Feminist-Pragmatism is a philosophical tradition, which draws upon the insights of both feminist and pragmatist theory and practice. It is fundamentally concerned with enlarging philosophical thought through activism and lived experience, and assumes feminist and pragmatist ideas to be mutually beneficial for liberatory causes. Feminist-pragmatism emphasises the need to redress false distinctions, or dualisms, as these usually result in a denigration of one oppositional by another. Thus, feminist-pragmatists critique such bifurcations as thought/action, mind/body, universal/particular, and they show how the skewed favouring of one over the other results in philosophical theories which are incapable of explaining our gendered existences, positions in society, understandings of knowledge, or learning experiences. Feminist-pragmatists contribute to current debates in epistemology, social and political philosophy, philosophy of education, ethics, and metaphysics. Their work reflects the theoretical advances made by feminist theorists especially over the course of the latter part of the twentieth century, while being rooted in the principles and criticisms of the classical pragmatists.
Importantly, contemporary feminist-pragmatists have highlighted the fact that women, indeed feminist women, played a central role in the development of classical pragmatism itself, either by influencing the work of male pragmatist philosophers, or by constituting formidable thinkers in their own right. This means, then, that feminist-pragmatism can be traced to the origins of pragmatism itself, which developed primarily in North America from about the mid-nineteenth century to the mid-twentieth century, coinciding with the Progressive Era of 1890–1920.
This article will begin by presenting early feminist-pragmatism in section one, and will then move on to discuss contemporary feminist-pragmatism in section two. Throughout, the philosophical tradition under discussion will be referred to as feminist-pragmatism, although some theorists refer to it as pragmatist-feminism, or indeed, use both terms interchangeably. Present terminology does not imply a favouring of feminism over pragmatism, but simply indicates a tradition of joint feminist and pragmatist philosophising.
Table of Contents
- Early Feminist-Pragmatism
- Contemporary Feminist-Pragmatism
- References and Further Reading
In the 21st century pragmatism has experienced something of a renaissance, with contemporary philosophers returning to the works of the classical pragmatists, by re-appropriating their insights and methods for current philosophical problems. Among such neo-pragmatists is a growing number of feminist thinkers and activists who seek to particularly utilise pragmatism’s theories and concepts to ameliorate problems originating in oppressive systems structured by gender, race, class, and other markers of difference. As this article will demonstrate, there are several aspects of pragmatist philosophy which appear to overlap with the priorities of feminists, making pragmatism an attractive and valuable resource for a joint feminist-pragmatist approach.
While feminists have therefore found a useful ‘ally’ (Siegfried 1993a, 2) in pragmatism as a means of thinking about selves and the worlds they inhabit, this feminist reengagement with pragmatism has also uncovered hitherto unknown or neglected historical thinkers from the classical period. More often than not, historiographies of pragmatism identify the classical pragmatists as Charles Sanders Peirce, William James, John Dewey, and sometimes to a lesser extent George Herbert Mead, George Santayana, or Josiah Royce (for more on these topics, see Pragmatism). However, feminists have shown that historical accounts, which are limited to only these figures, omit the contributions made by women to the development of pragmatism, and fail to recognise the important role women pragmatists play as classical pragmatists.
For instance, Alice Chipman Dewey, John Dewey’s wife, had a significant impact upon the latter’s thought, indeed, she ran the experimental Lab School at the University of Chicago, where Dewey’s educational theories were given real-life application (see John Dewey). Moreover, Alice’s feminism and religious unorthodoxy formed an important influence in the trajectory Dewey’s idealism and theism took, and it is now generally acknowledged that Dewey’s concern with the social problems of his day can be attributed to Alice (West, 78–79). Dewey and Alice met at the University of Michigan, where women had only recently been allowed to undertake studies, and where Dewey was employed as a young philosophy instructor. They married in 1886, and throughout her lifetime, Alice continued to affect Dewey’s beliefs, being particularly concerned with women’s rights, while going on to expand her knowledge and practice in the field of education – a field she had entered as a teacher before beginning college. Describing her mother as a woman with a “brilliant mind…a sensitive nature combined with indomitable courage and energy,” Jane Dewey held Alice largely responsible for Dewey’s “early widening of…philosophic interests from the commentative and classical to the field of contemporary life” (Dewey 1987, 21). Given that Dewey understood philosophy as a means to redressing the problems of his time, and given that Alice awakened a sort of social consciousness in Dewey, it is obvious what a pivotal role she played in Dewey’s thought, and, in turn, in the development of pragmatism more generally.
While several women influenced pragmatism in such a manner, there are examples of women thinkers from this early period who could legitimately be classed alongside the traditionally acknowledged pragmatists. Thus, recent efforts to recover women pragmatist work have resulted in the identification of Jane Addams as a philosopher and social reformer, whose name should be listed in conjunction with Peirce, James and Dewey in the historical annals of pragmatism. Like Alice Chipman Dewey, Addams had a profound effect on Dewey, however, she was also a prolific writer and activist, who sought to bring about the real-life changes she theorised. Many other pragmatists at the time were connected to Addams, particularly through her activist headquarters and home, Hull House. Addams set up Hull House as a hub for local activities and community organising, as she shared her life with the diverse immigrant groups of one of Chicago’s poorest areas. Hull House soon became a centre for people wishing to contribute to Addams’s vision, and several women emerged from this environment having already effected substantial changes in such diverse areas as education, industrial relations, and architecture, and subsequently going on to establish successful careers, often as the first leading women in their respective chosen fields.
Charlotte Perkins Gilman, for example, stayed in Hull House for a month, and was a prominent social reformer, drawing particular attention to women’s domestic role and the politics of urban planning. Gilman argued that the division of labour disadvantaged and trapped women in the domestic sphere, and she maintained that household work should be professionalised. As such, Gilman has been understood as occupying a place in the history of material feminism, however, she has also been shown to rightfully “belon[g] in pragmatism’s pantheon” (Upin, 56). Beyond Gilman’s obvious relationship with Jane Addams and Hull House, Jane Upin also outlines her possibly personal, but certainly intellectual, connection to John Dewey. In fact, Gilman is said to expand upon the latter’s pragmatist insights by extending the basic principle of ‘environmentalism’ (that is, the notion that human nature can be altered by one’s environment), by theorising women’s confinement in the domestic realm, and the effect this has on women as human beings (Upin, 48–54). Sharing Dewey’s and Addams’s regard for Darwinism, and their opposition to a deterministic reading thereof, Gilman joins her pragmatist contemporaries by coupling Darwinism with a belief in the capacity for human beings to bring about change. Like Addams, she takes such change to be especially pertinent for women, and she is therefore a prime example of an early feminist-pragmatist.
While Hull House formed a focal point for pragmatist activism and intellectualism, the universities at which pragmatists taught fulfilled a similar role. For example, Ella Flagg Young studied with John Dewey at the University of Chicago and earned her doctoral degree on “Isolation in the School” before taking up the post of supervisor of the Lab School. Young was a mature student, having already had a successful career as an educator, and Dewey drew upon her vast experience in developing and applying pragmatist concepts and ideas of education. Both Dewey and Young influenced each other, though, and Dewey actually maintained that Young often underestimated her own pragmatist work, which he described as a “concrete empirical pragmatism with reference to philosophical conceptions before the doctrine was ever formulated in print” (quoted in Seigfried 1996, 81). Following Dewey’s departure from the University of Chicago, Young went on to become the first woman superintendent of Chicago’s public schools, and was also the first woman president of the National Educational Association.
Upon leaving Chicago, Dewey taught Elsie Ripley Clapp at Columbia University, who acted simultaneously as his graduate assistant. This was a long and fruitful collaboration, with Clapp not only helping Dewey to structure and develop courses, but also contributing to research, particularly on education. Dewey appears to have gained insights from her, which he acknowledges in private correspondence, or rather obtusely in his published work. For example, Charlene Haddock Siegfried points out that Dewey states his indebtedness to her (and to other women influences) not in the main text of his works, but rather in the preface (or in footnotes, as the case may be), leaving Clapp’s precise input obscure, and obfuscating the exact nature and scale thereof. And yet, her role is a significant one, as Dewey describes in a letter his indebtedness in profuse terms, noting that “such a generous exploitation of your ideas as is likely to result if and when I publish the outcome, seems to go beyond the limit” (Seigfried 1996, 50). Indeed, Dewey supported Clapp as his successor when he retired, although his enthusiasm was not met by the administration of Teachers College, as she was bypassed for the post. Clapp subsequently ran two experimental rural schools in Jefferson County, Kentucky, and in Arthurdale, West Virginia, the latter being a project conceived by Eleanor Roosevelt. She wrote books on education, incorporating pragmatist ideas developed during her time with Dewey, and acted as editor for Progressive Education. Sadly, her work, and influence on Dewey’s work, became neglected, with accounts of the latter’s academic life omitting Clapp altogether, hence the importance of recovering such historically overlooked figures (Seigfried 1996, 47–52).
Lucy Sprague Mitchell, another student of the pragmatists, was influenced not only by Dewey (with whom she developed a life-long intellectual relationship through her parents, and whose classes she went to at Teachers College in 1913), but she also benefited from being exposed to the Harvard pragmatists, including William James, Josiah Royce, George Herbert Palmer, Hugo Münsterberg, and George Santayana. She became the first dean for women at the University of California at Berkeley, while also taking on a faculty position in English. Mitchell sometimes looked after a friend’s child, Polly, whom she studied intensely, and her enthusiasm for seeing Polly develop, issued in a career change toward childhood education. Polly died when she was only four years old, yet undoubtedly she had a profound effect on Mitchell, who took her cue for pragmatist educational theory from the real-life experiences gained with Polly. Thus, although Mitchell had attended several philosophy classes, she had no interest in becoming a philosopher, finding the (male) philosophers she knew eccentric or aloof. In Alice Freeman Palmer, wife of Herbert Palmer, though, she found a role model, and since Alice had been president of Wellesley in an age where women’s education was still a controversial topic, Mitchell followed in her footsteps, as it were, by opting for an administrative career at Berkeley. The pervasive sexism she encountered there, and her growing belief in “public education [as] the most constructive attack on social problems” (Seigfried 1996, 55), when coupled with her emphasis on experience, resulted in the focus on education in the latter part of her life. Notably, Mitchell’s pragmatist educational theory and practice took hold in the Bank Street School (Seigfried 1996, 52 – 57).
A student of George Herbert Mead, Jessie Taft, is another forgotten pragmatist figure recently ‘unearthed’ by contemporary scholars engaged in recovering women pragmatist work. Taft completed, in 1913, her doctoral thesis, which formed possibly “the first Ph.D. dissertation in philosophy on the women’s movement” (Seigfried 1993b, 215). Entitled “The Woman Movement from the Point of View of Social Consciousness,” it is remarkably contemporary in tone, and appears to anticipate several important issues and conceptual ideas debated by feminist theorists today. Taft argues that women are hampered in both the domestic and public spheres, having control over neither, ultimately resulting in a disconnected and under-developed self with limited social awareness. Drawing parallels with the labour movement, she thus explains the task of the women’s movement as a twofold venture, consisting first of the need to “make women conscious of their relations to a social order, second, to show society its need of conscious womanhood” (Taft 225). She notes that the situation of women is not only inhibitive for women’s selfhood, but also for men’s, and for the “growth,” as Dewey would term it, of society more generally. Writes Taft:
This stage of social development [wherein we shall have conditions favourable for the control of social problems] can never be reached as long as any large class of people, such as its women, are permitted, encouraged, or forced to exist in an unreal world wilfully maintained for that purpose. Nor will the selves of men, in so far as they are formed by their relations to women, ever reach the full possibilities of selfhood while women remain only partially self-conscious. (Taft 229)
Taft extends Mead’s theory of selfhood, and couples it with a tripartite categorisation of consciousness, rejecting individualism in favour of a social reading of selfhood in the context of feminists’ attempts to institute suffrage. Sadly, Taft’s own life story appears to be a stark reminder of the rather slow progress made by the movement she theorised, as it took over two decades for her to find a full-time post after completing her doctorate (Seigfried 1993b, 215 – 218).
Discriminatory and sexist treatment like this undoubtedly impacted upon the lives and work of many of the early women pragmatists. Universities were often loath to recognise women on a par with men, either as students or as faculty members. Several women students of pragmatists, though, found in their teachers male philosophers supportive of women’s education, who repeated their courses at attached women’s colleges (Radcliffe in the case of Harvard), or who committed themselves to coeducation. Unfortunately, such progressiveness was not always matched by the university hierarchy, and women scholars struggled to gain the legitimate and deserved recognition for their work. For instance, Mary Whiton Calkins completed with distinction her Ph.D. in 1895 under the supervision of Hugo Münsterberg. However, she never received her doctorate from Harvard, despite undertaking studies there. She was asked, instead, to take the degree from Radcliffe, but as Seigfried explains, since Radcliffe only provided undergraduate courses, acceptance of such an intermediary would have legitimised Harvard’s continued discriminatory treatment of women. Calkins went on to become a professor at Wellesley, and was the first woman president of both the American Psychological Association and the American Philosophical Association (Seigfried 1993c, 230 – 231).
Given the off-putting nature of such overt sexism, it is not surprising to find that several women pragmatists either left universities, or had only a limited direct involvement with them. Seigfried, for instance, cites Lucy Sprague Mitchell’s letter, in which she details her reaction to encountering misogyny at Berkeley. Mitchell states that she was shocked upon realising “that most of the faculty thought of women frankly as inferior beings” (Seigfried 1996, 54). While many women scholars tried to remain within the university system, one can understand how such a pervasive sexism may pose a deterrent to a continued career in academia. On the other hand, several women pragmatists felt confined not only by the hostility of university administrations and faculty members, but by the largely theoretical nature of academic work. Since pragmatism emphasises experience as a counter-weight to theory, and insists upon the mutually reinforcing and informing nature of experience and theory, many women pragmatists found the university setting constricting.
Thus, Mitchell notes of Jane Addams, that she became for her “a symbol of the ‘real’ world – a world of work and of people that I longed to reach but could not” (Seigfried 1996, 56). The “real world” referred to by Mitchell, although promoted through initiatives such as the Lab School, remained, to too large an extent, inaccessible for pragmatists such as Mitchell, and they therefore sought actual experience outside of the realm of academia. It is for this reason, also, that the most prominent woman pragmatist, Jane Addams, kept her focus on the “real world” outside of universities, despite giving lectures at the University of Chicago. The next section explores the life and thought of this influential pragmatist in greater detail, as her work and impact merits further elucidation, if women’s role in the development of pragmatism is to be fully understood. It is important though, to note in sum, that pragmatism is not confined to universities, but is very much a philosophy inspired by and concerned with “the real world,” whether this is found in academia or outside of it.
Jane Addams epitomises this quest, typical of many women pragmatists, for a life in the “real world” wherein pragmatist insights can be gained and fed into theory production. Thus, Addams’s writings are replete with quotidian experiences and scenes taken from Hull House. Many of her essays and books concentrate on the personal lives of immigrant neighbours she came to know through her settlement activities, and her diverse intellectual influences lead to a polyvocality rarely seen in more traditional philosophical writing. The voices of her neighbours, novelists, poets, Greek dramatists, and philosophers, mingle in her texts, problematising lived experiences and drawing important theoretical insights therefrom.
The topics she discusses are far from typical Victorian era academic fare. Prostitution, juvenile delinquency, world peace, folk tales, and democracy are just some of the themes covered in her extensive philosophical output. Perhaps because Addams’s writing is unconventional in content and style, has she been dismissed as a mere practitioner. She is often erroneously viewed as an implementer of the male pragmatists’ ideas, and her philosophical insights are denigrated while she is labelled a social worker rather than a philosopher. Although Addams was simultaneously a social worker, sociologist, political activist, labour mediator, and educator, importantly, she was also a formidable pragmatist thinker. Her multiple roles informed a unique body of work so intimately linked to experience that it is perhaps most quintessentially pragmatist, in that there really is no separation between theory and practice in her work.
The recovery work undertaken by contemporary scholars acknowledges this, and has sought to re-establish Addams as a classical pragmatist who captures the progressive era’s spirit in her very being, by living the principles pragmatism espouses. For although Addams was somewhat of a celebrity in her time, just like many other women pragmatists, she was left out of the philosophical canon, being remembered, instead, as a pacifist or suffragist. Renewed interest in Addams, though, has led to a re-examination of her work, and her impact upon the development of pragmatism is now increasingly recognised. For instance, Dewey and Addams had an intimate intellectual relationship, with Dewey becoming a trustee of Hull House, and visiting there frequently to deliver lectures to the Plato Club, Hull House’s philosophical society. Dewey acknowledged his philosophical indebtedness to Addams, and both thinkers influenced each other mutually, developing pragmatist ideas and theories in tandem. Addams’s close links with the University of Chicago meant that a cross-pollination of ideas between faculty members and Hull House residents was inevitable. Further, owing to the fame she achieved in her lifetime, she was in close correspondence with many influential thinkers, writers, activists, and policy makers beyond the realms of academia and the Chicago settlement.
Addams was a sought-after public speaker, and although she had a steadfast belief in the principles she developed in her work, she never spoke on behalf of those whose interests she defended, but chose to speak with them by engaging in an inclusionary approach to transformation. This, perhaps, most aptly characterises Addams’s conception of the settlement, as she rejected the negative stereotyping of people found in supposedly benevolent charity work, and instead opted for understanding and supporting her neighbours through what we would today call a ‘bottom-up’ approach to activism. Hence, Addams understands the settlement as:
an experimental effort to aid in the solution of the social and industrial problems which are engendered by the modern conditions of life in a great city…It is an attempt to relieve, at the same time, the overaccumulation at one end of society and the destitution at the other; but it assumes that this overaccumulation and destitution is most sorely felt in the things that pertain to social and educational advantages. (Addams 2008, 83)
While Hull House counteracted such ‘overaccumulation at one end of society’ through various initiatives – establishing educational courses, art classes, child care and sports facilities, or rallying against corruption in politics and providing space for labour organising – Addams remained non-committed in ideological terms.
She rejected divisiveness and although she supported several causes, she avoided adopting specific labels. In her autobiographical book Twenty Years at Hull House, she wrote of the settlement, that “from its very nature it can stand for no political or social propaganda. It must, in a sense, give the warm welcome of an inn to all such propaganda, if perchance one of them be found an angel” (Addams 2008, 83). This non-ideological attitude was often criticised by commentators, as was, ironically, the one ideology she did assume, that is, pacifism. Addams was an outspoken opponent of war, and campaigned against the U.S.’s entry into World War I. For this, she was vilified and her work was frequently maligned. In later years, though, her activism for peace, which included the co-founding of the Women’s International League for Peace and Freedom (WILPF), was recognised, and she was awarded the 1931 Nobel Peace Prize.
Throughout Addams’s varied career, during which she gradually moved from settlement work to more global activism, she developed a pragmatism, which was intimately concerned with instituting progress, particularly for the politically, socially and economically marginalised. Since women made up a large part of this constituency, her work represents a formidable example of early feminist-pragmatism. Addams explicitly addressed the concerns of women, which were largely neglected by the male pragmatists, and her texts provide invaluable insights informed by the gendered nature of our experiences. Her attribution of moral import to pluralism in democracy (Addams 2002a), her cosmopolitanism (Addams 2002b), her meliorism (Addams 2005), her quest for knowledge through ‘perplexities’ (Addams 2002a), her understanding of memory in terms of its transformative potential of past and future (Addams 2002c), and her interpretation of art and beauty as relief from the dreariness of industrial life (Addams 2008), form just some of the significant theoretical contributions to a pragmatist philosophy, which was both lived and intellectually conceived. As such, Addams constitutes a towering figure in the history of feminist-pragmatism and of classical pragmatism more generally.
Owing largely to Charlene Haddock Seigfried’s seminal work Pragmatism and Feminism, contemporary feminist-pragmatists have managed to unearth hitherto unknown early pragmatist work undertaken by women. Some of these women were not necessarily feminists, nor were they necessarily primarily concerned with theorising the experiences of women. However, their influences have shaped the development of pragmatism itself, and the work of expressly feminist-pragmatists constitutes a particularly rich resource for contemporary feminist-pragmatist theorists. Thus, the writings of early women pragmatists are being utilised by theorists today, and increased interest in their work has resulted not only in several updated biographies and a reissuing of their texts, but also in new, original books and articles engaging with their arguments and theories (see for example, Hamington, 2010 and Fischer 2009).
Importantly, some of the themes contemporary thinkers are concerned with, are also topics previously explored by their feminist-pragmatist forerunners. For instance, Judy D. Whipps (2006) draws upon the work of Emily Greene Balch to trace the thematic continuity between Balch’s priorities and the priorities of contemporary feminist peace activists. Balch was a pragmatist thinker, economist, and social scientist. Like Addams, she was a co-founder of the Women’s International League for Peace and Freedom (WILPF), and was awarded the Nobel Peace Prize fifteen years after Addams had received that same honour. Balch’s activism similarly grew out of her engagement with the settlement movement, although being involved with the foundation of Denison House in 1982, she re-entered academia after two years to continue her studies both in the United States and in Europe. Together with Addams and Alice Hamilton she wrote Women at The Hague (Addams et al.2003), an account of the 1915 International Congress of Women.
Although employed by Wellesley as a professor, her peace activism hampered her academic career, and she subsequently focused solely on advocating for peace. She championed anti-colonialism, being largely responsible for a critical report on United States de facto control over Haiti (1927), criticised unjust trade relations between more or less powerful states, and sought U.N. control of all military bases. Her theoretical work enshrined a cosmopolitanism and pluralism reminiscent of Addams’s ‘bottom-up’ conceptualisation of meliorism. She held that shared work could facilitate shared understanding, arguing that “cooperation in practical, technical tasks is one of the best ways of learning the indispensable art of getting along with one another” (Whipps 126). Importantly, Balch is a predecessor to contemporary women peace activists, who can learn from her pragmatist understandings of international affairs in terms of cooperation and the desire to realise progressive change (Whipps 123 – 130).
Several early women pragmatists seem to anticipate contemporary feminist debates, and formulate concepts, which are part and parcel of today’s theoretical vocabulary. Thus, in “Follett’s Pragmatist Ontology of Relations: Potentials for a Feminist Perspective on Violence,” Amrita Banerjee (2008) makes use of Mary Parker Follett’s work to shed light on the ontological implications of gendered violence. Follett became a leading management consultant in her time, however, she also developed pragmatist theories on politics in works such as The New State (1998). Follett distinguished between ‘power-over’ and ‘power-with’, arguing that “whereas power usually means power-over…it is possible to develop the conception of power-with, a jointly developed power, a co-active, not a coercive power” (Banerjee 4). While Banerjee employs this reconceptualisation of power in terms of ‘power-over’ and ‘power-with’ in an analysis of gender based violence, it is easy to see how this hybrid understanding of power has become engrained in our contemporary minds, and has been utilised by feminist theorists, peace activists, and others, to advance a more sophisticated comprehension of a variety of political issues.
In this sense, then, early women pragmatists, even when not explicitly feminist, can be engaged by current feminist thinkers in feminist causes and can contribute to critical feminist-pragmatist reflections on problems facing women and men in today’s world. Also, the thematic continuity between early and later women pragmatists – whether they wrote on democracy, international governance, peace, education, community activism, gender roles, or employment – indicates the abundance of theoretical material which can be fruitfully mined by contemporary theorists. Thus, the writings of Addams, Balch, Follett, Gilman, Mitchell, Young, Clapp and Taft constitute a rich legacy for the feminist-pragmatists of today.
Beyond the conduciveness of early women pragmatist work to contemporary feminist projects, theorists and activists of today also draw upon the work of the male pragmatists. This is because pragmatism, in general, is a tradition which rejects many of the philosophical claims feminists reject, and promotes many of the objectives feminists promote. Due to the extensive proliferation of feminist theory, particularly over the latter part of the twentieth century and into the present, feminists are in a position to bring sophisticated philosophical insights and concepts to bear upon early pragmatist thought. Indeed, many feminist theoretical analyses, which may have developed in isolation from pragmatism, nonetheless find resonance in pragmatist theory and practice. For example, there is a large body of work, in feminist philosophy, on embodiment. Feminists have argued that physicality is often denigrated in our societies, and is theorised as being subservient or inferior to intellect. Pragmatists, such as John Dewey, have rejected this demarcation of body and mind, and oppose the devaluing of the former in favour of the latter. Contemporary feminist-pragmatists, like Shannon Sullivan (2001), have therefore been able to use pragmatist and feminist work to advance feminist-pragmatist theories of embodiment.
Dewey calls such false axiological bifurcations as mind/body dualisms, and he identifies several of these in the history of philosophical thought. Self/environment, change/stasis, universal/particular, thought/practice─all of these are distinctions, which erroneously create oppositionals, with one oppositional being valued at the expense of the other. Feminists have similarly found such dualisms in philosophical theories, and have shown that they hold distinctly gendered implications. Thus, connections have been made between the philosophical denigration of the body in favour of the mind, and the devaluation of women’s bodies in particular (owing to the common identification of womanhood in bodily terms). Feminists can therefore use pragmatist understandings of dualisms to counter the traditional juxtaposition of body and mind, and in conjunction with feminist theoretical insights, can argue against the subjugation of gendered bodies in particular.
Another dualism prevalent in much philosophical thought, is reason/emotion. As several feminist-pragmatists have pointed out, both pragmatists and feminists reject this dualism and recognise the importance of feeling and the affective in our daily interactions with people, while accepting the political potential this may also hold for our societies. Indeed, the feminist re-valuing of the affective has issued in a branch of feminist moral philosophy called care ethics. Charles Sanders Peirce’s work recognises the emotional or felt dimension of thought (Peirce 1934-1963), while William James emphasises the centrality of care and sympathy particularly in women’s lives (James 1983, see also Seigfried 1996). Pragmatist philosophy and care ethics can be mutually conducive bodies of work, allowing feminist-pragmatists to reconceptualise the relationship between reason and emotion, and redressing the skewed favouring of one over the other. Several feminist-pragmatists have done precisely that, by theorising the affective in the context of care ethics and pragmatist thought (see Leffers, 1993; Pappas, 1993; and Seigfried, 1989).
Many feminists, including care ethicists, critique a dominant view of selfhood, which assumes us to be isolated, self-sufficient beings. This abstract individualism attendant in much philosophical theorising is also, however, undermined by pragmatist thinkers. George Herbert Meade, for instance, problematises the development of selves in community with other human beings, and explicitly discusses what is later to become a central theme in feminist theory, that is, self as it exists in relation to the other (1934). Pragmatists reject a clear opposition between self and society, and argue instead that true selfhood can only take place through community. Hence, for pragmatists and feminists, the self needs to be understood with regard to its relationality. This conception of the self and its interdependent existence with others is important both for ontology, and for moral and political philosophy, as our dependency, our sociality, and our power to transform each other hold important implications for debates on gender and liberalism, communitarianism, and libertarianism, amongst others. Thus, theorists such as Judy Whipps (2004) have developed feminist-pragmatist models for comprehending selves in the context of their shared existences with others.
Feminists and pragmatists also oppose the practice/thought dualism alongside the closely related experience/theory dualism. As noted earlier, for many women pragmatists of the classical period, the university setting stifled any real, sustained engagement with experience. This is why they often practiced pragmatism outside of academia, where experience could be focused on more intensively, thereby allowing the reciprocal relationship between theory and practice to really take hold. Today, as well, pragmatism exists outside of the academic world, and this is perhaps why it is such an attractive philosophy for feminists, as feminism also usually entails activism outside of the academy. The intimate relationship between practice and thought is also significant in terms of education, and the early pragmatists, such as Dewey and Addams, developed educational theories which captured the symbiotic nature of doing and thinking (Dewey, 2008 and Addams 2008). These insights are still relevant today, and have epistemological import, especially when coupled with the pragmatist prioritising of pluralism.
For pragmatists, diversity leads to vibrant democracies, however, it also enriches knowledge. Given that women’s knowledge is often dismissed, feminism is fundamentally akin to pragmatism in this respect, as it promotes inclusionary epistemologies, which stem directly from our gendered life experiences. Feminists seek the legitimisation of women’s knowledge through epistemological models, such as standpoint theory, which recognise women’s unique experiences knowable only to them. Pragmatists also reject a bird’s eye view of the world, wherein objective knowledge can be achieved by appealing to singular accounts of the Truth, but instead propose that there are multiple truths. Dewey, for example, views truth as a working hypothesis, which we’ve come, for the time being, to agree upon, but which needs to be continuously reviewed (Dewey, 1986). Pragmatism thus anticipates the post-modern critique of totalising narratives of truth, without falling into an inescapable relativism. Feminism, which has had to come to terms with its own exclusions – in terms of omitting the experiences and attendant truths of women of colour, for example – can utilise pragmatist epistemological insights to its advantage to promote pluralist and egalitarian epistemologies. Several contemporary feminists have proceeded in such a manner to devise feminist-pragmatist approaches to knowledge, building upon pragmatist explanations of , for example, the impetus for thought provided by Addams’s ‘perplexities’ or Peirce’s ‘irritation of doubt’ (see Rooney, 1993). Shannon Sullivan has also developed a feminist-pragmatist standpoint theory with which to overcome the “false dilemma of objectivism and relativism” (Sullivan 211).
The early pragmatists were ardent defenders of democracy, although they eschewed labels and the blind adoption of ideologies. This is due to pragmatism’s meliorism, but also to pragmatism’s view of the world and its inhabitants as constantly evolving. Hence, the dualism of change/stasis is undercut in pragmatist philosophy, as continuity and stability exist simultaneously with dynamism and change. Precisely because metaphysically everything is in the making, should we avoid rigidly clinging to certain structures, as these should not retain their current form. Thus, Dewey recognised that American society had changed immensely since democracy was instituted, and yet, the same out-dated ideas seemed to underpin democracy several hundred years later. For Dewey, this was hugely destructive to the values and aims democracy sought to promote, and he repeatedly criticised the abstract individualism and false universalism attendant in liberal theory, which were originally, perhaps, appropriate, but which hampered the further development of democracy into a more modern ethico-political system (Dewey, 1985). In her book The Task of Utopia, Erin McKenna appropriates Dewey’s adaptive ontology, and draws upon feminist utopian literature to advance a “process model of utopia” which counters the “end-state model of utopia” by positing utopia as always in the making (2001). Contemporary feminist-pragmatists have also developed and extended pragmatist theorising on democracy, and have built upon pragmatism’s espousal of pluralism and the political implications of the often problematic nature of selves in community with others (see Singer 1999, Greene 1999, and Sullivan 2006).
Finally, it should be noted that there has been feminist engagement with neo-pragmatist philosophers, particularly with Richard Rorty. However, this has sometimes been controversial, as Rorty’s philosophy has been criticised for undermining some of pragmatism’s core principles, including its social and political commitments (Brodsky, 1982). Contemporary feminist-pragmatists have thus critically evaluated Rorty and his post-linguistic turn interpretation of pragmatism, while Rorty, on the other hand, has explicitly problematised feminism’s relationship to deconstructionism and pragmatism (1993). Themes covered in this neo-pragmatist and feminist exchange include masculinist ideology, the rejection of language over experience (Kaufman-Osborn, 1993), and the functioning of power (Bickford, 1993).
Feminist-pragmatists of the 21st century benefit from the confluence of feminism and pragmatism, being able to draw upon both feminist and pragmatist theory and practice. Early feminist-pragmatist work, of course, already exhibits a convergence of feminist and pragmatist insights, hence the wealth of material available for ‘mining’ by contemporary feminist-pragmatists. Given that the recovery of women pragmatist work is still ongoing, it is likely that such feminist-pragmatist resources will continue to grow, as more and more women pragmatists are rescued from historical oblivion. In the meantime, though, pragmatists provide the inspiration for many feminist-pragmatists writing on themes dear to the hearts of their feminist-pragmatist predecessors, bringing contemporary feminist concepts and debates to bear upon pragmatist lessons from metaphysics, epistemology, political philosophy, ethics, and philosophy of education.
The philosophical kinship between pragmatism and feminism can also be attributed to both their liberatory aspirations. Early pragmatists, such as Addams, Dewey, and Balch, were part of progressive movements for equality for women and people of colour, for world peace, for increased access to quality education, and for an end to political corruption and economic greed. Contemporary feminist-pragmatists will likely continue pursuing some of these progressive goals, while also trying to achieve new goals arising from the present historical context.
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Last updated: June 19, 2012 | Originally published: June 19, 2012
Categories: Feminist Philosophy