Charles Hartshorne: Neoclassical Metaphysics

HartshorneCharles Hartshorne (1897-2000) was an intrepid defender of the claims of metaphysics in a century characterized by its anti-metaphysical genius. While many influential voices were explaining what speculative philosophy could not accomplish or even proclaiming an end to it, Hartshorne was trying to show what speculative philosophy could accomplish. Metaphysics, he said, has a future as well as a past. He believed that the history of philosophy exhibits genuine, albeit halting and uneven, progress towards a comprehensive understanding of the nature of existence.

Philosophy was, for him, a dialogue that spans centuries, with partners whose wisdom has a perennial relevance. The two philosophers who most influenced him, and in whose work he found the greatest parallels with his own thinking, were Charles Sanders Peirce and Alfred North Whitehead. Hartshorne was co-editor with Paul Weiss of the first comprehensive edition of Peirce’s philosophical papers, and he served as Whitehead’s assistant during the most metaphysically creative period of the Englishman’s career.

Hartshorne considered the metaphysical views he had begun to develop in his 1923 dissertation as, to a great extent, in pre-established harmony with Whitehead’s philosophy of organism. He indicated that Whitehead helped him sharpen his ideas and gave him a better vocabulary to express them, although there remained important differences between the two philosophers. One difference is that theism was always a central element of Hartshorne’s metaphysics (addressed briefly here, but see “Charles Hartshorne: Dipolar Theism” and “Charles Hartshorne: Theistic and Anti-theistic Arguments”) whereas Whitehead was preoccupied for much of his career with a philosophy of nature and did not introduce God until he developed the speculative philosophy of his later works.

Table of Contents

  1. The Nature Metaphysics
  2. The Question of Method in Metaphysics
    1. Dipolarity
    2. Inclusive Asymmetry/Concrete Inclusion
    3. Position Matrices
  3. Neoclassical Metaphysics
    1. Creativity
    2. Psychicalism
    3. Indeterminism and Freedom
    4. Personal Identity
    5. Time and Possibility
    6. The Aesthetic Motif
  4. Conclusion: Hartshorne’s Legacy
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources: Books (In Order of Appearance)
    2. Primary Sources: Hartshorne’s Response to his Critics
    3. Primary Sources: Selected Articles
    4. Secondary Sources
    5. Bibliography

1. The Nature Metaphysics

After his first book on sensation, Hartshorne’s philosophical work focused mostly on the questions of metaphysics (see “Charles Hartshorne: Philosophy and Psychology of Sensation”). In Creative Synthesis and Philosophic Method, he provides no fewer than a dozen definitions of “metaphysics” which, he argued, differ only as a matter of emphasis. Central to all of Hartshorne’s definitions is that genuinely metaphysical propositions are unconditionally necessary and non-restrictive of existential possibilities. If metaphysical propositions are true at all, they hold true of all possible world-states or state-descriptions. This means that they are propositions which are illustrated or exemplified by any conceivable observations or experiences when such observations or experiences are properly understood or reflected upon.

“Conceivable observation” is here understood in terms of Karl Popper’s notion that observation is always of the form “such and such is the case” rather than “such and such is not the case.” Cognitive definiteness is gained only by noting what is observed, rather than what is not observed, which is indefinite or infinite. Plato argues that negation is parasitic upon affirmation—“that which is not” is not contrary to what exists, but something different than what exists (Sophist 257b). In effect, quantificational criteria for identity can apply only to events that occur, not events which do not occur. The question, “How many storms did not occur?” has no definite answer. In Hartshorne’s view, there are no merely negative facts. Every negation presupposes some actually existing state of affairs. For example, to say that there are no swans in the lake is to say that every part of the lake is occupied by something other than a swan. Or, more generally, to say that swans do not exist is tantamount to saying that every location in the universe is occupied by something other than a swan. Sheer denials (claims purporting to state negative facts) represent an absence of positivity, and this is a key feature of metaphysical error. Properly metaphysical propositions are unique in never being falsified by any actual or genuinely possible states of affairs and in always being verified by actual or genuinely possible states of affairs. They represent, in effect, the kind of necessity defined since Leibniz and found in modern modal logic as “that which is common to all possibilities.”

This distinguishes genuinely metaphysical propositions from other kinds of a priori necessary propositions, such as truths of mathematics and hypothetical necessities. In Creative Synthesis and Philosophic Method (p. 162), Hartshorne maintains that mathematical propositions are non-existential, for they express relations between conceivable states of affairs. “Two apples plus two apples equals four apples” is an existential assertion containing a true mathematical relation, but “two slithy toves plus two slithy toves equals four slithy toves” is a non-existential assertion that nonetheless contains the same true mathematical relation. The bare arithmetic truth that “2 + 2 = 4” is neutral to existential instantiation. Similarly, “The number nine is not integrally divisible by two” is necessarily the case given the conventional meanings of the vocabulary of finite arithmetic. However, although no conceivable state of affairs falsifies the proposition, it is not verified by any conceivable state of affairs. And while hypothetical necessities express necessary relationships between possibilities, Hartshorne takes them to be covert denials that there are any states of affairs which falsify the relation asserted by the conditional. By contrast, genuinely metaphysical propositions are unequivocally affirmative, and their denials can only be sheer denials (as described above), expressions of utter absence or privation. The denials of metaphysical propositions are impossibilities; they are failed attempts to represent that which would never be found among possibilities.

As a prime illustration of a metaphysical truth, Hartshorne used the proposition, “Something exists.” This is properly metaphysical since it could not be falsified under any conceivable observational or experiential circumstances, yet it could be verified by every such circumstance; in fact, to assert both of these features is to assert something that is analytically true of the proposition, since any attempt to verify the proposition would posit, at minimum, a verification-event which would in turn falsify the counter-proposition that “nothing exists.” Some philosophers suggest that it is a contingent truth that something exists, as seems to be assumed by the question, “Why is there something rather than nothing?” In Creative Evolution, Henri Bergson said that one could attempt to arrive at the idea of nonbeing by imaginatively negating every true statement asserting the existence of something. Hartshorne points out, following Bergson, that this thought experiment is self-defeating. It ends in one of two ways: either there is no assertion, but only a denial, or there is an assertion that is self-referentially incoherent such as, “Nonexistence exists.” It is logically kindred to such “nonsense” propositions as “I was told something by nobody” or “I ate nothingness.” There is literally no possible state of affairs that could make “Nothing exists” true. If it is impossible for “Nothing exists” to be true then “Something exists” must be necessarily true.

If Hartshorne is correct that it is impossible for “Nothing exists” to be true, then there can be no state of affairs that meaningfully contrasts with “Something exists.”  To say that it is necessary that something exists does not provide any information about any existing thing; in other words, “Something exists” is too abstract to tell one about the concretely existing things (pluralism) or thing (monism) that may exist. This observation, however, presupposes the contrast between the abstract and the concrete. A further metaphysical question, therefore, is the relation that exists between the abstract and the concrete. “Something exists” does not describe an existing thing but rather presupposes the existence of entities (or an entity) more concrete than the sentence itself—this is the case even if, per impossibile, only the sentence existed, for “Something exists” is more abstract than “Only the sentence ‘something exists’ exists.” In light of these kinds of considerations, Hartshorne concludes not only that “Something exists” is necessarily true but also that “Something concrete exists” is as well, where the adjective “concrete” is the contrary of “abstract.” There is a hint of paradox in the fact that “concreteness” is itself abstract, but this leads to another of Hartshorne’s definitions of metaphysics as the study of the abstraction “concreteness.” Indeed, Hartshorne maintains that all metaphysical mistakes are instances of what Whitehead called “the fallacy of misplaced concreteness,” that it is to say, of mistaking an abstraction for what is concrete.

Conceivable propositions involve conceivable states of affairs in order for them to count intelligibly as propositions. Natural deduction systems of modern symbolic logic seem to make this supposition as in the decision of Whitehead and Russell in Principia Mathematica to make “there exists something X which either does or does not have an arbitrary one-place predicate P” axiomatic: in effect, they disallow an empty universe of discourse since an empty universe produces incoherence in the system such as counter-instances to the law of Universal Instantiation. While it is to be granted that free logics can avoid this assumption, it is also true that free logics entail difficulties precisely in determining their semantical domains. Most important, free logics that are designed to formalize ordinary language presuppose “objects” in both their inner or outer domains. Despite such monikers as “null inner domains,” such domains assume objects that are non-actual possibles. All free logics that have cognitive import for the description of “possible worlds” assume a semantical domain of objects that are conceptualized on the basis of actual objects or properties; for example, “Batman is a superhero” can be formalized in free logic, but it ultimately makes oblique reference to actualities (bat ears, masks, muscular strength, courage, and so forth) that are posed in non-actual combinations or juxtapositions. In effect, free logics can be interpreted in such a way that they do not contradict basic tenets of Hartshorne’s modal theory. Where cognitively meaningful, they assume objects as values for variables, and they formalize fictional scenarios that indirectly display the conceptual priority of actualities.

Hartshorne contrasts metaphysical propositions with empirical and contingent propositions, which are restrictive of some existential possibilities. An empirical proposition is essentially restrictive, always involving an actualization of a state of affairs that excludes other possible alternatives. For example, “Barack Obama resides in the White House during 2011” tells us about states of affairs obtaining in the White House during 2011, and it tacitly excludes the state of affairs of John McCain, his opponent in the 2008 presidential election, residing in the White House during 2011. This feature of exclusion among alternative possibilities is definitive of contingency, and, for Hartshorne, follows from Leibniz’s insight that the scope of disjunctive possibilities cannot be actualized simultaneously or conjunctively, since there are incompossible possibilities. Thus, the selection among possibilities confronted by natural processes must involve the acceptance of one alternative and the rejection of others, and this is a signature feature of empirical propositions. Hartshorne never considered the many-worlds interpretation of quantum theory, which by virtue of quantum branching into conjunctively realized alternative space-times, denies Leibniz’s principle of contingency as exclusion of alternatives. (For a critique of the so-called “actualist” account of many-worlds ontology and defense of the coherence of process philosophy and quantum theory, see Shields 2008.)

If empirical propositions are essentially restrictive, it follows that every empirical state of affairs is positive, but has negative implications. The denial of these negative implications is also an empirical state of affairs. For example, one alternative to Obama’s having won the 2008 presidential election is Hillary Clinton’s having won it. Since this alternative did not occur, the denial of this alternative, namely, “Hillary Clinton did not win the 2008 presidential election” is true of the actual world. However, if an empirical proposition is one which excludes alternatives, how is this true of negative empirical implications of such propositions? Is not a negative empirical proposition simply an assertion of an absence or privation? Hartshorne holds that this is clearly not the case. What is excluded from actualization in the above negative empirical statement is Hillary Clinton’s winning the 2008 presidential election, and this exclusion is achieved by a positive state of affairs. Positivity and exclusion of possibilities are thus features of all empirical propositions. Thus, unlike metaphysical propositions, empirical propositions have both an affirmative and a negative logical quality.

The division between metaphysics and empirical science is, in principle, clear. Hartshorne notes that, in practice, it is not always clear which statements count as empirical and which as metaphysical. It is well to keep in mind that Hartshorne uses Popper’s idea about falsifiability as a criterion of what it means to be an empirical statement and not as the guiding method of empirical science. Popper elevated falsification over verification as the proper method of science. Hartshorne does not address in a systematic way the question of the proper methods of science; even so, showing that a given statement is falsifiable is, on Hartshorne’s principles, one way in which it can be discredited as a true metaphysical idea. If a true metaphysical claim is falsified by no conceivable observation it is also the case that it is verified by every conceivable observation. Hartshorne holds that verifiability fails as a criterion for empirical statements but succeeds as a criterion for true metaphysical statements. It follows that false metaphysical ideas are falsified by every conceivable observation and verified by none.

A nuanced issue emerges, however, when one considers particular case studies of the relationship between metaphysical and empirical propositions in Hartshorne’s theory. Some critics have urged that Hartshorne’s neoclassical positions may sometimes conflict with apparently well-corroborated empirical scientific hypotheses. Among other hypotheses, these include (i) the apparent empirical result from special relativity theory that there is no cosmic simultaneity and thus no privileged or divine time (Hartshorne’s theory of deity posits a temporal God), or (ii) the beginning of physical events in space-time a finite time ago as posited in standard hot big bang cosmologies (Hartshorne’s metaphysics of creativity posits an infinite past of cosmic epochs, the latest of which is our actual cosmos since the purported big bang event). Such apparent conflicts, however, do not actually speak to Hartshorne’s general theory of the difference between metaphysical and empirical propositions. Rather, they concern whether the specific propositions he proposes as metaphysical are in fact illustrated by any conceivable state of affairs.

While Hartshorne can be described as a kind of rationalist insofar as he maintains, like classical rationalists such as Descartes and Leibniz, that metaphysics is a matter of consistent and adequate meanings of concepts, he is hardly a dogmatic “armchair” or purely speculative philosopher who desires no engagement with the special empirical sciences—his first and thirteenth books demonstrate that he was a serious psychologist and ornithologist. His rationalism is in fact “critical” and rather severely qualified. For instance, a propos of the above comment regarding the question of the “success” of his metaphysical project, Hartshorne speaks in Creative Synthesis (Ch. II) of metaphysics as our quite “contingent ways of trying to become conscious of the non-contingent ground of contingency,” and he insists on the qualification that the notion of the a priori should hardly be conflated with the epistemic notion of “certainty.” With Whitehead, Hartshorne insists that philosophers should be epistemically wary by avoiding the “dogmatic fallacy” such as found in the confidence of the Continental rationalists. In “The Development of My Philosophy” (1970) Hartshorne declares, “All philosophizing is risky: cognitive security is for God, not for us.”

There are at least three considerations which make it clear that, at the very least, it is not obvious that Hartshorne’s neoclassical metaphysics conflicts with the above mentioned empirical hypotheses, or that he is cavalier about empirical challenges. Following Popperian distinctions, Hartshorne never claimed that his proposed metaphysics is in principle exempt from empirical disconfirmation, although it is exempt from the quite distinct notion of empirical confirmation. If a “metaphysical” proposal really does conflict with an empirical fact, then it is disconfirmed and fails to be a genuinely metaphysical proposition. No genuinely metaphysical proposition, however, could be “empirically confirmed” in the standard sense that some restrictive state of affairs as opposed to another illustrates the proposition, because this would deny the universality of the candidate metaphysical proposition’s requirement that it be illustrative of any conceivable state of affairs. This requirement does not prevent it from being the case that some states of affairs are phenomenologically “privileged” in the sense that certain metaphysical truths may be more readily apparent in special cases of phenomena. Hartshorne agrees with the early Heidegger that metaphysics can be about profoundly general concepts, yet such concepts are neither phenomenologically vacuous nor inexplicable nor utterly without discernible structure. For instance, the process metaphysical theory of the necessarily “social structure of all experience” might be seen with particular clarity via the special phenomenon of the “active concern” (Heidegger’s sorge) of human being.

The determination of the relevant “empirical facts” (or interpretations of them) which a philosopher is forced to accept is a subtle, highly theory-dependent and much disputed matter, especially regarding the above mentioned cases of relativity theory and big bang cosmology. For example, it is not clear or agreed upon by philosophers of science that relativity physics establishes that time is “relative” even in Newton’s sense or that special relativity robs us of any objective, uniform notion of temporal modes of past, present, or future; nor is it clear that the standard big bang model, even if sound, “proves” the absolute finitude of either time or creative process as such. W. H. Newton-Smith, in The Structure of Time, argues that the notion of an “empirical” proof of a beginning of time even when granting a big bang singularity is highly problematic.

Hartshorne was cognizant of the prima facie tensions between relativity and big bang theory and his neoclassical metaphysics, and he offered plausible conciliatory suggestions: For example, consider his embrace of quantum physicist H. P. Stapp’s notion of a primordial, asymmetrically well-ordered sequence of events upon which space-time location is dependent. Stapp’s idea harmonizes the relativity of spatio-temporal observations dependent upon light-cone propagation and the ultimacy of ontological asymmetry demanded by process theory. Consider also Hartshorne’s observation that big bang theory establishes, at most, the contingent origin and present physical chronometry of time appropriate to our “cosmic epoch.” At any rate, whether or not these conciliatory suggestions are successful, Hartshorne attempted to follow through with the directives of his theory of metaphysics. As he says in Creative Synthesis, “there must be an at least possible way of harmonizing what physicists say is true of our epoch and what metaphysicians say is true of all possible epochs (since it forms the content of ideas of such generality that there is nothing we can think which is not a specialization of this content).”

2. The Question of Method in Metaphysics

            That Hartshorne thought at length about questions of philosophical method can be inferred from what Paul Weiss called the systematic “machinery” at work in his metaphysics, and from the very title of one his most important mature philosophical works, Creative Synthesis and Philosophic Method. Hartshorne’s method for neoclassical metaphysics results from both original insights and critical reflection on a wide swath of variegated influences. These range from the work of American pragmatists (especially Peirce), to phenomenology, to the speculative thought of Whitehead, to the work of analytic philosophers (with particular attention given to Popper and the logical investigations of his Harvard teachers Lewis and Sheffer as well as his University of Chicago colleague Carnap). The section titled “Reply to Everybody” published in The Philosophy of Charles Hartshorne lists no fewer than twenty-one methodological principles to be used in the proper adjudication of metaphysical claims. Among the most important of these are what could be termed the principles of “positivity,” of “dipolar contrast,” of “inclusive asymmetry,” and of Peirce’s doctrine of “position matrices or diagrams.” We explained the principle of positivity, or the rejection of purely negative facts, in the previous section, so let us turn to a discussion of the other principles.

a. Dipolarity

Hartshorne’s principle of dipolar contrast derives, in part, from the semantic “law of polarity” found in Morris R. Cohen’s A Preface to Logic. Following Cohen, Hartshorne holds that genuine metaphysical concepts are semantically interdependent. In effect, such concepts have logical contraries which cannot mean anything in utter isolation from one another. In spite of the extreme generality of metaphysical concepts, each such concept entails a polar contrast to it. Even the highly general concept “reality” requires that the concept “unreality” be assigned some meaning. To use Hartshorne’s illustration, the concept of “reality” ought to include the notion of having mental states, but the concept of “unreality” should include the notion of intentional objects of real mental acts which fail to designate anything extra-mental. Perhaps a more telling example could be found in the notion of necessity. A standard definition of necessity is “that which has no alternative,” yet alternativeness clearly invokes contingency, since a contingent state of affairs is to be characterized as “this rather than that alternative.” Hence, the semantical analysis of necessity invokes contingency. For Hartshorne, then, each metaphysical concept has a corresponding contrast: necessity requires contingency, being requires becoming, unity requires variety, and so on, for any concept that is non-restrictively general, having applicability across possible states or state-descriptions. The two interdependent contraries in each case warrant the term dipolarity.

Lack of recognition of dipolarity is, for Hartshorne, a chief difficulty in previous metaphysical theories that suppress expression of a polar contrast. In effect, they suffer from a certain conceptual poverty or “fallacy of monopolarity.” Monopolar theories allow expression of only one pole of a pair of contrasts; stated obversely, they completely deny one pole of a pair of contrasts. One example of denying dipolarity is monistic theories such as that of Spinoza, which allow causal necessity and internal relatedness, but which disallow contingency and external relatedness. At the opposite “monopolar” extreme are logical atomist theories like that of Russell, which allow causal contingency and external relatedness, but which disallow causal necessity or internal relatedness. Hartshorne asks if these contrary extremes make any more sense than supposing that doors must have hinges on both sides or on neither side. Hartshorne’s metaphysical project is guided by the observance of dipolarity and thus conceptual inclusiveness; in his view, a neoclassical process theory of reality is structurally dipolar and offers comprehensive accommodation of both necessity and contingency, both causal determination and a degree of freedom from such determination, both internal and external relations, and so forth, throughout the range of metaphysical polar contrasts.

b. Inclusive Asymmetry/Concrete Inclusion

Hartshorne’s principle of dipolarity is complemented and qualified by a principle of inclusive asymmetry or concrete inclusion. As Hartshorne points out, the principle of dipolarity does not justify metaphysical dualism. One should distinguish between asserting that a metaphysical concept requires a contrary polar conception in its definition, and asserting that two polar concepts have an equivalent metaphysical status. It may well be the case that one concept requires the other polar concept in its definition, while the other polar concept both requires the polar contrast in its definition, and yet is itself the ground or source of that polar contrast. In other words, it may be the case, as Hartshorne asserts, that dipolarity is itself grounded in a logically asymmetrical relation between the contraries.

The model for this relation can be seen in logical implication, which Hartshorne, following Peirce’s trail-blazing work on “illation” as logically fundamental or primal, takes to be the ultimate concept in formal logic and a resource for metaphysical generalization. “p implies q” means that p both implies itself and q. This can be formally expressed in the tautology that (p ⊃ q) iff [(p ⊃ p) & (p ⊃ q)]. (This result is mirrored in Lewisian systems in which the formula—changing material implication to strict implication—is a theorem.) However, given a standard material implication, p ⊃ q (where p and q are not equivalent in meaning), we cannot say conversely that q logically implies p. This is reflected in the fact that the correlative formula (p ⊃ q) iff [(q ⊃ q) & (q ⊃ p)] is not a tautology, for it is false on the truth-tabular conditions that  p and q have opposite truth values, and thus implicitly involves a species of “fallacy of affirming the consequent.” (Analogously, the similar formula using strict implication is not a theorem.) Thus, entailment is essentially asymmetrical.

Consider furthermore the defining power of variant connectives of standard systems of propositional logic. For Hartshorne, it is immensely significant that the defining power of propositional operators or functions “varies inversely with symmetry.” The symmetrical function of logical equivalence, as in “p if and only if q,” has the least defining power of the propositional functions, since, even when combined with negation, it can be used to produce only eight (including itself) out of the sixteen propositional functions. On the other hand, the directional or asymmetrical functions, which contrast with the equivalence function, are constitutive of entailment. Hartshorne points out that Peirce, and then Sheffer, were the first to see that either the combination of negation and conjunction (“not both”) or the combination of conjunction and negation (“neither/nor”) are singly sufficient to define all the others.

The Sheffer functions (the “stroke” and “daggar”) are the most definitive functions, but they possess a triadic asymmetry that yet includes dyadic symmetry. We see this, Hartshorne notes, in their truth-tabular definitions. The Sheffer stroke is false if and only if both propositional variables are true, while the Sheffer daggar (also Peirce’s ampheck) is true if and only if both propositional variables are false. In effect, the triadic relation of the stroke, that is, the truth-value product of the binary Sheffer construction p|q, which is dyadically symmetrical in terms of its propositional truth-value assignments (p is true and q is true), stands as an asymmetry in terms of its truth value (that is, it is false in relation to symmetrical truth). Hartshorne finds a metaphysically ultimate pattern here, namely, symmetry within an all-embracing asymmetry.

Hartshorne holds that the relation between dipolar metaphysical contraries exhibits this asymmetrical structure. As an illustration, consider his argument in Creative Synthesis that “becoming” logically contains its polar contrast “being,” but not the converse. Suppose there is a reality, X, that does not come to be, that is eternal, and another reality, Y, that does come to be. The total reality, XY, is not eternal; XY comes to be, for Y itself is not eternal. This shows that becoming is the more inclusive category, for it preserves itself (becoming) and its polar contrast (being). No comparable argument can show that being can include becoming without destroying the contrast. The concrete or definite, the creatively cumulative, is the inclusive element, and is the key to the abstract, not vice versa. The concrete and the abstract are neither sheer conjuncts as posited by varieties of dualism, nor some mysterious “third” entity, but, in consonance with both Whitehead’s ontological principle and Aristotle’s ontological priority of the actual, is rather, “the abstract in the concrete.”

In his “Logic of Ultimate Contrasts” (Creative Synthesis, Ch. VI and Zero Fallacy, Ch. VII), Hartshorne calls the concrete terms in a pair of metaphysical contraries the r-terms (correlated with Peirce’s categoreal “seconds” and “thirds”), while abstract terms are called a-terms (correlated with Peirce’s categoreal “firsts”). While he provides 21 r-terms and 21 a-terms in his table of metaphysical contraries, a few samples could be taken as illustrative, especially given his Rule of Proportionality, namely: as any one r-term stands to its contextually correlated a-term, all other r-terms stand to their contextually correlated a-terms.

graphic of r-terms

Hartshorne argues that each r-term includes its correlative a-term, but not vice versa. Given the items above, we see that, for Hartshorne, the analysis of experience should be constructed so as to include the notions that objects or things experienced are independent of or externally related to the contingent acts of experience which include the objects as their necessary (but not sufficient) conditions. If correct, these conceptual relations all exhibit the essential asymmetry of entailment. Yet, there is a two-way necessity within this overall asymmetry, for while the relation of logical inclusion falls always on the r-term side of the table, a-terms nonetheless necessitate that “a class of suitable r-term correlates be non-empty.” For example, the necessary can be expressed, Hartshorne contends, as “the non-emptiness of the class of contingent states of affairs.” (This particular rumination is a key feature of Hartshorne’s revision of the ontological argument; see “Charles Hartshorne: Theistic and Anti-theistic Arguments”.)

While the detailed arguments for and against proper adjudication of each case of r-term/a-term relation is a complex affair that cannot be presented here, it is interesting to notice that some independent considerations of modern logic arguably shore up Hartshorne’s basic principle of r-term inclusion. For example, Hartshorne pointed to the fact that an important theorem of contemporary modal logic “mirrors” the logical inclusiveness of contingent concreta or “r-terms” in juxtaposition with the abstract necessity or “a-terms,” namely, the theorem that [(Np & ~ Nq) ~ N(p & q)], where N is a modal operator for “necessarily.” In effect, the conjunction of  necessary and contingent propositions logically entails the modally contingent status of the conjunction of assertoric propositions—in effect, contingency in a relevant sense “includes” necessity rather than vice versa.

c. Position Matrices

Hartshorne also holds that metaphysical theories can be tested by subjecting them to processes of rational elimination and/or comparison of cognitive costs that begin with a formal logical elaboration of theoretical possibilities. This idea has its origin in Peirce’s doctrine of position matrices or diagrams. The point here is that no philosophical topic can be declared fully rationally adjudicated until the constituent fundamental aspects of that topic have been subjected to an exhaustive “mathematical analysis.” Much error can occur unless and until all possibilities have been foreseen and subjected to thorough rational consideration. Consider the issue of the God-world relationship in philosophical theology. Hartshorne argues that there are sixteen combinatorial possibilities for theological and atheological models of this relationship when we notice that the concepts of God and world can each be either ontologically necessary, ontologically contingent, can possess these modal properties in diverse aspects, or are neither ontologically necessary nor contingent. In the following matrix, upper case letters (N and C) represent ontological modalities as applied to God and lower case letters (n and c) represent ontological modalities as applied to the world. The zero case (O) represents lack of modal status or impossibility:

graphic God in all

Hartshorne’s matrix provides a method of making distinctions among various types of historically significant worldviews as well as highlighting the distinctiveness of his own position. For example: Parmenidean monism or classic Advaita Vedanta can be symbolized as N.o; early Buddhist thought is; Aristotle’s theism is; Aquinas’ theism is N.c; Stoic and Spinozistic pantheism is N.n; LaPlacean atheism is O.n; John Stuart Mill’s theism and most forms of deism are C.n; William James’s theism is C.c; Jules Lequyer’s is NC.c; Bertrand Russell’s atheism is O.c. Hartshorne argued that his preferred option ( is the most formally inclusive of the theoretical options, and that no specific options are logically compossible (otherwise we would have modal incoherence or contradiction).

Hartshorne’s presentation of the position matrix representing necessity and contingency as applied to God and world developed over the course of his career. He did not come to the four-row, four-column arrangement until after his ninetieth birthday, with the help of Joseph Pickle at Colorado College. A more substantive change was in the way that Hartshorne interpreted the zeros. In Creative Synthesis, the zeros are the atheistic and acosmic positions. In later discussions, however, he interprets the zeros more broadly as “God is impossible (or has no modal status)” and the “World is impossible (or has no modal status).” To illustrate the difference between these interpretations consider the position of W. V. O. Quine. He would say that God does not exist, the world does exist, but the world has no modal status. This option cannot be represented as O.n, O.c, or as since each presupposes modal status for the world. Nor can it be represented as O.o without serious distortion, since Quine does not deny that the world exists. Another illustration of the problem is Robert Neville’s emphasis on apophatic theology. In Neville’s view, the necessary/contingent contrast is a product of God’s creative act; God cannot be characterized as either necessary or contingent, but only as indeterminate, at least prior to the act of creation. Hartshorne’s table, as presented here, finesses these issues by interpreting the zeros in a strictly formal fashion to mean “neither necessary nor contingent,” leaving open the possibility of further refinement.

Whatever one’s ultimate convictions about this particular topic, Hartshorne’s approach arguably represents an advance in metaphysical or philosophical theology since it provides a matrix that may well suggest missed possibilities in traditional or conventional ways of thinking about the topic. Furthermore, Hartshorne’s method can be extended: similar 16-fold matrixes can be made for other polar contrasts such as infinite/finite, eternal/temporal, and so on. If any two matrixes are combined (16 X 16) the number of formal alternatives leaps to 256. More generally, if m equals the number of contrasts one wishes to include in talking about God and the world, then 16m is the number of formal alternatives available. There is no apparent antecedent in the history of philosophical theology of Hartshorne’s matrices. It is no wonder, therefore, that he considered them as one of his original contributions to metaphysics.

3. Neoclassical Metaphysics

Hartshorne referred to his metaphysics as “neoclassical” to emphasize its continuity with classical traditions, especially as they sprang up in antiquity from the Presocratic philosophers and from Plato and Aristotle. He was also keen to stress that his views are importantly different, or new (“neo”), in their substantive claims. He would eventually highlight the parallels of his metaphysics with ideas in early Buddhist thought. The family of metaphysical views to which Hartshorne’s ideas belong is often called process philosophy or, following Bernard Loomer, process-relational philosophy. One finds anticipations of process-relational philosophy in Peirce’s tychism, James’s pluralistic universe, and Bergson’s la durée. Hartshorne was influenced by these philosophers (with Peirce being the most dominant of the three) but his greatest debt was to Whitehead.

a. Creativity

Philosophers venture various hypotheses as to the character of the finally real constituents of existence. One remembers Parmenides’ Being, Democritus’ tiny impenetrable atoms, Aristotle’s hylomorphic ousia, Descartes’ dual substance ontology, Leibniz’s monads, and Whitehead’s actual entities. Hartshorne adopted a Whiteheadian view, sometimes speaking of “dynamic singulars” instead of “actual entities.” Dynamic singulars are instances of what Hartshorne called “creative experiencing,” an expression that suggests an activity of synthesis, a bringing together of diverse elements from an entity’s antecedent world into a unity of feeling. Hartshorne often used Whitehead’s word “prehension” to name the feelings from which a dynamic singular weaves its own experience from the welter of data from its past. The “diverse elements” from the past that are synthesized are themselves instances of creative experiencing; for this reason, Hartshorne was fond of the expression “feeling of feeling,” which is close to Whitehead’s language in Process and Reality (Ch. X, sec. II). The prime example on which both Whitehead and Hartshorne model this activity is memory. Memories are themselves experiences that may have previous experiences as component parts. Moreover, memories are active in the way that they highlight some items of experience but place other items in the background, sometimes almost forgotten. Memory also serves as a model of the way emotional tone suffuses experience, in accordance with Hartshorne’s theory of the affective continuum. Finally, in keeping with process-relational philosophy, memory is a process, a coming-to-be, and not an unchanging substance; its very existence, moreover, depends upon its relation to past events.

Hartshorne agreed with Whitehead when the latter spoke of creativity as “the category of the ultimate.” In Whitehead’s words, “the many become one and are increased by one” (Process and Reality, Ch. II, sec. II). For both Whitehead and Hartshorne, creativity is not itself a substance but rather the name for the activity that characterizes every concrete particular, from the lowliest puff of existence to God. Thomas Aquinas restricted creativity in the strict sense to deity alone. Whitehead and Hartshorne, on the other hand, treat creativity as what medieval thinkers called a transcendental, a universal concept that is not restricted to this or that kind of real thing but which identifies a thing as such as real. Another departure from traditional ideas about creativity is that, for Whitehead and Hartshorne, creativity is never from nothing (ex nihilo), whether it is God’s creativity or the creativity of individuals within the cosmos. According to Hartshorne, the “nothing” in the expression “creatio ex nihilo” would be a purely negative fact. As noted in a previous section, Hartshorne rejects the existence of such facts. Thus, Hartshorne concluded that a creative act always presupposes an antecedent world from which the novel act arises.

Hartshorne’s emphasis on creativity illustrates his commitment to the principle—summarized in the previous section—that that which comes-to-be (becoming) includes but is not included by that which is but does not come to be (being). Hartshorne insists on taking “becoming” in the strictest sense as a process that adds to the definiteness of reality something that was not included in the class of real things prior to the act of becoming. Nothing corresponds to the word “reality” considered as a single nontemporal or eternal fact; rather, reality grows with every act of becoming and is, as it were, defined by them. Hartshorne rejects the idea that there is literally “nothing new under the sun”; on the contrary, there was a time when even the sun was new. Hartshorne is not simply reaffirming the flux of Heraclitus where all concrete things change; he is affirming that reality is a growing totality, an idea that is also prominent in Peirce’s evolutionary cosmology. The growth of reality, moreover, is thoroughly temporal—time itself is the process of creation. The past is determinate, the future is a field of relatively indeterminate possibilia, and the present is the process of determination. Finally, Hartshorne argues that what comes to be, once it has become fully determinate, is a permanent fixture of all subsequent becoming, guaranteed in the final analysis by God’s memory of it. This is why Hartshorne speaks of creation as a cumulative process.

b. Psychicalism

The fact that, for Hartshorne, experience is ontologically foundational means that his metaphysics is a type of what has traditionally been known as panpsychism. Early in his career, Hartshorne used “panpsychism,” distinguishing true and false versions of the doctrine. Later he preferred “psychicalism” and he said that he did not object to David Ray Griffin’s word “panexperientialism.” Hartshorne attributed mind-like qualities to every concrete particular (that is, dynamic singular), but his metaphysics cannot be described as anthropomorphic. He accepted Leibniz’s two-fold criticism of Descartes that self-consciousness is not the only form of human experience, and that human experience is not the only form of experience. In his second book, Beyond Humanism, Hartshorne points out that a dog need not become a human in order to suffer. In keeping with the theory of the affective continuum Hartshorne conceives mind-like qualities as existing along a continuum from the simplest feelings to the most complex thoughts. He argues that it is precisely in its psychological characteristics that it is possible for a nonhuman being to be infinitely other than a human being. This is because psychological variables such as memory, feeling, and volition are infinitely variable. Memories are conceivably of any span (a few seconds, a million years, and so forth) and of any condition of vagueness or precision; feelings can be any degree of intensity or complexity; volitions, which presuppose memory and feeling, are likewise infinitely variable.

Hartshorne denied the assumption of much of modern philosophy that an experience can have only itself as an object. The errors of waking experience as well as the false impressions during dreams provide no sure ground for a global skepticism—in the words of Peirce, “as if doubting were as easy as lying.” Hartshorne maintains that the question “What if all of our experience is a dream?” is based on a faulty phenomenology of dreaming and he points to Henri Bergson’s small book, Le rêve. Bergson argued that, during dreams, perceptions are indistinct, memory is free-floating, and attention is mostly disengaged, but the connection with the world through the body is never severed. Events and concerns of the day as well as immediate stimuli from the environment regularly appear in our dreams. Hartshorne gives the example of having dreamed of a propeller airplane and, as he awoke, hearing the sound of the airplane blend imperceptibly into the sound of a fan blowing in the room. As perception is not lacking in dreams, so more generally experience is always of something not itself. What philosophers call “the given” in experience are, according to Hartshorne, the independent causal conditions of the experience. Introspection too conforms to this model: it is a present experience having the immediately previous experience as an object. Experience, at every level imaginable, is essentially social—dynamic singulars feeling the feelings of others.

Hartshorne rejects the assumption that minds are essentially non-physical entities. Even Descartes, who argued for this claim, acknowledged that certain mental qualities are experienced as spread throughout one’s body or as being in specific regions of the body. Mental and physical qualities are indeed distinguishable but it does not follow that they are separable. Descartes raised the question of the criteria for the presence of mind in a physical object, thereby making materialism the default position for anything outside one’s own consciousness; since, however, mind-like qualities are so pervasively present in varying degrees in so much of nature, Hartshorne asked for the criteria for the absence of mind. The problem, as Hartshorne sees it, is as much with the concept of mind as with the concept of the physical or of matter. He raises the question whether there is anything that positively corresponds to the concept of a merely physical entity, that is to say, a physical entity in which mind-like qualities—not simply human mind-like qualities—are wholly absent. To be sure, there are physical entities in which mind seems to be absent, but Hartshorne argues that this is no more evidence of the absence of mind than the appearance of inactivity in a physical object is evidence that there is no activity in it. Leibniz guessed otherwise and modern science is on his side; the micro-world, even where apparently “dead matter” is concerned, is buzzing with activity. The old adage, “absence of evidence is not evidence of absence” applies.

In arguing for the ubiquity of mind-like qualities, Hartshorne found inspiration in certain aspects of Leibniz’s panpsychism. With Leibniz, he distinguished parts and wholes. The parts—Hartshorne’s dynamic singulars—have mind-like qualities even if some wholes of which they are made lack them. He argues by analogy that feeling can be everywhere even though not everything feels. For instance, a flock of birds does not have feeling, but there are feelings in the individual birds. Hartshorne explains the difference using a modified version of Leibniz’s concept of a “dominant entelechy” according to which some physical systems are organized in such a way that the experiences of the dynamic singulars (the parts) can be channeled into a single more or less unified stream of experience or even conscious experience, as in the case of animals with complex nervous systems. In Hartshorne’s theory, the body not only reacts to the world around it, but also reacts to itself. We feel the feelings of at least some of our cells. As Hartshorne said, hurt my cells and you hurt me. Some organic wholes, such as plants, do not have a structure integrated enough to allow for a dominant stream of experience. Hartshorne viewed plants as having no feeling, but he attributed feelings to their individual cells. He held that the phototropism of a flower tracking the sun is more a function of the activity of the cells than of the plant as a whole. Hartshorne generalizes this analysis along Leibnizian lines to the inorganic world. Leibniz spoke of monads in inorganic substances as being in a “stupor.” Hartshorne attains a similar result in his theory of the infinite variability of mind-like qualities. There is no such thing as “mere matter,” only matter in which mind-like qualities are far removed from what is recognizably human-like, animal-like, or even cell-like. With Leibniz’s distinctions, Hartshorne is able to theorize that there is experience in every object, but not every object of experience is an experiencing object.

Despite Hartshorne’s use of Leibniz’s ideas, the dissimilarities between their versions of panpsychism are as striking as their similarities. As already noted, dynamic singulars are entities that come to exist in the creative-cumulative advance of the world; Leibniz’s monads do not come to exist within the universe but are coexistent with it. For Leibniz, God’s creation of the universe is nothing more than God’s creation of the monads that make it up. Another significant difference between the two philosophers concerns relations of cause and effect. Leibniz denied causal relations among nondivine monads—they are “sans fenêtres” (windowless); he secured the appearance of relations of cause and effect by positing a divinely imposed pre-established harmony. For Hartshorne, every dynamic singular is both a partial result of causal conditions that precede it and a partial causal condition of events that succeed it. In short, every dynamic singular is both an effect and a cause. The word “partial,” especially as regards the relation from cause to effect, is important. Hartshorne rejected determinism (see below), and this represents another departure from Leibniz. For Hartshorne, causal conditions are necessary, but not entirely sufficient, for the emergence of a dynamic singular. The individual’s response to its own causal past—the way it synthesizes the world given to it—provides an ineradicable aspect of the explanation for why it is the way it is. It acts and is not merely acted upon. According to Hartshorne, the same principle applies to God, although allowance must be made in the divine case for the modal difference between existence and actuality (see below). The twin ideas that there are real relations among dynamic singulars and that each is unique by virtue of its manner of experiencing the world highlight two features of Hartshorne’s metaphysics. First, reality has a social structure (see below, under “personal identity” for a discussion of the meaning of “social”); second, every concrete particular that “makes” the world retains at least a minimal degree of freedom.

One objection to Hartshorne’s theory is that mental qualities seem to require a central nervous system. In Beyond Humanism, Hartshorne makes several points that are crucially relevant to this objection. He notes that among animals with central nervous systems, physical and psychical qualities are correlated. Hartshorne observes, in an almost Teilhardian turn of phrase, that physical complexity is a sign of psychical complexity. The more complex is the mental life, the more complex is the nervous system that underlies it. Can one generalize beyond creatures with a nervous system? Hartshorne points out that one-celled animals manage the functions of digestion, oxygenation, and locomotion without the organs and body parts that in creatures with nervous systems make these possible. He asks whether mental function, broadly conceived, may not be analogous. Is it any more reasonable to say that a paramecium feels nothing because it lacks a central nervous system than it is to say that it cannot swim because it has neither motor nerves nor muscle cells? If it has primitive feelings, then it displays them behaviorally in the only way it could, by responding to stimuli. Hartshorne argues that the only conclusion that can be drawn from physiology is that similarity of mind between a one-celled creature and a human is limited by the dissimilarity of their bodies. Physical wholes insufficiently organized to allow a dominant stream of experience are the closest thing in Hartshorne’s philosophy to what materialists call “matter.”

An important objection to Hartshorne’s psychicalist theory is suggested in the work of Karl Popper. In his classic treatise on the mind-body problem titled The Self and Its Brain (co-authored with neuroscientist John Eccles), Popper objected to “psychicalist” or “proto-mental” conceptions of the brain’s elementary particles, arguing that such conceptions have no empirical explanatory power and are thus “metaphysical in the bad sense.” Popper maintains that elementary particles can have no “interior states” because they are “completely identical whatever their past states.” For example, any arbitrary proton selected at any time for measurement will have the same physical properties as any other proton selected at any time for measurement: its mass will be 938 MeV/c2; its charge +1; and its spin ½.

Contra Popper, it does not follow from this that elementary particles are absolutelypredicatively identical no matter what their past states. To use Hartshorne’s dipolar vocabulary, Popper is here conflating “gen-identity” (identical characteristics over time) and “strict identity.” Such properties as mass, charge and spin are gen-identical features of protons that are present in each proton-occasion. However, protons do not remain static in terms of their empirically discernible behavior over periods of time. For example, a proton P in a tritium nucleus of hydrogen (a nucleus of hydrogen with one proton and two neutrons) has a rate of radiation decay as compared to a distinctive proton P* in a lead-206 nucleus (one of the four "stable" isotopes of lead), which has no such decay, as is now familiar to us through the “half-life radiation law.” Notice that the behavioral differences occur precisely because of differences in physical contexts. That physical context matters to the behavior of protons is readily explicable in a Hartshornean interpretation of elementary particle-occasions, because such particle-occasions are “open” to their environments—in Whitehead’s vocabulary, the environments are their “actual worlds”—through prehension. More recent empirically well-corroborated developments in quantum physics are likewise readily explicable in Hartshorne’s psychicalist interpretation, again through the notion of prehension. One may note in this regard the phenomena that (a) “information transfer or influence” occurs between well-separated particles faster than light-cone propagation (that is, quantum entanglement) and (b) that physical states are discernibly influenced by the selection and rapidity of an observation or measurement process (that is, quantum Zeno effect). It may well be no accident that one of the first philosopher-physicists to devise experimental tests for quantum entanglement phenomena was Abner Shimony, a student of Hartshorne’s at the University of Chicago, who has remained indebted to the “Whiteheadian paradigm.” In neuroscience, the emergence of neuroplastic phenomena in which rigorously repeated thought or “attentional” exercises have an empirically discernible effect upon brain metabolism as shown through PET-scans also conjures a top-down causation model which again can be readily handled by a Hartshornean interpretation of particle-occasions as prehensive. Thus, Popper’s dismissive estimate of the empirical explanatory power of psychicalist or panexperientialist concepts seems to be, at the very least, seriously challenged by more recent developments in physics.

Hartshorne believed that his concept of the infinite variability of mind-like qualities provides the theoretical bridge to extend the categories of experience beyond the human, the animal, or even the organic. He does not deny that these speculations about the possibility of radically non-human or non-animal minds are, for the foreseeable future, of little or no use to much of science. Physics, for example, need not worry whether atoms or electrons have “feelings”; but this may simply be a way of saying that what is of interest to metaphysics is not necessarily of interest to physics. In a 1934 article in The New Frontier, Hartshorne characterized physics as the behavioristic aspect of the lowest branch of comparative psychology, or even of comparative sociology since reality, in his view, has a social structure. Hartshorne argued further that psychicalism is the metaphysic best suited to an evolutionary world-view. Psychicalism does not face the problem of the emergence of mind from what is wholly lacking in psychical qualities. Hartshorne calls this view “temporal dualism”; all of the problems of mind-body dualism of how to relate nonphysical mind to nonmental matter are repeated, only in an evolutionary context. For Hartshorne, on the contrary, new forms of mind emerge in the process of evolution, but not mind itself.

c. Indeterminism and Freedom

The philosophy of creative becoming is inherently anti-deterministic. This is not to say that Hartshorne denied relations of cause and effect or that he rejected the laws of nature discovered through scientific investigation. It is all-too-common for philosophers to argue that the falsity of determinism implies chaoticism, the doctrine that there exists, at most, an appearance of causal regularity in the world. By way of clarification, Hartshorne noted that determinism posits absolute modal regularity in the sense that, for every set of causal conditions, it is not only the case that, then and there, there is only one effect that will occur (which may well be a truism), but there is only one effect, then and there, that can occur (note that “can” is a modal concept). As William James argued in “The Dilemma of Determinism,” if some sets of causal conditions allow for more than one possible effect, then determinism is false. Therefore, the logical contradictory of absolute regularity is non-absolute regularity, not absolute irregularity (chaoticism). Absolute irregularity is the logical contrary, not the contradictory, of determinism. For this reason, Hartshorne argues in Wisdom as Moderation that determinism and chaoticism are the extreme metaphysical positions, both of which may be false. If both are false, then some form of indeterminism must be true.

Determinism has sometimes gone by the name of the doctrine of necessity, as in Perice’s famous article “The Doctrine of Necessity Examined.” The meaning of “necessity” as it applies to determinism is that a specific effect could not have been otherwise given the causes that brought it about; in other words, causes necessitate their effects. Indeed, determinists seek to minimize the extent to which events seem contingent—that they could have been otherwise—by uncovering their causal antecedents. The deterministic theory is that all contingency in the world, which is to say, all of the variety and novelty or all deviations from absolute regularity, are apparent only. Alternate effects seem possible, but determinists claim that this is only because of our ignorance of all of the factors—the causes and the laws that link cause to effect—that explain a particular effect. Nevertheless, hidden within the seeming contingency of our ignorance is another necessity: the causal nexus of events absolutely fixes the details of our knowledge in any given situation. Of course, whether determinism or indeterminism is correct, some degree of ignorance and fallibility is an inescapable aspect of the human condition. The indeterminism espoused by Hartshorne also admits of unknown causes that limit what is possible. For example, an athlete may eat breakfast with plans of competing later in the day, not realizing that the food she is eating is contaminated and will incapacitate her. In Hartshorne’s theory, however, contingency is not merely a function of ignorance; on the contrary, sometimes there are real alternatives, no one of which the concatenation of causal conditions entirely eliminates. The incapacitated athlete, for example, may nevertheless have a variety of real alternatives for how to respond to the food poisoning.

Peirce argued, and Hartshorne agreed with him, that one cannot help but posit real alternatives: either reality as a whole could have been otherwise or contingency enters the world piecemeal or incrementally. Determinists may attempt to eliminate contingency within the universe by tracing events to their causal antecedents—to a singularity at the beginning of the universe or to an eternal decree from deity—but there remains the question of why the universe has the exact initial conditions that it has. There is no plausible modal theory that would allow one to consider the contingency of the initial conditions as a hidden form of necessity. Thus, contingency is unavoidable, or as Hartshorne says in Creative Synthesis (Ch. II), “There can be no alternative to alternativeness itself.” Hartshorne, following Peirce and James, locates the contingency of the universe not in an absolute beginning or in the divine will but within the universe’s own creative processes—in Hartshorne’s words, contingency “seeping into the world bit by bit” (Creativity in American Philosophy, Ch. X). James spoke of “pluralism’s additive world” and this is Hartshorne’s view: the coming-to-be of each dynamic singular introduces a morsel of novelty into existence and, in so doing, adds itself to the universe. Every subsequent dynamic singular must take account of this prior addition to the universe as a causal factor in its own emergence. In this way, there is a rhythm of the universe as each new subject of experience inevitably becomes a new object for a new experience.

It should now be clear that Hartshorne intended his version of indeterminism to leave ample room for the massive regularities—the order—of the world that scientists make it their business to discover, but these regularities are not absolute as determinists conceive them to be. Hartshorne turned on its head the traditional doctrine that effects are contained in their causes; for Hartshorne, it is the other way around: at the most basic metaphysical level of analysis, causes are contained in their effects. Again, Hartshorne finds a clue in the experience of memory. One’s memory-of-X includes X as an indispensable causal component, but X as partial cause of one’s memory-of-X does not contain the memory itself. Hartshorne goes further and denies that memory-of-X is contained, implicitly or virtually, in the entire set of causal conditions leading up to the memory. In short, the causal antecedents of the memory provide the necessary but not the sufficient conditions of the memory. The present memory-experience is an instance of creative experiencing; as such, it adds a novel element to reality. Nevertheless, the causal conditions are limiting factors in what experience may result from them; the causes define a field of possible experience activity. Not just any effect can result from a particular set of casual conditions and this principle is enough to block the inference from indeterminism to chaoticism. This principle also provides the metaphysical ground of developmental processes. For example, every adult human has a developmental history beginning with a fertilized egg, but no single-celled zygote and its genetic make-up is sufficient to make an adult. The countless intermediate steps of growth and education, as well as the person’s own reactions to his or her circumstances, are required to complete the process.

Since at least David Hume, philosophers have acknowledged that empirical science cannot establish the truth of determinism. There remained, however, the idea that scientific explanations presuppose or require a deterministic framework. In Hartshorne’s reckoning, Peirce disposed of this claim once and for all. First, Peirce observed that measurements can be no more fine-grained than our instruments and our proneness to error will allow. There can be no empirical or scientific meaning to the concept of an absolute measurement. Second, the far reaching regularities in nature that a reasonable indeterminism posits are enough for the purposes of scientific theorizing; saying that the regularities are absolute, as determinism does, adds nothing. The much diminished levels of novel experiencing that Hartshorne’s metaphysics locates in the world of inorganic beings makes that realm as deterministic in appearance as it needs to be for the purposes of discovering laws of nature. To be sure, those laws must be understood as stochastic, but this fits well enough with scientific judgments which are couched in terms of probabilities rather than certainties. It is worth noting that Hartshorne did not look to subatomic physics for his main support for indeterminism, for he believed that the case against determinism had already been made by Peirce and others. As far as Hartshorne was concerned, quantum indeterminacies buttress the case against determinism by showing that physics, the supposedly most materialistic of sciences, does not require determinism. Even Einstein, who rejected indeterministic interpretations of quantum phenomena, did not deny that those interpretations were scientific.

Numerous philosophers use moral freedom as an argument—perhaps the central argument—against determinism. Hartshorne agreed that moral freedom is indispensable to a proper understanding of human life but he was more interested in defending a more generalized idea of freedom that extends beyond moral decision-making and even into the nonhuman realm. Freedom in this more generalized sense, as a creative act, complements and completes Hartshorne’s indeterminism. In The Logic of Perfection (Ch. VIII), he speaks of causality as crystallized freedom and freedom as causality in the making. As we have just seen, for Hartshorne, every effect is more than, and even includes, the causal conditions that make it possible. If one analyzes the effect, abstracting from its causes, one is left with the particular way in which a dynamic singular experiences its causal antecedents, which is the measure of novelty in it. The word “experience” may call to mind a merely private epiphenomenon, but Hartshorne insists that experience has an ineliminable public aspect as it becomes a datum for subsequent experiences—a cause for future effects. In Creative Experiencing: A Philosophy of Freedom, he stresses that this idea of freedom is essentially social. Every creative act is a combination of self-determination and determination by others. The creative act, once completed in a dynamic singular, becomes part-cause of subsequent dynamic singulars. In this way, cause and effect relations are explained by the more basic principle of freedom limiting freedom.

For all of Hartshorne’s animadversions on determinism and his advocacy of a philosophy of creativity, he was under no illusions about the limits, sometimes extreme limits, on freedom in any particular situation. In The Logic of Perfection (Ch. VIII), he speaks of a present creation as adding “only its little mite” to the vast totality of the universe. Hartshorne says that a phrase like “creative experiencing” escapes redundancy because there are degrees of creativity. As Hartshorne’s indeterminism provides the metaphysical ground for developmental ideas, so the concept of freedom limiting freedom provides the ground for a meaningful concept of degrees of freedom. Freedom increases to the extent that there are more options of more complexity, allowing for greater contrasts of feeling. The development of more and more complex organisms during the course of evolution makes for new levels of organizational structure (for example, in the convolutions of brains), more varieties of experiencing, and a widening range of possibilities for creative realization. The most dramatic example of augmented freedom occurs when organisms cross the threshold from experience to conscious experience. This occurred in the evolution of the human species but it is also the natural development within each member of that species. Hartshorne remarks on how the complexities of a symphony can be appreciated by a human being but they are hopelessly beyond the understanding of creatures with simpler brains. Consciousness also makes possible moral freedom which brings with it increased opportunities for achievement and for risk of failure in the attainment of high ideals. The opportunities and the risks go hand-in-hand in such a way that one cannot be had without the other.

d. Personal Identity

The attribution of responsibility for acts worthy of praise or censure involves the concept of a person, or more fundamentally, of agency. With the problematic exception of a supernatural deity that exists outside of time, persons do not simply exist, they persist; their existence requires days, months, and years. Dynamic singulars, as momentary flashes of experience, are not persons, but in Hartshorne’s view, they are the raw materials from which persons are made. One can say that a person is a whole of which dynamic singulars are the parts. Hartshorne adopts the more refined categories of Whitehead’s philosophy in order to express, in neoclassical terms, the concept of personhood. Whitehead spoke of a nexus as any “particular fact of togetherness among actual entities.” A society is a type of nexus whose constituents prehend (feel) a common element of form. Every mammal, for example, is a society of dynamic singulars, each of which inherits from its predecessors and passes along to its successors the form of “mammal.” A society is more than a mere mathematical set, for the common form of the society is passed along—shared by prehensive relations—from one grouping of dynamic singulars to another.

In the philosophies of Whitehead and Hartshorne, the existence of a person requires that there be a special type of society, one that exhibits personal order. A personally ordered society is a sequence of dynamic singulars, no two of which are contemporaries. This is the neoclassical metaphysical account of our sense of being persons that persist through time. Both Whitehead and Hartshorne emphasize, however, that personally ordered societies are embodied. A personally ordered society is a sub-society within the larger society that is the human body. Leibniz spoke of a dominant entelechy or soul associated with each animal body, itself a collection of monads; a personally ordered society is a very rough equivalent of this (taking into account all of the caveats mentioned in the discussion of psychicalism). Each dynamic singular making up a personally ordered society inherits not only from its predecessor in the sequence but also from the dynamic singulars that make up the rest of the body. The body, one might say, is the immediate environment of the soul, or more colloquially, the self. Whitehead and Hartshorne believed that a personally ordered society does not survive without the body. Although neither philosopher definitively dismissed the possibility of a limited post-mortem existence, they did not show the slightest interest in speculating on the details of such a possibility.

Hartshorne argued that his and Whitehead’s view of personhood avoids two extremes. A person is not, as Hume seemed to think, a mere bundle of qualities existing from moment to moment, with no internal relations among its component parts. Every dynamic singular within a personally ordered society is a creative appropriation of its successors in the sequence and in the wider environment of its body. As noted in the previous section, Hartshorne denied determinism without denying the efficacy of causal regularities. Certain kinds of damage to the brain, for instance, are real causal factors in seriously altering or even eliminating personality. The other extreme that Hartshorne claims to avoid is the denial of external relations among the components of the self. According to Leibniz, the identity of a monad, including a dominant entelechy, is in its “concept,” which is all of the properties that ever were or will be true of it. Hartshorne maintains that a person is a product of developmental processes that are inherently open-ended, allowing for different outcomes. For this reason, Hartshorne accepted the Jamesian view that one’s character as so far formed is no absolute guarantee of one’s future behavior. It is true, as is said, that people “act in character,” but one is also part-creator of one’s character. We meet here once again, but now as applied to the problem of self-identity, the protean nature of creativity in neoclassical metaphysics. As each dynamic singular in one’s personally ordered society emerges, one is a partly new self.

On Hartshorne’s principles, personal identity is not a matter of strict or mathematical identity. The additive nature of creativity entails that identity through time, or gen-identity, is relative only—a question of “more or less” rather than “all or none.” The unity of self-identity in a person is wholly a function of the inertia that past dynamic singulars carry into the present of a personally ordered series. Hartshorne sometimes spoke of this relation as being among past and present “selves.” James said that the present thought itself is the thinker. Hartshorne would agree, for it is not the past “selves” in a personal sequence that do the thinking; the present is where thinking occurs and where particular decisions are made. For most of us, most of the time, the broad outlines of our personality remain stable, allowing us to speak of ourselves as being “the same person.” Yet, dramatic changes are possible, for the better and for the worse. The annals of both brain science and of religious conversion are full of case histories of persons who undergo changes that are sufficiently global to speak of a new person being born. It is also worth noting that Hartshorne’s metaphysics allows for the possibility that a single body could support more than one personally ordered society; this might provide the outlines of an account of multiple personality or even of aspects of the unconscious mind.

Hartshorne’s theory of personal identity is not reductionist. It is, like his indeterminism and philosophy of freedom, inherently developmental. Consider the beginnings of a human life. In most cases, conception results in a full complement of chromosomes necessary for a human person to develop. Much more must be accomplished, even within the mother’s reproductive system, to complete the process. The single-celled zygote from which we grow is genetically human, but it is arguably not the individual we associate with being a person. For example, far from being one individual rather than another, the fertilized egg has the potential to divide to produce twins or triplets. Hartshorne noted that his twin brothers, James and Henry, were very different persons despite having the same genetic make-up. Another argument against reducing personhood to genetic structure is that the nervous system and a functioning brain, which provide the physiological basis of human personhood, are not present from the moment of conception; they are the result of development both in utero and after birth. These observations do not determine the moral or legal status of the unborn, but they are relevant to those questions, for they argue against reducing personhood to genetics. To be sure, the question of abortion is complicated. When does the unborn become a person with rights and how do these rights, assuming they exist, stand vis-à-vis a woman’s manifest right to self-determination? Hartshorne was firmly on the side of allowing women to decide for themselves, apart from interference from government or religion, whether to terminate an unwanted pregnancy. His position on abortion was basically that of Roe v. Wade. What Hartshorne’s metaphysic of personal identity brings to the debate is a robust rejection of reducing personhood to genetics and a corresponding emphasis on developmental categories. In The Second Sex, Simone de Beauvoir wrote that one is not born a woman, but becomes one. Hartshorne would agree and generalize the thought: one is not born a person, but becomes a person.

Hartshorne drew interesting ethical implications from his metaphysics of personal identity. Most notably, he argued that a metaphysics which includes such Whiteheadian notions as prehension, personally-ordered societies of actual occasions, and transmutation of conformal feeling, could never countenance what Hartshorne calls the “illusions of egoism.” Even more plausible versions of “enlightened” ethical egoism, which allow interest in others for the sake of welfare of self, are incoherent in Hartshorne’s reckoning. Enlightened self-interest theories are based on a partially true but misleading “common sense” conception of self-identity that fails to grasp the logical distinction between being an individual and being the concrete states of an individual. The former is an abstraction from the latter. No momentary state is strictly identical with any other but there can be enough continuity to speak of an abstract, relatively unchanging, character. As Hartshorne says in The Zero Fallacy (Ch. XII), “The identity is somewhat abstract, the non-identity is concrete. Without this distinction the language of self-identity is a conceptual trap.” When this distinction is grasped, we see that the claim to have an interest in self cannot be simpliciter or absolute, since there must always be an “other,” namely, the future concrete states of the individual self, to which the interests of the self in a concrete state now must be addressed. Moreover, the fact that (psychologically normal) individuals “enjoy the enjoyment of others” is grounded in the metaphysical structure of social selves, whose dominant occasions of experience are built up and transmuted by conformal feeling of the feeling-tone in constituent neural occasions. We are, quite literally in Hartshorne’s account, “members one of another.” That is to say, a “self” is precisely a creative synthesis of feelings of others through its “perceptual mode of causal efficacy” in Whitehead’s language. The capacity for feeling the feelings of others, in a word “sympathy,” is basic, and thus the capacity for altruism as well as selfishness is built into the nature of being a social organism.

e. Time and Possibility

Hartshorne’s philosophy of creative experiencing is inseparable from his philosophy of time. As already explained, he posits a universe that is forever in the making by the dynamic singulars that come to be. What has already been made is the past, what has yet to be made is the future, and the present is the locus of activity where future possibility becomes past actuality. This characterization of time is in one sense circular, for the definens presupposes the definiendum; for example, “yet to be” presupposes “future.” What keeps the definition from being vacuous is Hartshorne’s concept of creativity or making. Classical ideas about creation in Christian tradition, for example, place God outside of time as its creator. According to this theory, God brings the temporal world—past, present, future—into existence but the divine act itself is not in time. From God’s eternity, what is future for us is as fully detailed as any moment that has for us become past. Hartshorne, on the other hand, finds a fundamental asymmetry in temporal relations. There is no such thing, even from a divine perspective, of a future that is as fully detailed as the past. The future, as “yet to be made,” lacks details that will not exist until the making of them. The “making of them,” as already noted, adds something to the universe that was not previously part of it. The universe, and time itself, is nothing more than this process of accumulated and accumulating acts of becoming and all that they contain.

Some commentators are tempted to see in Hartshorne’s theory of time a variation on J. M. E. McTaggart’s concept of an A-series. However, in his article on “Time” for Vergilius Ferm’s 1955 Encyclopedia of Religion, Hartshorne distinguished his own ideas from those of McTaggart. McTaggart distinguished two ways of marking time: the A-series of relations of past, present, and future and the B-series of relations of before and after. McTaggart said that if one abstracts from the A-series and B-series relations, one is left with an ordered array of events, called a C-series, without temporal order of any kind. If a C-series is like a film strip, with each frame representing an event, the A-series is analogous to frames passing in front of the light of the projector; as the light shines through a particular frame the photo on that frame is a present event, beforehand it is a future event and afterwards it is a past event. By contrast, Hartshorne’s cumulative theory of becoming entails that there is no such thing as a C-series from which A-series relations could be abstracted. To continue the analogy, there is no film running on a projector with frames yet to be viewed. In short, there are no future events. At best, and in keeping with Hartshorne’s indeterminism, there is field of possibility that is only as detailed as the past determines it must be, all else in the field remaining essentially vague, awaiting full determination as novel dynamic singulars arise in the creative advance. By parity of reasoning, B-series relations are not fixed in eternity but are themselves results of temporal becoming. For example, the fact denoted by “Socrates died before Aristotle’s birth” could not exist until Aristotle was born. This is no mere limitation of human knowledge. After Socrates’ death and before Aristotle’s birth, there was no such relation as Socrates-having-died-before-Aristotle-was-born; what existed at the time of Socrates’ death was a range of recently emergent possibilities of someone or other being born after Socrates, for example: a-great-philosopher-born-fifteen-years-after-the-death-of-Socrates. As Hartshorne says in the Encyclopedia article, “Time is not a mere relation of becomings but a becoming of relations.”

Hartshorne grounded modal concepts in the temporal structure of the world. He often quoted, with approval, Peirce’s dictum that time is a particular variety of objective modality: the past is fully determinate or actual, the future is relatively indeterminate or possible, and the present is the becoming of the actual as the relatively indeterminate becomes determinate. Following the lead of both Peirce and James, Hartshorne argued that determinism denies the reality of time. As noted previously, the only objective modality where determinism is concerned is necessity. Hartshorne’s indeterminism, on the other hand, posits necessity in the direction from effect to cause; in the direction from cause to effect, however, there is an element of contingency, and this is the objective modality of the future. Determinists emphasize our ignorance of causes and the consequent inability to clearly perceive the necessary relations among all events. For the determinist, however, the ignorance includes the systematic illusion of time’s direction. From a practical point of view we cannot help but treat the illusion as reality. Aristotle remarked in Nichomachean Ethics (Bk. VI) that no one decides to have sacked Troy; however, the war (assuming its historicity) was once a matter of urgent decision in which the future was not something to be known but something to be made. For this reason, Hartshorne maintained that we act as though the future is relatively indeterminate even if we convince ourselves otherwise.

Hartshorne argued that the human capacity to form general conceptions and to frame principles that guide actions is another illustration that it is necessarily the case that we act as though determinism were false and time is real. The asymmetry between remembering a past event and planning for a future event is a powerful indication of the asymmetry of time. One may remember or misremember any amount of detail about a plan that has been carried out, but when the plan has yet to be executed, the only details that can be known are ones within the plan itself. As a script for future activity, the plan is abstract compared to its eventual realization. One may remember having taken one’s dog for a walk, including the memory of having intended to take a particular route; however, the memory of the originally intended route cannot include everything that happened on the walk: on this walk, a toddler peered at you from beside a car, a fallen branch blocked your path, you stepped on two ants, a street lamp burned out, a raccoon scurried into a sewage drain—these and countless other details were not included in the plan. Of course, what one anticipates by way of plans, intentions, or purposes, can be more or less specific. Regardless of the amount of detail, however, one’s future projects leave innumerable particulars undecided. When things go “as planned” it is not because every aspect of the plan matched some detail fixed in advance, for there are many ways that plans can be successfully fulfilled. Musicians know that every musical score leaves a great deal to be decided; different performances can be equally faithful to what the composer wrote.

Hartshorne realized that if his theory of modality as essentially temporal is correct then there can be no such thing as merely possible worlds that are not anchored in the actual world. At most, there are possible world-states; that is to say, there are ways the actual world might have been. For any given past event, there was a time when something else might have occurred in its place. We can ask “What if?” about the past in order to conceive of ways the world might have been different, even though nothing can now be done to change what occurred. The future, on the other hand, is the arena of what might yet occur given the actual history of the world up to the present. Hartshorne’s view contrasts neatly with Leibniz’s idea that possible worlds are completely detailed descriptions of universes that God might choose to create. Possible worlds, in the Leibnizian sense, contain possible persons. As Leibniz argues in his correspondence with Arnauld, when the “concept”—the complete description of a possible person—is made actual by God, the person exists; the making actual of a different “concept” (that is, altering the description in some way) would result in a different person. Hartshorne objects that persons cannot be merely possible. Contrary to Leibniz, an actual person could have had properties other than what it has and the properties that it has could have been had by others. For example, Hillary Clinton could have been elected the U.S. president in 2008 and someone besides Hillary could have been Bill Clinton’s first lady. A fictional character, on the other hand, has no reality beyond the description of it; it has enough specificity to simulate a real person, but no feat of magic could transform it into a real person. Hartshorne’s arguments clearly anticipate and dovetail with those of Saul Kripke in Naming and Necessity. Kripke maintains that a proper name designates the same object across possible worlds (for example, Hillary Clinton) whereas a description designates different objects from world to world (for example, “winner of the 2008 U.S. presidential election”). Kripke also suggested that “counter-factual situation” or “possible state (or history) of the world” are less misleading expressions than “possible world.” To speak of a “counter-factual” is to presuppose the factual. On these points, Hartshorne and Kripke are in full agreement.

On the question of the nature of possibility, Hartshorne sided closely with Peirce but parted ways with Whitehead. Peirce conceived the realm of possibilities as a continuum which, by definition, has no least member, but is infinitely divisible. There are no actual parts of a continuum, only an infinite number of ways to slice it. This idea is evident in Hartshorne’s concept of the affective continuum (see the companion article “Charles Hartshorne: Biography/Philosophy: Philosophy and Psychology of Sensation”). Whitehead, on the other hand, spoke of “eternal objects” as “forms of definiteness” that identify what a thing is. The point of calling eternal objects “eternal” is that none of them are novel; the point of calling them “objects” is that they are definite; for example, a particular shade of green is this shade and no other. To use Whitehead’s example, a leaf on a tree changes colors but any particular shade of color exhibited by the leaf does not change. Hartshorne maintains, by contrast, that the shades of color in question are neither eternal nor are they definite objects; put somewhat differently, they are definite only insofar as they are not eternal. The successive shades of color of the leaf are slices of the color continuum that exist as definite only when instantiated in the leaf. The color of the leaf at a particular moment is novel. In Hartshorne’s account, we speak of sameness of color because the gradation between any two shades may be so infinitesimally slight as to be imperceptible. He noted that observed sameness of color is not a transitive relation. An object X may appear to be the same color as Y and Y the same color as Z, but X may appear slightly different than Z. In other words, there is a threshold defined by a degree of separation on the color continuum below which real differences are not observable for creatures like us.

According to Hartshorne, any quality that admits of a negative instance is not eternal. There are, in short, emergent universals. In Creative Synthesis (Ch. IV), Hartshorne notes that “lover of Shakespeare” is a universal in the sense that it may be true of more than one thing but it is emergent in the sense that it could be true of nothing prior to Shakespeare. By parity of reasoning, specific qualities in the affective continuum—particular tonal qualities, particular shades of color, and so forth—emerge as the affective continuum is cut in various ways and patterns by dynamic singulars. On the other hand, the generic quality of “feeling” may be classified, in Hartshornean principles, as eternal, if not quite an “object” in the Whiteheadian sense. As previously noted, qualities that admit only of positive instances are metaphysical. A consequence of Hartshorne’s view is that similarity is not simply a function of partial identity. It is true that we count two things similar when they have a sufficient number of qualities in common. But it is also the case that qualities themselves are similar to each other, as when we observe that orange is closer to red than it is to blue. Hartshorne concludes that similarity is as metaphysically ultimate as identity.

f. The Aesthetic Motif

One of the best and earliest interpreters of Hartshorne’s philosophy, Eugene Peters, spoke of “the aesthetic motif” that runs through neoclassical theism. Peters was drawing attention to the fact that, for Hartshorne, the most inclusive values are aesthetic. Hartshorne began his career proposing, as an empirical hypothesis, that all sensations are feelings and that all feelings exist along an aesthetic continuum (see “Charles Hartshorne: Philosophy and Psychology of Sensation”). Hartshorne’s metaphysics completes and complements the empirical hypothesis by considering the value-achievement and value-enrichment of dynamic singulars as the very foundations of existence. In Divine Beauty, Daniel Dombrowski rightly says that, for Hartshorne, aesthetic experiences are not merely woven into the real, they are the real. The poet e. e. cummings wrote, “Since feeling is first / who pays any attention / to the syntax of things . . .” Hartshorne did precisely what cummings dismissed (at least in the poem): he recognized feeling as first (that is, as a metaphysical category) but he also paid close attention to the syntax of things (to understand the structure of feeling).

In his first book Hartshorne rejected the “annex view of value.” In the context of neoclassical metaphysics this means that there is no merely valueless stuff (what Whitehead called “vacuous actuality”) onto which values are projected by human or divine purposes. Our pre-reflective experiences of our bodies, our memories, and of the world are never, Hartshorne insists, of bare valueless existence. The mother hears her baby’s cries as irritating and the mother’s songs are heard as soothing by the child. The values in experience, however, are not primarily ethical but aesthetic, a fact most clearly illustrated in the animal kingdom. The experiences of subhuman creatures are productive primarily—and for most creatures, exclusively—of non-moral values. When a lion fells an antelope, it is good for the lion pride and bad for the antelope, but moral judgments are out of place. One may, it is true, stress what is adaptive in behavior and useful for the survival of the species. There remain, however, the values of living for the lions and for the antelope that derive from being aware of the world around them, of breathing, eating, and the interactions with their fellows. These creatures do not think about their worlds but they feel them. For them, aesthesis or feeling (the root of “aesthetics”) is indeed “first.” Hartshorne’s extensive study of song birds in his book Born to Sing supports this hypothesis; oscines have what in us would be called an aesthetic sense.

Hartshorne did not consider beauty to be the only aesthetic value, but “beauty” was his word of choice for what anchors his aesthetic theory. One could generalize or gloss “beauty” to mean intense satisfactory experience without distorting Hartshorne’s meaning. Much of traditional aesthetics holds that beauty is unity within diversity. Hartshorne argued, however, that another contrast is necessary to make sense of beauty, that of complexity and simplicity. This concept of beauty, along with the relation of beauty to other aesthetic values, is expressed in the Dessoir-Davis-Hartshorne Circle. (Max Dessoir and Kay Davis helped Hartshorne with the diagram.) If Hartshorne is correct, then beauty is a mean between two extremes, between order and disorder on the one hand (the vertical axis of the circles) and between complexity and simplicity on the other (the horizontal axis of the circles). Outside of the boundary of the outer circle is not merely aesthetic failure but also the failure of experience and therefore (because of Hartshorne’s psychicalism) of existence itself.

graph of undiversified unityFor Hartshorne, beauty (or any aesthetic quality) is not merely in “the eye of the beholder” (or the perception of the perceiver). One must take into account not only the perceiving mind but what the mind perceives. A mind of sufficient complexity, cultivation, and education is required to appreciate the elements that make for beauty in something. For example, until one knows what counterpoint is and until one is taught to listen for it, one is not in a position to be fully aware of it and one may not even be able to hear it. An adequate grasp of such things is beyond the ability of creatures with simpler nervous systems or of humans with certain kinds of brain damage. There is, in short, an intellectual component of beauty that requires a higher intellect to appreciate. This intellectual side of beauty predominates in science and mathematics, but Hartshorne argues that the twin contrasts of order / disorder and complexity / simplicity remain. In one of his articles, titled “Science as the Search for the Hidden Beauty of the World” (1982), he chronicles the ways in which ideals of beauty guide pure scientific inquiry and how the deliverances of science themselves are beautiful. Science seeks a proper balance between imagination (for example, theorizing) and observation. Hartshorne speaks of the “romance of science” as “the disclosure of a universe whose wild harmonies surpass the most vivid dreams of imagination not submitting itself to criticism and observational test.” He reminds us that Darwin closed the Origin with “a prose poem on the beauty of the web of life.”

Prediction is one of the goals of scientific inquiry, but even here, there is an aesthetic component. Too little predictability is chaotic but too much predictability is monotonous. Good science is also heuristic, meaning that it is fruitful, leading to more discoveries. But discoveries in the strict sense are not predictable and are often quite surprising. Hartshorne accuses the determinism of traditional Newtonian science of aesthetic failure for it posited absolute regularity as the ideal to the exclusion of spontaneity, chance, and freedom: the adventure of life reduced to mechanistic obedience to law. Hartshorne’s indeterminism, as we have seen, respects the rule of laws of nature but provides a balance between regularity and irregularity. Traditional theology, Hartshorne claims, was as defective from an aesthetic point of view as the traditional philosophy of nature. Classical theologians stressed divine simplicity and unity to the exclusion of complexity and variety. In an article titled “The Aesthetic Dimensions of Religious Experience” (1992) Hartshorne says, “The beauty of the world is in its partly unprogrammed spontaneities.” Hartshorne’s neoclassical theism affirms a world of multiple creative agents in interaction with each other and with God (see “Charles Hartshorne: Dipolar Theism”). In Hartshorne’s view, God is affected by the creatures and, consequently, the divine experience is a complex reality, full of all of the serendipity and tragedy that interactions with others routinely bring. If Hartshorne is correct, there is an ever changing beauty of the world as a whole that is fully appreciated only by deity and to contemplate this divine experience is to have something akin to what classical theologians called the beatific vision (see the discussion of Hartshorne’s aesthetic argument in “Charles Hartshorne: Theistic and Anti-theistic Arguments”).

4. Conclusion: Hartshorne’s Legacy

At an early age, after reading Emerson, Hartshorne says in his introduction to The Logic of Perfection that he resolved “to trust reason to the end.” He left ample evidence that he was true to this purpose. He was, however, sensitive to the many ways in which philosophy is a frail and fallible enterprise. Communication must take place across centuries and across cultural and linguistic boundaries. There is the snobbery and inertia of traditions and what Hartshorne called “cultural lag” in the recognition of genuine insights (“Analysis and Cultural Lag in Philosophy,” 1973). There is the tendency to forget, ignore, or marginalize objections to one’s views; Hartshorne also considered it mistaken to suppose that meeting objections is sufficient for securing the rationality of one’s ideas, or as he wrote in his correspondence with Edgar Sheffield Brightman, to merely defend one’s own “castle of ideas.” As Carnap said, it is one thing to ask what your metaphysical position commits you to, but it is something else again to ask what commits you to your metaphysical position. Despite their knowledge of formal logic, philosophers are also susceptible to the fallacy of affirming the consequent, looking only for confirmation of their views or for arguments favorable to them. There is, finally, the failure to exhaust the logically possible alternatives in considering the solutions for particular philosophical problems. Hartshorne discussed all of these obstacles, and more, to making progress in philosophy, and he took measures to remedy them in his own attempt to trust reason.

Hartshorne distinguished, with Edith Wharton, between those who light new candles and those who are mirrors reflecting the candles that are lit by others. At the close of his autobiography, he remarked that Whitehead and Peirce had done both, and he dared to hope that he had done both. Hartshorne’s own “candle” has perhaps often been missed because he expended a lot of energy reflecting the lights of Whitehead and Peirce. Hartshorne, however, was neither Whiteheadian nor Peircean. This is true not only of his range of interests and expertise—he contributed to the psychology of sensation and to the study of bird song; it is also true of his systematic presentation, development, and defense of the project of metaphysics, as well as of his own distinctive metaphysical system. He lacked for neither ideas nor for arguments to support those ideas. His neoclassical metaphysics is arguably one of the great intellectual achievements of the twentieth century.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources: Books (In Order of Appearance)

  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1937. Beyond Humanism: Essays in the Philosophy of Nature. Chicago: Willett, Clark & Company. Republished in 1975 by Peter Smith.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1953. Reality as Social Process: Studies in Metaphysics and Religion. Boston: Beacon Press.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1962. The Logic of Perfection and Other Essays in Neoclassical Metaphysics. La Salle, Illinois: Open Court.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1970. Creative Synthesis and Philosophic Method. La Salle, Illinois: Open Court.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1972. Whitehead’s Philosophy: Selected Essays, 1935-1970. Lincoln, Nebraska: University of Nebraska Press.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1976. Aquinas to Whitehead: Seven Centuries of Metaphysics of Religion. Milwaukee, Wisconsin: Marquette University Publications.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1983. Insights and Oversights of Great Thinkers: An Evaluation of Western Philosophy. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1984. Creativity in American Philosophy. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1987. Wisdom as Moderation: A Philosophy of the Middle Way. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1997. The Zero Fallacy and Other Essays in Neoclassical Philosophy, edited by Mohammad Valady. Peru, Illinois: Open Court Publishing Company.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 2011. Creative Experiencing: A Philosophy of Freedom, edited by Donald W. Viney and Jincheol O. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Auxier, Randall E. and Mark Y. A. Davies, editors. 2001. Hartshorne and Brightman on God, Process, and Persons: The Correspondence, 1922-1945. Nashville: Vanderbilt University Press.
  • Viney, Donald W., guest editor. 2001. Process Studies, Special Focus on Charles Hartshorne, 30/2 (Fall-Winter)
  • Viney, Donald W., editor. 2001. Charles Hartshorne’s Letters to a Young Philosopher: 1979-1995. Logos-Sophia, the Journal of the Pittsburg State University Philosophical Society, volume 11. Pittsburg, Kansas.
  • Viney, Donald W., guest editor. 2011. Process Studies, Special Focus Section: Charles Hartshorne, 40/1 (Spring/Summer): 91–161.
  • Vetter, Herbert F., editor. 2007. Hartshorne, A New World View: Essays by Charles Hartshorne. Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard Square Library.

b. Primary Sources: Hartshorne’s Response to his Critics

  • “Interrogations of Charles Hartshorne,” conducted by William Alston. 1964. Philosophical Interrogations, edited by Sydney and Beatrice Rome. New York: Holt, Rinehart and Winston: 319–354.
  • Cobb, John B. Jr. and Franklin L Gamwell, editors. 1984. Existence and Actuality: Conversations with Charles Hartshorne. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Hahn, Lewis Edwin, editor. 1991. The Philosophy of Charles Hartshorne, The Library of Living Philosophers Volume XX. La Salle, Illinois: Open Court.
  • Kane, Robert and Stephen H. Phillips, editors. 1989. Hartshorne, Process Philosophy and Theology. Albany State University of New York Press.
  • Sia, Santiago, editor. 1990. Charles Hartshorne’s Concept of God: Philosophical and Theological Responses. Dordrecht, the Netherlands: Kluwer Academic Publishers.

c. Primary Sources: Selected Articles

  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1932. “Contingency and the New Era in Metaphysics, I.” Journal of Philosophy 29/16. 4 August: 421–431.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1932. “Contingency and the New Era in Metaphysics, II.” Journal of Philosophy 29/17. 18 August: 457–469.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1934. “The New Metaphysics and Current Problems, I.” New Frontier 1/1: 24–31; “The New Metaphysics and current Problems, II.” New Frontier 1/5: 8–14.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1935. “Metaphysics for Positivists.” Philosophy of Science 2/3. July: 287-303.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1945. Entry for “time”, pp. 787-88 in An Encyclopedia of Religion, ed. Vergilius Ferm. New York: Philosophical Library.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1964. “Thinking About Thinking Machines,” Texas Quarterly 7/1. Spring: 131–140.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1970. “The Development of My Philosophy” in John E. Smith (ed.) Contemporary American Philosophy: Second Series, London: Allen & Unwin: 211–28.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1973. “Analysis and Cultural Lag in Philosophy.” Southern Journal of Philosophy 11/2-3: 105–112.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1977. “Bell’s Theorem and Stapp’s Revised View of Space-Time.” Process Studies 7/3 (Fall): 183–191.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1978. “A Philosophy of Death.” Philosophical Aspects of Thanatology, volume 2, edited by Florence M. Hetzler and A. H. Kutscher. New York: MSS Information Corporation: 81–89.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1980. “Mysticism and Rationatistic Metaphysics.” Understanding Mysticism, edited by Richard Woods. Garden City, New York: Image: 415–421.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1981. “Concerning Abortion: An Attempt at a Rational View.” The Christian Century 98/2. 21 January: 42–45.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1982. “Science as the Search for the Hidden Beauty of the World.” The Aesthetic Dimension of Science 1980 Nobel Conference, Number 16, ed. Deane W. Curtin. New York: Philosophical Library, 1982): 85–106.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1987. “Mind and Body: A Special Case of Mind and Mind.” A Process Theory of Medicine: Interdisciplinary Essays, edited by Marcus Ford. Lewiston, New York: Edwin Mellen Press: 77–88.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1987. “A Metaphysics of Universal Freedom.” Faith and Creativity, Essays in Honor of Eugene H. Peters, edited by George Nordgulen and George W. Shields. St. Louis, Missouri: CBP Press: 27–40.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1988. “Some Principles of Procedure in Metaphysics.” The Nature of Metaphysical Knowledge, edited by G. F. McLean and Hugo Meynell. Lanham, New York: University Press of America: 69–75.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1988. “Sankara, Nagarjuna, and Fa Tsang, with Some Western Analogues.” Interpreting Across Boundaries: New Essays in Comparative Philosophy, edited by G. J. Larson and Eliot Deutsch. Princeton University Press: 98–115.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1989. “Von Wright and Hume’s Axiom.” The Philosophy of Georg Henrik von Wright, edited by Paul Arthur Schilpp and Lewis Edwin Hahn. La Salle, Illinois: Open Court: 59–76.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1990. “Hegel, Logic, and Metaphysics,” CLIO 19/4: 345–352.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1991. “An Open Letter to Carl Sagan.” The Journal of Speculative Philosophy 5/4: 227–232.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1992. “The Aesthetic Dimensions of Religious Experience.” Logic, God and Metaphysics, ed. J. F. Harris. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers: 9–18.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1993. “Can Philosophers Cooperate Intellectually: Metaphysics as Applied Mathematics.” The Midwest Quarterly 35/1. Autumn: 8–20.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1994. “Three Important Scientists on Mind, Matter, and the Metaphysics of Religion.” The Journal of Speculative Philosophy, 8/3: 211–227.

d. Secondary Sources

  • Chancey, Anita. 1999. “Rationality, Contributionism, and the Value of Love: Hartshorne on Abortion.” Process Studies 28/1-2. Spring-Summer: 85–97.
  • Dombrowski, Daniel A. 1988. Hartshorne and the Metaphysics of Animal Rights. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Dombrowski, Daniel A. 2004. Divine Beauty: The Aesthetics of Charles Hartshorne. Nashville, Tennessee: Vanderbilt University Press.
  • Easterbrook, Gregg. 1998. “A Hundred Years of Thinking About God, A Philosopher Soon to be Rediscovered,” U.S. News & World Report. February 23: 61, 65.
  • Fitzgerald, Paul. 1972. “Relativity Physics and the God of Process Philosophy.” Process Studies 2/4. Winter: 251–276.
  • Ford, Lewis S. 1968. “Is Process Theism Compatible with Relativity Theory?” Journal of Religion 48/2. April: 124–135.
  • Ford, Lewis S., editor. 1973. Two Process Philosophers: Hartshorne’s Encounter with Whitehead. Tallahassee, Florida: American Academy of Religion.
  • Griffin, David Ray, John B. Cobb Jr., Marcus P. Ford, Pete A. Y. Gunter, and Peter Ochs. 1993. Founders of Constructive Postmodern Philosophy: Peirce, James, Bergson, Whitehead, and Hartshorne. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Jesse, Jennifer G. and J. Wesley Robbins, editors. 2001. American Journal of Theology & Philosophy, memorial issue in tribute to Charles Hartshorne, 22/2. May.
  • Minor, William S., editor. 1969. Charles Hartshorne and Henry Nelson Wieman. Lanham, MD: University Press of America.
  • Myers, William, guest editor. 1998. The Personalist Forum, Special Issue on Charles Hartshorne, 14/2. Fall.
  • Peters, Eugene H. 1970. Hartshorne and Neoclassical Metaphysics. Lincoln: University of Nebraska Press.
  • Peters, Eugene H. 1976. “Philosophic Insights of Charles Hartshorne,” Southwestern Journal of Philosophy, VII, 1/17: 157–170.
  • Ramal, Randy, editor. 2010. Metaphysics, Analysis, and the Grammar of God: Process and Analytic Voices in Dialogue .Tübingen, Germany: Mohr Siebeck.
  • Reck, Andrew J. 1961. “The Philosophy of Charles Hartshorne,” Tulane Studies in Philosophy X. May: 89–108.
  • Reese, William L. and Eugene Freeman, editors. 1964. Process and Divinity: Philosophical Essays Presented to Charles Hartshorne: The Hartshorne Festchrift. La Salle, Illinois: Open Court Publishing Company.
  • Shields, George W. 1992. “Infinitesimals and Hartshorne’s Set-Theoretic Platonism” The Modern Schoolman 49/2. January.
  • Shields, George W. 2004. “Process and Universals” in After Whitehead: Rescher on Process Metaphysics, ed. by M. Weber. Frankfurt: Ontos Verlag.
  • Shields, George W. 2008. “‘Beyond Enlightened Self-Interest’ Revisited: Process Philosophy and the Biology of Altruism” in Researching with Whitehead: Essays in Honor of John B. Cobb, Jr., ed. by F. Riffert and Hans-Joachim Sander. Muenchen: Verlag Karl Alber.
  • Shields, George W. 2008. “MWI Quantum Theory: Some Logical and Philosophical Issues,” paper presented at the Center for Philosophy and Natural Sciences, California State University-Sacramento.
  • Shields, George W. 2009. “Quo Vadis?: On Current Prospects for Process Philosophy and Theology,” The American Journal of Theology & Philosophy, 30/2. May.
  • Shields, George W. 2010. “Eternal Objects, Middle Knowledge, and Hartshorne: A Response to Malone-France,” Process Studies, 39/1. Spring/Summer: 149–165.
  • Shields, George W. 2010. “Panexperientialism, Quantum Theory, and Neuroplasticity” in Process Approaches to Consciousness, eds. Michel Weber and A. Weekes. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Shields, George W., editor. 2003. Process and Analysis: Whitehead, Hartshorne, and the Analytic Tradition. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Simoni-Wastila, Henry. 1999. “Is Divine Relativity Possible? Charles Hartshorne on God’s Sympathy with the World.” Process Studies 28/1-2. Spring-Summer: 98–116.
  • Sprigge, T. L. S. 2006. The God of Metaphysics. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Suchocki, Marjorie Hewitt and John B. Cobb, Jr. editors. 1992. Process Studies, Special Issue on the Philosophy of Charles Hartshorne, 21/2. Summer.
  • Viney, Donald Wayne. 2008. “Charles Hartshorne (1897-2000),” Handbook of Whiteheadian Process Thought, Volume 2, edited by Michel Weber and Will Desmond. Frankfurt / Paris / Lancaster: Ontos Verlag: 589–596.
  • Viney, Donald Wayne and Rebecca Viney. 1993. “For the Beauty of the Earth: A Hartshornean Ecological Aesthetic.” Proceedings of the Institute for Liberal Studies: Science, Technology & Religious Ideas, volume 4. Frankfort: Kentucky State University: 38–44.
  • Whitehead, Alfred North. 1978 [1929]. Process and Reality: An Essay in Cosmology, corrected edition, edited by David Ray Griffin and Donald W. Sherburne. New York: Free Press.
  • Wilcox, John T. 1961. “A Question from Physics for Certain Theists.” Journal of Religion 40/4. October: 293–300.

e. Bibliography

“Primary Bibliography of Philosophical Works of Charles Hartshorne” (compiled by Dorothy Hartshorne; corrected, revised, and updated by Donald Wayne Viney and Randy Ramal) in Herbert F. Vetter, editor, Hartshorne: A New World View: Essays by Charles Hartshorne. Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard Square Library, 2007: 129–160. Also published in Santiago Sia, Religion, Reason and God. Frankfurt am Main: Peter Lang, 2004: 195–223.

Author Information

Donald Wayne Viney
Pittsburg State University
U. S. A.


George W. Shields
Kentucky State University
U. S. A.