Philosophy of Film: Continental Perspectives
This article introduces the most important perspectives on film (movies) from the continental philosophical perspective. “Continental” is not used as a geographical term, but as an abstract concept referring to nineteenth and twentieth century European philosophical traditions exemplified by German idealism, phenomenology, existentialism, hermeneutics, structuralism, post-structuralism, French feminism, and the Frankfurt School. The continental-friendly philosophy of film that has emerged in Anglophone countries since the 1980s also is taken into account in this article.
If one considers only contributions by well known philosophers, the philosophical output on film might appear relatively meager. Books that deal with the philosophy of film are equally rare. If, however, one considers the scholarly contributions from the entire field of humanities, specifically in the form of film aesthetics and film theory, the body of reflections on film inspired by philosophical ideas (in the most general sense) is impressive. Most of these works are linked to the European philosophical tradition of philosophy of film, which developed from the 1920s onward. Henri Bergson (1859-1941) was the first philosopher to show interest in film, though his influence on continental philosophy of film remained minor – though not inexistent – before the publication of Gilles Deleuze’s two volumes on cinema (1983 and 1985). In the 1980s, two French philosophers, Jean-Louis Schefer and Gilles Deleuze, decided to devote their attention to film studies. These studies began a continuous line of European philosophical works on film that stretched through to today’s writings by Jacques Rancière and Slavoj Žižek. In the English-speaking world, philosophical concepts entered the discourse on film at around the same time. Stanley Cavell’s work The World Viewed: Reflections on the Ontology of Film (1971) was a notable precursor of this tendency. In 1988, Noel Carroll published a critique of contemporary film theory (Mystifying Movies) which he criticized as being overly determined by Psycho-Semiotic Marxist paradigms. In the same year he published Philosophical Problems of Classical Film Theory that examined pre-semiotic theorists like Bazin and Arnheim in an analytical fashion.
Both representatives of the analytical and the continental tradition see thinkers that were active before the analytical-continental divide (for example, Münsterberg, Kracauer) as being central to their film studies; however, the interpretations of such thinkers differ considerably in both traditions.
A significant amount of continental work developed around the British journal Screen, which was very influential in the 1970s and has laid many of the foundations of Lacanian and neo-Marxist film theory.
Analytical philosophy of film has profited greatly from its rich tradition of analytical aesthetics. A significant part of this philosophy has attempted to push its studies in the direction of evidence-based scientific models. Continental thought has typically been inspired by the softer fields of humanities and has displayed a solid amount of political engagement. In the former Soviet Union, a complex discourse on the semiotics of film, inspired by a Russian formalist heritage that has a natural affinity with film, has made numerous philosophical statements.
Table of Contents
- What Is Philosophy Of Film?
- An Overview Of Theories
- Henri Bergson
- Hugo Münsterberg
- Formalist Approaches
- Cinematographic Ontology and Phenomenology
- Walter Benjamin and the Frankfurt School
- Hermeneutic Film Analysis
- Future Perspectives
- References and Further Reading
Many studies of film do not necessarily claim a specific philosophical heritage, but can be considered as philosophical inasmuch as their approaches are methodologically sophisticated and transgress empiricism. Though it is very difficult to establish positive standards for what is ‘’philosophical’’ and what is not, it can be concurred that an approach is “philosophical” as soon as it uses references to philosophers and some abstract concepts that are not merely technical. A degree of argumentation and claim-making supported by reasons, some sort of evidence, and analysis or interpretation, on the other hand, are not particular to philosophy but are followed by all (human) sciences.
Para-philosophical studies have also been conveniently labelled as ‘film theory’. Strictly speaking, film theory, which develops concepts like ‘narrativity’, ‘diegesis’, ‘genre’ or ‘authorship’ is not a unique philosophy, but is very often part of it. Although parts of film theory and philosophy of film do overlap in both traditions (and since Münsterberg and Arnheim many film theorists have maintained that what they do is also related to the philosophy of film), it is wrong to characterize every “theoretical” reflection on film as philosophical because film theory can also be limited to the analysis of mere technicalities or textual analysis. Here, film theory is not different from literary theory where reflections on authorship or analyses of narrative and genre occur most typically without necessarily receiving the label “philosophy” unless they are imbedded in more “philosophical” considerations. The contemporary Anglophone philosophy of film sees this perspective slightly differently since longstanding reflections on these subjects (by Cavell, Carroll, Bordwell, Gaut, and Branigan) are usually classified as philosophy.
While the degrees of “philosophicality” vary within different interpretations of films, it is safe to assume that any reflective study of the nature of film is philosophical. Whenever scholars attempt to spell out what film is (Is film an art? How is film different from other arts?), their discourse becomes necessarily philosophical. This reflective study is not limited to film, but is true for any academic field (it becomes most obvious in philosophy of science).
Philosophy of film cannot be seen only as a subfield of aesthetics or of the philosophy of art. Philosophy of film also should not be labeled as ‘film aesthetics’. Philosophy of film is able to approach a spectrum of questions so broad that its link with aesthetics can sometimes be maintained only by purely formal reasons. Bergson’s philosophy of film, which has attained a central position in contemporary philosophy of film, was not developed out of an aesthetic interest at all; but film would have served Bergson as merely an illustration for his general philosophical ideas. It is even possible to say that the philosophy of film, just because of its readiness to undertake paradoxical fusions that contrast aesthetics against fields other than aesthetics, develops a discourse that stands out in the entire body of philosophy. Treating, for example, psychoanalytical or cognitive problems as aesthetical phenomena bears an immense critical potential that does not exist to the same extent in other sub-disciplines of philosophy.
Film and Philosophy
Philos-sophia, the ancient Greek term for ‘’love of wisdom’’, can be understood as an immense attempt at interpreting or questioning human existence and the world in its entirety. Logically, film can be one of its subjects. When this is the case, the approach towards film usually exceeds the label of mere interpretation and places film in a relationship with classical philosophical questions such as (its own) essence, truth, or beauty.
Philos-sophia can see film as one of its subjects, but film can also be its object, that is, film can be a philosophy through which a thinker attempts to see the world In other words, film can establish its own stances about essence, truth, or beauty. Theoretically, this can be done with any art form: it is also possible to see painting, literature, or dance as philosophical activities. However, film has been found much more apt for such models because its integrative mode of time, space, images, and movement brings it much closer to thinking (as will be developed below).
The idea of “philosophy of film” is a little like Kant’s “Critique of Pure Reason” because it implies two ideas at the same time. Kant’s title can be understood as (1) “pure reason being criticized” and as (2) “pure reason doing the criticizing.” In the first case, pure reason is a passive object of research undergoing the scrutiny of critical thought while in the second case pure reason is actively imposing its standards on this critical thought. The same is true for the phrase “philosophy of film,” which can mean (1) that film is undergoing a philosophical examination and (2) that film itself helps to develop a certain type of philosophical thinking that will subsequently be imposed upon various subjects of research. Strictly speaking, any outline of the philosophy of film should be divided into two parts: (1) a philosophy about film and (2) film as an philosophy. The latter occupies a prominent place in many recent continental and Anglo-American discourses, and has been defended by Wartenberg (2006), Mulhall (2002), Frampton (2006), and Smuts (2009), and has been criticized by Russell (2000), Murray Smith (2006), Livingston (2009), and Davies (2009). However, in the practice of much of philosophy of film, both approaches often intermingle. Film as a philosophic experience or philosophy as a filmic experience often appear as two sides of the same coin.
Films are similar to dreams and much of what the philosophical tradition has said about the “reality of the outer world” and its skeptical evaluation can be demonstrated through reflections on film. Here film theory maintains a strong contact with philosophy. The distinction between appearance (that is, dream and poiesis) and reality has been on the agenda of film theory for almost eighty years. The “reality and dream” problem is not limited to the subjectivist approach that perceives film as a manifestation of fantasies and hallucinations. However “realists” like André Bazin have classified film as real, because film is able to capture an authentic reality independent of human subjectivity (see below). Comparisons of films and dreams can reveal new concepts of space and time because dreams seem to take place in an intermediary domain of abstractness and concreteness. Film is not, according to Amédée Ayfre, a thesis about the world; rather it presents the world. Any abstractly existential stance contained in this presentation makes film a philosophical phenomenon. Psychoanalysis represents another approach towards dreams and has a status within the philosophy of film which will be explained below.
Analytical philosophy of film has been unwilling to identify psychoanalytical elements and some sociological elements, in particular approaches of critical theory or ideology critique, as “philosophical” because it deems that this theory does not satisfy more scientific standards. While a continental film scholar like Christian Metz would find the results of the French school of filmology relevant for the most scientific forms of experimental psychology, analytical philosophy usually rejects continental models based on language. These models are usually derived from the Saussurean model of signification and are present in poetics, semiotics or Lacanian psychology. Instead analytical philosophy favors either cognition-based models or more “classical” questions related to problems such as the ontology of film, analyses of movement, realism, the nature of filmic representation, and explanations of our emotional engagement with fiction. Further, there is in analytical philosophy a strong desire to limit work on the philosophy of film from critical theory and cultural studies practiced in English departments. This problem never occurred in the more eclectic and naturally open field of continental philosophy of film.
Still, in many cases, the distinction between continental and analytical is not easy and does not always pass smoothly along the lines of a European and an American tradition. Although David Bordwell is a cognitive philosopher, initially he was inspired by Russian formalist terminology and was himself a subject of interest for European semioticians. Though he is one of the most scathing critics of the continental paradigm in film theory (together with Carroll he coined the term “SLAB theory” to refer to theories that use the ideas of Saussure, Lacan, Althusser, and Barthes) (Bordwell & Carroll 1996), his early work is “structuralist” or “Foucaultian” in spirit as it analyzes the rules governing the practice of institutional film criticism/theory.
French philosophy has played an outstanding role in the development of a philosophy of film. Henri Bergson was the first philosopher who adopted film as a conceptual model for philosophical thought. Cinema helped him to imagine the distinction between spatialized time and duration, an idea that would remain essential for his entire philosophy. Though Bergson’s ideas bear no relation with the more contemporary language-based models of reason (and his interpreter Gilles Deleuze never used them in that way), Bergson’s thought fused with the remaining field of French philosophy of cinema in an often paradoxical fashion. Though French philosophy of film is composed of diverse elements, French or even continental philosophy of film can appear as amazingly coherent. Deleuze’s Bergsonian concept of the “time-image,” for example, is very much compatible with ideas elaborated by the Russian director Andrei Tarkovsky who derived his insights not from Bergson, but from a critical evaluation of Russian formalist film theory.
In 1946, Gilbert Cohen Séat published the first monograph on the philosophy of film (Essai sur les principes d’une philosophie du film). Jean Epstein’s L’Intelligence d’une machine, a truly philosophical book on film, appeared in the same year. In 1948, the interdisciplinary Parisian École de Filmologie began approaching film from a sociological, psychological, and philosophical angle. Filmology can be considered as a precursor of the semiology of cinema.
In the 1960’s and 1970’s, many principal theoretical discussions (such as auteur theory and genre theory) were developed in the Parisian journal Les Cahiers du cinéma, co-founded in 1951 by André Bazin. It was in this journal that French philosophy of film began to produce its characteristic mixtures of structuralism, semiotics, psychoanalysis, and Marxism. Paradoxically, the affiliation of filmology with semiotics and psychology – provocative as it might have seemed – provided the philosophy of film access to academia in the 1960’s. For European state-financed universities, film studies could never have been the economic boon as they have been in the United States. French philosophy departments remain resistant in the 21st century and permit the teaching of the philosophy of film only in institutions that are considered off the mainstream or within the newly founded – relatively small – discipline of aesthetics. While the “sociological temptation” exists, overall, French philosophy of film has remained very distinct from the sociology of cinema.
French philosophy of film is a unique phenomenon; no other European country has produced a similarly philosophical output on film. In Italy, Umberto Eco and Pier Paolo Pasolini published writings on film in the 1960s that would quickly be integrated into the French discourse. In Germany, the journal Filmkritik (launched in 1957), was the German equivalent of the Cahiers du cinema, though earlier writings by Frankfurt School members Siegfried Kracauer and Walter Benjamin turned out to be most compatible with French philosophy of film. Different from French and American postwar developments, in Germany, film studies never became institutionalized nor have they developed a consistent link with the praxis of film. German Filmwissenschaft (filmology) – most prominently represented by Thomas Elsaesser – developed along the lines of comparative literature, theater science, and art history rather than plunge into an adventurous speculative discourse. It would be absorbed into academia through the disciplines of Media- and Communication Science. The activities of Filmwissenschaft are diverse though its dominant tendency may be characterized as sociological whereas systematical film analysis is highly empirical. Aestheticians working in German philosophy departments (where the main tendency is analytical) continue the philosophical considerations of film, though hermeneutic film analysis has had some impact.
In the early 1900’s, Henri Bergson (1859-1941) developed the concepts of “movement-image” and “time-image” (in Matière et memoire), both of which anticipated the development of film theory. Bergson declares the image to be superior to the concept because the image is able to evoke thought content in a more fluent and less abstract fashion. In lectures held at the College de France between 1902-03, Bergson briefly refers to the possibility of “comparing the mechanism of conceptual thought with that of the cinematograph” (now in L’Evolution créatrice, 1991, p. 725, note 1). Bergson’s main philosophical theme is that temporality should be thought of as independent from concepts of spatiality. Bergson contrasts duration, as it is experienced by the human consciousness, with scientific definitions of time, the latter of which, in his view, tends to “spatialize” time. Ironically, Bergson would later reject any possibility of using film as an exemplification of his ideas, in an essay entitled “The Cinematographic Illusion” (also in L’Evolution créatrice). Subsequent developments of Bergson’s ideas on duration by Epstein, Sartre, or Deleuze go, strictly speaking, against the grain of his original thought on cinema.
The German-American philosopher and psychologist Hugo Münsterberg (1863-1916) wrote the first book on the philosophy of film entitled Photoplay: A Psychological Study (1916, German: Das Lichtspiel: eine psychologische Studie, 1916). Active during the silent film era, Münsterberg attempted to establish cinema as an art form that is different from theater or photography. Coming to America at the age of thirty-four, Münsterberg had clearly been under Neo-Kantian influence in Germany. Photoplay is divided into two parts, the first of which is inspired by experimental psychology dealing with the mental functions of the spectator. This first part is a precursor to the cognitive theory of film. The second part bears clear traits of Neo-Kantian aesthetics as it analyzes, in a formalist fashion, film’s form and function. The Neo-Kantian input became obvious through Münsterberg’s conviction that film is the mirror of the mind and not that of the world; the goal of cinema is not to reproduce reality, but to materialize emotions. Münsterberg theorized about how close-ups and flashbacks parallel acts of consciousness (that is affect, memory) and formulated the ‘film/mind’ analogy that was much explored and criticized by other philosophers (for example Carroll, 1988b).
Russian Formalism designates a school of innovative linguists and literary critics. It developed out of modernist movements such as Russian symbolism and constructivism. From 1915 to 1930, both the Moscow group (led by Roman Jakobson) and the St. Petersburg Society for the Study of Poetical Language (OPOJAZ), which included notorious members like Viktor Shklovsky, Osip Brik, Boris Eikhenbaum, and Vladimir Propp, applied newly invented formalist linguistic methods to the study of literature and poetry. Rediscovered in the West in the 1960’s, the work of the Russian Formalists has had an important influence on structuralist theories of literature, and on some of the more recent varieties of Marxist literary criticism.
Several Russian Formalists wrote on film mainly by establishing analogies between film and language. The idea to interpret film as language goes back, among other things, to Shklovsky’s reaction to the writings of the Ukrainian linguist Alexander Potebnja (1836-1891) who thought of poetry as “thinking in images.” According to Shklovsky, this leads to the false assumption that the creation of symbols is the main cognitive occupation. Shklovsky suggested seeing the activity of thinking as a more abstract and relational way of thinking. This model of thinking comes close to a formalist idea of film. Finally, all artistic activity should be seen as a creative reorganization of pre-aesthetic materials: art need not express new content but should make a strange habitualized form.
For formalism, cinematic time (or cinematic reality altogether) is incompatible with naturalist representations. It is not staged, nor does the director transfer reality on the screen by means of intuition (as does, for example, impressionist painting). For the formalists, time is created through montage. Technical terms such as ‘defamiliarization’ (ostranenie) or the ‘story’ (fabula) as opposed to the ‘plot’ (sjuzhet), have become important in Western European and American film studies. Both Christian Metz (1975) and David Bordwell (1985) borrowed heavily from formalism.
The director Sergei Mikhailovich Eisenstein remains a central figure in formalist film theory and by helping to develop the above idea of time created through montage. One of Eisenstein’s aims was to overcome, in a formalist fashion, “intuitive creativity” through “rational constructive composition of effective elements” (1988a, I, p. 175). Eisenstein designated artistic activity as the process of organizing raw material. A large part of this cinematic theory is based on a principle similar to what Russian Formalists called ostranenie (alienation, estrangement, German: Verfremdung). According to Eisenstein, within every shot there is a conflict between an object and its spatial nature or between an event and its temporal nature. As a consequence of this conflict, cinematic time does not exist as “real time,” but must be experienced as an artistic-technical device. For Eisenstein, montage will never produce a “rhythm” or regularly patterned series of shots because such series would still rely too much on “artistic feeling” or empathy.
Eisenstein was the first person who attempted to see cinema as a thinking process. Recognizing that film reconstructs the actions of the human mind, Eisenstein perceived montage form as “a reconstruction of the laws of the thought process” (1988c, p. 236). His theory of dialectical montage (directly referring to Hegel and Marx) suggests that a third idea can emerge from the presentation of two conflicting shots. Related to this is his concept of “shock to thought” which occurs when the conflict between two shots forces us to think its synthesis (1988b, p. 45). Deleuze takes this idea up in Image-Temps and explains that this shock forces thinking to think itself as well as to think the whole (p. 207). Another famous concept is Eisenstein’s idea of cinema as a revolutionary ‘kino-fist’ formulated in reaction against his rival Dziga Vertov’s Kino Eye group (see below). It is difficult to summarize the entire body of Eisenstein’s writings as they teem with unpredictable insights and can certainly not be reduced to formalist recipes towards technicality.
Vsevolod Illarionovitch Pudovkin (1893-1953) elaborated in the late 1920s and early 1930s on a theory of film based on narrative and spatiotemporal continuity. In Kinorezhisser i kinomaterial (1926), Kinoszenarii: Teoria szenarija (1926), and Akter v fil’me (1934) (published in English as Film Technique and Film Acting), Pudovkin examines such devices as contrast, parallelism, and symbolism. Several of Pudovkin’s formulations influenced Rudolf Arnheim (see below).
The idea that editing constitutes the “essence” of film art originated with the Russian director and theoretician Lev Kuleshov (1899-1970) who experimented with montage in the 1920s in an almost scientific fashion and is also one of the key exponents of the ‘film as language’ idea. Thoughts on montage are expressed as early as 1920 in his study “The Banner of Cinematography” (Engl. in Selected Works, 1987, Moscow). Kuleshov was able to show with the help of experiments that an isolated shot has no meaning (the famous Kuleshov effect).
The Russo-Estonian semiotician Yuri Mikhailovitch Lotman (1922-1993) set out to reformulate the Saussurean notion of the sign by establishing a relationship of necessity between the signified and the signifier (which Saussure believed to be arbitrary). Lotman was the main proponent of the Tartu-Moscow School and his work is directly linked to the Russian Formalist tradition. He is perhaps most noted for the coinage of the term “semiosphere.” In his Semiotika kino i problemy kinoestetiki (1973) (Semiotics of Cinema), Lotman distinguished between the different levels of illusion and reality in film by analyzing the cinematic shot, narration, as well as the ideological function of cinema as mass-media. His distinction between pictorial/iconic signs used in the visual arts and conventional signs (words, letters) as used in literature had a central position in his work. Lotman also insisted that the cinematic language of a film is always related to exterior cultural codes.
Béla Balász (1949-1984) was a Hungarian film aesthetician who wrote in Hungarian and German. His books, Der sichtbare Mensch (The Visible Man, 1924) and Der Geist des Films (The Spirit of Film, 1930) were the first theoretical books on film after Münsterberg’s Photoplay. They remain the founding stones of modern film theory though they have been translated into English only in 2010. Balász’s book Theory of the Film (Hungarian, 1948, English 1953) picked up threads from the earlier books and brought him posthumous international fame. In general, Balász strove to offer to modern man possibilities of overcoming his particular state of estrangement by designing a utopian visual culture in which film plays an essential role. Balász’s ambition to describe film as a language brought him close to the Russian Formalists; he was actually able to advance views on montage that would be too mechanistic even for Eisenstein’s standards. However, a genuinely philosophical component enters his work through complex reflections on cinematic “reality.” In Theory of the Film, Balász wrote: “Although objective reality is independent of the subject and his subjective consciousness, beauty is not merely objective reality, not an attribute of the object entirely independent of the spectator, not something that would be there objectively even without a corresponding subject even if there were no human beings on earth” (p. 33). Malcolm Turvey classifies Balász (together with Jean Epstein, Dziga Vertov, and Siegfried Kracauer) as a “revelationist” because for all these theorists, the cinema is a means of enlightenment: it escapes the limits of human sight and reveals the true nature of reality. To some extent, the particular way of tackling the reality problem in film was determined by Balász’s interest in dreams. Two of Balász’s prose works are entitled Youth of a Dreamer and Fairytale, Ritual, and Film, the latter of which testified to his interest in film as “otherworldliness.” Without giving in to mystification and decidedly refusing fades or dissolves, Balász remained fascinated by film’s “ability to transform all things in space into bearers of expressions” and interpreted some original scenes psychoanalytically, such as substantial dream images (cf. Loewi, p. 318).
The ‘Bakhtin School’ theorists Mikhail M. Bakhtin, Pavel N. Medvedev, and Valentin N. Voloshinov developed elements of formalism by emphasizing the dialogical and polyphonic character of texts and cultural phenomena. Though the Bakhtin School did not write explicitly on film, it should be mentioned here for two reasons. First, Mikhail Bakhtin’s (1895-1975) writings had indirect influence on the film semiotics of Julia Kristeva and Tzvetan Todorov. Bakhtinian concepts of dialogism and polyphony are crucial because they can help to address fundamental questions about film form and reception. Second, film is an extremely good example for polyphony. While in the novel we most typically encounter the monologic narrator, in the film, the narrative, the character’s appearance, the dialogues, and several other elements appear simultaneously within one time frame (cf. Vice, p. 142). Also, Bakhtin’s central notion of the chronotope exemplifies the fusion of time and space that is typical for film.
The Italian Marxist philosopher Galvano Della Volpe (1895-1968), who in 1954 published a book called Il verosimile filmico e altri scritti di estetica, designed a rational aesthetics of film emphasizing unity, coherence, and harmony. Della Volpe formulated an organic theory of literature affirming the rational instead of the sentimental value of the work of art. Art is not distinct from science because both are based on the unity of the concept (in Critica del gusto). Central is Della Volpe’s critique of Crocean idealism, but also of materialism. Della Volpe established an epistemology of art that voluntarily remains indifferent towards social contexts or contents and excels in the analysis of technical, structural or formal processes in art. Della Volpe drew greatly from Aristotle’s Poetics. Emphasizing the analysis of formal aspects, Della Volpe pointed out film’s capacity to present the world symbolically as well as its ability to express abstract concepts. The latter happened for him mainly through montage. Similar to Jean Mitry, Della Volpe criticized the reduction of film to language; furthermore he was inspired by Pudovkin’s distinction between ‘plasticity’ and ‘concreteness’ of filmic images. Finally, Della Volpe established cinematic verisimilitude as non-equivalent to reality.
Semiotics is the study of signs and symbols and examines how meaning is created and communicated through signifying processes. In France, the term sémiologie is more often used than the term sémiotique, though there does not seem to be a clear distinction between the terms. The discipline of semiology goes back to Ferdinand de Saussure whereas semiotics was founded by Charles Sanders Peirce, who was later taken up by Deleuze (rather than Saussure).
In 1946, Gilbert Cohen-Séat published the first monograph on film which bears the word “philosophy” in its title (Essai sur les principes d’une philosophie du film). The Revue internationale de filmologie was founded soon afterwards and Cohen-Séat’s name remains linked to filmology. Arguably, his most important contribution to film studies was the distinction between “filmic facts” and “cinematic facts”: “The filmic fact consists of the expression of life (the life of the world, the spirit, the imagination, of beings and things) through a system of combined images (visual-natural or conventional- and auditory-sounds and words). The cinematic fact, instead, consists of social circulation of sensations, ideas, feelings, and materials that come from life itself and that cinema shapes according to its desires,” (Essai…, p. 57). Cohen-Séat’s scientific approach made him a precursor of the semiotics of cinema.
Roland Barthes’ influence on film theory is similar to that of the Bakhtin school. Though having written almost nothing on film, his narratology that strives to see theatre, photography, and music as texts has deeply influenced our ways of seeing film as the interplay of voices or codes. Paradoxically, this thinker who mused so much about “floating signifiers,” found very disturbing the fact that in films, signifiers are in motion: “The filmic, very paradoxically, cannot be grasped in the film ‘in situation’, ‘in movement’, in its natural state’, but only in that major artifact, the still” (1977, p. 65).
Christian Metz (1931–1994) was the initiator of a film analysis that relies in the most outspoken way on semiotics and is, like Barthes, what the French call a “sémiologue.” In general, Metz’s approach towards cinema has become the prototypical example of a quasi-scientific form of film theory. Apart from linguistic structuralism, Metz borrowed from psychoanalysis, in particular from Jacques Lacan and his writings on the mechanisms of dreams and voyeurism. This allowed him to explain perceptual phenomena of the filmic narrative from the point of view of the perceiving subject and take into consideration the unconscious processes of desire that allegedly position the spectator ideologically. Metz is particularly renowned for his “grand synagmatics” (grande syntagmatique) through which he categorized the most frequent codes and signifying units (called ‘syntagmes’) in cinema. Metz established the single shot as the smallest unit and the entire film as the largest one. He classified all syntagmes in distinct categories, distinguishing, for example, between chronological and a-chronological syntagmes.
According to Metz, cinematic language (langage) is not constituted by all elements that appear in a film, but only by those things that can only appear in film. Film analysis should highlight only those signifying figures that are truly cinematographic. Metz questioned Eisenstein’s vision of cinema as a langue because a langue is a highly organized code, whereas language covers a much broader area. Film should not be seen as langue because cinematic signs are reinvented or are updated in every film (Essais sur la signification, p. 47). Some might find Metz’s approach anti-philosophical because it so vehemently denies the possibility of phenomenological considerations. On the other hand, Metz’s work can be considered as philosophical because it deals with ethical implications (employing Marxist themes) and it extensively discusses the matter of reality and of dreams through a Freudian perspective.
Pier Paolo Pasolini (1922-1975) was, and remains, a relatively little known as a theorist in the United States, but he held a central position in European film theory. Under the influence of Barthes, Metz, and Gramsci, Pasolini’s essays on cinema collected in the book Empirismo Eretico (1972) are exercises in semiotics that raised, in the 1960’s, a debate involving Umberto Eco (1967) and Metz (1968). When Pasolini postulated that cinema is the “written language of reality,” he was not intending to establish cinematic reality as a sort of cinematic language, nor is he preaching realism. Pasolini wants to conceive the real as cinematic. Reality is the discourse of things that cinema re-narrates. This project is highly philosophical and, famously, in 1967 Pasolini remarked, in the Journal of the Communist Party, that “semiotics has not taken the step which would lead it to become a Philosophy.”
Phenomenology is a philosophy that goes back to Edmund Husserl and takes as a point of departure a sort of “experience” that is strictly designed as the sensible intuition of phenomena. On the basis of this prescription, phenomenology attempts to understand the essence of what is experienced. Martin Heidegger, though influenced by Husserl, interpreted phenomenology as an ontology, that is, as a discipline attempting to understand the Being of ourselves as Dasein (existence) and preparing for an understanding of the meaning of Being as such. His version is called “existential phenomenology.” Both Husserl’s and Heidegger’s phenomenology remain critical towards metaphysics. In the philosophy of film, the phenomenological, “synthetic” approach has often been opposed to the “analytical,” semiotic one.
Like Bergson, Merleau-Ponty (1908-1961) criticized all attempts of representing the world in a purely scientific fashion as reductive. In film, the meaning of an image depends on the preceding image and their succession creates a new reality. Merleau-Ponty has had a considerable influence on Cohen-Séat (see Andrew 1978: p. 46). In 1945, Merleau-Ponty devoted a lecture to the possibilities of phenomenological interpretations of cinema (“Le cinéma et la nouvelle psychologie” in Sens et non-sens) where he depicted film not as a sum of images, but as a temporal phenomenon. The central term in Merleau-Ponty’s musings on film is the idea of immersion. For the phenomenologist, humans are thrown into a life world to which they remain attached in the most natural and inconspicuous way. Film provides a phenomenological experience par excellence because in the cinema the human consciousness is consistently immersed in a world. Merleau-Ponty’s ideas never developed into a phenomenological theory of film, but have inspired theorists of Neo-Realism, such as Ayfre and Bazin and have been developed by Vivian Sobchack (1992).
Amédée Ayfre (1895-1963), a student of Merleau-Ponty, rejected formalist components such as style as essential characteristics of cinema and attempted to establish a “phenomenological realism” (Ayfre, 1964: 214) in film studies. In his Conversion aux images (written together with Henri Agel) Ayfre explicitly referred to the phenomenological ambition of strictly adhering to mere descriptions of experience without being influenced by either scientific or psychological considerations of causes (pp. 212-13). Ayfre’s notion of écriture as it appears in the cinéma d’auteur, designated “neither a content nor a style” (1969, p. 162), but attempted to go beyond the division of film into form and content. Phenomenological existence transgresses constructive devices as well as stylization and Ayfre’s sympathies clearly went towards Neo-Realist cinema (see below). As a Jesuit priest, Ayfre strove to reconcile his existentially-minded phenomenology with his Catholicism. Ayfre’s phenomenological realism is meant to depict a “spiritual” reality and not just a “real” one; it creates an illusion due to a “prodigious asceticism of means.” Ayfre’s concept of realism is diametrically opposed to formalist ideas about “realistic” narrative modes. David Bordwell, for example, believed that realistic expressions can be grasped best through norms and codes which vary according to different criteria, but remain formalizable in the last instance. “Realistic” motivations will be applied according to what the given narrative mode defines as realistic. For Bordwell, “verisimilitude in a classical narrative film is quite different from verisimilitude in the art cinema” (Narration in the Fiction Film, 1985, pp. 153-54). Ayfre, on the other hand, saw cinematic reality as the internal logic of a universe created by the director. Ayfre’s realism was also opposed to psychological interpretations because the reality we encounter in a film is more than merely the subconscious emanation or the reverie of a director. Ayfre’s younger collaborator Henri Agel (1911-2008) pursued a long publishing career and never abandoned the initial tendency, defining himself until the end as a “humanist and a spiritualist”.
Realism attempts to recreate life in art by relying on realistic presentation while minimizing controlling devices in the process of artistic production. In literature, realism has been developed by Balzac, Flaubert, and Zola. In film, Italian Neo-Realism is the most important realist movement.
The establishment of neo-realist film theory was mainly been the task of André Bazin (1918-1958) and Ayfre. Bazin’s realism was similar to Ayfre’s phenomenological realism, more so since he accepted Merleau-Ponty’s idea of reality as “the pure appearance of everything that is in the world” (“la pure apparence des êtres au monde” (Questions IV, p. 62). In 1957, Bazin openly adopted Ayfre’s expression “phenomenological realism” in order to label the kind of films in which “reality is not modified according to psychological functions or dramatic requirements” (Questions IV, p. 138). Dudley Andrew writes that “Bazin saw in realism a kind of style which reduced signification to a minimum. In other words, he saw the rejection of style as a potential stylistic option” (Andrew, 1976, p. 143).
Together with Alexandre Astruc, Bazin was also responsible for the so-called “auteur theory,” which grew mainly out of the two writers’ works and since has been central for French New Wave cinema. François Truffaut and other Cahiers authors joined later on, as well as Andrew Sarris in the USA. Bazin’s realism had a metaphysically significant backdrop. Like Ayfre’s phenomenological realism, Bazin’s phenomenological ontology was strongly marked by religious convictions. Sometimes terms like “real presence” or “revelation of reality” appear to have almost religious connotations. In this sense, Bazin’s philosophy was essentialist, in spite of the existentialist stances to which he was submitted. Bazin remains one of the most anti-formalist theoreticians. In his opinion, neo-realist films “aim to reduce montage to zero and to transport to the screen reality in its continuity” (p. 146).
Siegfried Kracauer’s (1889-1966) writings on film were based on sociology and psychology. His conviction that film has a realist character made him a main proponent of cinematic realism and brought him close to Bazin (whom he never mentions). Kracauer based his realism on the resemblance that he perceived between film and photography. For post-surrealists critics such as Bazin and Kracauer, cinema should look for its genuine expression within a kind of realist expression that can be described as the exact opposite of the surrealist cinema of dreams and symbolisms. Interestingly, in the end, Kracauer defined an alternative form of dreamlike realism able to transmit reality “as if it were a dream”. In his Theory of Film he wrote: “Perhaps films look most like dreams when they overwhelm us with the crude and unnegotiated presence of natural objects—as if the camera had just now extricated them from the womb of physical existence and as if the umbilical cord between image and actuality had not yet been severed. There is something in the abrupt immediacy and shocking veracity of such pictures that justifies their identification as dream images” (p. 224).
Like Ayfre, Kracauer was opposed to any stylization of reality: the realistic character of dream elements is compared to those objects that we can find in nature. Kracauer’s realism was not based on calculations with possibilities of literal reproductions, but on the director’s ability to capture a certain spiritual quantity that is supposed to be enclosed to reality. Ayfre’s phenomenological realism, which strove to depict a “spiritual” reality, and not just a “real” one is echoed by Kracauer’s distinction between “photographic reality” and “camera reality” (Theory of Film, p. 150). For Kracauer, it was important that the “the form giving tendency does not rise above the realistic one” (p. 67). Ayfre, Bazin, and Kracauer engaged in paradoxical projects: Ayfre attempted to apply an aesthetic asceticism on reality without applying stylization; Bazin attempted to retrieve style by rejecting style; Kracauer attempted to establish a paradoxical balance between realistic and formalizing tendencies.
Dziga Vertov’s theory of the “cinema of fact” can be considered a form of cinematic realism. In 1919, Vertov founded the group Kino-oki (“cinema-eyes”) insisting, in various manifestos, that the cinema of the future will not be that of stars and of fiction, but a cinema of facts. Vertov developed a concept of cinema as “life caught in awareness,” in which the camera eye innocently captures reality “as it is” without stylizing it. This clearly joins the ambitions of the neo-realists. The Russian director Andrei Tarkovsky, who was strongly influenced by Vertov and by Russian “Documentary Aesthetics” in the 1960’s, has indeed been likened to Bazin and neo-realism. Jon Beasley-Murray points out that Tarkovsky restored the “actuality of time” by constructing a subjectivity by which this reality is inhabited (1997, p. 47).
A disciple of Bazin, Alexandre Astruc (1923-) established in his essay “La Caméra-stylo” (1948) an aesthetics of cinema that based its expressions on the idea of writing rather than on conventional conceptions of the image. The language of film can be shaped until it becomes as subtle as the language of literature. Cinema is not a consecution of images. Instead, it adopts more abstract characteristics because it is able to integrate abstraction in itself. Abstraction is no longer present as an underlying structure of the film (as is the case with montage), but it expresses itself directly: “By language I mean a form in which and by which an artist can express his thoughts, however abstract they may be, or translate his obsessions exactly as he does in the contemporary essay or novel. That is what I would like to call this new age of cinema, the age of caméra-stylo” (Astruc, 1968, p. 18).
Like Bazin’s and Kracauer’s, Astruc’s strategy is directed against surrealist cinema. But it is also directed against conventional documentaries because the caméra-stylo intends to grasp “any kind of reality.” In a film “recorded” by a caméra-stylo there is no evocation of subjective, intimate symbols; nothing has been produced by the artist through the direct transposition of an inner reality; nor is there is any objective recording of reality. Film is not a documentation undertaken from a detached point of view located outside the things filmed. This is why the camera works like a pen: it records concrete reality, but then transforms it instantly into an abstraction. A caméra-stylo can produce an “écriture,” but it would be too simple to say that a film is transformed into literature only because the camera is transformed, in a metaphorical way, into a pen. The use of the camera as a pen has more to do with the interplay of realization and abstraction or, to use another term, of stylization. In other words, the writing camera produces style. This makes Astruc’s theory different from “anti-stylization” movements such as realism and (to some extent) phenomenology. However, it is important to understand that the caméra-stylo philosophy does not preach formalist stylization, but attempts to capture style, which makes it, paradoxically, compatible with some realist and phenomenological stances. Marcel Martin goes as far as saying that the “new language” which cinema has discovered makes sense as long as style turns out to be the main protagonist of this medium. “The real main character of this cinema is thus the style (…). The ‘poetic cinema’ (cinéma de poésie) is thus essentially founded on the exercise of style as inspiration” (Martin, 1967, p. 68).
Jacques Aumont, in A quoi pensent les films?, insists that “film has the power of thinking”. In the introduction of this article, the idea to see film as a form of thinking has been addressed as an important part of the philosophy of film that begins with Eisenstein.
The avant-garde director Jean Epstein (1897-1953) remains better known for his theoretical writings than for his films, many of which are no longer extant. Together with Eisenstein, Epstein is a precursor of “cinema as thought” theories. Mixing Eisenstein’s thoughts with Marxism and the intellectual potential flowing out of the French Impressionist School of Film active during the 1920’s, Epstein designs a philosophy that is more reminiscent of Bergson than of formalism and can even be called anti-semiotic. Film is much more than a text or a writing; it is a machine able to produce a dreamlike reality by unhinging the most basic rules of logic and time, and by overcoming human reason.
In his major work L’Intelligence d’une machine (1921), Epstein discovered that cinema as a thinking machine is able to liberate us from the constraints of logic in order to produce a poetic and dreamlike reality. Cinema manipulates space and time. Comparing film with the microscope, it seems that Epstein anticipated contemporary computer reality or virtual reality. Cinema is a “robot brain” (p. 71) able to transcend the physical and mental limits of humans. The cinematograph, like the calculator, is the first materialization of “machines for thinking” (p. 48) and more complex ones will follow. Obviously inspired by Bergson, Epstein observes how cinema stretches and condenses duration and lets us feel the variable and relative nature of time. Cinema thinks time is a “partial mechanical brain” that develops a “rich philosophy full of surprises” (p. 71). The reality that cinema thinks is “the sum of many irrealities”. For some, Epstein’s theory might smack a little too much of pseudo-science but he plausibly defines cinema as a “machine for producing dreams” (p. 55).
Some might remember Jean Mitry (1907-1988) as an “anti-semiologist” film thinker because of his harsh criticism of Christian Metz in La Sémiologie en question (1987). Still this theorist and film maker has his own semiotic past. In 1963, the publication of the two volumes of Esthétique et psychologie du cinéma was seen as a major event in the world of French cinema theory. The highly synthetic book deals with all thinkable subjects and accepts some of Bazin’s realism as well as several formalist patterns, but does not – though the title might suggest this – engage in Freudian psychoanalytical elaborations. Mitry’s method was that of perceptual psychology and his refusal of Bazin’s ambition to discover in cinema a “world beyond the world” is absolute. A philosophical input comes from another side. Mitry was asking himself if “filmic language does not reflect thought in the way in which it produces itself [‘en train de se faire’] much better than could do words (…) which only crystallize thoughts in the form of more or less independent ideas by translating a thought that is already achieved” (p. 90). It becomes clear here that Mitry working within the thread of those “Cinema as Thought” theorists presented in the present sub-chapter. Mitry found cinema to be unique in that it signifies only while functioning (p. 63). It is thus consistent that he reproaches, in La Sémiologie en Question, Christian Metz (his admirer) his reductive application of linguistics to film because the language of film is not based on words. Mitry’s position can be summarized as that of a phenomenology of perception and his work often proceeds synoptically with the precision of a historian.
Deleuze’s (1925-1995) analysis of cinema was founded on Bergson’s work Matière et memoire and C. S. Peirce’s taxonomy of signs. Deleuze’s engagement with both represents a rupture with the Saussureian linguistic semiotic tradition. Deleuze rejected “linguistic” as well as psychoanalytic models of film theorisation. Like Mitry, Deleuze believed that film, as it represents and reflects on time, is incompatible with language; for him, the pre-signifying ‘signaletic material’ that films are made of was not assimilable to models of semiotics. In this regard, Deleuze anticipated a number of analytic-cognitivist film theorists.
Similar to Epstein, Deleuze believed that film can alter our modes of thinking about movement and time. In a Bergsonian way, Deleuze put forward that cinematic experience was as a means to perceive time and movement as a whole. The starting point of Bergson’s philosophy was the distinction between temporal and spatial reality. Bergson modified the traditional relationship between unity and repetition by attributing singularity to time and discontinuity to space. Lived time and measured time should not be confused. Bergson’s thesis is that the human who looks at the clock perceives merely juxtapositions of different positions of the hand, which bear no link among themselves. Only the ‘I’ (consciousness) experiences a time whose essence is duration. Correspondingly, Deleuze held that in cinema, our mind does not need to put together the successive percepts or sensations it perceives; rather it receives them as a whole.
Deleuze seemed to be going back in time as he attempted to base his theory of cinema on a point before the semiotic tradition and even before Shklovsky’s formalism which strove to overcome Potebnja’s model of “thinking in images.” More precisely, Deleuze held that films do not think with simple images, but with movement-images and time-images. In his two monumental books on cinema, “Image-Mouvement” (Cinéma I) and “Image-Temps” (Cinéma II), Deleuze engaged the entire history of cinema in order to show a difference between these two types of images. Frequently, we encounter the movement-image, which is based on a sensory-motor scheme (it shows an action, which produces a reaction). In the movement-image, the action imposes itself upon time, it is the action which determines the duration of a scene and the next scene is a reaction to this action (see Deleuze 1984). The time-image, on the other hand, is based on pure thinking. The time-image emerged in cinema after WWII mainly with Italian Neo-Realism and French New Wave cinema. It does not follow the scheme of action-reaction, but it can evoke a time that is prior to movement. Time-images do not simply show us actions and movements, but different layers of time, all of which converge within single points of present. These images can express a present that constantly reaches for the past and for the future.
Deleuze brought film studies closer to philosophy. For Deleuze, film was superior to other arts because it combines time and movement in such a necessary fashion. More than that, cinema must be considered as a philosophy because it constructs its own “concepts.” Cinema is not an applied philosophy submitted to traditional philosophical concepts, but it develops “cinematic” concepts. It does not simply represent reality, but is in itself an ontological practice. Therefore cinema is more than simply an art. In this sense, Deleuze was doing neither film theory nor aesthetics, but he thinks of film as a philosophy. In Deleuze’s earlier writings, art is able to draw on concepts and therefore not confined to percepts or ‘blocs of sensation.’ However, even here Deleuze did not recommend extracting as many concepts as possible from cinema: “A theory of cinema is not about cinema but about the concepts sparked by cinema” (p. 365). Later, in What is Philosophy? (1991), Deleuze (and his co-writer Felix Guattari) reserved “concepts” for philosophy only and declared that cinema thinks with affects and precepts.
Cinema’s highest objective is nothing other than promoting thought and the functioning that comes from thinking. This is what makes cinema different from mere dreams which, in Deleuze’s view, are not thinking. Bad films do nothing more than induce a dream in the spectators (Image-temps, p. 219), they simply reiterate sensory-motor clichés that provoke neither thought or affect.
More recently, Daniel Frampton has added a brick to the wall called “Film as Thought” by insisting that film does not narrate or show things, characters, or actions. Instead, it thinks them. When watching a film we observe a thinking process. In his book Filmosophy (2006) Frampton attempts to grasp this cinematic thinking process with the help of newly coined concepts such as ‘film-thinking’ and ‘filmind’ and assigns to ‘filmosophy’ the task of “conceptualizing all film as an organic intelligence” (p. 7). Film-thinking is not a metaphorical way of arranging reality, but “the filmind has its own particular film-phenomenology, its own way of attending to its world” (p. 91). There is a film-like way of thinking. Philosophers like Bachelard, for example, were able to produce “a flow that weaves discourses together, yet still with rigor and meaning” (p. 179). Although philosophers can learn from film-thinking, Frampton insists that “film has its own kind of thinking” (p. 23), that it “cannot show us human thinking, [but that] it shows us ‘film-thinking’” (p. 47). Thinking is radically removed from the activity of merely processing data.
Susanne Langer’s philosophy of film drew very much upon the analogy of film and dream. Langer was an American pragmatist philosopher close to the continental tradition. She was also a frequent reference point in analytic philosophy of film (for example, in Carroll). For Langer, cinema is an art that has introduced the “dream mode” as its main artistic expression, a mode that finally enables cinema to establish itself as an independent medium. Still, film is not a daydream – which is but a wilful imitation of a dream. In her essay “A Note on Film,” Langer wrote: “[Film] is not any poetic art we have known before; it makes the primary illusion—virtual history—in its own mode. This is, essentially, the dream mode. I do not mean that it copies dream, or puts one into a daydream. Not at all, no more than literature invokes memory, or makes us believe that we are remembering’’ (p. 200).
Psychological film theory began with the publication of Münsterberg’s Photoplay, in which the first part is inspired by experimental psychology. In remainder of the twentieth century, more philosophical approaches would use psychoanalysis for the decoding of unconscious elements that were supposed to contain truth by reading films through schemes of symbolization and representation. These approaches are current in the continental tradition.
Rudolf Arnheim (1904-2007) published Film als Kunst (Film as Art) in 1932, defending film as a form of art distinct from the productions of the entertainment industry. Historically, Arnheim’s main writings on film can be situated between Münsterberg and Balász. Later Arnheim founded a full-fledged aesthetics on the theory of perception and gestalt theory (especially in Art and Visual Perception, 1954). Comments on film are sparse in Arnheim’s later work, but the following quotation, which links film interpretation to Freudian psychology, is remarkable because it addresses a possible extension of the Freudian vision of dream into Arnheim’s own domain. In Visual Thinking (1969), Arnheim pointed to a fundamental link between film and dream that psychology should follow: “Freud raises the question of how the important logical links of reasoning can be represented in images. An analogous problem, he says, exists for the visual arts. There are indeed parallels between dream images and those created in art on the one hand, and the mental images serving as the vehicle of thought on the other; but by noting the resemblance one also becomes aware of the differences, and these can help to characterize thought imagery more precisely” (p. 241).
Reflections on the relationship between the spectator and the film have become particularly central in French film theory since the publication of Christian Metz’s Le signifiant imaginaire: psychoanalyse et cinéma (1977) and Metz’s Lacanian developments as well as the writings of Jean Louis Baudry. For psychoanalysis, the proximity between film and dream is essential because film interpretation is seen as a sort of Freudian dream interpretation. Almost half a century after Arnheim’s above remark, psychoanalytical film theory is still struggling to explain the ways in which unconscious elements obstruct the reception of films and to understand how films spark unconscious or irrational processes. This approach can be understood as diametrically opposed to that of cognitive science which is also interested in how spectators make sense of and respond to films, but which observes the viewer’s conscious processing of films.
Bruce F. Kawin began his book Mindscreen: Bergman and First-Person Film (1978) with the question: “Film is a dream—but whose?” (p. 3). Kawin claimed that dreamlike films are self-conscious artworks in which narrative voices have been “generalized” up to a point that we perceive the artworks themselves as if they appear on a “dream screen.” Kawin adopted the idea of the dream screen from the American Psychologist Bertram D. Lewin (1950) whose ideas had, in their time, contributed in an outstanding way to an increasing interest in dreams in post-Freudian America. In an article entitled “Interferences from the Dream Screen,” Lewin declared: “In a previous communication, a special structure, the dream screen was distinguished from the rest of the dream and defined as the blank background upon which the dream picture appears to be projected. The term was suggested by the action pictures because, like the analogue in the cinema, the dream screen is either not noted by the dreaming spectator, or it is ignored due to the interest in the pictures and actions that appear on it’’ (p. 104).
Kawin’s contribution to film theory consists of examining the validity of the dream screen (or mindscreen) in cinema providing clues to particularities of the narrative structure of film. In Bergman’s Persona, for example, there is “an impression of the mindscreen’s being generalized,” so that the film’s self-consciousness appears to originate from within. Being identified neither with a specific character nor with the filmmaker, the “potential linguistic focus” takes on the characteristics of a mindscreen: “The film becomes first-person, it speaks itself” (Kawin, pp. 113-14). Kawin anticipates Frampton’s ‘filmind’.
Given his use of psychoanalysis and Marxism, the extremely influential Slovenian philosopher Slavoj Žižek (1949-) is a typical representative of continental film theory, the more so since he has explicitly opposed Anglo-American, empirical approaches (see “Introduction to 2001”). Žižek uses Lacanian concepts and insights (most importantly his notion of the Other) and works with concepts derived from the philosophies of Derrida and Deleuze, such as a decentralized notion of the subject. The value of his philosophy of film, developed in numerous books, seems to reside mainly in his consistent and original application of abstract theories to films though he has also submitted various concepts to original developments. His writings do not represent philosophy of film as such; rather they are attempts to read ideology by analyzing contemporary popular films.
Like Siegfried Kracauer, Walter Benjamin (1892-1940) belongs to the Frankfurt School of philosophy. Benjamin believed that the techniques of reproduction can be used for the reproduction of traditional works only, and also as new modes of representation. Benjamin’s theory of film is sometimes associated with that of cinematographic realism. Most famously, in his essay Das Kunstwerk im Zeitalter seiner technischen Reproduzierbarkeit [The Work of Art in the Age of Mechanical Reproduction] (1935), Benjamin interpreted modifications of the original through the process of reproduction, as a loss of the work’s aura.
Benjamin favored an allegorical kind of photography (that is definitely opposed to the art of montage), examples of which he found in early photography because it can be perceived something like an aura: “In the fleeting expression of a human face seen in early photographs, the aura shows itself for the last time. This is what makes their melancholic and thus incomparable beauty” (I, 2, p. 445). Like Epstein, Benjamin believed that cinema can provide us with extraordinary access to reality: the details that are produced by the close-up or the forms that are revealed by slow motion can “give us access to the experience of an optical unconscious just like psychoanalysis offers us the experience of the instinctive unconscious” (p. 460). In this sense, knowledge about the world is a matter of a sudden “awakening” to the world and this world can be a cinematic world.
Theodor W. Adorno (1903–1969), another member of the Frankfurt School, would transform Benjamin’s notion of “mass culture” into that of the “Kulturindustrie,” in which he saw as a systematized commodification encompassing ‘high’ and ‘mass’ art. This stands in contrast to Benjamin’s view of popular or mass culture as concealing a certain emancipatory potential to be unleashed by dialectical criticism. In their book Dialectic of Enlightenment (1972), Adorno and Max Horkheimer (1895–1973), developed a cultural critique that contains some dispersed but pertinent references to the culture industry of film excelling in standardized production techniques and catering for commercial and not for cultural purposes.
The hermeneutic approach is based on the interpretation of texts and detects the semantic potential of a text as well as its different levels of meanings. Hermeneutics can be seen as a branch of phenomenology and many of Ayfre’s and Agel’s texts bear traces of hermeneutic thinking. Still, in film analysis its method has mainly been developed in proximity with the interpretation of literature. Though hermeneutics of film explains the semiotic status of iconic signs, it never engages in the construction of semiotic systems because it is constantly aware of the historicity of any analysis. Today, hermeneutic film analysis is mainly practiced in German academic departments of Media and Communication Science. Moreover, such analysis has been brought to a point by Anke-Marie Lohmeier.
The future of continental philosophy of film will probably be developed in several areas. Žižek’s Lacanian approach, as long as it does not entirely enter the stream of cultural studies, will attract philosophers who deem that ideology should be the primary focus of cinema studies. Another area that might develop is the one pioneered by Bruce Kawin and Daniel Frampton, who provide a vocabulary for describing our aesthetic experience of film that transcends both Deleuze’s conceptual analyses of movement and time and phenomenological approaches. It clearly opens up philosophy to new ways of thinking. Equally promising is a whole range of “crossovers,” such as those that combine semiotic and cognitive paradigms of which Warren Buckland’s The Cognitive Semiotics of Film (2000) is an example. Other crossovers synthesize Deleuzian film theory and phenomenology (Shaw 2008), or the Cavellian-Wittgensteinian approach with continental philosophy (of which Stephen Mulhall is an example).
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Last updated: May 13, 2011 | Originally published: May 12, 2011