Logical Problem of Evil
The existence of evil and suffering in our world seems to pose a serious challenge to belief in the existence of a perfect God. If God were all-knowing, it seems that God would know about all of the horrible things that happen in our world. If God were all-powerful, God would be able to do something about all of the evil and suffering. Furthermore, if God were morally perfect, then surely God would want to do something about it. And yet we find that our world is filled with countless instances of evil and suffering. These facts about evil and suffering seem to conflict with the orthodox theist claim that there exists a perfectly good God. The challenged posed by this apparent conflict has come to be known as the problem of evil.
This article addresses one form of that problem that is prominent in recent philosophical discussions–that the conflict that exists between the claims of orthodox theism and the facts about evil and suffering in our world is a logical one. This is the “logical problem of evil.”
The article clarifies the nature of the logical problem of evil and considers various theistic responses to the problem. Special attention is given to the free will defense, which has been the most widely discussed theistic response to the logical problem of evil.
Table of Contents
- Introducing the Problem
- Logical Consistency
- Logical Consistency and the Logical Problem of Evil
- Plantinga’s Free Will Defense
- Divine Omnipotence and the Free Will Defense
- An Objection: Free Will and Natural Evil
- Evaluating the Free Will Defense
- Was Plantinga’s Victory Too Easy?
- Other Responses to the Logical Problem of Evil
- Problems with the Free Will Defense
- References and Further Reading
Journalist and best-selling author Lee Strobel commissioned George Barna, the public-opinion pollster, to conduct a nationwide survey. The survey included the question “If you could ask God only one question and you knew he would give you an answer, what would you ask?” The most common response, offered by 17% of those who could think of a question was “Why is there pain and suffering in the world?” (Strobel 2000, p. 29). If God is all-powerful, all-knowing and perfectly good, why does he let so many bad things happen? This question raises what philosophers call “the problem of evil.”
It would be one thing if the only people who suffered debilitating diseases or tragic losses were the likes of Adolf Hitler, Joseph Stalin or Osama Bin Laden. As it is, however, thousands of good-hearted, innocent people experience the ravages of violent crime, terminal disease, and other evils. Michael Peterson (1998, p. 1) writes,
Something is dreadfully wrong with our world. An earthquake kills hundreds in Peru. A pancreatic cancer patient suffers prolonged, excruciating pain and dies. A pit bull attacks a two-year-old child, angrily ripping his flesh and killing him. Countless multitudes suffer the ravages of war in Somalia. A crazed cult leader pushes eighty-five people to their deaths in Waco, Texas. Millions starve and die in North Korea as famine ravages the land. Horrible things of all kinds happen in our world—and that has been the story since the dawn of civilization.
Peterson (1998, p. 9) claims that the problem of evil is a kind of “moral protest.” In asking “How could God let this happen?” people are often claiming “It’s not fair that God has let this happen.” Many atheists try to turn the existence of evil and suffering into an argument against the existence of God. They claim that, since there is something morally problematic about a morally perfect God allowing all of the evil and suffering we see, there must not be a morally perfect God after all. The popularity of this kind of argument has led Hans Küng (1976, p. 432) to call the problem of evil “the rock of atheism.” This essay examines one form the argument from evil has taken, which is known as “the logical problem of evil.”
In the second half of the twentieth century, atheologians (that is, persons who try to prove the non-existence of God) commonly claimed that the problem of evil was a problem of logical inconsistency. J. L. Mackie (1955, p. 200), for example, claimed,
Here it can be shown, not that religious beliefs lack rational support, but that they are positively irrational, that several parts of the essential theological doctrine are inconsistent with one another.
H. J. McCloskey (1960, p. 97) wrote,
Evil is a problem, for the theist, in that a contradiction is involved in the fact of evil on the one hand and belief in the omnipotence and omniscience of God on the other.
Mackie and McCloskey can be understood as claiming that it is impossible for all of the following statements to be true at the same time:
(1) God is omnipotent (that is, all-powerful).
(2) God is omniscient (that is, all-knowing).
(3) God is perfectly good.
(4) Evil exists.
Any two or three of them might be true at the same time; but there is no way that all of them could be true. In other words, (1) through (4) form a logically inconsistent set. What does it mean to say that something is logically inconsistent?
(5) A set of statements is logically inconsistent if and only if: (a) that set includes a direct contradiction of the form “p & not-p”; or (b) a direct contradiction can be deduced from that set.
None of the statements in (1) through (4) directly contradicts any other, so if the set is logically inconsistent, it must be because we can deduce a contradiction from it. This is precisely what atheologians claim to be able to do.
Atheologians claim that a contradiction can easily be deduced from (1) through (4) once we think through the implications of the divine attributes cited in (1) through (3). They reason as follows:
(6) If God is omnipotent, he would be able to prevent all of the evil and suffering in the world.
(7) If God is omniscient, he would know about all of the evil and suffering in the world and would know how to eliminate or prevent it.
(8) If God is perfectly good, he would want to prevent all of the evil and suffering in the world.
Statements (6) through (8) jointly imply that if the perfect God of theism really existed, there would not be any evil or suffering. However, as we all know, our world is filled with a staggering amount of evil and suffering. Atheologians claim that, if we reflect upon (6) through (8) in light of the fact of evil and suffering in our world, we should be led to the following conclusions:
(9) If God knows about all of the evil and suffering in the world, knows how to eliminate or prevent it, is powerful enough to prevent it, and yet does not prevent it, he must not be perfectly good.
(10) If God knows about all of the evil and suffering, knows how to eliminate or prevent it, wants to prevent it, and yet does not do so, he must not be all- powerful.
(11) If God is powerful enough to prevent all of the evil and suffering, wants to do so, and yet does not, he must not know about all of the suffering or know how to eliminate or prevent it—that is, he must not be all-knowing.
From (9) through (11) we can infer:
(12) If evil and suffering exist, then God is either not omnipotent, not omniscient, or not perfectly good.
Since evil and suffering obviously do exist, we get:
(13) God is either not omnipotent, not omniscient, or not perfectly good.
Putting the point more bluntly, this line of argument suggests that—in light of the evil and suffering we find in our world—if God exists, he is either impotent, ignorant or wicked. It should be obvious that (13) conflicts with (1) through (3) above. To make the conflict more clear, we can combine (1), (2) and (3) into the following single statement.
(14) God is omnipotent, omniscient and perfectly good.
There is no way that (13) and (14) could both be true at the same time. These statements are logically inconsistent or contradictory.
Statement (14) is simply the conjunction of (1) through (3) and expresses the central belief of classical theism. However, atheologians claim that statement ( 13) can also be derived from (1) through (3). [Statements (6) through (12) purport to show how this is done.] (13) and (14), however, are logically contradictory. Because a contradiction can be deduced from statements (1) through (4) and because all theists believe (1) through (4), atheologians claim that theists have logically inconsistent beliefs. They note that philosophers have always believed it is never rational to believe something contradictory. So, the existence of evil and suffering makes theists’ belief in the existence of a perfect God irrational.
Can the believer in God escape from this dilemma? In his best-selling book When Bad Things Happen to Good People, Rabbi Harold Kushner (1981) offers the following escape route for the theist: deny the truth of (1). According to this proposal, God is not ignoring your suffering when he doesn’t act to prevent it because—as an all-knowing God—he knows about all of your suffering. As a perfectly good God, he also feels your pain. The problem is that he can’t do anything about it because he’s not omnipotent. According to Kushner’s portrayal, God is something of a kind-hearted wimp. He’d like to help, but he doesn’t have the power to do anything about evil and suffering. Denying the truth of either (1), (2), (3) or ( 4) is certainly one way for the theist to escape from the logical problem of evil, but it would not be a very palatable option to many theists. In the remainder of this essay, we will examine some theistic responses to the logical problem of evil that do not require the abandonment of any central tenet of theism.
Theists who want to rebut the logical problem of evil need to find a way to show that (1) through (4)—perhaps despite initial appearances—are consistent after all. We said above that a set of statements is logically inconsistent if and only if that set includes a direct contradiction or a direct contradiction can be deduced from that set. That means that a set of statements is logically consistent if and only if that set does not include a direct contradiction and a direct contradiction cannot be deduced from that set. In other words,
(15) A set of statements is logically consistent if and only if it is possible for all of them to be true at the same time.
Notice that (15) does not say that consistent statements must actually be true at the same time. They may all be false or some may be true and others false. Consistency only requires that it be possible for all of the statements to be true (even if that possibility is never actualized). (15) also doesn’t say anything about plausibility. It does not require the joint of a consistent set of statements to be plausible. It may be exceedingly unlikely or improbable that a certain set of statements should all be true at the same time. But improbability is not the same thing as impossibility. As long as there is nothing contradictory about their conjunction, it will be possible (even if unlikely) for them all to be true at the same time.
This brief discussion allows us to see that the atheological claim that statements (1) through (4) are logically inconsistent is a rather strong one. The atheologian is maintaining that statements (1) through (4) couldn’t possibly all be true at the same time. In other words,
(16) It is not possible for God and evil to co-exist.
The logical problem of evil claims that God’s omnipotence, omniscience and supreme goodness would completely rule out the possibility of evil and that the existence of evil would do the same for the existence of a supreme being.
How might a theist go about demonstrating that (16) is false? Some theists suggest that perhaps God has a good reason for allowing the evil and suffering that he does. Not just any old reason can justify God’s allowing all of the evil and suffering we see. Mass murderers and serial killers typically have reasons for why they commit horrible crimes, but they do not have good reasons. It’s only when people have morally good reasons that we excuse or condone their behavior. Philosophers of religion have called the kind of reason that could morally justify God’s allowing evil and suffering a “morally sufficient reason.”
Consider the following statement.
(17) It is possible that God has a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil.
If God were to have a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil, would it be possible for God to be omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good, and yet for there to be evil and suffering? Many theists answer “Yes.” If (17) were true, (9) through (12) would have to be modified to read:
(9′) If God knows about all of the evil and suffering in the world, knows how to eliminate or prevent it, is powerful enough to prevent it, and yet does not prevent it, he must not be perfectly good—unless he has a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil.
(10′) If God knows about all of the evil and suffering, knows how to eliminate or prevent it, wants to prevent it, and yet does not do so, he must not be all-powerful—unless he has a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil.
(11′) If God is powerful enough to prevent all of the evil and suffering, wants to do so, and yet does not, he must not know about all of the suffering or know how to eliminate or prevent it (that is, he must not be all-knowing)—unless he has a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil.
(12′) If evil and suffering exist, then either: a) God is not omnipotent, not omniscient, or not perfectly good; or b) God has a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil.
From (9′) through (12′), it is not possible to conclude that God does not exist. The most that can be concluded is that either God does not exist or God has a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil. So, some theists suggest that the real question behind the logical problem of evil is whether (17) is true.
If it is possible that God has a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil and suffering to occur, then the logical problem of evil fails to prove the non-existence of God. If, however, it is not possible that God has a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil, then it seems that (13) would be true: God is either not omnipotent, not omniscient, or not perfectly good.
An implicit assumption behind this part of the debate over the logical problem of evil is the following:
(18) It is not morally permissible for God to allow evil and suffering to occur unless he has a morally sufficient reason for doing so.
Is (18) correct? Many philosophers think so. It is difficult to see how a God who allowed bad things to happen just for the heck of it could be worthy of reverence, faith and worship. If God had no morally sufficient reason for allowing evil, then if we made it to the pearly gates some day and asked God why he allowed so many bad things to happen, he would simply have to shrug his shoulders and say “There was no reason or point to all of that suffering you endured. I just felt like letting it happen.” This callous image of God is difficult to reconcile with orthodox theism’s portrayal of God as a loving Father who cares deeply about his creation. (18), combined with the assumption that God does not have a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil, yields
(19) God is doing something morally inappropriate or blameworthy in allowing evil to occur,
(20) If God is doing something morally inappropriate or blameworthy, then God is not perfectly good.
If (19) and (20) are true, then the God of orthodox theism does not exist.
What would it look like for God to have a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil? Let’s first consider a down-to-earth example of a morally sufficient reason a human being might have before moving on to the case of God. Suppose a gossipy neighbor were to tell you that Mrs. Jones just allowed someone to inflict unwanted pain upon her child. Your first reaction to this news might be one of horror. But once you find out that the pain was caused by a shot that immunized Mrs. Jones’ infant daughter against polio, you would no longer view Mrs. Jones as a danger to society. Generally, we believe the following moral principle to be true.
(21) Parents should not inflict unwanted pain upon their children.
In the immunization case, Mrs. Jones has a morally sufficient reason for overriding or suspending this principle. A higher moral duty—namely, the duty of protecting the long-term health of her child—trumps the lesser duty expressed by (21). If God has a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil and suffering, theists claim, it will probably look something like Mrs. Jones’.
What might God’s reason be for allowing evil and suffering to occur? Alvin Plantinga (1974, 1977) has offered the most famous contemporary philosophical response to this question. He suggests the following as a possible morally sufficient reason:
(MSR1) God’s creation of persons with morally significant free will is something of tremendous value. God could not eliminate much of the evil and suffering in this world without thereby eliminating the greater good of having created persons with free will with whom he could have relationships and who are able to love one another and do good deeds.
(MSR1) claims that God allows some evils to occur that are smaller in value than a greater good to which they are intimately connected. If God eliminated the evil, he would have to eliminate the greater good as well. God is pictured as being in a situation much like that of Mrs. Jones: she allowed a small evil (the pain of a needle) to be inflicted upon her child because that pain was necessary for bringing about a greater good (immunization against polio). Before we try to decide whether (MSR1) can justify God in allowing evil and suffering to occur, some of its key terms need to be explained.
To begin with, (MSR1) presupposes the view of free will known as “libertarianism”:
(22) Libertarianism=df the view that a person is free with respect to a given action if and only if that person is both free to perform that action and free to refrain from performing that action; in other words, that person is not determined to perform or refrain from that action by any prior causal forces.
Although the term “libertarianism” isn’t exactly a household name, the view it expresses is commonly taken to be the average person’s view of free will. It is the view that causal determinism is false, that—unlike robots or other machines—we can make choices that are genuinely free.
According to Plantinga, libertarian free will is a morally significant kind of free will. An action is morally significant just when it is appropriate to evaluate that action from a moral perspective (for example, by ascribing moral praise or blame). Persons have morally significant free will if they are able to perform actions that are morally significant. Imagine a possible world where God creates creatures with a very limited kind of freedom. Suppose that the persons in this world can only choose good options and are incapable of choosing bad options. So, if one of them were faced with three possible courses of action—two of which were morally good and one of which was morally bad—this person would not be free with respect to the morally bad option. That is, that person would not be able to choose any bad option even if they wanted to. Our hypothetical person does, however, have complete freedom to decide which of the two good courses of action to take. Plantinga would deny that any such person has morally significant free will. People in this world always perform morally good actions, but they deserve no credit for doing so. It is impossible for them to do wrong. So, when they do perform right actions, they should not be praised. It would be ridiculous to give moral praise to a robot for putting your soda can in the recycle bin rather than the trash can, if that is what it was programmed to do. Given the program running inside the robot and its exposure to an empty soda can, it’s going to take the can to the recycle bin. It has no choice about the matter. Similarly, the people in the possible world under consideration have no choice about being good. Since they are pre-programmed to be good, they deserve no praise for it.
According to Plantinga, people in the actual world are free in the most robust sense of that term. They are fully free and responsible for their actions and decisions. Because of this, when they do what is right, they can properly be praised. Moreover, when they do wrong, they can be rightly blamed or punished for their actions.
It is important to note that (MSR1) directly conflicts with a common assumption about what kind of world God could have created. Many atheologians believe that God could have created a world that was populated with free creatures and yet did not contain any evil or suffering. Since this is something that God could have done and since a world with free creatures and no evil is better than a world with free creatures and evil, this is something God should have done. Since he did not do so, God did something blameworthy by not preventing or eliminating evil and suffering (if indeed God exists at all). In response to this charge, Plantinga maintains that there are some worlds God cannot create. In particular, he cannot do the logically impossible. (MSR1) claims that God cannot get rid of much of the evil and suffering in the world without also getting rid of morally significant free will. (The question of whether God’s omnipotence is compatible with the claim that God cannot do the logically impossible will be addressed below.)
Consider the following descriptions of various worlds. We need to determine which ones describe worlds that are logically possible and which ones describe impossible worlds. The worlds described will be possible if the descriptions of those worlds are logically consistent. If the descriptions of those worlds are inconsistent or contradictory, the worlds in question will be impossible.
W1: (a) God creates persons with morally significant free will; (b) God does not causally determine people in every situation to choose what is right and to avoid what is wrong; and (c) There is evil and suffering in W1. W2: (a) God does not create persons with morally significant free will; (b) God causally determines people in every situation to choose what is right and to avoid what is wrong; and (c) There is no evil or suffering in W2. W3: (a) God creates persons with morally significant free will; (b) God causally determines people in every situation to choose what is right and to avoid what is wrong; and (c) There is no evil or suffering in W3. W4: (a) God creates persons with morally significant free will; (b) God does not causally determine people in every situation to choose what is right and to avoid what is wrong; and (c) There is no evil or suffering in W4.
Let’s figure out which of these worlds are possible. Is W1 possible? Yes. In fact, on the assumption that God exists, it seems to describe the actual world. People have free will in this world and there is evil and suffering. God has obviously not causally determined people in every situation to choose what is right and to avoid what is wrong because there would be no evil or suffering if he had. So, W1 is clearly possible.
What about W2? Granting Plantinga’s assumption that human beings are genuinely free creatures, the first thing to notice about W2 is that you and I would not exist in such a world. We are creatures with morally significant free will. If you took away our free will, we would no longer be the kinds of creatures we are. We would not be human in that world. Returning to the main issue, there does not seem to be anything impossible about God causally determining people in every situation to choose what is right and to avoid what is wrong. It seems clearly possible that whatever creatures God were to make in such a world would not have morally significant free will and that there would be no evil or suffering. W2, then, is also possible.
Now let’s consider the philosophically more important world W3. Is W3 possible? Plantinga says, “No.” Parts (a) and (b) of the description of W3 are, he claims, logically inconsistent. In W3 God causally determines people in every situation to choose what is right and to avoid what is wrong. People in this world couldn’t do morally bad things if they wanted to. And yet part of what it means for creatures to have morally significant free will is that they can do morally bad things whenever they want to. Think about what it would be like to live in W3. If you wanted to tell a lie, you would not be able to do so. Causal forces beyond your control would make you tell the truth on every occasion. You would also be physically incapable of stealing your neighbor’s belongings. In fact, since W3 is a world without evil of any kind and since merely wanting to lie or steal is itself a bad thing, the people in W3 would not even be able to have morally bad thoughts or desires. If God is going to causally determine people in every situation to choose what is right and to avoid what is wrong in W3, there is no way that he could allow them to be free in a morally significant sense. Peterson (1998, p. 39) writes,
if a person is free with respect to an action A, then God does not bring it about or cause it to be the case that she does A or refrains from doing A. For if God brings it about or causes it to be the case in any manner whatsoever that the person either does A or does not do A, then that person is not really free.
God can’t have it both ways. He can create a world with free creatures or he can causally determine creatures to choose what is right and to avoid what is wrong every time; but he can’t do both. God can forcibly eliminate evil and suffering (as in W2) only at the cost of getting rid of free will.
The fact that W3 is impossible is centrally important to Plantinga’s Free Will Defense. Atheologians, as we saw above, claim that God is doing something morally blameworthy by allowing evil and suffering to exist in our world. They charge that a good God would and should eliminate all evil and suffering. The assumption behind this charge is that, in so doing, God could leave human free will untouched. Plantinga claims that when we think through what robust free will really amounts to, we can see that atheologians are (unbeknownst to themselves) asking God to do the logically impossible. Being upset that God has not done something that is logically impossible is, according to Plantinga, misguided. He might say, “Of course he hasn’t done that. It’s logically impossible!” As we will see in section V below, Plantinga maintains that divine omnipotence involves an ability to do anything that is logically possible, but it does not include the ability to do the logically impossible.
Consider W4. Is it possible? Yes! Most people are tempted to answer “No” when first exposed to this description, but think carefully about it. Although there is no evil and suffering in this world, it is not because God causally determines people in every situation to choose what is right and to avoid what is wrong. In this world God has given creatures morally significant free will without any strings attached. If there is nothing bad in this world, it can only be because the free creatures that inhabit this world have—by their own free will—always chosen to do the right thing. Is this kind of situation really possible? Yes. Something is logically possible just when it can be conceived without contradiction. There is nothing contradictory about supposing that there is a possible world where free creatures always make the right choices and never go wrong. Of course, it’s highly improbable, given what we know about human nature. But improbability and impossibility, as we said above, are two different things. In fact, according to the Judeo-Christian story of Adam and Eve, it was God’s will that significantly free human beings would live in the Garden of Eden and always obey God’s commands. If Adam and Eve had followed God’s plan, then W4 would have been the actual world.
It is important to note certain similarities between W1 and W4. Both worlds are populated by creatures with free will and in neither world does God causally determine people to always choose what is right and to avoid what is wrong. The only difference is that, in W1, the free creatures choose to do wrong at least some of the time, and in W4, the free creatures always make morally good decisions. In other words, whether there is immorality in either one of these worlds depends upon the persons living in these worlds—not upon God. According to Plantinga’s Free Will Defense, there is evil and suffering in this world because people do immoral things. People deserve the blame for the bad things that happen—not God. Plantinga (1974, p. 190) writes,
The essential point of the Free Will Defense is that the creation of a world containing moral good is a cooperative venture; it requires the uncoerced concurrence of significantly free creatures. But then the actualization of a world W containing moral good is not up to God alone; it also depends upon what the significantly free creatures of W would do.
Atheist philosophers such as Anthony Flew and J. L. Mackie have argued that an omnipotent God should be able to create a world containing moral good but no moral evil. As Flew (1955, p. 149) put it, “If there is no contradiction here then Omnipotence might have made a world inhabited by perfectly virtuous people.” Mackie (1955, p. 209) writes,
If God has made men such that in their free choices they sometimes prefer what is good and sometimes what is evil, why could he not have made men such that they always freely choose the good? If there is no logical impossibility in a man’s choosing the good on one, or on several occasions, there cannot be a logical impossibility in his freely choosing the good on every occasion. God was not, then, faced with a choice between making innocent automata and making beings who, in acting freely, would sometimes go wrong: there was open to him the obviously better possibility of making beings who would act freely but always go right. Clearly, his failure to avail himself of this possibility is inconsistent with his being both omnipotent and perfectly good.
According to Plantinga, Mackie is correct in thinking that there is nothing impossible about a world in which people always freely choose to do right. That’s W4. He is also correct in thinking that God’s only options were not “making innocent automata and making beings who, in acting freely, would sometimes go wrong.” In other words, worlds like W1 and W2 are not the only logically possible worlds. But Plantinga thinks he is mistaken in thinking that W3 is possible and in not recognizing important differences between W3 and W4. People can freely choose to do what is right only when their actions are not causally determined.
We might wonder why God would choose to risk populating his new creation with free creatures if he knew there was a chance that human immorality could foul the whole thing up. C. S. Lewis (1943, p. 52) offers the following answer to this question:
Why, then, did God give them free will? Because free will, though it makes evil possible, is also the only thing that makes possible any love or goodness or joy worth having. A world of automata—of creatures that worked like machines—would hardly be worth creating. The happiness which God designs for His higher creatures is the happiness of being freely, voluntarily united to Him and to each other…. And for that they must be free. Of course, God knew what would happen if they used their freedom the wrong way: apparently He thought it worth the risk.
Plantinga concurs. He writes,
A world containing creatures who are sometimes significantly free (and freely perform more good than evil actions) is more valuable, all else being equal, than a world containing no free creatures at all. Now God can create free creatures, but he cannot cause or determine them to do only what is right. For if he does so, then they are not significantly free after all; they do not do what is right freely. To create creatures capable of moral good, therefore, he must create creatures capable of moral evil; and he cannot leave these creatures free to perform evil and at the same time prevent them from doing so…. The fact that these free creatures sometimes go wrong, however, counts neither against God’s omnipotence nor against his goodness; for he could have forestalled the occurrence of moral evil only by excising the possibility of moral good. (Plantinga 1974, pp. 166-167)
According to his Free Will Defense, God could not eliminate the possibility of moral evil without at the same time eliminating some greater good.
Some scholars maintain that Plantinga has rejected the idea of an omnipotent God because he claims there are some things God cannot do—namely, logically impossible things. Plantinga, however, doesn’t take God’s omnipotence to include the power to do the logically impossible. He reasons as follows. Can God create a round square? Can he make 2 + 2 = 5? Can he create a stick that is not as long as itself? Can he make contradictory statements true? Can he make a rock so big he can’t lift it? In response to each of these questions, Plantinga’s answer is “No.” Each of the scenarios depicted in these questions is impossible: the objects or events in question couldn’t possibly exist. Omnipotence, according to Plantinga, is the power to do anything that is logically possible. The fact that God cannot do the logically impossible is not, Plantinga claims, a genuine limitation of God’s power. He would urge those uncomfortable with the idea of limitations on God’s power to think carefully about the absurd implications of a God who can do the logically impossible. If you think God really can make a round square, Plantinga would like to know what such a shape would look like. If God can make 2 + 2 = 5, then what would 2 + 3 equal? If God can make a rock so big that he can’t lift it, exactly how big would that rock be? What Plantinga would really like to see is a stick that is not as long as itself. Each of these things seems to be absolutely, positively impossible.
Many theists maintain that it is a mistake to think that God’s omnipotence requires that the blank in the following sentence must never be filled in:
(23) God is not able to ______________.
According to orthodox theism, all of the following statements (and many more like them) are true.
(24) God is not able to lie.
(25) God is not able to cheat.
(26) God is not able to steal.
(27) God is not able to be unjust.
(28) God is not able to be envious.
(29) God is not able to fail to know what is right.
(30) God is not able to fail to do what he knows to be right.
(31) God is not able to have false beliefs about anything.
(32) God is not able to be ignorant.
(33) God is not able to be unwise.
(34) God is not able to cease to exist.
(35) God is not able to make a mistake of any kind.
According to classical theism, the fact that God cannot do any of these things is not a sign of weakness. On the contrary, theists claim, it is an indication of his supremacy and uniqueness. These facts reveal that God is, in St. Anselm’s (1033-1109 A.D.) words, “that being than which none greater can be conceived.” Plantinga adds the following two items to the list of things God cannot do.
(36) God is not able to contradict himself.
(37) God is not able to make significantly free creatures and to causally determine that they will always choose what is right and avoid what is wrong.
These inabilities follow not from God’s omnipotence alone but from his omnipotence in combination with his omniscience, moral perfection and the other divine perfections God possesses.
At this point, someone might raise the following objection.
Plantinga can’t put all the blame for pain and suffering on human beings. Although much of the evil in this world results from the free choices people make, some of it does not. Cancer, AIDS, famines, earthquakes, tornadoes, and many other kinds of diseases and natural disasters are things that happen without anybody choosing to bring them about. Plantinga’s Free Will Defense, then, cannot serve as a morally sufficient reason for God’s allowing disease and natural disasters.
This objection leads us to draw a distinction between the following two kinds of evil and suffering:
(38) Moral evil =df evil or suffering that results from the immoral choices of free creatures.
(39) Natural evil =df evil or suffering that results from the operations of nature or nature gone awry.
According to Edward Madden and Peter Hare (1968, p. 6), natural evil includes
the terrible pain, suffering, and untimely death caused by events like fire, flood, landslide, hurricane, earthquake, tidal wave, and famine and by diseases like cancer, leprosy and tetanus—as well as crippling defects and deformities like blindness, deafness, dumbness, shriveled limbs, and insanity by which so many sentient beings are cheated of the full benefits of life.
Moral evil, they continue, includes
both moral wrong-doing such as lying, cheating, stealing, torturing, and murdering and character defects like greed, deceit, cruelty, wantonness, cowardice, and selfishness. (ibid.)
It seems that, although Plantinga’s Free Will Defense may be able to explain why God allows moral evil to occur, it cannot explain why he allows natural evil. If God is going to allow people to be free, it seems plausible to claim that they need to have the capacity to commit crimes and to be immoral. However, it is not clear that human freedom requires the existence of natural evils like deadly viruses and natural disasters. How would my free will be compromised if tomorrow God completely eliminated cancer from the face of the Earth? Do people really need to die from heart disease and flash floods in order for us to have morally significant free will? It is difficult to see that they do. So, the objection goes, even if Plantinga’s Free Will Defense explains why God allows moral evil, it does not explain why he allows natural evil.
Plantinga, however, thinks that his Free Will Defense can be used to solve the logical problem of evil as it pertains to natural evil. Here is a possible reason God might have for allowing natural evil:
(MSR2) God allowed natural evil to enter the world as part of Adam and Eve’s punishment for their sin in the Garden of Eden.
(Those familiar with Plantinga’s work will notice that this is not the same reason Plantinga offers for God’s allowing natural evil. They will also be able to guess why a different reason was chosen in this article.) The sin of Adam and Eve was a moral evil. (MSR2) claims that all natural evil followed as the result of the world’s first moral evil. So, if it is plausible to think that Plantinga’s Free Will Defense solves the logical problem of evil as it pertains to moral evil, the current suggestion is that it is plausible also to think that it solves the logical problem of evil as it pertains to natural evil because all of the worlds evils have their source in moral evil.
(MSR2) represents a common Jewish and Christian response to the challenge posed by natural evil. Death, disease, pain and even the tiresome labor involved in gleaning food from the soil came into the world as a direct result of Adam and Eve’s sin. The emotional pain of separation, shame and broken relationships are also consequences that first instance of moral evil. In fact, according to the first chapter of Genesis, animals in the Garden of Eden didn’t even kill each other for food before the Fall. In the description of the sixth day of creation God says to Adam and Eve,
I give you every seed-bearing plant on the face of the whole earth and every tree that has fruit with seed in it. They will be yours for food. And to all the beasts of the earth and all the birds of the air and all the creatures that move on the ground—everything that has the breath of life in it—I give every green plant for food. (Gen. 1:29-30, NIV)
In other words, the Garden of Eden is pictured as a peaceful, vegetarian commune until moral evil entered the world and brought natural evil with it. It seems, then, that the Free Will Defense might be adapted to rebut the logical problem of natural evil after all.
Some might think that (MSR2) is simply too far-fetched to be taken seriously. [If you think (MSR2) is far-fetched, see Plantinga's (1974, pp. 191-193) own suggestions about who is responsible for natural evil.] Natural disasters, it will be said, bear no essential connection to human wrongdoing, so it is absurd to think that moral evil could somehow bring natural evil into the world. Moreover, (MSR2) would have us believe that there were real persons named Adam and Eve and that they actually performed the misdeeds attributed to them in the book of Genesis. (MSR2) seems to be asking us to believe things that only a certain kind of theist would believe. The implausibility of (MSR2) is taken by some to be a serious defect.
What should we make of Plantinga’s Free Will Defense? Does it succeed in solving the logical problem of evil as it pertains to either moral or natural evil? In order to answer these questions, let’s briefly consider what it would take for any response to the logical problem of evil to be successful. Recall that the logical problem of evil can be summarized as the following claim:
(16) It is not possible for God and evil to co-exist.
When someone claims
(40) Situation x is impossible,
what is the least that you would have to prove in order to show that (40) is false? If you could point to an actual instance of the type of situation in question, that would certainly prove that (40) is false. But you don’t even need to trouble yourself with finding an actual x. All you need is a possible x. The claim
(41) Situation x is possible
is the contradictory of (40). The two claims are logical opposites. If one is true, the other is false; if one is false, the other is true. If you can show that x is merely possible, you will have refuted (40).
How would you go about finding a logically possible x? Philosophers claim that you only need to use your imagination. If you can conceive of a state of affairs without there being anything contradictory about what you’re imagining, then that state of affairs must be possible. In a word, conceivability is your guide to possibility.
Since the logical problem of evil claims that it is logically impossible for God and evil to co-exist, all that Plantinga (or any other theist) needs to do to combat this claim is to describe a possible situation in which God and evil co-exist. That situation doesn’t need to be actual or even realistic. Plantinga doesn’t need to have a single shred of evidence supporting the truth of his suggestion. All he needs to do is give a logically consistent description of a way that God and evil can co-exist. Plantinga claims God and evil could co-exist if God had a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil. He suggests that God’s morally sufficient reason might have something to do with humans being granted morally significant free will and with the greater goods this freedom makes possible. All that Plantinga needs to claim on behalf of (MSR1) and (MSR2) is that they are logically possible (that is, not contradictory).
Does Plantinga’s Free Will Defense succeed in describing a possible state of affairs in which God has a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil? It certainly seems so. In fact, it appears that even the most hardened atheist must admit that (MSR1) and (MSR2) are possible reasons God might have for allowing moral and natural evil. They may not represent God’s actual reasons, but for the purpose of blocking the logical problem of evil, it is not necessary that Plantinga discover God’s actual reasons. In the last section we noted that many people will find (MSR2)’s explanation of natural evil extremely difficult to believe because it assumes the literal existence of Adam and Eve and the literal occurrence of the Fall. However, since (MSR2) deals with the logical problem of evil as it pertains to natural evil (which claims that it is logically impossible for God and natural evil to co-exist), it only needs to sketch a possible way for God and natural evil to co-exist. The fact that (MSR2) may be implausible does not keep it from being possible. Since the situation described by (MSR2) is clearly possible, it appears that it successfully rebuts the logical problem of evil as it pertains to natural evil.
Since (MSR1) and (MSR2) together seem to show contra the claims of the logical problem of evil how it is possible for God and (moral and natural) evil to co-exist, it seems that the Free Will Defense successfully defeats the logical problem of evil.
Some philosophers feel that Plantinga’s apparent victory over the logical problem of evil was somehow too easy. His solution to the logical problem of evil leaves them feeling unsatisfied and suspicious that they have been taken in by some kind of sleight of hand. For example, J. L. Mackie one of the most prominent atheist philosophers of the mid-twentieth-century and a key exponent of the logical problem of evil has this to say about Plantinga’s Free Will Defense:
Since this defense is formally [that is, logically] possible, and its principle involves no real abandonment of our ordinary view of the opposition between good and evil, we can concede that the problem of evil does not, after all, show that the central doctrines of theism are logically inconsistent with one another. But whether this offers a real solution of the problem is another question. (Mackie 1982, p. 154)
Mackie admits that Plantinga’s defense shows how God and evil can co-exist, that is, it shows that “the central doctrines of theism” are logically consistent after all. However, Mackie is reluctant to attribute much significance to Plantinga’s accomplishment. He expresses doubt about whether Plantinga has adequately dealt with the problem of evil.
Part of Mackie’s dissatisfaction probably stems from the fact that Plantinga only gives a possible reason for why God might have for allowing evil and suffering and does not provide any evidence for his claims or in any way try to make them plausible. Although sketching out mere possibilities without giving them any evidential support is typically an unsatisfactory thing to do in philosophy, it is not clear that Mackie’s unhappiness with Plantinga is completely warranted. It was, after all, Mackie himself who characterized the problem of evil as one of logical inconsistency:
Here it can be shown, not that religious beliefs lack rational support, but that they are positively irrational, that several parts of the essential theological doctrine are inconsistent with one another. (Mackie 1955, p. 200)
In response to this formulation of the problem of evil, Plantinga showed that this charge of inconsistency was mistaken. Even Mackie admits that Plantinga solved the problem of evil, if that problem is understood as one of inconsistency. It is, therefore, difficult to see why Plantinga’s Free Will Defense should be found wanting if that defense is seen as a response to the logical problem of evil. As an attempt to rebut the logical problem of evil, it is strikingly successful.
The dissatisfaction many have felt with Plantinga’s solution may stem from a desire to see Plantinga’s Free Will Defense respond more generally to the problem of evil and not merely to a single formulation of the problem. As an all-around response to the problem of evil, the Free Will Defense does not offer us much in the way of explanation. It leaves several of the most important questions about God and evil unanswered. The desire to see a theistic response to the problem of evil go beyond merely undermining a particular atheological argument is understandable. However, we should keep in mind that all parties admit that Plantinga’s Free Will Defense successfully rebuts the logical problem of evil as it was formulated by atheists during the mid-twentieth-century.
If there is any blame that needs to go around, it may be that some of it should go to Mackie and other atheologians for claiming that the problem of evil was a problem of inconsistency. The ease with which Plantinga undermined that formulation of the problem suggests that the logical formulation did not adequately capture the difficult and perplexing issue concerning God and evil that has been so hotly debated by philosophers and theologians. In fact, this is precisely the message that many philosophers took away from the debate between Plantinga and the defenders of the logical problem of evil. They reasoned that there must be more to the problem of evil than what is captured in the logical formulation of the problem. It is now widely agreed that this intuition is correct. Current discussions of the problem focus on what is called “the probabilistic problem of evil” or “the evidential problem of evil.” According to this formulation of the problem, the evil and suffering (or, in some cases, the amounts, kinds and distributions of evil and suffering) that we find in the world count as evidence against the existence of God (or make it improbable that God exists). Responding to this formulation of the problem requires much more than simply describing a logically possible scenario in which God and evil co-exist.
Plantinga’s Free Will Defense has been the most famous theistic response to the logical problem of evil because he did more to clarify the issues surrounding the logical problem than anyone else. It has not, however, been the only such response. Other solutions to the problem include John Hick’s (1977) soul-making theodicy. Hick rejects the traditional view of the Fall, which pictures humans as being created in a finitely perfect and finished state from which they disastrously fell away. Instead, Hick claims that human beings are unfinished and in the midst of being made all that God intended them to be. The long evolutionary process made humans into a distinguishable species capable of reasoning and responsibility, but they must now (as individuals) go through a second process of “spiritualization” or “soul-making,” during which they become “children of God.” According to Hick, the suffering and travails of this life are part of the divine plan of soul-making. A world full of suffering, trials and temptations is more conducive to the process of soul-making than a world full of constant pleasure and the complete absence of pain. Hick (1977, pp. 255-256) writes,
The value-judgment that is implicitly being invoked here is that one who has attained to goodness by meeting and eventually mastering temptations, and thus by rightly making responsible choices in concrete situations, is good in a richer and more valuable sense than would be one created ab initio in a state either of innocence or of virtue…. I suggest, then, that it is an ethically reasonable judgment… that human goodness slowly built up through personal histories of moral effort has a value in the eyes of the Creator which justifies even the long travail of the soul-making process.
Unlike Plantinga’s response to the logical problem of evil, which is merely a “defense” (that is, a negative attempt to undermine a certain atheological argument without offering a positive account of why God allows evil and suffering), Hick’s response is a “theodicy” (that is, a more comprehensive attempt to account for why God is justified in allowing evil and suffering).
Eleonore Stump (1985) offers another response to the problem of evil that brings a range of distinctively Christian theological commitments to bear on the issue. She claims that a world full of evil and suffering is “conducive to bringing about both the initial human [receipt of God's gift of salvation] and also the subsequent process of sanctification” (Stump 1985, p. 409). She writes,
Natural evil—the pain of disease, the intermittent and unpredictable destruction of natural disasters, the decay of old age, the imminence of death—takes away a person’s satisfaction with himself. It tends to humble him, show him his frailty, make him reflect on the transience of temporal goods, and turn his affections towards other-worldly things, away from the things of this world. No amount of moral or natural evil, of course, can guarantee that a man will [place his faith in God]…. But evil of this sort is the best hope, I think, and maybe the only effective means, for bringing men to such a state. (Stump 1985, p. 409)
Stump claims that, although the sin of Adam—and not any act of God—first brought moral and natural evil into this world, God providentially uses both kinds of evil in order to bring about the greatest good that a fallen, sinful human being can experience: a repaired will and eternal union with God.
The responses of both Hick and Stump are intended to cover not only the logical problem of evil but also any other formulation of the problem as well. Thus, some of those dissatisfied with Plantinga’s merely defensive response to the problem of evil may find these more constructive, alternative responses more attractive. Regardless of the details of these alternatives, the fact remains that all they need to do in order to rebut the logical problem of evil is to describe a logically possible way that God and evil can co-exist. A variety of morally sufficient reasons can be proposed as possible explanations of why a perfect God might allow evil and suffering to exist. Because the suggestions of Hick and Stump are clearly logically possible, they, too, succeed in undermining the logical problem of evil.
A. Even though it is widely agreed that Plantinga’s Free Will Defense describes a state of affairs that is logically possible, some of the details of his defense seem to conflict with important theistic doctrines. One point of conflict concerns the possibility of human free will in heaven. Plantinga claims that if someone is incapable of doing evil, that person cannot have morally significant free will. He also maintains that part of what makes us the creatures we are is that we possess morally significant freedom. If that freedom were to be taken away, we might very well cease to be the creatures we are. However, consider the sort of freedom enjoyed by the redeemed in heaven. According to classical theism, believers in heaven will somehow be changed so that they will no longer commit any sins. It is not that they will contingently always do what is right and contingently always avoid what is wrong. They will somehow no longer be capable of doing wrong. In other words, their good behavior will be necessary rather than contingent.
This orthodox view of heaven poses the following significant challenges to Plantinga’s view:
(i) If heavenly dwellers do not possess morally significant free will and yet their existence is something of tremendous value, it is not clear that God was justified in creating persons here on Earth with the capacity for rape, murder, torture, sexual molestation, and nuclear war. It seems that God could have actualized whatever greater goods are made possible by the existence of persons without allowing horrible instances of evil and suffering to exist in this world.
(ii) If possessing morally significant free will is essential to human nature, it is not clear how the redeemed can lose their morally significant freedom when they get to heaven and still be the same people they were before.
(iii) If despite initial appearances heavenly dwellers do possess morally significant free will, then it seems that it is not impossible for God to create genuinely free creatures who always (of necessity) do what is right.
In other words, it appears that W3 isn’t impossible after all. If W3 is possible, an important plank in Plantinga’s Free Will Defense is removed. None of these challenges undermines the basic point established above that Plantinga’s Free Will Defense successfully rebuts the logical problem of evil. However, they reveal that some of the central claims of his defense conflict with other important theistic doctrines. Although Plantinga claimed that his Free Will Defense offered merely possible and not necessarily actual reasons God might have for allowing evil and suffering, it may be difficult for other theists to embrace his defense if it runs contrary to what theism says is actually the case in heaven.
B. Another problem facing Plantinga’s Free Will Defense concerns the question of God’s free will. God, it seems, is incapable of doing anything wrong. Thus, it does not appear that, with respect to any choice of morally good and morally bad options, God is free to choose a bad option. He seems constitutionally incapable of choosing (or even wanting) to do what is wrong. According to Plantinga’s description of morally significant free will, it does not seem that God would be significantly free. Plantinga suggests that morally significant freedom is necessary in order for one’s actions to be assessed as being morally good or bad. But then it seems that God’s actions could not carry any moral significance. They could never be praiseworthy. That certainly runs contrary to central doctrines of theism.
If, as theists must surely maintain, God does possess morally significant freedom, then perhaps this sort of freedom does not preclude an inability to choose what is wrong. But if it is possible for God to possess morally significant freedom and for him to be unable to do wrong, then W3 once again appears to be possible after all. Originally, Plantinga claimed that W3 is not a logically possible world because the description of that world is logically inconsistent. If W3 is possible, then the complaint lodged by Flew and Mackie above that God could (and therefore should) have created a world full of creatures who always did what is right is not answered.
There may be ways for Plantinga to resolve the difficulties sketched above, so that the Free Will Defense can be shown to be compatible with theistic doctrines about heaven and divine freedom. As it stands, however, some important challenges to the Free Will Defense remain unanswered. It is also important to note that, simply because Plantinga’s particular use of free will in fashioning a response to the problem of evil runs into certain difficulties, that does not mean that other theistic uses of free will in distinct kinds of defenses or theodicies would face the same difficulties.
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James R. Beebe
Email: beebe “at” yahoo “dot” com
University at Buffalo
Last updated: July 12, 2005 | Originally published: August/17/2003
Categories: Philosophy of Religion