Everettian Interpretations of Quantum Mechanics

Between the 1920s and the 1950s, the mathematical results of quantum mechanics were interpreted according to what is often referred to as “the standard interpretation” or the “Copenhagen interpretation.” This interpretation is known as the “collapse interpretation" because it supposes that an observer external to a system causes the system, upon observation, to collapse from a quantum mechanical state to a state in which the elements of the system appear to have a determinate value for the property measured. Although this interpretation is largely successful at explaining our experiences of the world, it fails in that it gives rise to what has become known as the measurement problem, a problem described in section 2.

In addition to this problem, there is another problem tied to the role of the observer. In the 1950s, Hugh Everett III (1930-1982) was considering quantum mechanics as it might apply to the entirety of the universe. Surely if quantum mechanics were true on the local level of laboratories and experiments taken as closed systems, it would also be true for the entire universe taken as a closed system. The problem with this approach is that there is no external observer available at the scale of the entire universe to cause a collapse of the quantum state, a state that the laws of quantum mechanics say the universe would be in, were it unobserved. Thus, Everett suggested that we abandon the notion of an observer-caused collapse and we consider all quantum states to be always non-collapsed.

Everett published one short paper in 1957—his doctoral dissertation (Everett 1957a, 1957b)—and after that, he left academia. He later published the longer, original version of his dissertation at the request of Bryce DeWitt and Neill Graham (Everett 1973). In his dissertation, Everett develops the mathematical theory that is the foundation of Everettian quantum mechanics [EQM]; but many people have believed the theory itself needs interpretation. Although Everett was not interested in the philosophical implications of his work, there has been great interest among philosophers in trying to interpret what EQM implies about the metaphysical structure of the world.

This article surveys the various ways philosophers have attempted to interpret Everett. To begin, the standard interpretation, as well as its attendant problems, is discussed briefly. Following that, the bare theory, the single and many minds theories, and versions of a many worlds theory are discussed. The article closes by discussing two relational interpretations of Everett.

Table of Contents

  1. Preamble
  2. The Standard Interpretation
  3. Everettian Interpretations
    1. Everett Plus Nothing (The Bare Theory)
    2. Everett Plus Minds
    3. Everett Plus Worlds (DeWitt’s Splitting Worlds)
      1. Problems with the Notion of Splitting
      2. The Preferred Basis Problem
  4. The Evolution of Many Worlds Interpretations
    1. The Problem of Probability and Graham’s Attempt at Adding a Measure
    2. The Oxford MWI
    3. Objections to the Oxford MWI
  5. Relational Interpretations of Everettian Quantum Mechanics
    1. Simon Saunders’ Relational Interpretation
    2. The Relative Facts Interpretation
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Preamble

Before beginning to survey the various ways philosophers have attempted to interpret Everett, we must address the question of whether or not there even are rival interpretations of Everett. Some of the most influential physicists and philosophers working on EQM have either taken it as fact (DeWitt 1970) or explicitly argued (Deutsch 2010; Wallace 2012) that there is only one “interpretation” of EQM: some version of the many worlds interpretation [MWI].

Bryce DeWitt (1923-2004) took it to be the case that the only way one can “interpret” Everett was through a many worlds theory. He wrote, “The mathematical formalism of the quantum theory is capable of yielding its own interpretation” (DeWitt 1970: 160). And that formalism “forces us to believe in the reality of all the simultaneous worlds represented in the superposition described by equation [(2), below], in each of which the measurement has yielded a different outcome” (DeWitt 1970: 161).

David Deutsch (1953- ) and David Wallace (1976- ) have argued that there are no rival “interpretations” of Everett: “Other ‘interpretations’ . . . are really alternative physical theories . . .” (Wallace 2012: 382, Wallace’s emphasis). They see the “Everett interpretation” to be “just quantum mechanics itself, read literally, straightforwardly—naively, if you will—as a direct description of the physical world, just like any other microphysical theory” (Wallace 2012: 2). Deutsch writes:

. . . insisting that parallel universes are ‘only an interpretation’ and not a – what? a scientifically established fact or something (as if there were such a thing) – has the same logic as those stickers that they paste in some American biology textbooks, saying that evolution is ‘only a theory’, by which they mean precisely that it’s just an ‘interpretation’. Or, in terms of the analogy that Everett used in his famous exchange of letters with Bryce DeWitt, it’s like claiming that the motion of the Earth about its axis is only an ‘interpretation’ that we place on our observations of the sky (2010: 543, Deutsch’s emphasis).

Wallace writes:

The ‘Everett interpretation of quantum mechanics’ is just quantum mechanics itself, ‘interpreted’ the same way we have always interpreted scientific theories in the past: as modelling the world. Someone might be right or wrong about the Everett interpretation – they might be right or wrong about whether it succeeds in explaining the experimental results of quantum mechanics, or in describing our world of macroscopically definite objects, or even in making sense – but there cannot be multiple logically possible Everett interpretations any more than there are multiple logically possible interpretations of molecular biology or classical electrodynamics (2012: 38, Wallace’s emphasis).

The arguments Deutsch and Wallace provide may be persuasive to some readers. But the purpose of the current article is to survey what has historically been done by philosophers attempting to draw metaphysical pictures from Everett’s pure wave mechanics. Wallace is explicit about the fact that he is not attempting to do historical exegesis of Everett’s views (2012: 2), and whether Everett would be sympathetic to or supportive of an MWI is an open question. (Again see Barrett 2010, Barrett and Byrne 2012, and Bevers 2011.) So whether or not a version of the MWI is the correct interpretation of Everett, or even the only interpretation of Everett, is a question that can be adjudicated in other venues. Our purpose here is to consider the ways in which philosophers have attempted to interpret Everett’s pure wave mechanics, and so, after one final preliminary note, it is to this that we shall turn.

There is one other debate that ought to be considered before embarking on our project. And that is the debate over the appropriate way to explain the results of quantum mechanical experiments. Everett’s proposal for pure wave mechanics is but one way physicists explain what seem to be counterintuitive outcomes of quantum mechanical experiments. Other ways include Bohmian mechanics (de Broglie 1928, Bohm 1952) and GRW (Ghirardi, Rimini & Weber 1986). Whether or not the unitary dynamics proposed by Everett are the correct laws for describing the world is a question that is far from decided. But as this article is concerned with the question of Everett interpretation, a full rehearsal of this debate goes beyond its scope. There is no assumption made here about what the correct theory of the world is; rather there is only a historical discussion of the way people have interpreted Everett.

For more on interpretations of quantum mechanics, see "Interpretations of Quantum Mechanics" in this encyclopedia and also (Lewis 2016).

2. The Standard Interpretation

In Schrödinger’s cat thought experiment (Schrödinger, 1935),  there is a cat locked inside a box along with a glass vial of cyanide; a hammer set to potentially break the vial; and a Geiger counter inside of which there is a sample of a radioactive substance small enough that there is a 50% chance of one of the atoms decaying in the course of one hour and a 50% chance that none will. If an atom decays the Geiger counter will click which causes the hammer to fall, the flask to break, the cyanide gas to be released and the cat to die. If an atom does not decay, the cat remains alive. If the inside of the box is not observed during this hour, Schrödinger took the formalism of quantum mechanics to imply that the cat would be in a superposition of being alive and dead.

Superpositions are states of systems that are represented mathematically by a weighted sum of the possible values for the property in question. Each summand will represent one of the possible values for the property and will be accompanied by a complex number coefficient which, when it is multiplied by its complex conjugate and the result is squared (in other words, when its norm is squared), the standard interpretation takes to be the probability of the system collapsing into that value for the property. So in our cat example, there will be two terms in the superposition of the state of the system that includes the cat, each with a coefficient of 1/√2 which, when its norm is squared, gives us a ½ probability of the system collapsing into the state that includes the cat being alive and a ½ probability of its collapsing into the state of the system that includes the cat being dead.

We never seem to observe cats (or any other macroscopic objects) as being in superpositions. The standard interpretation assumes that when an observer interacts with a system, that observation causes a collapse of the superposition, and the objects in the system take on definite values for the property being measured. So when the box is opened and the observer looks into it, the system randomly and instantaneously collapses into either cat alive or cat dead with a 50% probability of finding either.

Now we can transition from cats to electrons. Electrons have a property called “angular momentum” that can take a definite value of either spin up or spin down along the x, y or z axis. These values are mutually exclusive in the sense that if an electron has a definite value for one of the properties, it does not have a definite value for any of the others. It has been experimentally determined that when electrons have a definite spin property along one axis, they are in a superposition of having spin up and spin down along both of the other axes. So, for example, when an electron is determinately x-spin up, it is in a superposition of being y-spin up and y-spin down, and it is in a superposition of being z-spin up and z-spin down.

The standard interpretation tells us that when we observe electrons that are in such superpositions, they instantaneously and randomly collapse from the superposition they were in to one of the definite properties that make up that superposition. So when we take an electron that is x-spin up, for example, and measure its z-spin, the standard interpretation tells us that it collapses from being in a superposition of being z-spin up and z-spin down into either being z-spin up or being z-spin down. In the standard interpretation, this collapse explains the determinate measurement records that we get in experiments with quantum mechanical systems. The standard interpretation also tells us that if we do not observe quantum particles, then that collapse will not happen and they will remain in their superpositions.

The difference in these empirical results is captured in two of the laws that are part of the theory of quantum mechanics:

  1. When no measurement, or other observation, is made of a system, then that system evolves in a deterministic and linear fashion.
  2. When a measurement, or other observation, is made of a system, then that system instantaneously and non-deterministically collapses into a definite value for the property being measured.

In the standard interpretation, the second law accounts for the fact that when we measure any property of an object, it has a definite value.

These two laws are not compatible, and there is no clear explanation of when one is to be used instead of the other.  In other words, there is no explanation of what constitutes an act of observation in the standard interpretation.  In addition to this, there is the problem that if we take measurement devices to be physical systems like any other, then the standard interpretation says that the quantum system that makes up the measuring device will evolve deterministically, but the second law says that it will take on a definite value with a certain probability.  In other words, it would have to follow both a deterministic law and a law governed by chance. This is not logically possible.  This, in short, is the quantum measurement problem.  It is part of what has driven the search for different interpretations of quantum mechanics.

Another part of what drove the search for a new interpretation of quantum mechanics was an interest in being able to apply quantum mechanics to the entire universe. This is what, at least in part, led Hugh Everett III to suggest that instead of having two mutually incompatible laws for the description of the evolution of states, we drop the law that is used when systems are observed (Everett 1957a, 1957b). The implication of this is that while the standard interpretation suggests that when a measurement is made, the superposition of a quantum particle collapses and the particle has a determinate measurable (and measured) property, the so-called “Everett interpretation” claims that there is no such collapse.  All the theories that have sprung from Everett's “pure wave mechanics” have come to be known as “no-collapse” theories since they propose that there is no collapse of the superpositions.

One difficulty with no-collapse theories is making sense of how it is that we seem to have determinate measurement records for quantum particles even though those particles do not have a determinate value for the property measured, since they never collapse out of their superpositions. Another is the question of probability in a universe in which everything happens. Various interpretations of Everett have answered these issues differently. It is to a discussion of these various interpretations that we now turn.

3. Everettian Interpretations

a. Everett Plus Nothing (The Bare Theory)

Everett’s pure wave mechanics suggests that there is generally no determinate fact about the everyday properties of the objects in our world, since the equations that are supposed to describe such properties are such that they describe superpositions of those properties. Rather, Everett takes there to be only “relative states” and thus “relative properties” of quantum systems.

To see what he means by “relative states” and “relative properties,” consider the following. When we want to learn the value of a property for some system, we measure for that property.  But Everett treats measuring devices just as he would any other system with which the object system interacts, and so the measuring device will become correlated with the system that it is measuring.  In order to learn anything about one subsystem, even the reading on a measuring device, one must make reference to the complement of the subsystem:

As a result of the [measurement] interaction the state of the measuring apparatus is no longer capable of independent definition. It can be defined only relative to the state of the object system. In other words, there exists only a correlation between the two states of the two systems. It seems as if nothing can ever be settled by such a measurement . . . There is no longer any independent system state or observer state, although the two have become correlated in a one-one manner (Everett 1957b: 144, 146).

Everett explains “correlation” this way: “If one makes the statement that two variables, X and Y, are correlated, what is basically meant is that one learns something about one variable when he is told the value of the other'' (Everett 2012: 61; this definition also shows up in Everett 1973: 17). Even in this case, it only “seems” as if nothing can be settled because of this correlation between an object system and a measuring device.  In fact, one can settle matters with the use of relative states:

. . . a constituent subsystem cannot be said to be in any single well-defined state, independently of the remainder of the composite system.  To any arbitrarily chosen state for one subsystem there will correspond a unique relative state for the remainder of the composite system.  This relative state will usually depend upon the choice of state for the first subsystem.  Thus the state of one subsystem does not have an independent existence, but is fixed only by the state of the remaining subsystem.  In other words, the states occupied by the subsystems are not independent, but correlated.  Such correlations between systems arise whenever systems interact (Everett 1957b: 142; Everett’s emphasis).

Consider again what happens when we measure the z-spin of an x-spin up electron. Before the measurement interaction, the state of the system consisting of the electron, e, and the measuring device, m, can be expressed in this way:

(1)        |m>ready1/√2(|↑z>e + |↓z>e)

Where “|m>ready” is what we use to express that the measuring device is ready to make a measurement, “|↑z>e” expresses that the electron is z-spin up and “|↓z>e” expresses that it is z-spin down. When we measure the z-spin, the measuring device interacts with the system it is measuring and becomes a part of the system. After that interaction, the state of the system that consists of the measuring device and the electron can be expressed in this way:

(2)        1/√2(|↑z>e |“↑”z>m + |↓z>e|“↓”z>m)

Where “|“↑”z>m” expresses that the measuring device has recorded z-spin up and “|“↓”z>m” expresses that the measuring device has recorded z-spin down.

In this state, the measuring device is in a superposition of reading z-spin up and z-spin down. Everett writes, “one can . . . look upon the total wave function . . . as a superposition of pairs of subsystem states, each element of which has a definite q value . . . for each of which the apparatus has recorded a definite value . . .” (Everett 1957a: 58, 59; Everett’s emphasis). So the way we get an explanation of our determinate measurement records is by understanding that they are records of relative states of a system.

Using the concept of relative states, we can say two things: (1) relative to the electron’s being z-spin up, the measuring device recorded “z-spin up” as the value of the electron’s z-spin; (2) relative to the electron’s being z-spin down, the measuring device recorded “z-spin down” as the value of the electron’s z-spin. This explains our determinate measurement results because if we ask a reliable observer whether he got a determinate measurement result for an experiment, he will always say “yes,” even when his measurement result is a superposition of outcomes and not one outcome determinately (Albert 1992, Barrett 1999). Here is why:

Let us say that there is a reliable observer who is about to measure the z-spin of an x-spin up electron. By “reliable” we mean that when we ask him whether he has a measurement record, if he has one then he will answer that he does; if he does not have one, he will answer that he does not. Let us also say that our observer is truthful.  He will always truthfully report what he has as a measurement record—if he recorded “z-spin down,” then he will answer “z-spin down” when asked what he recorded. Recall that x-spin up electrons are in a superposition of being z-spin up and z-spin down. So when we describe the state of the electron mathematically there will be one summand that describes the electron as z-spin up and one that describes it as z-spin down.

According to Everett’s pure wave mechanics, when our observer makes a measurement of the electron he does not cause a collapse, but instead becomes correlated with the electron. What this means is that where once we had a system that consisted of just an electron, there is now a system that consists of the electron and the observer. The mathematical equation that describes the state of the new system has one summand in which the electron is z-spin up and the observer measured “z-spin up” and another in which the electron is z-spin down and the observer measured “z-spin down.” In both summands our observer got a determinate measurement record, so in both, if we ask him whether he got a determinate record, he will say “yes.” If, as in this case, all summands share a property (in this case the property of our observer saying “yes” when asked if he got a determinate measurement record), then that property is determinate.

This is strange because he did not in fact get a determinate measurement record; he instead recorded a superposition of two outcomes.  After our observer measures an x-spin up electron's z-spin, he will not have determinately gotten either “z-spin up” or “z-spin down” as his record. Rather he will have determinately gotten “z-spin up or z-spin down,” since his state will have become correlated with the state of the electron due to his interaction with it through measurement. Everett believed he had explained determinate experience through the use of relative states (Everett 1957b: 146; Everett 1973: 63, 68–70, 98–9). That he did not succeed is largely agreed upon in the community of Everettians.

This sparse interpretation of Everett, adding no metaphysics or special assumptions to the theory, has come to be known as the “bare theory.”  One might say that the bare theory predicts disjunctive outcomes, since the observer will report that she got “either z-spin up or z-spin down ''—without any determinate classical outcome—without being in a state where she would determinately report that she got “z-spin up” or determinately report that she got “z-spin down” (Barrett 1999).  So, if the problem is to explain how we end up with determinate measurement results, the bare theory does not provide us with that explanation. Something must be added to Everett's account.

For more on the bare theory see Albert and Loewer 1988, Albert 1992 and Barrett 1999. That Everett was uninterested in the philosophical implications of his work has been argued by Barrett 2010, Barrett and Byrne 2012 and Bevers 2011, though Deutsch 2010 and Wallace 2012 differ with this conclusion.

b. Everett Plus Minds

One suggestion about what to add to Everett’s account is to suppose that every time we are faced with an entangled state such as the state in which our observer found himself in the last section, we conclude that he got a determinate result from a particular perspective. To see what motivates this, consider what happens when an observer goes from being ready to read the result on a measuring device:

(3) |o>ready 1/√2(|↑z>e |“↑”z>m + |↓z>e|“↓”z>m)

to having read the device:

(4) 1/√2(|↑z>e |“↑”z>m |“↑”z>o + |↓z>e|“↓”z>m|“↓”z>o).

Here we use “|“↑”z>o” to represent the state of the observer having read “z-spin up” off the measuring device’s pointer. If the observer forms beliefs about the z-spin of the electron based on the results of the experiment (as it seems reasonable to presume), then the state of the system that now contains the observer will be the following:

(5) 1/√2(|↑z>e |“↑”z>m|“↑”z>o |BEL“↑”z>o + |↓z>e|“↓”z>m|“↓”z>o |BEL“↓”z>o)

Here “|BEL“↑”z>o” expresses that the observer believes that the electron is z-spin up. This state of the system implies that our observer is in a superposition of belief states (Albert and Loewer, 1988: 197). But our observer doesn’t feel like he is in a superposition of belief states. He feels like he has a definite result for the z-spin measurement of the electron. David Albert and Barry Loewer set out to produce an interpretation of Everett’s pure wave mechanics that “explains how it is that we always ‘see’ (mistakenly so . . .) macroscopic objects as not being in superpositions and never experience ourselves as in superpositions” (Albert and Loewer, 1988: 203). They propose that it is a function of the evolution of one’s mental state that explains one’s experiences (Albert and Loewer, 1988; Albert 1992).

Albert and Loewer begin by supposing that mental states supervene on particular brain states and are accurately accessible to introspection (204). They take it that the state of our observer believing that he read “z-spin up” is identical with a physical brain state that is distinct from the physical brain state that is associated with our observer believing he read “z-spin down” (204). Albert and Loewer do not explain this supervening relation; they merely state it as a given fact. But, they argue, this fact is inconsistent with taking our observer to be reliable and to his holding the belief that there was a determinate measurement record obtained when he measured the z-spin of an x-spin up electron. This is because to the state expressed by (5) our observer will answer “yes” when asked, “Does the electron have a determinate z-spin?” since it does have a determinate z-spin in each term. But our observer does not believe that the electron is z-spin up, nor does he believe that it is z-spin down since his brain is not in the state that corresponds to either of those beliefs; his brain is in a superposition of states (Albert and Loewer, 1988: 204). So Albert and Loewer give up the connection between brain states and belief states. They accept a “modest . . . non-physicalism” (205).

The first way they explain this is with what they call the single mind view. This view adds to quantum theory the principle that the evolution of an observer’s mental states is probabilistic. In the state expressed by (4), our observer starts out with no beliefs about the z-spin of the electron. But when he measures the z-spin, the probability is 50% that he ends up believing it is z-spin up and 50% that he ends up believing it is z-spin down. The association of belief states with physical states is dictated by probability and is determined by the quantum evolution of the system that consists of him, the electron and the measuring device (Albert and Loewer, 1988: 205–206). Thus, mental states are never in superpositions, even if physical brain states are.

Albert and Loewer immediately recognized certain problems with this view (1988: 206). The dualism this implies is particularly problematic since it implies that mental states do not supervene on brain states, or any physical states in general, since “one cannot tell from the state of a brain what its single mind believes” (206). Additionally, in the superposition that describes the state of the system in question, all the terms but one will represent “mindless brains” (often referred to as “mindless hulks”), and which one represents a mind is impossible to determine from the quantum formalism or from experiment. Jeffrey Barrett describes this problem nicely (1999). If two observers are measuring the z-spin of our x-spin up electron, then the system of the observers, the measuring devices and the electron will evolve from this state

(6) |o1>ready|o2>ready 1/√2(|↑z>e |“↑”z>m + |↓z>e|“↓”z>m)

to this one

(7) 1/√2(|↑z>e |“↑”z>m |“↑”z>o1|“↑”z>o2 + |↓z>e|“↓”z>m|“↓”z>o1|“↓”z>o2).

There is nothing in the dynamics proposed by Albert and Loewer that prevents the mental states of each observer from being associated with the same term or from being associated with different terms. But there is nothing that tells us which is the case. In each term of (7) there is a physical brain state for each observer, but with only one is there a mental state for each observer. Thus, it is possible that observer 1 is associated with the first term of (7) and observer 2 is associated with the second, but that neither of them realizes it. As such, observer 1 will (correctly) remember having gotten “z-spin up” as the result of her measurement but (incorrectly) remember that her friend got the same result. The same will hold true, mutatis mutandis, for observer 2. There is no way to determine whether or not one is speaking to a mindless hulk rather than a set of physical states with which there is associated a mental state (Barrett, 1999: 189–190).

Barrett also points out that the single minds view predicts that when an observer repeats a measurement she may get a different result from what she first got and falsely remember having gotten a first measurement that matches her second (1999: 187–188). So this observer is in a position where she cannot trust that what she remembers is what actually happened. Here is why. Consider again the state represented in (4). If our observer were to repeat her measurement of the z-spin of the electron, then the second measurement would be identical to the first. The state would then be

(8) 1/√2(|↑z>e |“↑”z“↑”z >m |“↑”z“↑”z> o + |↓z>e|“↓”z“↓”z >m|“↓”z“↓”z >o).

Even if our observer ended up in the state in which she read “z-spin up” for her first measurement, there is still a 50/50 chance that her mental state will be associated with each term in (8). Thus, there is a 50% chance that her mental state will evolve in such a way that she (correctly) believes that the results of her two measurements agreed, but she will (incorrectly) believe that she got “z-spin down” each time.

To avoid some of these problems, Albert and Loewer propose what they call the many minds view. This view takes it that every observer is associated with an infinite set of minds. This immediately solves the mindless brains problem since there are minds associated with each term in the state of a system that includes an observer. It also solves the problem of dualism in the sense that “mental states are determined by or supervenient on brain (or brain + environment) states” (206), though the minds are still non-physical in that they are not subject to the rules of quantum mechanics for their evolution. This is a benefit of the many minds view since mental states will never (in accordance with our experience) be in a superposition. But this benefit leads to an additional difficulty in that it retains a certain element of dualism. The only mental state that does any supervening on an observer’s physical state is what might be called the “global” mental state. This is the state that is associated with the entire set of minds. It is the only thing that evolves according to quantum mechanical dynamics. Importantly, what might be called the “local” state, the state to which an observer has direct introspective access, does not so supervene. If it did, it would also evolve according to the dynamics, but Albert and Loewer take it as a benefit to the many minds view that it does not. (For more on this objection see Barrett, 1999: 194–196 and Lockwood, 1996: 174.)

Determinate experience is just one part of the dilemma of Everett interpretation. The other is probability. The many minds view takes the norm squared of the coefficients on the terms to be interpreted as giving the proportion of minds associated with each term in the state of the system. In this view, probabilities “refer . . . to sequences of states of individual minds” (208). In (4) our observer is in a brain state that has a mind associated with it that has no belief about the z-spin of the electron, but she can predict what the probability is of ending up with a mind that believes she observed z-spin up or z-spin down; she can predict what the sequence of her mental states will be, according to the norm squared of the coefficients. Knowing that (3) evolves into (4) after a measurement, and accepting the reasonable claim that beliefs are formed when the observer looks at the measuring device, our observer knows that half her minds will believe that she measured the electron as being z-spin up and half believe she measured it as z-spin down.

It is debatable whether Albert and Loewer’s many minds view succeeds in answering the questions of determinate experience and probability that come with any interpretation of Everett and whether the dualism that is inherent in their view is a price worth paying. Michael Lockwood (1996) believed that it was not a price worth paying and so worked to develop a competing many minds view that did not suffer this problem.

Lockwood’s version of many minds argues that “associated with a sentient being at any given time, there is a multiplicity of distinct conscious points of view . . .  it is these conscious points of view or ‘minds’ . . . that are to be conceived as literally dividing or differentiating over time” (1996: 170). For him there is a sense in which our observer can regard herself as having just one mind. He calls this her “multimind” or “Mind,” and it consists of all the minds (lower-case “m”) that are described in the terms of the state of the system of which the observer is a part (1996: 177). Each mind has a “maximal experience” that describes its complete state of consciousness, but it should not be identified with a state of the Mind of the observer. Lockwood takes it that there is “complete supervenience of the mental on the physical” and so he avoids the dualism that plagues Albert and Loewer’s version (1996: 184). To do this, though, he agrees with Albert and Loewer that one must give up “the assumption that . . . there is a uniquely correct way of linking earlier and later maximal experiences of the same Mind together to form persisting minds . . .” but he does not take that to be fatal to his project (1996: 183–184). For Lockwood, each mind makes up one subset of the Mind and “each stands in an equal relation of succession to the given . . . maximal experience . . . with which we started” (Lockwood, 1996: 183). To go back to our example, there is a mind associated with each term in (4), and these go to make up the Mind of the observer. Each of these minds has equal claim to be the successor to the mind in (3) that was in the ready state. So it is unclear who the observer in (3) should expect to be once the measurement is made.

Diachronic personal identity leads to the problem of how to interpret probabilities from this viewpoint. Lockwood believes that he has a meaningful interpretation of probability as “a naturally preferred measure on sets of simultaneous maximal experiences” (1996: 182). He wants to analogize this to duration so that in analogy to “this pain lasted twice as long as the last one” he can say something like, “this pain is, superpositionally speaking, twice as extensive as that” (182; Lockwood’s emphasis). The extensiveness of an experience is a function of its “temporal ‘length’ and of superpositional ‘width’” in the sense that it has a higher coefficient associated with its term (182). It is largely agreed that Lockwood does not have a sufficient explanation for probability. Loewer (1996) and Barrett (1999) both argue that Lockwood’s conception of probability is insufficient for explaining how we are to take probabilities to be guides to rational decision making and prediction. Lockwood cannot explain how the norm squared of the coefficient ought to guide an observer’s predictions about what her experience will be in the future since there is no way to track her over time. In our example above, when we ask what the probability will be of our observer in (3) seeing “z-spin up” upon measurement, we have to say it will be 1. The same is true for “z-spin down,” since in some term there is a mind that goes to make up the Mind of the observer that observes each measurement result.

Barrett (1999) argues that aside from this problem, Lockwood has a “very unusual notion of probability in mind” (209). He wants to “introduce a (sic) entirely new notion of probability,” and one that Barrett finds puzzling and insufficient for explaining an observer’s determinate experiences (209–210).

There are several other interpretations of Everett that are in the same vein as the single minds and many minds views of Albert and Loewer and Lockwood, but none of them are quite as fully worked out as those presented here. The interested reader may want to look at Zeh 1981, Squires 1987, Donald 1990, Squires 1991, Stapp 1991, Squires 1993, Donald 1993, Donald 1995, and Page 1995.

c. Everett Plus Worlds (DeWitt’s Splitting Worlds)

What is arguably the most common interpretation of Everett's formulation is what Bryce DeWitt called the many-worlds interpretation [MWI] (DeWitt 1968 and Wheeler 1998: 269–70). In his 1967 lecture on what he calls the “Everett-Wheeler interpretation” of quantum mechanics, DeWitt takes Everett's claim that:

. . . with each succeeding observation (or interaction), the observer state “branches” into a number of different outcomes of the measurement . . . for the object-system state.  All branches exist simultaneously in the superposition after any given sequence of observations (Everett 1957a: 25–6; Everett 1957b: 146).

to imply that we are forced:

. . . to believe in the ‘reality’ of all the simultaneous ‘worlds’ represented in the superposition [in which we find the universe after a measurement interaction] . . . in each of which the measurement has yielded a different outcome (DeWitt 1968: 326).

The first published version of Everett's dissertation began to gain popularity when it was reprinted in The Many Worlds Interpretation of Quantum Mechanics (DeWitt and Graham 1973).  In his papers in this volume, DeWitt explicitly refers to the “reality of all simultaneous worlds” that he believes are implied by his reading of Everett and to the “reality composed of many worlds” that he takes Everett's formalism to have taught us is true about our universe (DeWitt 1970: 161, DeWitt 1971: 182). So from this point on, Everett's interpretation has most commonly been known as the “many worlds interpretation” of quantum mechanics.

The branching that occurs in DeWitt’s MWI can be interpreted in several different ways. One possibility is DeWitt’s way, which suggests that:

[o]ur universe must be viewed as constantly splitting into a stupendous number of branches, all resulting from the measurementlike interactions between its myriads of components . . . every quantum transition taking place on every star, in every galaxy, in every remote corner of the universe is splitting our local world on earth into myriads of copies of itself (DeWitt 1970: 178).

DeWitt takes a strong realist position in regards to the worlds that are the result of the branches splitting.  He takes each branch to be “a possible universe-as-we-actually-see-it” (DeWitt 1970: 163) and believes that in spite of the fact that “all branches must be regarded as equally real” (DeWitt 1970: 178; see also Everett 1957b: note added in proof), we inhabit only one of the worlds that go to make up reality and we have no access to other worlds (DeWitt 1970: 182).

In order to see how this fares with regards to the question of determinate measurement results, let us make a distinction between a local I, IL, and a global I, IG. IL is the self who experiences determinate measurement results when conducting quantum mechanical experiments; IL sees only one outcome of every experiment. IL is who we generally consider ourselves to be. So when DeWitt says that we inhabit only one world of the many possible worlds, we can take him to be referring to weL as a collection of ILs. We then can understand him to believe that there will be an IL for each world that is created in the split. In contrast, there is always only one IG. We can think of the IG as the self, were it to exist, which has access to all the worlds. IG can be thought of as someone outside the theory who can see the branching structure of the world and who knows every outcome of quantum mechanical experiments, someone who has a “god’s-eye view” of the universe as a whole. We as ILs do not seem to have access to the experiences of IG. Thus, the only thing that needs to be explained in terms of determinate measurement results is the perspective of IL since this is the only perspective we seem to have, and according to Everett, it is the only perspective that is of any importance to an observer (Everett 1973: 99).

Everett argues that relative states provide a way to understand an observerL's determinate measurement record. The only place where the indeterminacy shows up is in the global perspective of a state; the local, relative perspective will always be determinate. Everett argues that an observer will never have access to the global state and therefore will always and only have determinate measurement results relative to his state (Everett 1973).

DeWitt's branching worlds follow along the same line. For him, there are many different branches of the universe and each branch splits every time there is an observation or correlation made. On each branch is an observerL who will split every time the branch does. Each observerL gets a determinate record of whatever outcome occurs on his branch, because that is exactly what happened on that branch.

i. Problems with the Notion of Splitting

However, there are objections that have been raised to DeWitt's proposal that we take each branch to be “a possible universe-as-we-actually-see-it.” The main objection has been that the idea that we in some way split or branch seems absurd given our experience in the world (Everett 1957c: 2; DeWitt 1971: 179; DeWitt and Graham 1973: 161; Xavier 1962: Tuesday Morning, p. 20).

Additionally, one might object to what turns out to be an infinite (possibly uncountable) number of worlds (Healey 1984; Saunders 1997). Some early many-world interpreters have taken Everett to be implying such a profligacy of worlds when he writes: “[a]ll branches exist simultaneously in the superposition after any given sequence of observations” (Everett 1957b: 146), and so “[f]rom the viewpoint of the theory all elements of a superposition (all ‘branches’) are ‘actual’, none any more ‘real’ than the rest” (Everett57b: note added in proof; Everett's emphasis).

There appear to be two distinct issues raised.  The first is that a multitude of worlds, always splitting, seems to defy our sense that we are not splitting.  The second is that it seems to run counter to intuition to propose that there are multiple copies of the world, and of people, that constitute the universe.  Let us see how these objections are addressed one at a time as doing so will shed light on Everett's thoughts about the relative state formulation.

The first objection, that we do not feel the splitting, is addressed by Everett both in his response to DeWitt's letter in 1957 (Everett 1957c) and ultimately in the short dissertation (Everett 1957b).  In the letter to DeWitt he writes:

I must confess that I do not see this “branching process” as the “vast contradiction” that you do.  The theory is in full accord with our experience (at least insofar as ordinary quantum mechanics is).  It is in full accord just because it is possible to show that no observer would ever be aware of any “branching,” which is alien to our experience as you point out.

The whole issue of the “transition from the possible to the actual” is taken care of in a very simple way – there is no such transition, nor is such a transition necessary for the theory to be in accord with our experience.

From the viewpoint of the theory, all elements of a superposition (all “branches”) are “actual,” none any more “real” than another.  It is completely unnecessary to suppose that after an observation somehow one element of the final superposition is selected to be awarded with a mysterious quality called “reality” and the others condemned to oblivion – they won't cause any trouble anyway because all the separate elements of the superposition (“branches”) individually obey the wave equation with complete indifference to the presence of absence (“actuality” or not) of any other elements.

This is only to say that the theory manages to avoid the difficulty of the “transition from possible to actual” – and I consider this to be not a weakness, but rather a great strength of the theory.  The theory is isomorphic with experience when one takes the trouble to see what the theory itself says our experience will be.  Little more can be asked of it without exposing a naked philosophic prejudice of one kind or another (Everett 1957c: 3; Everett's emphasis).

In the short dissertation this becomes:

Arguments that the world picture presented by this theory is contradicted by experience, because we are unaware of any branching process, are like the criticism of the Copernican theory that the mobility of the earth as a real physical fact is incompatible with the common sense interpretation of nature because we feel no such motion.  In both cases the argument fails when it is shown that the theory itself predicts that our experience will be what it in fact is.  (In the Copernican case the addition of Newtonian physics was required to be able to show that the earth's inhabitants would be unaware of any motion of the earth.) (Everett 1957b: note added in proof).

Everett had no problem with an observerL not feeling the split because his theory predicts that the splitting of worlds is not something of which IL could be aware.  An observerL will never have access to the global state of a system and so will never be able to observe anything but the state of his branch.  It requires a perspectiveG to observe any branching event.  Since there can never be any observation of a branching event, there can never be a physical record (memory) of the event.

The second objection comes from those who want the most economic metaphysics possible.  Such philosophers might argue that to have an infinite number of worlds after a split is metaphysically extravagant.  While some theorists who first encounter this idea initially balk at it, ultimately most do not find anything terribly objectionable in it.  In fact, most MWI theorists embrace the notion of a multitude of existing worlds.  If the MWI as proposed by DeWitt solves the quantum measurement problem, then this metaphysical extravagance may be worth the cost.

For more on the story of the evolution from the long to the short thesis, and on Everett’s life, see Byrne 2010.

ii. The Preferred Basis Problem

DeWitt's MWI fails to provide us with any explanation of when worlds split.  Unfortunately, saying when they do is just as difficult as saying when a collapse occurs, which is one way to understand the quantum measurement problem. To determine when a world splits, we would first need to know in which basis we should write the universal state. If we knew this, then we would know that a split has occurred because a new term would show up in the global state when it is written in the preferred basis.  The choice of basis also determines which properties in the universe are determinate—namely, those that are represented by vectors that are on the axes of the basis—and which worlds exist after a measurement interaction. DeWitt does not provide any way to choose a particular basis, and any way that we might suggest in the context of his MWI would be blatantly ad hoc.  This problem has come to be known as the preferred basis problem.

Even though DeWitt's MWI seems to provide us with an explanation of why we get determinate measurement records, that explanation assumes that there is a basis in which the universal state has been written that guarantees that those measurement records are in fact determinate.  In order to be able to assert the determinateness of records in a particular branch, the basis that we choose ought to be one in which those records are determinate.  But the basis in which the pointer on our measuring device has a determinate position and the basis in which our mental states are determinate are not necessarily the same.  It is not clear that we can choose a basis in which they will both be determinate, not to mention all the other things that we want to have as determinate properties in order to be conscious beings capable of successfully completing a quantum mechanical experiment.

Without a preferred basis in which to write the universal state, one is free to choose any basis one likes with the result being that in different bases there will be different decompositions of the universal state vector.  If each term in the expansion of the universal state is taken to represent a different possible world, or a different description of a world, then with each choice of basis there will be different terms and so different worlds. Thus, without a preferred basis, there is no fact of the matter as to when splits occur, no fact of the matter as to which properties in the universe are determinate and no fact of the matter as to which worlds go to make up the universe; rather, these are all a function of the choice of basis.

So we are left without answers to several questions: What worlds are there?  Which properties are determinate?  When do worlds split?  Solving this is as difficult as solving the original quantum measurement problem and in fact is a version of it (Barrett 1999: 176).  Thus, no progress has been made toward solving the measurement problem, insofar as this is a problem that could be solved by saying when collapses or splits occur.  So the cost of DeWitt's MWI is the reintroduction of the measurement problem, something Everett's pure wave mechanics was developed to avoid.  Fortunately for those sympathetic to Everett's ideas, quantum mechanics without the collapse postulate has evolved in the decades since DeWitt’s writing.  In what follows we will see how the concept of “many worlds” has been developed within the interpretation of Everett's physics.

4. The Evolution of Many Worlds Interpretations

a. The Problem of Probability and Graham’s Attempt at Adding a Measure

Something that the standard interpretation of quantum mechanics provides that is missing in pure wave mechanics is a way to account for probabilistic claims. In any MWI of Everett's relative state formulation, there is in some sense a different world in which every possible outcome of an experiment occurs; every world is real, and therefore every outcome occurs.  We lose the ability to say, “Event e happens with probability p” where p is less than 1. Everett writes, “In order to establish quantitative results, we must put some sort of measure (weighting) on the elements of the final superposition” (Everett 1957b: 147).

In the standard interpretation, this is done with the use of the Born rule (Born 1926). The Born rule is what physicists use to assign probabilities to the outcomes of quantum mechanical experiments. For each term in the state of the system, written in some basis, there is associated with it a complex number, the amplitude of that region of the wave function. The Born rule says to take that number and square its norm in order to get the probability of that term being the outcome of a measurement. But in EQM, a deterministic theory in which everything happens, the Born rule does not prima facie seem to be applicable.

To be able to derive probability from within his theory, Everett first needed to define what he meant by a “typical element of the final superposition” since “typical” presupposes some notion of probability. Presumably he meant an element in which the predications of quantum mechanics are borne out. But if he determined what is “typical” by counting up all the branches, taking there to be one world for each term in the expansion of the universal state when it is written in the preferred basis, and calling a world “typical” when it displays the same results as most of the others, then there is a problem because in a large majority of the worlds, by this measure, the quantum statistics will not even be close to true (Graham 1973: 235).

Neill Graham was the first to suggest that there was something missing from Everett's derivation of a probability measure. He writes that the worlds that display the proper relative frequency are “in a numerical minority” and “any attempt to show that the probability interpretation holds in the majority of the resulting Everett worlds is doomed to failure” (Graham 1973: 236). (See also Barrett 1999: 168–70 for a very clear explanation of why the statistics fail to work for any coefficient other than 1/√2.) But Everett not only suggests that we use a counting measure, he believes that he has shown that the “only choice of measure” is the square amplitude measure (Everett 1957b: 147). A typical world is then one for which the value of the square amplitude measure is high.  But Everett's use of this measure is not a solution to the original problem. The original problem was to derive probability from a deterministic theory in which everything happens. To solve this one needs to add the assumption that after a measurement one should expect to find oneself in a “typical” world, that typicality being determined by the norm-square of the coefficient on the term that describes that world; the higher the value, the more “typical” the world. But this is akin to claiming that the Born rule holds.  (For more on this see Barrett 1999: 168–173, Wallace 2007 and 2012.)

Early 21st century MWI theorists take a very different view of the multiplicity of the world, thereby solving some of the problems inherent in earlier MWIs. This view is in line with what David Wallace has proposed, namely that the multiple branches of the universe that arise from the mathematical theory of quantum mechanics are emergent (Wallace 2012). Because most of those who have developed and are proponents of Wallace’s emergent branching universe view are or have been located around Oxford, we will call this view the “Oxford MWI.”

b. The Oxford MWI

The main difference among Wallace’s emergent branching universe view, the Oxford MWI, and the MWIs that came before is that prior MWI theorists, in large part, understand the wave function to be a real entity, leading to a real multiplicity of worlds at the fundamental level of the theory. (For more on the question of realism regarding the wave function, see Ney and Albert 2013.) Wallace, on the other hand, sees these worlds to be emergent from the underlying microphysical description of the universe. They are no less real, but they are structural facts that are instantiated within EQM (Wallace 2012: Chapter 2). Wallace explains how he conceptualizes these structures with what he calls “Dennett’s criterion”: “A macro-object is a pattern, and the existence of a pattern as a real thing depends on the usefulness – in particular, the explanatory power and predictive reliability – of theories which admit that pattern in their ontology” (Wallace 2010a: 58, Wallace 2012: 50).

Wallace asks us to consider a tiger and its hunting patterns. We can describe both in terms of electrons and atoms, but in that description we do not see the patterns that emerge when we consider them at the macroscopic level. The tiger atoms and the swirl of atoms and energy that make up the hunting patterns are real, objective parts of the microphysical system, but they are not practically useful for predicting how tigers behave in the wild. Zoology cannot be reduced to physics. Rather, physics instantiates zoology. Wallace illustrates the instantiation relation with the example of the relation between quantum mechanics and a classical conception of the solar system. Classical mechanics is instantiated by quantum mechanics and is applicable to the solar system because some of the solar system’s properties “approximately instantiate a classical-mechanical dynamical system” (Wallace 2012: 56).

Applying these considerations to EQM, one can say that the microphysical description of the universe contains descriptions of states of affairs that are structured like the macroscopic objects we encounter in the world. When two of these states are superposed with one another, the quantum state of the system instantiates two different macroscopic systems at once. Thus, one can say that two different worlds emerge from the microphysical-level description that instantiates them. Wallace writes that “there are entities whose existence is entailed by the theory which deserve the name ‘worlds’” (Wallace 2010a: 68); thus we should take these worlds to be real entities.

Wallace considers decoherence the only consideration that one should use to help determine how the universe ought to be carved up. A system is said to “decohere” when it becomes correlated with something in its environment and thereby destroys the interference effects that would otherwise have been present if the system were in a pure state, the state in which one finds an entangled system. Decoherence theorists take the destruction of the interference effects to be all that is required to explain determinate experience. Because such correlations are ubiquitous and radically swift, and because it is, in practice, impossible to isolate a macroscopic system from its environment sufficiently to prevent such correlations (even the best isolated system, if it is above absolute zero, will radiate heat and therefore interact with its environment), these correlations will produce results that seem to indicate that a collapse has occurred and not that the system is still in a superposition. The property that decoherence picks out is very close to position when one is considering an experiment that requires us to see the position of a pointer on a measuring device (as pointing either “up” or “down,” for example). (For more on decoherence see the original formulations of it in Zeh 1970, Zeh 1973, Zurek 1981, and Zurek 1982. In Zurek 1991, Zeh 1995, Giulini et al 1996, Butterfield 2001, Zurek 2002 and Schlosshauer 2007 the reader can find very accessible introductions to and discussions of decoherence.)

Given that there is no preferred way to carve up the universe, aside from decoherence considerations, and no particular “most-fine-grained” way to describe the quantum structure of the universe, there is also no fact of the matter about how many branches there are, but Wallace does not see this as a problem. Rather he sees it as misguided to even ask the question “How many worlds are there?” much as it is misguided to ask “How many experiences did you have yesterday?” (Wallace 2010a: 67–8, Wallace 2012: 99–102, 120).

Recall that part of the job of Everett interpretation is to explain how it is that we get determinate measurement records when we do quantum mechanics experiments. Wallace argues that “the emergence of a classical world from quantum mechanics is to be understood in terms of the emergence from the theory of certain sorts of structures and patterns” (2003: 5), and it is these structures that are in superpositions, not the emergent macroscopic objects. To see what he means here, it is worth quoting him at some length:

To see in a different way how the ideas of Sections 4-5 resolve the problem of macroscopic indefiniteness, consider the following sketch of the problem.

  1. After the experiment, there is a linear superposition of a live cat and a dead cat.
  2. Therefore, after the experiment the cat is in a linear superposition of being alive and being dead.
  3. Therefore, the macroscopic state of the cat is indefinite.
  4. This is either meaningless or refuted by experiment.

But (1) does not imply (2). The belief that it does is based upon an oversimplified view of the quantum formalism, in which there is a Hilbert space of cat states such that any vector in the space is a possible state of the cat. This is superficially plausible in view of the way that we treat microscopic subsystems: an electron or proton, for instance, is certainly understood this way, and any superposition of electron states is another electron state. But any state of a cat is actually a member of a Hilbert space containing states representing all possible macroscopic objects made out of the cat’s subatomic constituents. Because of Dennett’s criterion, this includes states which describe

a live cat;
a dead cat;
a dead dog;
this paper . . .

We can say (if we want, and within nonrelativistic quantum mechanics) that the particles which used to make up the cat are now jointly in a linear superposition of being a live cat and being a dead cat. But cats themselves are not the sort of things which can be in superpositions. Cats are by definition “patterns which behave like cats”, and there are definitely two such patterns in the superposition.

The point can be made more generally:

It makes sense to consider a superposition of patterns, but it is just meaningless to speak of a given pattern as being in a superposition (Wallace 2003: 12; Wallace’s emphases).

In the Oxford MWI, decoherence gives rise to the branching structures that make up the various worlds. And it is these structures that give rise to the patterns from which macroscopic objects emerge. Decoherence also causes the interference between branches to “wash out,” and so systems appear to have determinate values in the decoherence basis. (For more on the Oxford MWI see Albert 2010, Kent 2010, Maudlin 2010, Price 2010, Vaidman 2014 and Bacciagaluppi and Ismael 2015.)

There was quite a bit of work at developing a theory of probability in the context of the Oxford MWI (Saunders 1995, Saunders 1998, Vaidman 1998, Wallace 2002, Wallace September 2003, Saunders 2005, Wallace 2006, Greaves January 2007, Wallace 2007, Greaves and Myrvold 2010, Saunders 2010, Wallace 2010b, Tappenden 2011, Vaidman 2012, Wallace 2012, Wilson 2013). The work generally focuses on two different concerns in probability theory: explaining how one can recover uncertainty from a deterministic world, and explaining how we can make sense of the fact that we seem to be able to take branch weights to be related to probability, as the Born rule suggests that we can in a standard collapse interpretation.

Simon Saunders presents a tripartite view of what role chance plays in standard single world views of probability:

(i) Chance is measured by statistics, and perhaps, among observable quantities, only statistics, but only with high chance. (ii) Chance is quantitatively linked to subjective degrees of belief, or credences: all else being equal, one who believes that the chance of E is p will set his credence in E equal to p (the so-called “principal principle”). (iii) Chance involves uncertainty; chance events, prior to their occurrence, are uncertain (Saunders 2010: 181).

Linking chance to statistics (as in (i)) was originally argued by Everett (1973), as we have seen above. But while this might explain certain aspects of probability, it does not explain why we ought to take branch weights to be probability. The arguments for (ii) and (iii) aim to answer this question.

Wallace and others have argued that we can make sense of probability in a theory in which all possible outcomes occur (what has been called the “incoherence problem” in Greaves 2004, Wallace 2005, Wallace 2006, Baker 2007, Lewis 2007, and Saunders and Wallace 2008a; and what has been alternatively termed “Subjective Certainty” by Greaves 2004, Baker 2007, Greaves 2007, Lewis 2007, and Greaves and Myrvold 2010). Wallace’s justification for the claim that we can make sense of probability in a determinate universe is the emergent structure that we have discussed above. It is only at the fundamental level that EQM is deterministic; at the emergent level it is not (Wallace 2012: 115). Once this has been established, two other problems remain to be solved, what Wallace calls the “practical problem” and the “epistemic problem” (Wallace 2012: 158). The first of these is how to justify allowing branch weights to play the role in decision making that ordinary probability plays in a classical context ((ii), above). The second asks how we justify taking branch weights to play the role of probability in showing that the results of experiments support quantum mechanics. Albert (2010) explains this general concern clearly when he writes, “Why (for example) should it come as a surprise, on a picture like [EQM], to see what we would ordinarily consider a low-probability string of experimental results? Why should such a result cast any doubt on the truth of this theory (as it does, in fact, cast doubt on quantum mechanics)” (Albert 2010: 356)?

The general principle of rationality on which Wallace’s argument is founded is David Lewis’ Principal Principle (Lewis 1980). In Wallace’s terminology: “For any real number x, a rational agent’s personal probability of an event E conditional on the objective probability of E being x, and on any other background information, is also x” (Wallace 2012: 140). Wallace’s goal is to show that there is an “Everett-specific derivation of the Principle” and,

to prove, rigorously and from general principles of rationality, that a rational agent, believing that (Everett-interpreted) quantum mechanics correctly gives the structure and dynamics of the world and that the quantum states of his branch is |y>, will act for all intents and purposes as if he ascribed probabilities in accordance with the Born Rule, as applied to |y> (Wallace 2012: 150, 159).

To provide this rigorous proof, Wallace builds on an argument of David Deutsch’s (1997, 1999). He uses Deutsch’s results and furthers them to argue that branch weight non-circularly serves as objective probability. As the details of both Deutsch’s and Wallace’s arguments are quite technical, I leave it to the interested reader to investigate more fully. (More on the Deutsch-Wallace derivation of probability and refinements to their work can be found in Wallace 2002, Wallace September 2003, Greaves 2004, Saunders 2005, Greaves January 2007, Greaves March 2007, Wallace 2007, Greaves and Myrvold 2010.)

The arguments for (iii), that chance involves uncertainty, are the focus of quite a number of papers. Saunders believes that to have a fully worked out view of probability, one must explain uncertainty in EQM (2010: 189–90).  A view called Subjective Uncertainty [SU] is described by Saunders (1998). There he argues that there is uncertainty in even the deterministic physics of Everettian quantum mechanics. He asks us to consider a pre-measurement observer at time t1. Call her she1. When she1 measures the x-spin of a z-spin particle, this results in a branching of her world and she1 ends up with two successors at time t2: “she2” who sees “up” as her measurement result, and “she2” who sees “down” as her measurement result. The question is, “Who should she1 expect to become?”

There seem to be three possibilities: She can expect to become one of them, both of them or neither of them (Saunders 1998: 383). Saunders claims that it is nonsense to suggest that she1 should expect to become neither of them. In the emergent branching view, branching events are ubiquitous and yet we have the experience of continuing to move through time. She would not expect to become both of them because we do not have the experience of seeing two measurement results of our experiments. So the only remaining option is that she1 should expect to become one of her successors, but she does not know which one. This is the basis for the SU attitude about uncertainty. (For more on the link between uncertainty and probability in EQM see Ismael 2003, Greaves 2004, Wallace 2006, Baker 2007, Greaves January 2007, Greaves March 2007, Lewis 2007, and Wallace 2007.)

Saunders links uncertainty to questions of personal identity in EQM (2010). If an agent, Alice, does not know what branch she is on, that can account for a type of uncertainty in EQM. This implies that some of the questions of uncertainty, and therefore probability, will depend upon answers to the question of diachronic personal identity in the context of EQM. (For more on self-locating uncertainty and diachronic identity in EQM see Vaidman 1998, Wallace 2005, Lewis 2007, Lewis 2008, Saunders and Wallace 2008a, 2008b, Tappenden 2008, Wallace 2012, Conroy 2016, and Sebens and Carroll 2016.)

c. Objections to the Oxford MWI

There are of course objections to the Oxford MWI. The first set to consider are those that focus on the use of decoherence to solve the preferred basis problem—a problem that must be solved to explain determinate measurement records and probability.

Recall that a system is said to decohere when it becomes correlated with something in its environment and thereby destroys the interference effects that would otherwise have been present if the system were in a pure state. The coefficients on each term of the state of the system, when one traces over the environment (that is, when one essentially ignores the effects that are caused by only the environment) approximately match the probabilities one obtains from the standard collapse formulation. But even though decoherence theorists believe they have solved the problem of accounting for what seem to be determinate measurement records (Zeh 1997), such interactions do not produce determinate results (Barrett 1999). The interaction between, say, a pointer on a measuring device and its environment does not produce a determinate position for the pointer. Decoherence destroys the interference effects, but it does not produce determinate measurement records. There is a sense as if a collapse has occurred, but all we really end up with is a more complex entangled superposition (Albert 1992, Barrett 1999).

Related to this worry is the fact that using decoherence considerations to choose a preferred basis does not clarify exactly which basis is chosen. In every interaction the property that decoheres most quickly and completely will always be one that is close to position, but it will not always be the same property each time (Barrett 1999: 242–4). This is not going to be troubling to a MWI theorist like Wallace, however, as he does not take there to be a particular fine-grained way to carve up the universe—provided that it is done in a way that preserves the emergence of macroscopic entities from the underlying structure (Wallace 2012).

An additional problem with taking a property very close to position to be the preferred basis in which to write the state of the system is that this is adding an additional principle to quantum mechanics, one that says that whatever decoheres most quickly and completely is the preferred observable chosen to be determinate (Barrett 1999). This does not concern most Oxford MWI theorists, though, as they do not take themselves to be doing Everett exegesis.

A more pressing problem that faces the MWI theorist who relies on decoherence is the question of circularity. David Baker (2007) and Ruth Kastner (2014) have both argued that the use of decoherence begs the question regarding the derivation of probability because the use of decoherence presupposes a concept of objective probability. As Baker puts it, “proofs of decoherence depend implicitly upon the truth of the Born rule. Without first justifying the probability rule, Everettians cannot establish the existence of a preferred basis or the division of the wave function into branches. But without a preferred basis or a specification of branches, there can be no assignment of probabilities to measurement outcomes” (Baker 2007: 3). Kastner puts her concern this way: “the goal of decoherence is to obtain vanishing of the off-diagonal terms, which corresponds to the vanishing of interference and the selection of the observable R as the one with respect to which the universe purportedly ‘splits’ in an Everettian account . . . the vanishing of the off-diagonal terms is crucially dependent on an assumption that makes the derivation circular” (Kastner 2014: 57). Both Baker and Kastner are pointing to the fact that in order to ignore the off-diagonal terms, the crucial step in decoherence that provides the preferred basis, one must already have a conception of probability.

The best that Oxford MWI theorists can do, according to Baker, is to show that because the off-diagonal terms are incredibly close to zero, the observer can ignore them as part of her decision making (she ought not care much about them). If, however, that is justified by saying that it is because those terms are very unlikely to occur, then one is bringing in an illegitimate notion of probability (Baker 2007: 19ff). Kastner points to a different problem, the problem of the arbitrariness of the division between system, measuring device and environment (Kastner 2014: 57). It is crucial that one be able to ignore the effects of the environment, but if the division is arbitrary, then there is no non-circular way of isolating only the environment.

There are at least two other objections raised against the Oxford MWI that are in this vein, Barnum et al 2000 and Hemmo and Pitowsky 2007. The former points to a hidden assumption in Deutsch’s proof, one that “is not just a minor addition to Deutsch’s list of assumptions, but rather a major conceptual shift. The assumption is akin to applying Laplace’s Principle of Insufficient Reason to a set of indistinguishable alternatives, an application that requires acknowledging a priori that amplitudes are related to probabilities” (Barnum et al 2000: 1180). Hemmo and Pitowsky criticize the use of the Everettian Principal Principle, essential to Wallace’s derivation of the Born rule, on the grounds that it is incoherent to claim that observers should treat a term with a measure of zero as if it had a probability of zero. They also argue that there is no reason to believe (that is not question-begging) that rational observers would be justified in believing the statistical predications of quantum mechanics if they also believed the Oxford MWI (Hemmo and Pitowsky 2007: 334). Some of these objections were addressed by Wallace and others in the intervening years. But other criticisms have also been raised. Most of these criticize the use of decision theory to guide the derivations of probability in EQM.

David Albert (2010) argues that the entire program undertaken by Deutsch and Wallace (and others supporting them) misses the point. He writes, “the question out of which this entire program arises, seems like the wrong question. The questions to which this program is addressed are questions of what we would do if we believe that the fission hypothesis were correct. But the question at issue here is precisely whether to believe that the fission hypothesis is correct” (359)! The “fission hypothesis” is the hypothesis that the Schrödinger equation is the complete story of the evolution of the world and that each branch that results from a branching event has an observer with an actual experience. He goes on to say, “The decision-theoretic program seems to act as if what primarily and in the first instance stands in need to being explained about the world is why we bet the way we do” (359). And this is not what Albert believes needs to be explained, but rather, “What we need is an account of our actual empirical experiences of frequencies” (360).

Peter Lewis (2010) has argued that the decision-theoretic considerations that guide both Deutsch’s and Wallace’s arguments are not sufficient to show that the only rational guide to an observer’s decision-making procedures is the Born rule. Lewis argues that there is a gap in Deutsch’s proof by showing that there are other rules that an observer can follow and still be consistent with the rationality constraints assumed by Deutsch. Lewis acknowledges that Wallace has filled the gaps in Deutsch’s argument by adding a new axiom of rationality, but that unlike Deutsch’s axioms, Wallace’s addition is “not an innocuous and general axiom of rationality . . . [rather] it is a substantive claim about decision-making in the specific context of Everettian quantum mechanics, and so requires a substantive justification” (Lewis 2010: 21). Lewis does not believe that the justification that Wallace provides is sufficient. Alastair Wilson (2013, 2015) has worked to counter this criticism of Lewis’ by proposing new principles that tie the physics of EQM to modal metaphysics, thereby helping to provide the justification for some of Wallace’s most contentious claims.

Adrian Kent (2010) argues that Wallace’s attempt to axiomatize rational decision making in EQM, using decision theory as its model, is incoherent, and that in fact “Wallace’s axioms are not constitutive of rationality either in Everettian quantum theory or in theories in which branchings and branch weights are precisely defined” (307). Huw Price (2010) argues that because in the Oxford MWI view there are multiple future successors to an observer that she ought to care about, it is irrelevant to the observer (as far as rationality requirements go) which future branch she will subjectively occupy (378–79). Following this and further detailed argument, Price concludes that “there seems little prospect that a Deutschian decision rule can be a constraint of rationality, in a manner analogous to the classical case” (389).

the Oxford MWI has had a great deal of influence on many philosophers, and so work on the question of probability has not stopped. For more work on the question of probability see Dizadji-Bahmani 2013, Dawid and Thébault 2014, Wilson 2015, Jansson 2016, and Sebens and Carroll 2016.

5. Relational Interpretations of Everettian Quantum Mechanics

Given the centrality of Everett’s notion of relative states, it seems important to consider those interpretations that also highlight their importance. In section 3a we considered the bare theory interpretation of Everett. The two interpretations considered in this section are Simon Saunders’ relational interpretation and the relative facts interpretation.

a. Simon Saunders’ Relational Interpretation

Simon Saunders developed an interpretation of Everett in which values for systems can only be defined relative to a point of view, or a context of interest or relevance.  He proposes that just as we understand facts about tense to be relations, we should also understand facts about the properties of systems to be relations (Saunders 1993, 1995, 1996a, 1996b, 1997, 1998).

Let us assume that what appears to be the case is in fact the case, and that we are tracking the truth about the world when we make statements about how the world appears to us.  Then, there must be something about the world that makes true the proposition

 (9)  My coffee cup is on my desk.

This is what is known as the truthmaker principle.  Saunders has proposed that we understand the truthmaker for (9) analogously to the way B-theorists about time understand the truthmaker for a proposition like

(10)  My coffee cup was at home.

A B-theorist takes the truthmaker for (10) to be a fundamentally relational fact. For the B-theorist a statement like (10) can be reduced to a statement like

(11) The event of my coffee cup’s being at home is earlier than now.

For a B-theorist, relations such as the one in (11) are permanent dyadic relations that order positions in time. Other B-series relations include simultaneous with, earlier than, and later than. (For more on the B-theory of time, see McTaggart 1908, Maudlin 2002 and Markosian 2008 and the article on time in this encyclopedia.)

Saunders draws an analogy between what he considers the nature of the truthmaker for a proposition about the property of an object and what a B-theorist considers the nature of the truthmaker for a proposition about the property of an event like

(12) Event e is past.

In both cases the truthmaker is some fundamentally relative fact (Saunders 1995).

So now suppose that there are two non-concurrent events, E and E’. Then the following two statements, while both true, appear to be contradictory:

(13) Event E is now.

(14) Event E’ is now.

However, if we introduce two other events, W and W’, that are not identical and not concurrent, then we can resolve the apparent contradiction by instead saying:

(15) Event E is now relative to event W.

(16) Event E’ is now relative to event W’.

And these two statements are not contradictory.

Saunders suggests that we extend this analogy to the consideration of truthmakers for propositions like (9).  If we do, then a seeming contradiction in pure wave mechanics has a solution that is analogous to the solution to the apparent contradiction in tense metaphysics (Saunders 1995).

In a relational interpretation of EQM, most every physical systemG will typically have most every possible relative value for a property, just as every event has all of the qualities of past, present and future.  So, it is true to say:

 (17) X has value x.


(18) X has value x’.

even if ≠ x’ and the two are mutually exclusive.  But if so, then (17) and (18) are contradictory.

However, if we now introduce two parameters, Y and Y’, that can take values and are such that Y ≠ Y’, we can restate (17) and (18) as:

(19) X has value x relative to Y having value y.

(20) X has value x’ relative to Y’ having value y’.

It is clear that (19) and (20) are not contradictory.

In this view, an event's having a seemingly particular (tensed) time is analogous to an object having a seemingly particular (determinate) value for a property.  An event happened in the past (or future) relative to another time.  Likewise, an objectL has a determinate value relative to some parameter.

By relativizing the property of an object, what we are doing is explicitly changing the focus of our discussion from that of the properties of an objectG to that of the properties of an objectL.  So in (17) and (18) it is to XG that we are referring, but in (19) and (20) it is to XL that we are referring.  In the tense case, we change our focus from one concept of “now” in pair (13) and (14), to a different, relative concept of “now” in the pair (15) and (16).

The question then becomes, what are the relativizing parameters Y and Y’?  For Saunders, the parameters are worlds, or branches, at a particular time. In light of this, consider again (9).  In analogy with the B-theory, one recourse for explaining its truth (when it is in fact true) is to say that it is true because there is a determinate relative fact that consists in the coffee cup being on my desk.  Each possible fact about the value for the coffee cupG's position occurs in a different world.  So Saunders makes sense of the truth of a proposition like (9) by relativizing the cupL's position value to the world in which it finds itself.  Relative to being in this world, the coffee cupL is on my desk; relative to being in a different world, the coffee cupL is in the Mariana Trench; relative to being in yet another world, the coffee cupL is in my mother's kitchen.  Thus, the fact that makes (9) true is a relation between the position value for the coffee cupL and the world in which the coffee cupL finds itself. (For more discussion and criticism of Saunders’ relational interpretation see Barrett 1999, Conroy 2010, Laudisa and Rovelli 2008.)

b. The Relative Facts Interpretation

Another attempt to read a metaphysical picture from EQM is the relative facts interpretation [RFI]. It takes seriously Everett’s claim of the centrality of the notion of relative states and adds no additional principles to his pure wave mechanics. It bears a great deal of similarity to Saunders’ relational interpretation, but whereas Saunders’ view is a many-worlds view, the RFI takes there to be just one world in which all objects generally have relational properties (Conroy 2010, 2012, 2016).

Consider the problem described in the last section of resolving the contradiction between (17) and (18). The RFI can do so by defining the parameters Y and Y’ as being the (relative) state of the complement of the system that we are considering.  So we can make sense of the truth of a proposition like (9) by relativizing a coffee cupL's position to the state of the complement of the system of which it is a part.  My coffee cupL is on my desk relative to my having put it there, my desk being in my office, to my not having knocked the cup off, and so forth.  The fact that my desk is in my office is relative to some other collection of relative facts about the complement of its system (the movers that put it there being a part of that), and this goes on ad infinitum.  Likewise, my coffee cupL is in the Mariana Trench relative to my having decided to take a cruise in the Pacific, and my having dropped my coffee cup over the side of the ship at the right time, and so on. The truthmaker for a proposition like (9), in the RFI, is a relative fact.

That there can be a metaphysics of relative facts has been argued in the context of quantum mechanics in a general sense. Because entanglement is an inescapable part of the quantum mechanical world, several philosophers have argued that non-separable, entangled quantum mechanical states imply that there are relations that fail to be supervenient upon or be grounded by non-relational properties of their relata, and that this leads to quantum holism and a metaphysics consisting of non-reducible relations. Thus it seems reasonable to take a relational metaphysics and apply it to Everett interpretation given the importance he places on the notion of relative states. (For more on the development of a relational metaphysics in light of considerations of quantum entanglement see Cleland 1984, Teller 1986, Teller 1989, French 1989, Healey 1991, Esfeld 2003, Esfeld 2004, Schaffer 2010, Calosi 2014, McKenzie 2014, and Esfeld 2016.)

Both the RFI and Saunders’ relational interpretation can explain determinate measurement results by saying that an observer has a determinate relative result. While Saunders has worked on solving the problem of probability (see section 4b above), the RFI still lacks a development of a clear sense of how probability is meant to function.

6. Conclusion

Although there is no consensus about the correct way to interpret the outcome of quantum mechanical experiments, one very influential way of doing so is due to Hugh Everett III, who suggested that we drop the collapse postulate and take the universe to be such that its quantum state is an incredibly complex superposition that never collapses. The work that Everett did in the late 1950s has led many philosophers and philosophers of physics to attempt to build a metaphysical picture of the world based on the physics that he proposed. This article has surveyed the major developments in the work that was inspired by Everett’s 1957 dissertation. Just as there is no consensus on whether or not Everett has the best physics for the description of the world, there is no consensus on the best way to read a metaphysical picture off of the world Everett described. It is left to the reader to adjudicate these debates.

7. References and Further Reading

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Author Information

Christina Conroy
Email: c.conroy@moreheadstate.edu
Morehead State University
U. S. A.