knows, and doesn’t spell out the mode of knowing that God has.  And this counts against the response, since it doesn’t give us a way of understanding how God knows.  By being undeveloped, it is hard to analyze its merits.  Nevertheless, if it is true that God knows in a way unique to him, then that way may help solve the problem.

A final response is due to Eleonore Stump and Norman Kretzmann. Their response assumes divine eternity, which implies, in part, that God is atemporal.  They argue that the claim that God knows what time it is now is ambiguous between four readings, depending on whether the “knows” is understood as an eternally present or temporally present verb, and depending on whether the now refers to the temporal now or the atemporal now.  Thus, God knows (eternally or temporally) what time it is now (that is, in the temporal present or the eternal present).  Nothing can know what time it is in the eternal present, since in the eternal present there is no time.  So we must understand the sense of ‘now’ to be ranging over the temporal present and not the eternal present.  God, since eternal, cannot know at the present time, but must know eternally.  So the only viable reading of the four possible readings is God knows eternally what is happening in the temporal present.  Consider the following inference introduced earlier: “If God does know such temporally changing truths, then God changes, since God goes from knowing that it is now 2:23pm to knowing that it is now 2:24pm.”  This inference, Stump and Kretzmann claim, does not hold when it is disambiguated as they disambiguate it.  For God eternally knows that at different times different truths are true, for instance, that it is now (at the temporal present) a certain time, but he knows these truths in one unchanging, atemporal action.  God’s eternal knowledge not only doesn’t allow for change; it positively rules change out, since change is inconsistent with eternity.  God eternally knows what is happening now, and at every other time, but in so knowing doesn’t go from being one way to being another.  Rather God simultaneously knows (on the assumption of divine eternity) in one act of knowing all temporally indexed truths (Stump and Kretzmann, 1981, p 455-458).

This response requires the assumption of divine eternity, which may be a cost for some defenders of divine immutability.  Also, it requires an understanding of simultaneity that can allow for God to be simultaneous with all times, but not entail that all times be simultaneous. Stump and Kretzmann offer such an account of simultaneity. (For more on this topic, see Leftow (1991) chapters 14 and 15.)

b. Immutability and Modal Collapse

One might worry that strong immutability leads to a modal collapse—that whatever is actually the case is necessary and whatever is not the case is impossible.  For, one might think, if it is impossible that God change, then no matter what happens, God will be the same.  So, no matter what happens, God will talk to Abraham at a certain time.  God can’t change to do anything else.  And if God can’t change to do anything else, then it seems like he’s stuck doing what he does, knowing what he knows, desiring what he desires, and so on, come what may.  And if that’s true, it is a small step to saying nothing could be different than it is, since if God hadn’t talked to Abraham at a certain time, God would be different.  And if God were different, he would be mutable.

The key to responding to this objection is to draw a distinction between being different in different circumstances and changing.  Divine immutability rules out that God go from being one way to being another way.  But it does not rule out God knowing, desiring, or acting differently than he does.  It is possible that God not create anything.  If God hadn’t created anything, he wouldn’t talk to Abraham at a certain time (since no Abraham would exist).  But such a scenario doesn’t require that God change, since it doesn’t require that there be a time when God is one way, and a later time when he is different.  Rather, it just requires the counterfactual difference that if God had not created, he would not talk to Abraham.  Such a truth is neutral to whether or not God changes.  In short, difference across possible worlds does not entail difference across times.  Since all that strong immutability rules out is difference across times, divine immutability is not inconsistent with counterfactual difference, and hence does not entail a modal collapse.  Things could have been otherwise than they are, and, had they been different, God would immutably know things other than he does, all without change (to see more on this, see Stump (2003) p 109-115.) In the words of one Catholic dogmatist:

Because of His unchangeableness God cannot revoke what he has once freely decreed,—such decisions, for instance, as to create a visible world, to redeem the human race, to permit Christ to die on the cross, etc.—though it is possible, of course, that some other Economy different from the present might be governed by entirely different divine decrees (Pohle, 1946, p 283).

One might still have worries about modal collapse here, especially if one affirms the doctrine of divine simplicity along with strong immutability, as most proponents of strong immutability do.

As I’ve argued, strong immutability rules out differences across times, but not across possible situations or worlds (or Economies, as Pohle has it).  The doctrine of divine simplicity—the thesis that in God there is no composition whatsoever, that God is uniquely metaphysically simple—seems to rule out difference across possible worlds. For what is there in God to be different if God is wholly simple?  So it seems that these two doctrines together rule out God’s being different at all, either across time or across worlds, and so, together, they seem to entail a modal collapse.

The first thing to note here is that, even if it is true that the doctrines of divine simplicity and strong immutability together entail a modal collapse—and there is good reason to be suspicious of this claim—the doctrine of divine simplicity is doing all the work in entailing the modal collapse.  This is because it, and it alone, seems to entail that God is the same in all possible worlds—strong immutability is silent on this point.  The second thing to note here is that the doctrine of divine simplicity can be understood in many different ways, some of which do not require simplicity to entail modal collapse.  Enumerating and defending these ways, however, is beyond the scope of this entry. (For two such understandings of divine simplicity, see Stump (2003), p 109-115, and Brower (2008)).

c. Responsiveness and an Immutable God

Adherents to the three great monotheisms, as well as other theists, traditionally believe that God answers prayers.  Answering prayers requires a response to the actions of another (in particular, a response to a petition).  Here is an argument that begins with responsiveness and concludes to a mutable God.  God is responsive to prayers.  Anything that is responsive, in responding, undergoes change.  Thus if God responds to prayers, then God undergoes change.  If God undergoes change, then God is not immutable.  Therefore, if God responds to prayers, then God is not immutable.

One response to this argument is to define immutability in the weaker sense of constancy of character (the discussion here follows Eleonore Stump’s treatment of divine responsiveness in her book Aquinas (Stump, 2003, p 115-118).  See also Stump and Kretzmann, “Eternity,” especially pages 450-451).  Immutability, so defined, does not rule out responsiveness to prayers.  In fact, it might be God’s character that accounts for divine responsiveness.  The defender of the strong immutability, however, will have to make a different reply.  Since she will affirm that God responds to prayers, she will reject the claim that responsiveness requires change.  One way to support such a rejection is to provide an analysis of responsiveness that doesn’t require change across time.  Here are two such analyses:

J is responsive to T’s request to x if and only if J does x because T requested it.

J is responsive to T’s request to x if and only if J does x, and J might not have done x if T didn’t request it.

If either of these two closely related views is correct, then responsiveness doesn’t require temporal priority or change.  Notice that nothing in these two understandings of responsiveness requires change in the part of a responder.  In many cases where someone changes in responding it is, in part, due to her gaining new knowledge or having to prepare to respond.  But suppose that there was no point in her existence where she didn’t know that to which she responds or isn’t prepared to respond.  It might be hard to imagine what that would be like for a human, since we humans were once ignorant, powerless babes.  But suppose a person were omniscient and omnipotent for all of his existence.  God, since omniscient, knows of all petitions, and, since omnipotent, needn’t ever prepare to answer a petition.  So God doesn’t fall under the conditions that humans fall under which require change on their parts to respond.  God can be immutably responding to the petitions of his followers.  That is, God can act in certain ways because his followers ask him to, and he might not have acted that way had they not asked.  But he doesn’t need to change in order to do so.

What responsiveness does require is counterfactual difference.  That is, had the circumstances been different than they are, then God might have done differently.  And that’s true.  Had Monica not asked for Augustine’s conversion, and God saved Augustine, at least in part, because Monica asked him to, God might not have converted Augustine.  All this leads to an important point: responsiveness is a modal, not temporal, concept.  That is, responsiveness has to do with difference across possible situations and not change across times. To respond is to do something because of something else.  Since we’ve seen in the previous objection that divine immutability does not rule out counterfactual difference, responsiveness is not ruled out by immutability.  While in very many cases it seems that responsiveness will require change, it does not require change in situations where the responder need not gain knowledge and need not prepare to respond.

d. Personhood and Immutability

Some thinkers have claimed that there is an inconsistency in something’s being both a person and unchanging.  One reason for thinking that personhood and immutability are inconsistent is that being a person requires being able to respond, and responsiveness is not possible for something immutable.  That objection was already discussed in the proceeding section.  But there are other reasons for thinking that personhood and immutability are inconsistent.

Richard Swinburne claims that personhood and immutability are inconsistent because immutability is inconsistent with responsiveness, as the previous objection had it, and additionally because immutability is inconsistent with freedom.  God is free, and, according to Swinburne:

[A]n agent is perfectly free at a certain time if his action results from his own choice at that time and if his choice is not itself brought about by anything else.  Yet a person immutable in the strong sense would be unable to perform any action at a certain time other than what he had previously intended to do.  His course of action being fixed by his past choices, he would not be perfectly free (Swinburne, 1993, p 222).

A strongly immutable God cannot be free, and God is perfectly free, so God is not strongly immutable.

One response to this problem is to invoke divine timelessness.  If God is outside of time, this passage, which is about things that are “free at a certain time” does not apply to God. Furthermore, if we were to drop the “at a certain time” from the text, the proponent of divine timelessness would still have a response to this argument.  Given that God is atemporal, it isn’t true of God that he “previously intended to do” anything.  There are no previous or later intentions for an atemporal being—they are all at once.  Likewise, he would have no “past choices” to fix his actions.  So this argument is not applicable to an atemporal, immutable person.

Even for a temporally located immutable person, there are still responses to this argument.  The perfectly free, temporally located, immutable person needn’t have his actions brought about by anything else besides his own choices.  Such an agent can still fulfill the criterion set out by Swinburne for being perfectly free.  God’s immutable action is brought about by his own choice at a time, and his choice is not brought about by any previous things, including previous choices.  Swinburne is right that God’s past choices would bring about his present actions (being immutable, God’s choices can’t change, so the past choices are identical with the present choices), but he is wrong in thinking that his choice is brought about by previous things.  For the choice of a temporal, immutable God is everlastingly the exact same (if God goes from choosing one thing to not choosing that thing, he is not immutable).  God’s action is everlastingly the same, and everlastingly brought about by God’s choice, which is also everlastingly the same.  God’s course of action is, as Swinburne says, fixed by past choices, but those past choices are identical with the current choices, and the choices are not brought about by anything else.  So such a being will fulfill the definition of what it is to be perfectly free.

One might also think that personhood requires rationality, consciousness, the ability to communicate, and being self-conscious (William Mann, 1983, p 269-272). Notice that none of these properties are inconsistent with immutability.  Some aspects of human rationality and consciousness aren’t available for an immutable person, for example, getting angry, learning something new, or becoming aware of a situation.  That doesn’t entail that an immutable person cannot be rational or conscious at all.  Rather, it means that the aspects of rationality or consciousness that require temporal change are ruled out.  But an immutable God can still be aware of what Moses does, still respond in a way we can call wrathful, and still love Moses.  Such actions are clear cases of rationality and consciousness and none of them require, as a necessary condition, change in the agent.

e. Immutability, Time, and Freedom

Suppose that God is in time, but immutable.  That means his knowledge can’t change over time, as discussed in a previous objection.  So anything God knows now, he knew a thousand years ago.  And here’s one thing that God knows now: what I freely chose to eat for breakfast yesterday.  I know such a truth, so God can’t be ignorant of it.  Given immutability, God can’t go from not knowing it to knowing it.  So he has everlastingly known it.  Similarly for all other truths.  In general, God knows what we are going to do before we do it.

If God knows before I act that I am going to act in that way, then I can’t do anything but act in that way.  And if, for every one of my actions, I can’t do otherwise, then I can’t be free.  Put another way, God’s knowledge ten thousand years ago that I would do thus-and-such entails that now I do thus-and-such.  And that’s true of all my actions.  So God’s knowledge determines all of my actions.

The proponent of an eternal, immutable God doesn’t face this problem, since on that view God doesn’t, strictly speaking, know anything before anything else.  Likewise, someone who denies immutability may get around this objection by affirming that God changes to learn new facts as time marches on.  But the defender of a temporal, immutable God has neither of these options available.

One response open to the defender of a temporal, immutable God is to embrace the view, presented above in section 3.a, that immutability doesn’t rule out extrinsic change, and gaining or losing knowledge is extrinsic change.  The benefits and costs of this view were discussed above.

Another response would be to argue that there is an asymmetry between truths and the world which allows for prior logical determination not to render a posterior action unfree. Truths are true because reality is as it is, and not the other way around.  So the truth of God’s knowledge that I do thus-and-such is because I do thus-and-such, and not the converse.  In order to get unfree action, one must have one’s actions be done because of something else, such as force.  Since the dependence of truth on reality requires the “because of” relations to run the other way, actions entailed by the truth of earlier truths do not render such actions unfree. ( Trenton Merricks, 2009; see also Kevin Timpe, 2007).

A final response is to claim that God knows all the actions that I will do, and he knew them far before I do actually perform those actions, but, were I to freely do something else, he would have known differently than he does.  This answer requires backwards counterfactual dependence of God’s knowledge on future actions.  But it doesn’t, at least without much argument, require backwards causation. This view is known as Ockham’s Way Out, and was popularized in an article by Alvin Plantinga (1986) entitled, aptly, “On Ockham’s Way Out.”

4. Related Issues

There are both philosophical and theological issues related to divine immutability.  Some theological issues include the relationship between immutability and other attributes and the consistency of God becoming man yet being strongly immutable.  As for philosophically related issues, one is the issue discussed above in section 3.e: the issue of (theological) determinism and free will.  Another relevant issue is the distinction, so important to Leftow’s understanding of immutability (see section 3.a), between intrinsic and extrinsic properties.

a. Divine Timelessness or Eternality

As is clear from the responses to some objections in section 3, supposing that God is outside of time has some advantages when it comes to answering objections to divine immutability (Mann, 1983). Divine timelessness entails divine immutability, given that change has as a necessary condition time in which to change.  But running the entailment relation the other way—from immutability to timelessness—is more difficult.  If one can show that existing in time requires at least one sort of intrinsic change—if, for instance, change in age or duration of existence is intrinsic change—then one can argue that immutability and temporality are inconsistent (Leftow, 2004). For arguments from immutability to timelessness, see Leftow (2004).

b. Divine Impassibility

Divine impassibility is the claim that God cannot have affects, or be affected by things.  Paul Gavrilyuk describes it as follows:

[T]hat [God] does not have the same emotions as the gods of the heathen; that his care for human beings is free from self-interest and any association with evil; that since he has neither body nor soul, he cannot directly have the experiences typically connected with them; that he is not overwhelmed by emotions and in the incarnation emerges victorious over suffering and death (Gavrilyuk (2004) 15-16; for other definitions of the term, see Creel (1986) 3-10).

Notice that impassibility, as so described, doesn’t entail immutability.  An agent can be impassible in the sense described by Gavrilyuk but still mutable.  He can, for instance, change in going from not promising to promising and be impassible.  Likewise, an immutable God can be passible.  He can be continually undergoing an emotion without change—for instance, he could be continually feeling the sorrow over human sin without change (Leftow, 2004). Neither entails the other. Nevertheless, they are closely related and often discussed in tandem.

c. The Incarnation

The incarnation is the doctrine, central to Christianity, that the Son of God, the Second Person of the Trinity, assumed a full human nature (that is, all that there is to a human), and became man.  Thus the one divine person had two natures—one divine, and one human, each with its own intellect and will, and these two natures didn’t mix together or exclude one another.  For the most important traditional expression of this doctrine, see the council of Chalcedon.  (Though it must be said that the doctrine wasn’t fully developed—in particular, the parts about Christ having two wills—until later councils.)

The incarnation raises questions concerning the immutability of God insofar as in the incarnation the Second Person of the Trinity becomes a man, and becoming, at least on the face of it, appears to involve change.  So the incarnation, it has been argued, is inconsistent with divine immutability.

This is not the place to go into a theological discussion of the consistency of the two teachings.  One should note, however, that the very church fathers and councils that teach that Christ’s two natures didn’t change one another or mix together, provide as evidence, as we saw in sections 1.b and 2, that God is absolutely unchangeable by his very nature.  So the principle of charity dictates that if we do find ourselves understanding immutability and the incarnation such that there is an explicit, obvious contradiction between them, noticeable by the merest reflection upon the two doctrines, the chances are that it is our understanding, and not the traditional doctrine's, that is at fault. To see more on the relationship between the incarnation and immutability, see Richards (2003) p 209-210 and Dodds (1986) p 272-277.  Stump (2003) chapter 14 is helpful here as well.  Also, see Weinandy (1985), which is a book-length discussion of this very question.

d. Intrinsic/Extrinsic Properties

The distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic properties is important to the discussion of divine immutability because there needs to be a way to distinguish between the predications concerning God which can change in truth-value without precluding divine immutability and those that can’t.  This was discussed in sections 2.b and 3.a.  Divine immutability is compromised if that God is planning to redeem creation changes in truth-value, but it is not compromised if that God is being praised by Father Jones changes in truth-value.  The difference between propositions of these two sorts is often spelled out in terms of intrinsic and extrinsic properties (oftentimes extrinsic changes are called Cambridge changes).  God’s plans are intrinsic to God, but his being praised is extrinsic to him (unless he is praising himself).

5. References and Further Reading

  • Brower, Jeffrey. “Making Sense of Divine Simplicity”. Faith and Philosophy 25(1) 2008. p 3-30.
  • Creel, Richard. Divine Impassibility. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1986.
  • Denby, David. “The Distinction between Intrinsic and Extrinsic Properties”. Mind: A Quarterly Review of Philosophy 115(457) 2006. p 1-17.
  • Dodds, Michael. The Unchanging God of Love: a Study of the Teaching of St. Thomas Aquinas on Divine Immutability in View of Certain Contemporary Criticism of This Doctrine. Fribourg: Editions Universitaires, 1986.
    • This book provides a detailed and historical look at Thomas Aquinas’ understanding of immutability, as well as defending it against objections.
  • Dorner, I. and Robert Williams. Divine Immutability. Minneapolis: Fortress Press, 1994.
    • This is an important work on immutability by a 19th century theologian, which receives more attention in theological than in philosophical contexts.
  • Gavrilyuk, Paul. The Suffering of the Impassible God. Oxford Oxfordshire: Oxford University Press, 2004.
    • This is a good, recent discussion of divine impassibility.
  • Kretzmann, Norman. “Omniscience and Immutability”. Journal of Philosophy 63(14) 1966. p 409-421.
  • Leftow, Brian.  “Eternity and Immutability.” The Blackwell Guide to Philosophy of Religion.  Mann, William E.  Blackwell Publishing, 2004.
    • This is an excellent article on divine immutability and eternality from a philosophical viewpoint.
  • Leftow, Brian. “Immutability”. The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2008 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).
    • This, too, is an excellent article on divine immutability from a philosophical viewpoint.
  • Leftow, Brian. Time and Eternity. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1991.
    • This book provides a technical, extended discussion of divine eternality, its entailments, and arguments for and against it.
  • Mann, William. “Simplicity and Immutability in God”. International Philosophical Quarterly 23, 1983. p 267-276.
    • This article argues that divine immutability is best understood in the light of divine eternality and simplicity.  It also includes a nice discussion of immutability and personhood.
  • Merricks, Trenton.  “Truth and Freedom”. Philosophical Review 118(1), 2009. p 29-57.
  • Perry, John. “The Problem of the Essential Indexical”. Noûs 13, 1979. p 3-21.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. “On Ockham's Way Out”. Faith and Philosophy 3(3) 1986. p 235-269.
  • Pohle, Joseph and Arthur Preuss.  God: His Knowability, Essence, and Attributes.  St. Louis, MO: Herder Book Co, 1946.
    • This is volume from a standard dogmatic set, which contains biblical, patristic, and philosophical arguments for Catholic dogmas.
  • Richards, Jay. The Untamed God. Downers Grove: InterVarsity Press, 2003.
    • This book is about divine immutability and simplicity.  It is written at a good level for a beginner, but contains discussion useful for advanced readers as well.
  • Schaff, Philip.  The Creeds of Christendom: The Evangelical Protestant Creeds, with Translations. Harper, 1877.
    • This is a useful collection of confessional statements from the protestant reformers and their successors.
  • Stump, Eleonore. Aquinas. New York: Routledge, 2003.
    • An excellent discussion of Aquinas’s philosophy, which includes extended discussions of divine responsiveness, immutability, simplicity, and eternality.
  • Stump, Eleonore, and Norman Kretzmann, "Eternity". Journal of Philosophy 78, 1981. p 429-458.
    • A seminal article on the relationship between time and God.
  • Sullivan, Thomas D.  "Omniscience, Immutability, and the Divine Mode of Knowing". Faith and Philosophy 8(1) 1991. p 21-35.
  • Swinburne, Richard. The Coherence of Theism. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1993.
  • Tanner, Norman. Decrees of the Ecumenical Councils. Franklin: Sheed & Ward, 1990.
    • An excellent two volume work which contains the decrees of the councils in the original languages, with facing translations.
  • Timpe, Kevin. “Truthmaking and Divine Eternity”. Religious Studies 43(3) 2007. p 299-315.
  • Weinandy, Thomas. Does God Change?. Still River: St. Bede's Publications, 1985.
    • This book is an interesting historical discussion of what it means to say that God is immutable but became man.
  • Williams, Robert R., “I. A Dorner: The Ethical Immutability of God”. Journal of the American Academy of Religion 54(4), 1986. p 721-738.

Author Information

Tim Pawl
Email: timpawl@stthomas.edu
University of Saint Thomas
U. S. A.