Charles Hartshorne: Theistic and Anti-Theistic Arguments
Charles Hartshorne is well known in philosophical circles for his rehabilitation of Anselm’s ontological argument. Indeed, he may have written more on that subject than any other philosopher. He considered it to be the argument that, more than any other, reveals the logical status of theism. Nevertheless, he always clearly and explicitly denied that the argument was his reason for being a theist. There are two reasons for this. First, he believed that, without a revision in the very concept of deity, Anselm’s argument could readily be turned upside down, so to speak, so as to constitute not a proof of theism but its disproof. Consequently, Hartshorne believed that a full defense of theism requires developing a coherent concept of God. (See “Charles Hartshorne: Dipolar Theism.”) Second, Hartshorne’s revised ontological argument does not stand alone. It is one strand in a fabric of reasoning which he sometimes called “the global argument.” He followed C. S. Peirce’s recommendation that philosophy should rely on a variety of interrelated pieces of evidence rather than trust to the conclusiveness of a single argument. Peirce (5.265) used the analogy of a cable, the strength of which is in the combination of its numerous fibers. Peirce specifically mentioned that this way of arguing is typical of science, but it is also evident in other areas such as law, history, and literary criticism. Nowadays, philosophers use Basil Mitchell’s terminology and call the multiple argument strategy a “cumulative case.” Hartshorne’s most systematic presentation of the global argument is in the fourteenth chapter of Creative Synthesis and Philosophic Method, titled “Six Theistic Proofs.” Not long after this essay appeared, he stopped calling the arguments proofs, for he recognized that it is often the case that equally rational and informed philosophers disagree on fundamental issues. For this reason, he presented the global argument in a way that emphasizes both the rational basis of neoclassical theism and the rational cost of rejecting it. In addition to discussing Hartshorne’s case for theism, this article also addresses Hartshorne’s reflections on the problem of evil.
Table of Contents
- Anselm’s Discovery and the Ontological Argument
- The Global Argument
- The Problem of Evil and Theodicy
- References and Further Reading
It used to be customary to speak in the singular of “Anselm’s ontological argument.” Hartshorne was the first to argue that this is mistaken. Setting aside the question of Anselm’s intentions, Hartshorne found that two arguments are suggested in Anselm’s Proslogion, one in chapter II, another in chapter III. Hartshorne made this point in 1944 in an article published in The Philosophical Review and again in 1953 in Philosophers Speak of God. The philosophical world did not take notice until 1960 when Norman Malcolm’s article, “Anselm’s Ontological Arguments,” made the distinction between the two arguments famous. Hartshorne, like Malcolm, agreed with Anselm’s critics that the first argument (in chapter II) is fallacious, but the second argument (in chapter III), which has a modal structure, he considered valid. The difficulty in showing that the argument is sound kept Hartshorne from thinking of it as demonstrating God’s existence. In The Logic of Perfection, Hartshorne presented a formalized version of the argument using C. I. Lewis’s system S5, the first such formalization to be published. In Anselm’s Discovery, he again defended a version of the argument and canvassed the various treatments of Anselm’s reasoning in the history of philosophy, including an anticipation of the argument in Plato noted by the scholar Prescott Johnson.
In the introduction to George L. Goodwin’s The Ontological Argument of Charles Hartshorne, and again in Creative Experiencing, Hartshorne reduced the modal ontological argument to what he considered to be its essentials. The argument’s logical symbols are the tilde (~) for negation, the arrow (→) for strict implication, M for “is logically possible” (thus, “~M~” means “is logically necessary”), and p* stands for “God exists,” where God is defined as “a being unsurpassable by any other conceivable being.” (In Hartshorne’s dipolar theism, the divine can, in some senses, surpass itself but it is unsurpassable by any other being). The argument is presented as follows:
- Mp* → ~M~p*
- Therefore, ~M~p*
If necessity (~M~) is what is common to all possibilities—a common definition—and if any state of affairs that is actual is also possible—a standard modal principle—then the conclusion to be drawn is that God exists (p*). Hartshorne was under no illusions that this mode of reasoning would convince the skeptic that God exists. Nor did he use it as his reason for believing in God. Nevertheless, the argument is not, in the hyperbole of Graham Oppy (199), “completely worthless.” In A Natural Theology for Our Time, Hartshorne credited George Mavrodes with the insight that it is unreasonable to suppose that no doubts about theism can be removed because an argument cannot remove all doubts about theism. Moreover, the simple deductive structure of the argument clarifies what is at stake in the theistic question. If one denies the conclusion, one must deny one or more of the premises or what their denials entail. Hartshorne follows Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz in urging that, in questions of metaphysics, philosophers are more apt to err in what they deny than in what they affirm. Highlighting the rational cost of rejecting theism can, for this reason, be a fruitful method in metaphysics.
If one rejects the conclusion of Hartshorne’s modal argument, one of two alternatives is possible. First, it may be that God’s existence is impossible (~Mp*), which is the denial of the first premise. This is the view that J. N. Findlay originally took in his famous 1948 article, “Can God’s Existence Be Disproved?” In effect, Findlay’s argument turns Hartshorne’s modal modus ponens upside down to make a modal modus tollens disproof: If M~p* and Mp* → ~M~p*, it follows that ~Mp*. Hartshorne referred to this as the a priori atheist or positivist position. The second alternative is that a logical consequence of the second premise is false. The strict implication of the second premise allows one to infer that if God’s existence is logically possible then it is logically necessary. If this is false, then God’s existence and non-existence are equally possible: Mp* and M~p*. This was the view of David Hume, for whom every proposition asserting or denying existence, including “God exists,” is logically contingent. Hartshorne calls this the empiricist position, or sometimes empirical theism or empirical atheism depending on whether or not the empiricist thinks that God exists.
Hartshorne considered the empiricist position regarding the ontological argument as the least tenable. The second premise says, colloquially, if God is so much as logically possible, then it must be the case that God exists. Hartshorne calls this “Anselm’s principle,” or more forcefully, “Anselm’s discovery.” The discovery is that God, as unsurpassable, cannot exist with the possibility of not existing. Put differently, contingency of existence is incompatible with deity. Anselm’s formula that God is “that than which nothing greater can be conceived” means, among other things, that any abstract characteristic for which something greater can be conceived cannot properly be attributed to deity. For example, if there is something greater than being partially ignorant, then God cannot be conceived as partially ignorant. Or again, if there is something greater than interacting with some but not all others, then God cannot be conceived as a merely localized being. Applied to modality of existence, Anselm’s principle means that a deity that can fail to exist is not the greatest conceivable. If correct it is then a mistake to conceive of God as possibly existing and possibly not existing. This is another way to state the second premise. One may deduce from this premise that it is impossible that God’s existence and non-existence are both logically possible. Symbolic notation presents this as ~M(Mp* and M~p*).
Hartshorne emphasized that the empiricist’s view he considers Anselm to have refuted is shared by, among others, those who consider the existence of God as a hypothesis to be established or refuted by science. Hartshorne accepts Karl Popper’s idea that empirical statements must be falsifiable by some conceivable experience (see “Charles Hartshorne: Neoclassical Metaphysics”). Anselm’s principle entails that if God exists, there could be no disconfirming empirical evidence of God’s existence. On the other hand, if God does not exist, then by parity of reasoning, there could be no confirming empirical evidence of God’s existence. If premise two is correct, the remaining options are that God exists necessarily (~M~p*) or God’s existence is impossible (~Mp*). This removes the question of God’s existence from the domain of science. Yet, this is not the same as removing the question from rational justification, unless metaphysics is impossible, a position that Hartshorne vigorously opposed. In effect, treating the existence of God as a scientific hypothesis is a failure to conceive of God as unsurpassable by any being other than God—and is therefore a changing of the subject.
Among the many criticisms of Hartshorne’s reasoning about the ontological argument, four stand out as deserving special treatment: one from J. N. Findlay, one from John Hick, one stemming from W. V. O. Quine’s reflections on modal logic, and one from H. G. Hubbeling. Each is set forth in The Philosophy of Charles Hartshorne. Hartshorne praises Findlay for most clearly stating the objection that the concrete cannot be deduced from the abstract, and that this is what the ontological argument purports to do. Definitions are abstract, but God’s existence must be concrete; from the logically weak definition of God one may not deduce the logically stronger conclusion that God exists. Put somewhat differently, if the deduction succeeds, then God’s existence must be as abstract as God’s essence. Hartshorne’s response to Findlay is to accept the principle but to appeal to the distinction between existence and “actuality”––Hartshorne’s term for existence in a particular, determinate, concrete state (see “Charles Hartshorne: Dipolar Theism, section 2”). To be sure, the ontological argument concludes to the existence of God, which is abstract, but more explicitly, it concludes to God’s existence as somehow actualized. No actual state of God—which is the concreteness of God—can be deduced by a metaphysical argument. The structure of this reasoning is analogous to Hartshorne’s argument that non-being is impossible (see “Charles Hartshorne: Neoclassical Metaphysics”). The statement “Something exists” may be necessarily true, as Hartshorne urges, although it gives no information as to what actually exists. It only says that the set of existing things is not empty. By parity of reasoning, the conclusion of Hartshorne’s modal argument can be rephrased to say that the set of actual divine states is never empty. With good reason, Hartshorne insisted that he knew very little about God. At most, his metaphysics yields only the most abstract truths about deity, although he stressed that it is a notable achievement to advance the subject of metaphysics when so few attend to its reasoning.
Hick pressed the objection that Hartshorne’s ontological argument confuses two kinds of necessity; one pertaining to propositions (logical necessity), the other pertaining to a being (ontological necessity). According to Hick, to say that God exists of necessity is to say no more than that God has the property of “aseity.” That is, God’s existence, unlike all creaturely existence, depends upon nothing outside of itself. This does not mean, Hick claims, that “God exists” is a necessary truth. To speak of God’s existence as logically necessary is, in Hick’s view, a category mistake; applying to a being a predicate that is properly a predicate of sentences. Hartshorne agrees with Hick that, excluding the case of God, all propositions asserting the existence or non-existence of an individual are logically contingent. However, in all of these cases, there is a causal explanation for the possibility of the individual’s existence which neatly explains why the proposition asserting or denying existence is not necessarily true. For example, the non-existence of x’s monozygotic twin is explained by the fact that the fertilized egg from which x came did not split; x’s existence also has a causal explanation in the union of a particular sperm and egg. Hartshorne notes that there is no analogous explanation, on Hick’s empiricist account, for why “God exists” is logically contingent. Yet, Hartshorne has a ready explanation for why the proposition is not logically contingent, an explanation moreover that Hick uses in explaining the meaning of divine necessity: neither God’s existence nor non-existence could have a causal explanation. In both The Logic of Perfection and Creative Experiencing, Hartshorne discusses other characteristics of logically contingent propositions that “God exists” lacks. For example, God’s existence includes all positive forms of existence whereas the existence of any creature within the universe excludes certain positive states of affairs. Hartshorne says that God’s existence is not competitive. Hartshorne’s conclusion is that, on Hick’s account, “God exists” breaks the usual semantic criteria for a proposition to count as logically contingent.
Hartshorne’s response to Hick is that the meanings of modal terms must be anchored in the causal-temporal matrix. If this is true, then only particular noun-adjective combinations are logically conceivable. Numerous parodies of the modal argument—beginning with Gaunilo’s “perfect island”—consist in joining the concept of necessary existence to real or imagined localized beings. On Hartshorne’s account these ideas are improperly conceived, for they cannot withstand the application of semantic criteria that distinguish contingent and necessary truths. Attaching necessary existence to a being that is properly conceived as contingent is the reverse of the error of attaching contingent existence to a being that is properly conceived as necessary. Hartshorne counts both extremes as errors. It is no accident that it was J. S. Mill, an empiricist, who made famous the question, “Who made God?” If “God” signifies a being unsurpassable by all others, then asking for the cause of God’s existence is on a par with asking what is north of the North Pole. Both questions are grammatical, but both are also nonsensical. Of course, on Hick’s account of divine aseity, it is also a mistake to ask for the cause of God’s existence. However, Hartshorne’s theory of the semantic grounding of modal terms in temporal process provides one reason why it is a mistake.
Another important objection to Hartshorne’s modal ontological argument, especially as presented in The Logic of Perfection, arises from Quine’s attack on the intelligibility of de re modality. While Hick criticized Hartshorne’s modal argument for moving illicitly from de dicto (linguistic) to de re (ontological) conceptions of modality, Quine’s strategy is to reject the very intelligibility of de re modality. If successful, such a critique would surely devastate the modal version of the argument since, for Hartshorne, “logical modality mirrors objective modality.”
Quine’s challenge to the intelligibility of de re modality has been taken up in great detail by Goodwin in his book The Ontological Argument of Charles Hartshorne. In his foreword of the work, Hartshorne endorses Goodwin’s approach. The arguments could be summarized as follows. Quine objected to the idea of de re modality, since it involves quantification across modal operators. For example, the formulation “(Ǝx) (necessarily, x is greater than seven)” is logically illicit, claims Quine, because the modal operator “necessarily” is inserted within a quantifier-bound variable-predicate expression. Quine points out that we cannot generalize existentially from the legitimate de dicto formulation:
Necessarily, nine is greater than seven.
to the illicit
(Ǝx) (necessarily, x is greater than seven).
This is because “nine” in (a) is referentially opaque; it fails to denote in a singular way, and thus opens the door to counter-examples in the generalized sentence (b). For instance, Quine says that “nine” can name “the number of planets,” but it is not a property of “the number of planets” that it is necessarily greater than seven. Given his theory of contingent states of affairs, Hartshorne would not object to the notion that “the number of planets,” presumably in our solar system, is indeed a contingency. The thrust of this is that, because of referential opacity in quantified modal logic, we do not know what it means to introduce propositions of the existentially generalized form (b). However, Goodwin notes that Hartshorne is indeed committed in his modal version of the argument to such forms as:
(Ǝx) (necessarily, x is perfect).
Consequently, an effective Hartshornean response to Quine’s critique requires an intelligible semantics for modal logic.
Goodwin argues that Saul Kripke supplies such a semantics in the essay, “Semantical Considerations on Modal Logic.” According to Kripke, we can give an intelligible account of sentences involving quantification into modal contexts. A sentence having the form of (b) can be interpreted to say: “there is an object, x, in this world which has the property “greater than seven,” and x has this property in every possible world in which x exists.” In other words, x exists in this world and at least some possible worlds accessible from this world, and x falls under the extension of the predicate “greater than seven” in every world in which it exists.” However, this only takes one so far in the provision of an (arguably) intelligible formal semantics for sentences involving quantification into modal contexts.
Quine replies that the very terms of this formal semantical solution to the problem of opacity raises the further question of what it means for an individual or object to exist in various possible worlds. This problem has come to be known as the problem of “trans-world identity.” Quine challenges any response to his critique of de re modality based on Kripke’s semantics by arguing that Kripke’s solution to referential opacity ushers in a semantics involving the difficulty of “essential properties.” For instance, let the value for x be C. S. Peirce, while the predicate attributed to x is “being a speculative philosopher.” Must Peirce be a speculative philosopher in any possible world in which he exists in order to be Peirce in such worlds? Could Peirce be a “seventeenth century sea captain” in some possible worlds and still intelligibly remain Peirce in such possible worlds?
It is precisely here, argues Goodwin, that Hartshorne’s ontology of temporal process can be employed, providing Kripke with intelligible criteria for making trans-world identifications. The problem of trans-world identity seems perplexing and insolvable when assuming, to use Quine’s phrase, “Aristotelian essentialism,” in which essential properties belong to substances that make no inherent reference to temporality. By contrast, Hartshorne’s process or event ontology positions the search for an intelligible criterion for trans-world identity in the much wider matrix of successive and causally efficacious temporal units of becoming. This is one reason why Hartshorne prefers to speak of “possible world-states” rather than “possible worlds” (see “Charles Hartshorne: Neoclassical Metaphysics”). Temporal inheritance becomes the essential factor in determining identity, and thus more readily settles the above questions: Peirce might well exist as, say, a professional painter in some possible world-state, since he might have been one in the history of this actual world; that is, since there may have been a juncture in Peirce’s development in which he was not particularly taken with questions of speculative philosophy, but was exposed to an environment of intense interest in artistic expression. Yet, surely he could not be, in any possible world-state, a seventeenth century sea captain, since this would bear nothing in common with his succession of temporal events. To conclude the issue cautiously, perhaps we should say that, even if Hartshorne’s event-ontological criterion of temporal inheritance does not fully resolve the issue of trans-world identity, it seems to simplify it profoundly. More pointedly, this criterion directly answers Quine’s charge of the unintelligibility of solutions based on Aristotelian essentialism that appeal to temporally de-contextualized substances.
A technically sophisticated objection to Hartshorne’s modal argument, especially as expressed in The Logic of Perfection, comes from H. G. Hubbeling. He presents Hartshorne with a dilemma: the modal argument is valid if and only if the theory of temporal modalities is false. The problem is that Hartshorne’s argument is expressed in Lewis’s S5 system in which modal status is necessary. Symbolically (where L = ~M~), it is presented as such: “If Lp* then LLp*” and “If Mp* then LMp*.” Temporal modalities, however, are best expressed in Lewis’s weaker S4 system, which includes the first of these formulae as an axiom but the second formula is neither an axiom nor a theorem. Without “If Mp* then LMp*” Hartshorne’s argument is not valid, for then it could be the case that God’s existence is possible but not necessarily so. On the other hand, Hartshorne wants to ground the meaning of modal terms in temporal process. The most plausible semantics for S5, however, leaves modal concepts untethered to time.
It is to be noted, however, that Hartshorne gave other versions, both informal and formal (such as the version used above) which do not depend on S5. Hartshorne was convinced that an element of intuitive judgment that goes beyond the logical formalism is involved in assessing the argument. However, granting the element of intuitive judgment does not directly answer Hubbeling’s dilemma. What remains is whether Hubbeling’s challenge can be met from within Hartshorne’s form of dipolar theism. It seems true that S5 is the appropriate modal system for expressing the abstract point of the argument relating to God’s unique characteristic of existence in every possible state of affairs. S5’s property of complete “world accessibility” symmetry is exactly what is needed. On the other hand, S4 is applicable to the description of what Hartshorne calls God’s actuality or God’s concrete states. So, Hartshorne’s distinction between existence and actuality maps onto the S5/S4 distinction. (For more on the existence/actuality distinction, see “Charles Hartshorne: Dipolar Theism,” section 2).
If Hartshorne is correct, the ontological argument reveals the logical status of the theistic question as metaphysical rather than empirical. The argument falls short of a proof of theism, in large measure, because it depends on the premise that the existence of God is logically possible. Hartshorne’s own arguments against classical theism show that this is not an acceptable premise. Hartshorne once commented that John Duns Scotus also concluded that the question of God’s existence is not empirical. Hartshorne added, “My quarrel with him is that I regard his form of theism as either self-inconsistent or meaningless” (Viney 1985, x). Hartshorne believed that the weak premise in the modal argument is the first one, that “God” names a possible reality. He said in his reply to Hick that all of his misgivings about believing in God rested on the suspicion, which is difficult to remove, that every form of theism masks an absurdity. At least in part, this explains Hartshorne’s efforts to defend metaphysics as both the search for necessary truths about existence and the development of a coherent dipolar theism. One can think of the global argument as the completion of this process. Discounting the modal argument, each element of Hartshorne’s cumulative case is designed to buttress the claim that the existence of God is logically possible.
The various strands of the global argument highlight what Hartshorne considered to be the theistic implications of neoclassical metaphysics. Each argument is given a familiar name that suggests precursors in the history of philosophy, but none of them has an exact equivalent in the world’s philosophical literature. In addition to the ontological argument, Hartshorne develops his own versions of the cosmological, teleological, epistemic, moral, and aesthetic arguments. In keeping with Hartshorne’s use of position matrixes, each argument is presented as a logically exhaustive set of options. We have already hinted at this style of reasoning in the modal argument where one has the choice that God’s existence is a necessity (~M~p*), an impossibility (~Mp), or a contingency (Mp* and M~p*). Other strands of the global argument are also presented in this way: to affirm one alternative is to deny all others, and alternately, to deny one is to affirm that only one of the others is true. In each case, Hartshorne employs what he calls “the principle of least paradox” to conclude that the rational cost of rejecting neoclassical theism is greater than the cost of accepting it. Time and again, Hartshorne acknowledged the difficulties of an unqualified verdict in favor of neoclassical theism, but he also believed that his view better answered the questions of metaphysics than his rivals. Hartshorne was epistemically cautious in recognizing that his method would not yield a decisive victory for his own views. As with the modal argument, Hartshorne believed that no degree of logical rigor can eliminate the need for an element of intuitive judgment. The “essential element in rational procedure in metaphysics” is to honestly face the logically possible alternatives and to weigh up the cost of accepting or rejecting them (Viney 1985, x).
Much of the global argument is anticipated in Hartshorne’s explanation and defense of neoclassical metaphysics (see “Charles Hartshorne: Neoclassical Metaphysics”). Consider an outline of Hartshorne’s cosmological argument. As noted above, Hartshorne argues that “Something exists” is necessarily true. The principle of contrast and Hartshorne’s defense of de re modality, if correct, imply that what exists is characterized by both contingency and necessity. The necessary, moreover, as the common element in all possibility, is abstract. If it is possible for this necessity to be divine—more precisely, the abstract pole of the divine—then it is possible for God to exist. This supports the weak premise of the modal argument that God’s existence is logically possible. To reject the conclusion, one must either deny the necessity of existence, the principle of contrast, de re modalities, the character of necessity as abstract, or the possibility that the necessary aspect of things is divine. Hartshorne’s cosmological argument differs from traditional versions in neither concluding to the existence of a prime mover, an uncaused cause, nor a wholly necessary being. Of course, none of these descriptions fits the dipolar God, and Hartshorne had no interest in defending them.
Causal principles enter Hartshorne’s cumulative case in his argument from cosmic order, which he calls “the design argument.” Hartshorne defends a metaphysic according to which the cosmos is a theater of interactions among dynamic singulars, all of which act and are acted upon. The existence of many real beings, thus defined, raises the problem of cosmic order. The question is not why there is order rather than mere chaos. For Hartshorne, chaos presupposes order as much as non-existence presupposes existence—indeed, mere chaos is indistinguishable from nonbeing. The question, rather, is how there can be order on a cosmic scale if there is only an uncoordinated set of centers of creative activity. Localized order, or order within the cosmos, can be explained by localized activity of entities within the cosmos. The order of the cosmos, however, cannot be the outcome of a coordinated effort by the many entities since their very existence, severally scattered throughout the cosmos, presupposes the cosmos as a field of activity. If there is a cosmic-ordering power that itself falls under the metaphysical principle of acting and being acted upon, then cosmic order can be explained. Moreover, as Hartshorne argues in A Natural Theology for Our Time, the explanation is not ad hoc since all real beings, localized ones and the cosmic-ordering power, fall under the same metaphysical principle. The cosmic-ordering power is not, in the words of Alfred North Whitehead, an exception to metaphysical principles, invoked to save their collapse, but is their chief exemplification.
Hartshorne allows that the expression “cosmic order” permits different values; the laws of nature must include constants as well as variables, and the values of the constants (for example, the speed of light), are not logical necessities. In this way, one may speak, with Whitehead, of different “cosmic epochs” in which the laws of nature beyond the singularities of our universe are not identical with our own. Hartshorne insists, however, that the problem of cosmic order remains. This is because our conceptions of the fundamental laws of nature are contingent and mathematically peculiar in character. For instance, an epoch such as our own with a law of gravitation specified by “mass times mass proportioned to the radius squared” is a particular nomological condition to be conceptually contrasted with, say, gravitation as “mass times mass proportioned to the radius cubed.” Basic laws of nature appear to have the logical earmarks of “contingent decrees,” and as such it is legitimate to ask for their causal explanations. Thought experiments which assert that such basic laws could be instituted by chance mechanisms beg the question of basic order. An example is Hume’s suggestion of an epicurean universe of swerving atoms that happen to arrange themselves into the cosmic “regularities” we observe. As Hartshorne says in A Natural Theology for Our Time, talk of atoms with a definite character persisting through time is “already a tremendous order.” Recent thought experiments in cosmology such as “bubble inflation” models also seem to posit background assumptions of contingent cosmic conditions, including the operating laws of quantum mechanics which necessarily involve specific quantitative values (for example, as in the use of Planck’s Constant).
On Hartshorne’s neoclassical theistic alternative, one arguably need not settle for any metaphysically inexplicable contingent cosmic order or a freedom-suppressing “necessitarian” universe. It is also well to remember that Hartshorne vigorously defends “indeterminism.” If determinism is false, then neither the order within the cosmos nor the order of the cosmos is absolute. Multiple real beings with varying degrees of creative power are a recipe for conflict. To be sure, the existence of multiple real beings also opens the possibility for cooperative endeavors, whether it is cooperation among or between localized beings and the cosmic designer; but multiple creativity guarantees a mixture of disharmony and harmony. The cosmic-ordering power can guarantee a cosmic order, but because of the existence of a plurality of real beings that act, and are not simply acted upon, not everything that happens can be chosen by a single individual, even a divine one. This is relevant to the problem of theodicy, for it shows that, in neoclassical metaphysics, the conflict of decisions among the creatures and between the creatures and God are possible, opening the way to tragedies that not even God can avoid.
A skeptic may embrace any of the options that Hartshorne denies, but at a cost. Hartshorne argues that each of the non-theistic options has dubious metaphysical credentials and that his solution to the problem of cosmic order is the most parsimonious. If there is no cosmic order one must explain the apparent success of science in discovering that order. If there is no cosmic-ordering power then either localized beings are being used to explain an order that their activity presupposes or there is no explanation of the order. Another atheistic option is to accept that there is a cosmic-ordering power but deny that it is divine. Hartshorne considered “panentheism” to provide a superior analogy to anything atheism can propose for the cosmic designer. However, the remaining three strands of the global argument can also be used to support the idea of such an ordering power; it is not only an agent causally affecting the world but is also affected by the world and incorporates it into the divine life, as one that perfectly knows the world (epistemic argument), perfectly preserves its achievements (moral argument), and fully appreciates the world (aesthetic argument).
In the epistemic argument, Hartshorne raises the question of the relation between reality and knowledge. In one respect, knowledge depends upon the real, for one cannot know what is not real. On the other hand, it is difficult to give an account of the real apart from some form of knowledge. As Hartshorne (Creative Synthesis 288) notes, Immanuel Kant suggested that appearance differs from reality because “ … the content of our sensory intuition differs from the content of a non-sensory intuition” (See also Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason, A249, A252). The object of the non-sensory intuition is the “noumenon.” (Hartshorne parts company with Kant in conceiving God’s knowledge as partly passive rather than as wholly active). Taking up Kant’s point, no merely partial or fallible knowing can circumscribe the real, for the extent of errors in knowing are measured by the real—if one is mistaken about x then something about x escapes one’s knowledge. In view of these conundrums, it is tempting to say that reality is the potential content of infallible knowledge—what an epistemically unsurpassable being would know if it existed. The problem with this solution, as far as atheism is concerned, is that an infallible knower, by definition, could not possibly be mistaken. However, it would know its own existence, so one is led to posit not simply the possible existence of an infallible knower, but also its actual existence. Hartshorne drew precisely this conclusion, that reality is the actual content of infallible knowledge. He argued further, following Josiah Royce, that defects in cognitive experience are internal to experience. Hartshorne mentions confusion, inconsistency, doubt, inconstancy of beliefs, and “above all, a lack of concepts adequate to interpret our percepts and of percepts adequate to distinguish between false and true concepts” (Creative Synthesis 288).
A distinctive feature of Hartshorne’s account of perfect knowledge is that it requires both cognitive and affective components (see “Charles Hartshorne: Dipolar Theism,” part 5). God must be conceived not only as knowing all true propositions but also as knowing the creatures themselves; that is, feeling what they feel. Whatever one has been and however one has felt become transformed thereafter as an everlasting memory in God’s consciousness. This applies also to the collective life of the creatures. There is no mere numerical sum of value in God—as if value were simply a question of set membership—for the experiences of creatures become woven into the fabric of God’s undying experience. This is what Hartshorne means by “contributionism,” that the creatures enrich the divine life in a way that would not have been possible apart from their activity. In comments he made on a debate about the resurrection of Jesus, Hartshorne (Did Jesus Rise From the Dead? 140) asked, “If people can live or die for country, or other human groups, why can they not live and die for that which embraces all groups and their intrinsic values—the divine life?” Hartshorne was fond of quoting the Jewish prayer, “Help us to become co-workers with You, and endow our fleeting days with abiding worth.” The moral argument brings out the attractiveness of this ideal as the supreme aim of creaturely existence.
There are a number of ways to reject contributionism. One may deny that there is any supreme aim, theistic or nontheistic. Hartshorne argues that this robs comparative value judgments of a standard of comparison; if, as most reflective people would accept, it is possible to squander one’s life on trivial, unimportant, or immoral pursuits, then there must be a measure of the good life that is being used as a comparison. Another option is that self-interest is the supreme aim. Hartshorne follows the Buddhists in rejecting this (see “Charles Hartshorne: Neoclassical Metaphysics”). More plausible is the idea that the aim of life is to live for self and for others either during this life or in an afterlife. Hartshorne considered this laudable, but finally unsatisfactory as the supreme aim of life. First, he argued that there is at best a numerical meaning of “general welfare,” whereas neoclassical theism provides an experiential meaning in God’s experience. Second, there is the problem of mortality. In “A Free Man’s Worship,” Bertrand Russell stated the problem clearly when he proposed to build a philosophy of life upon a foundation of “unyielding despair.” The despair stems from the recognition that “the noonday brightness of human genius” and “the whole temple of man’s achievement” is destined to perish. There is, to be sure, apparent nobility in such Sisyphian labor, except that “nobility” and “tragedy” become, on this account, as if they had never been. Dipolar theism, on the other hand, accounts for the value of past achievement as an enduring aspect of the unending process of God’s life and memory. Moreover, the value of living for self and others is included in Hartshorne’s account, for the supreme “other” is God. The extent and nature of value that one contributes to God is precisely the extent and quality of value that one has contributed to others. Hartshorne argued that contributionism captures the inclusive nature of love that one finds expressed in biblical ethics: one cannot love God if one does not love others, and one is to love God with everything one is and to love one’s neighbor as oneself.
An argument from the beauty of the world as a de facto whole rounds out Hartshorne’s cumulative case and ties it to the aesthetic motif of his philosophy. It is quite natural, and prima facie rational, to speak of enjoying the beauty of the cosmos. Most people consider it appropriate to include aesthetic predicates in descriptions of the universe, for it is endlessly interesting, mysterious, and awe inspiring. Hartshorne described science as the search for the hidden beauty of the world, and many great scientists would agree; even those who have little or no use for philosophy or religion, like Steven Weinberg who states that the universe is beautiful beyond what seems necessary. An aesthetically displeasing universe, says Hartshorne, would be either chaotic or monotonous. What we find, on the contrary, is order in the laws of nature and variety in the evolution of new arrangements of matter and levels of mind. Hartshorne speaks of the world as a de facto whole, for he means to stress its open-ended and dynamic character. If atheism is true, then it is non-divine individuals alone that enjoy the beauty of the universe as a whole, catching a glimpse of it in the slice of time that is available to them and to the species. The peek that we have of the beauty of the cosmos, moreover, reveals horizons suggestive of aesthetic riches forever beyond our grasp. Hartshorne argues that this would represent an irremediable aesthetic defect in the universe, for beauty should be enjoyed and only God could adequately enjoy the beauty of the world as a whole. Of course, what should be is not necessarily what is. Hartshorne insists, however, that unlike merely contingent defects, the lack of a divine spectator would be a necessary defect, “an eternally necessary yet ugly aspect of things” (Creative Synthesis 290). It is a thought without intrinsic reward or pragmatic value, best conceived as a thought experiment whose purpose is to make us realize a divine mind that can appreciate the beauty that escapes us.
The conclusions of the design and epistemic arguments, together with Hartshorne’s “psychicalism,” lend support to his aesthetic argument. As the supreme cosmic-ordering power, whose knowledge is the ultimate measure of reality, the divine, in any particular state of its life, must find within itself the entire wealth of all creative experiencing that has ever existed. This experience of a universe in process is, as Whitehead says, “beyond our imagination to conceive”; it includes (to us) the imperceptible abyss of the past as well as the infinite possibilities of the future. It is here that these lines of inference dovetail with the moral argument. God must be conceived not only as the supreme spectator appreciating the beauty of the world as a de facto whole, but also as the supremely beautiful (or sublime) object of contemplation, adoration, and worship—an endlessly unfolding cosmic experience to which we contribute. Also implicit in Hartshorne’s theology is that God is, as it were, the supreme actor in the play of existence. The various roles of the deity, as Hartshorne conceives it, are neatly summarized in the title of one of his articles: “God as Composer-Director, Enjoyer, and, in a Sense, Player of the Cosmic Drama.”
As long as there have been theists there has been a problem of evil, whether as a believer’s lament (as in Job), as a theologian’s conundrum (as in Augustine), or as a skeptic’s argument (as in Hume). Contemporary philosophers of religion speak of two forms of the problem of evil: the logical and the evidential. The logical problem of evil raises the question whether the existence of evil, conceived as gratuitous suffering, is logically consistent with the existence of a God that is perfect in power, knowledge, and goodness. The evidential problem of evil raises the question whether its existence renders improbable that of a perfect God. Hartshorne found neither version of the problem especially troublesome for his form of theism. He held that the problem with both versions of the problem of evil, as they are usually stated, is that they pose a loaded question, presupposing a concept of divine power that, in Hartshorne’s (Philosophical Aspects of Thanatology 86) words, “is not even coherent enough to be false.” Hartshorne developed and defended a metaphysic of shared creativity in which no individual, not even a divine one, can have a monopoly of power (see “Charles Hartshorne: Neoclassical Metaphysics” and “Dipolar Theism”). He was fond of disagreeing with Einstein who said that God does not play dice. On the contrary, chance and multiple freedom are inseparable; it is no accident, said Hartshorne (Studies in the Philosophy of J. N. Findlay 230), that there are accidents. Although God has the eminent form of creative power, it is not enough to guarantee a world without accidents, wrongdoing, and tragedy. Hartshorne would say that the evidential problem of evil suffers from the additional defect of assuming that God’s existence is an empirical question. We have seen that, according to Hartshorne, this represents a failure to appreciate the logical consequences of “Anselm’s discovery.”
Much of the appeal of traditional religion is that it offers the hope that the gulf between what is and what ought to be can be bridged in a future existence. It promises that the cosmic scales of justice are finally balanced either through the mysterious operations of karma in the process of reincarnation or through the omnipotence of God in a heavenly or hellish afterlife. Hartshorne considered these to be false hopes. While he did not definitively reject the possibility of an afterlife, he showed no interest in speculating about it or defending the idea. He argued that it is the divine prerogative alone to persist through infinite variations; the self-identity (that is, the genetic identity) of a non-divine individual cannot sustain itself indefinitely. Even if there were an afterlife, there could be no guarantee that the individual would survive long enough for every injustice, or even the greatest of injustices, in that person’s life to be rectified. Moreover, an afterlife could not eliminate the risk inherent in multiple or shared creativity. Traditional accounts of the afterlife are plausible only to the extent that creaturely freedom bends to a higher moral law (karma) or will (God’s) imposed on it. The heavens, hells, and purgatories of religion are elaborately orchestrated so as to place all lesser freedoms in perfect harmony with justice. In Hartshorne’s neoclassical metaphysics—especially evident in his design argument—God has the power to insure order on a cosmic scale, a power that is tantamount to insuring a field of activity for localized individuals. Divine power does not, however, extend to insuring what decisions the creatures will make. No particular outcome can be guaranteed.
To grant that the two versions of the problem of evil do not undermine neoclassical metaphysics, still leaves the question of God’s role regarding suffering and injustice. The facts that generate the problem of evil do not go away because one successfully rebuts a philosophical argument. Hartshorne claims that his theology makes better sense of “God is love” than its competitors, yet, there is a great deal of suffering that is undeserved, pointless, and widespread. Evolutionary theory adds another dimension. Entire ecosystems and countless species have come and gone in the course of geologic time. Throughout this history, creatures compete for the goods that will insure their survival and very often live at each other’s expense. Nature seems entirely indifferent to comparative values; as John B. Cobb Jr. noted, “lower” species thrive at the expense of “higher” species as when malarial mosquitoes feed on human beings. Finally, there are what Marilyn Adams calls “horrendous evils,” evils that are so pernicious that they give reason to doubt that the person’s life could be a great good to him or her on the whole. Hartshorne claims that a loving God is a necessary and indispensible character in this drama. One may ask whether this is plausible, but one must also take care not to permit the presuppositions of classical theism to color one’s judgment. Hartshorne counsels to be suspicious of the question whether our world is the sort that one would expect from an almighty and all-loving creator. In the context of dipolar theism the question must be rephrased: Is this the sort of world that one would expect of a deity that is perfect in power and love that presides over a world composed of beings, each of which exercises some degree of creativity?
If Hartshorne is correct, God accounts for order on a cosmic scale. There must be, however, two aspects to this activity that are distinguishable but not separable. On the one hand, there is the ordering activity that establishes the cosmic order per se, making possible all non-divine forms of freedom. On the other hand, there is the ordering activity that lures each localized being towards greater intensity of experience. Hartshorne holds that both aspects of God’s creative ordering of the world follow aesthetic principles (see “Charles Hartshorne: Neoclassical Metaphysics”). According to these principles, the double extremes between which the divine ordering power operates are (1) unqualified unity and unqualified diversity (or chaos) and (2) ultra-complexity and ultra-simplicity (or triviality). The mere fact of an ordered cosmos does not automatically avoid the aesthetic defects of being overly chaotic or trivial. Avoidance of these extremes requires a cumulative developmental process, which is implicit in Hartshorne’s cumulative view of process. In neoclassical metaphysics, “the explanation for the contingent must be a genetic one,” as Hartshorne (82) says in Insights and Oversights of Great Thinkers. It could not be everlastingly true that there have been elephants or seahorses. Because the process is cumulative, it must also be developmental. For example, an elephant is not created de novo from a mixture of atoms and molecules; it requires a lengthy process of species development. This is why Hartshorne claimed in Omnipotence and Other Theological Mistakes that the general idea of evolution is derivable from his metaphysical principles.
God’s role in the economy of nature is not simply maintaining cosmic order, but also eliciting higher forms of order, making possible forms of experience with greater levels of unity in diversity. A law of axiology as firm as any law of nature is that varying levels of creative experience are necessarily correlated with varying levels of what can be achieved in the way of value. For example, as complex and emotionally rich as a dog’s interior life may be, it is not sufficient to produce scientific theorizing or high artistic accomplishment. What follows is that varying levels of creativity exhibit varying levels of opportunity and risk. For instance, one cannot be ironic with a dog. Irony may amuse or offend only if one’s audience can understand it. As goes creative experiencing, so goes freedom. The cost of actual or possible achievement is the risk of failure. This analysis is evident in the few comments that Hartshorne made about sin. In a 1944 symposium on world peace, Hartshorne said that much could be learned from Reinhold Niebuhr that sin is not a struggle between “lower” (bodily) and “higher” (spiritual) aspects of personality. Rather, sin is a perversion of what is highest in a person, one’s sense of the divine; it is the claim to be divine, “a rebellion against our humble station in the universe” (Finkelstein and Maciever 597). This idolatry comes in many forms, religious and nonreligious, in the pernicious claims to infallibility or any attempt to place ultimate worth in something less than deity. As far as our experience goes, these are the highest and most tragic manifestations of the general principle that greater degrees of freedom necessarily accompany greater possibilities of its abuse.
Hartshorne agrees that the world is better to the extent that sin, and the suffering it brings in its wake, is not part of it. It does not follow, however, that the world is better to the extent that the possibility of sin is excluded from it. The conditions for the possibility of good or evil are the same: freedom. Indeed, Hartshorne maintained that some degree of evil is inevitable if good is to be possible. It is true that the particular evils that occur are not inevitable. Knowing this, we imagine that the cosmos could be altogether free of the blemish of evil, but this is to imagine an ideal that no single individual could bring about. One might agree with this but ask, with Hartshorne, whether there is a greater possibility of evil than might be expected from an all-loving cosmic designer. In The Zero Fallacy, Hartshorne spoke of human beings as the “bullies of the planet,” heedless of the welfare of other creatures, cruel to our own kind, and too often lacking the will to prevent such cruelty. He asked whether the seemingly unbridgeable distances between the earth and other solar systems might be a providential arrangement. In Omnipotence and Other Theological Mistakes, he allows himself an expression of doubt as to whether the “perilous experiment” of creatures free of instinctive guidance was too dangerous. He says that if he played at criticizing God, it would be at this point. Yet, Hartshorne also accepted on faith the infallible wisdom and ideal power of God. In Wisdom as Moderation, Hartshorne denies that limited intellects are in a position to know whether there is too much risk of evil in the world, for such a judgment must include a potentially infinite future. He also stressed that the justification of the world is in the world; that is, in the open-ended adventure of life itself that God’s creativity insures.
One of Hartshorne’s definitions of religion is the acceptance of our fragmentariness. We are fragmentary both in the sense that we are limited in space and time (that is, we are localized) and in the sense that our capacities for knowledge and goodness are limited (that is, we are imperfect). If something like Hartshorne’s panentheism is correct, we are also fragmentary in the sense that we are part of the divine being-in-becoming (see “Charles Hartshorne: Dipolar Theism”). For Hartshorne, God includes all but does not determine all, much like a person includes the cells of his or her body without being able to decide the details of their activity. Thus, what we do makes a difference in and to God in the sense that we can enhance or diminish in admittedly limited ways the divine enjoyment of the world—hence, the concept of tragedy in God mentioned previously. We have also seen, in the moral argument, that Hartshorne regarded the aim of consciously contributing to the divine life as the highest purpose to which we can aspire. In Wisdom as Moderation, he says, “God’s possession of us is our final achievement, not our possession of God” (90). Every creature that has ever existed or will ever exist becomes part of the inexhaustible memory of God. In Plato’s Symposium, Socrates, reporting the views of Diotima, speaks of immortality as the achievement of doing acts worthy of future generations’ remembrance. Hartshorne offers a similar kind of immortality except that the fallible and mortal memory of future generations is replaced by the infallible and unending memory of God.
A Hartshornean theodicy does not allow one to say that everything, or every evil, happens for a reason. There is no cure for the fact that the “lower” sometimes lives at the expense of the “higher” and that horrendous evils are part of this universe. On the other hand, a Hartshornean theodicy allows one to say that anything that happens, or any evil that occurs, can become part of a reason for striving to overcome evil with good thereby depriving evil of its capacity to dishearten us. The true depth of divine power, on Hartshorne’s view, is not God’s ability to manipulate events to the best possible outcome, but to be able to bear the suffering of the creatures without being overcome by it. On Hartshorne’s view, God is forever seeking ways to bring good from the world no matter how bad things may get. The world-weariness that sometimes overcomes the creatures never overcomes deity. In the language of William James, Hartshorne’s God is neither a pessimist (thinking that things cannot get better) nor an optimist (thinking that things are for the best), but a kind of cosmic meliorist (thinking that things can get better). This theology may console in at least two ways. To those who are helpless and who suffer, Hartshorne claims that there is a divine co-sufferer. To those who are not helpless and who work for the welfare of others, Hartshorne maintains that they are indeed working on the side of the cosmos itself, as co-workers with God. This is what Pierre Teilhard de Chardin called “building the earth.” In this way, Hartshorne’s theism may promote a resilient spirit in the face of defeat, hope that may conquer despair, and love that holds the promise of harnessing evil.
Hartshorne’s extensive writings on the ontological argument were instrumental in generating new interest in Anselm’s reasoning and in redoubling the efforts of philosophers in exploring and evaluating the variations that it can take. By highlighting a second form of ontological argument—a modal version—that the vast majority of philosophers had ignored, Hartshorne demonstrated that it was no longer sufficient to rely on Gaunilo or Kant for a refutation of Anselm. Hartshorne benefited from the formalizations of modal systems made popular by his teacher C. I. Lewis, and was the first to publish a formalized version of the modal argument. This unprecedented accomplishment clarified the argument and helped turn attention to its modal structure.
One could argue that Hartshorne was a victim of his own success. As many philosophers had failed to read Anselm closely enough to discern a second argument in his Proslogion, so philosophers had a tendency not to read Hartshorne closely enough to understand that he never used the modal argument as a singular proof of theism. Hartshorne used the argument as a single strand in a cumulative or global argument for neoclassical theism. His way of presenting the elements of the global argument emphasized the rational cost of rejecting the premises that, in each case, Hartshorne argued, was greater than in accepting the conclusion. To be sure, Hartshorne considered the modal argument an essential strand in the case for theism since it reveals, he believed, the logic of theism. If Hartshorne is correct, empirical arguments for or against the existence of God are unavailing because they misconstrue the nature of the theistic question. This idea also extends to skeptical arguments from evil that conclude to either the non-existence or probable non-existence of God. The problems of theodicy, for Hartshorne, concern the presence of evil in a universe in which every concrete particular has some degree of creativity, and not, as in traditional theology, where creativity is the unique privilege of God.
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Donald Wayne Viney
Pittsburg State University
U. S. A.
George W. Shields
Kentucky State University
U. S. A.