Charles Hartshorne: Dipolar Theism

HartshorneFrom the beginning to the end of his career Charles Hartshorne maintained that the idea that “God is love” was his guiding intuition in philosophy. This “intuition” presupposes both that there is a divine reality and that that reality answers to some positive description of being a loving God. This article focuses on the latter issue, namely, Hartshorne’s concept of God. Hartshorne’s views on the former issue are treated separately in another article, “Charles Hartshorne: Theistic and Anti-Theistic Arguments.” Hartshorne vigorously defended both propositions by clarifying what he meant by the phrase, “God is love,” by defending his views against a variety of objections, and generally by arguing that his version of theism (called “dipolar” or “neoclassical” theism) survives critical scrutiny better than its philosophical competitors.

Heavily influenced by Alfred North Whitehead, Hartshorne borrowed some of Whitehead’s technical vocabulary and he often promoted broadly Whiteheadian ideas. It is a mistake, however, to style him as Whitehead’s disciple for he departed from the older philosopher on a number of points, most notably (where this article is concerned), on questions surrounding the concept and the existence of God. In what follows we examine Hartshorne’s ideas about the concept of God. It is important, however, to appreciate that the formulation of a coherent theism is an integral part of the rational defense of theism. Hartshorne spent much of his career in a philosophical atmosphere in which the question was not so much “Does God exist?” as it was “Does ‘God’ name a coherent idea?” Philosophers from very diverse schools of thought—from Sartre to the Logical Positivists—rejected theism on the basis of alleged inconsistencies in the very idea of deity. Hartshorne himself remarked that there would be fewer atheists if theists had done a better job of making sense of the concept of God. Hartshorne’s response to this situation was to develop his dipolar or neoclassical concept of God. It can plausibly be claimed that Hartshorne accomplished at least two tasks: first, he introduced a sophisticated and religiously important form of theism heretofore unheard of or at least very poorly developed through philosophical argument and, second, he shifted the burden of proof onto those who claim that the concept of God is hopelessly muddled.

Table of Contents

  1. Divine Love and Divine Relativity
  2. Existence and Actuality
  3. Divine Perfection
  4. Divine Power
  5. Divine Knowledge
  6. Panentheism
  7. Conclusion
  8. Suggestions for Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
      1. Books (in order of appearance)
      2. Hartshorne’s Response to his Critics
      3. Selected Articles
    2. Secondary Sources
    3. Bibliography

1. Divine Love and Divine Relativity

The only deity worthy of worship, Hartshorne believed, is one that could be described as “Love divine, all loves excelling,” as in the title of Charles Wesley’s hymn. Hartshorne did not identify himself as Christian nor did he consider himself a theologian. He argued, however, that Christian thinkers had an unfortunate tendency to allow what he considered to be warped ideas about absolute power and unchanging perfection to eclipse the central teaching of their faith concerning divine love. The parables of Jesus and the personal qualities he exhibits in the Gospels reflect, for the Christian, the image of a loving God. They portray one who not only acts for the benefit of the beloved but also sympathizes with others in such a way as to rejoice in their well-being and feel sorrow in their tragedies. These are the qualities of love that Hartshorne takes to be essential to it; at a bare minimum, love requires both the capacity to act for the welfare of others and to sympathize with their feelings. As the etymology of “compassion” suggests, it is “to suffer with” another in the desire to ameliorate the other’s suffering. If this sort of love is to be attributed to the divine being, then it must not only be possible for God to act for the welfare of the creatures but also to be affected by their weal and woe. In short, divine love entails the divine relativity: a social conception of God—the title of Hartshorne’s fourth book, published in 1948, now considered a classic in the philosophy of religion.

Divine relativity is precisely what much of traditional theology would not allow. As Aquinas said in Summa Theologica, God is really related to the creatures but the creatures have only a rational (that is, an imagined) relation to God (ST I, Q 13, a. 7). In short, God is impassible or unaffected by anything external. The only doctrine of divine love consistent with the doctrine of impassibility is one in which God promotes the welfare of the creatures, but is unaffected by what happens to them. On this view, divine love, unlike human forms of love, involves neither sympathy nor empathy. John Sanders demonstrates in The God Who Risks that Christian thinkers, from as early as Justin Martyr, realized that there is a tension between the belief in the goodness of God and the denial that God somehow shares in the joys and sorrows of the creatures. Anselm raised the question explicitly in chapter 8 of Proslogion: How can God be all-loving without any sympathetic responsiveness? Anselm answered by promoting a kind of theological behaviorism: we feel the effects of God’s goodness, but God feels nothing. On Hartshorne’s view, this doesn’t answer the question, it only reasserts divine impassibility.

Hartshorne affirms God’s love as involving both benevolence and feeling. Because God loves the creatures, what happens to them is felt also by God. As a loving parent suffers for a child who is ill or who has lost her way in life, so the God in whom Hartshorne believes, suffers through the misfortunes and the mischief of the creatures. He was fond of quoting one of the final statements from Whitehead’s Process and Reality that “God is the great companion—the fellow-sufferer who understands.” Hartshorne, following both Whitehead and Berdyaev, maintained that there can be tragedy, even for God. As Martha Nussbaum argues, tragedy can happen only to someone who cares enough about others to be disappointed by them or hurt by what happens to them. God, in Hartshorne’s view, is one who cares and who can therefore be disappointed or hurt by the actions of the creatures.

Hartshorne’s basic argument for divine relativity is stated throughout his writings. If God knows contingent states of affairs (for example, a woman listening to a bird singing at a particular time and place), then there must be contingency in God. For, if the object of knowledge can be other than it is (for example, the woman not listening to the bird), then the knowledge itself could be otherwise (for example, God knowing that the woman is not listening to the bird). The argument is not that God might have failed to be omniscient, but that the particular cognitive states of God could have been different. As Hartshorne noted, Aristotle inferred from this reasoning that God does not know the world; Spinoza, on the other hand, denied the contingency of the world—despite what seems to be the case, it is impossible, at that very moment, that the woman not be listening to the bird. Hartshorne concludes that one must choose among the mutually exclusive options: a God that is ignorant of the world, a world devoid of contingency, or the neoclassical view that there is contingency in God. What is ruled out by this argument is the Thomistic view that God knows contingent states of affairs but there is no contingency in God. (For different formalizations of this argument see Shields 1983 and Viney 2007/2012.)

Hartshorne’s basic argument for divine relativity is expressed in terms of the idea of God’s exhaustive knowledge but it could equally well be rephrased in terms of inexhaustible love, for love, like knowledge has it objects. Of course, these are not the only qualities that theists usually ascribe to God—there are also such qualities as eminent creativity, perfect power, and infinite wisdom. Hartshorne attempts to do justice to these ideas in formulating his neoclassical concept of God, but for him divine love remained paramount. This is significant for it highlights Hartshorne’s commitment to the principle that negation is parasitic upon positive attributions, that there are no merely negative facts (see “Charles Hartshorne: Neoclassical Metaphysics”). Many theologians, eager to affirm the transcendence of God, emphasize what cannot be known of God and argue that, in view of this ignorance, the most appropriate theological language is by way of negation (via negativa): God is not finite (infinite), not changeable (immutable), not affected by anything external (impassible), not contingent (necessary), not in time (non-temporal), and so forth. Hartshorne also emphasized what is not known of God and he did not deny that negations play an important role in religious discourse. In A Natural Theology for Our Time, he comments that our knowledge of the concrete divine reality is “negligibly small.” He argues, however, that as the sole or even primary approach to religious language, “the negative way” is a case of false modesty. Negative theologians are supposedly being deferential to God by stressing what cannot be known or said of God, but this masks the fact that they consider themselves privy to enough knowledge about the divine reality to know what cannot be attributed to it.

Hartshorne couples the accusation of false modesty with the charge that the negations used of deity by negative theologians almost invariably presuppose invidious contrasts: the finite is inferior to the infinite, the changeable to the unchangeable, the passible to the impassible, the temporal to the non-temporal, and so forth. Hartshorne argues that it is much too simplistic to label one side of an ultimate contrast as “better” and the other side “worse.” On the contrary, there are better and worse forms of each side of each contrast. For example, there are better and worse ways of being affected by others (passibility) and better and worse ways of being unaffected by others (impassibility): to identify too much with the suffering of others is damaging to one’s own well-being and may prevent one from helping others in need; to remain unaffected by the plight of others exhibits the character flaw of insensitivity. In Hartshorne’s view, theologians should not chase after negations if they wish to speak of one that is worthy of worship; rather, they should explore ways of attributing to God what is best in both sides of any particular contrast. For this reason, Hartshorne maintains that, to the extent that language is adequate to theological purposes, only a properly dipolar concept of deity can reflect the divine perfection: God is both finite and infinite, both passible and impassible, and so forth, but in different respects and in eminent ways.

In Analytic Theism, Hartshorne, and the Concept of God, Daniel Dombrowski notes that Hartshorne sought a theory of religious language that avoids two extremes: (1) language is wholly inadequate to describe God and (2) verbal formulae may capture God without doubt or obscurity. Hartshorne considered the formal abstractions of metaphysics to be the most nearly univocal language that is possible for deity, for they do not admit of degrees. For example, on Hartshorne’s view, God is, in different respects, necessary and contingent; we shall see, however, that this does not mean that God is more or less necessary or more or less contingent. Hartshorne calls the most nearly equivocal language about God “symbolic” because it presupposes particular times, places, and situations. Metaphors such as “shepherd,” “mother,” “father,” are examples. Analogical language holds a place between the abstract contraries of metaphysics and the concrete imagery of poetic imagination. Analogical language is a matter of degree, as when one says that love comes in many forms, but the eminent form of love belongs to God. In Beyond Humanism, Hartshorne claimed that psychical predicates such as memory, feeling, and volition admit of an infinite variability, extending beyond their specifically human forms to include the non-human animal world and to include what might exist in a superhuman form, such as deity. Hartshorne sometimes says that these sorts of predicates only apply literally to God and not the creatures. As Dombrowski avers, the most parsimonious interpretation of this “negative anthropology” is that Hartshorne is emphasizing that God alone has the supreme or eminent form of these qualities.

2. Existence and Actuality

To say that God exhibits both sides of a metaphysical contrast would be a logical contradiction unless there was a way of showing that the polar extremes apply to God in different respects. Søren Kierkegaard seemed to relish the paradox that “the eternal came to be in time.” Hartshorne did not mention Kierkegaard in this connection, but he apparently saw little advantage in this way of speaking. In The Divine Relativity, he complained that a theological paradox seems to be what a contradiction is when applied to God. In Hartshorne’s view, asserting contradictory things of God is not a sign of profundity but of confusion. Hartshorne’s proposal is to make a three-fold distinction of logical type, applicable to both God and the creatures, among existence (that a thing is), essence (what a thing is), and actuality (the particular state in which a thing is). To illustrate how this distinction can be applied to both God and the creatures, consider the case of a woman listening to a bird sing and of God knowing this fact. The woman exists, has the cognitive capacity to hear song birds, which is part of her essence (insofar as audition of is part of her natural endowment) and she is currently listening to a bird sing, which is her actual state. The same distinctions apply to God: God exists, has the essence of being all-knowing, and is in the actual state of knowing that the woman is listening to the bird sing.

The tripartite distinction of existence, essence, and actuality is one of logical type analogous to the logical type difference between universals and particulars. One may, for example, deduce that the woman exists if she is listening to the bird, but one may not deduce from the fact of her existence that she is listening to a bird. For this reason, Hartshorne maintains that existence (also essence) is abstract relative to actuality. Actuality is, so to speak, information rich, relative to existence (and essence). This is recognized in modern logic in the use of the existential quantifier which, by itself, gives no details about the existent object. Hartshorne’s three-fold distinction also allows one to make a distinction within God between what is necessary (could not be otherwise) and what is contingent (could be otherwise). It is conceivable that God exists necessarily and necessarily has the quality of being all-knowing, but the actual state of God’s knowing (for example, knowing that the woman is listening to a bird sing) might be contingent. Barring determinism, the woman’s listening to the bird is contingent: she might have been asleep, she might have been listening to a different bird, she might have been distracted, and so forth. If God is necessarily all-knowing, then God knows about the woman and her actual state, regardless of what it may be. Moreover, God’s actual state of knowing the woman as listening to the bird sing is as contingent as the fact that she is listening to the bird sing. The following diagram summarizes how the distinctions between the concrete and the abstract and the necessary and the contingent map onto Hartshorne’s three-fold distinction of existence, essence, and actuality as it applies to God and the creatures.

Hartshorne graphics

The three-fold distinction is often referred to by means of the simpler distinction between existence and actuality thereby anticipating the thesis of Hartshorne’s ontological argument that existence belongs to the nature or essence of God. One need not accept the ontological argument, however, to appreciate the importance of the distinction. David Tracy calls the distinction “Hartshorne’s Discovery” and Hartshorne himself said, “I rather hope to be remembered for this distinction.” Hartshorne notes that Aristotle anticipated the tripartite distinction of existence, essence, and actuality when he spoke of substance, essence, and accident. Hartshorne’s criticism of the Stagirite is that he considered substance as ontologically basic and thus could speak of accidental compounds. For Hartshorne, actuality is ontologically basic in the sense of being most concrete. In Philosophers Speak of God, Hartshorne writes, “It is actuality of accidents, not existence of substances that is prior” (1953, 72).

The distinction between existence and actuality is important because it allows, among other things, that there can be give-and-take relations between God and the creatures without reducing God to the status of a creature. Contrary to the ancient tradition of divine impassibility, God can be conceived as affected by the creatures. In the example, the woman listening to the bird brings it about that God knows that she is listening to the bird, although she does not bring it about that God is omniscient, for God would have been omniscient even had she never existed. In Summa Contra Gentiles, Aquinas argued that any contingency in God implies the possibility of God’s non-existence, thereby reducing God’s existence to the status of creaturely existence (SCG I, 16.2). In view of the difference between existence and actuality, the inference is invalid. God’s actual states can be contingent while God’s existence and essence remain necessary. Moreover, the essence of God must now be described not merely as necessary but as necessarily somehow actualized.

3. Divine Perfection

Hartshorne’s three-fold distinction allows one to appreciate the extent of his divergence from the dominant tradition in philosophical theology which he called “classical theism.” We have noted that classical theists, committed to the transcendence of God, were keen on the via negativa: God was placed on one side only of the pairs of contrasts, absolute/relative, infinite/finite, immutable/mutable, impassible/passible, necessary/contingent, and eternal/temporal. Hartshorne rejects this as a “monopolar prejudice,” an expression that highlights not only the “monopolar” aspect of classical theism but also the invidious character of the contrasts—the “prejudice”—as applied to God and the creatures. Hartshorne speaks instead of God’s dual transcendence. God transcends the creatures by being the supreme instance of both sides of the contrasts. The distinction between existence and actuality permits a logically coherent doctrine of dual transcendence by distinguishing different aspects of God. For example, God is immutable with respect to existence and essence, but mutable with respect to actuality. That is to say, God’s existence and essence are always the same, but God’s actual states are constantly being added to with the creative advance of the world. Or again, God is both necessary and contingent, but in different respects. God’s existence and essence are necessary (that is, could not be otherwise) whereas God’s actuality is contingent (that is, could be otherwise). The examples of divine mutability and contingency represent God’s flexibility in being able to respond to every possible change. It should now be clear why Hartshorne was making a serious point when he quipped that he believed in twice as much transcendence as was usually found in more traditional forms of theism.

From time to time, Hartshorne has been characterized as promoting a merely finite deity such as one finds in Mill’s essay Theism. Hartshorne’s commitment to the principle of dual transcendence entails that this is mistaken. Insofar as God has actual states, God is indeed finite. Furthermore, God can be nothing other than finite in this respect. God’s actuality is the realization of concrete value in the life of God and every realization of value, whether in God or in any other being, is finite in the sense that it excludes values that could have been achieved. For example, from an early age, Mozart’s father set his son on the trajectory of being a musician. Apart from this education and training, Mozart might have lived a very different life, as a lawyer, a military leader, or a peasant farmer. Each path would have led to a certain value achievement, but each, to a greater or lesser extent, excludes the others. In some fashion, God incorporates Mozart’s achievement into the divine life; as the values Mozart did not achieve were not part of his life, no more are they part of God’s. To say that God is not finite in this sense is to risk accepting a doctrine according to which God is merely infinite—that is to say, that God excludes whatever is of worth in the enjoyment of a finite realization of value. Hartshorne long maintained that the concept of the realization of all possible values is a meaningless ideal. God must, therefore, be finite, but not merely so. Dual transcendence means, among other things, that God must be infinite in receptive capacity; whatever comes to be, comes to be for God and becomes an everlasting component in God’s memory. There must also be in God an inexhaustible or infinite capacity to appreciate the creative advance. In addition, Hartshorne allowed that God is actually infinite in the sense that there was never a time when God did not exist and that God is omniscient with respect to this past life. Hartshorne was quick to add that this form of infinity is not the realization of all possible values, for the actually infinite life of God could have been different in as many ways (an infinite number) as the creative advance itself could have been different.

Classical theologians adopted an ideal of perfection as unchanging, often using the argument from Plato’s Republic that change for the better or worse implies an unchanging measure of perfection. The argument is that if something changes for the better then it is not yet perfect, but if it changes for the worse then it is no longer perfect. In either case, change implies imperfection. God, being perfect, must be devoid of change. This argument, however, begs the question against a dipolar conception of God like Hartshorne’s by assuming that there cannot be perfect forms of change. Hartshorne argues, on the contrary, that some forms of value—aesthetic qualities in particular—do not admit of a maximum. Just as it is impossible to speak of a greatest possible positive integer, so it may be impossible to speak of a greatest possible beauty. The fact that Mozart’s music achieved a new level of beauty does not mean that there was nothing left for Beethoven to do. Another analogy is interpersonal relationships. It is a good thing to be flexible in one’s responses to others. The ideal is not unchangeableness; it is, rather, adequate response to the needs of others. It is true that stability and reliability of character are desirable. But this means, in part, that the person can be relied upon to respond in ways appropriate to each situation, and responsiveness is a kind of change. The analogy is particularly appropriate in the divine case since there are always new creatures to which God must respond and hence there is no upper limit to the values associated with these relationships, for each is as unique as the individuals with whom God is related.

As Hartshorne distinguished existence and actuality, so he distinguished different ways in which God is perfect. Taking a clue from the work of Gustav Fechner, Hartshorne noticed an ambiguity in the concept of perfection. If one is perfect, then one is unsurpassable, but by what or by whom is one unsurpassable? The obvious answer is “by others.” This leaves open the possibility that one may surpass oneself. Thus, there is a distinction between (a) being unsurpassable by all others including self and (b) being unsurpassable by all others excluding self.” In Man’s Vision of God and the Logic of Theism, Hartshorne labels these two ideas respectively A-perfection (for absolute perfection) and R-perfection (for relative perfection). God is A-perfect with respect to existence and essence and R-perfect with respect to actuality. Hartshorne agrees with more traditional theists who spoke of God as infinite, immutable, impassible, necessary, and eternal, for this is God’s A-perfection. Hartshorne quickly adds, however, that God is not in all respects infinite, immutable, impassible, necessary, and eternal. To use our previous example, if aesthetic values exhibit an unlimited possibility of increase, then God’s appreciation of beauty may—indeed must—exhibit this possibility. Again, Beethoven’s music introduces new forms of beauty that did not exist prior to his creative life. Hartshorne would also say that God, in enjoying the changing beauty of the world, is also the supremely beautiful object of contemplation, a point to which we shall return in the discussion of panentheism. Hartshorne summarized these ideas about divine perfection in The Divine Relativity when he spoke of God as “the self-surpassing surpasser of all.”

4. Divine Power

Theologians have often commented on how difficult it is to define “omnipotence.” Most of those who have thought about this, Hartshorne included, conclude that René Descartes was wrong, in his letter to Mersenne (May 27, 1630), to suppose that God could bring about logically inconsistent states of affairs. Aquinas, for example, in Summa Contra Gentiles denied that God could draw a circle with unequal radii, for this involves a logical inconsistency: one must fix the angle of the compass in order to guarantee that the arc becomes a circle, but one must at the same time not fix the angle, allowing it to become wider or smaller, in order to make the radii unequal (SCG II, 25.14). Aquinas also denied that God could change the past once it has occurred. In Summa Theologica, Aquinas says that not even God can restore virginity to someone who has lost it (ST I, Q 25, a. 4, reply to Obj. 3). Finally, Aquinas denied that God can do what is contrary to God’s nature, such as doing an unloving deed (ST I, Q 25, art. 3, Reply to Obj. 2). On each of these points, Hartshorne agrees.

Beyond these agreements, Hartshorne attributes both more power and less power to God than did the Angelic Doctor. For Aquinas, God can act but not be acted upon by anything external—this is the doctrine of impassibility. As we have seen, Hartshorne argues that God has the power to be acted upon by the creatures and to respond to them. In this sense, Hartshorne attributes more power to God than does Aquinas. On the other hand, Aquinas apparently believed that God can unilaterally bring about some states of affairs in which more than one agent makes decisions. For Aquinas, God is called omnipotent because everything that does not imply a contradiction in terms is within God’s power to accomplish (ST I, Q 25, a. 3). Hartshorne rejects this claim and holds instead that any state of affairs in which more than one agent makes decisions cannot be conceived as the product of one agent, even if that agent is God. Suppose Ruth loves Naomi and Naomi loves Ruth—their mutual love can be explained only by referring to the activity of two persons, Ruth and Naomi. The logic of the situation does not change if one of the agents is God. The state of affairs described by God loving Ruth and Ruth loving God can only be explained by the activity of both God and Ruth, and not by God alone. Of course, if God is all-loving, then it is impossible that Ruth (an actual person) not be loved by God; but this does not change the fact that two agents—God and Ruth—are required to create the situation of their mutual love. If this is correct, then it is false that God, acting alone, can bring about any state of affairs in which more than one agent is making decisions. A corollary is that it is false that God can bring about any state of affairs the description of which is logically consistent—for there is nothing logically inconsistent about two individuals loving each other.

Classical theists, Aquinas in particular, are not without responses to Hartshorne’s reasoning. Aquinas made two claims relevant to Hartshorne’s argument. First, he maintained that the self-same result could be wholly attributed to two different causes; perhaps Ruth’s loving God can be wholly attributed to Ruth and wholly attributed to God. In Summa Contra Gentiles, Aquinas’ example is that the music of a flute is wholly attributable to the instrument and to the musician (SCG III, Pt. 1, 70.8). Of course, the music is manifestly not attributable to either the instrument or the musician singly; both are required, which supports Hartshorne’s claim. It is relevant to note that it is illicit to distribute “wholly” through a conjunction. There is no valid inference from “X is wholly the result of (A and B)” to “X is wholly the result of A and X is wholly the result of B.” The second thing that Aquinas says that might undermine Hartshorne’s argument is his claim that God has the power to bring about some events necessarily and to bring about other events contingently (ST I, Q 19, a. 8). In this way, one might make head-way in making sense of the idea that God creates a person’s decision while yet preserving the contingency (an element of freedom) of the decision. Again, however, Hartshorne demurs. It makes sense to say that one can be the cause of a contingent event—every roll of the dice is proof of that. It is much less clear that it makes sense to say that one can guarantee the outcome of a contingent event. If one loads the dice in such a way that a particular number must appear (say, seven), then the outcome is not contingent; only if the dice are not loaded is the outcome truly contingent. Again, one should take note of an illicit distribution, but this time it is the problem of distributing “causes” or “guarantees” over a disjunction. There is no valid inference from “X causes (A or B or C)” to “X causes A or X causes B or X causes C.”

Hartshorne’s most controversial departure from classical theism is his denial of creation ex nihilo. Indeed, the argument just given that some states of affairs require multiple decision makers is itself an argument against ex nihilo creation, at least in its classic form. God was said to create the universe, which includes the decisions that creatures make, in one non-temporal and unilateral act. Hartshorne’s argument entails that no universe with multiple decision makers can be created in its entirety by God alone. Aquinas notwithstanding, the making of decisions is a paradigm of creative activity, for something is brought into existence if only the decision itself. For this reason, Hartshorne’s example of multiple decision makers is also an example of multiple creators. Hartshorne saw in Jules Lequyer’s statement that “God created me creator of myself” an anticipation of his own views on divine creativity. A hallmark of Hartshorne’s neoclassical theism is that the universe is a joint creative product of (a) the lesser creators that are the creatures, localized in space and time, and (b) the eminent creator which is God whose influence extends to every creature that ever has or that ever will exist.

Hartshorne defends a metaphysical view that posits creativity as a transcendental, applicable to both God and the creatures. Creativity, in such a metaphysic, is never “from nothing” but is relational, requiring a pre-existent universe (see “Charles Hartshorne: Neoclassical Metaphysics”). It follows that there can be no such thing as God without a universe or, for that matter, a universe without God. A common objection to this view is that it portrays God as dependent upon the universe. Hartshorne considers the objection to be flawed in two ways. First, it assumes an invidious contrast between independence and dependence. We have seen that Hartshorne is at pains to instruct philosophers and theologians to be wary of devaluing dependence (and, more generally, to be cautious of simplistic valuations of metaphysical contrasts). Second, the objection is subtly ambiguous. If Hartshorne is correct, then God and the universe are indeed necessary to each other. The proviso, however, is that no particular set of creatures (that is, no particular universe) is necessary to God. An analogy that Hartshorne uses in Creative Synthesis is of a mathematical set that necessarily has numbers, but the numbers that it has are not necessary. God’s actual states, being contingent, are dependent upon interaction with the creatures; God’s existence, on the other hand, is necessary, for it depends upon no particular creatures or groups of creatures. It should also be noted that Hartshorne preserves the distinction between God and the creatures: the divine being meets with no universe that it did not have a hand in co-creating whereas the creatures, because they begin to exist, are born into a universe that they had no part in making. Of course, once the creature exists, it becomes a lesser, co-creator, with God.

In The Divine Relativity and elsewhere, Hartshorne distinguishes two forms of power involving direct and indirect causation. Direct causal influence occurs when one entity—Hartshorne’s name for the metaphysically basic entities is “dynamic singulars”—acts on another without an intermediary as when a present experience acts upon an immediately subsequent experience in the life of a single individual; one’s memory of the preceding moment, for example, is the feeling of one experience acting on its successor in direct fashion. Hartshorne avers that a similar direct action occurs between parts of the nervous system and between the nervous system and the body. Indirect causal influence, on Hartshorne’s account, occurs when one body acts upon another body, which often involves modifying the inter-bodily environment in some way, such as speaking, which causes air to move and sound waves are heard by another person. Some cases of indirect causal action are examples of “brute force” whereby one body moves another body from one place to another. Barring telepathy, cases of one person acting on another are always indirect. On the other hand, Hartshorne maintains that God’s action on dynamic singulars is never indirect. Because each entity retains its own power of creative experiencing, this direct causal influence is not deterministic. Hartshorne, following Whitehead (who was following the later Plato), refers to this mode of influence as “divine persuasion” which is, in effect, the active side of divine love. God acts as a supreme ideal, urging each dynamic singular to achieve an intensity of experience appropriate to its level of complexity. Thus, in Creative Experiencing Hartshorne says, “It is the [divine] love that explains the [divine] power, not vice versa.”

Some philosophers accept Hartshorne’s critique of the traditional concept of omnipotence but argue that the neoclassical account of divine power does not endow God with the highest degree of power conceivable. One may concede that “divine persuasion” is the most admirable form of power, but insist nevertheless that God should also be conceived as having the ability to thwart human decisions by preventing them from being acted upon or by preventing their natural consequences from occurring. In Divine Power in Process Theism, David Basinger notes that a parent can force an unruly child to go to bed by physically putting the child there. If God is unable to accomplish such a feat then, Basinger argues, God does not have the highest degree of power, for the parent is able to do what God cannot. In response one may note that Hartshorne’s metaphysical principles allow that God has the ability to persuade the child to get into bed or even to persuade the parent to force the child into bed. It is contrary to Hartshorne’s thinking, however, to say that God has a body with a location within the cosmos. This is also contrary to classical theism (also Basinger’s “free will theism”)—the idea that Jesus was God embodied involves metaphysical issues which Basinger’s critique does not presuppose. In view of these qualifications, Basinger’s objection seems to be that if God is to be conceived as having the highest degree of power, God must be able to accomplish miraculously what the parent accomplishes without a miracle through the use of his or her body.

Hartshorne responded to Basinger’s critique in a letter (dated August 4, 1988) and said, among other things, that he doubted that he ever claimed that miracles never occur. He was disinclined to believe that miracles have in fact occurred on grounds similar to those offered by Hume (also Montaigne): probabilities favor deceit or error over genuine miracles. Hartshorne attributed the laws of nature to God’s influence over all dynamic singulars (see the article, “Charles Hartshorne on Theistic and Anti-theistic Arguments: Global Argument”) and said that he doubted our wisdom to judge how far the value of such laws “justifies the absence of notable divine intervention.” Doubting, however, the quality of evidence for miracles is different from doubting the possibility of miracles. Basinger replied to Hartshorne (August 24, 1988) that he wasn’t “quite sure” what it could mean in neoclassical metaphysics to suppose that miracles could occur. This is a fair question, especially in light of Hartshorne’s denial that God acts indirectly. On the other hand, it is fair to ask for an account of divine power that is not merely ad hoc but flows naturally from general metaphysical principles such as Hartshorne was at pains to give. With the possible exception of Descartes’ concept of omnipotence, every account of divine power includes propositions of the form “God cannot X.” The force of the “cannot” may be in the logical impossibility of the act named (for example, making a circle with unequal radii), in the nature of God (for example, God cannot intend evil), in the nature of that over which divine power is exercised (for example, God cannot create a creature’s creative act), or in the particular relations that God has with the creatures (for example, God cannot act indirectly). It is a legitimate question what it means to speak of attributing the highest degree of power to God apart from a system of metaphysical principles. It is not that a particular metaphysic is a final court of appeal for a concept of divine power; on the other hand, an appeal to divine power may be no more than a deus ex machina apart from a well-articulated metaphysic.

5. Divine Knowledge

One of the lessons to be learned from debates about divine power is that one’s ideas about God have implications for one’s ideas about the world and vice versa. To assume that God can bring about any logically possible state of affairs presupposes that all states of affairs are such that, in principle, they require only a single being to bring them about. That presupposition, however, begs the question against a world-view like Hartshorne’s in which reality has a social structure. In such a world, it is no limit on God if God cannot bring about every logically possible state of affairs. There is an analogous lesson where divine knowledge is concerned. If reality is continually in-the-making, as Hartshorne maintains, then there is a fundamental asymmetry between past and future. The past is fully determinate and the future is the realm of the partially indeterminate. If God is all-knowing, then God must know the future for what it is, as partially indeterminate. If one raises the objection that such a deity is not omniscient because the future is partially hidden from it, one has failed to cross the pons asinorum of the debate. It is a defect in divine knowledge not to know a fully determinate future only if there is a fully determinate future to be known. The assumption of a fully determinate future is evident in the use that Aquinas makes of the analogy made famous by Boethius: as each point on the circumference of a circle is equidistant from the center, so God is equally knowledgeable of every moment of time (SCG I, 66.7; see also Boethius, Consolation of Philosophy, Bk 4, Pr. 6). As Hartshorne noted, however, the analogy assumes that time can be represented as a completed whole, whereas time may be more like an endless line whose points are added from moment to moment.

Hartshorne’s criticism of the circle analogy was anticipated by late medieval philosophers like John Duns Scotus (Ordinatio I, d. 39, q. 1-5) and Luis de Molina (Condordia IV, d. 49.18). The questions raised by the circle analogy concern not only the nature of time, but also the nature of God. Traditional theists, as we have seen, were reluctant to attribute any passive potency to God; they thought that the perfection of the divine being required that God be immutable and impassible. If, however, God is not affected by anything external, then how is it that God knows the world? Aquinas answered that the cognitive relation in God is the reverse of what it is for humans. We know the world because it affects us, but God knows the world because God is its creator. The Thomistic solution may preserve divine impassibility but at the expense of making human freedom problematic. We have already discussed this problem in the previous section. There was, however, another very imaginative solution to the “mechanics of omniscience” given by Molina. He argued that, prior to creating the world, God has knowledge of what any possible free creature would do in any particular circumstance. Using this “middle knowledge” in combination with the knowledge of what creatures God has in fact chosen to create, God is able to know what every free creature will do in the circumstances where they have been placed.

New life was breathed into Molinism by analytic philosophers of religion in the late twentieth century. For his part, Hartshorne never directly addressed Molina’s theory. It is easy enough, however, to reconstruct a Hartshornean response to Molinism. Above all, it is important to appreciate that, of necessity, the logical subjects of God’s middle knowledge are possible persons. God’s knowledge of what would be the case for any free creature is pre-volitional; that is to say, God knows, prior to creating, what any creature, whether it is eventually created or not, would do under any given circumstance. Middle knowledge cannot serve to guide God’s providential decisions about which world to create if it depends upon which world God creates. For this reason, the usual characterization of middle knowledge as “counter-factuals of freedom” is seriously misleading. Prior to God’s decision to create a world, there are no creatures and, hence, no fact of the matter about any actual creature. There are only possible creatures. Hartshorne denied the existence of possible non-actual individuals. In Man’s Vision of God and the Logic of Theism he wrote, “There is an unutilized possibility of individuals, but not an individuality of unutilized possibility.” (See also, “Charles’s Hartshorne: Neoclassical Metaphysics.”) Given these views, it is clear that Hartshorne would reject Molinism.

There is a hint of irony in claiming to know what Hartshorne would say about middle knowledge. Does this not presuppose a kind of middle knowledge of Hartshorne? In view of what was just said about the logical subjects of middle knowledge, the answer to this question should be obvious. Hartshorne was not a possible person; he was a real person whose views on various philosophical topics were clearly stated. The argument is this: Molinism entails belief in possible persons; Hartshorne denied the existence of possible persons; therefore, Hartshorne would deny Molinism. This argument points to one of the most puzzling features of Molinism, to wit, that middle knowledge is not grounded in fact. Hartshorne’s developmental and cumulative view of process permits speculation about what a given actual person would or might do under various sets of circumstances. These “would be” and “might be” statements are grounded in the world-historical process itself, including a person’s character as so far formed or (as in Hartshorne’s case) as it was formed. Hartshorne made precisely this point in his response to Robert Kane in the Library of Living Philosophers volume devoted to Hartshorne’s work. For Hartshorne, God’s knowledge of the world is similar to our knowledge in that it requires a real relation from the object of knowledge to the knower. The difference, in God’s case, is that divine knowledge is eminent—God perfectly knows the extent to which the future is open or closed at any particular juncture of the creative advance.

A subtle objection to Hartshorne’s theory of omniscience is that it represents God as ignorant of certain truths. To be sure, the neoclassical God perfectly knows the past—what did or did not happen—but does God, as so conceived, know everything that will or will not happen? Consider a person, P, at time T1 as yet undecided about a difficult choice: will P choose B or not-B? Let us suppose that at T2 the person decides B. On Hartshorne’s account, God knows at T2 that P chooses B, but God does not know at T1 that P will choose B. The argument can be further refined: an omniscient being knows all truths; at T1, either “P will choose B” or “P will choose not-B” is true; the neoclassical God does not know at T1 which of the statements is true; therefore, this God is not omniscient.

Hartshorne’s initial response to this objection, in a 1939 article, was to argue, in effect, that there are three truth values: true, false, and indeterminate. According to this view—which may have been Aristotle’s—future tense statements have an indeterminate truth value. Hartshorne was unhappy with this idea because it requires abandoning the law of excluded middle; if p concerns a future event, then “p or not-p” is best construed as indeterminate rather than (as in traditional logic) a tautology. In Man’s Vision of God and the Logic of Theism, Hartshorne hit upon a different response to the argument, one which he would develop more fully in an article in Mind in 1965 (reprinted in Creative Experiencing). Hartshorne’s mature position was to argue that “P will choose B” and “P will choose not-B” are best construed as contraries rather than contradictories. The strict contradictory of “P will choose B” is “P may not choose B” and the strict contradictory of “P will not choose B” is “P may choose B.” The statements forms in the triad—“P will choose B,” “P will not choose B” and “P may or may not choose B”—are mutually exclusive: if one is true the other two are false. In this way, Hartshorne preserves the law of excluded middle as to truth values while allowing for the openness of the future.

Since, on Hartshorne’s view, “will” and “will not” statements are contraries, it is incorrect to represent them in the sentential meta-language as, respectively, p and not-p. Rather, “X will occur” and “X will not occur” should be represented as p and q, where ~ (p & q) (that is, “not-(p and q)”). A similar mapping of object language expressions onto sentential meta-language is needed in other domains as when one represents the pairs of contraries, “commands X” vs. “forbids X” or “legally requires X” vs. “legally requires not-X”: the remaining alternative in each case, respectively, is “makes no command with respect to X” and “there is no legal requirement with respect to X.” The metaphysical underpinning of Hartshorne’s proposed semantics of future tense statements is his indeterminism, according to which past causal conditions require (X will occur), exclude (X will not occur), or permit (X may or may not occur) various effects in the future.

Anticipating an objection, Hartshorne admits that it seems paradoxical to say that “X will occur,” as a prediction, is false even when X in fact occurs. Hartshorne replies that the “paradox” may be no more problematic than the familiar fact that a false scientific law can be verified (or corroborated). This is simply one more instance of the so-called paradox of material implication. We accept that “if p then q” is true when p is false, even if this seems counter-intuitive. The paradox dissolves upon the realization that any other truth functional definition of the conditional besides the standard one—“if p then q” is equivalent by definition to “not-p or q”—yields manifestly invalid inferences. Hartshorne takes a clue from Popper and says that the decisive operation where “will be” statements are concerned is falsification. “X will occur” is shown to be false when X does not occur, but it is not shown to have been true when X occurs. Hartshorne’s view requires that, in the strictest philosophical sense, “will be” statements are disguised “must be” statements. Intuitions among competent speakers of the language differ on this point so it is reasonable not to expect the issue to be decided by ordinary language. When Scrooge, in Dickens’ A Christmas Carol, asks the Ghost of Christmas Future whether he is seeing the shadows of the things that “will be” or the shadows of the things that “may be only,” he is expressing in a precise way Hartshorne’s analysis of future tense statements. If the shadows are of the things that “will be,” then all hope is lost, but if they are the shadows of the things that “may be only” then Scrooge can change his ways and make for himself a different future.

Our discussion to this point has followed philosophical orthodoxy by focusing on whether God knows the truth values of propositions. For Hartshorne, however, this question is secondary, for there is more to knowledge than knowledge that a proposition is true. In The Principles of Psychology, William James, following John Grote distinguished, “knowledge of acquaintance” and “knowledge-about,” a distinction later made famous by Bertrand Russell who spoke of “knowledge by acquaintance” and “knowledge by description.” To have information about something or someone is not the same as having first-hand awareness of them. The two sorts of knowledge are related as more abstract to more concrete. It is one thing to read about a battle, quite another to have experienced it for oneself. Moreover, as a general rule, the more abstract the knowledge, the more emotionally detached it can be. The basic form of knowledge that Hartshorne attributes to deity is direct acquaintance through the affective bonds of feeling; Hartshorne adopts Whitehead’s term “prehension” for the most concrete facts of relatedness among dynamic singulars. If God’s knowledge is prehensive, it is perhaps easier to understand why Hartshorne resists the idea that God knows the future as determinate: no one is acquainted with the future; at best one has knowledge of acquaintance of the future as an array of tendencies towards actualization or as possibilities entertained. Moreover, conceiving God’s relations with the creatures as prehensive places emphasis on the affective dimension of divine knowing. God’s knowing, as feelings of the feelings of others can then be conceived as a form of caring.

Hartshorne’s theory posits God’s perfect knowledge of the future as relatively indeterminate and of the past as determinate. Yet, the past, even if it is determinate as Hartshorne claims, is no longer. Does this mean that God also lacks knowledge of acquaintance with the past? Hartshorne answers in the negative and it is important to understand his reasons. A creature, having specific spatio-temporal location, has acquaintance with at most a vanishingly small segment of events in space and time, and even that knowledge is shot through with fallibility. Most of our knowledge of the past is through inference and by description. We know by acquaintance the past we have lived, but most of our knowledge of the past is about the past. God’s knowledge is both quantitatively and qualitatively different. Divine experience encompasses everything that has ever come to pass. As a localized individual has acquaintance with its past, God, in an analogous fashion, has acquaintance with all that is past. Divine knowledge, moreover, not only knows all of the past but knows it with perfect adequacy. God’s is the eminent form of prehension. On Hartshorne’s principles, the distant past must be as vivid for God as the recent past. In other words, the past does not “fade” for God. The difference, for God, between distant past events and recent ones is in the knowledge that recent events were preceded by the distant ones whereas there was a time when the recent events were, at best, outlines of what could be relative to distant past events.

The extent of God’s knowledge of the past is a point of contention between Whitehead (or Whiteheadians) and Hartshorne. In the concluding lines of Process and Reality, Whitehead speaks of how creaturely achievements, though transient, are everlastingly remembered by God, making them objectively immortal. The “unfading importance of our immediate actions” are said to “perish and yet live for evermore.” In the Library of Living Philosophers volume on Hartshorne, Lewis Ford interprets Whitehead to mean that each actual occasion (Hartshorne’s dynamic singulars) undergoes a two stage process, its coming-to-be (during which it is a subject of experience) and its objectification (in which it ceases to be a subject of experience) in the coming-to-be of subsequent occasions. According to Ford, it was Whitehead’s “momentous discovery” in metaphysics that the subject/object distinction is a difference in temporal modality; that is to say, an occasion’s status in the present, as it comes to be, is to be a subject, but as past it is an object. Hartshorne agrees with much of this analysis, but he objects to Whitehead’s metaphor of perishing. Hartshorne contends that the objects that are prehended by subsequent occasions are past subjects. If the being of an actual entity is constituted by its becoming, as Whitehead says (and Hartshorne agrees), then God’s prehension of an occasion is precisely God’s feeling of that occasion’s feelings. What exists everlastingly in the divine memory is not merely a knowledge that a dynamic singular felt in a particular way, but an acquaintance with how it felt. Hartshorne likens God’s memory of a person’s experiences to the person’s own vivid recollection of their past experiences.

6. Panentheism

A distinctive feature of Hartshorne’s theism, and one that sets it apart from Whitehead’s theism, is that God includes the universe in a way that bears a distant analogy with the way that a person includes his or her body. Until 1941 Hartshorne spoke of a “new pantheism,” but afterwards he spoke of panentheism, meaning that all (pan) is in (en) God (theos). Hartshorne cited Plato’s World-Soul analogy in some of the later dialogues as an anticipation of panentheism. Hartshorne, however, divests the doctrine of any vestige of mind-body dualism. God is not an immaterial entity haunting the universe; rather, as Hartshorne says in Omnipotence and Other Theological Mistakes, God is “the individual integrity of ‘the world,’ which otherwise is just the myriad creatures.” Hartshorne relies on modern cell theory for an analogy which, of course, was unavailable to Plato. Every localized dynamic singular is, as it were, a cell, in the body of God. An important disanalogy is that the universe, unlike a body within the universe, has no environment external to itself. Thus, in the divine case, the “body” of God and the “environment” in which God operates are one and the same. Hartshorne expresses this idea by saying that God’s “environment” is wholly internal. He adds that the disanalogy explains why there are no specialized organs—such as liver, heart, and brain—in the divine body as there must be in a localized body. Specialized organs allow a localized body to monitor itself in its relation to its environment, but there is no other environment for God to negotiate except the universe. Dombrowski rightly says that, for Hartshorne, it is as true to say that the cosmos is ensouled as to say that God is embodied (Dombrowski 1996, 86).

Hartshorne also used analogies of persons related to persons as symbolic language for the relationship between God and the creatures. He was deeply critical, however, of the male bias of traditional theology. The few female metaphors used for God in the Bible, for example, were overshadowed by the dominance of male images—Lord of Hosts, Father, King—which reinforced patriarchal attitudes. Hartshorne considered himself a feminist. Sometime in the late 1970s or early 1980s, he was alerted to the problem of sexism in language and so he began using inclusive language as one can see in Omnipotence and Other Theological Mistakes and elsewhere. He said that, in retrospect, it would have been better had his early book Man’s Vision of God been titled Our Vision of God. (Auxier and Davies 2001, 159). Hartshorne’s feminism is also apparent in a variation he gives to panentheism. He argued that the relationship between mother and fetus is decidedly more intimate than the relation between father and fetus. Thus, for some purposes, the analogy of a pregnant mother for the relation between God and the creatures is preferable to any male counterpart. Of course, the pregnancy analogy, like all symbolic language for deity, has a restricted use. Nevertheless, re-imagining God as a woman is a useful reminder of the male bias of traditional theology and it helps to highlight aspects of the God/World relationship that were obscured by that bias.

Analogies like World-Soul, person-cell, or pregnancy, are at best distant approximations for the relationship of God to the world. As metaphors they are literally false, but they are aids in understanding what Hartshorne has in mind when he says that God includes the world. Hartshorne’s argument for panentheism is disarmingly simple: If God is the greatest conceivable reality, then God must include all that is valuable in the universe. Otherwise, there would be a reality greater than God, namely, the universe-plus-God. Could God include what is valuable in the universe without including the universe? Hartshorne does not think so. Each dynamic singular that comes to be is not simply an additional fact; it is, by virtue of Hartshorne’s panexperientialist psychicalism also a value-achievement, and that value-achievement is greater in more complex organisms. We have previously used the examples of Mozart and Beethoven as introducing new values into the universe, but other examples are legion. The sum total of value in the universe, which is inseparable from the dynamic singulars that comprise it, is ever increasing according to Hartshorne’s process-relational metaphysic. It must therefore be included within God if God is to be conceived as the reality than which none is greater.

Norris Clarke says that medieval philosophers anticipated Hartshorne’s argument and replied to it (Clarke 1990, 108). They said that the reality described by “God plus the universe” involves more beings in a quantitative sense, but not greater perfection of being in a qualitative sense. More precisely, says Clarke, “God plus the universe” means that there are more sharers in being. All value is in God, and the creatures merely share or participate in that value. By way of analogy, Clarke says that a mathematician may impart her knowledge to her students. Once the students learn what the teacher has to teach there is not more knowledge in the class, there is only more of those sharing in the knowledge. A different analogy, however, could be used to bring out the distinctiveness of Hartshorne’s view. A music teacher may provide her class with the basics of theory and composition, but the students can create new musical pieces, each with a value of its own. In this example, there are not simply more sharers of being, but more creators of value. The medieval response that Clarke gives is defective, on Hartshorne’s reckoning, at precisely the point that process-relational theology departs from classical theism: the universe is not simply a product of divine creativity but of multiple creative agents. Classical theism had the unhappy consequence of divesting the creatures of any value that is their own, except for what is on loan from God. The sum-total value or perfection of existence is the same whether or not the creatures exist. For this reason, Hartshorne considered his panentheism to give a better account than classical theism of what it means to serve God. If the value in a creature is wholly borrowed from God, then the individual can offer God nothing that did not already belong to God by natural endowment. For Hartshorne, on the other hand, the creatures may be imperfect, but they are not mere conduits for values that God already possesses. On the contrary, their value contributes to that of God—hence, Hartshorne’s expression, “contributionism.”

A question that Hartshorne raised in Man’s Vision of God and the Logic of Theism and that he discussed with E. S. Brightman in their correspondence was whether it is possible for God to include individuals that hold erroneous beliefs without also holding those beliefs. Put somewhat differently, if different individuals hold contradictory beliefs and God “includes” those individuals and their beliefs, does God hold contradictory beliefs? Similar puzzles can be raised about God’s inclusion of individuals who commit terrible crimes—is the evil of the criminal deed a property of God? Or again, can God include creatures who are anxious about their death without also being anxious about death? Hartshorne replies that the logic of parts and wholes is such that they do not necessarily share properties—for example, a sand dune is not the size of a grain of sand even though it is made of grains of sand. Each part of the universe, Hartshorne holds, is a dynamic singular with an activity of its own that is not simply the activity of the universe as a whole (this is another way of expressing indeterminism). By parity of reasoning, these centers of individual activity, or the organisms of which they are parts, can have properties (such as false beliefs, evil deeds, or anxiety about death) that are not shared by the whole. A person can remember formerly holding a false belief or doing something wrong; God, by analogous extension, can prehend—that is, make part of the divine life—the errors and sins of the creatures without thereby being in error or sinning. It is important to add that while Hartshorne denies that God is the author of creaturely lack of wisdom and virtue, God nevertheless suffers their negative effects. In Creativity in American Philosophy, Hartshorne maintains that God feels how others feel without feeling as they feel (1984, 199).

Two advantages of panentheism, as Hartshorne argues for it, are that it provides a ready argument in support of monotheism and it addresses the empiricist challenge of how to identify the referent of the word God. If God is an all-inclusive reality, then there can be only one God because there can be only one all-inclusive reality. In “Synthesis as Polydyadic Inclusion,” Hartshorne defines inclusion in these terms: if X includes Y, then X + Y = X (1976, 247). If X denotes God and Y denotes the universe, then God, plus the universe is God. The argument that there could not be two all-inclusive deities is this: suppose W and X are two all-inclusive deities; this means that each must include the other. That is to say, W + X = X and W + X = W, but in that case, W = X. As for the empiricist challenge, the conditions for the identification of the panentheistic God are not the same as would be required to identify a localized being. Individuals within the cosmos occupy a tiny portion of the universe for a vanishingly brief period. Their influence is felt locally but not universally. God, on the other hand, is affected by all and affects all. As Hartshorne says, God is the one individual with strictly universal functions (1948, 31; 1967, 76). From this, he infers that God is the one individual identifiable, or picked out, by concepts alone. Other individuals have properties that might have been had by others (for example, Obama was the Democratic candidate for President in 2008, but he need not have been) and the properties they actually have might have been different (for example, Hillary Clinton was born in Chicago, but she could have been born elsewhere). The formal properties of God as all inclusive are unique to God: no other individual has universal functions. One might search the earth for Obama or Clinton, but it would be profoundly misguided to search the earth, or the cosmos, for God. The description of God in the book of Acts is applicable to Hartshorne’s panentheism: God is the one “in whom we live, move, and have our being.”

7. Conclusion

The amount of energy that Hartshorne devoted to questions surrounding the nature and existence of God might lead one to classify him as a theologian. Yet, his defense of dipolar theism presupposes no sectarian dogma, makes no appeals to “revealed” truths or books, and privileges no mystical experience. There can be no question that he was first and foremost—as he himself emphasized—a philosopher. Various ideas about deity that he defended, most notably his critique of divine immutability and impassibility, have been widely influential although few would be willing to call themselves Hartshorneans. A case in point is the late William P. Alston who had been a student in Hartshorne’s class and who, late in his career, attempted to find a mediating position between Hartshorne and Aquinas. Another example of Hartshorne’s influence is that he spoke explicitly of “the openness of God” fully thirty years before that expression was adopted by a group of evangelical Christians to describe a deity open to creaturely influence and that faces a relatively open future. Some of the major figures in that movement—William Hasker, Gregory Boyd, and Richard Rice—acknowledge a debt to Hartshorne’s arguments for conceiving God in relational terms even as they distance themselves from the heterodox elements of his thinking. One may also mention Hartshorne as a pioneer who contributed to the recent widespread interest among philosophers of religion in panentheism. Carol Christ, long at the forefront of feminist theology, sees in Hartshorne’s work philosophically sophisticated ways of “re-imagining the divine in the world.”

Although he was a philosopher, Hartshorne’s work has attracted the attention of theologians. In 1973, a volume devoted to his thought was published in a series titled, “Makers of the Modern Theological Mind.” Many theologians, such as Schubert Ogden (who studied with Hartshorne at Chicago), Marjorie Suchocki, Sheila Devaney, Anna Case-Winters, and Theodore Walker, Jr., have critically appropriated Hartshorne’s philosophical theology. John B. Cobb Jr. (who also studied with Hartshorne at Chicago), once commented that it is often the case that a philosopher that gains a following among theologians is regarded with suspicion by other philosophers. This tendency may be less prominent since the resurgence of interest in philosophy of religion in the closing decades of the twentieth century. Of course, Hartshorne was active throughout the century, vigorously defending the rationality of dipolar theism in the heyday of the Vienna Circle. At a time when religious discourse was widely regarded as nonsensical, Hartshorne met and challenged the positivists on their own terms. It is fair to say that Hartshorne was influenced by his Chicago colleague Rudolf Carnap in his insistence on high standards of logical rigor. Carnap was, in turn, constructively engaged with Hartshorne’s work. Carnap was reportedly intrigued by Hartshorne’s formal reduction to absurdity disproof of the coherence of classical attributes of deity as developed in The Divine Relativity; he worked with Hartshorne closely on the technical appendix to Chapter II on “Relativity and Logical Entailment” in The Divine Relativity.

Hartshorne’s development of a philosophical theology according to which God is transcendent yet inseparable from temporal processes is arguably one of his lasting achievements. His defense of divine relativity may well be the single most important factor in dissolving the near consensus that once prevailed that an entirely unchanging and eternal deity should be considered normative for theology. He considered the deity of the classical tradition as at once too active and too passive. It is too active in the sense that nothing falls outside its control; the creatures are left to unwittingly play roles decided for them in eternity—“imitations of life” as Jules Lequyer called them. It is too static in the sense that it cannot change or be affected by the triumphs and tragedies of the creatures. In short, it is a deity that acts but is never acted upon and can therefore never interact. This is captured in the Aristotelian formula that was borrowed and reinterpreted by medieval thinkers to denote the God of the Abrahamic traditions: God as the “unmoved mover.” In a discussion of Mortimer Adler’s use of this formula, Hartshorne once called it a half-truth parading as the full truth. Hartshorne admired Abraham Heschel for reversing this idea by calling God the “most moved mover” (a phrase later adopted by Clark Pinnock). Hartshorne amended this formula to distill the essence of dipolar or neoclassical theism: God is the most and best moved mover.

8. Suggestions for Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

i. Books (in order of appearance)

  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1941. Man’s Vision of God and the Logic of Theism. Chicago: Willett, Clark and Company.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1948. The Divine Relativity: A Social Conception of God. New Haven. Connecticut: Yale University Press.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1953. Reality as Social Process: Studies in Metaphysics and Religion. Boston: Beacon Press.
  • Hartshorne, Charles and William L. Reese, eds. 1953. Philosophers Speak of God. University of Chicago Press. Republished in 2000 by Humanity Books.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1962. The Logic of Perfection and Other Essays in Neoclassical Metaphysics. La Salle, Illinois: Open Court.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1965. Anselm’s Discovery: A Re-examination of the Ontological Proof for God’s Existence. La Salle, Illinois: Open Court.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1967. A Natural Theology for Our Time. La Salle, Illinois: Open Court.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1970. Creative Synthesis and Philosophic Method. La Salle, Illinois: Open Court.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1976. Aquinas to Whitehead: Seven Centuries of Metaphysics of Religion. Milwaukee, Wisconsin: Marquette University Publications.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1984. Creativity in American Philosophy. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1984. Omnipotence and Other Theological Mistakes. Albany: State University of New Press.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1987. Wisdom as Moderation: A Philosophy of the Middle Way. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1997. The Zero Fallacy and Other Essays in Neoclassical Philosophy, edited by Mohammad Valady. Peru, Illinois: Open Court Publishing Company.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 2011. Creative Experiencing: A Philosophy of Freedom, edited by Donald W. Viney and Jincheol O. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Auxier, Randall E. and Mark Y. A. Davies, editors. 2001. Hartshorne and Brightman on God, Process, and Persons: The Correspondence, 1922-1945. Nashville: Vanderbilt University Press.
  • Viney, Donald W., guest editor. 2001. Process Studies, Special Focus on Charles Hartshorne, 30/2 (Fall-Winter)
  • Viney, Donald W., guest editor. 2011. Process Studies, Special Focus Section: Charles Hartshorne, 40/1 (Spring/Summer): 91-161.

ii. Hartshorne’s Response to his Critics

  • Cobb, John B. Jr. and Franklin L Gamwell, editors. 1984. Existence and Actuality: Conversations with Charles Hartshorne. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Hahn, Lewis Edwin, editor. 1991. The Philosophy of Charles Hartshorne, The Library of Living Philosophers Volume XX. La Salle, Illinois: Open Court.
  • Kane, Robert and Stephen H. Phillips, editors. 1989. Hartshorne, Process Philosophy and Theology. Albany State University of New York Press.
  • Sia, Santiago, editor. 1990. Charles Hartshorne’s Concept of God: Philosophical and Theological Responses. Dordrecht, the Netherlands: Kluwer Academic Publishers.

iii. Selected Articles

  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1945. Entries for “Eternal” (256), “Eternity” (257), “Foreknowledge, Divine” (284), “Omniscience” (546-47), “time” (787-88), “transcendence” (791-92) in An Encyclopedia of Religion, ed. Vergilius Ferm. New York: Philosophical Library.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1950. “The Divine Relativity and Absoluteness: A Reply [to John Wild].” Review of Metaphysics 4, 1: 31-60.
  • Hartshorne, Charles.1966. “A New Look at the Problem of Evil,” Current Philosophical Issues: Essays in Honor of Curt John Ducasse, edited by Frederick C. Dommeyer. Springfield, Illinois: Charles C. Thomas: 201-212.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1967. “Religion in Process Philosophy,” Religion in Philosophical and Cultural Perspective: A New Approach to the Philosophy of Religion Through Cross Disciplinary Studies, edited by J. Clayton Feaver and William Horosz. Princeton, New Jersey: D. Van Nostrand Company, Inc.: 246-268.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1967. “The Dipolar Conception of Deity.” Review of Metaphysics 21, 2: 273-89.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1969. “Divine Absoluteness and Divine Relativity.” Transcendence, eds. Herbert W. Richardson and Donald R. Cutler. Boston: Beacon: 164-71.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1971. “Could There Have Been Nothing? A Reply [to Houston Craighead].”  Process Studies 1, 1: 25-28.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1976. “Synthesis as Polydyadic Inclusion: A Reply to Sessions’ Charles Hartshorne and Thirdness,” Southern Journal of Philosophy 14/2: 245-55.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1977. “Bell’s Theorem and Stapp’s Revised View of Space-Time.” Process Studies 7/3 (Fall): 183-191.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1978. “Theism in Asian and Western Thought.” Philosophy East and West 28, 4: 401-11.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1980. “Mysticism and Rationalistic Metaphysics.” Understanding Mysticism, edited by Richard Woods. Garden City, New York: Image: 415-421.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1984. “Toward a Buddhisto-Christian Religion.” Buddhism and American Thinkers, edited by Kenneth K. Inada and Nolan P. Jacobson. Albany State University of NewYork Press: 1-13.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1992. “The Aesthetic Dimensions of Religious Experience.” Logic, God and Metaphysics, edited by James Franklin Harris. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers: 9-18.
  • Hartshorne, Charles.1993. “Can Philosophers Cooperate Intellectually: Metaphysics as Applied Mathematics.” The Midwest Quarterly 35/1 (Autumn): 8-20.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Blanchette, Oliva. 1994. “The Logic of Perfection in Aquinas.” Thomas Aquinas and His Legacy. Edited by David M. Gallagher. Studies in Philosophy and the History of Philosophy, Volume 28. Washington, D.C.: The Catholic University of America Press: 107-130.
  • Boyd, Gregory A. Trinity and Process: A Critical Evaluation and Reconstruction of Hartshorne’s Di-Polar Theism Towards a Trinitarian Metaphysics. New York: Peter Lang, 1992.
  • Burrell, David B. 1982. “Does Process Theology Rest on a Mistake?” Theological Studies 43/1 (March): 125-135.
  • Case-Winters, Anna. 1990. God’s Power: Traditional Understandings and Contemporary Challenges. Louisville, Kentucky: Westminster/John Knox Press.
  • Christ, Carol P. 2003. She Who Changes: Re-Imagining the Divine in the World. New York: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Clarke, Bowman. 1966. Language and Natural Theology. The Hague: Mouton & Co.
  • Clarke, Bowman. 1995. “Two Process Views of God.” God, Reason and Religions: New Essays in the Philosophy of Religions. Edited by Eugene Thomas Long. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers: 61-74.
  • Clarke, W. Norris. 1990. “Charles Hartshorne’s Philosophy of God: A Thomistic Critique,” Charles Hartshorne’s Concept of God: Philosophical and Theological Responses. Edited by Santiago Sia. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers: 103-23.
  • Davaney, Sheila Greeve. 1986. Divine Power: A Study of Karl Barth and Charles Hartshorne. Harvard Dissertations in Religion, number 19. Philadelphia: Fortress Press.
  • Dombrowski, Daniel A. 1996. Analytic Theism, Hartshorne, and the Concept of God. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Dombrowski, Daniel A. 2004. Divine Beauty: The Aesthetics of Charles Hartshorne. Nashville, Tennessee: Vanderbilt University Press.
  • Enxing, Julia and Klaus Müller, editors. 2011. Perfect Changes: Die Religionsphilosophie Charles Hartshornes. Regensburg: Friedrich Pustet.
  • Enxing, Julia. 2013. Gott im Werden. Die Prozesstheologie Charles Hartshorne. Regensburg: Friedrich Pustet.
  • Fitzgerald, Paul. 1972. “Relativity Physics and the God of Process Philosophy.” Process Studies 2/4 (Winter): 251-276.
  • Ford, Lewis S. 1968. “Is Process Theism Compatible with Relativity Theory?” Journal of Religion 48/2 (April): 124-135.
  • Geisler, Norman L. 1976. “Process Theology.” Tensions in Contemporary Theology. Edited by Stanley N. Gundry and Alan F. Johnson. Chicago: Moody Press: 235-284.
  • Alan Gragg. 1973. Charles Hartshorne, Maker of the Modern Theological Mind, edited by Bob E. Patterson. Waco, Texas: Word Books Publisher.
  • Griffin, David Ray, John B. Cobb Jr., Marcus P. Ford, Pete A. Y. Gunter, and Peter Ochs. 1993. Founders of Constructive Postmodern Philosophy: Peirce, James, Bergson, Whitehead, and Hartshorne. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Gruenler, Royce Gordon. 1983. The Inexhaustible God: Biblical Faith and the Challenge of Process Theism. Grand Rapids, Michigan: Baker Book House.
  • Gunton, Colin E. 1978. Becoming and Being: The Doctrine of God in Charles Hartshorne and Karl Barth. Oxford University Press.
  • James, Ralph E. 1967. The Concrete God, A New Beginning for Theology—The Thought of Charles Hartshorne. Indianapolis, Indiana: The Bobbs-Merrill Company.
  • Kachappilly, Kurian. 2002. God of Love: A Neoclassical Inquiry. Bangalore, India: Dharmaram Publications.
  • Moskop, John C. 1984. Divine Omniscience and Human Freedom: Thomas Aquinas and Charles Hartshorne. Foreword by Charles Hartshorne. Macon, Georgia: Mercer University Press.
  • Myers, William, guest editor. 1998. The Personalist Forum, Special Issue on Charles Hartshorne, 14/2 (Fall).
  • Nash, Ronald H. editor. 1987. Process Theology. Grand Rapids, Michigan: Baker Book House.
  • Neville, Robert C. 1980. Creativity and God: A Challenge to Process Theology. New York: The Seabury Press.
  • Neville, Robert C. 2009. Realism in Religion: A Pragmatist’s Perspective. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Peters, Eugene H. 1970. Hartshorne and Neoclassical Metaphysics. Lincoln: University of Nebraska Press.
  • Pratt, Douglas. 2002. Relational Deity: Hartshorne and Macquarrie on God. Lanham, Maryland: University Press of America.
  • Ramal, Randy, editor. 2010. Metaphysics, Analysis, and the Grammar of God: Process and Analytic Voices in Dialogue .Tübingen, Germany: Mohr Siebeck.
  • Sanders, John. 2007. The God Who Risks: A Theology of Divine Providence, revised edition. Downers Grove, Illinois: IVP Academic.
  • Shields, George W. 1983. “God, Modality and Incoherence.” Encounter 44/1: 27-39.
  • Shields, George W. 1992. “Hartshorne and Creel on Impassibility,” Process Studies 21/1 (Spring): 44-59.
  • Shields, George W. 1992. “Infinitesimals and Hartshorne’s Set-Theoretic Platonism” The Modern Schoolman 49/2 (January): 123-134.
  • Shields, George W. 2003. “Omniscience and Radical Particularity: Reply to Simoni,” Religious Studies 39/2 (October).
  • Shields, George W. 2009. “Quo Vadis?: On Current Prospects for Process Philosophy and Theology,” The American Journal of Theology & Philosophy, 30/2 (May).
  • Shields, George W. 2010. “Eternal Objects, Middle Knowledge, and Hartshorne: A Response to Malone-France,” Process Studies, 39/1 (Spring/Summer): 149-165.
  • Shields, George W. 2010. “Panexperientialism, Quantum Theory, and Neuroplasticity” in Process Approaches to Consciousness, eds. Michel Weber and A. Weekes. (Albany: State University of New York Press).
  • Shields, George W., editor. 2003. Process and Analysis: Whitehead, Hartshorne, and the Analytic Tradition. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Sia, Santiago. 1985. God in Process Thought: A Study in Charles Hartshorne’s Concept of God. Postscript by Charles Hartshorne. Dordrecht, the Netherlands: Martinus Nijhoff.
  • Sia, Santiago. 2004. Religion, Reason and God: Essays in the Philosophy of Charles Hartshorne and A. N. Whitehead. Frankfurt am Main: Peter Lang.
  • Sia, Santiago, editor. 1986. Process Theology and the Christian Doctrine of God, special edition of Word and Spirit, a Monastic Review, 8. Petersham, Massachusetts: St. Bede’s Publications.
  • Simoni-Wastila, Henry. 1999. “Is Divine Relativity Possible? Charles Hartshorne on God’s Sympathy with the World.” Process Studies 28/1-2 (Spring-Summer): 98-116.
  • Sprigge, T. L. S. 2006. The God of Metaphysics. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Suchocki, Marjorie Hewitt and John B. Cobb, Jr. editors. 1992. Process Studies, Special Issue on the Philosophy of Charles Hartshorne, 21/2 (Summer).
  • Towne, Edgar A. 1997. Two Types of Theism: Knowledge of God in the Thought of Paul Tillich and Charles Hartshorne. New York: Peter Lang.
  • Viney, Donald Wayne. 1985. Charles Hartshorne and the Existence of God. Albany State University of New York Press.
  • Viney, Donald Wayne. 1989. “Does Omniscience Imply Foreknowledge? Craig on Hartshorne.” Process Studies, 18/1 (Spring): 30-37.
  • Viney, Donald Wayne. 2000. “What is Wrong with the Mirror Image? A Brief Reply to Simoni-Wastila on the Problem of Radical Particularity,” Process Studies, 29/2 (Fall-Winter): 365-367.
  • Viney, Donald Wayne. 2005. “Hartshorne, Charles (1897-2000)” The Dictionary of Modern American Philosophers, edited by John R. Shook (London: Thoemmes Press): 1056-62.
  • Viney, Donald Wayne. 2006. “God as the Most and Best Moved Mover: Charles Hartshorne’s Importance to Philosophical Theology.” The Midwest Quarterly, 48/1: 10-28.
  • Viney, Donald Wayne. 2007. “Hartshorne’s Dipolar Theism and the Mystery of God.” Philosophia, 35: 341-350.
  • Wilcox, John T. 1961. “A Question from Physics for Certain Theists.” Journal of Religion 40/4 (October): 293-300.
  • Wood, Forest Jr. and Michael DeArmey, editors. 1986. Hartshorne’s Neo-Classical Theology. Tulane Studies in Philosophy, volume 34.

c. Bibliography

“Primary Bibliography of Philosophical Works of Charles Hartshorne” (compiled by Dorothy Hartshorne; corrected, revised, and updated by Donald Wayne Viney and Randy Ramal) in Herbert F. Vetter, editor, Hartshorne: A New World View: Essays by Charles Hartshorne (Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard Square Library, 2007): 129-160. Also published in Santiago Sia, Religion, Reason and God (Frankfurt am Main: Peter Lang, 2004): 195-223.

Author Information

Donald Wayne Viney
Pittsburg State University
U. S. A.


George W. Shields
Kentucky State University
U. S. A.