Just War Theory

Just War Theory

Just war theory deals with the justification of how and why wars are fought. The justification can be either theoretical or historical. The theoretical aspect is concerned with ethically justifying war and the forms that warfare may or may not take. The historical aspect, or the "just war tradition," deals with the historical body of rules or agreements that have applied in various wars across the ages. For instance, international agreements such as the Geneva and Hague conventions are historical rules aimed at limiting certain kinds of warfare which lawyers may refer to in prosecuting transgressors, but it is the role of ethics to examine these institutional agreements for their philosophical coherence as well as to inquire into whether aspects of the conventions ought to be changed. The just war tradition may also consider the thoughts of various philosophers and lawyers through the ages and examine both their philosophical visions of war’s ethical limits (or absence of) and whether their thoughts have contributed to the body of conventions that have evolved to guide war and warfare.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. The Jus Ad Bellum Convention
  3. The Principles Of Jus In Bello
  4. Jus post bellum
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Historically, the just war tradition--a set of mutually agreed rules of combat—may be said to commonly evolve between two culturally similar enemies. That is, when an array of values are shared between two warring peoples, we often find that they implicitly or explicitly agree upon limits to their warfare. But when enemies differ greatly because of different religious beliefs, race, or language, and as such they see each other as “less than human”, war conventions are rarely applied. It is only when the enemy is seen to be a people, sharing a moral identity with whom one will do business in the following peace, that tacit or explicit rules are formed for how wars should be fought and who they should involve and what kind of relations should apply in the aftermath of war. In part, the motivation for forming or agreeing to certain conventions, can be seen as mutually benefiting—preferable, for instance, to the deployment of any underhand tactics or weapons that may provoke an indefinite series of vengeance acts, or the kinds of action that have proved to be detrimental to the political or moral interests to both sides in the past.

Regardless of the conventions that have historically formed, it has been the concern of the majority of just war theorists that the lack of rules to war or any asymmetrical morality between belligerents should be denounced, and that the rules of war should apply to all equally. That is, just war theory should be universal, binding on all and capable in turn of appraising the actions of all parties over and above any historically formed conventions.

The just war tradition is indeed as old as warfare itself. Early records of collective fighting indicate that some moral considerations were used by warriors to limit the outbreak or to rein in the potential devastation of warfare. They may have involved consideration of women and children or the treatment of prisoners (enslaving them rather than killing them, or ransoming or exchanging them). Commonly, the earlier traditions invoked considerations of honor: some acts in war have always been deemed dishonorable, whilst others have been deemed honorable. However, what is “honorable” is often highly specific to culture: for instance, a suicidal attack or defense may be deemed the honorable act for one people but ludicrous to another. Robinson (2006) notes that honor conventions are also contextually slippery, giving way to pragmatic or military interest when required. Whereas the specifics of what is honorable differ with time and place, the very fact that one moral virtue is alluded to in the great literature (for example, Homer’s Iliad) is sufficient for us to note that warfare has been infused with some moral concerns from the beginning rather than war being a mere Macbethian bloodbath.

The just war theory also has a long history. Parts of the Bible hint at ethical behavior in war and concepts of just cause, typically announcing the justice of war by divine intervention; the Greeks may have paid lip service to the gods, but, as with the Romans, practical and political issues tended to overwhelm any fledgling legal conventions: that is, interests of state or Realpolitik (the theory known as political realism would take precedence in declaring and waging war. Nonetheless, this has also been the reading of political realists, who enjoy Thucydides’ History of the Peloponnesian War as an example of why war is necessarily the extension of politics and hence permeated by hard-nosed state interest rather than “lofty” pretensions to moral behavior.

Although St. Augustine provided comments on the morality of war from the Christian perspective (railing against the love of violence that war can engender) as did several Arabic commentators in the intellectual flourishing from the 9th to 12th centuries, but the most systematic exposition in the Western tradition and one that still attracts attention was outlined by Saint Thomas Aquinas in the 13th century. In the Summa Theologicae, Aquinas presents the general outline of what becomes the traditional just war theory as discussed in modern universities. He discusses not only the justification of war but also the kinds of activity that are permissible (for a Christian) in war (see below). Aquinas's thoughts become the model for later Scholastics and Jurists to expand and to gradually to universalize beyond Christendom – notably, for instance, in relations with the peoples of America following European incursions into the continent. The most important of these writers are: Francisco de Vitoria (1486-1546), Francisco Suarez (1548-1617), Hugo Grotius (1583-1645), Samuel Pufendorf (1632-1704), Christian Wolff (1679-1754), and Emerich de Vattel (1714-1767).

In the twentieth century, just war theory has undergone a revival mainly in response to the invention of nuclear weaponry and American involvement in the Vietnam war. The most important contemporary texts include Michael Walzer's Just and Unjust Wars (1977), Barrie Paskins and Michael Dockrill The Ethics of War (1979), Richard Norman Ethics, Killing, and War (1995), Brian Orend War and International Justice (2001) and Michael Walzer on War and Justice (2001), as well as seminal articles by Thomas Nagel "War and Massacre", Elizabeth Anscombe "War and Murder", and a host of others, commonly found in the journals Ethics or The Journal of Philosophy and Public Affairs.

Since the terrorist attacks on the USA on 9/11 in 2001, academics have turned their attention to just war once again with international, national, academic, and military conferences developing and consolidating the theoretical aspects of the conventions. Just war theory has become a popular topic in International Relations, Political Science, Philosophy, Ethics, and Military History courses. Conference proceedings are regularly published, offering readers a breadth of issues that the topic stirs: for example, Alexander Moseley and Richard Norman, eds. Human Rights and Military Intervention, Paul Robinson, ed., Just War in a Comparative Perspective, Alexsander Jokic, ed., War Crimes and Collective Wrongdoing. What has been of great interest is that in the headline wars of the past decade, the dynamic interplay of the rules and conventions of warfare not only remain intact on the battlefield but their role and hence their explication have been awarded a higher level of scrutiny and debate. In the political circles, justification of war still requires even in the most critical analysis a superficial acknowledgement of justification. On the ground, generals have extolled their troops to adhere to the rules, soldiers are taught the just war conventions in the military academies (for example, explicitly through military ethics courses or implicitly through veterans’ experiences). Yet despite the emphasis on abiding by war’s conventions, war crimes continue - genocidal campaigns have been waged by mutually hating peoples, leaders have waged total war on ethnic groups within or without their borders, and individual soldiers or guerilla bands have committed atrocious, murderous, or humiliating acts on their enemy. But, arguably, such acts do remain atrocities by virtue of the just war conventions that some things in war are deemed to be inexcusable, regardless of the righteousness of the cause or the noise and fog of battle.

Yet increasingly, the rule of law - the need to hold violators and transgressors responsible for their actions in war and therefore after the battle - is making headway onto the battlefield. In chivalrous times, the Christian crusader could seek priestly absolution for atrocities committed in war, a stance supported by Augustine for example; today, the law courts are seemingly less forgiving: a violation of the conventions assumes that the soldier is responsible and accountable and should be charged for a crime. Nonetheless, the idealism of those who seek the imposition of law and responsibility on the battlefield (cf. Geoffrey Robertson's Crimes Against Humanity), often runs ahead of the traditions and customs, or plain state interests, that demean or weaken the justum bellum that may exist between warring factions. And in some cases, no just war conventions and hence no potential for legal acknowledgement of malfeasance, exist at all; in such cases, the ethic of war is considered, or is implicitly held to be, beyond the norms of peaceful ethics and therefore deserving a separate moral realm where "fair is foul and foul is fair" (Shakespeare, Macbeth I.i). In such examples (e.g, Rwanda, 1994), a people's justification of destructiveness and killing to whatever relative degree they hold to be justifiable triumphs over attempts to establish the laws of peaceful interaction into this separate bloody realm; and in some wars, people fighting for their land or nation prefer to pick up the cudgel rather than the rapier, as Leo Tolstoy notes in War and Peace (Book 4.Ch.2), to sidestep the etiquette or war in favor securing their land from occupational or invading forces.

The continued brutality of war in the face of conventions and courts of international law lead some to maintain that the application of morality to war is a nonstarter: state interest or military exigency would always overwhelm moral concerns. But there are those of a more skeptical persuasion who do not believe that morality can or should exist in war: its very nature precludes ethical concerns. But as there are several ethical viewpoints, there are also several common reasons laid against the need or the possibility of morality in war. Generally, consequentialists and act utilitarians may claim that if military victory is sought then all methods should be employed to ensure it is gained at a minimum of expense and time. Arguments from 'military necessity' are of this type; for example, to defeat Germany in World War II, it was deemed necessary to bomb civilian centers, or in the US Civil War, for General Sherman to burn Atlanta. However, intrinsicists (who claim that there are certain acts that are good or bad in themselves) may also decree that no morality can exist in the state of war: they may claim that it can only exist in a peaceful situation in which, for instance, recourse exists to conflict resolving institutions. Alternatively, intrinsicists may claim that possessing a just cause (the argument from righteousness) is a sufficient condition for pursuing whatever means are necessary to gain a victory or to punish an enemy. A different skeptical argument, one advanced by Michael Walzer, is that the invention of nuclear weapons alters war so much that our notions of morality—and hence just war theories—become redundant. However, against Walzer, it can be reasonably argued that although such weapons change the nature of warfare (for example, the timing, range, and potential devastation) they do not dissolve the need to consider their use within a moral framework: a nuclear warhead remains a weapon and weapons can be morally or immorally employed.

Whilst skeptical positions may be derived from consequentialist and intrinsicist positions, they need not be. Consequentialists can argue that there are long-term benefits to having a war convention. For example, by fighting cleanly, both sides can be sure that the war does not escalate, thus reducing the probability of creating an incessant war of counter-revenges. Intrinsicists, on the other hand, can argue that certain spheres of life ought never to be targeted in war; for example, hospitals and densely populated suburbs.

The inherent problem with both ethical models is that they become either vague or restrictive when it comes to war. Consequentialism is an open-ended model, highly vulnerable to pressing military or political needs to adhere to any code of conduct in war: if more will be gained from breaking the rules than will be lost, the consequentialist cannot but demur to military “necessity.” On the other hand, intrinsicism can be so restrictive that it permits no flexibility in war: whether it entails a Kantian thesis of dutifully respecting others or a classical rights position, intrinsicism produces an inflexible model that would restrain warriors’ actions to the targeting of permissible targets only. In principle such a prescription is commendable, yet the nature of war is not so clean cut when military targets can be hidden amongst civilian centers.

Against these two ethical positions, just war theory offers a series of principles that aim to retain a plausible moral framework for war. From the just war (justum bellum) tradition, theorists distinguish between the rules that govern the justice of war (jus ad bellum) from those that govern just and fair conduct in war (jus In bello) and the responsibility and accountability of warring parties after the war (jus post bellum). The three aspects are by no means mutually exclusive, but they offer a set of moral guidelines for waging war that are neither unrestricted nor too restrictive. The problem for ethics involves expounding the guidelines in particular wars or situations.

2. The Jus Ad Bellum Convention

The principles of the justice of war are commonly held to be: having just cause, being a last resort, being declared by a proper authority, possessing right intention, having a reasonable chance of success, and the end being proportional to the means used. One can immediately detect that the principles are not wholly intrinsicist nor consequentialist—they invoke the concerns of both models. Whilst this provides just war theory with the advantage of flexibility, the lack of a strict ethical framework means that the principles themselves are open to broad interpretations. Examining each in turn draws attention to the relevant problems.

Possessing just cause is the first and arguably the most important condition of jus ad bellum. Most theorists hold that initiating acts of aggression is unjust and gives a group a just cause to defend itself. But unless "aggression" is defined, this proscription is rather open-ended. For example, just cause resulting from an act of aggression can ostensibly be a response to a physical injury (for example, a violation of territory), an insult (an aggression against national honor), a trade embargo (an aggression against economic activity), or even to a neighbor’s prosperity (a violation of social justice). The onus is then on the just war theorist to provide a consistent and sound account of what is meant by just cause. Whilst not going into the reasons why the other explanations do not offer a useful condition of just cause, the consensus is that an initiation of physical force is wrong and may justly be resisted. Self-defense against physical aggression, therefore, is putatively the only sufficient reason for just cause. Nonetheless, the principle of self-defense can be extrapolated to anticipate probable acts of aggression, as well as in assisting others against an oppressive government or from another external threat (interventionism). Therefore, it is commonly held that aggressive war is only permissible if its purpose is to retaliate against a wrong already committed (for example, to pursue and punish an aggressor), or to pre-empt an anticipated attack. In recent years, the argument for preemption has gained supporters in the West: surely, the argument goes, it is right on consequentialist grounds to strike the first blow if a future war is to be avoided? By acting decisively against a probable aggressor, a powerful message is sent that a nation will defend itself with armed force; thus preemption may provide a deterrent and a more peaceful world. However, critics complain that preemptive strikes are based on conjectured rather than impending aggression and in effect denounce the moral principle that an agent is presumed innocent – posturing and the building up of armaments do not in themselves constitute aggression, just a man carrying a weapon is not a man using a weapon, Consequentialist critics may also reject preemption on the grounds that it is more likely to destabilize peace, while other realists may complain that a preemptive strike policy is the ploy of a tyrannical or bullying power that justifies other nations to act in their self-interest to neutralize either through alliances or military action – such is the principle behind the “balance of power” politics in which nations constantly renew their alliances and treatises to ensure that not one of them becomes a hegemonic power. It is also feared that the policy of preemption slips easily into the machinations of “false flag operations” in which a pretext for war is created by a contrived theatrical or actual stunt – of dressing one’s own soldiers up in the enemy’s uniforms, for instance, and having them attack a military or even civilian target so as to gain political backing for a war. Unfortunately, false flag operations tend to be quite common. Just war theory would reject them as it would reject waging war to defend a leader’s “honor” following an insult. Realists may defend them on grounds of a higher necessity but such moves are likely to fail as being smoke screens for political rather than moral interests.

War should always be a last resort. This connects intimately with presenting a just cause – all other forms of solution must have been attempted prior to the declaration of war. It has often been recognized that war unleashes forces and powers that soon get beyond the grips of the leaders and generals to control – there is too much “fog” in war, as Clausewitz noted, but that fog is also a moral haze in which truth and trust are early casualties. The resulting damage that war wrecks tends to be very high for most economies and so theorists have advised that war should not be lightly accepted: once unleashed, war is not like a sport that can be quickly stopped at the blow of a whistle (although the Celtic druids supposedly had the power to stop a battle by virtue of their moral standing) and its repercussions last for generations. Holding “hawks” at bay though is a complicated task – the apparent ease by which war may resolve disputes, especially in the eyes of those whose military might is apparently great and victory a certainty, does present war as a low cost option relative to continuing political problems and economic or moral hardship. Yet the just war theorist wishes to underline the need to attempt all other solutions but also to tie the justice of the war to the other principles of jus ad bellum too.

The notion of proper authority seems to be resolved for most of the theorists, who claim it obviously resides in the sovereign power of the state. But the concept of sovereignty raises a plethora of issues to consider here. If a government is just, i.e., most theorists would accept that the government is accountable and does not rule arbitrarily, then giving the officers of the state the right to declare war is reasonable, so the more removed from a proper and just form a government is, the more reasonable it is that its claim to justifiable political sovereignty disintegrates. A historical example can elucidate the problem: when Nazi Germany invaded France in 1940 it set up the Vichy puppet regime. What allegiance did the people of France under its rule owe to its precepts and rules? A Hobbesian rendition of almost absolute allegiance to the state entails that resistance is wrong (so long as the state is not tyrannical and imposes war when it should be the guardian of peace); whereas a Lockean or instrumentalist conception of the state entails that a poorly accountable, inept, or corrupt regime possesses no sovereignty, and the right of declaring war (to defend themselves against the government or from a foreign power) is wholly justifiable. The notion of proper authority therefore requires thinking about what is meant by sovereignty, what is meant by the state, and what is the proper relationship between a people and its government.

The possession of right intention is ostensibly less problematic. The general thrust of the concept being that a nation waging a just war should be doing so for the cause of justice and not for reasons of self-interest or aggrandizement. Putatively, a just war cannot be considered to be just if reasons of national interest are paramount or overwhelm the pretext of fighting aggression. However, “right intention” masks many philosophical problems. According to Kant, possessing good intent constitutes the only condition of moral activity, regardless of the consequences envisioned or caused, and regardless, or even in spite, of any self interest in the action the agent may have. The extreme intrinsicism of Kant can be criticized on various grounds, the most pertinent here being the value of self-interest itself. At what point does right intention separate itself from self-interest – is the moral worthiness of intent only gained by acting in favor of one’s neighbor, and if so, what does that imply for moral action – that one should woo one’s neighbor’s spouse to make him/her feel good? Acting with proper intent requires us to think about what is proper and it is not certain that not acting in self interest is necessarily the proper thing to do. On the one hand, if the only method to secure a general peace (some thing usually held to be good in itself) is to annex a belligerent neighbor's territory, political aggrandizement becomes intimately connected with the proper intention of maintaining the peace for all or the majority. On the other hand, a nation may possess just cause to defend an oppressed group, and may rightly argue that the proper intention is to secure their freedom, yet such a war may justly be deemed too expensive or too difficult to wage; i.e., it is not ultimately in their self-interest to fight the just war. On that account, the realist may counter that national interest is paramount: only if waging war on behalf of freedom is also complemented by the securing of economic or other military interests should a nation commit its troops. The issue of intention raises the concern of practicalities as well as consequences, both of which should be considered before declaring war.

The next principle is that of reasonable success. This is another necessary condition for waging just war, but again is insufficient by itself. Given just cause and right intention, the just war theory asserts that there must be a reasonable probability of success. The principle of reasonable success is consequentialist in that the costs and benefits of a campaign must be calculated. However, the concept of weighing benefits poses moral as well as practical problems as evinced in the following questions. Should one not go to the aid of a people or declare war if there is no conceivable chance of success? Is it right to comply with aggression because the costs of not complying are too prohibitive? Would it be right to crush a weak enemy because it would be marginally costless? Is it not sometimes morally necessary to stand up to a bullying larger force, as the Finns did when Russia invaded in 1940, for the sake of national self-esteem or simple interests of defending land? Historically, many nations have overcome the probability of defeat: the fight may seem hopeless, but a charismatic leader or rousing speech can sometimes be enough to stir a people into fighting with all their will. Winston Churchill offered the British nation some of the finest of war's rhetoric when it was threatened with defeat and invasion by Nazi Germany in 1940. For example: "Let us therefore brace ourselves to do our duty, and so bear ourselves that, if the British Commonwealth and its Empire lasts for a thousand years, men will still say, 'This was their finest hour.’“ ….And “What is our aim?….Victory, victory at all costs, victory in spite of all terror; victory, however long and hard the road may be; for without victory, there is no survival." (Speeches to Parliament, 1940). However, the thrust of the reasonable success principle emphasizes that human life and economic resources should not be wasted in what would obviously be an uneven match. For a nation threatened by invasion, other forms of retaliation or defense may be available, such as civil disobedience, or even forming alliances with other small nations to equalize the odds.

The final guide of jus ad bellum is that the desired end should be proportional to the means used. This principle overlaps into the moral guidelines of how a war should be fought, namely the principles of jus In bello. With regards to just cause, a policy of war requires a goal, and that goal must be proportional to the other principles of just cause. Whilst this commonly entails the minimizing of war's destruction, it can also invoke general balance of power considerations. For example, if nation A invades a land belonging to the people of nation B, then B has just cause to take the land back. According to the principle of proportionality, B’s counter-attack must not invoke a disproportionate response: it should aim to retrieve its land and not exact further retribution or invade the aggressor’s lands, or in graphic terms it should not retaliate with overwhelming force or nuclear weaponry to resolve a small border dispute. That goal may be tempered with attaining assurances that no further invasion will take place, but for B to invade and annex regions of A is nominally a disproportionate response, unless (controversially) that is the only method for securing guarantees of no future reprisals. For B to invade and annex A and then to continue to invade neutral neighboring nations on the grounds that their territory would provide a useful defense against other threats and a putative imbalance of power is even more unsustainable.

On the whole the principles offered by jus ad bellum are useful guidelines for reviewing the morality of going to war that are not tied to the intrinsicist’s absolutism or consequentialist’s open-endedness. Philosophically however they invoke a plethora of problems by either their independent vagueness or by mutually inconsistent results – a properly declared war may involve improper intention or disproportionate ambitions. But war is a complicated issue and the principles are nonetheless a useful starting point for ethical examination and they remain a guide for both statesmen and women and for those who judge political proceedings.

3. The Principles Of Jus In Bello

The rules of just conduct within war fall under the two broad principles of discrimination and proportionality. The principle of discrimination concerns who are legitimate targets in war, whilst the principle of proportionality concerns how much force is morally appropriate. A third principle can be added to the traditional two, namely the principle of responsibility, which demands an examination of where responsibility lies in war.

One strong implication of the justice of warfare being a separate topic of analysis to the justice of war is that the theory thus permits the judging of acts within war to be dissociated from it cause. This allows the theorist to claim that a nation fighting an unjust cause may still fight justly, or a nation fighting a just cause may be said to fight unjustly. It is a useful division but one that does not necessarily sever all ties between the two great principles of warfare: the justice of a cause remains a powerful moral guide by which warfare is to be judged, for what does it matter, it can be asked, if a nation wages a war of aggression but does so cleanly?

In waging war it is considered unfair and unjust to attack indiscriminately since non-combatants or innocents are deemed to stand outside the field of war proper. Immunity from war can be reasoned from the fact that their existence and activity is not part of the essence of war, which is the killing of combatants. Since killing itself is highly problematic, the just war theorist has to proffer a reason why combatants become legitimate targets in the first place, and whether their status alters if they are fighting a just or unjust war. Firstly, a theorist may hold that being trained and/or armed constitutes a sufficient threat to combatants on the other side and thereby the donning of uniform alters the person’s moral status to legitimate target; whether this extends to peaceful as well as war duties is not certain though. Voluntarists may invoke the boxing ring analogy: punching another individual is not morally supportable in a civilized community, but those who voluntarily enter the boxing ring renounce their right not to be hit. Normally, a boxer does not retain the right to hit another boxer outside of the ring, yet perhaps a soldier’s training creates a wholly different expectation governing his or her status and that wearing the uniform or merely possessing the training secures their legitimacy as a target both on and off the battlefield. Such an argument would imply that it is right to attack unarmed soldiers or soldiers who have surrendered or who are enjoying the normality of civilian life, which just war theorists and historical conventions have traditionally rejected on the claim that when a soldier lays down his weapons or removes his uniform, he or she returns to civilian life and hence the status of the non-combatant even if that return is temporary. Conversely, in joining an army the individual is said to renounce his or her rights not to be targeted in war – the bearing of arms takes a person into an alternative moral realm in which killing is the expectation and possible norm: it is world removed from civilian structures and historically has evolved rites of passage and exit that underline the alteration in status for cadets and veterans; all analogies to the fair play of sports fail at this juncture, for war involves killing and what the British Army call “unlimited liability.” On entering the army, the civilian loses the right not to be targeted, yet does it follow that all who bear uniform are legitimate targets, or are some more so than others – those who are presently fighting compared to those bearing arms but who are involved in supplies or administration, for instance?

Others, avoiding a rights analysis for it produces many problems on delineating the boundaries of rights and the bearers, may argue that those who join the army (or who have even been pressed into conscription) come to terms with being a target, and hence their own deaths. This is argued for example by Barrie Paskins and Michael Dockrill in The Ethics of War (1979). However, since civilians can just as readily come to terms with their own deaths and it is not necessarily the case that a soldier has, their argument, although interesting, is not sufficient to defend the principle of discrimination and why soldiers alone should be targeted legitimately in war. In turn, rights-based analyses may be more philosophically productive in giving soldiers and critics crucial guidelines, especially those analyses that focus on the renouncing of rights by combatants by virtue of their war status, which would leave nominally intact a sphere of immunity for civilians. Yet what is the status of guerrilla fighters who use civilian camouflage in order to press their attacks or to hide? Similarly, soldiers on covert operations present intricate problems of identification and legitimization: is there a difference between the two? Referring back to the fighters’ cause (for example, the guerrilla is a “freedom fighter” and thus carries a moral trump card) creates its own problems, which the just war theory in dividing the justice of the cause from the justice of the manner in which war is fought attempts to avoid: the guerrilla fighter may breach codes of conduct just as the soldier on a politically sensitive covert operations may avoid targeting the wrong people.

Walzer, in his Just and Unjust Wars (1977) claims that the lack of identification does not give a government the right to kill indiscriminately—the onus is on the government to identify the combatants, and so, the implication goes, if there is any uncertainty involved then an attack must not be made. Others have argued that the nature of modern warfare dissolves the possibility of discrimination: civilians are just as necessary causal conditions for the war machine as are combatants, therefore, they claim, there is no moral distinction in targeting an armed combatant and a civilian involved in arming or feeding the combatant. The distinction is, however, not closed by the nature of modern economies, since a combatant still remains a very different entity from a non-combatant, if not for the simple reason that the former is presently armed (and hence has renounced rights or is prepared to die, or is a threat), whilst the civilian is not. On the other hand, it can be argued that being a civilian does not necessarily mean that one is not a threat and hence not a legitimate target. If Mr Smith is the only individual in the nation to possess the correct combination that will detonate a device that could kill thousands, then he becomes not only causally efficacious in the firing of a weapon of war, but also morally responsible; reasonably he also becomes a legitimate military target. His job effectively militarizes his status even though he does not bear arms.

The underlying issues that ethical analysis must deal with involve the logical nature of an individual's complicity and the aiding and abetting the war machine, with greater weight being imposed on those logically closer than those logically further from the war machine in their work. At a deeper level, one can consider the role that civilians play in supporting an unjust war: to what extent are they morally culpable, and if they are culpable in giving moral, financial, or economic support to some extent, does that mean they may become legitimate targets? This invokes the issue of collective versus individual responsibility that is in itself a complex topic but one that the principle of discrimination tries to circumvent by presenting guidelines for soldiers that keep their activity within the realms of war and its effects rather than murder. It would be wrong, on the principle of discrimination, to group the enemy into one targetable mass of people – some can not be responsible for a war or its procedures, notably children. Yet, on the other hand, if a civilian bankrolls a war or initiates aggression as a politician, surely he or she bears some moral responsibility for the ensuing deaths: some may argue that the war’s justification rests upon such shoulders but not the manner in which it is fought, while others may prefer to saddle the leader or initiator with the entire responsibility for how a war is fought on the argument that each combatant is responsible for those below him or her in rank – so the political or civilian leaders are analogously responsible for all operating in the military field.

The second principle of just conduct is that any offensive action should remain strictly proportional to the objective desired. This principle overlaps with the proportionality principle of just cause, but it is distinct enough to consider it in its own light. Proportionality for jus In bello requires tempering the extent and violence of warfare to minimize destruction and casualties. It is broadly utilitarian in that it seeks to minimize overall suffering, but it can also be understood from other moral perspectives, for instance, from harboring good will to all (Kantian ethics), or acting virtuously (Aristotelian ethics). Whilst the consideration of discrimination focuses on who is a legitimate target of war, the principle of proportionality deals with what kind of force is morally permissible. In fighting a just war in which only military targets are attacked, it is still possible to breach morality by employing disproportionate force against an enemy. Whilst the earlier theoreticians, such as Thomas Aquinas, invoked the Christian concepts of charity and mercy, modern theorists may invoke either consequentialist or intrinsicist prescriptions, both of which remain problematic as the foregoing discussions have noted. However, it does not seem morally reasonable to completely gun down a barely armed albeit belligerent tribe. At the battle of Omdurman in 1898 in the Sudan, six machine gunners killed thousands of dervishes—the gunners may have been in the right to defend themselves, but the principle of proportionality implies that a battle end before it becomes a massacre. Similarly, following the battle of Culloden in 1746 in Scotland, Cumberland ordered "No Quarter", which was not only a breach of the principle of discrimination, for his troops were permitted to kill the wounded as well as supporting civilians, but also a breach of the principle of proportionality, since the battle had been won, and the Jacobite cause effectively defeated on the battle field.

What if a war and all of its suffering could be avoided by highly selective killing? Could just war theory endorse assassination for instance? Assassination programs have often been secretly accepted and employed by states throughout the centuries and appeal, if challenged, is often to a “higher” value such as self-defense, killing a target guilty of war crimes and atrocities, or removing a threat to peace and stability. The CIA manual on assassination (1954, cf. Belfield), sought to distinguish between murder and assassination, the latter being justifiable according to the higher purposes sought. This is analogous to just war theorists seeking to put mass killing on a higher moral ground than pure massacre and slaughter and is fraught with the same problems raised in this article and in the just war literature. On grounds of discrimination, assassination would be justifiable if the target were legitimate and not, say, the wife or children of a legitimate target. On grounds of proportionality, the policy would also be acceptable, for if one man or woman (a legitimate target by virtue of his or her aggression) should die to avoid further bloodshed or to secure a quicker victory, then surely assassination is covered by the just war theory? The founder of the Hashshashin society (c.11-13thC), Hasan ibn el Sabah preferred to target or threaten warmongers rather than drag innocents and noncombatants into bloody and protracted warfare: his threats were often successful for he brought the reality of death home to the leaders who otherwise would enjoy what lyricist Roger Waters calls “the bravery of being out of range.” In recent years, the US and UK proclaimed that the war in the Gulf was not with the Iraqi people but with its leader and his regime; the US government even issued a bounty on the heads of key agents in the Ba’ath party; indeed, Saddam Hussein’s sons, Uday and Qusay with a bounty of £15m, were killed in a selective hunt and destroy mission rather than being captured and brought to trial for the crimes asserted of them. Assassination would apparently clear the two hurdles of discrimination and proportionality, yet the intrinsicist wing of just war theorists would reasonably claim that underhand and covert operations, including assassination, should not form a part of war on grounds that they act to undermine the respect due one’s enemy (not matter how cruel he or she is) as well as the moral integrity of the assassin; the consequentialists would also counter that such policies also encourage the enemy to retaliate in similar manner, and one of the sustaining conclusions of just war theory is that escalation or retaliatory measures (tit for tat policies) should be avoided for their destabilizing nature. Once initiated, assassination tends to become the norm of political affairs – indeed, civil politics would thus crumble into fearful and barbaric plots and conspiracies (as did Rome in its last centuries) in a race to gain power and mastery over others rather than to forge justifiable sovereignty.

The principles of proportionality and discrimination aim to temper war's violence and range; while they may ostensibly imply the acceptance of some forms of warfare, their malleability also implies that we continuously look afresh upon seemingly acceptable acts. Accordingly, they are complemented by other considerations that are not always explicitly taken up in the traditional exposition of jus In bello, this is especially true in the case of the issue of responsibility.

Jus in bello requires that the agents of war be held responsible for their actions. This ties in their actions to morality generally. Some, such as Saint Augustine argues against this assertion: "who is but the sword in the hand of him who uses it, is not himself responsible for the death he deals." Those who act according to a divine command, or even God's laws as enacted by the state and who put wicked men to death “have by no means violated the commandment, 'Thou shalt not kill.’” Whilst this issue is connected to the concepts of just cause, it does not follow that individuals waging a just, or unjust war, should be absolved of breaching the principles of just conduct. Readily it can be accepted that soldiers killing other soldiers is part of the nature of warfare for which soldiers ought to be prepared and trained, but when soldiers turn their weapons against non-combatants, or pursue their enemy beyond what is reasonable, then they are no longer committing legitimate acts of war but acts of murder. The principle of responsibility re-asserts the burden of abiding by rules in times of peace on those acting in war to remind them that one day they will once more take up civilian status and should be prepared to do so conscientiously, free of any guilt from war crimes. The issues that arise from this principle include the morality of obeying orders (for example, when one knows those orders to be immoral), as well as the moral status of ignorance (not knowing of the effects of one’s actions either reasonably or literally).

Responsibility for acts of war relate back to the tenets of jus ad bellum as well as jus in bello, for the justification of going to war involves responsibility as well as the acts ordered and committed in war. In reviewing the stories from military ethics readers, the acts of bravery that attract our attention involve soldiers standing up to do the “right thing” against either the prevailing momentum of the platoon or the orders from higher up; the realist rejects such acts as infrequent or unnecessary performances that do not alter the main characteristic of war and its innate brutality, yet such acts also remind the critic as well as the soldier of the importance of returning to the civilian mode with good conscience.

The aftermath of war involves the relinquishing of armed conflict as a means of resolving disputes and the donning of more civil modes of conduct but it also raises questions concerning the nature of the post bellum justice.

4. Jus post bellum

Following the cessation of a war, three possibilities emerge: either the army has been defeated, has been victorious, or it has agreed to a ceasefire. Principles of justice may then be applied to each situation. Orend presents a useful summary of the principles of jus post bellum : the principle of discrimination should be employed to avoid imposing punishment on innocents or non-combatants; the rights or traditions of the defeated deserve respect; the claims of victory should be proportional to the war’s character; compensatory claims should be tempered by the principles of discrimination and proportionality; and, controversially, the need to rehabilitate or re-educate an aggressor should also be considered.

It has often been remarked that justice, like history, is written by the victors. A defeated army and indeed the civilian body from which the army stems should thus be prepared to subject itself to the imposition of rules and forms of punishments, humiliation, and even retributions that it would not otherwise agree to. The lives, values, and resources that have been fought for must now be handed over to the conquerors. When put this way, when one readily imagines one’s own country’s army falling to an aggressive enemy, the terms immediately appear fearful and unjust and may stir a greater endeavor to make the victory hollow by the raising of guerrilla or even terrorist organizations to thwart the conquerors’ designs.

Yet when one’s own army is victorious, the partiality of victory can be so easily dismissed on the enthusiastic wave that accompanies triumph: victory is so often associated with the greater right when one’s own country vanquishes its enemy, and assumedly with that right comes the justification to impose conditions upon the vanquished. In so many wars in history, both ancient and modern, victory has provided the winners with the means of exploiting the defeated nation and for claiming rights over its lands and people whether in the form of enslavement or in monopolistic mercantile contracts; sometimes an appeal to divine justice is made; at other times the supremacy of one’s nation, race, creed, or political order is lauded over the defeated. Economic exploitation is not the only means of subjugating the defeated: new political or religious frameworks can also be imposed sometimes as a means of “rehabilitating the defeated” or as a means to avoid the circumstances (political or economic) that may bring about further warfare; the philosopher must naturally inquire as to the justice of such measures.

The just war theorist is keen to remind warriors and politicians alike that the principles of justice following war should be universalizable and morally ordered and that victory should not provide a license for imposing unduly harsh or punitive measures or that state or commercial interests should not dictate the form of the new peace. Similarly, imposing an alternative political or religious is not likely to be conducive to peace, as Edmund Burke prophetically warned about decreeing for the “rights of man” in an unprepared culture; re-educating a defeated military or bureaucracy may seem reasonable and arguably was successful in post-war Germany (1945), yet such a program may also be so superficial or condescending as to have only short term and illusory benefits or act to further humiliate the defeated into seething desire for revenge. In post-war Iraq (2003-date), the rehabilitation programs have met with mixed success and have often been criticized for favoring some ethnic groups over others, i.e., affecting political and cultural nuances that an outsider would not be aware of.

Criticism may stem from either intrinsicist reasons (that the defeated should still be viewed as a people deserving moral respect and their traditions held as sacrosanct) or consequentialist reasons (that punitive impositions are likely to produce a backlash); but again it is worth reminding that just war theory tends to merge the two to avoid awkward implications derived from either position singly.

At this point, the attraction for jus post bellum thinkers is to return to the initial justice of the war. Consider a war of self-defense: this is considered by most, except absolute pacifists, to be the most justifiable of all wars. If the people are defeated but their cause remains just, should they then continue the fight to rid their country of all the vestiges of occupation? What if fighting is impossible? Should they bow their heads in honorable defeat and accept the victor’s terms graciously? Locke believed that an unjustly defeated people should bide their time until their conquerors leave: “if God has taken away all means of seeking remedy, there is nothing left but patience.” (Second Treatises, §177); however, the right always remains with those who fought against an unjust war but they do not gain any moral right to attack indiscriminately or disproportionately (such as terrorizing the invader’s own civilians or soldiers at rest), although they may carry on their claim for freedom over the generations. A realist, however, may ask how a people are to regain their freedom if they do not raise arms against their sea of troubles? Nonetheless, if the “good fight” is to continue, most theorists follow Locke and prohibit breaches of the jus in bello principles: while it would be wrong to bow to a tyrant or conquering army, it would be immoral to target their families in order to encourage the occupying army to leave. Others may counsel civil disobedience and other forms of intransigence to signal displeasure.

If, on the other hand, the victors have won a just war against an aggressor, Locke argues that the victor’s right does not extend to the aggressive nation’s civilian population, but that it does extend to all those engaged in the aggression and that it extends absolutely: that is, the just conqueror has absolute rights of life and death over the defeated aggressors. The aggressor, one who initiates war, puts the individual or the community into a state of war, he argues, and so the defender has an absolute prerogative to use whatever force necessary to secure freedom and peace: accordingly, in victory, the victors may enslave or kill the aggressors. Locke’s is an extreme although not logically incoherent position and his exhortations may be compared to other moral positions (often emerging from religious thinking) to temper the justice in favor of other virtues such as charity, liberality, and justice. Indeed, King Alfred the Great of Wessex (c.878AD) defeated the Viking invader Guthrum in battle and rather than executing him as the Vikings would have done Alfred, he ordered them to join the Christian religion and then, and probably more importantly, offered them a stake in the land: toleration merged with prudence and self-interest ensured Guthrum was no longer a threat. Indeed, Machiavelli warned that killing an opponent’s family is likely to raise their ire but taking away their land is guaranteed to continue the fight over generations. It may be reasonably held that the aggressors deserve punishment of some sort, although Alfred’s example highlights an alternative view of dealing with an enemy, one that reminds the theorist that peace not further war remains the goal. But what if the defeated aggressors are guilty of atrocities, surely they should be made to stand trial to send a signal to other “war criminals” as well as to punish them for their own misdeeds? Here we enter the debates regarding punishment: does punishing a violator make any sense except to exact either retribution, revenge, or to promote a deterrence? Can the victors be sure of their claim to punish the aggressors and what good could possibly flow from bringing more violence or enslavement to the world? In asserting the need to find universalisable principles, the just war theorist is usually keen to insist that any war crimes trials are held in neutral states and presided over by neutral parties, rather than the victors whose partiality in proceedings must be presumed: after all, in the Nuremberg and Tokyo trials, no allied generals or politicians were held accountable for the atrocities created by bombing civilian centers in Germany and Japan and the dropping of nuclear bombs on Hiroshima and Nagasaki.

The end game and hence the jus post bellum certainly merit attention before the battles are lost or won: what should be the ruling affairs once the peace is proclaimed? Should the terms of war’s end be elaborated and publicly pronounced as to ensure all parties are aware of the costs of defeat? Is it right that an army should demand unconditional surrender, for instance, when such a policy may entail a protracted war for no incentive is given to the other side to surrender; on the other hand, unconditional surrender implies a derogatory view of the enemy as one not to be respected either in or after war. Yet if an unconditional surrender policy does suitably raise the stakes of fighting war it may act as a sufficient deterrent against possible aggressors or act as a useful diplomatic tool to bring a worried enemy back to peaceful overtures. Similarly, is it right that an army should demand reparations in advance rather than leave them undisclosed and thereby risk the uncertainty of punishment creating a backlash from the defeated, who may not wish to be so subjected? To keep the expected conditions of war’s end secretive does not seem a wise move in that uncertainty generates fear, and fear can generate a harder campaign than otherwise would be necessary; but if the publicized conditions appear onerous to the enemy, then they have good reasons to prolong and/or intensify their own fight. Of course, if promises of an amnesty or fair treatment of prisoners is reneged on by the victor, then all trust for future arrangements is lost and the consequences imply embedding hatreds and mistrust for generations.

Assume that victory is given, that the army has defeated its enemy on the battlefield so attention turns to the nature of the post bellum justice of dealing with the defeated regardless of its intentions beforehand. Arguably, the very nature of the warring participants’ vision of each other and of themselves will color the proceedings both politically and morally. A victorious side, for instance, that sees itself as rightfully triumphant is more likely to impose its will and exactions upon the defeated in a more stringent manner in which a victorious side that sees itself as its enemy’s equal; but universality demands seeing one’s enemy as oneself and understanding not just the Realpolitik of state interests and state gains in victory but also the conventions of magnanimity and honor in victory (or defeat).

Consider the demands for reparations. A defeated aggressor may just be asked to pay for the damage incurred by the war (as justice demands of criminals that they pay for their crimes). But to what extent should the reparations extend? Should there be demands for retribution and deterrence added in, so that those deemed responsible for their aggression should be put on trial and suitably punished (and what would “suitable” mean in this instance – that Saddam Hussein stand trial for his invasion of Kuwait implies that George W Bush similarly stand trial for his invasions of Afghanistan and Iraq?). In forming the conditions of defeat, should neutral third parties be turned to so as to avoid later accusations of “victor’s justice” and the partiality that such justice can invoke or imply, or does victory present the victor with the ultimate moral wreath to justify whatever demands seen appropriate or fitting?

Should a war be indecisive though, the character of the peace would presumably be formed by the character of the ceasefire – namely, the cessation of fighting would imply a mere hiatus in which the belligerents regain the time and resources to stock their defenses and prepare for further fighting. As such, a ceasefire would be merely a respite for the military to regain its strengths. However, just war theory also acts to remind contenders that war is a last resort and that its essential aim is always peace, so if peace is forthcoming in any guise, it is morally critical for all parties to seek a return to a permanent peace rather than a momentary lapse of war.

5. Conclusion

This article has described the main tenets of the just war theory, as well as some of the problems that it entails. The theory bridges theoretical and applied ethics, since it demands an adherence, or at least a consideration of meta-ethical conditions and models, as well as prompting concern for the practicalities of war. A few of those practicalities have been mentioned here. Other areas of interest are: hostages, innocent threats, international blockades, sieges, the use of weapons of mass destruction or of anti-personnel weapons (for example, land mines), and the morality and practicalities of interventionism.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Anscombe, Elizabeth. (1981) “War and Murder”. In Ethics, Religion, and Politics. University of Minnesota Press. pp. 51-71.
  • Aquinas, St Thomas. (1988). Politics and Ethics. Norton.
  • Augustine, St. (1984). City of God. Penguin.
  • Belfield, Richard (2005). Assassination: The Killers and their Paymasters Revealed. Magpie Books.
  • Burke, Edmund (1986). Reflections on the Revolution in France. Penguin.
  • Dockrill, Michael and Barrie Paskins (1979). The Ethics of War.
  • Hobbes, Thomas (1988). Leviathan. Penguin.
  • Jokic Alexsander, and Anthony Ellis eds. (2001), War Crimes and Collective Wrongdoing. WileyBlackwell.
  • Locke, John (1963). Two Treatises of Government. Cambridge University Press.
  • Machiavelli, Nicolo (1988). The Prince. Cambridge University Press.
  • Minear, Richard (1971). Victor’s Justice: The Tokyo War Crimes Trial. Princeton.
  • Moseley, Alexander and Richard Norman, eds. (2001) Human Rights and Military Intervention. Ashgate.
  • Moseley, Alexander (2006). An Introduction to Political Philosophy. Continuum.
  • Nagel, Thomas (1972). “War and Massacre.” Philosophy and Public Affairs . Vol. 1, pp. 123-44.
  • Norman, Richard (1995). Ethics, Killing, and War.
  • Orend, Brian (2001). War and International Justice. Wilfrid Laurier Press.
  • Orend, Brian (2006). The Morality of War. Broadview.
  • Robertson, Geoffrey (1999). Crimes Against Humanity.
  • Robinson, Paul ed., (2003) Just War in a Comparative Perspective. Ashgate.
  • Robinson, Paul. (2006). Military Honour and the Conduct of War. Routledge.
  • Thucydides (1974). History of the Peloponnesian War. Penguin.
  • Tolstoy, Leo (1992). War and Peace. Everyman.
  • Walzer, Michael (1978). Just and Unjust Wars. Basic Books.

Author Information

Alexander Moseley
Email: alex@classical-foundations.com
United Kingdom