Individualism in Classical Chinese Thought
“Individualism” is used here to denote inborn and inalienable prerogatives, powers, or values associated with the self and person as found throughout much of the Chinese philosophical tradition. Unlike individualism in modern European and American contexts, Chinese manifestations of “individualism” do not stress an individual’s separation, total independence, and uniqueness from external authorities of power. Rather, individualism in the Chinese tradition emphasizes one’s power from within the context of one’s connection and unity (or harmony) with external authorities of power. So while both the modern Western and Chinese contexts share a belief that individuals are morally valuable and may attain an outstanding status as such, the Western tradition tends to view the individual in an atomized, disconnected manner, whereas the Chinese tradition focuses on the individual as a vitally integrated element within a larger familial, social, political, and cosmic whole. Chinese thinkers frequently address issues related to individual value, empowerment, authority, control, creativity, and self-determination, yet they package these crucial aspects of individualism in ways that are generally different from the way individualism has been packaged in the West.
Since the term is not indigenous to China, there is a general scholarly dispute about the relevance and appropriateness of applying the term “individualism” to Chinese philosophy. The inability of mainstream scholarship and discourse to locate and come to terms with native forms of individualism in China has had important ramifications for scholarship, politics, and international relations as well. For example, the current debate about universal human rights is founded on beliefs that individuals can lay claim to certain prerogatives simply by virtue of their existence as individuals. Some Asian polities have used the argument that Asian traditions are not individualistic in order to claim that human rights discourse is not only not universal in scope, but that it is also incompatible with traditional Asian values.
Table of Contents
- Dispute over “Individualism” in Chinese Philosophy
- The Concept of Autonomy in Chinese Individualism
- The Self as Individual
- Individualism in Classical Confucian Thought
- Moral Autonomy in the Mohist Writings
- Individualism in the Zhuangzi
- Individualism in the Thought of Yang Zhu
- References and Further Reading
Scholars of early Chinese thought such as Chad Hansen, Henry Rosemont, and Michael Nylan have often considered the term “individualism” to be irrelevant or inappropriate for studying Chinese culture and history. Popular perceptions also tend to view Chinese culture as characterized by obligation and duty rather than by individual freedoms. This characterization of Chinese culture as group-oriented rather than individual-oriented helps promote the notion that individualism, especially as it is perceived – as a doctrine that protects individual autonomy against obligations stemming from external, familial or social institutions – is inappropriate for the Chinese context.
Other scholars such as Yu Ying-shih, Donald Munro, Erica Brindley, and Irene Bloom accept the concept of individualism as relevant for the Chinese tradition, at least as a point of discussion. Brindley goes the farthest to contend that by denying individualism in Chinese thought, one effectively ignores the multiple ways in which goals and values for the individual are in fact underscored in the tradition. While Brindley, Yu, and perhaps Bloom readily concede that the term “individualism” stems historically from European and American contexts, they generally agree that this need not limit the term’s usefulness as a tool for understanding concepts relating to the value and powers of the individual in China. For, even in the West, there is no single definition of the term “individual” that has escaped scholarly and public challenge and contestation. Nor does “individualism” always strictly connote one’s uniqueness, separation, and distinction, even in Western usages. Furthermore, the lack of a term or even explicit debate over doctrines of the individual, free will, or autonomy does not mean that Chinese thinkers or even ordinary Chinese people did not imply such things in their writings, or experience them in their lives. Making use of such arguments, scholars of this persuasion therefore assert that one can apply “individualism” to Chinese philosophy to gain rich comparative insights and shed light upon the importance of the integrated individual in Chinese philosophy.
The following analysis of texts and their embedded assumptions and claims serves to draw out possible Chinese forms of individualism that appear to differ considerably from Western forms of possessive individualism, which arose specifically in seventeenth-century English contexts. The latter forms focus on an individual’s possessive claims to uniqueness, and autonomy from surroundings. Chinese forms of individualism, on the contrary, tend to stress an individual’s achievement or fulfillment of some potential from within and in terms of a larger familial, social, and cosmic whole. This concept of individualism does not support a strong sense of autonomy and independence as defined through separation or freedom from others, but rather it reveals the autonomy and independence of the individual as a fully attained and integrated being within a larger web of relationships and authorities.
The notion of autonomy arguably serves as a distinguishing aspect of any form of individualism. The autonomous agent in many Western discursive models is free from certain external influences. This can be seen in the fact that various individualisms of today generally recast the individual as someone with the potential to be separate and different from his environment and conventional norms. They empower individuals by emphasizing their ability to make decisions and judgments independent of mundane influences and norms in the world.
Early Chinese forms of individualism, on the contrary, do not generally focus on the radical autonomy of the individual; but rather on the holistic integration of the individual with forces and authorities in his or her surroundings (family, society, and cosmos). For early Chinese thinkers, there is no such thing as unfettered autonomy or freedom of will. Rather, early Chinese thinkers posit the existence of a relative and relational sort of autonomy; or, a type of autonomy that grants individuals the freedom to make decisions for themselves, and to shape the course of their own lives to the fullest degree that they can—all from within an intricate system of interrelationships. This type of autonomy grants authority to the individual to fulfill his or her potentials as an integrated individual. The goal of such an individual is to achieve authoritativeness as a person while at the same time duly negotiating influences, commands, and responsibilities that stem from his or her larger environment. Therefore, a crucial back-and-forth tug between the self and the various authorities surrounding it is woven into the very fabric of what it means to be a fully attained, authoritative, empowered, and integrated individual.
Free from the radical dichotomy between truth/essence and appearance that is characterized by Descartes, the early Chinese “self” is not encumbered by a gross split between mind and body, or between true nature and experience. Rather, the early Chinese “self” is more akin to an organism, which both consists in and emerges out of complex processes occurring inside and outside of it as it interacts with and relates to his or her environment. In such a way, the concepts of self and person are much more integrated than in certain, extreme dualistic Western traditions, as stand in constant and ever-changing relationship to what occurs both within and without.
To the extent that the self is conceived as physical, embodied, and dynamic, the early Chinese “self” necessarily entails a different definition of “individual.” While there is no clear term in Classical Chinese that might translate consistently into “individual,” this latter term facilitates discussion of those aspects of the self that emphasize its particularity within a whole. We use the term “individual” here to refer to early Chinese notions of self that concern not so much the subjective, psychological sense of “self,” but the qualities of a person that mark him or her as a single, particular entity capable of exerting agency from within a web of relationships. In other words, we refer to the individual not as an atomistic, isolated, and undifferentiated part of a whole, but as a distinct organism that must serve particular functions and fulfill a unique set of relationships in the worlds of which he or she is a part. The individual is thus a unique participant in a larger whole—integral to both, the processes that define the whole, as well as to the change and transformation that stems from itself.
One of the abiding concepts in Chinese philosophy, irrespective of the school of thought, is that of self-cultivation. The Ru, or Confucian lineage, places a premium on the moral cultivation of the individual using a variety of tools and resources, both internal and external. In the Analects of Confucius, the junzi (gentleman, or nobleman) constitutes the most important ideal for the individual, and any person who strives for such an ideal is to do so by a complicated moral regimen of intense involvement with the rites of the Zhou (dynastic house) and its music; moral education through a morally achieved ruler, master or moral exemplar; and training—involving texts and histories as well as personal resources such as will-power, moral desire, inward reflection and thought, and the active appraisal of how one’s own thoughts and actions compare to those of others.
While one may not wish to call anything mentioned in the Analects “individualism,” it is clear that the individual holds the most valuable key insofar as he or she serves as the locus for self-cultivation and, hence, for the transformation of himself or herself to contribute to a moral society and cosmos. The individual forms the basis upon which authoritative, moral meaning and behavior is to be constructed. Insofar as the individual is considered to be the fundamental site of moral transformation, it is an absolutely crucial element of Confucian thought. So, while the philosophy represented by the Analects does not promote individualism as a moral stance that stresses individual autonomy and freedom from social constraints, it does establish the individual as inherently valuable in the process of moral cultivation, with the potential to be authoritative and fully integrated as a junzi figure within a web of intricate social, political, and cosmic forces. Thus, a type of integrated individualism seems to exist even in the most basic of early Chinese Confucian texts.
The figure whose writings provide us with one of the earliest, and perhaps clearest, representations of early Chinese individualism is Mencius. In the literature prior to Mencius, the individual represents a foundational site for moral cultivation, but the source of one’s moral motivation and insight may stem largely from external authorities. Mencius changes this by appealing to the innate moral agencies of the individual through the concept of xing, (human nature). By naturalizing moral motivation through the concept of xing, Mencius reveals what appears to be a new orientation towards human agency: one that sees the individual body as a universal source of cosmic authority and natural patterns.
Mencius defines sources of moral agency and authority by outlining an internal-external dichotomy and emphasizing the internal resources of the individual in moral cultivation. This is best demonstrated in Mencius 2A2 and the entire Chapter Six, Part A of the text, where Mencius debates with an opponent, Gaozi, over the idea that xing is a source of moral agency and insight. Unlike Mencius, Gaozi advocates the total subordination of the human heart-mind, the seat of a person’s controlling mechanism, the will (zhi), to yan, or what might be translated in the passage as “sayings,” or “teachings.” In such a way, Gaozi declares the absolute necessity of study and discipline through tradition, culture, and other external inputs. Mencius counters this by showing the necessity of stilling one’s heart-mind so that it will allow for its natural, innate moral tendencies to guide the body in correct thinking and behavior.
In another famous debate, Gaozi compares moral refinement to cups and saucers, which have been constructed by man through hard work and external imprinting. His view of moral cultivation strongly denies that an individual’s internal xing could have any moral quality or potential. Mencius responds with an analogy of equal force, describing human xing in terms of water. Just as the flow of water naturally tends downward, he claims, so does human xing naturally move toward goodness. Denouncing Gaozi’s views on the external origins of morality, Mencius insists that only when internal resources such as xing are obstructed, violated, and destroyed through external forces, does immoral behavior arise.
Mencius’ claims integrate the moral motivation of xing with life processes associated with the human body. Taking advantage of a linguistic connection between the terms for “life” and “human nature” in classical Chinese, Mencius argues that the moral agency of xing is intrinsic to basic life processes. To him, moral motivation, rooted in human nature, is inextricably tied to the agency that fills our very lives with health and vitality.
In sum, to Mencius, each individual person is his or her own moral agent by virtue of living properly and healthfully as a human being. By locating the seeds of morality in xing, one’s Heaven-endowed agency for human life, Mencius demonstrates that cultivating oneself morally is tantamount to attaining the proper measures for the basic vital functions of human beings. Mencius therefore not only naturalizes moral agency by making it a universally inherent trait in every individual, he also proposes a radical, physiological claim for a type of individualism that connects proper moral cultivation to the natural growth of one’s inherent xing and life forces.
Mencius is important in the history of Chinese individualism because he grounds ultimate moral authority in the inner, innate resources of the individual. What characterizes Mencius’ form of individualism as a stronger form of individualism than that outlined in the Analects is its emphasis on the human body not merely as a medium of authority or primary locus for the attainment of idealized authority (as exemplified through self-cultivation), but as an individualized source of it as well.
It is noteworthy that all Confucians who postdate Mencius seem to understand xing in terms of powerful, innate tendencies of individuals, but some, like Xunzi, fought vigorously to deny that such tendencies were morally positive. While Xunzi may not be called an individualist in the sense that Mencius may, his thought nonetheless supports a strong notion of individual moral autonomy as represented in the Analects.
The early Mohists were famous for their views in social conformity and obedience to political authorities, such as rulers and the Son of Heaven, who abided by the authority of Heaven. There is little that is individualistic about such conformist ideals in a Western sense. However, when one considers that the basis of their views on moral meritocracy and Heaven’s Will are grounded on a fundamental belief in an individual’s rational capacity to know and learn about morality, then the Mohist individual starts to appear much more individualistic than he would at first glance. Indeed, in early Mohist writings, individuals are required to know and choose the morally correct path – that which conforms with Heaven’s Will – on their own. They are thus morally autonomous in two senses: (1) They have the ability to use their rational minds to decipher, come to know, or (in the case of unexceptional commoners and people) at least be tacitly familiar with Heaven’s Will, and (2) They have the ability to choose to conform with what is right.
The early Mohists, who argue explicitly against contemporary beliefs in ming (fate, destiny, derived from Heaven), grant the individual a high degree of control over outcomes in this world. So while the early Mohists do not place extra value or emphasis on the individual or its powers and prerogatives, much less on its self-cultivation, they implicitly grant the individual much agency and control over the course of its life and the type of moral path it wishes to follow. Through their writings one gains insights into the ways in which concepts like conformity may actually go hand-in-hand with beliefs in autonomy and free will.
The Inner Chapters of the Zhuangzi, generally considered by scholars to have been written by Zhuangzi (or Zhuang Zhou), promote a vision of the individual’s unity with the Dao of Heaven. Whether such a vision is individualistic or not is open to debate. On the one hand Zhuangzi does not explicitly attribute the processes of the Dao to powers inherent in an individual’s body or spirit. Therefore, his writings do not technically fall under the definition of “individualism,” used above when discussing Mencius, which locates the primary source of idealized agency within the mundane individual. In fact, Zhuangzi openly advocates the notion of losing one’s self-identity and sense of self or body in order to fully embrace the agency of Dao. This appears to go against any kind of individualism that might place value on the self.
On the other hand, however, Zhuangzi hopes that every individual might achieve a transcendent self, along with a freedom associated with the transcendent individual. Such freedom – spiritual in nature – is not freedom from a higher source of power, but freedom through it. Insofar as Zhuangzi promotes an ideal of spiritual freedom through individual self-cultivation, his thought is characteristic of the holistic individualism described previously. Individuals are not valued in and of themselves but through their connection with a higher authority or power. Realized individuals – the goal in Zhuangzian thought – are not unique, autonomous individuals who stand apart from external powers, but unique manifestations of the workings of a shared Dao.
The so-called “Primitivist,” whose writings in the Outer Chapters of the Zhuangzi seem to represent a coherent voice in that text, presents a form of individualism more akin to that described in the Mencius above. Whereas the Inner Chapters expound on a philosophy whose goals appear compatible with individualistic goals, this strand of the Outer Chapters goes further to locate value inside the individual from the beginning, even in an individual’s mundane state.
The primitivist writings uniquely emphasize the idealized powers of xing in every individual, which ultimately link a person with the Dao. Using a strong language of internal-external, the Primitivist denounces morality as an external overlay and unnecessary pollution of internal xing. By recommending that each individual place all of his or her faith in the natural, innate powers of xing, the Primitivist suggests that one can rid oneself of impulses responsible for the creation of cultural and social norms. This results in the reversion of the individual not just back to his or her most basic nature – one that is not coincidentally in accordance with the Dao of the natural world – but a reversion of society to an era of primitive political structures and human interactions as well.
By rejecting the necessity of social structures, institutions, knowledge, technologies, and cultural practices in favor of a cosmic or natural law and power that is accessible through the individual, human body, the proponents of the primitivist ideology share a basic individualistic point of view. Such a view assumes that ultimate value lies in what humans possess innately and in what is naturally accessible to every individual. For the Primitivist, this internal, innate, and universal human agency to interact ideally in the world derives from xing, which is ultimately a part of the natural cycles of the cosmic Dao.
The Primitivist illuminates polarities between what is external and alien or internal and inalienable to a given object. In such a manner he pits knowledge and culture in society against an individual’s personal vitality and innate powers. This naturalizes what is ideal by locating it in the cosmic capacity and authority of an individual’s xing. In the Laozi, a text upon which the Primitivist writing heavily relies, the ruler serves as the main conduit that enables everyone’s individual access to the Dao. Unlike the Laozi, the Primitivist presents a utopian vision that speaks to every individual’s direct, bodily relationship to cosmic power. This difference points to a noteworthy distinction between theocratic conceptualizations of cosmic authority and power as expressed in the Laozi; and biocratic, individualized ones as expressed in the Primitivist ideal.
One cannot speak of individualistic movements in early China without at least coming to terms with what we know about Yang Zhu, or Yangzi (c. 4th century B.C.E.), and his legacy. Mencius claimed that Yang Zhu promoted a doctrine of egoism, which the former deemed tantamount to anarchism. Though there is no solid evidence that anything Yangzi may have authored has been transmitted through the ages, we can still gain insight into his views from descriptions and condemnations of his teachings by Mencius and other writers of the slightly later Han period. It is possible that what we have described as primitivist above is nothing more than a strain of thought influenced by Yangist tenets and beliefs.
Yang Zhu, like Mencius, appears to have viewed the self and human body as an important resource for universal, objective forms of authority through xing. We see this through the following quote from Mencius, which states: “Even if he were to benefit the world by pulling out a single hair, he would not do it.” It appears that Yangzi’s so-called egoism is founded on a principle of preserving some aspect of one’s self or body over and above anything else. A later author claims that what Yangzi valued was self in and of itself, while others described his thinking in the following way: “Keeping one’s nature whole, preserving one’s genuineness, and not letting things tire one’s form (body) – these Yangzi advocated but Mencius denounced.” In this example, the self to be valued consists in xing, the body, and in “genuineness” – a vague concept that seems to refer to a spiritual ideal – inherent or original to the individual. Based on such a description, Yang Zhu appears to have idealized certain aspects of the self that help define its essence, whether material, spiritual, or both. By insisting on a sharp separation between that which is internal or associated with the person on the one hand, and external things that might tire it on the other, Yang Zhu joins Mencius in basing his ideals on a fundamental inner/outer distinction. However, his recommendation that one keep the self and its aspects free of outside contamination, if accurate, would constitute an even more extreme form of individualism than what we have encountered with Mencius.
Like Zhuangzi, Yang Zhu (as characterized by later texts that attribute a certain, relatively consistent perspective to his beliefs) seems to have supported the preservation of some essential and vital spirit that is ultimately related to the human body and its wholeness. Unlike Zhuangzi, who wishes for individuals to transcend their own awareness of the boundaries of the self and its materiality, Yang Zhu appears to glorify the existence of these, and to call for the preservation of a strict separation between what is inside and belonging to the sphere of the self, and what is outside and belonging to the sphere of things. Thus, the main distinction between Zhuangzi and Yang Zhu lies in the fact that Yang Zhu appears to value the self as a material body that is sacred precisely because of its essential materiality and life-producing qualities. Zhuangzi, on the other hand, does not directly embrace the cult of bodily vitality. He calls for individuals to transcend their bodies and their materiality so as to embrace what he sometimes refers to as the spirit of the Dao, which should be understood as an ethereal type of vitality.
Given these descriptions of Yang Zhu’s thought, it seems fair to call him an individualist rather than an apologist for selfish egoism. After all, there is no convincing evidence that Yang Zhu promoted selfishness in the sense that he inspired individuals to seek self-profit through the exploitation of public resources or goods. Moreover, there is no clear indication that Yang Zhu tacitly condoned harming or destroying society through his ideals. Rather, most of the reliable evidence points to the fact that Yang Zhu redefined what it meant to value the self in terms of one’s personal, material-spiritual salvation. Indeed, Yang Zhu was perhaps one of the first thinkers, like Mencius, to see xing and the self as a primary source of idealized individual agency and meaning.
Individualism, as has been introduced here, was a broad orientation in early Chinese thought that posited the value and autonomy of the individual and, in some instances, located sources of idealized cosmic power and authority within the individual body. Widespread notions of self-cultivation viewed the individual as the key site of moral or spiritual transformation and, hence, the individual was the primary medium for assimilating social and cosmic authority and order. Early Chinese thinkers also presumed the moral or spiritual autonomy of the individual, granting individuals the power to effect changes in their lives and make important choices concerning morality, self-cultivation, and conformity to external sources of authority. Individualistic authors like Mencius, the Primitivist, and possibly Yang Zhu, went so far as to naturalize cosmic or divine sources of authority in the world by locating them within the human body itself. They thereby made the individual body the primary source for idealized agencies, and valued one’s cultivation of such innate agencies as the highest good.
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