René Girard (1923 – )
René Girard’s thought defies classification. He has written from the perspective of a wide variety of disciplines: Literary Criticism, Psychology, Anthropology, Sociology, History, Biblical Hermeneutics and Theology. Although he rarely calls himself a philosopher, many philosophical implications can be derived from his work. Girard’s work is above all concerned with Philosophical Anthropology (that is, ‘What is it to be human?’), and draws from many disciplinary perspectives. Over the years he has developed a mimetic theory. According to this theory human beings imitate each other, and this eventually gives rise to rivalries and violent conflicts. Such conflicts are partially solved by a scapegoat mechanism, but ultimately, Christianity is the best antidote to violence.
Perhaps Girard’s lack of specific disciplinary affiliation has promoted a slight marginalization of his work among contemporary philosophers. Girard is not on par with more well known French contemporary philosophers (for example Derrida, Foucault, Deleuze, Lyotard), but his work is becoming increasingly recognized in the humanities, and his commitment as a Christian thinker has given him prominence among theologians.
Table of Contents
- Mimetic Desire
- The Scapegoat Mechanism
- The Uniqueness of the Bible and Christianity
- Theological Implications
- References and Further Reading
René Girard was born on December 25, 1923, in Avignon, France. He was the son of a local archivist, and he went on to follow his father’s footsteps. He studied in Paris’ École Nationale des Chartes, and specialized in Medieval studies. In 1947, Girard took the opportunity to emigrate to America, and pursued a doctorate at the University of Indiana. His dissertation was on Americans’ opinions about France. Although his later work has had little to do with his doctoral dissertation, Girard has kept a live interest in French affairs.
After the completion of his doctorate, Girard began to take interest in Jean-Paul Sartre’s work. Although on a personal level Girard is still very much interested in Sartre’s philosophy, it has had little influence on his thought. Girard settled in America, and has taught at different institutions (Indiana University, State University of New York in Buffalo, Duke, Johns Hopkins, Bryn Mawr and Stanford) until his retirement in 1995.
During the beginning of his career as lecturer, Girard was assigned to teach courses on European literature; he admits he was not at all familiar with the great works of European novelists. As Girard began to read the great European novels in preparation for the course, he became especially engaged with the work of five novelists in particular: Cervantes, Stendhal, Flaubert, Dostoyevsky and Proust.
His first book, Mensonge Romantique et Vérité Romanesque (1961), is a literary comment on the works of these great novelists. Until that time, Girard was a self-declared agnostic. As he researched the religious conversions of some of Dostoyevsky’s characters, he felt he had lived a similar experience, and converted to Christianity. Ever since, Girard has been a committed and practicing Roman Catholic.
After the publication of his first book, Girard turned his attention to ancient and contemporary sacrifice rituals, as well as Greek myth and tragedy. This led to another important book, La Violence et le Sacré (1972), for which he gained much recognition. On a personal level, he was a committed Christian, but his Christian views were not publicly expressed until the publication of Des Choses Cachées Depuis la Fondation du Monde (1978), his magnum opus, and best systematization of his thought. Ever since, Girard has written books that expand various aspects of his work. In 2005, Girard was elected to the Académie Française, a very important distinction among French intellectuals.
Girard’s fundamental concept is ‘mimetic desire’. Ever since Plato, students of human nature have highlighted the great mimetic capacity of human beings; that is, we are the species most apt at imitation. Indeed, imitation is the basic mechanism of learning (we learn inasmuch as we imitate what our teachers do), and neuroscientists are increasingly reporting that our neural structure promotes imitation very proficiently (for example, ‘mirror neurons’).
However, according to Girard, most thinking devoted to imitation pays little attention to the fact that we also imitate other people’s desires, and depending on how this happens, it may lead to conflicts and rivalries. If people imitate each other’s desires, they may wind up desiring the very same things; and if they desire the same things, they may easily become rivals, as they reach for the same objects. Girard usually distinguishes ‘imitation’ from ‘mimesis’. The former is usually understood as the positive aspect of reproducing someone else’s behavior, whereas the latter usually implies the negative aspect of rivalry. It should also be mentioned that because the former usually is understood to refer to mimicry, Girard proposes the latter term to refer to the deeper, instinctive response that humans have to each other.
Girard calls ‘mediation’ the process in which a person influences the desires and preferences of another person. Thus, whenever a person’s desire is imitated by someone else, she becomes a ‘mediator’ or ‘model’. Girard points out that this is very evident in publicity and marketing techniques: whenever a product is promoted, some celebrity is used to ‘mediate’ consumers’ desires: in a sense, the celebrity is inviting people to imitate him in his desire of the product. The product is not promoted on the basis of its inherent qualities, but simply because of the fact that some celebrity desires it.
In his studies on literature, Girard highlights this type of relationship in his literary studies, as for example in his study of Don Quixote. Don Quixote is mediated by Amadis de Gaula. Don Quixote becomes an errant knight, not really because he autonomously desires so, but in order to imitate Amadis. Nevertheless, Amadis and Don Quixote are characters on different planes. They will never meet, and in such a manner, they never become rivals.
The same can be said of the relation between Sancho and Don Quixote. Sancho desires to be governor of an island, mostly because Don Quixote has suggested to Sancho that that is what he should desire. Again, although they interact continuously, Sancho and Don Quixote belong to two different worlds: Don Quixote is a very complex man, Sancho is simple in extreme. Girard calls ‘external mediation’ the situation when the mediator and the person mediated are on different planes. Don Quixote is an ‘external mediator’ to Sancho, inasmuch as he mediates his desires ‘from the outside’; that is, Don Quixote never becomes an obstacle in Sancho’s attempts to satisfy his desires.
External mediation does not carry the risk of rivalry between subjects, because they belong to different worlds. Although the source of Sancho’s desire to be governor of an island is in fact Don Quixote, they never desire the same object. Don Quixote desires things Sancho does not desire, and vice versa. Hence, they never become rivals. Girard believes ‘external mediation’ is a frequent feature of the psychology of desire: from our earliest phase as infants, we look up in imitation to our elders, and eventually, most of what we desire is mediated by them.
In ‘internal mediation’, the ‘mediator’ and the person mediated are no longer abysmally separated and hence, do not belong to different worlds. In fact, they come to resemble each other to the point that they end up desiring the same things. But, precisely because they are no longer on different worlds and now reach for the same objects of desire, they become rivals. We are fully aware that competition is fiercer when competitors resemble each other.
Thus, in internal mediation the subject imitates the model’s desires, but ultimately, unlike external mediation, the subject falls into rivalry with the model/mediator. Consider this example: a toddler imitates his father in his occupations, and he desires to pursue his father’s career when he grows up. This will hardly cause any rivalry (although it may account for Freud’s Oedipus Complex; see section 2.d). This is, as we have seen, a case of external mediation. But, now consider a PhD candidate that learns a great deal from his supervisor, and seeks to imitate every aspect of his work, and even his life. Eventually, they may become rivals, especially if both are looking for scholarly recognition. Or, consider further the case of a toddler that is playing with a toy, and another toddler that, out of imitation, desires that very same toy: they will eventually become rivals for the control of the toy. This is ‘internal mediation’; that is the person is mediated from the ‘inside’ of his world, and therefore, may easily become his mediator’s rival. This rivalry often has tragic consequences, and Girard considers this a major theme in modern novels. In Girard’s view, this literary theme is in fact a portrait of human nature: very often, people will desire something as a result of imitating other people, but eventually, this imitation will lead to rivalries with the very person imitated in the first place.
In Girard’s view, mimetic desire may grow to such a degree, that a person may eventually desire to be her mediator. Again, publicity is illustrative: sometimes, consumers do not just desire a product for its inherent qualities, but rather, desire to be the celebrity that promotes such a product. Girard considers that a person may desire an object only as part of a larger desire; that is, to be her mediator. Girard calls the desire to be other people, ‘metaphysical desire’. Furthermore, acquisitive desire leads to metaphysical desire, and the original object of desire becomes a token representing the “larger” desire of having the being of the model/rival.
Whereas external mediation does not lead to rivalries, internal mediation does lead to rivalries. But, metaphysical desire leads a person not just to rivalry with her mediator; actually, it leads to total obsession with and resentment of the mediator. For, the mediator becomes the main obstacle in the satisfaction of the person’s metaphysical desire. Inasmuch as the person desires to be his mediator, such desire will never be satisfied. For nobody can be someone else. Eventually, the person developing a metaphysical desire comes to appreciate that the main obstacle to be the mediator is the mediator himself.
According to Girard, metaphysical desire can be a very destructive force, as it promotes resentment against others. Girard considers that the anti-hero of Dostoyevsky’s Notes From the Underground is the quintessential victim of metaphysical desire: the unnamed character eventually goes on a crusade against the world, as he is disillusioned with everything around him. Girard believes that the origin of his alienation is his dissatisfaction with himself, and his obsession to be someone else; that is, an impossible task.
Girard’s career has been mostly devoted to literary criticism, and the analysis of fictional characters. Girard believes that the great modern novelists (such as Stendhal, Flaubert, Proust and Dostoevsky) have understood human psychology better than the modern field of Psychology does. And, as a complement of his literary criticism, he has developed a psychology in which the concept of ‘mimetic desire’ is central. Inasmuch as human beings constantly seek to imitate others, and most desires are in fact borrowed from other people, Girard believes that it is crucial to study how personality relates to others.
Departing from the main premise of mimetic desire, Girard has sought to reformulate some of psychology’s long-held assumptions. In particular, Girard seeks to reconsider some of Freud’s concepts. Although Girard has been careful enough to warn that Freud’s thought may be highly misleading in many ways, he has been engaged with Freud’s work in a number of ways. Girard admits that Freud and his followers had some good initial intuitions, but criticizes Freudian psychoanalytic theory on the grounds that it tends to obviate the role that other individuals have on the development of personality. In other words, psychoanalysis tends to assume that human beings are largely autonomous, and hence, do not desire in imitation of others.
Girard grants that Freud was a superb observer, but was not a good interpreter. And, in a sense, Girard accepts that there is such a thing as the Oedipus Complex: the child will eventually come to unconsciously have a sexual desire for his mother, and a desire to kill his father; and indeed, perhaps this complex will endure throughout adulthood. But, Girard considers that the Oedipus Complex is the result of a mechanism very different from the one outlined by Freud.
According to Freud, the child has an innate sexual desire towards the mother, and eventually, discovers that the father is an obstacle to the satisfaction of that desire. Girard, on the other hand, reinterprets the Oedipus Complex in terms of mimetic desire: the child becomes identified with his father and imitates him. But, inasmuch as he imitates his father, the child imitates the sexual desire for his mother. Then, his father becomes his model and rival, and that explains the ambivalent feelings so characteristic of the Oedipus Complex.
In Girard’s psychology, internal mediation and metaphysical desire eventually lead to rivalry and violence. Imitation eventually erases the differences among human beings, and inasmuch as people become similar to each other, they desire the same things, which leads to rivalries and a Hobbesian war of all against all. These rivalries soon bear the potential to threaten the very existence of communities. Thus, Girard asks: how is it possible for communities to overcome their internal strife?
Whereas the philosophers of the 18th century would have agreed that communal violence comes to an end due to a social contract, Girard believes that, paradoxically, the problem of violence is frequently solved with a lesser dose of violence. When mimetic rivalries accumulate, tensions grow ever greater. But, that tension eventually reaches a paroxysm. When violence is at the point of threatening the existence of the community, very frequently a bizarre psychosocial mechanism arises: communal violence is all of the sudden projected upon a single individual. Thus, people that were formerly struggling, now unite efforts against someone chosen as a scapegoat. Former enemies now become friends, as they communally participate in the execution of violence against a specified enemy.
Girard calls this process ‘scapegoating’, an allusion to the ancient religious ritual where communal sins were metaphorically imposed upon a he-goat, and this beast was eventually abandoned in the desert, or sacrificed to the gods (in the Hebrew Bible, this is especially prescribed in Leviticus 16).The person that receives the communal violence is a ‘scapegoat’ in this sense: her death or expulsion is useful as a regeneration of communal peace and restoration of relationships.
However, Girard considers it crucial that this process be unconscious in order to work. The victim must never be recognized as an innocent scapegoat (indeed, Girard considers that, prior to the rise of Christianity, ‘innocent scapegoat’ was virtually an oxymoron; see section 4.b below); rather, the victim must be thought of as a monstrous creature that transgressed some prohibition and deserved to be punished. In such a manner, the community deceives itself into believing that the victim is the culprit of the communal crisis, and that the elimination of the victim will eventually restore peace.
Girard believes that the scapegoat mechanism is the very foundation of cultural life. Natural man became civilized, not through some sort of rational deliberation embodied in a social contract, (as it was fashionable to think among 18th century philosophers) but rather, through the repetition of the scapegoat mechanism. And, very much as many philosophers of the 18th Century believed that their descriptions of the natural state were in fact historical, Girard believes that, indeed, Paleolithic men continually used the scapegoat mechanism, and it was precisely this feature what allowed them to lay the foundations of culture and civilization.
In fact, Girard believes that this process goes farther back in the evolution of Homo sapiens: hominids probably were engaged in scapegoating. But, it was precisely scapegoating what allowed a minimum of communal peace among early hominid groups. Hominids could eventually develop their main cultural traits due to the efficiency of the scapegoat mechanism. The murder of a victim brought forth communal peace, and this peace promoted the flourishing of the most basic cultural institutions.
Once again, Girard takes deep inspiration from Freud, but reinterprets his observations. Freud’s Totem and Taboo presents a thesis that the origins of culture are founded upon the original murder of a father figure by his sons. Girard considers that Freud’s observations were only partially correct. Freud is right in pointing out that indeed, culture is founded upon a murder. But, this murder is not due to the oedipal themes Freud was so fond of. Instead, the founding murder is due to the scapegoat mechanism. The horde murdered a victim (not necessarily a father figure) in order to project upon her all the violence that was threatening the very existence of the community.
However, as mimetic desire has been a constant among human beings, scapegoating has never been entirely efficient. Nevertheless, human communities need to periodically recourse to the scapegoating mechanism in order to maintain social peace.
According to Girard, the scapegoat mechanism brings about unexpected peace. But, this moment is so marvelous, that it soon acquires a religious overtone. Thus, the victim is immediately consecrated. Girard is in the French sociological tradition of Durkheim, who considered that religion essentially accomplishes the function of social integration. In Girard’s view, inasmuch as the deceased victim brings forth communal peace and restores social order and integration, she becomes sacred.
At first, while living, victims are considered to be monstrous transgressors that deserve to be punished. But, once they die, they bring peace to the community. Then, they are not monsters any longer, but rather gods. Girard highlights that, in most primitive societies, there is a deep ambivalence towards deities: they hold high virtues, but they are also capable of performing some very monstrous deeds. That is how, according to Girard, primitive gods are sanctified victims.
In such a manner, all cultures are founded upon a religious basis. The function of the sacred is to offer protection for the stability of communal peace. And, to do this, it ensures that the scapegoat mechanism provides its effects through the main religious institutions.
Girard considers rituals the earliest cultural and religious institution. In Girard’s view, ritual is a reenactment of the original scapegoating murder. Although, as anthropologists are quick to assert, rituals are very diverse, Girard considers that the most popular form of ritual is sacrifice. When a victim is ritually killed, Girard believes, the community is commemorating the original event that promoted peace.
The original victim was most likely a member of the community. Girard considers that, probably, earliest sacrificial rituals employed human victims. Thus, Aztec human sacrifice may have impacted Western conquistadors and missionaries upon its discovery, but this was a cultural remnant of a popular ancient practice. Eventually, rituals promoted sacrificial substitution, and animals were employed. In fact, Girard considers that hunting and the domestication of animals arose out of the need to continually reenact the original murder with substitute animal victims.
Following the old school of European anthropologists, Girard believes that myths are the narrative corollary of ritual. And, inasmuch as rituals are mainly a reenactment of the original murder, myths also recapitulate the scapegoating themes.
Now, Girard’s crucial point about the necessary unconsciousness of scapegoating: must be kept in mind in order for this mechanism to work, its participants must not recognize it as such. That is to say, the victim must never appear as what it really is: a scapegoat that is no guiltier of disturbance, than other members of the community.
The way to assure that scapegoats are not recognized as what they really are is by distorting the story of the events that led to their death. This is accomplished by telling the story from the perspective of the scapegoaters. Myths will usually tell a story of someone doing a terrible thing and, thus, deserving to be punished. The victim’s perspective will never be incorporated into the myth, precisely because this would spoil the psychological effect of the scapegoating mechanism. The victim will always be portrayed as a culprit whose deeds brought about social chaos, but whose death or expulsion brought about social peace.
Girard’s most recurrent example of myths is that of Oedipus. According to the myth, Oedipus was expelled from Thebes because he murdered his father and married his mother. But, according to Girard, the myth should be read as a chronicle written by a community that chose a scapegoat, blamed him of some crime, punished him, and once expelled, peace returned. Under Girard’s interpretation, the fact that there was a pest in Thebes is suggestive of a social crisis. To solve the crisis, Oedipus is selected as a scapegoat. But, he is never presented as such: quite the contrary, he is accused of parricide and incest, and this justifies his persecution. Thus, Oedipus’ perspective as a victim is suppressed from the myth.
Furthermore, Girard believes that, as myths evolve, later versions will tend to dissimulate the scapegoating violence (for example, instead of presenting a victim who dies by drowning, the myth will just claim that the victim went to live to the bottom of the sea), in order to avoid feeling compassion for the victim. Indeed, Girard considers that the evolution of myths may even reach a point where no violence is present. But, Girard insists, all myths are founded upon violence, and if no violence is found in a myth, it must be because the community made it disappear.
Myths are typical of archaic societies, but Girard thinks that modern societies have the equivalent of myths: persecution texts. Especially during the witch-hunts and persecution of Jews during the Middle Ages, there were plenty of chronicles written from the perspective of the mobs and witch-hunters. These texts told the story of a crisis that appeared as the consequence of some crime committed by a person or a minority. The author of the chronicle is part of the persecuting mob, as he projects upon the victim all the typical accusations, and justifies the mob’s actions. Modern lynching accounts are another prominent example of such persecutory dynamics.
Inasmuch as, under the scapegoaters’ view, there are no innocent scapegoats, an accusation must be made. In the case of Oedipus, he was accused of parricide and incest, and these are recurrent accusations to justify persecution (for example Maria Antoinette), but many other accusations are found (for example blood libels, witchcraft, and so forth). After the victim is executed, Girard claims, a prohibition falls upon the action allegedly perpetrated by the scapegoat. By doing so, the scapegoaters believe they restore social order. Thus, along with ritual and myths, prohibitions derive from the scapegoat mechanism.
Girard also considers that prior to the scapegoating mechanism, communities go through a process he calls a ‘crisis of differences’. Mimetic desire eventually makes every member resemble each other, and this lack of differentiation generates chaos. Traditionally, this indifferentiation is represented through various symbols typically associated with chaos and disorder (plagues, monstrous animals, and so forth). The death of the scapegoat mechanism restores order and, by extension, differentiation. Thus, everything returns to its place. In such a manner, social differentiation and order in general is also derived from the scapegoat mechanism.
Girard’s Christian apologetics departs from a comparison of myths and the Bible. According to Girard, whereas myths are caught under the dynamics of the scapegoat mechanism by telling the foundational stories from the perspective of the scapegoaters, the Bible contains plenty of stories that tell the story from the perspective of the victims.
In myths, those who are collectively executed are presented as monstrous culprits that deserve to be punished. In the Bible, those who are collectively executed are presented as innocent victims that are unfairly accused and persecuted. Thus, Girard recapitulates the old Christian apologetic tradition of insisting upon the Bible’s singularity. But, instead of making emphasis on the Bible’s popularity, or fulfillment of prophecies, or consistency, Girard thinks the Bible is unique in its defense of victims.
However, according to Girard, this is not merely a shift in narrative perspective. It is in fact something much more profound. Inasmuch as the Bible presents stories from the perspective of the victims, the Biblical authors reveal something not understood by previous mythological traditions. And, by doing so, they make scapegoating inoperative. Once scapegoats are recognized for what they truly are, the scapegoating mechanism no longer works. Thus, the Bible is a remarkably subversive text, inasmuch as it shatters the scapegoating foundations of culture.
Girard thinks that the Hebrew Bible is a text in travail. There are plenty of stories that are still told from the perspective of the scapegoaters. And, more importantly, it continuously presents a wrathful God that sanctions violence. However, Girard appreciates some important shifts in some narratives from the Bible, especially when they are compared to myths that present similar structures.
For example, Girard contrasts the story of Cain and Abel with the myth of Remus and Romulus. In both stories, there is rivalry between the brothers. In both stories, there is a murder. But, in the Roman myth, Romulus is justified in killing Remus, as the latter transgressed the territorial limits they had earlier agreed upon. In the Biblical story, Cain is never justified in killing Abel. And, indeed, the blood of Abel is evoked as the blood of the innocent victims that have been murdered throughout history, and that God will vindicate.
Girard is also fond of comparing the story of Oedipus with the story of Joseph. Oedipus is accused of incest, and the myth accepts this accusation, therefore justifying his expulsion from Thebes. Joseph is also accused of incest (he allegedly attempted to rape Potiphar’s wife, his de facto step mother). But, the Bible never accepts such an accusation.
In Girard’s views, the Hebrew Bible is also crucial in its rejection of ritual sacrifice. Some prophets vehemently denounced the grotesque ritual killing of sacrificial victims, although, of course, the ritual requirement of sacrificial rituals permeates much of the Old Testament. Girard understands this as a complementary approach to the defense of victims. The prophets promote a new concept of the divinity: God is no longer pleased with ritual violence. This is evocative of Hosea’s plea from God: “I want mercy, not sacrifices”. Thus, the Hebrew Bible takes a twofold reversal of culture’s violent foundation: on the one hand, it begins to present the foundational stories from the perspective of the victims; on the other hand, it begins to present a God that is not satisfied with violence and, therefore, begins to dissociate the sacred from the violent.
Under Girard’s interpretation, the New Testament is the completion of the process that the Hebrew Bible had begun. The New Testament fully endorses the victims’ perspective, and satisfactorily dissociates the sacred from the violent.
The Passion story is central in the New Testament, and it is the complete reversal of traditional myth’s structure. Amidst a huge social crisis, a victim (Jesus) is persecuted, blamed of some fault, and executed. Even the apostles succumb to the collective pressure and abandon Jesus, tacitly becoming part of the scapegoating crowd. This is emblematic in the story of Peter’s denial of Jesus.
Nevertheless, the evangelists never succumb to the collective pressure of the scapegoating mob. The evangelists adhere to Jesus’ innocence throughout the whole story. Alas, Jesus is finally recognized as what he really is: an innocent scapegoat, the Lamb of God that was taken to the slaughterhouse, although no fault was in him. According to Girard, this is the completion of a slow process begun in the Hebrew Bible. Once and for all, the New Testament reverses the violent psychosocial mechanism upon which human culture has been founded.
Aside from that, Jesus’ ethical message is complementary. Under Girard’s interpretation, humanity has achieved social peace by performing violent acts of scapegoating. Jesus’ solution is much more radical and efficient: to turn the other cheek, to abstain from violent retribution. Scapegoating is not an efficient means to bring about peace, as it always depends on the periodic repetition of the mechanism. The real solution is in the total withdrawal from violence, and that is the bulk of Jesus’ message.
Girard is bothered by the possibility that his readers may fail to appreciate the uniqueness of the Bible and Christianity. In this sense, Girard is very critical of classical anthropologists such as Sir James Frazer, who saw the relevance of scapegoating in primitive rituals and myths, but, according to Girard, failed to see that the Christian story is fundamentally different from other scapegoating myths.
Indeed, Girard resents the fact that Christianity is usually considered to be merely one among many other religions. However, ironically, Girard seeks help from a powerful opponent of Christianity: Friedrich Nietzsche. Nietzsche criticized Christianity for its ‘slave morality’; that is, its tendency to side with the weak. Nietzsche recognized that, above other religions, Christianity promoted mercy as a virtue. Nietzsche interpreted this as a corruption of the human vital spirit, and advocated a return to the pre-Christian values of power and strength.
Girard is, of course, opposed to the Nietzschean disdain for mercy and antipathy towards the weak and victims. But, Girard considers Nietzsche a genius, inasmuch as the German philosopher saw what, according to Girard, most people (including the majority of Christians) fail to see: Christianity is unique in its defense of victims. Thus, in a sense, Girard claims that his Christian apologetics is for the most part a reversal of Nietzsche: they both agree that Christianity is singular, but whereas Nietzsche believed this singularity corrupted humanity, Girard believes this singularity is the manifestation of a power that reverses the violent foundations of culture.
Girard acknowledges that, on the surface, not everything in the New Testament is about peace and love. Indeed, there are some frightening passages in Jesus’ preaching, perhaps the most emblematic “I come not to bring peace, but a sword”. This is part of the apocalyptic worldview prevalent in Jesus’ days. But, much more than that, Girard believes that the apocalyptic teachings to be found in the New Testament are a warning about future human violence.
Girard considers that, inasmuch as the New Testament overturns the old scapegoating practices, humanity no longer has the capacity to return to the scapegoating mechanism in order to restore peace. Once victims are revealed as innocent, scapegoating can no longer be relied upon to restore peace. And, in such a sense, there is now an even greater threat of violence. According to Girard, Jesus brings a sword, not in the sense that he himself is going to execute violence, but in the sense that, through his work and the influence of the Bible, humanity will not have the traditional violent means to put an end to violence. The inefficacy of the scapegoat mechanism will bring even more violence. The way to restore peace is not through the scapegoat mechanism, but rather, through the total withdrawal of violence.
Thus, Girard believes that, ironically, Christianity has brought about even more violence. But, once again, this violence is not attributable to Christianity itself, but rather, to the stubbornness of human beings who do not want to follow the Christian admonition and insist on putting an end to violence through traditional scapegoating.
Girard believes that, 20th and 21st centuries are more than ever an apocalyptic age. And, once again, he acknowledges a 19th century German figure as a precursor of these views: Carl von Clausewitz. According to Girard, the great Prussian war strategist realized that modern war would no longer be an honorable enterprise, but rather, a brutal activity that has the potential to destroy all of humanity. Indeed, Girard believes 20th and 21st centuries are apocalyptic, but not in the fundamentalist sense. The ‘signs’ of apocalypse are not numerical clues such as 666, but rather, signs that humanity has not found an efficient way to put an end to violence, and unless the Christian message of repentance and withdrawal from violence is assumed, we are headed towards doomsday; not a Final Judgment brought forth by a punishing God, but rather, a doomsday brought about by our own human violence.
Girard claims not to be a theologian, but rather, a philosophical anthropologist. But, echoing Simone Weil, he believes that the gospels, inasmuch as they reveal the nature of human beings, also indirectly reveal the nature of God. Thus, Girard’s work has great implications for theologians, and his work has generated new ways to interpret the traditional Christian doctrines.
Girard is little concerned with the classical theistic attempt to prove the existence of God (for example Aquinas, Plantinga, Craig and Swinburne). But, he does seem to assume that the only way to explain the Bible’s uniqueness in its rejection of scapegoating distortion and its refusal to succumb to the mob’s influence, is by proposing the intervention of a higher celestial power. So, in a weak sense, Girard’s apologetic works try to prove that the Bible is divinely inspired and, therefore, that God exists.
More importantly, Girard believes that the Bible reveals that the true God is far removed from violence, whereas gods that sanction violence are false gods, that is, idols. By revealing how human violence works, Girard claims, the Bible reveals that this violence does not come from God; rather, God sympathizes with victims and wants nothing to do with victimizers.
Furthermore, the doctrine of Incarnation becomes especially important under Girard’s interpretation. For God himself incarnates in the person of Jesus, in order to become himself a victim. Thus, God is so far removed from aggressors and scapegoaters, He himself becomes a victim in order to show humanity that He sides with innocent victims. Thus, the way to overturn the scapegoat mechanism is not only by telling the stories from the perspective of the victim, but also by telling the story that the victim itself is God incarnate.
Most liberal contemporary Christians pay little attention to Satan, but Girard wishes to keep its relevance. Girard has little patience for the literal mythological interpretation of Satan as the red, horned creature. According to Girard, the concept of Satan and the Devil most frequently referred to in the gospels is what it etymologically expresses: the opponent, the accuser. And, in this sense, Satan is the scapegoating mechanism itself (or, perhaps more precisely, the accusing process); that is, the psychological processes in which human beings are caught up by the lynching mob, and eventually succumb to its influence and participate in the collective violence against the scapegoat.
Likewise, the Holy Spirit in Girard’s interpretation is the reverse of Satan. Again, Girard recurs to etymology: the Paraclete etymologically refers to the spirit of defense. Thus, Satan accuses victims, and the Paraclete mercifully defends victims. Thus, the Holy Spirit is understood by Girard as the overturning of the old scapegoating practices.
In the old Pelagian-Augustinian debate over original sin, Girard’s work clearly sides with Augustine. Under Girard’s interpretation, there is a twofold sense of original sin: 1) human beings are born with the propensity to imitate each other and, eventually, be led to violence; 2) human culture was laid upon the foundations of violence. Thus, human nature is tainted by an original sin, but it can be saved through repentance materialized in the withdrawal from violence.
The complementary aspect of the original sin debate, that is, free will, has not been tackled by Girard. But, being a Roman Catholic, it is presumable that Girard would not accept the Calvinist concepts of total depravity, irresistible grace and predestination. He seems to believe that human beings are born with sin, but they have the capacity to do something about it through repentance.
Girard’s vision of Christianity also brings forth a new interpretation of the doctrine of atonement, that is, that Christ died for our sins. Anselm’s traditional account (God’s honor was offended by the sins of mankind, His honor was reestablished with the death of His own son), or other traditional interpretations (mankind was kidnapped by the Devil, God offered Christ as a ransom; Jesus died so God could show humanity what He is capable of doing if we do not repent, and so forth) are deemed inadequate by Girard. Under Girard’s interpretation, Jesus saved us by becoming a victim and overturning once and for all the scapegoat mechanism. Thanks to Jesus’ salvific mission, human beings now have the capacity to understand what scapegoats really are, and have the golden opportunity to achieve enduring social peace.
An important source of criticisms against Girard is his apologetic commitment to Christianity. Most critics argue that he has a tendency to twist interpretations of classical texts and myths in order to favor Christian doctrine. Girard has frequently asserted that he was not a Christian for the early part of his life, but that his work as a humanist eventually drove him to Christianity. Also, Girard has been seen with contempt by postmodernist critics who, on the whole, are suspicious of objective truth.
The first point of criticism directed at Girard is that he is too ambitious. His initial plausible interpretations of mimetic psychology and anthropology are eventually transformed into a grandiose theoretical system that attempts to explain every aspect of human nature.
Consequently, in such a manner, his methods have been questioned. His theories regarding mimetic desire are derived, not from a careful study of subjects and the implementation of tests, but rather, from the reading of works of fiction. The fact that his theory seems to coincide with what many neuroscientists are informing us about mirror neurons is immaterial: his was just a lucky guess.
The same critique may be extended to his work on the origins of culture. Again, his scapegoating thesis may be plausible, in as much as it is easy to find many examples of scapegoating processes in human culture. But, to claim that all human culture ultimately relies on scapegoating, and that the fundamental cultural institutions (myths, rituals, hunting, domestication of animals, and so forth), are ultimately derived from an original murder, is perhaps too much.
Thus, in a sense, Girard’s work is subject to the same criticism of many of the great theoretical systems of the human sciences in the 19th century (Hegel, Freud, Marx, and so forth): his sole concentration on his favorite themes makes him overlook equally plausible alternate explanations for the phenomena he highlights.
As a corollary of the previous objection, empirically-minded philosophers would object that Girard’s theses are not verifiable in a meaningful way. There is little possibility to know what may have happened during Paleolithic times, apart from what paleontology and archaeology might tell us.
In some instances, Girard claims that his theses have indeed been verified. There have been plenty of archaeological remains that suggest ritual human sacrifice, and plenty of contemporary rituals and myths that suggest scapegoating violence. But, then again, the number of rituals and myths that do not display violence is even greater. Girard does not see this as a great obstacle to his theses, because according to him, cultures have a tendency to erase the track of original violence.
But, in such a case, the empirically-minded philosopher may argue that Girard’s work is not falsifiable in Popper’s sense. There seems to be no possibility of a counter-example that will refute Girard’s thesis. If a violent myth or ritual is considered, Girard will argue that this piece of evidence confirms his hypotheses. If, on the other hand, a non-violent myth or ritual is considered, Girard will once again argue that this piece of evidence confirms his evidence, because it proves that cultures erase tracks of violence in myths and rituals. Thus, Girard is open to the same Popperian objection leveled against Freud: both sexual and non-sexual dreams confirm psychoanalytic theory; therefore, there is no possible way to refute it, and in such a manner, it becomes a meaningless theory.
Girard is also open to criticism inasmuch as his Christian apologetics seems to rely on an already biased comparison of myths and the Bible. It has been objected that he is not thoroughly fair in the application of standards when contrasting the Bible and myths. Girard’s hermeneutic goes to great lengths to highlight violence in rituals when, in fact, it is not all that evident. He may be accused of being predisposed to find sanctioned violence in myths and, based upon that predisposition, he interprets as sanctioned violence mythical elements that, under another interpretative lens, would not be violent at all. Metaphorically speaking, when studying many myths, Girard is just seeing faces in the clouds, and projecting upon myths some elements that are far from being clear.
In the same manner, one may object that Girard’s treatment of the Bible, and especially the New Testament, is too benevolent. Most secular historians would agree that there are some hints of persecution against the Jews in the gospels (for example, an exaggeration of Jewish guilt in the arrest and execution of Jesus), and that the historical Jesus’ apocalyptic preaching is not just a warning of future human violence, but rather, an announcement of imminent divine wrath.
Even if Girard’s thesis about the uniqueness of Christianity were accepted, it needn’t prove a divine origin. Perhaps Christianity is unique due to a set of historical and sociological circumstances that drove biblical authors to sympathize with victims (indeed, Max Weber’s explanation is as follows: the Bible’s authors sympathize with victims because they were themselves victims as subjects of the great empires of the Near East). In such a manner, Girard may be accused of incurring an ad ignorantiam fallacy. The fact that we cannot currently explain a given phenomenon does not imply that such phenomenon’s origins are supernatural.
Even if one were to accept that the Bible reveals a profound nature about human beings, scientifically-minded philosophers would object that Girard’s language is too obscure and too religiously-based for scientific purposes. Perhaps the Bible does reveal some interesting insights about the nature of scapegoating. But, to name such a process ‘Satan’, or to name the human tendency to incur in rivalries ‘sin’, bears a great potential for confusion. Whenever most readers encounter the word ‘Satan’, they are prone to imagine the nasty horned tailed creature, and not in some sort of abstract psychological mechanism that gives rise to scapegoating violence. So, even if Girard’s use of those terms is metaphoric, they are easily open to confusion, and perhaps should be abandoned.
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Last updated: January 6, 2012 | Originally published: January 5, 2012
Categories: Tradition Misc.