The philosophical study of humor has been focused on the development of a satisfactory definition of humor, which until recently has been treated as roughly co-extensive with laughter. The main task is to develop an adequate theory of just what humor is.

According to the standard analysis, humor theories can be classified into three neatly identifiable groups:incongruity, superiority, and relief theories. Incongruity theory is the leading approach and includes historical figures such as Immanuel Kant, Søren Kierkegaard, and perhaps has its origins in comments made by Aristotle in the Rhetoric. Primarily focusing on the object of humor, this school sees humor as a response to an incongruity, a term broadly used to include ambiguity, logical impossibility, irrelevance, and inappropriateness. The paradigmatic Superiority theorist is Thomas Hobbes, who said that humor arises from a “sudden glory” felt when we recognize our supremacy over others. Plato and Aristotle are generally considered superiority theorists, who emphasize the aggressive feelings that fuel humor. The third group, Relief theory, is typically associated with Sigmund Freud and Herbert Spencer, who saw humor as fundamentally a way to release or save energy generated by repression. In addition, this article will explore a fourth group of theories of humor: play theory. Play theorists are not so much listing necessary conditions for something’s counting as humor, as they are asking us to look at humor as an extension of animal play.

While the task of defining humor is a seemingly simple one, it has proven quite difficult. Each theory attempts to provide a characterization of what is at least at the core of humor. However, these theories are not necessarily competing; they may be seen as simply focusing on different aspects of humor, treating certain aspects as more fundamental than others.

Table of Contents

  1. What Is Humor?
    1. Humor, Laughter, and the Holy Grail
    2. Problems Classifying Theorists
  2. Theories of Humor
    1. Superiority Theory
    2. Relief Theory
    3. Incongruity Theory
    4. Play Theory
    5. Summary of Humor Theories
  3. Reference and Further Reading

1. What is Humor?

Almost every major figure in the history of philosophy has proposed a theory, but after 2500 years of discussion there has been little consensus about what constitutes humor. Despite the number of thinkers who have participated in the debate, the topic of humor is currently understudied in the discipline of philosophy. There are only a few philosophers currently focused on humor-related research, which is most likely due to two factors: the problems in the field have proved incredibly difficult, inviting repeated failures, and the subject is erroneously dismissed as an insignificant concern. Nevertheless, scope and significance of the study of humor is reflected in the interdisciplinary nature of the filed, which draws insights from philosophy, psychology, sociology, anthropology, film, and literature. It is rare to find a philosophical topic that bares such direct relevance to our daily lives, our social interactions, and our nature as humans.

a. Humor, Laughter, Comedy, and the Holy Grail

The majority of the work on humor has been occupied with the following foundational question: What is humor? The word “humor” itself is of relatively recent origin. According to the Oxford English Dictionary, it arose during the 17th century out of psycho-physiological scientific speculation on the effects of various humors that might affect a person’s temperament. Much of the earlier humor research is riddled with equivocations between humor and laughter, and the problem continues into recent discussions. John Dewey states one reason to make the distinction: “The laugh is by no means to be viewed from the standpoint of humor; its connection with humor is only secondary. It marks the ending [. . .] of a period of suspense, or expectation, all ending which is sharp and secondary” (John Dewey, 558). We laugh for a variety of reasons—hearing a funny joke, inhaling laughing gas, being tickled—not all of which result from what we think of as humor. Attempting to offer a general theory of laughter and humor, John Morreall (manuscript) makes a finer distinction: laughter results from a pleasant psychological shift, whereas, humor arises from a pleasant cognitive shift. Noting the predominance of non-humorous laughter, researcher Robert Provine (2000) argues that laughter is most often found in non-humorous social interactions, deployed as some sort of tension relief mechanism. If humor is not a necessary condition of laughter, then we might ask if it is sufficient. Often humor will produce laughter, but sometimes it results in only a smile. Obviously, these relatively distinct phenomena are intimately connected in some manner, but to understand the relationship we need clearer notions of both laugher and humor.

Laughter is a fairly well described physiological process that results in a limited range of characteristic vocal patterns that are only physiologically possible, as Provine suggests, for bi-pedal creatures with breath control. If we describe humorous laughter as laughter in response to humor, then we must answer the question, What is humor? This topic will be explored in the next few sections, but for starters, we can say that humor or amusement is widely regarded as a response to a certain kind of stimulus. The comic, on the other hand, is best described as a professionally produced source of humor, a generic element of various artforms. In distinguishing between humorous and non-humorous laughter we presuppose a working definition of humor, based partly on the character of our response and partly on the properties of humorous objects. This is not necessarily to beg the question about what is humor, but to enter into the real world process of correctively developing a definition. The first goal of a humor theory is to look for the basis of our practical ability to identify humor.

Most definitions of humor are essentialist in that they try to list the necessary and sufficient conditions something must meet in order to be counted as humor. Some theories isolate a common element supposedly found in all humor, but hold back from making claims about the sufficient conditions. Many theorists seem to confuse offering the necessary conditions for a response to count as humor with explaining why we find one thing funny rather than another. This second question, what would be sufficient for an object to be found funny, is the Holy Grail of humor studies, and must be kept distinct from the goals of a definition of the humor response. The Holy Grail is often confused with a question regarding the sufficient conditions for our response to count as humorous amusement, but a crucial distinction needs to be made: identifying the conditions of a response is different from the isolating the features something must possess in order to provoke such a response. The first task is much different from suggesting what features are sufficient to provoke a response of humorous amusement. What amounts to a humor response is different from what makes something humorous. The noun (humor) and adjectival (humorous) senses of the term are difficult to keep distinct due to the imprecision of our language in this area. Much of the dissatisfaction with traditional humor theories can be traced back to an equivocation between these two senses of the term.

b. Problems Classifying Theorists

The standard analysis, developed by D. H. Monro, that classifies humor theories into superiority, incongruity, and relief theories sets up a false expectation of genuine competition between the views. Rarely do any of the historical theorists in any of these schools state their theories as listing necessary of sufficient conditions for something to count as humor, much less put their views in competition with others. A further problem concerns just what the something is that might be called humor. Some theories address the object of humor, whereas others are concerned primarily with the characteristics of the response, and other theories discuss both.

The popular reduction of humor theories into three groups—Incongruity, Relief, and Superiority theories—is an over simplification. Several scholars have identified over 100 types of humor theories, and Patricia Keith-Spiegel’s classification of humor theories into 8 major types (biological, superiority, incongruity, surprise, ambivalence, release, configuration, and psychoanalytic theories) has been fairly influential. Jim Lyttle suggests that, based on the question they are primarily addressing humor, theories can be classified into 3 different groups. He argues that, depending on their focus, humor theories can be grouped under these categories: functional, stimuli, and response theories. (1) Functional theories of humor ask what purpose humor has in human life. (2) Stimuli theories ask what makes a particular thing funny. (3)Response theorists ask why we find things funny. A better way to phrase this concern is to say that response theorists ask what is particular about feelings of humor.

A little probing shows that Lyttle’s grouping is strained, since many of the humor theories address more than one of these questions, and an answer to one often involves an answer to the other questions. For instance, though focused on the function of humor, relief theories often have something to say about all three questions: humor serves as a tension release mechanism, the content often concerns the subject of repressed desires, and finding these funny involves a feeling of relief.

Regardless of the classificatory scheme, when analyzing the tradition of humor theories we need to consider how each of the traditionally defined schools answers the major questions that occupy the bulk of the discussion. The primary questions of humor theory include:

1. Humor question: What is humor?

(An answer to this question often entails answers to questions regarding the object and the response. This is the central question of any humor theory.)

2. Object Feature Questions:

  1. Are there any features frequently found in what is found funny?
  2. Are there any features necessary for something to have in order to be found funny?
  3. Are there any features that by themselves or considered jointly are sufficient for something to be found funny? (Answering this question affirmatively would amount to discovering the holy grail of humor theory.)

3. Response Question: Is there anything psychologically or cognitively distinctive or characteristic about finding something funny?

4. Laughter Question: How is humor related to laughter?

Given this list, we may ask what would a theory of humor amount to? To count as a humor theory and not just an approach to humor, a theory must attempt an answer to Question 1—What is humor? Like the relief theories, most humor theorists do not attempt to answer this question head on, but discuss some important or necessary characteristics of humor. Since the various theories of humor are addressing different sets of questions within this cluster as well as related question in the general study of humor, it is often difficult to put them in competition with each other. Accepting this limitation, we can proceed to explore a few of the major humor theories listed in the widely influential standard analysis.

2. Theories of Humor

a. Superiority Theory

We can give two forms to the claims of the superiority theory of humor: (1) the strong claim holds that all humor involves a feeling of superiority, and (2) the weak claim suggests that feelings of superiority are frequently found in many cases of humor. It is not clear that many superiority theorists would hold to the strong claim if pressed, but we will evaluate as a necessary condition nonetheless.

Neither Plato nor Aristotle makes clear pronouncements about the essence of humor, though their comments are preoccupied with the role of feelings of superiority in our finding something funny. In the “Philebus,” Plato tries to expose the “mixture of pleasure and pain that lies in the malice of amusement.” He argues that ignorance is a misfortune that when found in the weak is considered ridiculous. In comedy, we take malicious pleasure from the ridiculous, mixing pleasure with a pain of the soul. Some of Aristotle’s brief comments in the Poetics corroborate Plato’s view of the pleasure had from comedy. Tragedy deals with subjects who are average or better than average; however, in comedy we look down upon the characters, since it presents subjects of lesser virtue than, or “who are inferior to,” the audience. The “ludicrous,” according to Aristotle, is “that is a failing or a piece of ugliness which causes no pain of destruction” (Poetics, sections 3 and 7). Going beyond the subject of comedy, in the Rhetoric (II, 12) Aristotle defines wit as “educated insolence,” and in the Nicomachean Ethics (IV, 8) he describes jokes as “a kind of abuse” which should ideally be told without producing pain. Rather than clearly offering a superiority theory of humor, Plato and Aristotle focus on this common comic feature, bringing it to our attention for ethical considerations.

Thomas Hobbes developed the most well known version of the Superiority theory. Giving emphatic expression to the idea, Hobbes says “that the passion of laughter is nothing else but sudden glory arising from some sudden conception of some eminency in ourselves, by comparison with the infirmity of others, or with our own formerly” (Human Nature, ch. 8). Motivated by the literary conceit of the laugh of triumph, Hobbes’s expression the superiority theory looks like more of a theory of laughter than a theory of humor. Charles Baudelaire (1956) offers an interesting variation on Hobbes’ superiority theory, mixing it with mortal inferiority. He argues that that “laughter is satanic”—an expression of dominance over animals and a frustrated complaint against our being merely mortal.

Critically reversing the superiority theory, Robert Solomon (2002) offers an inferiority theory of humor. He thinks that self-recognition in the silly antics and self-deprecating behavior of the Three Stooges is characteristic of a source of humor based in inferiority or modesty. Rather than comparing our current with our former inferior selves, Solomon sees the ability to not take yourself seriously, or to see yourself as less than ideal, as a source of virtuous modesty and compassion. Solomon’s analysis of the Three Stooges is not a full-blown theory of humor, in that it does not make any pronouncements about the necessary or sufficient conditions of humor; however, it is a theory of humor in the sense that it suggests a possible source of humor or what humor can be and how it might function.

Solomon’s inferiority theory of humor raises a central objection against the Superiority theory, namely, that a feeling of superiority is not a necessary condition of humor. Morreall offers several examples, such as finding a bowling ball in his refrigerator, that could be found funny, but do not clearly involve superiority. If feelings of superiority are not necessary for humor, are they sufficient? Undoubtedly, this is not the case. As an 18th century critic of Hobbes, Francis Hutcheson, points out, we can feel superior to lots of things, dogs, cats, trees, etc, without being amused: “some ingenuity in dogs and monkeys, which comes near to some of our own arts, very often makes us merry; whereas their duller actions, in which the are much below us, are no matter of jest at all” (p. 29). However, if we evaluate the weaker version of the superiority theory—that humor is often fueled by feelings of superiority—then we have a fairly well supported empirical claim, easily confirmable by first hand observation.

b. Relief Theory

Relief theories attempt to describe humor along the lines of a tension-release model. Rather than defining humor, they discuss the essential structures and psychological processes that produce laughter. The two most prominent relief theorists are Herbert Spencer and Sigmund Freud. We can consider two version of the relief theory: (1) the strong version holds that all laughter results from a release of excessive energy; (2) the weak version claims that it is often the case that humorous laughter involves a release of tension or energy. Freud develops a more specific description of the energy transfer mechanism, but the process he describes is not essential to the basic claims of the relief theory of humor.

In “The Physiology of Laughter” (1860), Spencer develops a theory of laughter that is intimately related to his “hydraulic” theory of nervous energy, whereby excitement and mental agitation produces energy that “must expend itself in some way or another.” He argues that “nervous excitation always tends to beget muscular motion.” As a form of physical movement, laughter can serve as the expressive route of various forms of nervous energy. Spencer did not see his theory as a competitor to the incongruity theory of humor; rather, he tried to explain why it is that a certain mental agitation arising from a “descending incongruity” results in this characteristically purposeless physical movement. Spencer never satisfactorily answers this specific question, but he presents the basic idea that laughter serves to release pent up energy.

One criticism of Spencer’s theory of energy relief is that it does not seem to describe most cases of humor that occur quickly. Many instances of jokes, witticisms, and cartoons do not seem to involve a build up of energy that is then released. Perhaps Spencer thinks that the best explanation for laughter, an otherwise purposeless expenditure of energy, must be that it relieves energy produced from humor. However, since most of our experiences of humor do not seem to involve an energy build up, and humor does not seem forthcoming when we are generally agitated, a better explanation might be that laughter is not as purposeless as it seems or that all expenditures of energy, purposeful or not, need involve a build up.

Spencer might reply that everyone is continuously building up energy simply through the process of managing everyday stress. As such, most people have excess energy, a form of energy potential, waiting to be released by humor. For example, one often hears it said that humor allows one to “blow off steam” after a stressful day at work. The problem with this line of argument is that those who are most “stressed out” seem the least receptive to humor. Not only do attempts at humor frequently fall flat on the hurried, the amusement that results is typically minimal. Perhaps Spencer could argue that at a certain threshold the pent up energy jams the gates such that humor is unable to provide a release. This line of defense might be plausible, but the tension release theory starts to look a bit ad hoc when you have to posit things such as jammed energy release gates and the like.

In Jokes and Their Relation to the Unconscious (1905), Freud develops a more fine grained version of the relief theory of laughter, that amounts to a restatement of Spencer’s theory with the addition of a new process. He describes three different sources of laughter—joking, the comic, and humor—which all involve the saving of some psychic energy that is then discharged through laughter. In joking, the energy that would have been used to repress sexual and hostile feelings is saved and can be released in laughter. In the comic, cognitive energy to be used to solve an intellectual challenge is left over and can be released. The humorous involves a saving of emotional energy, since what might have been an emotion provoking situation turns out to be something we should treat non-seriously. The energy building up for the serious emotional reaction can then be released.

The details of Freud’s discussions of the process of energy saving, are widely regarded as problematic. His notion of energy saving is unclear, since it is not clear what sense it makes to say that energy which is never called upon is saved, rather than saying that no energy was expended. Take his theory of jokes, where the energy that otherwise would have been used to repress a desire is saved by joking which allows for aggression to be released. John Morreall and Noel Carroll make a similar criticism of this theory of energy management. We may have an idea of what it is like to express pent up energy, but we have no notion of what it would be to release energy that is used to repress a desire. Beyond the claim of queerness, this theory of joking does not result in the expected empirical observations. On Freud’s explanation, the most inhibited and repressed people would seem to enjoy joking the most, though the opposite is the case.

Relief theories of laughter do not furnish us a way to distinguish humorous from non-humorous laughter. Freud’s saved energy is perceptually indistinguishable with other forms of energy. As we saw with Spencer, Relief theories must be saddled to another theory of humor. Freud’s attempt to explain why we laugh is also an effort to explain why we find certain tendentious jokes especially funny, though it is not clear what he is getting at in his account of the saving of energy. He commits the fundamental mistake of relief theorists—they erroneously assume that since mental energy often finds release in physical movement, any physical movement must be explainable by an excess of nervous energy.

c. Incongruity Theory

The incongruity theory is the reigning theory of humor, since it seems to account for most cases of perceived funniness, which is partly because “incongruity” is something of an umbrella term. Most developments of the incongruity theory only try to list a necessary condition for humor—the perception of an incongruity—and they stop short of offering the sufficient conditions.

In the Rhetoric (III, 2), Aristotle presents the earliest glimmer of an incongruity theory of humor, finding that the best way to get an audience to laugh is to setup an expectation and deliver something “that gives a twist.” After discussing the power of metaphors to produce a surprise in the hearer, Aristotle says that “[t]he effect is produced even by jokes depending upon changes of the letters of a word; this too is a surprise. You find this in verse as well as in prose. The word which comes is not what the hearer imagined.” These remarks sound like a surprise theory of humor, similar to that later offered by René Descartes, but Aristotle continues to explain how the surprise must somehow “fit the facts,” or as we might put it today, the incongruity must be capable of a resolution.

In the Critique of Judgment, Immanuel Kant gives a clearer statement of the role of incongruity in humor: “In everything that is to excite a lively laugh there must be something absurd (in which the understanding, therefore, can find no satisfaction). Laughter is an affection arising from the sudden transformation of a strained expectation into nothing” (I, I, 54).

Arthur Schopenhauer offers a more specific version of the incongruity theory, arguing that humor arising from a failure of a concept to account for an object of thought. When the particular outstrips the general, we are faced with an incongruity. Schopenhauer also emphasizes the element of surprise, saying that “the greater and more unexpected [. . .] this incongruity is, the more violent will be his laughter” (1818, I, Sec. 13).

As stated by Kant and Schopenhauer, the incongruity theory of humor specifies a necessary condition of the object of humor. Focusing on the humorous object, leaves something out of the analysis of humor, since there are many kinds of things that are incongruous which do not produce amusement. A more robust statement of the incongruity theory would need to include the pleasurable response one has to humorous objects. John Morreall attempts to find sufficient conditions for identifying humor by focusing on our response. He defines humorous amusement as taking pleasure in a cognitive shift. The incongruity theory can be stated as a response focused theory, claiming that humor is a certain kind of reaction had to perceived incongruity.

Henri Bergson’s essay “Laughter” (1980) is perhaps the one of the most influential and sophisticated theories of humor. Bergson’s theory of humor is not easily classifiable, since it has elements of superiority and incongruity theories. In a famous phrase, Bergson argues that the source of humor is the “mechanical encrusted upon the living” (p. 84) According to Bergson “the comic does not exist outside of what is strictly human.” He thinks that humor involve an incongruous relationship between human intelligence and habitual or mechanical behaviors. As such, humor serves as a social corrective, helping people recognize behaviors that are inhospitable to human flourishing. A large source of the comic is in recognizing our superiority over the subhuman. Anything that threatens to reduce a person to an object—either animal or mechanical—is prime material for humor. No doubt, Bergson’s theory accounts for much of physical comedy and bodily humor, but he seems to over-estimate the necessity of mechanical encrustation. It is difficult to see how his theory can accommodate most jokes and sources of humor coming from wit.

Three major criticisms of the incongruity theory are that it is too broad to be very meaningful, it is insufficiently explanatory in that it does not distinguish between non-humorous incongruity and basic incongruity, and that revised versions still fail to explain why some things, rather than others, are funny. We have already addressed the third criticism: it confuses the object of humor with the response. What is at issue is the definition of humor, or how to identify humor, not how to create a humor-generating algorithm. The incongruity theorist has a response to this criticism as well, since they can claim that humor is pleasure in incongruity.

d. Play Theories

Describing play theories of humor as an independent school or approach might overstate their relative importance, although they do serve as a good representative of theories focused on the functional question. By looking at the contextual characteristic, play theories try to classify humor as a species of play. In this general categorization effort, the play theorists are not so much listing necessary conditions, as they are asking us to look at humor as an extension of animal play. They try to call our attention to the structural similarities between play contexts and humorous context, to suggest that what might be true of play, might be true of humor as well.

Play theorists often take an ethological approach to studying humor, tracing it back through evolutionary development. They look at laughter triggers like tickling, that are found in other species, to suggest that in humor ontogeny recapitulates phylogeny. In The Enjoyment of Laughter (1936), Max Eastman develops a play theory of humor with an adaptive story. He thinks we can find analogies of humor in the behavior of animals, especially in the proto-laughter of chimps to tickling. He goes so far as to argue that the wagging tail of a happy dog is a form of humorous laughter, since Eastman wants to broaden the definition of laughter to encompass other rhythmic responses to pleasure. Speaking more specifically of humor, he argues that “we come into the world endowed with an instinctive tendency to laugh and have this feeling in response to pains presented playfully” (p. 45). On Eastman’s account, what is central to humor and play is that both require taking a disinterested attitude towards what might otherwise be seen as serious.

Eastman considers humor to be a form of play, because humor involves a disinterested stance, certain kinds of humor involve mock aggression and insults, and because some forms of play activities result in humorous amusement. Since Eastman defines play as the adoption of this disinterested attitude, humor would count as a form of play on his definition, but this seems both too restrictive and too vague to serve as an adequate definition of play. In Homo Ludens (1938), Johan Huizinga criticizes identifying play with laughter or the comic. Though both seem to involve “the opposite of seriousness,” there are crucial asymmetries. Laughter, he argues, is particular to humans, whereas, play is found in other mammals and birds. Also, if we allow for certain types of competitive play, then a non-serious attitude is not essential to play, as it seems to be for humor. Identifying the comic, or humor, with play is problematic, since “in itself play is not comical for either for the player or public” (1938, p. 6). Huizinga questions whether humor and play share any necessary conditions, a requirement of the relationship if humor is a subtype of play. This will, of course, depend on how we describe humor and play, two equally elusive notions.

Play theorists are primarily concerned with the problem of determining the function of humor in order to explain how it might have adaptive value, a task taken up by other biological theories of humor. They argue that similarities between play and humor suggest that the adaptive value of play might be similar to that of humor. Other researchers focused on the functional questions have described humor as having value in cognitive development, social skill learning, tension relief, empathy management, immune system benefits, stress relief, and social bonding. Though these questions are primarily addressed by psychologists, sociologist, anthropologists, and medical researchers, their studies rely on and contribute to an evolving notion of just what counts as humor. Though the functional question is foremost in these theories, play theory tries to give humor a genus by offering some differentiating characteristics, essential to humor.

e. Summary of Humor Theories

We discussed four different schools of humor theories and noted how each reveals aspects common, if not necessary, to humor. Presenting these theories as rivals is misleading since, as we have seen, theorists in each classification focus on different problems and may draw upon the answers to different questions from another school. For instance, while focusing on why we find something funny, Spencer offers a functional explanation and relies on the answer incongruity theorists give to the question of what we find funny. Relief theories and Play theories tend to focus on the function humor serves in human life, though the functional question cannot be separated from characterizing amusement, or the humor response. Superiority theorists tend to focus on what feelings are necessary for there to be humor, or why we find some things funny. Incongruity theories have the most to say about the object of humor, though variants identify humor with the way we respond to a perceived incongruity. Though the functional, stimuli, and response questions are not neatly separated, the differing schools tend to assume that one question is more basic than the others.

3. References and Further Reading

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Author Information

Aaron Smuts
University of Wisconsin-Madison
U. s. A.