One of the most fascinating arguments for the existence of an all-perfect God is the ontological argument. While there are several different versions of the argument, all purport to show that it is self-contradictory to deny that there exists a greatest possible being. Thus, on this general line of argument, it is a necessary truth that such a being exists; and this being is the God of traditional Western theism. This article explains and evaluates classic and contemporary versions of the ontological argument.
Table of Contents
- Introduction: The Non-Empirical Nature of the Ontological Arguments
- The Classic Version of the Ontological Argument
- Anselm’s Second Version of the Ontological Argument
- Modal Versions of the Argument
- References and Further Reading
Most of the arguments for God’s existence rely on at least one empirical premise. For example, the “fine-tuning” version of the design argument depends on empirical evidence of intelligent design; in particular, it turns on the empirical claim that, as a nomological matter, that is, as a matter of law, life could not have developed if certain fundamental properties of the universe were to have differed even slightly from what they are. Likewise, cosmological arguments depend on certain empirical claims about the explanation for the occurrence of empirical events.
In contrast, the ontological arguments are conceptual in roughly the following sense: just as the propositions constituting the concept of a bachelor imply that every bachelor is male, the propositions constituting the concept of God, according to the ontological argument, imply that God exists. There is, of course, this difference: whereas the concept of a bachelor explicitly contains the proposition that bachelors are unmarried, the concept of God does not explicitly contain any proposition asserting the existence of such a being. Even so, the basic idea is the same: ontological arguments attempt to show that we can deduce God’s existence from, so to speak, the very definition of God.
It is worth reflecting for a moment on what a remarkable (and beautiful!) undertaking this is. Normally, existential claims don’t follow from conceptual claims. If I want to prove that bachelors, unicorns, or viruses exist, it is not enough just to reflect on the concepts. I need to go out into the world and conduct some sort of empirical investigation using my senses. Likewise, if I want to prove that bachelors, unicorns, or viruses don’t exist, I must do the same. In general, positive and negative existential claims can be established only by empirical methods.
There is, however, one class of exceptions. We can prove certain negative existential claims merely by reflecting on the content of the concept. Thus, for example, we can determine that there are no square circles in the world without going out and looking under every rock to see whether there is a square circle there. We can do so merely by consulting the definition and seeing that it is self-contradictory. Thus, the very concepts imply that there exist no entities that are both square and circular.
The ontological argument, then, is unique among such arguments in that it purports to establish the real (as opposed to abstract) existence of some entity. Indeed, if the ontological arguments succeed, it is as much a contradiction to suppose that God doesn’t exist as it is to suppose that there are square circles or female bachelors. In the following sections, we will evaluate a number of different attempts to develop this astonishing strategy.
St. Anselm, Archbishop of Cantebury (1033-1109), is the originator of the ontological argument, which he describes in the Proslogium as follows:
[Even a] fool, when he hears of … a being than which nothing greater can be conceived … understands what he hears, and what he understands is in his understanding.… And assuredly that, than which nothing greater can be conceived, cannot exist in the understanding alone. For suppose it exists in the understanding alone: then it can be conceived to exist in reality; which is greater.… Therefore, if that, than which nothing greater can be conceived, exists in the understanding alone, the very being, than which nothing greater can be conceived, is one, than which a greater can be conceived. But obviously this is impossible. Hence, there is no doubt that there exists a being, than which nothing greater can be conceived, and it exists both in the understanding and in reality.
The argument in this difficult passage can accurately be summarized in standard form:
- It is a conceptual truth (or, so to speak, true by definition) that God is a being than which none greater can be imagined (that is, the greatest possible being that can be imagined).
- God exists as an idea in the mind.
- A being that exists as an idea in the mind and in reality is, other things being equal, greater than a being that exists only as an idea in the mind.
- Thus, if God exists only as an idea in the mind, then we can imagine something that is greater than God (that is, a greatest possible being that does exist).
- But we cannot imagine something that is greater than God (for it is a contradiction to suppose that we can imagine a being greater than the greatest possible being that can be imagined.)
- Therefore, God exists.
Intuitively, one can think of the argument as being powered by two ideas. The first, expressed by Premise 2, is that we have a coherent idea of a being that instantiates all of the perfections. Otherwise put, Premise 2 asserts that we have a coherent idea of a being that instantiates every property that makes a being greater, other things being equal, than it would have been without that property (such properties are also known as “great-making” properties). Premise 3 asserts that existence is a perfection or great-making property.
Accordingly, the very concept of a being that instantiates all the perfections implies that it exists. Suppose B is a being that instantiates all the perfections and suppose B doesn’t exist (in reality). Since Premise 3 asserts that existence is a perfection, it follows that B lacks a perfection. But this contradicts the assumption that B is a being that instantiates all the perfections. Thus, according to this reasoning, it follows that B exists.
Gaunilo of Marmoutier, a monk and contemporary of Anselm’s, is responsible for one of the most important criticisms of Anselm’s argument. It is quite reasonable to worry that Anselm’s argument illegitimately moves from the existence of an idea to the existence of a thing that corresponds to the idea. As the objection is sometimes put, Anselm simply defines things into existence-and this cannot be done.
Gaunilo shared this worry, believing that one could use Anselm’s argument to show the existence of all kinds of non-existent things:
Now if some one should tell me that there is … an island [than which none greater can be conceived], I should easily understand his words, in which there is no difficulty. But suppose that he went on to say, as if by a logical inference: “You can no longer doubt that this island which is more excellent than all lands exists somewhere, since you have no doubt that it is in your understanding. And since it is more excellent not to be in the understanding alone, but to exist both in the understanding and in reality, for this reason it must exist. For if it does not exist, any land which really exists will be more excellent than it; and so the island understood by you to be more excellent will not be more excellent.”
Gaunilo’s argument, thus, proceeds by attempting to use Anselm’s strategy to deduce the existence of a perfect island, which Gaunilo rightly views as a counterexample to the argument form. The counterexample can be expressed as follows:
- It is a conceptual truth that a piland is an island than which none greater can be imagined (that is, the greatest possible island that can be imagined).
- A piland exists as an idea in the mind.
- A piland that exists as an idea in the mind and in reality is greater than a piland that exists only as an idea in the mind.
- Thus, if a piland exists only as an idea in the mind, then we can imagine an island that is greater than a piland (that is, a greatest possible island that does exist).
- But we cannot imagine an island that is greater than a piland.
- Therefore, a piland exists.
Notice, however, that premise 1 of Gaunilo’s argument is incoherent. The problem here is that the qualities that make an island great are not the sort of qualities that admit of conceptually maximal qualities. No matter how great any island is in some respect, it is always possible to imagine an island greater than that island in that very respect. For example, if one thinks that abundant fruit is a great-making property for an island, then, no matter how great a particular island might be, it will always be possible to imagine a greater island because there is no intrinsic maximum for fruit-abundance. For this reason, the very concept of a piland is incoherent.
But this is not true of the concept of God as Anselm conceives it. Properties like knowledge, power, and moral goodness, which comprise the concept of a maximally great being, do have intrinsic maximums. For example, perfect knowledge requires knowing all and only true propositions; it is conceptually impossible to know more than this. Likewise, perfect power means being able to do everything that it is possible to do; it is conceptually impossible for a being to be able to do more than this.
The general point here, then, is this: Anselm’s argument works, if at all, only for concepts that are entirely defined in terms of properties that admit of some sort of intrinsic maximum. As C.D. Broad puts this important point:
[The notion of a greatest possible being imaginable assumes that] each positive property is to be present in the highest possible degree. Now this will be meaningless verbiage unless there is some intrinsic maximum or upper limit to the possible intensity of every positive property which is capable of degrees. With some magnitudes this condition is fulfilled. It is, e.g., logically impossible that any proper fraction should exceed the ratio 1/1; and again, on a certain definition of “angle,” it is logically impossible for any angle to exceed four right angles. But it seems quite clear that there are other properties, such as length or temperature or pain, to which there is no intrinsic maximum or upper limit of degree.
If any of the properties that are conceptually essential to the notion of God do not admit of an intrinsic maximum, then Anselm’s argument strategy will not work because, like Guanilo’s concept of a piland, the relevant concept of God is incoherent. But insofar as the relevant great-making properties are limited to omnipotence, omniscience, and moral perfection (which do admit of intrinsic maximums), Anselm’s notion of a greatest possible being seems to avoid the worry expressed by Broad and Guanilo.
While St. Thomas Aquinas (1224-1274) believed that God’s existence is self-evident, he rejected the idea that it can be deduced from claims about the concept of God. Aquinas argued, plausibly enough, that “not everyone who hears this word ‘God’ understands it to signify something than which nothing greater can be thought, seeing that some have believed God to be a body.” The idea here is that, since different people have different concepts of God, this argument works, if at all, only to convince those who define the notion of God in the same way.
The problem with this criticism is that the ontological argument can be restated without defining God. To see this, simply delete premise 1 and replace each instance of “God” with “A being than which none greater can be conceived.” The conclusion, then, will be that a being than which none greater can be conceived exists – and it is, of course, quite natural to name this being God.
Nevertheless, Aquinas had a second problem with the ontological argument. On Aquinas’s view, even if we assume that everyone shares the same concept of God as a being than which none greater can be imagined, “it does not therefore follow that he understands what the word signifies exists actually, but only that it exists mentally.”
One natural interpretation of this somewhat ambiguous passage is that Aquinas is rejecting premise 2 of Anselm’s argument on the ground that, while we can rehearse the words “a being than which none greater can be imagined” in our minds, we have no idea of what this sequence of words really means. On this view, God is unlike any other reality known to us; while we can easily understand concepts of finite things, the concept of an infinitely great being dwarfs finite human understanding. We can, of course, try to associate the phrase “a being than which none greater can be imagined” with more familiar finite concepts, but these finite concepts are so far from being an adequate description of God, that it is fair to say they don’t help us to get a detailed idea of God.
Nevertheless, the success of the argument doesn’t depend on our having a complete understanding of the concept of a being than which none greater can be conceived. Consider, for example, that, while we don’t have a complete understanding (whatever this means) of the concept of a natural number than which none larger can be imagined, we understand it well enough to see that there does not exist such a number. No more complete understanding of the concept of a maximally great being than this is required, on Anselm’s view, to successfully make the argument. If the concept is coherent, then even a minimal understanding of the concept is sufficient to make the argument.
Immanuel Kant (1724-1804) directs his famous objection at premise 3′s claim that a being that exists as an idea in the mind and in reality is greater than a being that exists only as an idea in the mind. According to premise 3, existence is what’s known as a great-making property or, as the matter is sometimes put, a perfection. Premise 3 thus entails that (1) existence is a property; and (2) instantiating existence makes a thing better, other things being equal, than it would have been otherwise.
Kant rejects premise 3 on the ground that, as a purely formal matter, existence does not function as a predicate. As Kant puts the point:
Being is evidently not a real predicate, that is, a conception of something which is added to the conception of some other thing. It is merely the positing of a thing, or of certain determinations in it. Logically, it is merely the copula of a judgement. The proposition, God is omnipotent, contains two conceptions, which have a certain object or content; the word is, is no additional predicate-it merely indicates the relation of the predicate to the subject. Now if I take the subject (God) with all its predicates (omnipotence being one), and say, God is, or There is a God, I add no new predicate to the conception of God, I merely posit or affirm the existence of the subject with all its predicates – I posit the object in relation to my conception.
Accordingly, what goes wrong with the first version of the ontological argument is that the notion of existence is being treated as the wrong logical type. Concepts, as a logical matter, are defined entirely in terms of logical predicates. Since existence isn’t a logical predicate, it doesn’t belong to the concept of God; it rather affirms that the existence of something that satisfies the predicates defining the concept of God.
While Kant’s criticism is phrased (somewhat obscurely) in terms of the logic of predicates and copulas, it also makes a plausible metaphysical point. Existence is not a property (in, say, the way that being red is a property of an apple). Rather it is a precondition for the instantiation of properties in the following sense: it is not possible for a non-existent thing to instantiate any properties because there is nothing to which, so to speak, a property can stick. Nothing has no qualities whatsoever. To say that x instantiates a property P is hence to presuppose that x exists. Thus, on this line of reasoning, existence isn’t a great-making property because it is not a property at all; it is rather a metaphysically necessary condition for the instantiation of any properties.
But even if we concede that existence is a property, it does not seem to be the sort of property that makes something better for having it. Norman Malcolm expresses the argument as follows:
The doctrine that existence is a perfection is remarkably queer. It makes sense and is true to say that my future house will be a better one if it is insulated than if it is not insulated; but what could it mean to say that it will be a better house if it exists than if it does not? My future child will be a better man if he is honest than if he is not; but who would understand the saying that he will be a better man if he exists than if he does not? Or who understands the saying that if God exists He is more perfect than if he does not exist? One might say, with some intelligibility, that it would be better (for oneself or for mankind) if God exists than if He does not-but that is a different matter.
The idea here is that existence is very different from, say, the property of lovingness. A being that is loving is, other things being equal, better or greater than a being that is not. But it seems very strange to think that a loving being that exists is, other things being equal, better or greater than a loving being that doesn’t exist. But to the extent that existence doesn’t add to the greatness of a thing, the classic version of the ontological argument fails.
As it turns out, there are two different versions of the ontological argument in the Prosologium. The second version does not rely on the highly problematic claim that existence is a property and hence avoids many of the objections to the classic version. Here is the second version of the ontological argument as Anselm states it:
God is that, than which nothing greater can be conceived.… And [God] assuredly exists so truly, that it cannot be conceived not to exist. For, it is possible to conceive of a being which cannot be conceived not to exist; and this is greater than one which can be conceived not to exist. Hence, if that, than which nothing greater can be conceived, can be conceived not to exist, it is not that, than which nothing greater can be conceived. But this is an irreconcilable contradiction. There is, then, so truly a being than which nothing greater can be conceived to exist, that it cannot even be conceived not to exist; and this being thou art, O Lord, our God.
This version of the argument relies on two important claims. As before, the argument includes a premise asserting that God is a being than which a greater cannot be conceived. But this version of the argument, unlike the first, does not rely on the claim that existence is a perfection; instead it relies on the claim that necessary existence is a perfection. This latter claim asserts that a being whose existence is necessary is greater than a being whose existence is not necessary. Otherwise put, then, the second key claim is that a being whose non-existence is logically impossible is greater than a being whose non-existence is logically possible.
More formally, the argument is this:
- By definition, God is a being than which none greater can be imagined.
- A being that necessarily exists in reality is greater than a being that does not necessarily exist.
- Thus, by definition, if God exists as an idea in the mind but does not necessarily exist in reality, then we can imagine something that is greater than God.
- But we cannot imagine something that is greater than God.
- Thus, if God exists in the mind as an idea, then God necessarily exists in reality.
- God exists in the mind as an idea.
- Therefore, God necessarily exists in reality.
This second version appears to be less vulnerable to Kantian criticisms than the first. To begin with, necessary existence, unlike mere existence, seems clearly to be a property. Notice, for example, that the claim that x necessarily exists entails a number of claims that attribute particular properties to x. For example, if x necessarily exists, then its existence does not depend on the existence of any being (unlike contingent human beings whose existence depends, at the very least, on the existence of their parents). And this seems to entail that x has the reason for its existence in its own nature. But these latter claims clearly attribute particular properties to x.
And only a claim that attributes a particular property can entail claims that attribute particular properties. While the claim that x exists clearly entails that x has at least one property, this does not help. We cannot soundly infer any claims that attribute particular properties to x from either the claim that x exists or the claim that x has at least one property; indeed, the claim that x has at least one property no more expresses a particular property than the claim that x exists. This distinguishes the claim that x exists from the claim that x necessarily exists and hence seems to imply that the latter, and only the latter, expresses a property.
Moreover, one can plausibly argue that necessary existence is a great-making property. To say that a being necessarily exists is to say that it exists eternally in every logically possible world; such a being is not just, so to speak, indestructible in this world, but indestructible in every logically possible world – and this does seem, at first blush, to be a great-making property. As Malcolm puts the point:
If a housewife has a set of extremely fragile dishes, then as dishes, they are inferior to those of another set like them in all respects except that they are not fragile. Those of the first set are dependent for their continued existence on gentle handling; those of the second set are not. There is a definite connection between the notions of dependency and inferiority, and independence and superiority. To say that something which was dependent on nothing whatever was superior to anything that was dependent on any way upon anything is quite in keeping with the everyday use of the terms superior and greater.
Nevertheless, the matter is not so clear as Malcolm believes. It might be the case that, other things being equal, a set of dishes that is indestructible in this world is greater than a set of dishes that is not indestructible in this world. But it is very hard to see how transworld indestructibility adds anything to the greatness of a set of dishes that is indestructible in this world. From our perspective, there is simply nothing to be gained by adding transworld indestructibility to a set of dishes that is actually indestructible. There is simply nothing that a set of dishes that is indestructible in every possible world can do in this world that can’t be done by a set of dishes that is indestructible in this world but not in every other world.
And the same seems to be true of God. Suppose that an omniscient, omnipotent, omnibenevolent, eternal (and hence, so to speak, indestructible), personal God exists in this world but not in some other worlds. It is very hard to make sense of the claim that such a God is deficient in some relevant respect. God’s indestructibility in this world means that God exists eternally in all logically possible worlds that resemble this one in certain salient respects. It is simply unclear how existence in these other worlds that bear no resemblance to this one would make God greater and hence more worthy of worship. From our perspective, necessary existence adds nothing in value to eternal existence. If this is correct, then Anselm’s second version of the argument also fails.
Even if, however, we assume that Anselm’s second version of the argument can be defended against such objections, there is a further problem: it isn’t very convincing because it is so difficult to tell whether the argument is sound. Thus, the most important contemporary defender of the argument, Alvin Plantinga, complains “[a]t first sight, Anselm’s argument is remarkably unconvincing if not downright irritating; it looks too much like a parlor puzzle or word magic.” As a result, despite its enduring importance, the ontological argument has brought few people to theism.
There have been several attempts to render the persuasive force of the ontological argument more transparent by recasting it using the logical structures of contemporary modal logic. One influential attempts to ground the ontological argument in the notion of God as an unlimited being. As Malcolm describes this idea:
God is usually conceived of as an unlimited being. He is conceived of as a being who could not be limited, that is, as an absolutely unlimited being.… If God is conceived to be an absolutely unlimited being He must be conceived to be unlimited in regard to His existence as well as His operation. In this conception it will not make sense to say that He depends on anything for coming into or continuing in existence. Nor, as Spinoza observed, will it make sense to say that something could prevent Him from existing. Lack of moisture can prevent trees from existing in a certain region of the earth. But it would be contrary to the concept of God as an unlimited being to suppose that anything … could prevent Him from existing.
The unlimited character of God, then, entails that his existence is different from ours in this respect: while our existence depends causally on the existence of other beings (e.g., our parents), God’s existence does not depend causally on the existence of any other being.
Further, on Malcolm’s view, the existence of an unlimited being is either logically necessary or logically impossible. Here is his argument for this important claim. Either an unlimited being exists at world W or it doesn’t exist at world W; there are no other possibilities. If an unlimited being does not exist in W, then its nonexistence cannot be explained by reference to any causally contingent feature of W; accordingly, there is no contingent feature of W that explains why that being doesn’t exist. Now suppose, per reductio, an unlimited being exists in some other world W’. If so, then it must be some contingent feature f of W’ that explains why that being exists in that world. But this entails that the nonexistence of an unlimited being in W can be explained by the absence of f in W; and this contradicts the claim that its nonexistence in W can’t be explained by reference to any causally contingent feature. Thus, if God doesn’t exist at W, then God doesn’t exist in any logically possible world.
A very similar argument can be given for the claim that an unlimited being exists in every logically possible world if it exists in some possible world W; the details are left for the interested reader. Since there are only two possibilities with respect to W and one entails the impossibility of an unlimited being and the other entails the necessity of an unlimited being, it follows that the existence of an unlimited being is either logically necessary or logically impossible.
All that is left, then, to complete Malcolm’s elegant version of the proof is the premise that the existence of an unlimited being is not logically impossible – and this seems plausible enough. The existence of an unlimited being is logically impossible only if the concept of an unlimited being is self-contradictory. Since we have no reason, on Malcolm’s view to think the existence of an unlimited being is self-contradictory, it follows that an unlimited being, i.e., God, exists. Here’s the argument reduced to its basic elements:
- God is, as a conceptual matter (that is, as a matter of definition) an unlimited being.
- The existence of an unlimited being is either logically necessary or logically impossible.
- The existence of an unlimited being is not logically impossible.
- Therefore, the existence of God is logically necessary.
Notice that Malcolm’s version of the argument does not turn on the claim that necessary existence is a great-making property. Rather, as we saw above, Malcolm attempts to argue that there are only two possibilities with respect to the existence of an unlimited being: either it is necessary or it is impossible. And notice that his argument does not turn in any way on characterizing the property necessary existence as making something that instantiates that property better than it would be without it. Thus, Malcolm’s version of the argument is not vulnerable to the criticisms of Anselm’s claim that necessary existence is a perfection.
But while Malcolm’s version of the argument is, moreover, considerably easier to understand than Anselm’s versions, it is also vulnerable to objection. In particular, Premise 2 is not obviously correct. The claim that an unlimited being B exists at some world W clearly entails that B always exists at W (that is, that B‘s existence is eternal or everlasting in W), but this doesn’t clearly entail that B necessarily exists (that is, that B exists at every logically possible world). To defend this further claim, one needs to give an argument that the notion of a contingent eternal being is self-contradictory.
Similarly, the claim that an unlimited being B does not exist at W clearly entails that B never exists at W (that is, that it is always true in W that B doesn’t exist), but it doesn’t clearly entail that B necessarily doesn’t exist (that is, B exists at no logically possible world or B‘s existence is logically impossible. Indeed, there are plenty of beings that will probably never exist in this world that exist in other logically possible worlds, like unicorns. For this reason, Premise 2 of Malcolm’s version is questionable.
Perhaps the most influential of contemporary modal arguments is Plantinga’s version. Plantinga begins by defining two properties, the property of maximal greatness and the property of maximal excellence, as follows:
- A being is maximally excellent in a world W if and only if it is omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect in W; and
- A being is maximally great in a world W if and only if it is maximally excellent in every possible world.
Thus, maximal greatness entails existence in every possible world: since a being that is maximally great at W is omnipotent at every possible world and non-existent beings can’t be omnipotent, it follows that a maximally great being exists in every logically possible world.
Accordingly, the trick is to show that a maximally great being exists in some world W because it immediately follows from this claim that such a being exists in every world, including our own. But notice that the claim that a maximally great being exists in some world is logically equivalent to the claim that the concept of a maximally great being is not self-contradictory; for the only things that don’t exist in any possible world are things that are conceptually defined in terms of contradictory properties. There is no logically possible world in which a square circle exists (given the relevant concepts) because the property of being square is inconsistent with the property of being circular.
Since, on Plantinga’s view, the concept of a maximally great being is consistent and hence possibly instantiated, it follows that such a being, i.e., God, exists in every possible world. Here is a schematic representation of the argument:
- The concept of a maximally great being is self-consistent.
- If 1, then there is at least one logically possible world in which a maximally great being exists.
- Therefore, there is at least one logically possible world in which a maximally great being exists.
- If a maximally great being exists in one logically possible world, it exists in every logically possible world.
- Therefore, a maximally great being (that is, God) exists in every logically possible world.
It is sometimes objected that Plantinga’s Premise 4 is an instance of a controversial general modal principle. The S5 system of modal logic includes an axiom that looks suspiciously similar to Premise 4:
AxS5: If A is possible, then it is necessarily true that A is possible.
The intuition underlying AxS5 is, as James Sennett puts it, that “all propositions bear their modal status necessarily.” But, according to this line of criticism, Plantinga’s version is unconvincing insofar as it rests on a controversial principle of modal logic.
To see that this criticism is unfounded, it suffices to make two observations. First, notice that the following propositions are not logically equivalent:
PL4 If “A maximally great being exists” is possible, then “A maximally great being exists” is necessarily true.
PL4* If “A maximally great being exists” is possible, then it is necessarily true that “A maximally great being exists” is possible.
PL4 is, of course, Plantinga’s Premise 4 slightly reworded, while PL4* is simply a straightforward instance of AxS5. While PL4 implies PL4* (since if A is true at every world, it is possible at every world), PL4* doesn’t imply PL4; for PL4 clearly makes a much stronger claim than PL4*.
Second, notice that the argument for Premise 4 does not make any reference to the claim that all propositions bear their modal status necessarily. Plantinga simply builds necessary existence into the very notion of maximal greatness. Since, by definition, a being that is maximally great at W is omnipotent at every possible world and a being that does not exist at some world W’ cannot be omnipotent at W’, it straightforwardly follows, without the help of anything like the controversial S5 axiom, that a maximally great being exists in every logically possible world.
Indeed, it is for this very reason that Plantinga avoids the objection to Malcolm’s argument that was considered above. Since the notion of maximal greatness, in contrast to the notion of an unlimited being as Malcolm defines it, is conceived in terms that straightforwardly entail existence in every logically possible world (and hence eternal existence in every logically possible world), there are no worries about whether maximal greatness, in contrast to unlimitedness, entails something stronger than eternal existence.
IV. Is the Concept of a Maximally Great Being Coherent?
As is readily evident, each version of the ontological argument rests on the assumption that the concept of God, as it is described in the argument, is self-consistent. Both versions of Anselm’s argument rely on the claim that the idea of God (that is, a being than which none greater can be conceived) “exists as an idea in the understanding.” Similarly, Plantinga’s version relies on the more transparent claim that the concept of maximal greatness is self-consistent.
But many philosophers are skeptical about the underlying assumption, as Leibniz describes it, “that this idea of the all-great or all-perfect being is possible and implies no contradiction.” Here is the problem as C.D. Broad expresses it:
Let us suppose, e.g., that there were just three positive properties X, Y, and Z; that any two of them are compatible with each other; but that the presence of any two excludes the remaining one. Then there would be three possible beings, namely, one which combines X and Y, one which combines Y and Z, and one which combines Z and X, each of which would be such that nothing … superior to it is logically possible. For the only kind of being which would be … superior to any of these would be one which had all three properties, X, Y, and Z; and, by hypothesis, this combination is logically impossible.… It is now plain that, unless all positive properties be compatible with each other, this phrase [i.e., "a being than which none greater can be imagined"] is just meaningless verbiage like the phrase “the greatest possible integer.”
Thus, if there are two great-making characteristics essential to the classically theistic notion of an all-perfect God that are logically incompatible, it follows that this notion is incoherent.
Here it is important to note that all versions of the ontological argument assume that God is simultaneously omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect. As we have seen, Plantinga expressly defines maximal excellence in such terms. Though Anselm doesn’t expressly address the issue, it is clear (1) that he is attempting to show the existence of the God of classical theism; and (2) that the great-making properties include those of omnipotence, omniscience, and moral perfection.
There are a number of plausible arguments for thinking that even this restricted set of properties is logically inconsistent. For example, moral perfection is thought to entail being both perfectly merciful and perfectly just. But these two properties seem to contradict each other. To be perfectly just is always to give every person exactly what she deserves. But to be perfectly merciful is to give at least some persons less punishment than they deserve. If so, then a being cannot be perfectly just and perfectly merciful. Thus, if moral perfection entails, as seems reasonable, being perfectly just and merciful, then the concept of moral perfection is inconsistent.
The problem of divine foreknowledge can also be seen as denying that omniscience, omnipotence, and moral perfection constitute a coherent set. Roughly put, the problem of divine foreknowledge is as follows. If God is omniscient, then God knows what every person will do at every moment t. To say that a person p has free will is to say that there is at least one moment t at which p does A but could have done other than A. But if a person p who does A at t has the ability to do other than A at t, then it follows that p has the ability to bring it about that an omniscient God has a false belief – and this is clearly impossible.
On this line of analysis, then, it follows that it is logically impossible for a being to simultaneously instantiate omniscience and omnipotence. Omnipotence entails the power to create free beings, but omniscience rules out the possibility that such beings exist. Thus, a being that is omniscient lacks the ability to create free beings and is hence not omnipotent. Conversely, a being that is omnipotent has the power to create free beings and hence does not know what such beings would do if they existed. Thus, the argument concludes that omniscience and omnipotence are logically incompatible. If this is correct, then all versions of the ontological argument fail.
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Kenneth Einar Himma
Seattle Pacific University
Last updated: April 27, 2005 | Originally published: November/16/2001
Categories: Philosophy of Religion