Global Ethics: Capabilities Approach

The capabilities approach is meant to identify a space in which we can make cross-cultural judgments about ways of life. The capabilities approach is radically different from, yet indebted to, traditional ethical theories such as virtue ethics, consequentialism and deontology.

This article begins with a background on global ethics. This situates the capabilities approach as a possible solution to the problems that arise from globalization. The second section provides Amartya Sen’s account of the basic framework of the capabilities approach. That section also shows how Martha Nussbaum develops the approach. The third section describes Nussbaum’s list of ten central capabilities. This list has been viewed by some philosophers as a definitive list, while others, notably Sen, have argued that no list is complete, because a list should always be subject to revision. The fourth section shows how the approach is similar to, yet very different from, traditional ethical theories such as virtue ethics, consequentialism and deontology. The capabilities approach is shown to add to the approaches of global ethics such as communitarianism, human rights, and the approach of John Rawls. The section compares Michael Boylan’s table of embeddedness with Nussbaum’s capabilities list. The fifth section discusses two main philosophical critiques of the capabilities approach. First, and most notably, Alison Jaggar criticizes Nussbaum for not paying closer attention to asymmetrical power relations. Second, Bernard Williams raises questions about what constitutes a capability. The sixth section shows how the capabilities approach has been applied to advance various areas of applied philosophy including the environment and disability ethics. The final section explains how the capabilities approach has been undertaken as a global endeavor by the United Nations Development Program to fight poverty and illiteracy and to empower women.

Table of Contents

  1. Background of Global Ethics
  2. The Capabilities Approach
    1. Sen
    2. Nussbaum
  3. Nussbaum’s List of Central Capabilities
  4. The Relationship between the Capabilities Approach and Other Ethical Theories
    1. Virtue Ethics
    2. Communitarianism
    3. Deontology
    4. Rawls’ The Law of Peoples
    5. Human Rights
    6. Consequentialism
    7. Boylan’s Table of Embeddedness
  5. Philosophical Criticisms of the Capabilities Approach
    1. Illiberal and Neo-Colonialist
    2. What Is a Capability?
  6. Philosophical Applications
    1. The Environment
    2. Disability Ethics
  7. United Nations Development Program
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Background of Global Ethics

Issues of globalization have sparked great controversy since the 1980s. Globalization, broadly construed, is manifested in various forms of social activity including economic, political and cultural life. Practicing global ethics entails moral reasoning across borders. Borders can entail culture, religion, ethnicity, gender, race, class, sexuality, global location, historical experience, environment, species and nations. Ethicists ask how we best address issues of globalization–that is, how we begin to address conflicts that arise when vastly different cultural norms, values, and practices collide.


There have been two broad philosophical approaches to address cross-border moral disagreement and conflict. The dominant approach aims to develop moral theories that are not committed to a single metaphysical world-view or religious foundation, but are compatible with various perspectives. In other words, it is a goal to develop a theory that is both ‘thick’ (that is, it has a robust conception of the good embedded within a particular context, and respects local traditions) and ‘thin’ (that is, it embraces a set of universal norms). These universalists include human rights theorists, Onora O’Neill’s deontology, Seyla Benhabib’s discourse ethics and Martha Nussbaum’s capabilities approach. They tend to be associated with constructing ‘thin’ theories of morality. The other approach, most notably advocated by Michael Walzer, is communitarianism. Communitarians deny the possibility of developing a single universal standard of flourishing that is both thick enough to be useful and thin enough to support reasonable pluralism.


The debate between these two approaches to global ethics has reached an impasse. Since communitarians hold that moral norms are always local and valid internal to a particular community, universalists charge the communitarians with relativism. Moreover, universalists argue that communitarians fail to provide useful methods for addressing cross-border moral conflict. However, the communitarians charge the universalists with either positing theories that are too thin to be useful or advancing theories that are substantive but covertly build in premises that are not universally shared, and so risk cultural imperialism.


Martha Nussbaum believes her capabilities theory resolves the impasse and offers a viable approach to global ethics that provides a universal measure of human flourishing while also respecting religious and cultural differences. The capabilities approach, she argues, is universal, but ‘of a particular type.’ That is, it is a thick (or substantive) theory of morality that accommodates pluralism. Thus, she argues that her theory avoids criticisms applied to other universalists and communitarians. Before examining her theory, we must address her predecessor, Amartya Sen.

2. The Capabilities Approach

a. Sen

Amartya Sen, an economic theorist and founder of the capabilities approach, developed his theory in order to identify a space in which we can make cross cultural judgments on the quality of life. To best understand how these judgments can be passed, we must investigate a critical distinction made by proponents of the capabilities approach–between function and capability. A function, on the one hand, according to Sen, is an achievement, but this should be broadly understood to include any ‘state of being.’ Let’s examine Sen’s bike-riding example to shed light on a ‘function.’ He says a bicyclist has achieved the purpose of what one does with a bike–namely, ride it. From this example, clearly the choice to ride a bike is a function of a human being, however, the scope of functioning is not merely limited to a person’s intention to ride the bike. A ‘function’ entails any ‘state of being’ which includes excitement, happiness and fear. For example, a child who first begins to ride her bike may display a great amount of fear as she wobbles down the road, but once she understands how to ride the bike smoothly, she can enjoy (or perhaps become excited) riding her bike. Thus, when the child rides her bike (and is excited from doing so), she has performed the functions of riding a bike, and having the emotions associated with doing so, while partaking in the capability of play.

A capability, on the other hand, is a possibility, not just any possibility, but a real one. For example, we can talk about the possibility of a person in a deeply poverty-stricken area to find employment and support a family. However, such a possibility may not be real considering external circumstances–for example, no clothing, food or shelter. Put differently, a ‘capability set’ (as Sen calls it) is the total functions available for a person to perform.  By describing it in such a way, Sen places a deep correlation between freedom and function. That is to say, the more limited one’s freedom, the less opportunities one has to fulfill one’s functions. In sum, Crocker (2008) says succinctly that, according to Sen, a capability X entails (1) having the real possibility for X which (2) depends on my powers and (3) and no external circumstances preventing me from X.

A capability and function should not be understood as mutually exclusive or completely paralleling one another. Let’s consider two people with the same capabilities. Even though they have same capabilities, they may participate in radically different functions. For example, two people may both have the opportunity to engage in play, but do so in radically different ways (for example, one may swim while the other volunteers at a homeless shelter). Proponents of the capabilities approach argue this makes the theory most attractive, that is, it accommodates various ways of life even though it puts forth a conception of the good. Now, let’s consider a situation in which people participate in the same functions, but possess different capabilities set. Consider Sen’s example of hunger. Two people may be hungry, but for radically different reasons. Consider, on the one hand, a person who seeks to fulfill her desire to eat, but cannot because of socio-economic circumstances.  On the other, a person may be hungry because she is fasting for religious reasons or protesting an injustice. In both examples, the person suffers from starvation, but for radically different reasons.

b. Nussbaum

Nussbaum begins her capabilities approach by noting her indebtedness to Aristotle and Karl Marx (and to a lesser extent, J.S. Mill). Like Sen, she embraces the capabilities/function distinction. However, she begins to part ways with Sen’s philosophy when she grounds her theory in Marx and Aristotle. In doing so she argues that a function must not be performed in just any way, but in a ‘truly human way.’ That is to say, if a person lives a life where she is unable to exercise her human powers (for example, self-expressive creativity) then she is living her life in more of an animalistic manner than as a human being.

Nussbaum seeks a capabilities approach that can fully express human powers and not just provide (real) opportunities for people to perform certain functions. In other words, she does not deny, as Sen argues, that a capability is a real possibility or opportunity for an individual to perform certain actions, but that is merely necessary and not sufficient for the capabilities approach. Sen is missing, according to Nussbaum, aspects of what is particularly unique to human beings, that is, human powers. Nussbaum understands the capabilities/function distinction as multiply realized–that is, while the capabilities are the space for the opportunity for particular actions, the way in which that space is manifested, via different actions, is a person’s functioning.

Nussbaum notes that there are three specific differences that sets her capabilities approach apart from Sen. First, Nussbaum (2000) charges Sen with not explicitly rejecting cultural relativism. She agrees with his sympathies for universal norms, she also, criticizes his inability to completely reject cultural relativism. Second, Nussbaum criticizes Sen for not grounding his theory in a Marxian/Aristotelian idea of true human functioning. This is not to say that he would reject Nussbaum’s conclusions drawn from Marx and Aristotle, but rather he is not specifically indebted to (and does not ground his theory in) them.  Third, Sen does not provide an explicit list of central capabilities As a matter of fact, Sen has been critical of attempting to provide a list of central capabilities. Nonetheless, these three points of division seem to separate Sen and Nussbaum.

Nussbaum’s two philosophical justifications are the non-Platonic substantive good approach (that is, intuitionism) and a limited role of proceduralism (that is, discourse ethics)–which are a point of contention amongst critics. According to the former, the primary justification for the capabilities approach, we test various ethical theories against our fixed intuitions and decide which theory best matches them. Nussbaum contends that the theory that best represents our intuitions is the capabilities approach. The intuition that grounds the capabilities, according to Nussbaum, is the intuition of a dignified human life whereby people have the capability to pursue their conception of the good in cooperation with others. Consider her example of a person’s fixed intuition that rape is damaging to human dignity. She claims if one matches that intuition against all ethical theories that it will be best represented by the capabilities approach.

One may have reservations for this justification in situations where a person has underdeveloped (that is, intuitions that have not been challenged by competing intuitions) or mistaken intuitions. In response, Nussbaum argues that underdeveloped and mistaken intuitions must be rejected, and replaced with diversely experienced people who have tested their intuitions against competing beliefs. Although Nussbaum notes the primacy of intuitionism, she also argues that proceduralism has an ancillary justification for the capabilities approach.

Nussbaum’s proceduralism begins not with an intuition, but with a decision procedure, and it is the procedure that confers justification on the outcome. She is sympathetic to this form of proceduralism since it is rooted in Kantian discourse ethics (adopted by Jean Hampton), and has accordingly built into it a conception of equal human worth. In that sense proceduralism is similar to the intuitionist justification. However, there are stark contrasts. What is proceduralism, then? The version Nussbaum is concerned with claims that one consults the desires or preferences of another who is impacted by the outcome of the decision at hand. Similar to the concern above, Nussbaum fears that many people’s desires (like intuitions) will be corrupt, and thus produce a morally repugnant conclusion. Therefore, she seeks not just any desires, but ‘informed desires,’ that is, desires constructed by treating people with dignity. However, because not all desires are informed, and yet proceduralism calls for us to consult all desires affected by the decision, the capabilities approach would be placed on too weak of a foundation. Thus, in virtue of all the mistaken desires, proceduralism merely plays an ancillary role. Yet, it’s fair to say that if everyone had informed desires, then Nussbaum would grant proceduralism as a primary justification for the capabilities approach.

These two justifications are meant to be mutually reinforcing. They are meant to justify both the capabilities approach qua theory and the particular list of central capabilities put forth by Nussbaum. However, due to the limitations Nussbaum places on proceduralism, we must rely on intuitionism as the main justification.

3. Nussbaum’s List of Central Capabilities


There is much debate over whether Nussbaum’s list of central capabilities is revisable, and thus subject to change, or whether it is a fixed set of capabilities that cannot be compromised. Earlier in her career, Nussbaum (1995) argued that her list was static, however, she has since backed off such a claim and acknowledged the possibility that they could be altered. From her book, Women and Human Development: The Capabilities Approach (WHD hereafter), here is her list of capabilities, along with a brief description of each.

1. Life – Able to live to the end of a normal length human life, and to not have one’s life reduced to not worth living.

2. Bodily Health – Able to have a good life which includes (but is not limited to) reproductive health, nourishment and shelter.

3. Bodily Integrity – Able to change locations freely, in addition to, having sovereignty over one’s body which includes being secure against assault (for example, sexual assault, child sexual abuse, domestic violence and the opportunity for sexual satisfaction).

4. Senses, Imagination and Thought – Able to use one’s senses to imagine, think and reason in a ‘truly human way’–informed by an adequate education. Furthermore, the ability to produce self-expressive works and engage in religious rituals without fear of political ramifications. The ability to have pleasurable experiences and avoid unnecessary pain. Finally, the ability to seek the meaning of life.

5. Emotions – Able to have attachments to things outside of ourselves; this includes being able to love others, grieve at the loss of loved ones and be angry when it is justified.

6. Practical Reason – Able to form a conception of the good and critically reflect on it.

7. Affiliation

A. Able to live with and show concern for others, empathize with (and show compassion for) others and the capability of justice and friendship. Institutions help develop and protect forms of affiliation.

B. Able to have self-respect and not be humiliated by others, that is, being treated with dignity and equal worth. This entails (at the very least) protections of being discriminated on the basis of race, sex, sexuality, religion, caste, ethnicity and nationality. In work, this means entering relationships of mutual recognition.

8. Other Species – Able to have concern for and live with other animals, plants and the environment at large.

9. Play – Able to laugh, play and enjoy recreational activities.

10. Control over One’s Environment

A. Political – Able to effectively participate in the political life which includes having the right to free speech and association.

B. Material – Able to own property, not just formally, but materially (that is, as a real opportunity). Furthermore, having the ability to seek employment on an equal basis as others, and the freedom from unwarranted search and seizure.

Even though Nussbaum claims each of the ten capabilities is equally important, she places special emphasis on two of them–namely, practical reason and affiliation. We see the importance when she explicitly says the core behind the intuition of human functioning is that of a dignified free person who constructs her way of life in reciprocity with others, and not merely following, or being shaped by, others. Furthermore, Nussbaum notes that these two capabilities suffuse all the others, and this in turn, constitutes a truly human pursuit.

Furthermore, Nussbaum argues that the list is ‘thick,’ but ‘vague.’ It is thick because it provides a specific conception of the good life (that is, human flourishing), however, it is not thick enough that it mandates how one ought to live one’s life. Thus, the capabilities list is ‘thick’ enough to allow us to make cross-cultural judgments (for example, identifying areas where an individual or groups of people are unable to actualize a capability), and yet ‘vague’ enough for an individual to choose whether or not (or how) she wishes to participate in a capability.

Finally, Nussbaum says that citizens should be guaranteed a social minimum whereby capabilities can be realized. It is the role of institutions to ensure that a threshold level of central capabilities is achieved. Institutions (for example, religious, labor, government, and so forth) come in many forms, and protect various interests. For example, the Self Employed Women’s Association (SEWA) helps women provide protection and benefits for work in which they have been traditionally underappreciated. However, as Nussbaum notes, achieving the threshold may not be enough for justice.

4. The Relationship between the Capabilities Approach and Other Ethical Theories

The ethical theories that have dominated Western philosophy include (in one form or another) virtue ethics, consequentialism and deontology. The capabilities cannot be reduced to any of those ethical theories, however, it is indebted more or less to each of them. This section will review Rawls and human rights, both of which have numerous deontological underpinnings, and communitarianism which is closely linked with ethics. Finally, this section will include a section on Michael Boylan’s ‘table of embeddedness’ in order to see the challenges and parallels between it and Nussbaum’s list of capabilities. This section will explore parallels and differences between the capabilities approach and the above ethical theories.

a. Virtue Ethics

Even though there are clear differences between the virtue tradition (specifically, Aristotle) and the capabilities approach, Nussbaum uses the former as a point of departure. That is, Aristotle is the foundation for the capabilities approach because Nussbaum seeks a theory that provides the opportunity for human beings to use their powers to flourish in a truly human way.

Virtue ethics, broadly speaking, like the capabilities approach, claims human beings should exercise their powers qua human in attempt in order to live well. Contemporary neo-Aristotelians strive to explicate an account of flourishing  which may entail providing a naturalistic account of flourishing or through empirical psychology. Nussbaum, however, interprets Aristotle’s account of functioning as merely a moral concept and not naturalistic). However, unlike other neo-Aristotelians (and Aristotle himself), Nussbaum has no intention of providing a comprehensive doctrine of human flourishing, although, as noted above, she believes she is providing a tentatively comprehensive list of capabilities.

There is another stark contrast between virtue ethics and the capabilities approach–namely, character building and motivation. Nussbaum is less concerned with why people perform certain actions, and building one’s character over a period of time through proper motivations, and more concerned with providing the proper space that allows an individual to use her powers to fulfill a capability, if she chooses. One should not mistake this claim to mean that Nussbaum is not concerned with motivation at all, but rather this should be viewed as a shift in emphasis. Nussbaum argues in WHD that informed desires (that is, the justification for the capabilities approach) cannot be any desire, but those which contribute to living well. For example, even though one may fulfill the capability of practical reason through education, one should not use it in such a way that coerces others. Such a desire would be condemned by Nussbaum since, on the one hand, it prevents the coerced person from participating in all the capabilities, and on the other, it does not reflect an informed one.

b. Communitarianism

Communitarianism is a critique of liberal theory, and, on the other, emphasizes the importance of political norms within a community. In brief, liberal theorists contend that a self is ahistorical, asocial and apolitical.  Thus it is not necessarily the case that it will be burdened by the practices and beliefs of its community. Michael Sandel, a nationalist-communitarian, explains that a liberal self is ‘unencumbered’–that is, it is not wedded to a particular conception of the good not of its choosing. This abstract ontology allows liberals to make certain moves in the political sphere. For example, the concept of ‘justice’ entails universal normative claims since all human beings are ontologically the same.

In contrast, Alasdair MacIntyre, a communitarian indebted to Aristotle, argues against liberal political theory beginning with their conception of the self. He says a self is embedded within a particular set of cultural beliefs, practices and history. MacIntyre, following Aristotle, claims that in order for one to live a good life, one must be virtuous. A virtue, according to MacIntyre (2007), is a character trait that allows us to achieve goods that are internal to one’s practices By ‘practice,’ he is referring to a “socially established cooperative human activity through which goods internal to that form of activity are realized in the course of trying to achieve those standards of excellence….”  Thus, living a good life entails being virtuous within the context of a given practice (or community).

Furthermore, communitarians believe justice is limited to communities rather than human beings at large. This, in turn, allows them to reject the notion that we can make universal normative judgments. Finally, MacIntyre believes we need extend our conception of virtue from the individual to the community. It’s a bit unclear what a virtuous community would look like exactly, however, we know that it would have a conception of the good life in which people strive. This is clearly contrary to the liberal project in which, , individuals pursue whatever conception of the good they wish as long as they do not interfere or harm another.

Nussbaum is sympathetic to communitarianism insofar as it acknowledges the importance of local traditions and practices that shape our lives. For example, a Hindi woman in India will have a set of beliefs that shape who she is that differs from a Protestant male in the United States. However, Nussbaum ultimately rejects communitarianism. In her section entitled “Defending Universal Values” from WHD, she says communitarians fail to recognize that there is a conception of the individual that is not indebted to a particular metaphysical tradition. She argues that each person should be treated as an end, worthy of respect, dignity and honor. As mentioned in section II, Nussbaum believes the capabilities is founded on the intuition that each person is worthy of a dignified life, and this intuition holds irrespective of one’s community.

c. Deontology

In putting forth her ancillary justification for the capabilities, Nussbaum is indebted to Jean Hampton’s Kantian proceduralism. Nussbaum (2000) believes we need a “Kantian conception of human worth that prominently includes the ideas of equal worth and nonaggregation” (Nussbaum’s italics,). There are two points to take from this claim. First, she is indebted to the Kantian notion that all human beings have intrinsic worth, and as a result, they should always be treated as an end and never merely as a means. Second, she is critiquing the consequentialist argument for aggregate utility. We saw her specific problems with this argument immediately above.

Although Nussbaum is clearly indebted to deontology since it is a justification (albeit auxiliary) for the capabilities, there remains questions to what extent Kant plays a role. David Crocker (2008) argues that her Kantian equal-worth commitment is nothing more than an addition onto her Aristotelianism since the latter justifies moral and political inequality.

d. Rawls’ The Law of Peoples


John Rawls uses the same methodology (and preserves the liberal ontological framework of ‘autonomy’ and ‘reason’) in The Law of Peoples as in A Theory of Justice however, he has extended justice to a global scale rather than merely nationally. Beginning with the ‘global original position,’ Rawls argues that all reasonable (or decent) persons would construct political ideals that benefit all liberal peoples; these ideals would be reached via overlapping consensus. See Daniels (1989) and Pogge (1989) for further discussion on Rawls’ original position. A liberal, democratic society, according to Rawls (1999), would include the following benefits: (1) fair equality of opportunity–including, education, (2) a decent distribution of income, (3) society as employer of last resort through general or local government, (4) basic health care for all citizens and (5) public financing of elections (p. 50).

Rawls (1999) claims that the policies constructed by liberal peoples should direct non-liberal societies to (ideally) all become liberal. Rawls deems an illiberal society which rejects the possibility of becoming liberal (for example, abiding by human rights regulations) as an ‘outlaw state.’ While liberal societies should attempt to tolerate illiberal societies initially, he contends an outlaw state eventually subjects itself to severe sanctions and possible intervention

Nussbaum is indebted to not only Rawls specifically, but often praises the values of liberalism. First, she is committed to Rawls’ method of ‘overlapping consensus’ insofar as it is politically advantageous to perform such tasks as fairly distributing primary goods. Furthermore, Nussbaum (2000) respects Rawls attentiveness to “pluralism and paternalism” while remaining committed to the importance of basic liberties Finally, Nussbaum agrees with Rawls (and liberalism more generally) that we should treat people as dignified human beings, and respect their autonomy qua individual.

Nussbaum is also critical of Rawls beginning with his reluctance to make comparisons of well-being. Rawls refuses to make comparisons since each person constructs their conception of the good, so a person may be satisfied with their way of life even though another may find it unsatisfactory. While there may be fears of paternalism, Nussbaum is clear that we should make comparisons of well-being in order to grant certain areas as needing more resources than others. From this, Nussbaum (2000) criticizes Rawls for not taking seriously enough how greatly individuals vary in their needs. Consider her example. If we are concerned with spending resources on increasing literacy rates around the world, we will have to spend much more on women than men given the discrepancy between them. However, Nussbaum argues that Rawls’ approach could not properly address the obstacles when distributing resources since he is merely concerned with resource-distribution, and not cognizant of the variations of distribution within a particular region.

e. Human Rights

The rhetoric of human rights has arguably been more powerful than any other approach to global justice. There is debate amongst human rights advocates in regards to the origin of rights, how they are manifested (that is, who possess them), their possibility of group distribution and how they ought to be enforced. Nonetheless, human rights are universal political norms that belong to every individual simply in virtue of being human. It does not matter whether one belongs to one affiliation or another; but merely in virtue of being a human being, she is guaranteed minimal norms (for example, the right to life or liberty). These are minimal insofar as they are not connected with any conception of the good life, and thus, do not preclude any groups of people (or communities). For further discussion on the nature of human rights see Griffin (2008) and Donnelly (2003).

Alan Gewirth, in The Community of Rights, attempts to make human rights compatible with communities. We can see the difficulty of such a task given the commitment the communitarianism theorists have to a common good, on the one hand, and a value-neutral approach from rights, on the other. Nonetheless, Gewirth argues that if a community does not uphold a doctrine of human rights, then it ought to be rejected as a legitimate community. Gewirth puts forth a theory of human rights while respecting the role communities play in our lives. Furthermore, Will Kymlicka (1989) extends the concept of rights by constructing a theory of rights that considers communities or group rights.

In WHD, Nussbaum directly addresses the “very close” relationship between human rights and the capabilities approach. She believes the capabilities approach has advantages over human rights insofar as it can take a clear position on issues the latter cannot in addition to providing a clear goal. For example, human rights theorists often disagree on the origin and foundation of rights, whereas the capabilities approach, according to Nussbaum, is not plagued by such criticisms. She raises two concerns for why we should reject human rights in favor of the capabilities approach, and then provides four key roles for human rights.

Nussbaum first claims that human rights proponents often make rights claims in regards to property or economic advantage (for example, they have a right to shelter). However, in converting a language of rights to capabilities, she explains that this statement becomes problematic insofar as it can be understood in many ways including resources, utility and capabilities. The human rights tradition would discuss it in terms of resources; however, merely providing resources does not necessarily raise everyone to the same level of capability in order to allow them to fulfill their function. Second, the language of capability ethics does not contain all the baggage that pertains to human rights.  Although Nussbaum rejects the understanding that human rights are often characterized as simply being Western, she also says the capabilities approach avoids the troubles surrounding this debate.

Even though Nussbaum is critical of human rights, she believes is plays an essential role in global ethics. She presents the following four roles (or advantages) of human rights. First, human rights have the advantage of showing the urgency to claims of injustice. Second, human rights (as of now) have rhetorical power. Third, human rights place value on people’s autonomy. Finally, human rights preserve a sense of agreement insofar as it purports norms that apply to everyone.

f. Consequentialism

It would be easy to mistake the capabilities approach as a consequentialist argument to increase the overall utility in the world, where ‘utility’ can be understood in many ways–including ‘happiness.’ Peter Singer (1972), in his influential work, “Famine, Affluence and Morality,” puts forth arguments fighting global poverty from a consequentialist standpoint. In sum, he argues through a series of objections and replies that those in positions of material power should donate to those in less favorable conditions in order to increase the overall utility (and ultimately decrease poverty) throughout the world. It can be said that that Singer’s consequentialism and the capabilities approach are similar insofar as they both more or less seek to directly reduce poverty, and furthermore, provide more opportunities for those who have few or none.

However, Nussbaum (2000) provides three reasons for why consequentialism is different from the capabilities approach. First, one major difference is for whom the ethical theory accounts. On the one hand, consequentialism is interested in maximizing the utility of everyone (that is, the aggregate). On the other, the capabilities approach is interested in the individual. For example, Nussbaum says that the aggregative solution does not tell us who are the bottom and top, that is, who has control over material goods and whether or not someone else deserves a share of it. Thus, by focusing on the individual, we are able to best identify who needs resources and how much.

Second, related to the above point, consequentialism tends to ignore cross-cultural differences, that is, ignoring the fact that people live vastly different lives. As consequentialism is concerned with overall utility (and not merely particular persons or groups of people), it may ignore a particular good that is minimized in one culture, but widely present in another. Put differently, there are many goods–including education and religion–that are highly important to some and relatively unimportant to others. Consequentialism aggregates all goods under the heading of ‘utility,’ and thus, we are unable to identify which goods must be properly distributed to a particular region. The capabilities approach, however, is not only interested in allowing groups of people to use their power to fulfill a capability, but in each individual person to partake in a capability.

Finally, consequentialism ignores relevant aspects of individuals including emotions (that is, how individuals feel about what is happening to them) and what they are able to do or be (that is, fulfill a capability). This critique tends to be associated with consequentialism at large (and not specifically from the capabilities approach), but it is still worth noting. Since the capabilities strive for human flourishing, which entails the ability to express emotions without fear, we can understand why Nussbaum reiterates this critique.

g. Boylan’s Table of Embeddedness

Michael Boylan, in A Just Society, presents a ‘table of embeddedness,’ which is meant to describe a hierarchy of goods. Boylan’s argument for the table can be seen as follows: if people desire to be good, and becoming good requires action, then all people desire to act; the following table presents the interconnectedness between Boylan’s preconditions for actions and a hierarchy of goods.

Boylan (2004) splits the table into two levels–basic goods and secondary goods. The former, on the one hand, is broken further into ‘most deeply embedded’ goods (for example, food, clothing, shelter and free from being harmed) and ‘deeply embedded’ goods (for example, literate, basic math skills, treated with self-respect, and so forth). On the other hand, Boylan divides the latter into ‘life enhancing’ goods (for example, societal respect, equal opportunity and equal political participation), ‘useful’ goods (for example, property, gain from one’s labor and pursue goods owned by the general public such as a cell phone) and ‘luxurious’ goods (for example, pursue pleasant goods such as vacationing and use one’s will to possess a large portion of society’s resources). Even though society has no duty to provide ‘useful’ or ‘luxurious’ goods, it has an obligation to provide basic goods and life enhancing goods (from the secondary goods) to its members. Finally, in striving for equal respect, Boylan claims society may have to spend greater resources on those who are disadvantaged; in doing so Nussbaum would be sympathetic to Boylan’s claim that some groups of people require disproportionally more resources given their unfortunate circumstances than another. This was her critique of Rawls–namely, that he did not account for the varying needs of individuals. Furthermore, Nussbaum would also grant that society has an obligation to provide its citizens with Boylan’s basic goods such as food, shelter and water. However, the roles in which each list plays will be different given how their respective authors understand its purpose.

Nussbaum’s list, unlike Boylan’s, is not hierarchal, but rather everyone ought to have equal opportunity to perform a function that fulfills a capability. In other words, no capability, according to Nussbaum, is more essential than another. Marcus Düwell (2009) provides two criticisms of this view. First, he claims a lack of hierarchy of goods (or capabilities) raises concerns about its practical guidance in “morally contested topics.” Even though Nussbaum argues that no primacy should be given to a particular capability, it’s worth noting that it would be difficult to fulfill the capability of ‘bodily integrity,’ for example, if one’s capability of life is taken away. Second, it also raises concerns to what extent the capabilities are “foundational moral obligations for others.”

5. Philosophical Criticisms of the Capabilities Approach

The capabilities approach has endured many criticisms since its inception. The primary critique is constructed from the feminist and non-Western perspective. This entry will focus on Alison Jaggar’s critique since it embodies many concerns of power relations. Meanwhile, the latter critique can be found in many theorists, but the focus of this entry will be limited to Bernard Williams since he puts forth two challenges in attempt to seek the nature of a capability. Jaggar’s criticisms are limited to Nussbaum, and Williams’ critique is directed primarily towards Sen. This will provide a greater array of criticisms for the capabilities theory in general.

a. Illiberal and Neo-Colonialist

Alison Jaggar criticizes both Nussbaum’s justifications for the capabilities approach and her list. Jaggar believes Nussbaum may have ignored power asymmetries that exist between not only men and women, but also Western and non-Western peoples. She argues that the intuitionist and proceduralist justifications seem to be neo-colonialist and illiberal.

First, Jaggar (2006) argues that Nussbaum’s theory appears to be neo-colonialist insofar as those in power have the “final authority…to assess the moral worth of…[other's] voices”. This is problematic for the intuitionist justification since those who possess intuitions that do not match the capabilities list, for example, will be interpreted and possibly jettisoned. Put differently, there are no mechanisms in Nussbaum’s approach that allow us to encourage self-criticism from those who possess the list. Furthermore, Jaggar emphasizes that Nussbaum is committed to a politically liberal project (that is, considering everyone’s intuitions), however, the intuitionist justification paradoxically dismisses ideas that do not match the theory put forth by Nussbaum, and thus, it illiberally disregards others. In order for Nussbaum’s theory to encourage self-criticism, she must include all intuitions.

Second, the capabilities list seems to be illiberal since “other voices” (that is, mistaken or uninformed desires) are not ready for a proceduralist justification. Since Nussbaum demands only informed desires participate in the proceduralist justification for the list, desires that do not match the list will be unable to partake in the discourse. Furthermore, because these voices are silenced, there may be capabilities missing from the list or capabilities on the list that ought to be challenged. Regardless, they will be left untouched.

In sum, Jaggar criticizes Nussbaum’s justifications for the capabilities approach since they ignore asymmetrical power relationships. Jaggar believes that even though Nussbaum claims to be paying attention to such relations, she paradoxically fails to produce a theory that yields an outcome that is cognizant of power. It’s worth noting, though, that Jaggar does not believe these criticisms ultimately entail rejecting the capabilities. Rather, she believes that placing discourse ethics as the main justification for the capabilities may allow the theory to be self-critical, and thus, fully aware of power dynamics.

b. What Is a Capability?

Williams’ (1987) primary concern of the capabilities approach is trying to understand what is meant by a ‘capability.’ In pursuing this inquiry, he believes Sen in particular, but capabilities proponents in general, are unclear on the relationship between ‘choice’ and ‘capability.’ Williams does not provide knock-down arguments against the capabilities, but rather poses two challenges for the capabilities theorist to consider.

First, Williams asks what it means to have the capability to do X? Consider his example. If a person is posted once a year to a desirable holiday resort, does she have the capability to go? In a trivial sense, “yes,” but not in a meaningful way (that is, in a way that contributes to the well-being of an individual). If the term ‘capability’ is understood merely as ‘possibility,’ then it could be granted that she has the capability to go, although, there is still something missing–namely, the ability to choose whether or not to go. This example is meant to illustrate the correlation between capabilities and choice. That is, according to Williams, in this case a capability cannot exist without the option to choose it. However, consider Sen’s example where a capability exists without the ability to choose it. Sen, in his Tanner Lectures, notes that the life expectancy is higher in China than India. He believes this example shows that the higher one’s life expectancy the higher the capability of a standard of living. In response to this claim William asks, what capability is increased by a greater life expectancy? He poses this question since it might be the case that living longer only contributes to one having more time to contemplate whether to commit suicide. In this example, Williams is pointing out the problems with the relationship of a capability that completely lacks choice.

Second, and related to the above challenge, William questions the relationship of the capability of doing X to the actual ability to do X here and now. He notes that the ‘actual ability to do X’ can be understood as ‘can do X.’ In other words, if a person possesses the capability to do X, then it must be the case that she can do X. Consider Sen’s example of the capability of breathing unpolluted air. He would argue that if a person has the capability to breathe unpolluted air, then she can do so. Williams grants that a person living in Los Angeles cannot breathe unpolluted air here and now, however, that is not to say she cannot do so at all. In other words, this person has the capability to breathe unpolluted air, but she cannot do it here and now; this position is contrary, though, to Sen’s claim above that if one has the capability to do X, she can do X. Because she has the capability to breathe unpolluted air, she should move to a place where it is possible to do so. Williams argues, though, that there are large costs associated with moving to a place where she can breathe unpolluted air. Let’s assume that person does not have the economic means to do so. Does this person really have the capability, then, to breathe unpolluted air?–logically speaking, “yes,” however, certainly not in any meaningful sense. By considering the opportunity costs associated with a capability such as breathing unpolluted air, some capabilities may become nearly impossible for many to acquire. Thus, Williams argues it is not simply because one can do X that one has the capability to do X.

6. Philosophical Applications

The capabilities approach is often discussed in terms of providing opportunities (Sen) and using human powers (Nussbaum). More often than not it is an argument to reduce poverty or increase the well-being of people around the globe. Recently, it has provided the framework to further advance arguments in other areas of applied ethics including business ethics, the environment, disability ethics and animal ethics. This entry will merely focus on the environment and disability ethics because it calls attention to how far the capabilities approach can be extended.

a. The Environment

The biggest challenge facing capabilities theorists in regards to the environment is on the area of emphasis. The goal of the capabilities–whether Sen or Nussbaum–is human flourishing or well-being. It is never simply understood as non-human or ecological flourishing. Of course, this is not to say that the capabilities approach has nothing to say about the environment, or worse, that it must harm it in order for human beings to flourish, although, there are obstacles standing in the way when putting forth not only an environmentally friendly capabilities approach, but one in which environmental flourishing is taken just as seriously as human flourishing.

There seems to be two ways in which we can approach environmental ethics from a capabilities perspective. By briefly examining each solution, we will have a broader perspective of how the capabilities approach begins to asses environmental concerns. First, one may begin with the capabilities list, and show how environmental values relate to human flourishing. Recall Nussbaum’s eighth capability (out of ten): Other species have the ability to have a concern for and live with others animals, plants and the environment at large. There are two points we can take from this capability. First, Nussbaum believes the environment clearly plays a role in human flourishing otherwise she would not have included it as a capability. Even though the environment seems to be playing an instrumental role insofar as it contributes to human flourishing, it is nonetheless an essential capability. Furthermore, Nussbaum’s list is beneficial because she believes it should be implemented as public policy which would force countries that do not take the environmental capability seriously to reconsider their current policies. Second, however, Victoria Kamsler (2006) recalls that she places it eighth on the list which, she argues, is hard to deny that it is given less emphasis than on almost all the other capabilities. In defense of Nussbaum, she notes that all the capabilities are meant to be mutually reinforcing, and thus, the dignity of a human being as truly human cannot be met without taking environment flourishing seriously.

Second, rather than starting with the list and placing instrumental value on the environment, one may begin with a general account of flourishing that can be applied to non-human beings such as animals and the environment. Here, the environment is understood as being intrinsically valuable (that is, valuable independent of human beings). Kamsler notes that Nussbaum believes the “most basic intuition behind [the] capability theory… ‘wants to see each thing flourish as the sort of thing that it is’”. In other words, the environment qua capability must be treated as an entity that must flourish in its own right, and not merely for the value it provides human beings.

There still remains a lingering question about the relationship between the environment and the capabilities approach. If the capability is understood as anthropocentric insofar as it is concerned with human flourishing, what should we do when the environment impedes such flourishing? In other words, there seem to be cases in which being concerned with the environment’s flourishing will directly conflict with human flourishing (for example, the capability of work and protecting forests). Kamsler addresses this conflict when she says that the only way to overcome this seemingly tragic dilemma is through technological and political means. This is not to say that it will not be costly or conflict with other capabilities, but it is a solution that goes beyond being complacent with the dilemma.

b. Disability Ethics

A person cannot be said to flourish, according to the capabilities approach, if she is unable to perform functions that partake in the capabilities. This raises interesting questions with people who have disabilities insofar as they may be either physically or mentally impaired from having the ability to perform many functions. Nussbaum has given this topic ample discussion through her Tanner Lectures and various publications.

Nussbaum addresses the question of disabilities via the capabilities approach through her list. Her early formulation of the capabilities list excluded many people from the ability to live a truly human life since she required such a life to include using all five senses, for example. She has since retracted from such bold statements. However, Nussbaum (1995) does note that it would be difficult to imagine a person living a truly human life with total lack of the senses, imagination and reasoning.

Nussbaum (2002) has extended her account of functioning in a truly human way (that is, for human dignity) “as containing many different types of animal dignity, all of which deserve respect and even wonder”. In other words, she believes the mentally disabled can gain dignity not merely from rationality, but also through support for the “capabilities of life, health, and bodily integrity. It will also provide stimulation for senses, imagination and thought” This passage indicates a clear responsibility on the state to not only allow for such stimulation of the senses to occur, but to actually provide the resources for such stimulation to occur.

There are interesting questions about how to implement policies that provide the best opportunity for disabled peoples to perform functions that fulfill capabilities. Nussbaum heralds the Individuals with Disabilities Education Act (IDEA) as a way to understand how the capabilities can be manifested in the current education system. IDEA is a disabilities act that begins with the idea of human individuality. Instead of lumping all disabled students into one group, each student is taken on a case-by-case basis. This approach in turn, allows for each student to receive the proper care she needs. This Act does not focus on education being a ‘human right’ because that would entail the goal of merely providing an education to the student, that is, ensuring she receives an education in one form or another. What makes this Act uniquely indebted to the capabilities is its commitment to providing the opportunity for the students to use their powers qua human beings to fulfill their functions in a truly human way–for example, via their senses, imagination and thought.

7. United Nations Development Program

The UNDP is an organization built on the theoretical principles of the capabilities approach. Its goals include helping countries best address solutions pertaining to democratic governance, poverty reduction, crisis prevention and recovery, environment and energy and HIV/AIDS. The organization is clear that none of these solutions will ever come at the expense of women since they are an advocate of empowering women. The four solutions listed here are designed to assist the various challenges facing nations. However, there are eight concrete goals the UNDP is interested in achieving.

The UNDP has put forth eight Millennium Development Goals (MDGs). The MDGs include the following: (1) eradicate extreme poverty and hunger, (2) achieve universal primary education, (3) promote gender equality and empower women, (4) reduce child mortality, (5) improve maternal health, (6) combat HIV/AIDS, malaria and other diseases, (7) ensure environmental sustainability and (8) develop a global partnership for development. The success or failure of achieving these goals is based on a measurement from the Human Development Report (HDR).

The HDR is designed to measure the ways in which people can live up to their full potential in accordance with their desires and interests. Mahbub ul Haq, founder of the HDR, says “the basic purpose of development is to enlarge people’s choices…[which include] greater access to knowledge, better nutrition and health services, more secure livelihoods, security against crime and physical violence, satisfying leisure hours, political and cultural freedoms and sense of participation in community activities.” There are two points to take from this. First, it is clear that the theoretical aspects of the capabilities approach have been preserved upon measuring the MDGs. Second, the HDR is not committed to merely measuring wealth, but rather providing the opportunities for a person to fulfill any of the capabilities she is interested in pursuing.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Appiah, Kwame A. (2006) Cosmopolitanism: Ethics in a World of Strangers, W.W. Norton: NY.
  • Benhabib, Seyla (1995) “Cultural Complexity, Moral Interdependence, and the Global Dialogical Community” in Women, Culture and Development, Martha C. Nussbaum and Jonathan Glover (eds.), Clarendon Press: Oxford.
  • Boylan, Micahel (2004) A Just Society, Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc: Lanham, MD.
  • Crocker, David (2008) Ethics of Global Development: Agency, Capability and Deliberative Democracy, Cambridge University Press: NY.
  • Daniels, Norman (1989) Reading Rawls: Critical Studies on Rawls’ “A Theory of Justice,” Stanford University Press: Stanford, CA.
  • Donnelly, Jack (2003) Universal Human Rights in Theory and Practice, Cornell University Press: Ithaca.
  • Düwell, Marcus (2009) “On the Possibility of a Hierarchy of Moral Goods,” in Morality and Justice: Reading Boylan’s A Just Society, John-Steward Gordon (ed.), Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc: Lanham, MD.
  • Gewirth, Alan (1978) Reason and Morality, The University of Chicago Press: Chicago, IL.
  • Gewirth, Alan (1996) The Community of Rights, The University of Chicago Press: Chicago, IL.
  • Griffin, James (2008) On Human Rights, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
  • Jaggar, Alison (2006) “Reasoning About Well-Being: Nussbaum’s Methods of Justifying the Capabilities,” The Journal of Political Philosophy, 14:3, 301-322.
  • Kymlicka, Will (1989) Liberalism, Community and Culture, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair (1988) Whose Justice? Which Rationality?, University of Notre Dame Press, Notre Dame, IN.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair (2007) After Virtue, Notre Dame University Press: Notre Dame, IN.
  • Nussbaum, Martha (1995), “Human Capabilities, Female Human Beings,” in Women, Culture, and Development: A Study of Human Capabilities, Martha C. Nussbaum and Jonathan Glover (eds.), Clarendon Press: Oxford.
  • Nussbaum, Martha (2000) Women and Human Development: The Capabilities Approach, Cambridge University Press: Cambridge, MA.
  • Nussbaum, Martha (2002) “Capabilities and Disabilities: Justice for Mentally Disabled Citizens,” Philosophical Topics, 30:2, 133-165.
  • O’Neill, Onora (1996) Towards Justice and Virtue: A Constructive Account of Practical Reason, Cambridge University Press: Cambridge, MA.
  • Pogge, Thomas W. (1989) Realizing Rawls, Cornell University Press, Ithaca.
  • Rawls, John (1999) A Theory of Justice, Harvard University Press: Cambridge, MA.
  • Rawls, John (1999) The Law of Peoples, Harvard University Press: Cambridge, MA.
  • Sandel, Michael (1996) Democracy’s Discontent: America in Search of a Public Philosophy, Harvard University Press: Cambridge, MA.
  • Sandel, Michael J. (1982) Liberalism and the Limits of Justice, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge.
  • Sen, A. K. (1985) “Well-being, Agency and Freedom: the Dewey Lectures,” Journal of Philosophy, 82:4, 169-221.
  • Sen, Amartya K. (1987) The Standard of Living: The Tanner Lectures, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sen, Amartya (2009) The Idea of Justice, Harvard University Press: Cambridge, MA.
  • Singer, Peter (1972) “Famine, Affluence, and Morality,” Philosophy and Public Affairs, 1:1, 229-243.
  • Kamsler, Victoria (2006) “Attending to nature: capabilities and the environment,” in Capabilities Equality: Basic issues and problems (ed.) Alexander Kaufman, Routledge: NY, 198-213.
  • Williams, Bernard (1987), “The Standard of Living: Interests and Capabilities,” in The Standard of Living (ed.), Geoffrey Hawthorn, Cambridge University Press: Cambridge, 94-102.

Author Information

Chad Kleist
Marquette University
U. S. A.

Categories: Value Misc.